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Ancient Logic

First published Wed Dec 13, 2006

Logic as a discipline starts with the transition from the more or less unreflective use of logical methods and argument patterns to the reflection on and inquiry into these and their elements, including the syntax and semantics of sentences. In Greek and Roman antiquity, discussions of some elements of logic and a focus on methods of inference can be traced back to the late 5th century BCE. The Sophists, and later Plato (early 4th c.) displayed an interest in sentence analysis, truth, and fallacies, and Eubulides of Miletus (mid-4th c.) is on record as the inventor of both the Liar and the Sorites paradox. But logic as a fully systematic discipline begins with Aristotle, who systematized much of the logical inquiry of his predecessors. His main achievements were his theory of the logical interrelation of affirmative and negative existential and universal statements and, based on this theory, his syllogistic, which can be interpreted as a system of deductive inference. Aristotle's logic is known as term-logic, since it is concerned with the logical relations between terms, such as ‘human being’, ‘animal’, ‘white’. It shares elements with both set theory and predicate logic. Aristotle's successors in his school, the Peripatos, notably Theophrastus and Eudemus, widened the scope of deductive inference and improved some aspects of Aristotle's logic.

In the Hellenistic period, and apparently independent of Aristotle's achievements, the logicians Diodorus Cronus and his pupil Philo (see the entry Dialectical school) worked out the beginnings of a logic that took propositions, rather than terms, as its basic elements. They influenced the second major theorist of logic in antiquity, the Stoic Chrysippus (mid-3rd c.), whose main achievement is the development of a propositional logic, crowned by a deductive system. Considered by many in antiquity as the greatest logician, he was innovative in a large number of topics that are central to contemporary formal and philosophical logic. The many close similarities between Chrysippus' philosophical logic and that of Gottlob Frege are especially striking. Chrysippus' Stoic successors systematized his logic, and made some additions.

The development of logic from c. 100 BCE to c. 250 CE is mostly in the dark, but there can be no doubt that logic was one of the topics regularly studied and researched. At some point Peripatetics and Stoics began taking notice of the logical systems of each other, and we witness some conflation of both terminologies and theories. Aristotelian syllogistic became known as ‘categorical syllogistic’ and the Peripatetic adaptation of Stoic syllogistic as ‘hypothetical syllogistic’. In the 2nd century CE, Galen attempted to synthesize the two traditions; he also professed to have introduced a third kind of syllogism, the ‘relational syllogism’, which apparently was meant to help formalize mathematical reasoning. The attempt of some Middle Platonists (1st c. BCE–2nd c. CE) to claim a specifically Platonic logic failed, and in its stead, the Neo-Platonists (3rd–6th c. CE) adopted a scholasticized version of Aristotelian logic as their own. In the monumental—if rarely creative—volumes of the Greek commentators on Aristotle's logical works we find elements of Stoic and later Peripatetic logic; the same holds for the Latin logical writings of Apuleius (2nd c. CE) and Boethius (6th c. CE), which pave the way for the thus supplemented Aristotelian logic to enter the medieval era.

1. Pre-Aristotelian Logic

1.1 Syntax and Semantics

Some of the Sophists classified types of sentences (logoi) according to their force. So Protagoras (485–415 BCE), who included wish, question, answer and command (Diels Kranz (DK) 80.A1, Diogenes Laertius (D. L.) 9.53–4), and Alcidamas (pupil of Gorgias, fl. 4th BCE), who distinguished assertion (phasis), denial (apophasis), question and address (prosagoreusis) (D. L. 9.54). Antisthenes (mid-5th–mid-4th cent.) defined a sentence as ‘that which indicates what a thing was or is’ (D. L. 6.3, DK 45) and stated that someone who says what is speaks truly (DK49). Perhaps the earliest surviving passage on logic is found in the Dissoi Logoi or Double Arguments (DK 90.4, c. 400 BCE). It is evidence for a debate over truth and falsehood. Opposed were the views (i) that truth is a—temporal—property of sentences, and that a sentence is true (when it is said), if and only if things are as the sentence says they are when it is said, and false if they aren't; and (ii) that truth is an atemporal property of what is said, and that what is said is true if and only if the things are the case, false if they aren't the case. These are rudimentary formulations of two alternative correspondence theories of truth. The same passage displays awareness of the fact that self-referential use of the truth-predicate can be problematic—an insight also documented by the discovery of the Liar paradox by Eubulides of Miletus (mid-4th c. BCE) shortly thereafter.

Some Platonic dialogues contain passages whose topic is indubitably logic. In the Sophist, Plato analyzes simple statements as containing a verb (rhêma), which indicates action, and a name (onoma), which indicates the agent (Soph. 261e–262a). Anticipating the modern distinction of logical types, he argues that neither a series of names nor a series of verbs can combine into a statement (Soph. 262a–d). Plato also divorces syntax (‘what is a statement?’) from semantics (‘when is it true?’). Something (e.g. ‘Theaetetus is sitting’) is a statement if it both succeeds in specifying a subject and says something about this subject. Plato thus determines subject and predicate as relational elements in a statement and excludes as statements subject-predicate combinations containing empty subject expressions. Something is a true statement if with reference to its subject (Theaetetus) it says of what is (e.g. sitting) that it is. Something is a false statement if with reference to its subject it says of something other than what is (e.g. flying) that it is. Here Plato produces a sketch of a deflationist theory of truth (Soph. 262e–263d; cf. Crat. 385b). He also distinguished negations from affirmations and took the negation particle to have narrow scope: it negates the predicate, not the whole sentence (Soph. 257b–c). There are many passages in Plato where he struggles with explaining certain logical relations: for example his theory that things participate in Forms corresponds to a rudimentary theory of predication; in the Sophist and elsewhere he grapples with the class relations of exclusion, union and co-extension; also with the difference between the ‘is’ of predication (being) and the ‘is’ of identity (sameness); and in Republic 4, 436bff., he anticipates the law of non-contradiction. But his explications of these logical questions are cast in metaphysical terms, and so can at most be regarded as proto-logical.

1.2 Argument Patterns and Valid Inference

Pre-Aristotelian evidence for reflection on argument forms and valid inference are harder to come by. Both Zeno of Elea (born c. 490 BCE) and Socrates (470–399) were famous for the ways in which they refuted an opponent's view. Their methods display similarities with reductio ad absurdum, but neither of them seems to have theorized about their logical procedures. Zeno produced arguments (logoi) that manifest variations of the pattern ‘this (i.e. the opponent's view) only if that. But that is impossible. So this is impossible’. Socratic refutation was an exchange of questions and answers in which the opponents would be led, on the basis of their answers, to a conclusion incompatible with their original claim. Plato institutionalized such disputations into structured, rule-governed verbal contests that became known as dialectical argument. The development of a basic logical vocabulary for such contests indicates some reflection upon the patterns of argumentation.

