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Descartes' Theory of Ideas

First published Wed Mar 14, 2007

“Idea,” in its various linguistic forms, has been used in many ways by many philosophers, ancient, medieval, and early modern. Unfortunately for our current purposes, it was also used in many ways by Descartes himself. Exegesis of his views is, as a result, both a challenging and inescapably contentious affair. Amongst the many problems a complete exegesis would make sense of are these:

  1. Descartes' uses of the term “idea” diverge from perhaps the original or primary scholastic use;
  2. He provides multiple non-equivalent definitions of the term, uses it to refer to as many as six distinct kinds of entities, and divides ideas inconsistently into various genetic categories;
  3. He makes a trio of apparently inconsistent distinctions concerning ideas, invoking other opaquely employed scholastic concepts;
  4. It's not clear that his “ideas” are consistent with his own ontology in general;
  5. What he says about ideas suggests a “veil of perception” account of cognition,[1] on which the cognizing mind is not directly “aware” of the external object itself, but only of some representative proxy; yet at the same time his texts sometimes indicate some form of direct cognition of the object itself;
  6. Ideas' most important epistemic property — that of being clear and distinct — is ill-defined and poorly explicated, to the point that debates arise about whether and which ideas have this property;[2]
  7. To this day there are divergent interpretations of Descartes' account of sensory processes and ideas, concerning where and how he distinguishes between them and intellectual processes and ideas, whether sensory ideas have representational content, what Descartes means by the “material falsity” of some (or all?) sensory ideas, what the ontological status of “secondary” qualities is, etc.

These issues may be divided, roughly, into the metaphysical and the epistemological, reflecting the central role ideas play in both domains for Descartes. Since Descartes' conception of “clarity and distinctness” is discussed elsewhere in SEP,[3] and since an adequate account of his views on sensation and its relationship to the intellectual would require a whole article in its own right, this entry will focus on (1)–(5) above, and thus primarily on the metaphysical issues and on intellectual ideas. Since many of the difficulties in Cartesian “ideas” arise from his simultaneously both reflecting and attempting to reject the relevant scholastic philosophy, we must begin there.

1. The Scholastic Background[4]

I used the word ‘idea’ because it was the standard philosophical term used to refer to the forms of perception belonging to the divine mind … (3rd Replies, II.127, AT VII.181)[5]

For Christian philosophers from Augustine onwards, “ideas” were commonly conceived to be the “forms of divine perception”: roughly, Platonic forms transported into the divine mind, where they served as archetypes according to which God created the particulars of the created world.[6] But this general formulation invited much scholastic debate over their precise nature: Are they eternal and necessary — and so perhaps uncreated — beings ontologically independent of God? Or are they in some way dependent on God or God's intellect? If the latter, would that mean that actual being somehow comes in degrees, since the “being” of “being-known” seems “less real” than that of mind-independent beings? Are they actual universal beings — since many created particulars can instantiate the same form — or are they too as particular as the created beings “modeled” on them? Or are they best construed as merely possible beings, i.e. as essences which are possibly (but not always actually) instantiated in the created world? But then what are those? Nor was it straightforward simply to identify them with God Himself, for ideas and essences are all limited in a way that God is not. Aquinas suggested that they be identified with the various finite ways in which God's infinite being may be imitated, but that just buries the problem deeper: What are these “possible modes of imitation,” exactly, and how are they to be grounded in a purely actual being?

At the same there was equally much debate about the nature of human cognition. Through an enormous thicket of jargon — forms, essences, intentions, species, notions, concepts, phantasms, images, agent and patient intellect, etc — roughly the following general picture emerged. The cognitive process — the activity of coming to know the world — begins in the world, works through the senses, and culminates in the intellect. The form of some sensible quality — such as (say) the color red — “informs” some matter or object, and is then transmitted through the relevant medium (such as the air) to the relevant sensory organ (the eye), and ultimately to the intellect. The object instantiates or “realizes” the form “formally,” such that the object becomes actually red; but the air and the eye realize the form only “intentionally,” as a species, which means that they carry the red “information” without themselves actually becoming red. The form realized in the eye results in an act of sensation “directed towards” or “attentive of” that quality. The immaterial intellect may then in turn, by a complex process, extract or abstract the form in order to contemplate it, as it were, at which point the original object or quality is fully cognized or perceived or understood.

A few key points:

  1. The account reflects the Aristotelian doctrine that in cognizing, the cognizer becomes identical to or “like” the thing cognized (De Anima 5, 7 (430a20, 431a1)): the thing and the sense organ and the intellect all realize the very same form, albeit in different manners or modes.
  2. Intentional species were generally held to causally mediate cognition without themselves being objects of cognition, i.e. “what” is cognized.[7] The relevant form insofar as it informs the medium, sense organs and/or perhaps even the intellect, in other words, directs the latter not to the transmitting media nor to the states of the sense organ themselves, nor to its own states, but to the original quality or object initiating the sequence. Consequently the scholastic account is generally interpreted as one of “direct cognition.”[8]
  3. Species are said to “represent” the external quality or object, which means, at the least, that they make the thing knowable or known. But they perform this function by virtue of the fact that they “resemble” or are “similar” to the thing they represent. Due to this resemblance they are sometimes referred to as “images” of things, which gives rise to the picture — later ridiculed by Descartes (Optics I, I.153-4, AT VI.85) — that objects continuously slough off little images of themselves in order to allow our cognition of them. But Descartes' ridicule here was not perfectly fair. The scholastics were well aware that something which does not formally instantiate a sensible quality does not literally resemble the thing which does. All they meant by invoking terms such as “image” and “resemblance” was that species carry information (in-“form”-ation) about — i.e. the form of — the quality despite themselves not (formally) instantiating the quality: species are images of and resemble the object only insofar as the same form is (differently) realized in each.[9] In any case, as we'll see shortly, Descartes himself sometimes uses the notions of “image” and “resemblance” in just the same way.

How, then, are ideas qua archetypes in the divine mind connected to this account of human cognition? The very short answer might start with this text from Aquinas:

…[T]he human soul knows all things in the eternal types, since by participation of these types we know all things. For the intellectual light itself which is in us, is nothing else than a participated likeness of the uncreated light, in which are contained the eternal types …. But since besides the intellectual light which is in us, intelligible species, which are derived from things, are required in order for us to have knowledge of material things; therefore this same knowledge is not due merely to a participation of the eternal types, as the Platonists held … (ST 1.84.a5, 427)

Universal forms are present in the divine intellect. On the basis of these God creates the world, bringing these forms to be realized, formally, in the world, particularized through matter. Through the processes of human cognition these same forms come to be in the human intellect. Aquinas's (and scholasticism's) empiricist bent is reflected in the requirement that we proceed via deriving the forms, ultimately, “from things,” as sketched above — at the same time as it is recognized that our intellect's ability to extract or abstract forms also involves an ultimately divine “light.”

Descartes, of course, rejects many of the particulars of the doctrines above, since his ontology leaves no room for the sorts of “forms” (such as those of colors) being discussed. Nevertheless, as we'll see, he appears to adopt the account in its broader strokes, mutatis mutandis. Indeed, the very fact that he co-opts the term “idea” from its original use with respect to divine perception and applies it to human cognition is some evidence for this suggestion.

