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Cosmological Argument

First published Tue Jul 13, 2004; substantive revision Thu Sep 11, 2008

The cosmological argument is less a particular argument than an argument type. It uses a general pattern of argumentation (logos) that makes an inference from certain alleged facts about the world (cosmos) to the existence of a unique being, generally identified with or referred to as God. Among these initial facts are that the world came into being, that the world is contingent in that it could have been other than it is, or that certain beings or events in the world are causally dependent or contingent. From these facts philosophers infer either deductively or inductively that a first cause, a necessary being, an unmoved mover, or a personal being (God) exists. The cosmological argument is part of classical natural theology, whose goal has been to provide some evidence for the claim that God exists.

On the one hand, the argument arises from human curiosity as to why there is something rather than nothing. It invokes a concern for some complete, ultimate, or best explanation of what exists contingently. On the other hand, it raises intrinsically important philosophical questions about contingency and necessity, causation and explanation, part/whole relationships (mereology), infinity, sets, and the nature and origin of the universe. In what follows we will first sketch out a very brief history of the argument, note the two fundamental types of deductive cosmological arguments, and then provide a careful analysis of each, first the argument from contingency, then the argument from the impossibility of an infinite temporal regress of causes. In the end we will consider an inductive version of the cosmological argument.

1. Historical Overview

Although in Western philosophy the earliest formation of a version of the cosmological argument is found in Plato's Laws, 893-6, the classical argument is firmly rooted in Aristotle's Physics (VIII, 4-6) and Metaphysics (XII, 1-6). Islamic philosophy enriches the tradition, developing two types of arguments. The Arabic philosophers (falasifa) developed the atemporal argument from contingency, which is taken up by Thomas Aquinas (1225-74) in his Summa Theologica (I,q.2,a.3) and his Summa Contra Gentiles (I, 13). The mutakallimūm, theologians who used reason and argumentation to support their revealed Islamic beliefs, developed the temporal version of the argument from the impossibility of an infinite regress, known as the kalām argument. For example, al-Ghāzāli (1058-1111) argued that everything that begins to exist requires a cause of its beginning. The world is composed of temporal phenomena preceded by other temporally ordered phenomena. Since such a series of temporal phenomena cannot continue to infinity, the world must have had a beginning and a cause of its existence, namely, God (Craig 1979, part 1). This version of the argument enters the Christian tradition through Bonaventure (1221-74) in his Sentences (II Sent. D.1,p.1,a.1,q.2).

During the Enlightenment, writers such as Georg Wilhelm Leibniz and Samuel Clarke reaffirmed the cosmological argument. Leibniz (1646-1716) appealed to a strengthened principle of sufficient reason, according to which “no fact can be real or existing and no statement true without a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (Monadology, §32). Leibniz uses the principle to argue that the sufficient reason for the “series of things comprehended in the universe of creatures” (§36) must exist outside this series of contingencies and is found in a necessary being that we call God. The principle of sufficient reason is likewise employed by Samuel Clark in his cosmological argument (Rowe 1975, chap. 2).

Although the cosmological argument does not figure prominently in Asian philosophy, a very abbreviated version of it, proceeding from dependence, can be found in Udayana's Nyāyakusumāñjali I,4. In general philosophers in the Nyāya tradition argue that since the universe has parts that come into existence at one occasion and not another, it must have a cause. We could admit an infinite regress of causes if we had evidence for such, but lacking such evidence, God must exist as the non-dependent cause. Many of the objections to the argument contend that God is an inappropriate cause because of God's nature. For example, since God is immobile and has no body, he cannot properly be said to cause anything. The Naiyāyikas reply that God could assume a body at certain times, and in any case, God need not create in the same way humans do (Potter, 100-7).

The cosmological argument came under serious assault in the 18th century, first by David Hume and then by Immanuel Kant. Hume (1993) attacks both the view of causation presupposed in the argument (that causation is an objective, productive relation that holds between two things) and the Causal Principle — every contingent being has a cause of its being — that lies at the heart of the argument. Kant contends that the cosmological argument, in identifying the necessary being, relies on the ontological argument, which in turn is suspect. We will return to these criticisms below.

Both theists and non-theists in the last part of the 20th century generally have shown a healthy skepticism about the argument. Alvin Plantinga (1967, chap. 1) concludes “that this piece of natural theology is ineffective.” Richard Gale contends, in Kantian fashion, that since the conclusion of all versions of the cosmological argument invokes an impossibility, no cosmological arguments can provide examples of sound reasoning (1991, chap. 7). Similarly, Michael Martin (1990, chap. 4), as do John Mackie (chap. 5), Quentin Smith (Craig and Smith, 1993), Bede Rundle, and Graham Oppy (2006, chap. 3), reasons that no current version of the cosmological argument is sound (1990, ch. 4). Yet dissenting voices can be heard. Robert Koons employs mereology and modal and nonmonotonic logic in taking a “new look” at the argument from contingency, William Lane Craig defends the kalām argument, and Richard Swinburne, though rejecting deductive versions of the cosmological argument, proposes an inductive argument which is part of a larger cumulative case for God's existence. “There is quite a chance that if there is a God he will make something of the finitude and complexity of a universe. It is very unlikely that a universe would exist uncaused, but rather more likely that God would exist uncaused. The existence of the universe…can be made comprehensible if we suppose that it is brought about by God” (1979, 131-2). In short, contemporary philosophers continue to contribute detailed arguments on both sides of the debate.

2. Typology of Cosmological Arguments

Craig distinguishes three types of cosmological arguments. The first, advocated by Aquinas, is based on the impossiblity of an essentially ordered infinite regress. The second, which Craig terms the kalām argument, holds that an infinite temporal regress is impossible because an actual infinite is impossible. The third, espoused by Leibniz and Clarke, is overtly founded on the Principle of Sufficient Reason (Craig 1980, 282). Another way of distinguishing between versions of the argument is in terms of the relevance of time. In Aquinas's version, consideration of the essential ordering of the causes or reasons proceeds independent of temporal concerns. The relationship between cause and effect is treated as real but not temporal, so that the first cause is not a first cause in time but a sustaining cause. In the kalām version, however, the temporal ordering of the causal sequence is central. The distinction between these types of argument is important because the objections raised against one version may not be relevant to the other versions. So, for example, a critique of the principle of sufficient reason, which one finds developed by William Rowe or Richard Gale, might not be telling against the Thomistic or kalām versions of the argument.