The 5th and early to mid-4th centuries BCE also see great interest in fallacies and logical paradoxes. Besides the Liar, Eubulides is said to have been the originator of several other logical paradoxes, including the Sorites. Plato's Euthydemus contains a large collection of contemporary fallacies. In attempts to solve such logical puzzles, a logical terminology develops here, too, and the focus on the difference between valid and invalid arguments sets the scene for the search for a criterion of valid inference. Finally, it is possible that the shaping of deduction and proof in Greek mathematics that begins in the later 5th century BCE served as an inspiration for Aristotle's syllogistic.

2. Aristotle

(For a more detailed account see the entry on Aristotle's Logic in this encyclopedia.) Aristotle is the first great logician in the history of logic. His logic was taught by and large without rival from the 4th to the 19th centuries CE. Aristotle's logical works were collected and put in a systematic order by later Peripatetics, who entitled them the Organon or ‘tool’, because they considered logic not as a part but rather an instrument of philosophy. The Organon contains, in traditional order, the Categories, De Interpretatione, Prior Analytics, Posterior Analytics, Topics and Sophistical Refutations. In addition, Metaphysics Γ is a logical treatise that discusses the principle of non-contradiction, and some further logical insights are found scattered throughout Aristotle's other works, such as the Poetics, Rhetoric, De Anima, Metaphysics Δ and Θ, and some of the biological works. Some parts of the Categories and Posterior Analytics would today be regarded as metaphysics, epistemology or philosophy of science rather than logic. The traditional arrangement of works in the Organon is neither chronological nor Aristotle's own. The original chronology cannot be fully recovered since Aristotle seems often to have inserted supplements into earlier writings at a later time. However, by using logical advances as criterion, we can conjecture that most of the Topics, Sophistical Refutations, Categories and Metaphysics Γ predate the De Interpretatione, which in turn precedes the Prior Analytics and parts of the Posterior Analytics.

2.1 Dialectics

The Topics provide a manual for participants in the contests of dialectical argument as instituted in the Academy by Plato. Books 2–7 provide general procedures or rules (topoi) about how to find an argument to establish or refute a given thesis. The descriptions of these procedures—some of which are so general that they resemble logical laws—clearly presuppose a notion of logical form, and Aristotle's Topics may thus count as the earliest surviving logical treatise. The Sophistical Refutations are the first systematic classification of fallacies, sorted by what logical flaw each type manifests (e.g. equivocation, begging the question, affirming the consequent, secundum quid) and how to expose them.

2.2 Sub-sentential Classifications

Aristotle distinguishes things that have sentential unity through a combination of expressions (‘a horse runs’) from those that do not (‘horse’, ‘runs’); the latter are dealt with in the Categories (the title really means ‘predications’[1]). They have no truth-value and signify one of the following: substance (ousia), quantity (poson), quality (poion), relation (pros ti), location (pou), time (pote), position (keisthai), possession (echein), doing (poiein) and undergoing (paschein). It is unclear whether Aristotle considers this classification to be one of linguistic expressions that can be predicated of something else; or of kinds of predication; or of highest genera. In Topics 1 Aristotle distinguishes four relationships a predicate may have to the subject: it may give its definition, genus, unique property, or accidental property. These are known as predicables.

2.3 Syntax and Semantics of Sentences

When writing the De Interpretatione, Aristotle had worked out the following theory of simple sentences: a (declarative) sentence (apophantikos logos) or declaration (apophansis) is delimited from other pieces of discourse like prayer, command and question by its having a truth-value. The truth-bearers that feature in Aristotle's logic are thus linguistic items. They are spoken sentences that directly signify thoughts (shared by all humans) and through these, indirectly, things. Written sentences in turn signify spoken ones. (Simple) sentences are constructed from two signifying expressions which stand in subject-predicate relation to each other: a name and a verb (‘Callias walks’) or two names connected by the copula ‘is’, which co-signifies the connection (‘Pleasure is good’) (Int. 3). Names are either singular terms or common nouns (An. Pr. I 27). Both can be empty (Cat. 10, Int. 1). Singular terms can only take subject position. Verbs co-signify time. A name-verb sentence can be rephrased with the copula (‘Callias is (a) walking (thing)’) (Int. 12). As to their quality, a (declarative) sentence is either an affirmation or a negation, depending on whether it affirms or negates its predicate of its subject. The negation particle in a negation has wide scope (Cat. 10). Aristotle defined truth separately for affirmations and negations: An affirmation is true if it says of that which is that it is; a negation is true if it says of that which is not that it is not (Met. Γ.7 1011b25ff). These formulations, or in any case their Greek counterparts, can be interpreted as expressing either a correspondence or a deflationist conception of truth. Either way, truth is a property that belongs to a sentence at a time. As to their quantity, sentences are singular, universal, particular or indefinite. Thus Aristotle obtains eight types of sentences, which are later dubbed ‘categorical sentences’. The following are examples, paired by quality:

Singular: Callias is just. Callias is not just.
Universal: Every human is just. No human is just.
Particular: Some human is just. Some human is not just.
Indefinite: (A) human is just. (A) human is not just.

Universal and particular sentences contain a quantifier and both universal and particular affirmatives were taken to have existential import. (See entry The Traditional Square of Opposition). The logical status of the indefinites is ambiguous and controversial (Int. 6–7).

Aristotle distinguishes between two types of sentential opposition: contraries and contradictories. A contradictory pair of sentences (an antiphasis) consists of an affirmation and its negation (i.e. the negation that negates of the subject what the affirmation affirms of it). Aristotle assumes that—normally—one of these must be true, the other false. Contrary sentences are such that they cannot both be true. The contradictory of a universal affirmative is the corresponding particular negative; that of the universal negative the corresponding particular affirmative. A universal affirmative and its corresponding universal negative are contraries. Aristotle thus has captured the basic logical relations between monadic quantifiers (Int. 7).

Since Aristotle regards tense as part of the truth-bearer (as opposed to merely a grammatical feature), he detects a problem regarding future tense sentences about contingent matters: Does the principle that of an affirmation and its negation one must be false, the other true apply to these? What, for example, is the truth-value now of the sentence ‘There will be a sea-battle tomorrow’? Aristotle may have suggested that the sentence has no truth-value now, and that bivalence thus does not hold—despite the fact that it is necessary for there either to be or not to be a sea-battle tomorrow, so that the principle of excluded middle is preserved (Int. 9).

2.4 Non-modal Syllogistic

Aristotle's non-modal syllogistic (Prior Analytics A 1–7) is the pinnacle of his logic. Aristotle defines a syllogism as ‘an argument (logos) in which, certain things having been laid down, something different from what has been laid down follows of necessity because these things are so’. This definition appears to require (i) that a syllogism consists of at least two premises and a conclusion, (ii) that the conclusion follows of necessity from the premises (so that all syllogisms are valid arguments), and (iii) that the conclusion differs from the premises. Aristotle's syllogistic covers only a small part of all arguments that satisfy these conditions.

