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Diodorus Cronus

First published Tue Aug 4, 2009

Diodorus was a pioneering logician, and the most celebrated member of the Dialectical School of the 4th–3rd c. BCE. His contributions to logic—in particular, definitions of modal terms and the criteria for a sound conditional—are covered in the article on the Dialectical School (see also Section 2 of the entry on fatalism). The present article adds a conspectus of Diodorus's other ideas. His use of paradox is at least as prominent in our ancient sources about him as are those constructive contributions to logical theory.

1. Life

Diodorus died around 284 BCE at Alexandria in Egypt. His date of birth is unknown. It used to be common to consider him old enough to have influenced Aristotle (died 322 BCE), but there are no strong grounds for this. The dating was based largely on Aristotle's response in Metaphysics Theta 3 to the modal theory of ‘the Megarics’; but the theory discussed there differs from that of Diodorus, who in any case (see below) should not necessarily be assumed to be a Megaric, however great his debt to the school that went under that name. The best evidence tends rather to make Diodorus an older contemporary of, and a living influence on, the first generation of the Stoic school, which began life ca 300 BCE. Zeno of Citium, the school's founder, is said to have been a pupil of Diodorus (among others). Among Zeno's fellow-pupils in Diodorus's class is reported to have been Philo, himself later a highly original logician in his own right (see the entry on Dialectical School in this encyclopedia).

Diodorus came from Iasos in the eastern Aegean. In terms of affiliation he is regularly spoken of in our sources as a ‘Dialectician’. How distinct this school was from the ‘Megaric’ school is a matter of dispute, and one testimony does speak of a certain ‘Diodorus the Megaric’ (see Denyer 2002), who may well be Diodorus Cronus. But at all events no evidence that we possess associates him in any way with the town of Megara, after which the Megaric school was named. Apart from his birthplace, we hear of him as active at Athens in or around the last decade of the fourth century, and later at Alexandria. These were the two major cultural centres of the age.

‘Cronus’ was his nickname, said to have been inherited from his teacher Apollonius Cronus. It meant roughly ‘old fogey’. But Diodorus, far from being an old fogey, comes over as a rather flamboyant and non-traditional figure. To prove a point about the non-natural character of language (see 3 below), he renamed one of his slaves ‘Allamēn’ (not a randomly chosen sound but a Greek conjunction favoured by logicians like Diodorus for introducing the minor premise of a syllogism, ‘But now …’). And in defiance of the male-centred customs of contemporary philosophical education, he trained all five of his daughters in dialectic. His work in logic was so well known that, according to the Alexandrian poet Callimachus, even the crows on the rooftops recognized his wisdom, cawing out Diodorean questions about the soundness of a conditional. And his celebrated Master Argument, with which he sought to establish his modal definitions, was said to be hotly debated even at dinner parties.

There is no evidence that he wrote anything, and the choice of oral argument rather than written exposition would fit his label ‘Dialectician’, which refers to the Socratic practice of question-and-answer philosophical discussion. According to the anecdotal tradition (not necessarily to be trusted), he died after public humiliation at the court of the Alexandrian ruler Ptolemy Soter, having failed to solve a set of logical puzzles propounded there by the Megaric philosopher Stilpo.

2. Minima and motion

Diodorus is credited with four paradoxes of motion, which inevitably call to mind the celebrated four motion paradoxes of Zeno of Elea.

Of Diodorus's four paradoxes (Sextus Empiricus, Against the professors 10.85–118), two rested on the hypothesis that matter and space are only finitely divisible, namely into vanishingly small quanta, termed by him ‘smallest and partless’ (elachista kai amerē) bodies and places. He may have postulated similar minima for time as well. Sextus calls the postulation of minima Diodorus's ‘hypothesis’, but the denial of motion his ‘own doctrine’ (10.85–86), and we might do well to accept this distinction of status. Although there is plentiful evidence that Diodorus did himself endorse the thesis of minima as a correct account of the world's constitution, it was a controversial view, to which a dialectician could not count on his interlocutors' agreement. Hence in arguing against motion he may have treated it as a hypothesis, and designed some of his arguments to be independent of it.