3. Argument for a First Sustaining Cause

Thomas Aquinas held that among the things whose existence needs explanation are contingent beings that depend for their existence upon other beings. Richard Taylor (1992, 99-108) and others argue that the universe (meaning everything that ever existed), as contingent, needs explanation. Arguing that the term “universe” refers to an abstract entity or set, William Rowe rephrases the issue, “Why does that set (the universe) have the members that it does rather than some other members or none at all?” (Rowe 1975, 136). That is, "Why is there something rather than nothing?" (Smart, in Haldane and Smart, 36; Rundle). The response of the cosmological argument is that what is contingent exists because of a necessary being.

3.1 The Deductive Argument from Contingency

The cosmological argument begins with a fact about experience, namely, that something exists. We might sketch out the argument as follows.

  1. A contingent being (a being that if it exists can not-exist) exists.
  2. This contingent being has a cause of or explanation[1] for its existence.
  3. The cause of or explanation for its existence is something other than the contingent being itself.
  4. What causes or explains the existence of this contingent being must either be solely other contingent beings or include a non-contingent (necessary) being.
  5. Contingent beings alone cannot provide an adequate causal account or explanation for the existence of a contingent being.
  6. Therefore, what causes or explains the existence of this contingent being must include a non-contingent (necessary) being.
  7. Therefore, a necessary being (a being that if it exists cannot not-exist) exists.

Over the centuries philosophers have suggested various instantiations for the contingent being noted in premise 1. In his Summa Theologica I, q. 2, a 3, Aquinas argued that we need a causal explanation for things in motion, things that are caused, and contingent beings.[1] Others, such as Richard Taylor and Richard Swinburne (1979), propose that the contingent being referred to in premise 1 is the universe. The connection between the two is supplied by John Duns Scotus, who argued that even if the essentially ordered causes were infinite, “the whole series of effects would be dependent upon some prior cause” (Scotus, 46). Whereas the contingency of particular existents is generally undisputed, the contingency of the universe deserves some defense (see 3.2). Premise 2 invokes a version of the Principle of Causation or the Principle of Sufficient Reason; if something is contingent, there must be a cause of its existence or a reason why it exists rather than not exists. The point of 3 is simply that something cannot cause its own existence, for this would require it to already be (in a logical if not a temporal sense). Premise 4 is true by virtue of the Principle of Excluded Middle: what explains the existence of the contingent being is either other contingent beings or a non-contingent being. Conclusions 6 and 7 follow validly from the respective premises.

For many critics, premise 5 holds the key to the argument's success or failure. Whether 5 is true depends upon the requirements for an adequate explanation. According to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, what is required is an explanation that includes a causal account in terms of sufficient conditions and the reason why the cause had the effect it did. Swinburne thinks that it must be a full explanation, “a set of factors which together were sufficient for the occurrence of an event,” which deductively entails the occurrence of the event (Swinburne 1979, 24), but this may lead to a deterministic account that not only is unnecessary for the success of the argument but may be incompatible on a liberatarian account with the contention that God created freely. Quinn argues that an adequate explanation need not provide a complete explanation, depending on the context. If the contingent being in premise 1 is the universe, then an adequate explanation would require something beyond the contingent factors that, as part of the universe, are to be explained. It requires the existence of a non-contingent or necessary being. That contingent or dependent things (e.g., a universe) have always existed does not provide an alternative explanation, for it fails to provide an explanation for why the universe exists rather than not.

Finally, it should be noted in 7 that if the contingent being identified in 1 is the universe, the necessary being cannot provide a natural explanation for it, for we know of no natural, non-contingent causes and laws or principles exist from which the existence of the universe follows. What is required is a personal explanation in terms of the intentional acts of some eternal supernatural being. Since the argument proceeds independent of temporal considerations, the argument does not propose a first cause in time, but rather a first or primary sustaining cause of the universe. As Aquinas noted, the philosophical arguments for God's existence are compatible with the eternity of the universe (On the Eternity of the World).

That the first sustaining cause is God is not part of the cosmological argument per se, although defenders of the argument sometimes create additional arguments to identify the first cause. O'Connor (2005) argues that being a necessary being cannot be a derivative emergent property, otherwise the being would be contingent. Likewise the connection between the essential properties must be necessary. Hence, the universe cannot be the necessary being since it is mereologically complex. Similiarly, the myriad elementary particles cannot be necessary beings either, for their distinguishing distributions are externally caused and hence contingent. Rather, he contends that a more viable account of the Necessary Being is as a purposive agent with desires, intentions, and beliefs, whose activity is guided but not determined by its goals. All of these claims are challenged, as we shall see shortly. Koons is more willing to identify the necessary being as God, constructing corollaries regarding God's nature that follow from his construction of the cosmological argument. Oppy (1999) is rightly skeptical about the possibility of such a deductive move.

Critics have objected to most of the premises in the argument. We will consider the most important objections and responses.

3.2 Objection 1: The Universe Just Is

Interpreting the contingent being in premise 1 as the universe, Bertrand Russell denies that the universe needs an explanation; it just is. Russell, following Hume (1980), contends that since we derive the concept of cause from our observation of particular things, we cannot ask about the cause of something like the universe that we cannot experience. The universe is "just there, and that's all" (Russell, 175).

But we don't need to experience every possible referent of the class of contingent things to be able to conclude that a contingent thing needs a cause. "To know that a rubber ball dropped on a Tuesday in Waggener Hall by a redheaded tuba player will fall to the ground," I don't need a sample that includes tuba players dropping rubber balls at this location (Koons 1997, 202). Similarly, one does not need to experience a contingent cosmos to know it is caused.

But why should we think that the cosmos is contingent? Defenders of the argument contend that if the components of the universe are contingent, the universe itself is contingent. Russell replies that the move from the contingency of the components of the universe to the contingency of the universe commits the Fallacy of Composition, which mistakenly concludes that since the parts have a certain property, the whole likewise has that property. Hence, whereas we can ask for the cause of particular things, we cannot ask for the cause of the universe or the set of all contingent beings.