Aristotle restricts and regiments the types of categorical sentence that may feature in a syllogism. The admissible truth-bearers are now defined as each containing two different terms (horoi) conjoined by the copula, of which one (the predicate term) is said of the other (the subject term) either affirmatively or negatively. Aristotle never comes clear on the question whether terms are things (e.g., non-empty classes) or linguistic expressions for these things. Only universal and particular sentences are discussed. Singular sentences seem excluded and indefinite sentences are mostly ignored. At An. Pr. A 7 Aristotle mentions that by putting an indefinite premise in place of a particular one obtains a syllogism of the same kind.

Another innovation in the syllogistic is Aristotle's use of letters in place of terms. The letters may originally have served simply as abbreviations for terms (e.g. An. Post. A 13); but in the syllogistic they seem mostly to have the function either of schematic term letters or of term variables with universal quantifiers assumed but not stated. Where he uses letters, Aristotle tends to express the four types of categorical sentences in the following way (with common later abbreviations in parentheses):

A holds of (lit., belongs to) every B (AaB)
A holds of no B (AeB)
A holds of some B (AiB)
A does not hold of some B (AoB)

Instead of ‘holds’ he also uses ‘is predicated’.

All basic syllogisms consist of three categorical sentences, in which the two premises share exactly one term, called the middle term, and the conclusion contains the other two terms, sometimes called the extremes. Based on the position of the middle term, Aristotle classified all possible premise combinations into three figures (schemata): the first figure has the middle term (B) as subject in the first premise and predicated in the second; the second figure has it predicated in both premises, the third has it as subject in both premises:

A holds of B B holds of A A holds of B
B holds of C B holds of C C holds of B

A is also called the major term, C the minor term. Each figure can further be classified according to whether or not both premises are universal. Aristotle went systematically through the fifty-eight possible premise combinations and showed that fourteen have a conclusion following of necessity from them, i.e. are syllogisms. His procedure was this: He assumed that the syllogisms of the first figure are complete and not in need of proof, since they are evident. By contrast, the syllogisms of the second and third figures are incomplete and in need of proof. He proves them by reducing them to syllogisms of the first figure and thereby ‘completing’ them. For this he makes use of three methods:

(i) conversion (antistrophê): a categorical sentence is converted by interchanging its terms. Aristotle recognizes and establishes three conversion rules: ‘from AeB infer BeA’; ‘from AiB infer BiA’ and ‘from AaB infer BiA’. All second and third figure syllogisms but two can be proved by premise conversion.
(ii) reductio ad impossibile (apagôgê): the remaining two are proved by reduction to the impossible, where the contradictory of an assumed conclusion together with one of the premises is used to deduce by a first figure syllogism a conclusion that is incompatible with the other premise. Using the semantic relations between opposites established earlier the assumed conclusion is thus established.
(iii) exposition or setting-out (ekthesis): this method, which Aristotle uses additionally to (i) and (ii), involves choosing or ‘setting out’ some additional term, say D, that falls in the non-empty intersection delimited by two premises, say AxB and AxC, and using D to justify the inference from the premises to a particular conclusion, BxC. It is debated whether ‘D’ represents a singular or a general term and whether exposition constitutes proof.

For each of the thirty-four premise combinations that allow no conclusion Aristotle proves by counterexample that they allow no conclusion. As overall result, he acknowledges four first figure syllogisms (later named Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferio), four second figure syllogisms (Camestres, Cesare, Festino, Baroco) and six third figure syllogisms (Darapti, Felapton, Disamis, Datisi, Bocardo, Ferison); these were later called the modes or moods of the figures. (The names are mnemonics: e.g. each vowel, or the first three in cases where the name has more than three, indicates in order whether the first and second premises and the conclusion were sentences of type a, e, i or o.) Aristotle implicitly recognized that by using the conversion rules on the conclusions we obtain eight further syllogisms (An. Pr. 53a3–14), and that of the premise combinations rejected as non-syllogistic, some (five, in fact) will yield a conclusion in which the minor term is predicated of the major (An. Pr. 29a19–27). Moreover, in the Topics Aristotle accepted the rules ‘from AaB infer AiB’ and ‘from AeB infer AoB’. By using these on the conclusions five further syllogisms could be proved, though Aristotle did not mention this.

Going beyond his basic syllogistic, Aristotle reduced the 3rd and 4th first figure syllogisms to second figure syllogisms, thus de facto reducing all syllogisms to Barbara and Celarent; and later on in the Prior Analytics he invokes a type of cut-rule by which a multi-premise syllogism can be reduced to two or more basic syllogisms. From a modern perspective, Aristotle's system can be represented as an argumental natural deduction system en miniature. It has been shown to be sound and complete if one interprets the relations expressed by the categorical sentences set-theoretically as a system of non-empty classes as follows: AaB is true if and only if the class A contains the class B. AeB is true if and only if the classes A and B are disjoint. AiB is true if and only if the classes A and B are not disjoint. AoB is true if and only if the class A does not contain the class B. The vexing textual question what exactly Aristotle meant by ‘syllogisms’ has received several rival interpretations, including one that they are a certain type of conditional propositional form. Most plausibly, perhaps, Aristotle's complete and incomplete syllogisms taken together are understood as formally valid premise-conclusion arguments; and his complete and completed syllogisms taken together as (sound) deductions.

2.5 Modal Logic

Aristotle is also the originator of modal logic. In addition to quality (as affirmation or negation) and quantity (as singular, universal, particular, or indefinite), he takes categorical sentences to have a mode; this consists of the fact that the predicate is said to hold of the subject either actually or necessarily or possibly or contingently or impossibly. The latter four are expressed by modal operators that modify the predicate, e.g. ‘It is possible for A to hold of some B’; ‘A necessarily holds of every B’.

In De Interpretatione 12–13, Aristotle (i) concludes that modal operators modify the whole predicate (or the copula, as he puts it), not just the predicate term of a sentence. (ii) He states the logical relations that hold between modal operators, such as that ‘it is not possible for A not to hold of B’ implies ‘it is necessary for A to hold of B’. (iii) He investigates what the contradictories of modalized sentences are, and decides that they are obtained by placing the negator in front of the modal operator. (iv) He equates the expressions ‘possible’ and ‘contingent’, but wavers between a one-sided interpretation (where necessity implies possibility) and a two-sided interpretation (where possibility implies non-necessity).

Aristotle develops his modal syllogistic in Prior Analytics 1.8–22. He settles on two-sided possibility (contingency) and tests for syllogismhood all possible combinations of premise pairs of sentences with necessity (N), contingency (C) or no (U) modal operator: NN, CC, NU/UN, CU/UC and NC/CN. Syllogisms with the last three types of premise combinations are called mixed modal syllogisms. Apart from the NN category, which mirrors unmodalized syllogisms, all categories contain dubious cases. For instance, Aristotle accepts:

A necessarily holds of all B.
B holds of all C.
Therefore A necessarily holds of all C.

This and other problematic cases were already disputed in antiquity, and more recently have sparked a host of complex formalized reconstructions of Aristotle's modal syllogistic. As Aristotle's theory is conceivably internally inconsistent, the formal models that have been suggested may all be unsuccessful.