Certainly some of those puzzled by Zeno's dichotomy argument against motion (see Zeno of Elea 2.2.1) had sought to resolve the puzzlement by postulating a smallest magnitude. That solution, although rejected by Aristotle, was defended by his contemporary Xenocrates, a leading Platonist. Diodorus, a generation later, can be seen taking up this supposed solution to the Zenonian paradox and showing that it itself in fact generates a new motion paradox, the first of his four. (1) A minimal and partless body could never be moving, he argues, because it always exactly fills the minimal space that it occupies. It may next appear in a precisely adjacent space, but in the intervening time it could never be in transition from the one space to the other: that would have required its being partly in and partly not in the original space, whereas what has no parts cannot be ‘partly’ in anything. (The basic argument goes back to Plato, Parmenides 138d–e and Aristotle, Physics 6.10.)

Although he here denies that things move, Diodorus is not rejecting ordinary experience, as Zeno of Elea is generally held to have done. He concedes the empirical fact that things are in different places at different times, and therefore that an item can be said to ‘have moved’. What he denies is that motion could ever be taking place in the present. It may nevertheless be true that something has moved. The result, a staccato analysis of motion comparable to a series of film frames, is quite sufficient to account for our experience.

But can it be true that something, in this case motion, has happened, when it was never true to say of it ‘It is happening’? Yes, replies Diodorus (Sextus, 10.97–100): for example, ‘These men have married’ may be true despite the fact that there was never a time when it was true to say of them ‘These men are marrying,’ since they each married at a different time. This supporting argument, drawn from Diodorus's logical arsenal, sits comfortably with the assumption that the staccato theory of motion really was his own doctrine. Although unmistakably in the tradition of Zeno of Elea, it is an attempt to make us re-analyse, rather than reject, phenomenal change.

Diodorus also sought to defend his motion doctrine with his second and third motion paradoxes, both of them independent of the hypothesis of minima,.

(2) ‘If something is moving, it is moving either in the place it is in, or in the place it is not in. But it is moving neither in the place it is in (for it is at rest in it [subsequently further explained as: “for it completely fills it”]) nor in the place it is not in (for it is not in it). Therefore it is not the case that something is moving’ (Sextus, 10.87). This is sometimes attributed to Zeno of Elea, and it certainly owes some of its inspiration to him, but the dilemmatic form, at least, seems more characteristic of Diodorus.

(3) ‘What is moving is immediately in a place. But what is in a place is not moving. Therefore what is moving is not moving’ (Sextus, 10.112). Too brief to admit of close analysis, this looks like a descendant of Zeno's Arrow paradox (see Zeno of Elea 2.2.3). How far it can be deemed to differ, other than in form, from the first horn of Diodorus's preceding dilemma is unclear.

(4) Diodorus's fourth motion paradox appeals to the theory of minima once again. It assumes that a moving body, if there were one, would consist of a set of minima, and that the whole body would be moving if and only if a preponderance of its constituent minima were moving. The point of choosing minima as the relevant constituents is presumably (cf. Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism 3.76) to avoid the vicious regress that would threaten if everything moved by courtesy of the movement of a preponderance of its parts, which themselves moved by courtesy of the movement of their parts, and so on: minima, being defined precisely by their partlessness, provide the starting point from which composite motion—if there is such a thing—would be built up. The paradox asks us to imagine a body consisting of three minima, two moving plus one stationary. Thanks to this simple majority, the whole body is in motion. Hence if a further stationary minimum were now added to it, that could not be enough to halt its motion, being in a minority of 1 to the original 3, which, taken as a whole, have been assumed to be moving, and therefore preponderate. And stationary minima can go on being added to the body, one at a time, until it consists of 10,000 minima, only two of which are individually moving, and yet the whole body will, absurdly, nonetheless be moving, because of the ever-increasing preponderance of its moving parts.

Sextus (10.113–18), who reports this paradox, thinks the fallacy obvious, as it no doubt is, since on the original assumption, if it is to be acceptable, whether a whole body is moving or not should be a function of what the majority of its minimal parts, each taken on its own, are doing. What is most interesting about the paradox is that it is a variant of the Sorites or little-by-little argument (see next section), and thus clear evidence that Diodorus used to employ this form of argument, whose invention is in fact attributed to his forerunner Eubulides (see Dialectical School).

3. Semantics

The classic Sorites, or ‘heap argument’, seeks to show that even 10,000 grains do not make a heap, on the ground that (a) three grains do not, and (b) the addition of one grain could never be enough to turn a non-heap into a heap: however often a further grain is added, no precise boundary between non-heap and heap is ever found. Applications of this argument form were widespread in the Hellenistic age, and the Stoic logician Chrysippus wrote many books trying to solve it. Diodorus is a likely source or inspiration for this Hellenistic preoccupation (see previous paragraph).