Once the link is made between the forms in the divine and human intellects, now, many of the problems mentioned above arise again in the new context. In particular, there's much scholastic debate over the precise nature of and relationships between forms, objects, acts of cognition, and the cognizers themselves. Already in Aquinas we read the following, as part of his argument that species mediate cognition without being objects thereof:

Hence that by which the sight sees is the likeness of the visible thing; and the likeness of the thing understood, that is, the intelligible species, is the form by which the intellect understands. But since the intellect reflects upon itself, by such reflection it understands both its own act of intelligence, and the species by which it understands. Thus the intelligible species is that which is understood secondarily; but that which is primarily understood is the object, of which the species is the likeness …[I]t follows that the soul knows external things by means of its intelligible species. (ST 1.85.a2, 434)

As we noted, when the relevant form is “in” a state or act of thinking (say), the mind (or that state) is (somehow) “directed towards” the object (or the form qua present in the object). Consequently an act or state of thinking may be considered in at least two ways: as a state or property intrinsic to a thinker, and as a mechanism by which the thinker is related to the external object, O, thought about. Similarly, the act or state of thinking may perhaps be considered as a “way” in which O exists in the intellect, as “O-in-thought”: after all, both actually being a particular object O and being a thought of O involve the “same” form being realized (if in different media or ways).[10] Although a strong distinction was made between an actually existing external O and the act of thinking about O, much debate occurred over precisely what sorts of distinctions to make (if any) between the external O and O-in-thought, and between O-in-thought and the act of thinking, especially in cases where O does not actually exist in external reality. The core questions were these: Must O-in-thought be granted its own mode of (actual) being somehow distinct from the act of thought itself? If so, what is that kind of being — the being of “being-known” — exactly? Must O-in-thought stand as a “third thing,” a tertium quid, between the cognizing mind and the external O (if there is one), thus introducing the “veil of perception”? Or could O-in-thought possibly be identified either with the act of the thought or O itself, thus eliminating it as a distinct ontological category?

By the time of Suárez, these debates had crystallized around what he calls the “common distinction” (vulgaris distinctio) between a formal and an objective concept. He writes:

When we conceive of a man, the act which we perform in our minds … is called the ‘formal concept,’ while the man known and represented by that act is called the ‘objective concept.’ [The latter] is doubtless called a ‘concept’ by an extrinsic denomination from the formal concept through which, as it is said, the ‘object’ is conceived — and so it is properly [also] called ‘objective,’ because it is not conceived as a form intrinsically terminating the conception, but as an object and subject-matter with which the formal concept is concerned and towards which the mind's gaze is immediately directed. (DM 2.1.1, transl. Ayers 1998 (1099))

The formal concept is called a “concept,” (conceptus) from the verb to conceive (concipere), because it is, Suárez notes, “as if an offspring of the mind” (veluti prolis mentis) (DM 2.1.1:25, 64-65); the thinking-of-O involves O being taken into or generated in the mind just as biologically conceiving of O involves O being taken into or generated in a womb. As Wells 1990 notes, “it is designated as ‘formal’ because it is the ‘final form of the mind’ (ultima forma mentis), or because it ‘formally represents’ (formaliter repraesentat) to the mind the thing known, or because it is ‘the intrinsic formal terminus of the act of mental conception’ (intrinsecus et formalis terminus conceptionis mentalis)” (40).[11] The formal concept, then, just is the act of a mind, and as such realizes (formally) some relevant mental form, to make it that very mental act; but at the same time it realizes (intentionally) the form of some object or quality O, which makes the act to be “of” O.

This latter leads to the “objective concept,” i.e. to the thing which is “known and represented” by the mental act.[12] Note that the objective concept does not do the representing; it is, rather, the thing represented by the formal concept, which does. It is called a “concept” only “by extrinsic denomination,” insofar as (in being thought) it is related to the act of mind which in the strictest sense is a concept. It is called an “object” insofar as the mental act is not directed (merely) towards either itself, nor towards the form intentionally realized in the act, but towards the object itself (formally) realizing that form. While the formal concept, as an actual act or state of a mind, is always a “true positive thing inhering as a quality in the mind” (DM 2.1.1, 25, 65) and is thus always a singular or particular, the same is not always the case for the objective concept: we can conceive of mere “beings of reason” (such as privations), and of universals (such as “man”), and of mere possibilities, or “possible essences.” One can say of such things that, though not actually existing in the world, they have, qua objective concepts, “objective being.”

As a result, however, Suárez's “common distinction” does not itself solve any of the problems mentioned above, but merely provides a terminology for expressing them. For it is tempting to identify the objective concept with some externally existing object until we recognize that, in many cases, there is no such object available. This point is particularly pressing with respect to possible essences, commonly invoked to provide a ground for the eternal truths involved in essential predication. When we think of a perfect triangle, or a chiliagon, or even of some possible animal not actually existent, the object of our thought, the objective concept, is a possible essence. But what sort of being, precisely, does that thing enjoy, particularly insofar as it doesn't actually exist in the world? Well, the being of “being-thought.” But what is that, and how is related to the act of thinking, etc.?

There is much scholarly debate over how precisely to interpret Suárez's views on these questions. Readers familiar with the secondary literature on Descartes will recognize that precisely analogous debate occurs over interpreting Descartes' views on the very same questions. Roughly, the logical geography of the competing interpretations of both philosophers mirrors that of all the possible theories relating the relevant entities. Even restricting ourselves to the paradigm case of an act of thought T about some actually existing external object O, we have at least the following options:

  1. Admit only T and O into our ontology. Here talk of “objective concepts” (or the “objective being” of O) has no ontological commitment distinct from that of the being of T or O.
  2. Admit T and O, plus some tertium quid Q, which enjoys an “objective being” distinct from the being of T and O.

But now both (a) and (b) come in two versions. On (a1), T is related in some intrinsic way to O, while on (a2) T is related only extrinsically to O. Thus on (a1) we might say something like “T is O-itself-existing-in-thought,” while on (a2) we might merely say that T terminates at O, or represents O. Similarly, on (b1) the tertium quid Q is related to O in some intrinsic way, while on (b2) it is not. Thus on (b1) we might think of Q as O-existing-in-thought, while on (b2) we wouldn't, and instead think of Q as (say) some mental thing representing O.

But now, unfortunately, (a1), (a2), (b1), and (b2) themselves each come in two versions. Suffice to say that the dividing factor is whether T or Q are taken to be objects of cognition, i.e. “what” we cognize, or merely causal intermediaries in the cognitive process. The former is prone to generate a “veil of perception,” while the latter is not.

These are a lot of options from which to choose. It's no surprise that the scholastics spent centuries debating which is the best theory, nor that contemporary scholars spend years debating interpretations both of the various scholastics and of Descartes. Roughly, contemporary debate about Descartes' theory of ideas — and so his theory of cognition — amounts to an attempt to locate him in the logical space above, and the various points we'll explore below constitute some of the arguments supporting different locations. For now, our main conclusion is merely this modest one: despite Descartes' 1st-Meditation-fueled reputation as developing his philosophy from scratch, his conception of and doctrines concerning ideas not only do not come out of an intellectual vacuum, but in fact are extracted from something more resembling a plenum.

Sources/Further Reading: Cronin 1966, Wells 1967, O'Neill 1974, Doyle 1984, Yolton 1984, Normore 1986, M. Adams 1987, Hoffman 1990, Wells 1990, Grene 1991, Wells 1993, Ariew & Grene 1995, Pasnau 1997, Ayers 1998, Hatfield 1998, Hoffman 2002, King 2005, Lagerlund 2005, and mental representation in medieval philosophy.