Russell correctly notes that arguments of the part-whole type can commit the Fallacy of Composition. For example, the argument that since all the bricks in the wall are small, the wall is small, is fallacious. Yet it is an informal fallacy of content, not a formal fallacy. Sometimes the totality has the same quality as the parts because of the nature of the parts invoked — the wall is brick because it is built of bricks. The universe's contingency, theists argue, resembles the second case. If all the contingent things in the universe, including matter and energy, ceased to exist simultaneously, the universe itself, as the totality of these things, would cease to exist. But if the universe can cease to exist, it is contingent and requires an explanation for its existence (Reichenbach, chap. 5).

Some reply that this argument for the contingency of the universe still is fallacious, for even if every contingent being were to fail to exist in some possible world, it may be the case that there is no possible world that lacks a contingent being. That is, though no being would exist in every possible world, every world would possess at least one contingent being. Rowe gives the example of a horse race. “We know that although no horse in a given horse race necessarily will be the winner, it is, nevertheless, necessary that some horse in the race will be the winner” (1975, 164).

Rowe's example, however, fails, for it is possible that all the horses break a leg and none finishes the race. That is, the necessity that some horse will win follows only if there is some reason to think that some horse must finish the race. Similarly, his objection to the universe's contingency will hold only if there is some reason to think that the existence of something is necessary. One argument given in defense of this thesis is that the existence of one contingent being may be necessary for the nonexistence of some other contingent being. But though the fact that something's existence is necessary for the existence of something else holds for certain properties (for example, the existence of children is necessary for someone to be a parent), it is doubtful that something's existence is necessary for something else's nonexistence per se, which is what is needed to support the argument that denies the contingency of the universe. Hence, given the contingency of everything in the universe, it remains that there is a possible world without any contingent beings.

Whether this argument for the contingency of the universe is similar to that advanced by Aquinas in the Third Way depends on how one interprets Aquinas's argument. Aquinas holds that "if everything can not be, then at one time there was nothing in existence." Plantinga, among others, points out that this may commit a quantifier mistake, for the reason noted above (Plantinga, 6; Kenny, 56-66). However, Haldane (Smart and Haldane, 132) defends the cogency of Aquinas's reasoning on the grounds that Aquinas's argument is fallacious only on a temporal reading, but Aquinas's argument employs an atemporal ordering of contingent beings. That is, Aquinas does not hold that over time there would be nothing, but that in the per se ordering of causes, if every contingent thing in that order did not exist, there would be nothing.

To avoid any hint of the Fallacy of Composition and to avoid these complications, Koons (198-99) formulates the argument for the contingency of the universe as a mereological argument. If someting is contingent, it contains a contingent part. The whole and part overlap, and by virtue of overlapping, have a common part. Since the part in virtue of which they overlap is wholly contingent, the whole likewise must be contingent.

Rowe (1975, 166) develops a different argument to support the thesis that the universe must be contingent. He argues that it is necessary that if God exists, then it is possible that no dependent beings exist. Since it is possible that God exists, it is possible that it is possible that no dependent beings exist. (This conclusion is licensed by the following modal principle: If it is necessary that if p then q, then if it is possible that p, it is possible that q.) Hence, it is possible that there are no dependent beings; i.e., that the universe is contingent. Rowe takes the conditional as necessarily true in virtue of the classical concept of God, according to which God is free to decide whether or not to create dependent beings.

3.3 Objection 2: Explaining the Individual Constituents Is Sufficient

Whereas Russell argued that the universe just is, David Hume held that when the parts are explained the whole is explained.

But the whole, you say, wants a cause. I answer that the uniting of these parts into a whole… is performed merely by an arbitrary act of the mind, and has no influence on the nature of things. Did I show you the particular causes of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable should you afterwards ask me what was the cause of the whole twenty. This is sufficiently explained in explaining the parts. (Hume 1980, part 9)

Sometimes it is true that the whole is sufficiently explained in explaining its parts, but not always. An explanation of the parts may provide a partial but incomplete explanation; what remains unexplained is why these parts exist rather than others, why they exist rather than not, or why the parts are arranged as they are. However, although this shows that Hume's principle that the whole is explained in explaining the parts is sometimes false, it does not show it is false in the case under consideration, namely, when the universe is treated as a set rather than as an aggregate. But suppose Hume is correct that the explanation of the parts explains the whole. In terms of what are the parts themselves explained? Each is explained either in terms of themselves or in terms of something else. The former would make them necessary, not contingent, beings. If they are explained in terms of something else, the entire collection still remains unaccounted for. For as Rowe notes:

When the existence of each member of a collection is explained by reference to some other member of that very same collection then it does not follow that the collection itself has an explanation. For it is one thing for there to be an explanation of the existence of each dependent being and quite another thing for there to be an explanation of why there are dependent beings at all. (Rowe 1975, 264)

But what if the parts are themselves necessary beings? Will not that suffice to explain the whole? Rundle argues that contrary to Aquinas, persistence in existence is not change and hence there is no reason to ask for a sustaining cause of what persists. Hence, the question of why there is something rather than nothing makes no sense, for it already presumes there is something (112-17).

Rundle does not reject the notion of necessary existence. What has necessary existence is causally independent. Matter has necessary existence, for though it undergoes change, the given volume of matter found in the universe persists, and as persisting matter does not have or need a cause. This accords with the Principle of Conservation of Mass-Energy, according to which matter and energy are never lost but rather transmute into each other. As indestructible, then, matter is the necessary being (147). Hence, though the material components of the universe are contingent vis-à-vis their form, they are necessary vis-à-vis their existence. On this reading, there is not one but many necessary beings, all internal to the universe.

Interestingly enough, this approach was anticipated by Aquinas in his third way in his Summa Theologica (I,q.2,a.3). Once Aquinas concludes that necessary beings exist, he then goes on to ask whether these beings have their existence from themselves or from another. If from another, then we have an unsatisfactory infinite regress of explanations. Hence, there must be something whose necessity is uncaused. As Kenny points out, Aquinas understands this necessity in terms of being unable to cease to exist (Kenny, 48). Although Aquinas understands the uncaused necessary being to be God, Rundle takes this to be matter-energy itself. Since Rundle's objection introduces the notion of causation in time, it is more appopriate to the kalām argument. We will return to this issue in section 4, when we consider that argument.