The Sorites is a particularly lethal weapon when used in the field of semantics, threatening to erase the boundaries on which rigid definitions depend. It may be relevant, then, that Diodorus is reported to have propounded a semantic theory of his own (Aulus Gellius, Attic nights 11.12.1–3; cf. 1 above, the story of his renaming his slave, reported by Ammonius, On Aristotle's De interpretatione 38.17–20). This was based on the ‘conventionalist’ thesis expressed by the character Hermogenes in Plato's Cratylus, according to whom nothing but convention—whether national, local or simply private—determines the meaning of a word, and any convenient string of sounds can in principle be used to convey any meaning. Diodorus's inference from this was that the sole determinant of any word's meaning is the intention of the utterer on any given occasion on which it is used. He went on to infer that there are no actual ambiguities: given the assumption that a word is on each occasion uttered with one specific meaning in mind, a word has only one meaning at any time.

One may wonder whether this semantic theory was designed to remedy the kind of damage that the Sorites threatened. If meanings are determined purely by the utterer's intention on each occasion, a radical reconsideration of definitional theory seems in any event to be called for. And it may be that counting the grains becomes simply irrelevant to the determination of what constitutes a heap: some collections of grains get called a heap, some don't—possibly quite arbitrarily from the grain-counting point of view.

4. Philosophical position

Diodorus was known as a great dialectician. Zeno of Elea had been called by Aristotle (in a lost work) the founder of dialectic, and the motion paradoxes make it clear that Diodorus modelled himself to a considerable extent on Zeno.

On the other hand Diodorus's Dialectical school was Socratic in its affiliation (see the entry on Dialectical School in this encyclopedia, section 1). As mentioned above, it was an offshoot of the Megaric school, founded by Euclides of Megara and recognized as one of the minor ‘Socratic’ schools, thanks to Euclides's close association with Socrates.

The latter, Socratic link can be developed further. The Dialectical school is listed by Diogenes Laertius (1.18) as one of the ‘ethical’ sects—surprisingly, given that no ethical doctrines or interests are recorded for any of its known members. The explanation may lie in a well-known passage in Plato's Apology (38a), where Socrates remarks that ‘The greatest good for man is to hold discussions every day about virtue and about the other things about which you hear me conversing [dialegomenou, cognate with ‘dialectic’] and examining myself and others. And the unexamined life is not worth living for man…’ The Dialecticians may have concluded, following Socrates, that the development and exercise of dialectical skills are themselves the supreme fulfilment of the human self. If so, it becomes that much easier to accept that Diodorus and his colleagues gave their philosophy a Socratic pedigree.

However, there need be no tension between the Zenonian and the Socratic roots of Diodorus's philosophy. Indeed, in Plato's Parmenides (135c–d) a very young and still developing Socrates is advised by Parmenides to exercise his dialectical skills according to the model set by Zeno—a method which, perhaps significantly for Diodorus, involves systematically examining the consequences of a ‘hypothesis’.

To synthesize the methodologies of Zeno and Socrates may have seemed to Diodorus the ideal way to be a dialectician, and to achieve the human good.

5. Influence

Despite the above characterization, Diodorus's philosophy did not provide a comprehensive tripartite philosophical system—physics, ethics and logic—of the kind that was to flourish in the ensuing Hellenistic age. It is therefore unsurprising that his school did not last far into the third century BCE. Instead, some of his key ideas were appropriated by the dominant schools of the age, namely the Stoics, the Epicureans and the sceptically inclined dialecticians of the New Academy. Thus it was Diodorus's propositional logic (see Dialectical School), rather than the logic of terms developed by Aristotle, that became the basis of the remarkable Stoic logical system (see the entry on Stoicism in this encyclopedia, section 4, “Logic”). Diodorus's Master Argument stood at the very centre of Hellenistic debates about determinism (see especially Cicero, On fate). His theory of minima was endorsed by Epicurus as a key part of his own physical atomism (see the entry on Epicurus in this encyclopedia, section 3). And some of Diodorus's dialectical paradoxes, most notably the Sorites, became integral to the methodology of the New Academy.


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ambiguity | conditionals | Cratylus | dialectic | Dialectical School | Diodorus Cronus | Epicureanism | logic: ancient | Megarian School | Socrates | Sorites paradox | Zeno of Citium | Zeno of Elea