2. The What and the Whence of Cartesian Ideas

So what are “ideas,” according to Descartes? Here are just some of his definitions or relevant texts:

  1. I use the word ‘idea’ to mean everything which can be in our thought… (To Mersenne 16 June 1641, III.183-4)
  2. …[A]n idea is the thing which is thought of in so far as it has objective being in the intellect. (1st Replies, II.74, AT VII.102)
  3. Idea. I understand this term to mean the form of any given thought, immediate perception of which makes me aware of the thought. (2nd Replies, II.113, AT VII.160-1; cf. 3rd Replies, II.132, AT VII.188)
  4. …I am taking the word ‘idea’ to refer to whatever is immediately perceived by the mind. For example, when I want something … I simultaneously perceive that I want … and this is why I count volition … among my ideas. (3rd Replies, II.127, AT VII.181)
  5. Some of my thoughts are as it were the images of things, and it is only in these cases that the term ‘idea’ is strictly appropriate — for example, when I think of a man, or a chimera, or the sky, or an angel, or God. (3rd Med., II.25, AT VII.37)

The difficulties are immediately apparent. In (5) ideas are equated with our thoughts, or acts of thinking, some of which are “as it were images.” But it's clear that Descartes doesn't mean “image” literally here, as a kind of visual picture, since his examples include the idea of “God,” of whom we can form no such image. In (1) “idea” is applied not to our thoughts but to that which can be “in” our thoughts, which would seem to include all sorts of non-mental things, “in” our thoughts at least in the sense that these are what we can think of. But (2), invoking a scholastic term, suggests there's a special way of “being” in our thought, viz. objective being, which raises the question of how or whether these objective (perhaps mental) beings are identifiable with (or otherwise related to) the non-mental things external to mind. In (3) “idea” is applied specifically to the “form” of the thought — another scholastic term — “immediate perception of which” makes us aware of the thought itself. (4) may imply that what is “immediately perceived” is not a form but the act of thinking itself (but then again may not). We see within these definitions all the elements generating our logical geography above: the act of thinking, the object-in-thought (which may or may not be a mind-dependent being), the external object, and the “immediate” object of cognition. As unhelpfully as perhaps possible, Descartes uses the term “idea” rather indiscriminately for all of them.

Even worse, in his earlier works Descartes was inclined also to refer to various images in the brain as ideas.[13] And though he abandons this use in his later work, that's not so much a change of view as a clarification. Continuing definition (3) above, he writes:

… [I]t is not only the images depicted in the imagination which I call ‘ideas.’ Indeed, in so far as these images are in the corporeal imagination, that is, are depicted in some part of the brain, I do not call them ‘ideas’ at all; I call them ‘ideas’ only in so far as they give form to [informant] the mind itself, when it is directed towards that part of the brain. (2nd Replies, II.113, AT VII.160-1)

Corporeal images merited the term “idea,” in other words, insofar as they were related in some way to thought; just as, perhaps, external objects may merit the term “idea” insofar as they, as objects thought of or as objects-in-thought, are related to thought. This allows us, at least, to grasp the unifying theme of all these applications of “idea”: it is Descartes' generalized term for perhaps all the elements relevant to a theory of human cognition.

There is possibly one more important use. When discussing innate ideas Descartes is prone to speak of dispositions: roughly, to have an innate idea is to have a disposition towards forming certain thoughts on certain occasions. What is less than perfectly clear is whether the disposition is meant to be identified with the idea itself or merely with the manner in which the idea is stored in the mind. If the former, then we have a new use of “idea,” to refer to certain mental dispositions; but if the latter, then “idea” may be restricted to its previously discussed uses.[14]

What, then, are Cartesian ideas? Depending on context (and interpretation) the term may refer to: some (or all) of our acts of thinking, the external objects we think of (qua thought-of), objective (perhaps mental) beings, the forms of our acts of thinking, images in the brain, or certain kinds of mental dispositions we have with respect to all the preceding. What all these share, as noted, is their relevance to the theory of human cognition. To work out Descartes' “theory of ideas,” then, is to determine the nature of each of these elements and exactly how they're all related to each other. If the word “idea” itself is not used with perfect consistency — by him, or subsequently by us — then so be it.

As to the whence of Cartesian ideas:

Among my ideas, some appear to be innate, some to be adventitious, and others to have been invented by me. My understanding of what a thing is, what truth is, and what thought is, seems to derive simply from my own nature. But my hearing a noise, as I do now, or seeing the sun, or feeling the fire, comes from things which are located outside me, or so I have hitherto judged. Lastly, sirens, hippogriffs and the like are my own invention. (3rd Med., II.26, AT VII.37-38)

This passage appears to explain where his ideas at least seem to come from: his own nature (innate), from outside (adventitious), or from his invention. But immediately there's a small problem: the third category might reduce to the prior two, for his “invention” of ideas may involve only a recombination of ideas he already has, presumably from the first two sources. And then there's a slightly larger problem: in a later work Descartes offers an account of the origin of ideas inconsistent with the preceding.

…[I]n no case are the ideas of things presented to us by the senses just as we form them in our thinking. So much so that there is nothing in our ideas which is not innate to the mind or the faculty of thinking …. Nothing reaches our mind from external objects through the sense organs except certain corporeal motions … But neither the motions themselves nor the figures arising from them are conceived by us exactly as they occur in the sense organs … Hence it follows that the very ideas of the motions themselves and of the figures are innate in us. The ideas of pain, colours, sounds, and the like must be all the more innate … for there is no similarity between these ideas and the corporeal motions [which cause their production]. (Comments, I.304, AT VIIIB.358-9)

According to this text, it would seem, all ideas are innate, including the very sensory ideas which were paradigms of adventitious ideas in the earlier text.

But fortunately this problem is easily resolved: Descartes merely appears to be using “innate” in different senses between the two texts. In the later text an idea is innate insofar as it may be grounded in our very faculty or power of thinking; and since the Cartesian mind is created with the ability, roughly speaking, to think of or experience everything it will in fact think of or experience, then every such thought or experience (i.e. idea) will count as innate:

Consequently these ideas, along with that faculty [of thinking], are innate in us, i.e. they always exist within us potentially, for to exist in some faculty is not to exist actually, but merely potentially … (Comments I.305, AT VIIIA.360)

In the earlier text, to the contrary, the genetic distinction appears to concern the immediate causal origin of the ideas: adventitious ideas are those (perhaps typically) triggered externally, invented ideas are those whose construction entirely depends on our own relatively unconstrained will, and innate ideas are those we form (or actualize) not merely on the basis of our will but by reasoning or self-reflection.[15] So construed, ideas which are not innate in the earlier sense may count as innate in the later sense.[16]

Sources/Further Reading: McRae 1965, Kenny 1968, McRae 1972, R. Adams 1975, Costa 1983, Chappell 1986, Jolley 1990, Schmaltz 1997, Gorham 2002, and Nadler 2006.

3. Formal, Material, Objective

In so far as the ideas are <considered> simply <as> modes of thought, there is no recognizable inequality among them … But in so far as different ideas <are considered as images which> represent different things, it is clear that they differ widely. (3rd Med., II.27-28, AT VII.40; cf. Principles I.17, I.198-9, AT VIIIA.11)

In this text Descartes famously introduces the distinction between

(a) “formal reality” and “objective reality.”

The formal reality of ideas corresponds to what they are, “intrinsically,” or “actually,” viz. states or acts or modes of thinking. All ideas are, formally, on a par, sharing the same “degree” or kind of formal reality. But at the same time it is the nature of such states to “contain” or represent external objects,[17] and insofar as ideas vary here they are not all on a par:

Undoubtedly, the ideas which represent substances to me … contain within themselves more objective reality than the ideas which merely represent modes or accidents. (3rd Med., II.28, AT VII.40)

Our concern won't be with the ontological “hierarchy” here, but with the notion that ideas have or contain an “objective reality” corresponding to the object they represent, or at least “may be considered” as such.