Finally, Richard Swinburne asks how far any explanation must go. Whereas traditional cosmological arguments contend that we need to explain the existence of every relevant contingent causal condition in order to explain another's existence (Scotus's ordering of per se causes), Swinburne terms this requirement the completist fallacy (1979, 73). Swinburne notes that an explanation is complete when "any attempt to go beyond the factors which we have would result in no gain of explanatory power or prior probability" (1979, 86). But explaining why something exists rather than nothing and why it is as it is gives additional explanatory power in explaining why a universe exists at all. Gale (1991, 257-8) concludes from this that if we are to explain the parts of the universe and their particular concatenation, we must appeal to something other than those parts. In response, one might move away from an emphasis on a strong Principle of Sufficient reason to a weaker formulation based on adequate evidence (Quinn).

3.4 Objection 3: The Causal Principle is Suspect

Critics of the argument contend that the Causal Principle or, where applicable, the Principle of Sufficient Reason, that underlies versions of the argument is suspect. As Hume argued, there is no reason for thinking that the Causal Principle is true a priori, for we can conceive of effects without conceiving of their being caused and what is conceivable is possible in reality (1993, IV). Neither can an argument for the application of the Causal Principle to the universe be drawn from inductive experience. Even if the Causal Principle applies to events in the world, we cannot extrapolate from the way the world works to the world as a whole (Mackie, 85).

Defenders of the argument reply that the Principles are necessary to make the universe intelligible (Taylor). Without such presuppositions, science itself would be undercut; utilization of the principles best accounts for the success of science, and indeed, for any investigatory endeavor (Koons). But even then, critics reply, the principle has only methodological and not ontological justification. As Mackie argues, we have no right to assume that the universe complies with our intellectual preferences for causal order. We can simply work with brute facts.

Clearly, the soundness of the deductive version of the cosmological argument hinges on whether principles such as that of Causation or Sufficient Reason are more than methodologically true and on the extent to which these principles can be applied.

3.5 Objection 4: The Conclusion is Contradictory

Immanuel Kant objected to the conclusion of the cosmological argument that a necessary being exists. Kant held that the cosmological argument, in concluding to the existence of a necessary being, argues for the existence of a being whose nonexistence is absolutely inconceivable. But the only being that meets this condition is the most real or maximally excellent being, the very concept of which lies at the heart of the ontological argument. Accordingly, the cosmological argument presupposes the cogency of the ontological argument. But since the ontological argument is defective, the cosmological argument that depends on it likewise must be defective (Kant, A606; Smart, in Haldane and Smart, 36-8).

However, the contention that the cosmological argument depends on the ontological argument is based on a confusion. The term necessary being can be understood in different ways. Kant, like some modern defenders of the ontological argument, understands "necessary being" as having to do with logically necessary existence, that is, with existence that is logically undeniable. But this is not the sense in which "necessary being" is understood in the cosmological argument. Necessity is understood in the sense of ontological or metaphysical necessity. A necessary being is one that if it exists, it cannot cease to exist, and correspondingly, if it does not exist, it cannot come into existence. Since such a concept is not self-contradictory, the existence of a necessary being is not intrinsically impossible (Reichenbach, chap. 6).

Mackie replies that if God has metaphysical necessity, God's existence is contingent, such that some reason is required for God's own existence (Mackie, 84). That is, if God necessarily exists in the sense that if he exists, he exists in all possible worlds, it remains logically possible that God does not exist in any (and all) possible world. Hence, God is a logically contingent being and so could have not-existed. Why, then, does God exist? The Principles of Causation or Sufficient Reason can be applied to the necessary being.

The theist responds that the Principle of Sufficient Reason does not address logical contingency, but metaphysical contingency. One is not required to find a reason for what is not metaphysically contingent. It is not that the necessary being is self-explanatory; rather, a demand for explaining its existence is inappropriate. Hence, the theist concludes, Hawking's question, "Who created God?" (Hawking, 174), is out of place (Davis).

In short, defenders of the cosmological argument defend the Causal Principle (or alternatively Principle of Sufficient Reason), but limit its application to contingent beings, whereas critics of the argument either question these principles or want to apply them to the necessary being.

4. The Kalām Cosmological Argument

A second type of cosmological argument, contending for a first or beginning cause of the universe, has a venerable history, especially in the Islamic tradition. Although it had numerous defenders through the centuries, it received new life in the recent voluminous writings of William Lane Craig. Craig formulates the kalām cosmological argument this way (in Craig and Smith 1993, chap. 1):

  1. Everything that begins to exist has a cause of its existence.
  2. The universe began to exist.
  3. Therefore, the universe has a cause of its existence.
  4. Since no scientific explanation (in terms of physical laws) can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe, the cause must be personal (explanation is given in terms of a personal agent)
This argument has been the subject of much recent debate, some of which we will summarize here.

4.1 The Causal Principle and Quantum Physics

The basis for the argument's first premise is the Causal Principle that undergirds all cosmological arguments. Craig holds that this premise is intuitively obvious; no one, he says, seriously denies it (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993, 57). Although at times Craig suggests that one might treat the principle as an empirical generalization based on our ordinary and scientific experiences (which would not be strong enough for the argument to succeed), ultimately, he argues, the truth of the Causal Principle rests “upon the metaphysical intuition that something cannot come out of nothing” (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993, 147).

The Causal Principle has been the subject of extended criticism. We addressed objections to the Causal Principle from a philosophical perspective earlier in 3.4. Some critics of the argument deny that they share Craig's intuitions about the Causal Principle (Oppy 2002a). Others raise objections based on quantum physics (Davies, 1984, 200). On the quantum level, the connection between cause and effect, if not entirely broken, is to some extent loosened. For example, it appears that electrons can pass out of existence at one point and come back into existence elsewhere. One can neither trace their intermediate existence nor determine what causes them to come into existence at one point rather than another. Neither can one precisely determine or predict where they will reappear; their subsequent location is only statistically probable given what we know about their antecedent states. Hence, “quantum-mechanical considerations show that the causal proposition is limited in its application, if applicable at all, and consequently that a probabilistic argument for a cause of the Big Bang cannot go through” (Smith, in Craig and Smith, 1993, 121-23, 182).