3. The early Peripatetics: Theophrastus and Eudemus

Aristotle's pupil and successor Theophrastus of Eresus (c. 371–c. 287 BCE) wrote more logical treatises than his teacher, with a large overlap in topics. Eudemus of Rhodes (later 4th cent. BCE) wrote books entitled Categories, Analytics and On Speech. Of all these works only a number of fragments and later testimonies survive, mostly in Aristotle commentators. Theophrastus and Eudemus simplified some aspects of Aristotle's logic, and developed others where Aristotle left us only hints.

3.1 Improvements and Modifications of Aristotle's Logic

The two Peripatetics seem to have redefined Aristotle's first figure, so that it includes every syllogism in which the middle term is subject of one premise and predicate of the other. In this way, five types of non-modal syllogisms only intimated by Aristotle later in his Prior Analytics (Baralipton, Celantes, Dabitis, Fapesmo and Frisesomorum) are included, but Aristotle's criterion that first figure syllogisms are evident is given up (Theophrastus fr. 91, Fortenbaugh). Theophrastus and Eudemus also improved Aristotle's modal theory. Theophrastus replaced Aristotle's two-sided contingency by one-sided possibility, so that possibility no longer entails non-necessity. Both recognized that the problematic universal negative (‘A possibly holds of no B’) is simply convertible (Theophrastus fr. 102A Fortenbaugh). Moreover, they introduced the principle that in mixed modal syllogisms the conclusion always has the same modal character as the weaker of the premises (Theophrastus frs. 106 and 107 Fortenbaugh), where possibility is weaker than actuality, and actuality than necessity. In this way Aristotle's modal syllogistic is notably simplified and many unsatisfactory theses, like the one mentioned above (that from ‘Necessarily AaB’ and ‘BaC’ one can infer ‘Necessarily AaC’) disappear.

3.2 Prosleptic Syllogisms

Theophrastus introduced the so-called prosleptic premises and syllogisms (Theophrastus fr. 110 Fortenbaugh). A prosleptic premise is of the form:

For all X, if Φ(X), then Ψ(X)

where Φ(X) and Ψ(X) stand for categorical sentences in which the variable X occurs in place of one of the terms. For example:

(1)    A [holds] of all of that of all of which B [holds].
(2)    A [holds] of none of that which [holds] of all B.

Theophrastus considered such premises to contain three terms, two of which are definite (A, B), one indefinite (‘that’, or the bound variable X). We can represent (1) and (2) as

X (BaXAaX)
X (XaBAeX)

Prosleptic syllogisms then come about as follows: They are composed of a prosleptic premise and the categorical premise obtained by instantiating a term (C) in the antecedent ‘open categorical sentence’ as premises, and the categorical sentences one obtains by putting in the same term (C) in the consequent ‘open categorical sentence’ as conclusion. For example:

A [holds] of all of that of all of which B [holds].
B holds of all C.
Therefore, A holds of all C.

Theophrastus distinguished three figures of these syllogisms, depending on the position of the indefinite term (also called ‘middle term’) in the prosleptic premise; for example (1) produces a third figure syllogism, (2) a first figure syllogism. The number of prosleptic syllogisms was presumably equal to that of types of prosleptic sentences: with Theophrastus' concept of the first figure these would be sixty-four (i.e. 32 + 16 + 16). Theophrastus held that certain prosleptic premises were equivalent to certain categorical sentences, e.g. (1) to ‘A is predicated of all B’. However, for many, including (2), no such equivalent can be found, and prosleptic syllogisms thus increased the inferential power of Peripatetic logic.

3.3 Forerunners of Modus Ponens and Modus Tollens

Theophrastus and Eudemus considered complex premises which they called ‘hypothetical premises’ and which had one of the following two (or similar) forms:

If something is F, it is G
Either something is F or it is G    (with exclusive ‘or’)

They developed arguments with them which they called ‘mixed from a hypothetical premise and a probative premise’ (Theophrastus fr. 112A Fortenbaugh). These arguments were inspired by Aristotle's syllogisms ‘from a hypothesis’ (An. Pr. 1.44); they were forerunners of modus ponens and modus tollens and had the following forms (Theophrastus frs. 111 and 112 Fortenbaugh), employing the exclusive ‘or’:

If something is F, it is G.
a is F.
Therefore, a is G.
If something is F, it is G.
a is not G.
Therefore, a is not F.
Either something is F or it is G.
a is F.
Therefore, a is not G.
Either something is F or it is G.
a is not F.
Therefore, a is G.

Theophrastus also recognized that the connective particle ‘or’ can be inclusive (Theophrastus fr. 82A Fortenbaugh); and he considered relative quantified sentences such as those containing ‘more’, ‘fewer’, and ‘the same’ (Theophrastus fr. 89 Fortenbaugh), and seems to have discussed syllogisms built from such sentences, again following up upon what Aristotle said about syllogisms from a hypothesis (Theophrastus fr. 111E Fortenbaugh).

3.4 Wholly Hypothetical Syllogisms

Theophrastus is further credited with the invention of a system of the later so-called ‘wholly hypothetical syllogisms’ (Theophrastus fr. 113 Fortenbaugh). These syllogisms were originally abbreviated term-logical arguments of the kind

If [something is] A, [it is] B.
If [something is] B, [it is] C.
Therefore, if [something is] A, [it is] C.

and at least some of them were regarded as reducible to Aristotle's categorical syllogisms, presumably by way of the equivalences to ‘Every A is B’, etc. In parallel to Aristotle's syllogistic, Theophrastus distinguished three figures; each had sixteen modes. The first eight modes of the first figure are obtained by going through all permutations with ‘not X’ instead of ‘X’ (with X for A, B, C); the second eight modes are obtained by using a rule of contraposition on the conclusion:

(CR)   From ‘if X, Y’ infer ‘if the contradictory of Y then the contradictory of X

The sixteen modes of the second figure were obtained by using (CR) on the schema of the first premise of the first figure arguments, e.g.

If [something is] not B, [it is] not A.
If [something is] B, [it is] C.
Therefore, if [something is] A, [it is] C.

The sixteen modes of the third figure were obtained by using (CR) on the schema of the second premise of the first figure arguments, e.g.

If [something is] A, [it is] B.
If [something is] not C, [it is] not B.
Therefore, if [something is] A, [it is] C.

Theophrastus claimed that all second and third figure syllogisms could be reduced to first figure syllogisms. If Alexander of Aphrodisias (2nd c. CE Peripatetic) reports faithfully, any use of (CR) which transforms a syllogism into a first figure syllogism was such a reduction. The large number of modes and reductions can be explained by the fact that Theophrastus did not have the logical means for substituting negative for positive components in an argument. In later antiquity, after some intermediate stages, and possibly under Stoic influence, the wholly hypothetical syllogisms were interpreted as propositional-logical arguments of the kind

If p, then q.
If q, then r.
Therefore, if p, then r.