Note, to start, that distinction (a) is similar to another distinction concerning not ideas directly but the “modes of existence” of objects: the sun (say) exists “formally” in the sky but may also exist “objectively,” “in” a mind or intellect, insofar as someone is thinking of it. Since Descartes is explicit that the former is “really” distinct from the latter,[18] we'll speak, for convenience, of the “formal sun” and the “objective sun.” The obvious temptation now would be to equate or identify the objective sun with the objective reality of the idea of the sun, but that would be too quick. Since Descartes also suggests that the objective and formal realities of an idea in fact are two aspects of some single thing, two ways an idea “may be considered,” these are not “really” but merely “conceptually” distinct[19] — but then the objective sun would be really identical not merely to the objective reality of the idea of the sun but also to the formal reality of that idea, since these are really identical. In short, the objective sun would be identified with the idea simpliciter:

… [T]he idea of the sun is the sun itself existing in the intellect — not of course formally existing, as it does in the heavens, but objectively existing, i.e. in the way in which objects normally are in the intellect. (1st Replies, II.75, AT VII.102-03)

This result naturally opens a large can of (fortunately, objective) worms. The core problem is that the objective sun here seems to enjoy some kind of identity both with the act of thought (as just described) and with the formal sun, since the objective sun is in some sense the “sun itself” — and yet the act of thought is really distinct from the formal sun. But of course this problem is familiar by now: we have here the usual suspects — the act of thought, the object-in-thought, and the external object —described in the roughly Suárezian vocabulary from Section 1 above, so we ought to expect the usual problems in working out their precise natures and relations. Teasing it all apart will take some work. But first Descartes complicates the picture by introducing two other, apparently inconsistent distinctions.

In another famous passage, Descartes writes:

When M. Arnauld says ‘if cold is merely an absence, there cannot be an idea of cold which represents it as a positive thing,’ it is clear that he is dealing solely with an idea taken in the formal sense. Since ideas are forms of a kind, and are not composed of any matter, when we think of them as representing something we are taking them not materially but formally. If, however, we were considering them not as representing this or that, but simply as operations of the intellect, then it could be said that we were taking them materially, but in that case they would have no reference to the truth or falsity of their objects. (4th Replies, II.162-3, AT VII.232)

Here we have what appears to be the same distinction as in (a): an idea may be considered or “taken” (sumpta) in terms of what it is actually, intrinsically, in itself, i.e. an operation or act of thought, or it may be taken in terms of the external thing it contains or represents. But the terminology changes, as the distinction is now said to be between

(b) an idea taken “materially” v. taken “formally,”

where in distinction (a) the “formal” reality of the idea seems equivalent to the idea taken in the “material” sense here! As if that weren't confusing enough, Descartes elsewhere also writes:

…[T]here is an ambiguity here in the word ‘idea.’ ‘Idea’ can be taken materially, as an operation of the intellect, in which case it cannot be said to be more perfect than me. Alternatively, it can be taken objectively, as the thing represented by that operation; and this thing, even if it is not regarded as existing outside the intellect, can still, in virtue of its essence, be more perfect than myself. (Preface to Med., II.7, AT VII.8)

Again, apparently we have the same distinction, here said to be between

(c) an idea taken “materially” v. taken “objectively,”

where the “material” sense corresponds to the “material” sense of (b); only now, he uses “objective” where he used “formal” in (b), but just as he'd used it in (a). Overall, then, the word “material” seems to be used with the same meaning in (b) and (c), but is absent from (a); the word “objective” seems to be used with the same meaning in (a) and (c), but is absent from (b); and the word “formal” seems to switch dramatically in meaning between (a) and (b), but is absent from (c).

The problems here are more than merely terminological, unfortunately; for while it does appear to be the same underlying distinction in play in (a)-(c) — and indeed all three are invoked in and around the Meditations — even that underlying distinction seems susceptible to differing interpretations with different metaphysical implications. On the one hand, the distinction may be roughly a semantic one: the word “idea” can be used to refer to two distinct entities, viz. an act of thought and the object of that thought — where, pending resolution of Descartes' ontology, the object may be either a mental object in some way distinct from the thinking mind, or some actual external or abstract object itself. On the other hand, the distinction might be meant as a metaphysical one: ideas just are entities with a two-fold nature, or with two distinguishable aspects, viz. they are modes-of-thought-‘containing’-objects, i.e. modes-of-thought-with-representational-content. When Descartes invokes (a) and (b) he sounds as if he may, possibly, have the latter in mind; when he speaks of the “ambiguity” of the word “idea,” in invoking (c), he sounds as if he may, possibly, have the former in mind. Either way, once again we have the usual suspects in play, and thus all the familiar problems.

The central question, of course, is the nature of the objective reality of ideas, or, alternatively, of the objective mode of existing of objects. We noted above that Descartes seems to want to identify the objective sun (for example) both with the act of thought and the formal sun, while noting these latter two are really distinct. But in addition to some of the texts we've seen, various aspects of Cartesian metaphysics in general themselves seem to pull in opposing directions here, thus sharply deepening this difficulty.

  1. On the one hand, Descartes notes that the formal reality of his idea does not have the same causal requirements as its objective reality, which may imply that the objective sun is really distinct from the act of thought:
    The nature of an idea is such that of itself it requires no formal reality except what it derives from my thought, of which it is a mode. But in order for a given idea to contain such and such objective reality, it must surely derive it from some cause which contains at least as much formal reality as there is objective reality in the idea. (3rd Med., II.28-29, AT VII.41)

    Indeed, his very application of his causal principle — “…that there must be at least as much <reality> in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause” (3rd Med., II.28, AT VII.40) — to the objective reality of ideas itself strongly suggests that the objective sun might somehow be identified with the formal sun, the sun itself, since each requires a cause of equivalent reality or stature.

  2. On the other hand, his general dualist substance-mode ontology would seem to rule out any mental objects distinct from a mind, and so reinforce the identity between the objective sun and the act of thought. Nor would it do here to identify the objective sun with a physical object, the formal sun, as (1) does, since the objective sun has something to do with the objective reality of an idea, and an idea, Descartes insists, “is never outside the intellect” (2nd Replies, II.74, AT VII.102) — which the formal sun most certainly is.

  3. On a third hand, Descartes stresses the mind-independence of the objectively existing essences providing the objective reality of at least some of his ideas (5th Med., II.44-45, AT VII.64). Though there's debate over just what the mind-independence amounts to,[20] it too at least suggests strengthening the distinction between the objective sun and the act of thought, as in (1). But at the same time, contra (1), Descartes also admits objective beings which may not even have any actually existing formal counterparts at all (5th Med., II.44-45, AT VII.64) — in which case there's no external formal thing with which they may be identified.

Ayers 1998 offers a particularly succinct way of stating the problem, to which the preceding three points have been supplying arguments for the opposed responses:

The question could be put as follows. Which is the mere [conceptual distinction], and which the real distinction: (1) the distinction between the idea as mode of thought and the idea as intentional object of thought [i.e. the objective being] or (2) the distinction between the latter … and the real object (the thing as it exists in reality)? It seems clear that, at least on ordinary realist assumptions, there cannot be one thing, the idea, which is really identical both to the mode of thought and to the real object. (Ayers 1998, 1067)

Ayers notes that much rides on the answer: If (2) is the conceptual distinction, for example — so there is no real distinction between the objective and formal suns — then we have support for a “direct cognition” interpretation of Descartes: that ideas are the “immediate” objects of thought wouldn't preclude a sense in which external objects are as well. The problems here of course include those just noted: the objective and formal object couldn't be really identical since the former is “in” the intellect in a way the latter isn't, and the account must explain the cases where no relevant formal object exists extra-mentally. If, on the other hand, (1) is the conceptual distinction, it's not apparent how thought ever makes contact with the external world, since the object of thought turns out to be really identical just to the act of thinking itself. Further, there are the problems just noted, including that the real distinction between the objective and formal sun leaves unexplained Descartes' insistence that the objective sun just is the sun itself.

Ayers himself asserts that Descartes takes (1) to be the conceptual distinction. But Ayers makes no effort to accommodate the conflicting tensions both in the Cartesian texts and in his metaphysics, as expressed in points (1) and (3) above. Nor does he accommodate the apparent hint of direct cognition in Descartes' suggestion that the mind grasps the sun itself.