Craig responds that appeals to quantum phenomena do not affect the kalām argument. For one thing, quantum events are not completely devoid of causal conditions. Even if one grants that the causal conditions are not jointly sufficient to determine the event, at least some necessary conditions are involved in the quantum event. But when one considers the beginning of the universe, he notes, there are no prior necessary causal conditions; simply nothing exists (Craig, in Craig and Smith, 1993, 146; see Koons, 203).

For another, a difference exists between predictability and causality. It is true that, given Heisenberg's principle of uncertainty, we cannot precisely predict individual subatomic events. What is debated is whether this inability to predict is due to the absence of sufficient causal conditions, or whether it is merely a result of the fact that any attempt to precisely measure these events alters their status. The very introduction of the observer into the arena so affects what is observed that it gives the appearance that effects occur without sufficient or determinative causes. But we have no way of knowing what is happening without introducing observers into the situation and the changes they bring. In the above example, we simply are unable to discern the intermediate states of the electron's existence. When Heisenberg's indeterminacy is understood not as describing the events themselves but rather our knowledge of the events, the Causal Principle still holds and can still be applied to the initial singularity, although we cannot expect to achieve any kind of determinative predictability about what occurs given the cause.

At the same time, it should be recognized that showing that indeterminacy is a real feature of the world at the quantum level would have significant negative implications for the more general Causal Principle that underlies the deductive cosmological argument. The more this indeterminacy has ontological significance, the weaker is the Causal Principle. The more this indeterminacy has merely epistemic significance, the less it affects the Causal Principle. Quantum accounts allow for additional speculation regarding origins and structures of universes. In effect, whether Craig's response to the quantum objection succeeds depends upon deeper issues, in particular, the epistemic and ontological status of quantum indeterminacy and the nature of the Big Bang as a quantum phenomemon.

4.2 Impossibility of an Actual Infinite?

In defense of premise 2, Craig develops both a priori and a posteriori arguments to defend the second premise. His primary a priori argument is

  1. An actual infinite cannot exist.
  2. A beginningless temporal series of events is an actual infinite.
  3. Therefore, a beginningless temporal series of events cannot exist.

Since (7) follows validly, if (5) and (6) are true, the argument is sound. In defense of premise (5), Craig argues that if actual infinites that neither increase nor decrease in the number of members they contain were to exist, we would have rather absurd consequences. For example, imagine a library with an actually infinite number of books. Suppose that the library also contains an infinite number of red and an infinite number of black books, so that for every red book there is a black book, and vice versa. It follows that the library contains as many red books as the total books in its collection, and as many red books as red and black books combined. But this is absurd; in reality the subset cannot be equivalent to the entire set. Hence, actual infinites cannot exist in reality.

Craig's point is this. Two sets A and B are the same size just in case they can be put into one-to-one correspondence, that is, if and only if every member of A can be correlated with exactly one member of B in such a way that no member of B is left out. It is well known that in the case of infinite sets, this notion of ‘same size’ yields results like the following: the set of all natural numbers (let this be ‘A’) is the same size as the set of squares of natural numbers (‘B’), since every member of A can be correlated with exactly one member of B in a way that leaves out no member of B (correlate 0↔0, 1↔1, 2↔4, 3↔9, 4↔16,…). So this is a case — recognized in fact as early as Galileo (Dialogues Concerning Two New Sciences) — where two infinite sets have the same size but, intuitively, one of them appears to be smaller than the other; one set consists of only some of the members of another, but you nonetheless never run out of either when you pair off their members.

Craig uses a similar, intuitive notion of "smaller than" in his argument concerning the library. It appears that the set B of red books in the library is smaller than the set A of all the books in the library, even though both have the same (infinite) size. Craig concludes that it is absurd to suppose that such a library is possible in actuality, since the set of red books would simultaneously have to be smaller than the set of all books and yet equal in size.

Critics fail to be convinced by these paradoxes of infinity. When the intuitive notion of "smaller than" is replaced by a precise definition, finite sets and infinite sets behave somewhat differently. Cantor, and all subsequent set theorists, define a set B to be smaller than set A (i.e., has fewer members) just in case B is the same size as a subset of A, but A is not the same size as any subset of B. The application of this definition to finite and infinite sets yields results that Craig finds counter-intuitive but which mathematicians and logicians see as our best understanding for comparing the size of sets. They see the fact that an infinite set can be put into one-to-one correspondence with one of its own proper subsets as one of the defining characteristics of an infinite set, not an absurdity. Say that set C is a proper subset of A just in case every element of C is an element of A while A has some element that is not an element of C. In finite sets, but not necessarily in infinite sets, when set B is a proper subset of A, B is smaller than A. But this doesn't hold for infinite sets — we've seen this above where B is the set of squares of natural numbers and A is the set of all natural numbers.

Cantorian mathematicians argue that these results apply to any infinite set, whether in pure mathematics, imaginary libraries, or the real world series of concrete events. Thus, Smith argues that Craig begs the question by wrongly presuming that an intuitive relationship holds between finite sets and their proper subsets — that a set has more members than its proper subsets — must hold even in the case of infinite sets (Smith, in Craig and Smith 1993, 85). So while Craig thinks that Cantor's set theoretic definitions yield absurdities when applied to the world of concrete objects, set theorists see no problem so long as the definitions are maintained. Further discussion is in Oppy 2006, 137-54.

Why should one think premise (6) is true — that a beginningless series, such as the universe up to this point, is an actual rather than a potential infinite? For Craig, an actual infinite is a determinate totality or a completed unity, whereas the potential infinite is not. Since the past events of a beginningless series can be conceptually collected together and numbered, the series is a determinate totality. And since the past is beginningless, it has no starting point and is infinite. If the universe had a starting point, so that events were added to or subtracted from this point, we would have a potential infinite that increased through time by adding new members. The fact that the events do not occur simultaneously is irrelevant.

Craig is well aware of the fact that he is using actual and potential infinite in a way that differs from the traditional usage in Aristotle and Aquinas. For Aristotle all the elements in an actual finite exist simultaneously, whereas a potential infinite is realized over time by addition or division. Hence, the temporal series of events, as formed by successively adding new events, was a potential, not an actual, infinite (Aristotle, Physics, III, 6). For Craig, however, an actual infinite is a timeless totality that cannot be added to or reduced. “Since past events, as determinate parts of reality, are definite and distinct and can be numbered, they can be conceptually collected into a totality” (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993, 25). Hence, a further critical issue in the kalām argument is whether, as Craig suggests, completeness (in terms of being a determinate totality) characterizes an actual infinite, or whether an infinite formed by successive synthesis is a potential infinite (as Rundle holds, chap 8).