4. Diodorus Cronus and Philo the Logician

In the later 4th to mid 3rd centuries BCE, contemporary with Theophrastus and Eudemus, a loosely connected group of philosophers, sometimes referred to as dialecticians (see entry ‘Dialectical School’) and possibly influenced by Eubulides, conceived of logic as a logic of propositions. Their best known exponents were Diodorus Cronus and his pupil Philo (sometimes called ‘Philo of Megara’). Although no writings of theirs are preserved, there are a number of later reports of their doctrines. They each made ground-breaking contributions to the development of propositional logic, in particular to the theories of conditionals and modalities.

A conditional (sunêmmenon) was considered as a non-simple proposition composed of two propositions and the connecting particle ‘if’. Philo, who may be credited with introducing truth-functionality into logic, provided the following criterion for their truth: A conditional is false when and only when its antecedent is true and its consequent is false, and it is true in the three remaining truth-value combinations. The Philonian conditional resembles material implication, except that—since propositions were conceived of as functions of time that can have different truth-values at different times—it may change its truth-value over time. For Diodorus, a conditional proposition is true if it neither was nor is possible that its antecedent is true and its consequent false. The temporal elements in this account suggest that the possibility of a truth-value change in Philo's conditionals was meant to be improved on. With his own modal notions (see below) applied, a conditional is Diodorean-true now if and only if it is Philonian-true at all times. Diodorus' conditional is thus reminiscent of strict implication. Philo's and Diodorus' conceptions of conditionals lead to variants of the ‘paradoxes’ of material and strict implication—a fact the ancients were aware of (Sextus Empiricus [S. E.] M. 8.109–117).

Philo and Diodorus each considered the four modalities possibility, impossibility, necessity and non-necessity. These were conceived of as modal properties or modal values of propositions, not as modal operators. Philo defined them as follows: ‘Possible is that which is capable of being true by the proposition's own nature … necessary is that which is true, and which, as far as it is in itself, is not capable of being false. Non-necessary is that which as far as it is in itself, is capable of being false, and impossible is that which by its own nature is not capable of being true.’ Diodorus' definitions were these: ‘Possible is that which either is or will be [true]; impossible that which is false and will not be true; necessary that which is true and will not be false; non-necessary that which either is false already or will be false.’ Both sets of definitions satisfy the following standard requirements of modal logic: (i) necessity entails truth and truth entails possibility; (ii) possibility and impossibility are contradictories, and so are necessity and non-necessity; (iii) necessity and possibility are interdefinable; (iv) every proposition is either necessary or impossible or both possible and non-necessary. Philo's definitions appear to introduce mere conceptual modalities, whereas with Diodorus' definitions, some propositions may change their modal value (Boeth. In Arist. De Int., sec. ed., 234–235 Meiser).

Diodorus' definition of possibility rules out future contingents and implies the counterintuitive thesis that only the actual is possible. Diodorus tried to prove this claim with his famous Master Argument, which sets out to show the incompatibility of (i) ‘every past truth is necessary’, (ii) ‘the impossible does not follow from the possible’, and (iii) ‘something is possible which neither is nor will be true’ (Epict. Diss. II.19). The argument has not survived, but various reconstructions have been suggested. Some affinity with the arguments for logical determinism in Aristotle's De Interpretatione 9 is likely.

On the topic of ambiguity, Diodorus held that no linguistic expression is ambiguous. He supported this dictum by a theory of meaning based on speaker intention. Speakers generally intend to say only one thing when they speak. What is said when they speak is what they intend to say. Any discrepancy between speaker intention and listener decoding has its cause in the obscurity of what was said, not its ambiguity (Aulus Gellius 11.12.2–3).

5. The Stoics

The founder of the Stoa, Zeno of Citium (335–263 BCE), studied with Diodorus. His successor Cleanthes (331–232) tried to solve the Master Argument by denying that every past truth is necessary and wrote books—now lost—on paradoxes, dialectics, argument modes and predicates. Both philosophers considered knowledge of logic as a virtue and held it in high esteem, but they seem not to have been creative logicians. By contrast, Cleanthes' successor Chrysippus of Soli (c. 280–207) is without doubt the second great logician in the history of logic. It was said of him that if the gods used any logic, it would be that of Chrysippus (D. L. 7.180), and his reputation as a brilliant logician is amply testified. Chrysippus wrote over 300 books on logic, on virtually any topic logic today concerns itself with, including speech act theory, sentence analysis, singular and plural expressions, types of predicates, indexicals, existential propositions, sentential connectives, negations, disjunctions, conditionals, logical consequence, valid argument forms, theory of deduction, propositional logic, modal logic, tense logic, epistemic logic, logic of suppositions, logic of imperatives, ambiguity and logical paradoxes, in particular the Liar and the Sorites (D. L. 7.189–199). Of all these, only two badly damaged papyri have survived, luckily supplemented by a considerable number of fragments and testimonies in later texts, in particular in Diogenes Laertius (D. L.) book 7, sections 55–83, and Sextus Empiricus Outlines of Pyrrhonism (S. E. PH) book 2 and Against the Mathematicians (S. E. M) book 8. Chrysippus' successors, including Diogenes of Babylon (c. 240–152) and Antipater of Tarsus (2nd cent. BCE), appear to have systematized and simplified some of his ideas, but their original contributions to logic seem small. Many testimonies of Stoic logic do not name any particular Stoic. Hence the following paragraphs simply talk about ‘the Stoics’ in general; but we can be confident that a large part of what has survived goes back to Chrysippus.

5.1 Logical Achievements Besides Propositional Logic

The subject matter of Stoic logic are the so-called sayables (lekta): they are the underlying meanings in everything we say and think, but—like Frege's senses—subsist also independently of us. They are distinguished from spoken and written linguistic expressions: what we utter are those expressions, but what we say are the sayables (D. L. 7.57). There are complete and deficient sayables. Deficient sayables, if said, make the hearer feel prompted to ask for a completion; e.g. when somone says ‘writes’ we enquire ‘who?’. Complete sayables, if said, do not make the hearer ask for a completion (D. L.7.63). They include assertibles (the Stoic equivalent for propositions), imperativals, interrogatives, inquiries, exclamatives, hypotheses or suppositions, stipulations, oaths, curses and more. The accounts of the different complete sayables all had the general form ‘a so-and-so sayable is one in saying which we perform an act of such-and-such’. For instance: ‘an imperatival sayable is one in saying which we issue a command’, ‘an interrogative sayable is one in saying which we ask a question’, ‘a declaratory sayable (i.e. an assertible) is one in saying which we make an assertion’. Thus, according to the Stoics, each time we say a complete sayable, we perform three different acts: we utter a linguistic expression; we say the sayable; and we perform a speech-act. Chrysippus was aware of the use-mention distinction (D. L. 7.187). He seems to have held that every denoting expression is ambiguous in that it denotes both its denotation and itself (Galen, On ling. soph. 4; Aulus Gellius 11.12.1). Thus the expression ‘a wagon’ would denote both a wagon and the expression ‘a wagon’.[2]

Assertibles (axiômata) differ from all other complete sayables in their having a truth-value: at any one time they are either true or false. Truth is temporal and assertibles may change their truth-value. The Stoic principle of bivalence is hence temporalized, too. Truth is introduced by example: the assertible ‘it is day’ is true when it is day, and at all other times false (D. L. 7.65). This suggests some kind of deflationist view of truth, as does the fact that the Stoics identify true assertibles with facts, but define false assertibles simply as the contradictories of true ones (S. E. M 8.85).