We can do better.

Sources/Further Reading: Kenny 1970, Chappell 1986, Jolley 1990; Bennett 1994, Chappell 1997, Nolan 1997, Ayers 1998, Hoffman 2002, Clemenson 2005, Nadler 2006, and Rozemond (forthcoming).

4. Cartesian Ontology, and Ideas

Let us remind ourselves of four of the basic elements of Descartes' ontology.

  1. All created entities are either substances or properties of substances (Principles I.48, I.208, AT VIIIA.22).
  2. Created substances are either mental or physical in nature, i.e., either minds or bodies (Principles I.48, I.208, AT VIIIA.23). Each kind has a principal attribute — thought and extension respectively — and each has corresponding properties, which are construed as modifications or “modes” of that principal attribute (Principles I.53, I.210, AT VIIIA.25).
  3. Descartes generally rejects scholastic hylomorphism, aspects of which were sketched in Section 1 above.[21] In brief, this was the theory that created things are composed of matter and form. The matter here is not physical matter, but rather a kind of indeterminate potentiality which becomes actualized when in-formed by a form. Forms were generally understood as kinds of universals or essences but, unlike those of the Platonic variety, were not conceived to have any independent ontological status but rather only to exist when particularized “in things,” either formally or intentionally.[22] Forms divide into “substantial forms,” which make something into the kind of thing it is and thus bestow its essential properties and characteristic behaviors on it, and “accidental forms” which bestow its non-essential or contingent properties on it. That Descartes rejects hylomorphism is supported by (i) his generally negative remarks about it, (ii) the fact that he dispenses with it in his physical science, and (iii) items (1) and (2) in his ontology above: his substances are capable of existing independently in a way that substantial forms (requiring “matter”) ordinarily are not, and properties qua “modifications” seem attached to a substance more intimately than accidental forms would be.[23]
  4. Descartes has at least an inclination towards nominalism, i.e. the view that everything that exists is a particular:[24]
    …[N]umber, when it is considered simply in the abstract or in general, and not in any created things, is merely a mode of thinking; and the same applies to all the other universals, as we call them … These universals arise solely from the fact that we make use of one and the same idea for thinking of all individual items which resemble each other: we apply one and the same term [nomen] to all the things which are represented by the idea in question, and this is the universal term. (Principles I.58-59, I.212, AT VIIIA.27)

    This sounds like a traditional nominalist position: there are no genuinely universal beings, we merely apply the same term [nomen] or idea to particular things which resemble each other. Indeed Descartes goes so far as to claim that universals are merely “modes of thinking,” suggesting they have no mind-independent reality at all.

Overall, then, Descartes subscribes to a substance-mode, dualist, anti-hylomorphist, and nominalist-inclining ontology. Yet much in our discussion of Cartesian ideas, so far, was possibly in tension with this ontology. There were suggestions that objective beings might be mental objects which are not minds, or that mental states somehow “contain” (otherwise) mind-independent, non-mental objects such as bodies, or even abstract or universal beings. We've also seen Descartes invoke the hylomorphic “matter-form” terminology in his various distinctions. Any coherent exegesis of Cartesian ideas must make sense of these conflicting tendencies.

It must also make sense of his conflicting terminologies. We saw, in Section 3, that Descartes had three distinctions in play with respect to ideas, invoking these terms:

  1. formal v. objective,
  2. material v. formal,
  3. material v. objective.

Since these seemed to be three ways of stating the same (if ambiguous) distinction, two questions arise: Why introduce all these terms? And why does “formal” seem to shift so dramatically in meaning between (a) and (b)? With these questions in mind, let's now see what we can learn by revisiting Descartes' also conflicting definitions of “idea” from Section 2.

The word “form” in definition (3) naturally calls hylomorphism to mind. Again, as Aquinas writes:

Now Plato held … that the forms of things subsist of themselves apart from matter … by participation of which he said that our intellect knows all things: so that just as corporeal matter by participating the [form] of a stone becomes a stone, so our intellect, by participating the same [form], has knowledge of a stone. But since it seems contrary to faith that forms of things should subsist of themselves, outside the things themselves and apart from matter … Augustine … substituted the types of all creatures existing in the Divine mind, according to which types all things are made in themselves, and are known to the human soul. (ST 1.84.a5, 427)

The form of a stone in matter makes the matter (formally) a stone; the same form “in intellect” does not make the intellect formally into a stone, but only intentionally, by “forming it” into the thought of a stone. Augustine, placing these forms into the divine mind, called them “ideas.” And we can now appreciate, I think, just how deliberately Descartes chooses the term “idea” for the elements of human cognition: for his account of human cognition, ultimately, invokes entities playing precisely the same role that forms played for the scholastics.

We see this in definition (3), to be sure: an idea is the form of a thought. That suggests that mind is playing a role much like that of hylomorphic matter: in itself it is, in a sense, indeterminate, a potential or capacity for thought or thinking, but when in-formed it becomes a determinate thought, i.e. one with a determinate object or content.[25] In light of this, Descartes' distinction (b) makes perfect sense: a thought (or mind) considered “in itself” or intrinsically is like matter, and only insofar as it is in-formed, or considered with respect to a form, and thus to an object, is it taken “formally.” In our current example the form in question would be the form of the stone.

But forms, of course, also make something what it actually (formally) is. If the form of the stone makes matter into a formal stone, then the Cartesian dualist might also entertain forms for the mind, mental forms which make a mind (and particular mental states) formally into minds and mental states respectively. And indeed Descartes observes that some of his thoughts, in addition to representing objects (thus counting as “ideas”), “have various additional forms: thus when I will, or am afraid, or affirm … my thought includes something more than the likeness of [its object]” (3rd Med., II.25-26, AT VII.37; cf. 3rd Replies, II.128, AT VII.182-82). But of course there's an important difference here between the case of the physical stone and that of mental entities. The stone can ultimately be described, for Descartes, as a modification of extension, in precise, quantifiable terms, as some sort of mathematical essence. The mental forms here determining the category of representational state — viz. willing, fearing, etc. — enjoy nothing more precise than that vocabulary itself. More importantly, no account is given here of what mental form turns the state into one with that particular representational content. As Malebranche would later critique Descartes, we might say here that we lack a perfectly “clear idea” of the mind:[26] we do not conceive of mind in a way allowing us to understand its modes or states, or at least none comparable to the way our conception of mathematics affords us a grasp of the nature of extended matter and its modifications.

Still, we have enough now to also make sense of Descartes' distinction (a). The notion of “form” in play there is not that (say) of the stone, but that indescribable one which makes the mind what it actually or intrinsically is; in the common scholastic idiom we saw in Suárez in Section 1, this “formal” will contrast with “objective,” which invokes the object represented or its form. And this partly answers one of our questions: the apparently dramatic shift in meaning of “formal” between (a) and (b) is not so dramatic, as “formal” refers to forms in both. In our thinking of a stone, we can now see, there appear to be two forms in play: the form of the stone, and the relevant (if indescribable) form of the mind or mental state. When invoking (a), Descartes' focus is on the latter; when invoking (b), on the former.

What, then, about distinction (c)? We saw earlier that Descartes appears to take all three distinctions to be equivalent, and we can now see how this may be so: (c) merely combines the hylomorphic “material” with the common scholastic idiom of “objective.” This in turn partially answers our other question: Descartes uses this shifting vocabulary because all of it means what he wants it to mean, and would be familiar to his readers as so meaning. Its messiness, in other words, derives from his predecessors' own terminological profligacy.