4.3 The Big Bang Theory of Cosmic Origins

Craig's a posteriori argument for premise 2 invokes recent cosmology and the Big Bang theory of cosmic origins. Since the universe is expanding as the galaxies recede from each other, if we reverse the direction of our view and look back in time, the farther we look, the smaller the universe becomes. If we push backwards far enough, we find that the universe reaches a state of compression where the density and gravitational force are infinite. This unique singularity constitutes the beginning of the universe — of matter, energy, space, time, and all physical laws. It is not that the universe arose out of some prior state, for there was no prior state. Since time too comes to be, one cannot ask what happened before the initial event. Neither should one think that the universe expanded from some initial ‘point’ into space. Since the Big Bang initiates the very laws of physics, one cannot expect any physical explanation of this singularity; physical laws used to explain the expansion of the universe no longer hold at any time before t>0.

One picture, then, is of the universe beginning in a singular, non-temporal event roughly 13-14 billion years ago. Something, perhaps a quantum vacuum, came into existence. Its tremendous energy caused it, in the first fractions of a second, to expand and explode, creating the four-dimensional space-time universe that we experience today. How this all happened in the first 10−35 seconds and subsequently is a matter of serious debate; what advocates of premise 2 maintain is that since the universe and all its material elements originate in the Big Bang, the universe is temporally finite and thus had a beginning.

4.4 The Big Bang Is Not An Event

The response to this argument from the Big Bang is that, given the Grand Theory of Relativity, the Big Bang is not an event at all. An event takes place within a space-time context. But the Big Bang has no space-time context; there is neither time prior to the Big Bang nor a space in which the Big Bang occurs. Hence, the Big Bang cannot be considered as a physical event occurring at a moment of time. As Hawking notes, the finite universe has no space-time boundaries and hence lacks singularity and a beginning (Hawking 116, 136). Time might be multi-dimensional or imaginary, in which case one asymptotically approaches a beginning singularity but never reaches it. And without a beginning the universe requires no cause. The best one can say is that the universe is finite with respect to the past, not that it was an event with a beginning.

Given this understanding of event, we could reconceive the kalām argument.

  1. If something has a finite past, its existence has a cause.
  2. The universe has a finite past.
  3. Therefore, the universe has a cause of its existence.
  4. Since space-time originated with the universe and therefore similarly has a finite past, the cause of the universe's existence must transcend space-time (must have existed aspatially and, when there was no universe, atemporally).
  5. If the cause of the universe's existence transcends space-time, no scientific explanation (in terms of physical laws) can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe.
  6. If no scientific explanation can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe, the cause must be personal (explanation is given in terms of a personal agent).

The problem with this formulation is with premise 8. Whereas behind premise 1 lays the ancient Parmenidean contention that out of nothing nothing comes, no principle directly connects finitude with causation. Critics contend that we have no reason to think that just because something is finite it must have a cause of its coming into existence. Grünbaum argues that events can only result from other events. “Since the Big Bang singularity is technically a non-event, and t=0 is not a bona fide time of its occurrence, the singularity cannot be the effect of any cause in the case of either event-causation or agent causation alike…. The singularity t=0 cannot have a cause” (Grünbaum 1994). Of course, if the Big Bang singularity is not an event, then by this reasoning other events cannot be the effect of it, which seems to remove all events and all effects.

Rundle defends this view of events by arguing that coming into and going out of existence are symmetrical and both are in time. Ontologically applying infinity to future events does not differ from applying it to past events. Beginning from today one can always add another day to the past or future, since an infinity of past days exists in the same way as an infinity of future days. Thus, just as a day in the future is only finitely distant from today, so any day in the past is finitely distant from today. The past, like the future, is only potentially infinite. In the former case, though the universe is finite, there was no initial event or beginning of material existence; for any given event there is a possible precedent event finitely distant from us in time. Similarly, in the future at any finite point in time, there is a possible subsequent event, so that though the future is finite, it does not require an end to the universe (180). But then either there is a possible prior and posterior stage to any event so that the material uiverse is actually infinite (which he rejects) or else matter is uncaused, with no beginning or end. He accepts the latter; matter-energy is neither caused nor indestructible.

Rundle's argument is suspect in that it assumes that going from the present to the past does not differ from moving from the past to the present; both involve actually finite though potentially infinite series. But although to count events from present to the past always means the event is a finite time-distance from the present, to get to the present from the beginningless past one would have to traverse an actual infinite without a starting point. The two movements are quite disparate, and as Craig (1979) argues, one cannot traverse an infinite. Where there is an indefinite past there is no reason that one has arrived at today rather than yesterday or tomorrow. [Craig defends his case using the example, derived from Bertrand Russell, of Tristan Shandy, who takes a year to write in his diary one day's events. This example has generated a literature of its own (Eells, Oderberg, Oppy 2002b)].

One response to Grünbaum's objection is to opt for broader notions of “event” and “cause.” We might broaden the notion of “event” by removing the requirement that it must be relational, taking place in a space-time context. In the Big Bang the space-time universe commences and then continues to exist in time measurable subsequent to the initiating singularity (Silk 2001, 456). Thus, one might consider the Big Bang as either the event of the commencing of the universe or else a state in which “any two points in the observable universe were arbitrarily close together” (Silk 2001, 63). As such, one might inquire why there was this initial state of the universe in the finite past. Likewise, one need not require that causation embody the Humean condition of temporal priority, but may treat causation conditionally, or perhaps even, as traditionally, a relation of production. Any causal statement about the universe would have to be expressed atemporally, but for the theist this presents no problem provided that God is conceived atemporally and sense can be made of atemporal causation.

4.5 A Non-finite Universe

Some have suggested that since we cannot ”exclude the possibility of a prior phase of existence” (Silk 2001, 63); it is possible that the universe has cycled through oscillations, perhaps infinitely, so that Big Bangs occurred not once but an infinite number of times in the past and will do so in the future. The current universe is a “reboot” of previous universes that have expanded and then contracted (Musser 2004).