Assertibles are simple or non-simple. A simple predicative assertible like ‘Dion is walking’ is generated from the predicate ‘is walking’, which is a deficient assertible since it elicits the question ‘who?’, together with a nominative case (Dion's individual quality or the correlated sayable), which the assertible presents as falling under the predicate (D. L. 7.63 and 70). There is thus no interchangeability of predicate and subject terms as in Aristotle; rather, predicates—but not the things that fall under them—are defined as deficient, and thus resemble propositional functions. It seems that whereas some Stoics took the—Fregean—approach that singular terms had correlated sayables, others anticipated the notion of direct reference. Concerning indexicals, the Stoics took a simple definite assertible like ‘this one is walking’ to be true when the person pointed at by the speaker is walking (S. E. M 100). When the thing pointed at ceases to be, so does the assertible, though the sentence used to express it remains (Alex. Aphr. An. Pr. 177–8). A simple indefinite assertible like ‘someone is walking’ is said to be true when a corresponding definite assertible is true (S. E. M 98). Aristotelian universal affirmatives (‘Every A is B’) were to be rephrased as conditionals: ‘If something is A, it is B’ (S. E. M 9.8–11). Negations of simple assertibles are themselves simple assertibles. The Stoic negation of ‘Dion is walking’ is ‘(It is) not (the case that) Dion is walking’, and not ‘Dion is not walking’. The latter is analyzed in a Russellian manner as ‘Both Dion exists and not: Dion is walking’ (Alex. Aphr. An. Pr. 402). There are present tense, past tense and future tense assertibles. The—temporalized—principle of bivalence holds for them all. The past tense assertible ‘Dion walked’ is true when there is at least one past time at which ‘Dion is walking’ was true.

5.2 Syntax and Semantics of Complex Propositions

Thus the Stoics concerned themselves with several issues we would place under the heading of predicate logic; but their main achievement was the development of a propositional logic, i.e. of a system of deduction in which the smallest substantial unanalyzed expressions are propositions, or rather, assertibles.

The Stoics defined negations as assertibles that consist of a negative particle and an assertible controlled by this particle (S. E. M 103). Similarly, non-simple assertibles were defined as assertibles that either consist of more than one assertible or of one assertible taken more than once (D. L. 7.68–9) and that are controlled by a connective particle. Both definitions can be understood as being recursive and allow for assertibles of indeterminate complexity. Three types of non-simple assertibles feature in Stoic syllogistic. Conjunctions are non-simple assertibles put together by the conjunctive connective ‘both … and …’. They have two conjuncts.[3] Disjunctions are non-simple assertibles put together by the disjunctive connective ‘either … or … or …’. They have two or more disjuncts, all on a par. Conditionals are non-simple assertibles formed with the connective ‘if …, …’; they consist of antecedent and consequent (D. L. 7.71–2). What type of assertible an assertible is, is determined by the connective or logical particle that controls it, i.e. that has the largest scope. ‘Both not p and q’ is a conjunction, ‘Not both p and q’ a negation. Stoic language regimentation asks that sentences expressing assertibles always start with the logical particle or expression characteristic for the assertible. Thus, the Stoics invented an implicit bracketing device similar to that used in Łukasiewicz' Polish notation.

Stoic negations and conjunctions are truth-functional. Stoic (or at least Chrysippean) conditionals are true when the contradictory of the consequent is incompatible with its antecedent (D. L. 7.73). Two assertibles are contradictories of each other if one is the negation of the other (D. L. 7.73); that is, when one exceeds the other by a—pre-fixed—negation particle (S. E. M 8.89). The truth-functional Philonian conditional was expressed as a negation of a conjunction: that is, not as ‘if p, q’ but as ‘not both p and not q’. Stoic disjunction is exclusive and non-truth-functional. It is true when necessarily precisely one of its disjuncts is true. Later Stoics introduced a non-truth-functional inclusive disjunction (Aulus Gellius, N. A. 16.8.13–14).

Like Philo and Diodorus, Chrysippus distinguished four modalities and considered them as modal values of propositions rather than modal operators; they satisfy the same standard requirements of modal logic. Chrysippus' definitions are (D. L. 7.75): An assertible is possible when it is both capable of being true and not hindered by external things from being true. An assertible is impossible when it is [either] not capable of being true [or is capable of being true, but hindered by external things from being true]. An assertible is necessary when, being true, it either is not capable of being false or is capable of being false, but hindered by external things from being false. An assertible is non-necessary when it is both capable of being false and not hindered by external things [from being false]. Chrysippus' modal notions differ from Diodorus' in that they allow for future contingents and from Philo's in that they go beyond mere conceptual possibility.

5.3 Arguments

Arguments are—normally—compounds of assertibles. They are defined as a system of at least two premises and a conclusion (D. L. 7.45). Syntactically, every premise but the first is introduced by ‘now’ or ‘but’, and the conclusion by ‘therefore’. An argument is valid if the (Chrysippean) conditional formed with the conjunction of its premises as antecedent and its conclusion as consequent is correct (S. E. PH 2.137; D. L. 7.77). An argument is ‘sound’ (literally: ‘true’), when in addition to being valid it has true premises. The Stoics defined so-called argument modes as a sort of schema of an argument (D. L. 7.76). A mode of an argument differs from the argument itself by having ordinal numbers taking the place of assertibles. A mode of the argument

If it is day, it is light.
But it is not the case that it is light.
Therefore it is not the case that it is day.


If the 1st, the 2nd.
But not: the 2nd.
Therefore not: the 1st.

The modes functioned first as abbreviations of arguments that brought out their logically relevant form; and second, it seems, as representatives of the form of a class of arguments.

5.4 Stoic Syllogistic

Stoic syllogistic is an argumental deductive system consisting of five types of indemonstrables or axiomatic arguments and four inference rules, called themata. An argument is a syllogism precisely if it either is an indemonstrable or can be reduced to one by means of the themata (D. L. 7.78). Syllogisms are thus certain types of formally valid arguments. The Stoics explicitly acknowledged that there are valid arguments that are not syllogisms; but assumed that these could be somehow transformed into syllogisms.

All basic indemonstrables consist of a non-simple assertible as leading premiss and a simple assertible as co-assumption, and have another simple assertible as conclusion. They were defined by five standardized meta-linguistic descriptions of the forms of the arguments (S. E. M 8.224–5; D. L. 7.80–1):

Whether an argument is an indemonstrable can be tested by comparing it with these meta-linguistic descriptions. For instance,

If it is day, it is not the case that it is night.
But it is night.
Therefore it is not the case that it is day.

comes out as a second indemonstrable, and

If five is a number, then either five is odd or five is even.
But five is a number.
Therefore either five is odd or five is even.

as a first indemonstrable. For testing, a suitable mode of an argument can also be used as a stand-in. A mode is syllogistic, if a corresponding argument with the same form is a syllogism (because of that form). However in Stoic logic there are no five modes that can be used as inference schemata that represent the five types of indemonstrables. For example, the following are two of the many modes of fourth indemonstrables:

Either the 1st or the 2nd.     Either the 1st or not the 2nd.
But the 2nd.     But the 1st.
Therefore not the 1st.     Therefore the 2nd.