But now reading Descartes as adopting, in broad strokes, this scholastic account of cognition, has the additional virtue of making sense of his varying definitions of “idea” from Section 2. Definition (1) reflects the fact that objects can be “in” our thought, i.e. insofar as their forms in-form our minds. Definition (5) asserts that ideas are thoughts which are “as it were images,” where “image” invokes the notion of some sort of (non-literal, non-pictorial) likeness or resemblance between the thought and its object. As we saw in Section 1, forms were frequently referred to as “images” precisely when they were intentionally realized either in species or in the mind, and we can now see Descartes to be following suit: Our thought of a stone is an “image” of the stone insofar as the form of the stone (intentionally) in-forms our mind. Definition (2) reflects a similar point: a thing has objective being in the intellect insofar as its form intentionally in-forms the mind. And of course definition (3): If the mind is like “matter,” it only becomes determined into a particular mode or thought, with an object, once in-formed. The “idea”-ness of a thought, its having an object, is thus traced to its form. Similarly for definition (4): it's precisely by their “forms” (as we saw) that mental states become the type they are, thus volition etc. count as ideas by virtue of their forms.

But (3) and (4) also introduce something new: the notion of “immediate perception.” In (3) the idea is the form of a thought “immediate perception of which makes me aware of the thought”; in (4) the mind “immediately perceives” that it's willing, etc., which (again) is traced to the forms of its states. To simplify we'll ignore the mental forms responsible for generating the categories of representational states, and thus focus on (3) and the problem of representational content. The idea in (3) is the “immediately perceived form,” but as we've seen, there are apparently two in play: the form of the object of the thought (the stone), and the mental form of the thought itself qua representational state. So which one is relevant here?

To read Descartes in broadly scholastic terms is to recognize that they both are — and they both are because they are one and the same. As with the scholastics, when the form is realized in matter you get a formal, actual, particular stone; when that very same form is realized in a Cartesian mind, now, you get a particular thought of a stone.

A scholastic reading of Descartes appears to have a number of advantages:

(1) It's economical. With respect to substance dualism, the one form does both sorts of work: (formally) modifies matter, and (intentionally) modifies mind. Or with respect to the mind alone, the one form does both sorts of work: modifies the mind, and provides it with its representational content.

(2) Descartes appears to hold that all thought is representational, i.e. that it's the very nature of mind to represent (3rd Med., II.25, AT VII.36-37; II.29, AT VII.42).[27] But it also seems that our only epistemic access to the nature of our mind is via the contents of our thoughts. What we know in knowing our thoughts, in other words, are their objects. Thus definition (3): our immediate perception of the form of a given thought makes us aware of the thought. Which form is that? The form of the stone. It is both that which gives the thought its object AND that which makes the thought what it actually is, viz. a thought of a stone. Descartes has no need to specify “which” form is in play here, because there is only one.

Or to put this point more metaphysically: given the mind's nature to represent, thoughts are partly individuated by their contents.[28] If so, then that form which bestows content on the state is also that which determines what state it is. If some other form were required for the latter, then we'd need an entire theory relating the modes of the mind, individuated by nameless forms, to their representational contents, a theory conspicuously lacking in Descartes. Or even more succinctly: Cartesian minds are, primitively, “thought-makers,” which on receiving the forms of objects become thoughts of those objects. No distinct mental forms are necessary for representational content, just as the scholastic reading suggests.

(3) We saw a moment ago that Descartes' shift in meaning of the term “formal” between distinctions (a) and (b) was not actually that dramatic. In light of definition (3) we can now see that it may in fact be no shift at all — if the same form provides the “formal” in both (a) and (b)!

(4) A fourth advantage of the scholastic reading is that it affords a general, coherent account of the various conflicting metaphysical tendencies raised in Section 3.

We saw there, for example, that the objective sun seemed to enjoy some kind of identity both with the act of thought (since the formal and objective reality of an idea seemed to be two aspects of some single thing) and with the formal sun (since the objective sun is in some sense the “sun itself”) — and yet the act of thought is really distinct from the formal sun. But this tension is now easily satisfied: the act of thought is really identical to the objective sun, since both are constituted by the mind-informed-by-the-sun-form; the objective sun is the sun itself, since the very same form constitutes both the objective and formal suns (if in different media); and the act of thought remains really distinct from the formal sun.[29]

Similarly, we saw both that the objective being and the formal being of an object require causes of equal stature while the objective and formal realities of an idea differ in causal requirements; further, that Descartes sometimes stresses the mind-independence of objectively existing essences. These points supported distinguishing the objective sun from the act of thought and perhaps even identifying it with the formal sun. Yet at the same time Descartes also restricted objective beings to the mind: they're never “outside the intellect,” and sometimes no formal being exists to correspond to them.

But these tensions are now also satisfiable. Objective and formal beings require equal causes due to their sharing the same form. Yet that the objective and formal realities of an idea differ in causal requirements need not require that they be really distinct, for a conceptual distinction may support diverse causal explanations: The informed mind is a mind-thinking-of-O; when we “consider” it “intrinsically,” we need only invoke causes sufficient to create the finite mind, while when we “consider” it as “of-O” we need to invoke a cause sufficient to make it that particular state, of-O, which involves the form of O.[30] Meanwhile objective beings are naturally restricted to the mind, since objective beings are forms-realized-in-mind. If a given form is realized in mind and not in matter, we'll have an objective being that does not correspond to a formal one, but there's nothing particularly metaphysically problematic about that. But even if there does exist a corresponding formal being, nothing here requires a real identity between the objective and formal beings; they will share a form, but be really distinct instantiations or particularizations of that form. Finally objective essences may be mind-independent in the sense that the contents (or possible states) of our thoughts are not “up to us”: an objectively existing triangle may reasonably be said to contain all the essential properties of a triangle whether I notice it or like it or will it or not.[31] But whatever the final account of that fact, it doesn't entail that the objectively existing triangle itself exists “outside” the mind.

Lastly, Ayers' Descartes placed the real distinction between the objective and formal suns, as the scholastic Descartes does, thus identifying the objective sun with the act of thought. But Ayers made no effort to accommodate the conflicting tensions in the Cartesian texts above, and indeed, left as a major problem the hint of direct cognition in Descartes' suggestion that the mind grasps the sun itself: if the objective sun is identified with the act of thought, and so in thinking of the sun the mind is only aware of its own state, how does the mind make cognitive contact with the external world? The scholastic reading, to the contrary, supplies what Ayers' thesis lacked: the conflicting tensions are resolved as above, and the direct cognition is accommodated, as we'll see further in Section 5, by the fact that the very same form constituting external objects also in-forms the mind.

(5) The scholastic reading's fifth and final advantage is that it provides a coherent account of Descartes' overall ontology, as sketched at the start of this section. Three points in particular need attention: (i) Descartes rejects scholastic hylomorphism, yet often invokes the hylomorphic vocabulary; (ii) his objective beings sometimes seem to be mental objects which are not minds, or kinds of mental states which somehow “contain” non-mental objects, both of which seem inconsistent with his dualist, substance-mode ontology; and (iii) the mind-independent essences sometimes constituting his objective beings often seem to be abstract or universal beings, despite his inclination towards nominalism.

(i) Descartes' bark about hylomorphism is in general far worse than his bite: he does not so much reject it as refurbish it in accord with the mechanical philosophy.[32] Gone are the vast array of particular scholastic forms conjoined with hylomorphic matter in the physical world (such as those constituting “secondary” qualities and perhaps the genera-species of scholastic essences), but in their place are roughly analogous mechanical, and ultimately mathematical, essences (Principles IV.198, I.285, AT VIIIA.321-23; To Regius, January 1642, III.206-209, AT III.499-509). Gone are the sensible and intelligible species which convey the scholastic forms ultimately to the cognizing intellect, but in their place is matter in motion conveying “in-form-ation” about the surface textures of objects to the sensory organs, then onwards to the pineal gland, which in turn leads the cognizing mind to sense or understand, such that the object of cognition “itself” is now “present to the mind” (Optics 4-6, I.165ff., AT VI.112ff.; 6th Replies, II.295, AT VII.437; Principles IV.197-8, I.284-5, AT VIIIA.320-23; cf. O'Neil 1974). Nothing in this refurbishing precludes Descartes' accepting the basic scholastic notion that the same “form” — i.e. mathematical essence — may enjoy two kinds of realization, corresponding to his two kinds of substances. That Descartes expresses his account of cognition in thoroughly scholastic terms, and (again) that he chose the word “idea” in the first place, is perhaps the strongest evidence that he embraces the account in its broad outline, while differing in the important particulars above.