The idea of an oscillating universe faces significant problems. For one, no set of physical laws accounts for a series of cyclical universe-collapses and re-explosions. That the universe once exploded into existence provides no evidence that the event could reoccur once, if not an infinite number of times, should the universe collapse. Even an oscillating universe seems to be finite (Smith, in Craig and Smith 1993, 113). Further, the cycle of collapses and expansions would not, as was pictured, be periodic (of even duration). Rather, entropy would rise from cycle to cycle, so that even were a series of universe-oscillations possible, they would become progressively longer (Davies 1992, 52). If the universe were without beginning, by now that cycle would be infinite in duration, without any hope of contraction. Third, though each recollapse would destroy the components of the universe, the radiation would remain, so that each successive cycle would add to the total. “The radiation ends up as blackbody radiation. Because we measure a specific amount of cosmic blackbody radiation in the background radiation, we infer that a closed (oscillating) universe can have undergone only a finite number of repeated bounces” or cycles, no more than 100 and certainly not the infinite number required for a beginningless series. “We reluctantly conclude that a future singularity is inevitable in a closed universe; hypothetical observers cannot pass through it, and so the universe probably cannot be cyclical” (Silk 2001, 380, 399).

The central thesis of the oscillating theory has been countered by recent discoveries that the expansion of the universe is actually speeding up. Observations of distant supernova show that they appear to be fainter than they should be were the universe expanding at a steady rate. “Relative dimness of the supernovae showed that they were 10% to 15% farther out than expected, … indicating that the expansion has accelerated over billions of years” (Glanz, 2157). The hypothesis that these variations in intensity are caused by light being absorbed when passing through cosmic dust is no longer considered a viable explanation because the most distant supernova yet discovered is brighter than it should be if dust were the responsible factor (Sincell). Some force in the universe not only counteracts gravity but pushes the galaxies in the universe apart ever faster. This increased speed appears to be due to dark energy, a mysterious type of energy, characterized by a negative pressure, composing as much as 70% of the universe. Dark matter, it seems, is overmatched by dark energy.[3]

4.6 Personal Explanation

Finally, something needs to be said about statement 4, which asserts that the cause of the universe is personal. Defenders of the cosmological argument suggest two possible kinds of explanation. Natural explanation is provided in terms of precedent events, causal laws, or necessary conditions that invoke natural existents. Personal explanation is given “in terms of the intentional action of a rational agent” (Swinburne, 1979, 20). We have seen that one cannot provide a natural causal explanation for the initial event, for there are no precedent events or natural existents to which the laws of physics apply. The line of scientific explanation runs out at the initial singularity, and perhaps even before we arrive at the singularity (at 10−35 seconds). If no scientific explanation (in terms of physical laws) can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe, the explanation must be personal, i.e., in terms of the intentional action of a rational, supernatural agent. One might wonder, as Rundle does, how a supernatural agent could bring about the universe. He contends that a personal agent (God) cannot be the cause because intentional agency needs a body and actions occur within space-time.

But acceptance of the cosmological argument does not depend on an explanation of the manner of causation by a necessary being. When we explain that the girl raised her hand because she wanted to ask a question, we can accept that she was the cause of the raised hand without understanding how her wanting to ask a question brought about her raising it. As Swinburne notes, an event is “fully explained when we have cited the agent, his intention that the event occur, and his basic powers” that include his ability to bring about events of that sort (1979, 33). Similarly, theists argue, we may never know why and how creation took place. Nevertheless, we may accept it as an explanation in the sense that we can say that God created that initial event, that he had the intention to do so, and that such an event lies within the power of an omniscient and omnipotent being; not having a body is irrelevant.

Paul Davies argues that one need not appeal to God to account for the Big Bang. Its cause, he suggests, is found within the cosmic system itself. Originally a vacuum lacking space-time dimensions, the universe “found itself in an excited vacuum state,” a “ferment of quantum activity, teeming with virtual particles and full of complex interactions” (Davies 1984, 191-2), which, subject to a cosmic repulsive force, resulted in an immense increase in energy. Subsequent explosions from this collapsing vacuum released the energy in this vacuum, reinvigorating the cosmic inflation and setting the scenario for the subsequent expansion of the universe. But what is the origin of this increase in energy that eventually made the Big Bang possible? Davies's response is that the law of conservation of energy (that the total quantity of energy in the universe remains fixed despite transfer from one form to another), which now applies to our universe, did not apply to the initial expansion. Cosmic repulsion in the vacuum caused the energy to increase from zero to an enormous amount. This great explosion released energy, from which all matter emerged. Consequently, he contends, since the conclusion of the kalām argument is false, one of the premises of the argument — in all likelihood the first — is false.

Craig argues that several problems face this scenario. For one thing, how can empty space explode without there being matter or energy? Since space is a function of matter, if no matter existed, neither could space, let alone empty space, exist. Further, if the vacuum has energy, the question arises concerning the origin of the vacuum and its energy. In short, merely pushing the question of the beginning of the universe back to some primordial quantum vacuum does not escape the problem of what brought this vacuum laden with energy into existence. A quantum vacuum is not nothing (as in Newtonian physics) but “a sea of continually forming and dissolving particles which borrow energy from the vacuum for their brief existence” (Craig 1993, 143). Hence, he concludes, the appeal to a vacuum as the initial state is misleading. Defenders of the argument affirm that only a personal explanation can provide the sufficient reason for the existence of the universe.

The issues raised by the kalām argument concern not only the nature of explanation and when an explanation is necessary, but even whether an explanation of the universe is possible (given the above discussion). Whereas all agree that it makes no sense to ask about what occurs before the Big Bang (since there was no prior time) or about something coming out of nothing, the dispute rests on whether there needs to be a cause of the first natural existent, whether something like the universe can be finite and yet not have a beginning, and the nature of infinities and their connection with reality.

5. An Inductive Cosmological Argument

Richard Swinburne contends that the cosmological argument is not deductively valid; if it were so, “it would be incoherent to assert that a complex physical universe exists and that God does not” (1979, 119). Rather, he develops an inductive cosmological argument that appeals to the inference to the best explanation. Swinburne distinguishes between two varieties of inductive arguments: those that show that the conclusion is more probable than not (what he terms a correct P-inductive argument) and those that further increase the probability of the conclusion (what he terms a correct C-inductive argument). In The Existence of God he presents a cosmological argument that he claims falls in the category of C-inductive arguments. However, this argument is part of a larger, cumulative case for a P-inductive argument for God's existence.

Swinburne notes that if only scientific explanations are allowed, the universe would be a brute fact. If the universe is finite, the first moment would be a brute fact because no scientific causal account could be given for it. If the universe is infinite, each state would be a brute fact, for though each state would be explained by the causal conditions found in prior states plus the relevant physical laws, there is no reason why any particular state holds true rather than another, since the laws of physics are compatible with diverse states. That is, although the features F of the universe at time t are explained by F at time t1 plus the relevant physical laws L, and F at t1 is explained by F and L at t2, given an infinite regress there is no reason why F or L at tn might not have been different than they were. Since F and L at tn are brute facts, the same holds for any F explained by F and L at tn. Hence, regardless of whether the universe is infinite or finite, if only scientific evidence is allowed, the existence of the universe and its individual states is merely a brute fact, devoid of explanation.

The universe, however, is complex, whereas God is simple. But if something is to occur that is not explained, it is more likely that what occurs will be simple rather than complex. Hence, though the prior likelihood of neither God nor the universe is particularly high, the prior probability of a simple God exceeds that of a complex universe. Hence, if anything is to occur unexplained, it would be God, not the universe. On the other hand, it is reasonable to appeal to God as an explanation for the existence of a complex universe, since there are good reasons why God would make such a complex universe “as a theatre for finite agents to develop and make of it what they will” (Swinburne 1979, 131). Consequently, if we are to explain the universe, we must appeal to a personal explanation “in terms of a person who is not part of the universe acting from without. This can be done if we suppose that such a person (God) brings it about at each instant of time, that L operates” (Swinburne 1979, 126). Although for Swinburne this argument does not make the existence of God more probable than not (it is not a P-inductive argument), it does increase the probability of God's existence (is a C-inductive argument) because it provides a more reasonable explanation for the universe than merely attributing it to brute fact.

Swinburne's point is that to find the best explanation, one selects among the possible theories the theory that provides the best explanation. In light of the complexity of the universe, which of the overarching theories of materialism, humanism, or theism provides the best explanation? Swinburne notes four criteria to be used to determine the best explanation: an explanation is justified insofar as it provides predictability, is simple, fits with our background knowledge, and explains the phenomena better than any other theory (1996, 26). He suggests that fit with background knowledge does not apply in the case of the cause of the universe, for there are no "neighbouring fields of enquiry" where we investigate the cause of the universe. Indeed, he suggests, this criterion reduces to simplicity, which for him is the key to the inductive cosmological argument (1996, chap. 3). Appeals to God's intentions and actions, although not leading to specific predictions about what the world will look like, better explain specific phenomena than materialism, which leaves the universe as a brute fact. Swinburne concludes that “Theism does not make [certain phenomena] very probable; but nothing else makes their occurrence in the least probable, and they cry out for explanation. A priori, theism is perhaps very unlikely, but it is far more likely than any rival supposition. Hence our phenomena are substantial evidence for the truth of theism” (Swinburne 1976, 290).

Why does Swinburne hold that God provide the best or ultimate explanation of the universe? Part of the answer is that the Principle of Causation does not apply to God or a necessary being. On the one hand, there can be no scientific explanation of God's existence, for there are neither antecedent beings nor scientific principles from which God's existence follows. On the other hand, the Principle of Causation applies only to contingent and not to necessary beings. Explanation is required only of what is contingent. It is not that God's existence is logically necessary, but that if God exists, he cannot not exist. That God is eternal and not dependent on anything for his existence are not reasons for his existence but his properties. (See 3.5 above for Mackie's discussion of this argument.)

A second reason for Swinburne is that explanation can be reasonably thought to have achieved finality when one gives a personal explanation that appeals to the intentions of a conscious agent. One may attempt to provide a scientific account of why someone has particular intentions, but there is no requirement that such an account be supplied, let alone be possible. We may not achieve any better explanation by trying to explain physically why persons intended to act as they did. However, when we claim that something happened because persons intended it and acted on their intentions, we can achieve a complete explanation of why that thing happened.

Third, appeal to God as an intentional agent leads us to have certain expectations about the universe: that it manifests order, is comprehensible, and favors the existence of beings that can comprehend it. For Swinburne, who in his works often discusses this antecedent probability, this accords with his predictability criterion. Finally, Swinburne introduces a fourth feature, namely, the simplicity of God that, by its very nature, makes further explanation either impossible or makes theism the best explanation.[4] This consideration leads to discussion of God's properties and the nature of simplicity.

Still, Mackie notes, raising the probability of God's existence is not of geat assistance, for “the hypothesis of divine creation is very unlikely.” (Mackie, 100). Indeed, it is very unlikely that a God possessing the traditional theistic properties exists. Hence, increasing the probability of something very unlikely initially leaves us with the unlikely. Swinburne's response is that although theism is perhaps very unlikely, it is far more likely than any supposition that things just happen to be. So we return to what constitutes the best explanation of the existence of the universe. Swinburne and his critics leave us with the difficulties of determining what counts as an adequate explanation, of defining simplicity, and of determining prior probabilities.

Finally, even if the Cosmological Argument is sound or cogent, the difficult task remains to show that the necessary being to which the cosmological argument concludes is the God of religion, and if so, of what religion. Rowe suggests that the cosmological argument has two parts, one to establish the existence of a first cause or necessary being, the other that this necessary being is God (1975, 6). It is not clear, however, that the second contention is an essential part of the cosmological argument. Although Aquinas was quick to make the identification between God and the first mover or first cause, such identification goes beyond the causal reasoning that informs the argument. Instead, to give any religious substance to the concept of a necessary being requires lengthy discussion of the supreme beings found in the diverse religions and careful correlation of the properties of a necessary being with those of a religious being, to discern compatibilities and incompatibilities (Attfield). Defenders of the cosmological argument point to the subsequent relevance of such a task; critics find themselves freed from such endeavors.


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Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Bonaventure, Saint | Clarke, Samuel | Duns Scotus, John | Hume, David | Kant, Immanuel | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | ontological arguments | Russell, Bertrand