Although both are covered by the meta-linguistic description, neither could be singled out as the mode of the fourth indemonstrables: If we disregard complex arguments, there are thirty-two modes corresponding to the five meta-linguistic descriptions; the latter thus prove noticeably more economical. The almost universal assumption among historians of logic that the Stoics represented their five (types of) indemonstrables by five modes is false and not supported by textual evidence.

Of the four themata, only the first and third are extant. They, too, were meta-linguistically formulated. The first thema, in its basic form, was:

This is an inference rule of the kind today called antilogism. The third thema, in one formulation, was:

This is an inference rule of the kind today called cut-rule. It is used to reduce chain-syllogisms. The second and fourth themata were also cut-rules, and reconstructions of them can be provided, since we know what arguments they together with the third thema were thought to reduce, and we have some of the arguments said to be reducible by the second thema. A possible reconstruction of the second thema is:

A possible reconstruction of the fourth thema is:

A Stoic reduction shows the formal validity of an argument by applying to it the themata in one or more steps in such a way that all resultant arguments are indemonstrables. This can be done either with the arguments or their modes (S. E. M 8.230–8). For instance, the argument mode

If the 1st and the 2nd, the 3rd.
But not the 3rd.
Moreover, the 1st.
Therefore not: the 2nd.

can be reduced by the third thema to (the modes of) a second and a third indemonstrable as follows:

When from two assertibles (‘If the 1st and the 2nd, the 3rd’ and ‘But not the 3rd’) a third follows (‘Not: both the 1st and the 2nd’—this follows by a second indemonstrable) and from the third and an external one (‘The 1st’) another follows (‘Not: the 2nd’—this follows by a third indemonstrable), then this other (‘Not: the 2nd’) also follows from the two assertibles and the external one.

The second thema reduced, among others, arguments with the following modes (Alex. Aphr. An. Pr. 164.27–31):

Either the 1st or not the 1st.     If the 1st, if the 1st, the 2nd.
But the 1st.     But the 1st.
Therefore the 1st.     Therefore the 2nd.

The Peripatetics chided the Stoics for allowing such useless arguments, but the Stoics rightly insisted that if they can be reduced, they are valid.

The four themata can be used repeatedly and in any combination in a reduction. Thus propositional arguments of indeterminate length and complexity can be reduced. Stoic syllogistic has been formalized, and it has been shown that the Stoic deductive system shows strong similarities with relevance logical systems like those by McCall. Like Aristotle, the Stoics aimed at proving non-evident formally valid arguments by reducing them by means of accepted inference rules to evidently valid arguments. Thus, although their logic is a propositional logic, they did not intend to provide a system that allows for the deduction of all propositional-logical truths, but rather a system of valid propositional-logical arguments with at least two premises and a conclusion. Nonetheless, we have evidence that the Stoics expressly recognized many simple logical truths. For example, they accepted the following logical principles: the principle of double negation, stating that a double negation (‘not: not: p’) is equivalent to the assertible that is doubly negated (i.e. p) (D. L. 7.69); the principle that any conditional formed by using the same assertible as antecedent and as consequent (‘if p, p’) is true (S. E. M 8.281, 466); the principle that any two-place disjunctions formed by using contradictory disjuncts (‘either p or not: p’) is true (S. E. M 8.282, 467); and the principle of contraposition, that if ‘if p, q’ then ‘if not: q, not: p’ (D. L. 7.194, Philodemus Sign., PHerc. 1065, XI.26–XII.14).

5.5 Logical Paradoxes

The Stoics recognized the importance of both the Liar and the Sorites paradoxes (Cicero Acad. 2.95–8, Plut. Comm.Not. 1059D–E, Chrys. Log. Zet. col.IX). Chrysippus may have tried to solve the Liar as follows: there is an uneliminable ambiguity in the Liar sentence (‘I am speaking falsely’, uttered in isolation) between the assertibles (i) ‘I falsely say I speak falsely’ and (ii) ‘I am speaking falsely’ (i.e. I am doing what I'm saying, viz. speaking falsely), of which, at any time the Liar sentence is uttered, precisely one is true, but it is arbitrary which one. (i) entails (iii) ‘I am speaking truly’ and is incompatible with (ii) and with (iv) ‘I truly say I speak falsely’. (ii) entails (iv) and is incompatible with (i) and (iii). Thus bivalence is preserved (cf. Cavini 1993). Chrysippus' stand on the Sorites seems to have been that vague borderline sentences uttered in the context of a Sorites series have no assertibles corresponding to them, and that it is obscure to us where the borderline cases start, so that it is rational for us to stop answering while still on safe ground (i.e. before we might begin to make utterances with no assertible corresponding to them). The latter remark suggests Chrysippus was aware of the problem of higher order vagueness. Again, bivalence of assertibles is preserved (cf. Bobzien 2002).

6. Epicurus and the Epicureans

Epicurus (late 4th–early 3rd c. BCE) and the Epicureans are said to have rejected logic as an unnecessary discipline (D. L. 10.31, Usener 257). This notwithstanding, several aspects of their philosophy forced or prompted them to take a stand on some issues in philosophical logic. (1) Language meaning and definition: The Epicureans held that natural languages came into existence not by stipulation of word meanings but as the result of the innate capacities of humans for using signs and articulating sounds and of human social interaction (D. L. 10.75–6); that language is learnt in context (Lucretius 5.1028ff); and that linguistic expressions of natural languages are clearer and more conspicuous than their definitions; even that definitions would destroy their conspicuousness (Usener 258, 243); and that philosophers hence should use ordinary language rather than introduce technical expressions (Epicurus On Nature 28). (2) Truth-bearers: the Epicureans deny the existence of incorporeal meanings, such as Stoic sayables. Their truth-bearers are linguistic items, more precisely, utterances (phônai) (S. E. M 8.13, 258; Usener 259, 265). Truth consists in the correspondence of things and utterances, falsehood in a lack of such correspondence (S. E. M 8.9, Usener 244), although the details are obscure here. (3) Excluded middle: with utterances as truth-bearers, the Epicureans face the question what the truth-values of future contingents are. Two views are recorded. One is the denial of the Principle of Excluded Middle (‘p or not p’) for future contingents (Usener 376, Cicero Acad. 2.97, Cicero Fat. 37). The other, more interesting, one leaves the Excluded Middle intact for all utterances, but holds that, in the case of future contingents, the component utterances ‘p’ and ‘not p’ are neither true nor false (Cicero Fat. 37), but, it seems, indefinite. This could be considered as an anticipation of supervaluationism. (4) Induction: Inductive logic was comparatively little developed in antiquity. Aristotle discusses arguments from the particular to the universal (epagôgê) in the Topics and Posterior Analytics but does not provide a theory of them. Some later Epicureans developed a theory of inductive inference which bases the inference on empirical observation that certain properties concur without exception (Philodemus De Signis).