(ii) Texts suggestive of “mental objects” are understandable: the mind's awareness of its state of thinking, which is individuated by its form, is at the same time awareness of the object of the state which formally is (or would be) constituted by that form. Equally understandable is talk of these objects as “in the mind”: there's a real identity, after all, between the objective being and the act of thought. And so too we can understand the sense in which non-mental objects are “contained” in thought: the same form which, by in-forming matter, constitutes the object, by in-forming the mind constitutes a thought of that object. But nothing here violates Descartes' dualist, substance-mode ontology — at least on the obviously crucial assumption that his forms — which we'll now speak of interchangeably with his (ultimately mathematical) “essences” — do not.

(iii) Unfortunately, the ontological status of Cartesian essences is a matter of much dispute, as is, consequently, the question whether they truly fit within his overall ontology. A proper account of this issue would require its own article, so here I must be overly brief.

The major positions on Cartesian essences are roughly these:

  1. Essences are mind-independent, universal, abstract entities, like Platonic forms (Kenny 1968, 1970);
  2. Essences are grounded in the human cognitive structure, i.e. our capacities for thinking. That there “is” a triangle essence containing the essential properties of triangles, then, means merely that our minds are so structured that we cannot conceive of triangles without, ultimately, ascribing them their essential properties (Bennett 1994, Chappell 1997, Nolan 1997);[33]
  3. Essences just are the objects which have those essences (Cunning 2003);
  4. Essences are to be identified either with divine decrees or with the contents thereof (Schmaltz 1991, Rozemond (forthcoming)).

Each position finds some textual support. 5th Med., for example, displays a strong hint of (A) in its insistence on the eternal, immutable, (human) mind-independent status of essences. We saw in Principles, to the contrary, the nominalist inclination which may support (B). That Descartes denies a real distinction between (say) a substance and its attributes is some evidence for (C) (To ***, 1645 or 1646, III.280-1, AT IV.349-51). And in Descartes' mysterious doctrine of the divine creation of eternal truths — and thus of essences, with which the eternal truths are identified (To [Mersenne], 5/27/30, III.25, AT I.152) — we may find indications of (D). Yet another Cartesian conundrum — but one which perhaps, too, may be made intelligible by a scholastic reading.

When an essence in-forms a mind, the result is an act of thought whose content is determined by the essence. But we saw just above that that content may be mind-independent in the sense that it is not up to us, in particular to our wills, what must be included in the content. If that's not up to us, then what it is up to — the Cartesian God's eternal, immutable will — is free to confer that eternality and immutability on the content (To Mersenne, 4/15/30, III.23, AT I.145-46; To [Mesland], III.235, AT IV.118-19). But that fact does not require that essences ever exist except when realized or particularized in matter or minds. Thus we may make sense of the Platonic-sounding texts without reaching the Platonist conclusion. So much for (A).

(B) is more of a contender. For the scholastic Descartes, mental states are individuated by the essences realized in them, which may support identifying essences and our cognitive structure and so make sense of the texts supporting (B). Yet (B) may not do full justice to Descartes' references to “eternal” essences, since our minds are not eternal. Further, these “same” essences may be realized in matter as well. These points suggest that the essences are in some sense “prior” to our cognitive structures.

(C), similarly, has something right about it, insofar as essences do in-form matter; but it, too, may not do full justice to their eternality, and in particular, may struggle with the cases where essences exist “in thought” without any formally existing external object with which to identify them.

What about (D)? For our purposes we need not distinguish between its two versions: given the Cartesian God's simplicity, there can be no real distinction between God's “decrees” and their contents, just as we saw there to be none between the objective and formal realities of human ideas. And though we cannot engage here with the complex mysteries of Descartes' creation doctrine, we can observe at least an element of truth in (D): ultimately all Cartesian things must find their source in the Cartesian God, including essences. As such (D) gets closest to accommodating the eternality and mind-independence of essences supporting (A) while avoiding the demerits of (B) and (C).

Still we must note that (D) need not exactly rule out (B) and (C):

First, briefly, divine simplicity entails that the distinctions we make in God — between His perfections, faculties, decrees, etc. — are merely conceptual ones. Following a long scholastic tradition, Descartes will hold that anything we say about God involves our applying our very limited concepts to something with respect to which they are not fully adequate. But then our very characterization of the divine essence — as omnipotent, omniscient, infinite, etc. — will be determined by our own cognitive structure. And since it's that characterization which ultimately grounds Descartes' affirmation of (D) — and since it is our cognitive structure which determines how/what essences we can grasp in the first place — we have a sense, distinct from the earlier one, in which our cognitive structure might in fact be “prior” to the essences.

Second, more generally, Descartes' God's perfection precludes His systematically deceiving us (4th Med., II.37, AT VII.53). He has thus created us with a cognitive structure which accurately maps the general structure of reality, i.e. the complete set of what's possible; but this structure in turn maps neatly onto the structure of God's will, to the degree to which it's intelligible, since He is the causal source of all possibilities. While the order of explanation certainly starts with God, it may be a matter of taste to decide whether to identify the essences with the divine decrees or their content or with the minds and matter which are their causal consequences, or even all of the above. After all, it's the “same” essence present in all domains.

Similarly, lastly, perhaps the biggest problem for (D) arises from the fact that Descartes holds not only that God is the efficient cause of essences but that God is not the efficient cause of Himself (4th Replies, II.164-6, AT VII.235-7). Since, by divine simplicity, there can be no real distinction between God and His decrees (or their contents), it would seem that essences cannot be identified with divine decrees without entailing, contra Descartes, that God is the efficient cause of Himself. But the availability of (B) and (C) mitigate this problem: the very same essences present in the divine decrees are also present in creatures, as realized either in minds or in matter. Since creatures are uncontroversially the products of God's efficient causation, we can make sense of Descartes' claim that God is the efficient cause of essences without giving up (D).[34]

It may not matter, then, whether we ultimately go with (B) or (C) or (D), or all three (more or less). None raises an immediate problem for Descartes' ontology, which indisputably accepts minds with their cognitive structure, bodies with mechanical essences, and God with His decrees and their contents. Nevertheless a deeper problem is brewing. The Cartesian essences, even if “originating” with God, are realized not merely “in” God's decrees but also (consequently) in finite minds and matter. But does that mean we must say that essences are universal beings, and thus inconsistent with Descartes' nominalist leanings?

Let us briefly return to the Principles text above:

…[N]umber, when it is considered simply in the abstract or in general, and not in any created things, is merely a mode of thinking; and the same applies to all the other universals, as we call them … These universals arise solely from the fact that we make use of one and the same idea for thinking of all individual items which resemble each other: we apply one and the same term to all the things which are represented by the idea in question, and this is the universal term. (Principles I.58-59, I.212, AT VIIIA.27)

There are several important points here:

First, nothing in this text in fact is inconsistent with the scholastic Descartes. Descartes insists that universals — essences — “considered simply in the abstract or in general,” are merely “modes of thinking,” but that is consistent with allowing that universals, considered “in created things,” in fact also are realized in those things. He speaks of items resembling each other, but nothing precludes that resemblance's being a matter of their sharing the “same” essence. His account whereby material particulars are subsumed under an idea is both one of explaining the origin of an idea as well as its ability to represent a multiplicity; but when he says that universals are “modes of thinking,” he is merely saying that, when they are not realized in matter, they are realized only in mind. What he is keen to deny is just that essences exist in that mind-independent, Platonic way, which we may falsely think when we think about them “in the abstract or in general.”

Indeed Descartes quite explicitly refers to the idea as a “universal.” In the quoted text he calls it a “universal term” [quod nomen est universale], and in other parts of the text he makes several references to the “universal idea” [quae ideò est universalis]. There can be no doubt that he considers our individual acts of thought to be particulars, but insofar as these have the same “content,” they become, as he says in the text, “one and the same idea” (my italics): what we have is a “universal essence” realized in diverse acts of thought. In light of the considerations in the preceding paragraph, there is no reason to resist allowing a universal essence to be realized in diverse material particulars as well.

Finally, Descartes is quite clear that there is no real distinction between a thing's existence and its essence (To ***, 1645 or 1646, III.280-1, AT IV.349-351). What he does allow is a real distinction between the objective object and the formal object, but in the former we have an essence realized in mind, and in the latter, an essence realized in matter. The realizations of this essence, in mind and in matter, are really distinct, or “token-distinct”; but he simply lacks the resources (and on the scholastic account the motive) to treat the “essence” in this case itself as token-distinct across the instances. But if one and the same essence is realized in two media, we do indeed have a universal essence.

The conclusion, then? For Descartes, every existing thing is indeed a particular, and that will satisfy his nominalist inclinations. But that is consistent with allowing universal aspects or natures, i.e. essences, as long as these only “exist” insofar as they are realized in particulars.[35] Now realism about universals comes in many varieties, as does nominalism, and the position we've ascribed to Descartes may lean more towards the realist end of the spectrum than towards the nominalist. What's important to note, however, is that Descartes is concerned to reject a Platonic realism. Whether the resulting position still merits the label “realism” — perhaps “Aristotelian-scholastic realism” — is a merely terminological issue.

The broadly scholastic account of Cartesian ideas, then, nicely ties together the disparate elements of his ontology.

Sources/Further Reading: Kenny 1968, Kenny 1970, Brown 1980, Schmaltz 1991, Bennett 1994, Garber 1994, Chappell 1997, Nolan 1997, Bolton 1998, Rozemond 1998, Cunning 2003, Pessin 2003, Rozemond (forthcoming), Aristotle's psychology, medieval theories of universals, and properties.

5. Ideas and Direct Cognition[36]

The Cartesian texts often suggest, as we've seen, that (i) ideas are the “immediate” objects of our thoughts, (ii) they are never “outside the intellect,” (iii) they're distinct from the act of thought, but (iv) they can't be identified with any formal, external object, etc. Put these together and you've got strong hints at a doctrine in which ideas “veil” us off cognitively from the world: “what” we are aware of “directly,” in cognition, are only ideas, and not external objects themselves. Similarly we saw, in Section 3, Ayers' observation that the conceptual distinction between the act of thought and the objective being seemed to preclude our having cognitive contact with anything other than our own acts of thought, and thus also to support a “veil.” Yet at the same time, there are also hints of direct cognition in Descartes, in, for example, his insistence that the objective sun is the “sun itself,” and more generally in his account of “simple natures” which are both manifest in the physical world and directly graspable by the mind (Rules 12, I.39ff., AT X.411ff.; cf. O'Neil 1974). Fortunately the scholastic reading of Descartes can make sense of this final Cartesian conundrum as well.

What Ayers has failed to consider, on the scholastic Descartes, is the significance of the sameness of form across realizations in matter and in mind. There is a real distinction between the act of thought (objective being) and the formal being, but their sameness in form supports what we might call an identity in reason between them. Thus the act of thought is made determinate by a form, so constituting the objective being, while one and the same form is particularized in matter. This allows Descartes to say both, as we've seen, that our “immediate perception” of the form of a thought makes us aware of the act of thought itself, and that the objective sun — the object of our thought — is the sun itself. This is how the mind makes “cognitive contact” with the world, pace Ayers' concerns: the same form realized out there is also realized in here, and awareness of one is therefore awareness of the other. There is no tertium quid serving as an object of cognition.

So yes, ideas are “only in the intellect,” and may be the “immediate objects of awareness”; we can thus make sense of many of the texts supporting the “veil.” Nevertheless the identity in reason — the sameness of form — between the in-formed mind and in-formed matter ensures that the in-formed mind constitutes a thought “directed towards” the object, and the Cartesian intellect may be said to be (directly) aware of (say) “the sun itself.” Consequently, but unsurprisingly, the scholastic Descartes may be seen as subscribing to “direct cognition,” exactly (as we saw in Section 1) as his scholastic predecessors are generally taken to do.[37]

This doesn't solve every problem for the exegesis of Cartesian ideas, naturally. Most importantly, we've been focusing on “intellectual” ideas, the paradigm examples of which are the mathematical essences which can be realized in the physical world; we've not addressed the problem of “sensory” ideas, of which we certainly seem directly aware yet which do not and cannot in fact be manifest in the physical world of Descartes' mechanical philosophy. But that is a problem for another day.[38]

Sources/Further Reading: Lennon 1974, O'Neil 1974, Yolton 1975, Yolton 1984, Cook 1987, Nadler 1989, Wilson 1990, Tipton 1992, Wilson 1994, Simmons 1999, Hoffman 2002, Clemenson 2005, and Pessin 2007.


Let us close by situating this account in the logical geography sketched at the end of Section 1, focusing on the paradigm case of an act of thought T about some actually existing external object O. While Descartes appears to speak of a kind of tertium quid, Q, viz. an objective being, the mere conceptual distinction between Q and the act of thought T indicates that he grants Q no distinct being from that of T, thus putting us into option (a). Given the “sameness of form” doctrine, T is “intrinsically related” to O, putting us into (a1). Finally, in light of the real identity between T and the objective being, and the identity in reason between the latter and O, then T may indeed count as an object of cognition — but not in a way which in fact, after all, generates a “veil of perception.”[39]


Primary Sources


[ST] Summa theologica, transl. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1948/1981).


[De Anima] “On the Soul,” transl. by J. A. Smith, in ed. Richard McKeon, Introduction to Aristotle (2nd Edition) (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1973), 153-247. References are to the page, column, and line numbers of the Berlin Academy edition (1831-1870).


[AT] Oeuvres de Descartes, eds. C. Adam & P. Tannery (Paris: 1897-1910 and 1964-1978; Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, 1996). References are to volume and page number.
[CSM] The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, v. I, II, transl. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, & D. Murdoch, and v. III, transl. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, & A. Kenny (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1984, 1985, 1991). References are to volume and page number.
[Comments] Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, in CSM I.
[Med] Meditations on First Philosophy, in CSM II.
[Optics] Optics, in CSM I.
[Principles] Principles of Philosophy, in CSM I.
[Replies] Objections and Replies, in CSM II.
[Rules] Rules for the Direction of the Mind, in CSM I.
[Treatise] Treatise on Man, in CSM I.


[Elucidations] Elucidations of The Search After Truth, transl., ed., Thomas Lennon, in Search.
[Search] The Search after Truth, transl./ed. by Thomas Lennon and Paul Olscamp (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1997).


[DM] Disputationes Metaphysicae, in Opera Omnia, ed. Carolo Berton (Paris: Vives, 1856-66), vols. 25-26.

Secondary Sources

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Aristotle, General Topics: psychology | Descartes, René: epistemology | Descartes, René: modal metaphysics | properties | universals: the medieval problem of


Translations in the text are the author's own unless otherwise indicated.