7. Later Antiquity

Very little is known about the development of logic from c. 100 BCE to c. 250 CE. It is unclear when Peripatetics and Stoics began taking notice of the logical achievements of each other. Sometime during that period, the terminological distinction between ‘categorical syllogisms’, used for Aristotelian syllogisms, and ‘hypothetical syllogisms’, used not only for those introduced by Theophrastus and Eudemus, but also for the Stoic propositional-logical syllogisms, gained a foothold. In the first century BCE, the Peripatetics Ariston of Alexandria and Boethus of Sidon wrote about syllogistic. Ariston is said to have introduced the so-called ‘subaltern’ syllogisms (Barbari, Celaront, Cesaro, Camestrop and Camenop) into Aristotelian syllogistic (Apuleius Int. 213.5–10), i.e. the syllogisms one gains by applying the subalternation rules (that were acknowledged by Aristotle in his Topics)

From ‘A holds of every B’ infer ‘A holds of some B
From ‘A holds of no B’ infer ‘A does not hold of some B

to the conclusions of the relevant syllogisms. Boethus suggested substantial modifications to Aristotle's theories: he claimed that all categorical syllogisms are complete, and that hypothetical syllogistic is prior to categorical (Galen Inst. Log. 7.2), although we are not told what this priority was thought to consist in. The Stoic Posidonius (c. 135–c. 51 BCE) defended the possibility of logical or mathematical deduction against the Epicureans and discussed some syllogisms he called ‘conclusive by the force of an axiom’, which apparently included arguments of the type ‘As the 1st is to the 2nd, so the 3rd is to the 4th; the ratio of the 1st to the 2nd is double; therefore the ratio of the 3rd to the 4th is double’, which was considered conclusive by the force of the axiom ‘things which are in general of the same ratio, are also of the same particular ratio’ (Galen Inst. Log. 18.8). At least two Stoics in this period wrote a work on Aristotle's Categories. From his writings we know that Cicero (1st c. BCE) was knowledgeable about both Peripatetic and Stoic logic; and Epictetus' discourses (late 1st–early 2nd c. CE) prove that he was acquainted with some of the more taxing parts of Chrysippus' logic. In all likelihood, there existed at least a few creative logicians in this period, but we do not know who they were and what they created.

The next logician of rank, if of lower rank, of whom we have sufficient evidence to speak is Galen (129–199 or 216 CE), whose greater fame was as a physician. He studied logic with both Peripatetic and Stoic teachers, and recommended to avail oneself of parts of either doctrine, as long as it could be used for scientific demonstration. He composed commentaries on logical works by Aristotle, Theophrastus, Eudemus and Chrysippus, as well as treatises on various logical problems and a major work entitled On Demonstration. All these are lost, except for some information in later texts, but his Introduction to Logic has come down to us almost in full. In On Demonstration, Galen developed, among other things, a theory of compound categorical syllogisms with four terms, which fall into four figures, but we do not know the details. He also introduced the so-called relational syllogisms, examples of which are ‘A is equal to B, B is equal to C; therefore A is equal to C’ and ‘Dio owns half as much as Theo; Theo owns half as much as Philo. Therefore Dio owns a quarter of what Philo owns.’ (Galen Inst. Log. 17–18). All relational syllogisms Galen mentions have in common that they are not reducible in either Aristotle's or Stoic syllogistic, but it is difficult to find further formal characteristics that unite them. In general, in his Introduction to Logic Galen merges Aristotelian Syllogistic with a strongly Peripatetic reinterpretation of Stoic propositional logic. This becomes apparent in particular in Galen's emphatic denial that truth-preservation is sufficient for the validity or syllogismhood of an argument, and his insistence that, instead, knowledge-introduction or knowledge-extension is a necessary condition for something to count as a syllogism.[4]

The second ancient introduction to logic that has survived is Apuleius' (2nd cent. CE) De Interpretatione. This Latin text, too, displays knowledge of Stoic and Peripatetic logic; it contains the first full presentation of the square of opposition, which illustrates the logical relations between categorical sentences by diagram. The Platonist Alcinous (2nd cent. CE), in his Handbook of Platonism chapter 5, is witness to the emergence of a specifically Platonist logic, constructed on the Platonic notions and procedures of division, definition, analysis and hypothesis, but there is little that would make a logician's heart beat faster. Sometime between the 3rd and 6th century CE Stoic logic faded into oblivion, to be resurrected only in the 20th century, in the wake of the (re)-discovery of propositional logic.

The surviving, often voluminous, Greek commentaries on Aristotle's logical works by Alexander of Aphrodisias (fl. c. 200 CE), Porphyry (234–c. 305), Ammonius Hermeiou (5th century), Philoponus (c. 500) and Simplicius (6th century) and the Latin ones by Boethius (c. 480–524) have their main importance as preservers of alternative interpretations of Aristotle's logic and as sources for lost Peripatetic and Stoic works—with elements of Stoic logic either tacitly adopted or loudly decried. Two of the commentators deserve special mention in their own right: Porphyry, for writing the Isagoge or Introduction (i.e. to Aristotle's Categories), in which he discusses the five notions of genus, species, differentia, property and accident as basic notions one needs to know to understand the Categories. For centuries, the Isagoge was the first logic text a student would tackle, and Porphyry's five predicables (which differ from Aristotle's four) formed the basis for the medieval doctrine of the quinque voces. The second is Boethius. In addition to commentaries, he wrote a number of logical treatises, mostly simple explications of Aristotelian logic, but also two very interesting ones: (i) His On Topical Differentiae bears witness to the elaborated system of topical arguments that logicians of later antiquity had developed from Aristotle's Topics under the influence of the needs of Roman lawyers. (ii) His On Hypothetical Syllogisms systematically presents wholly hypothetical and mixed hypothetical syllogisms as they are known from the early Peripatetics; it may be derived from Porphyry. Boethius' insistence that the negation of ‘If it is A, it is B’ is ‘If it is A, it is not B’ suggests a suppositional understanding of the conditional, a view for which there is also some evidence in Ammonius, but that is not attested for earlier logicians. Historically, Boethius is most important because he translated all of Aristotle's Organon into Latin and thus these texts (except the Posterior Analytics) became available to philosophers of the medieval period.


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Alexander of Aphrodisias | Ammonius | Aristotle, commentators on | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Chrysippus | conditionals | connectives: sentence connectives in formal logic | Dialectical School | Frege, Gottlob | future contingents | Galen | indexicals | liar paradox | logic: classical | logic: inductive | logic: modal | logic: relevance | logic: temporal | Plato | propositions | Sorites paradox | square of opposition | Stoicism | truth: correspondence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes