Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Feminist Philosophy of Law

First published Tue May 19, 2009

Feminist philosophy of law refers to a body of scholarship that has grown out of and is closely associated with the feminist reform movement that began in the mid-20th century. It is concerned with analyzing legal structures, with identifying their effects on the material condition of women and girls, and with formulating new structures or reforms that could correct gender injustice, exploitation, or restriction. Thus it is the critique of law as a patriarchal institution.

While the immediate goal of feminist jurisprudence has always been institutional analysis and reform, accomplishing it requires conceptual analysis and revision. This is because promoting freedom and equality for women reflects a profound shift in basic assumptions about the nature of women and their proper place in the world: namely, a shift from inequality to equality of the sexes. Given the scope and detail of this change, much feminist legal theory proceeds on two levels: one pragmatic, concrete, and particular, and the other conceptual and ultimately visionary. In this article the interaction of institutional analysis with conceptual revision will be illustrated by reviewing the evolution of the concept of equality in terms of several areas of scholarly development, directly connected to pragmatic feminist goals.

1. Formulating the Foundations of Feminist Legal Philosophy

All feminist philosophy of law assumes two fundamental moral principles and one factual claim.

  1. All human beings are of equal intrinsic moral worth;
  2. Consequently, all human beings are entitled to equal protection of the law;
  3. No legal system, as it is currently constituted, provides equal protection of law to women.

Articulating what it would require (or mean) to provide equal protection to women and how existing legal doctrines fall short of that goal is the overall theme of feminist legal theory. Beyond this one general point, however, feminist methods, presumptions, and approaches vary considerably. There are as many approaches to feminist legal theory as there are feminist theories—which is to say, many. Radical feminists, socialist and Marxist feminists, relational, cultural, post-modern, pragmatist and liberal approaches to feminism are all represented in and provide differing insights to feminist legal philosophy. Despite all the differences of focus, emphasis, or approach, there are certain basic common presumptions about the nature of law and the problem that women have in securing a just administration of it. And these make feminist jurisprudence unique (see Smith 1993, ch.6). They can be stated as follows.

First, law presumes and reflects a world view—or way of thinking — a set of presumptively coherent propositions. That is, legal systems embody comprehensive and generally long-standing conceptual systems. (Even new legal systems, what few there are, are built on old systems and on old, often termed “ancient and honored,” principles.) The coherence of any legal system can always be challenged, but there is no question that an aspiration of any legal system is coherence. And (at a minimum) the appearance or illusion of coherence is maintained by requirements of consistency. The requirements of consistency include: following precedent; the rule of law; and judicial impartiality. Hence, in addition to its other properties and functions, a legal system may be viewed as a long-standing, comprehensive, conceptual system that aspires to coherence (MacKinnon 1989).

Secondly, this conceptual system tends to reinforce and legitimate the status quo, whatever it may happen to be. Indeed, one primary purpose of law is to promote stability and order by reinforcing adherence to predominant norms, representing them not only as the official values of a society (“our fundamental commitments” or “our way of life”), but often as universal, natural, and inevitable. Law sets the standard for what is normal and accepted. The law states the official position on matters that are required, prohibited, protected, or allowed. It is not self-evaluating in this regard; it is the standard of evaluation. It is accordingly represented as objective—for example, as compelled by precedent and not just a matter of opinion (Minow 1991). Since law defines what is legal, violations, wrongs, injustices, harms, or infractions are by definition deviations from law, and typically deviations from the status quo. The status quo is the invisible default standard of law. Thus, feminist philosophers of law have argued that law makes systemic bias (as opposed to personal biases of particular individuals), invisible, normal, and entrenched (Rhode 1989; Minow 1991; MacKinnon 1989). That is, systemic bias will be difficult to identify and hard to oppose, because it is the norm—it is “the way things are.” Thus, it is typically accepted by its victims as well as its beneficiaries and requires conceptual revision (or consciousness-raising) to identify it (Bartlett 1990; MacKinnon 1989).

The legal incorporation of the status quo can also result in arguments against systemic bias sounding odd, irrational, or even silly, or, on the other hand, threatening, revolutionary, or unreasonable. That is, since the status quo is perceived and institutionalized as “just the way things are,” arguments against it seem to be arguments against “nature” or against “commonsense.” For example, when the norm was that no women voted, arguments for women's suffrage were viewed by many as either silly or threatening. Similarly contemporary arguments for legalizing gay marriage are often viewed as silly or threatening (Smith 1993, I). Finally, law entrenches the status quo by institutionalizing it, making it both official and permanent. Indeed, as has been pointed out by feminist scholars, this is one major purpose of law—to stabilize social arrangements (Minow 1991; Rhode 1989). Part of the point of having a legal system is to formalize social customs, to make them uniform and reliable over time and across persons. Thus, a core insight that informs all contemporary feminist legal philosophy is that law reflects and reinforces cultural presumptions (the status quo) by restating and institutionalizing these presumptions as universal norms and necessary or unavoidable social arrangements (see e.g. MacKinnon 1989, 2006; Minow 1991; Rhode 1997; Smith 1993, 2005).

Thirdly, the status quo is patriarchal. That is, it reflects the ancient and almost universal presumption of gender inequality. This is not a conceptual necessity as applied to law. (Law, by its nature, need not be patriarchal.) But a patriarchal status quo is materially inevitable given the history of civilization. Throughout history, and in virtually every society, men and women have been viewed not only as different, but as different and (therefore) unequal. They were typically cast as opposites within an overarching set of dichotomies: men being considered rational, aggressive, competitive, political, dominating leaders; and women being emotional, passive, nurturing, domestic, subordinate followers. Versions of this set of assumptions have been widely and pervasively incorporated in long-standing institutions across the board from politics and economic arrangements to educational and religious institutions, aesthetic standards and personal relations. Virtually no area of life was untouched by it. It is arguably the most pervasive fundamental organizing principle of human life (Olsen 1983; MacKinnon 1989, 2006; Smith 1993, 2005).

By the end of the 20th century many societies had officially rejected this picture of sexual inequality. As just two examples: Human rights are now said to apply equally to women and equal protection of the law is seen as applying equally to men and women. But patriarchal institutions grow like poison ivy with each branch self-rooted, and this poison ivy has been covering the earth for centuries. We may uproot the original plant, but all the runners that cover the globe, deeply rooted in time, continue to flourish independently as though the original plant never existed. Individual institutions, doctrines, presumptions and laws reflecting the patriarchal environment and culture continue to thrive and flourish even though the principle of patriarchy itself has been quite widely rejected. Furthermore, given this entrenchment of sexual inequality in law (as well as culture and economics), each step of progress is reduced to the smallest possible change, and if possible is inverted altogether so as to be incorporated into the existing system with the least disruption. And finally, once overt discrimination is addressed, all further inequality tends to be invisible because it is the norm, and the system has presumptively been corrected (Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001). So, figuring out what it means to achieve sexual equality in law's diverse institutions, practices and doctrines is the great challenge for feminists, and the subject of feminist jurisprudence for now and the future. This is the feature that unites all feminist jurisprudence, despite all its many variations, and makes it unique from all other legal philosophy.

2. Controlling the Language: The Case of Reproductive Rights

A common presumption in both litigation and politics is that the side that controls how the issue is formulated is more likely to win the debate. One problem for feminist legal reform is that the language of law itself tends to reflect and perpetuate a status quo that disadvantages women and hides discrimination against them. A further problem is that the claims of tradition and custom as well as their justification are often obscured by apparently religious or moralistic language that is vague and emotional, thus tending to mystify the issues rather than clarifying them. Examples include: ‘the sanctity of life,’ ‘the sacred bonds of marriage,’ ‘the sanctity of motherhood,’ ‘the purity of virginity,’ or ‘the honor of the family.’ However, it is not only the language which makes issues of basic reform so difficult and delicate. The language is symptomatic of the thinking about customs or institutions that are taken to be fundamental and thus crucial to a particular way of life—and consequently, as dangerous to change (or reform). Hence, reform proposals that challenge traditional arrangements are often emotionally decried as “attacking the family,” or “undermining the moral fiber of the community,” or “destroying our way of life,” and similar such phrases.

One clear current example is the widespread (and very emotional) opposition to same-sex marriage in the United States. The reform proposal is a request for official recognition of a particular family arrangement that is not yet commonly recognized. Thus, it would be an extension or expansion of the traditional idea of family. Yet it is attacked by opponents as “the destruction of the family.” Recent legislation in the US that bans same sex marriage and restricts the legal category of marriage to one man and one woman, for example, is often called the “Defense of Marriage Act.” These enactments are never called the “Restriction of Marriage Act” or even straight forwardly the “Ban of Same-Sex Marriage.” Feminist scholars have identified several problems with such manipulation of the language. First, it is based on or at least incorporates a false presumption, namely that preserving the institution of marriage requires restricting it to one man and one woman. This is clearly false since the institution of marriage exists in societies that do not restrict it in this way (i.e. those that allow polygamy and more recently gay marriage). Furthermore, the title of the act, if accepted as a correct formulation of the issue, ends debate before it begins, thereby begging the question against opponents. It is difficult to argue against “the defense of marriage.” Similarly, anal or oral sex outside of marriage was once referred to as the “the abominable crime against nature.” Who could argue for legalizing that? Clearly the language in which the issues are formulated makes a difference in how they are perceived (Minow 1991; Rhode 1997; Peach 2002; Mir-Hosseini 2006; Husseini 2007).

To raise another example, consider legislation reforming Pakistani rape laws in 2006 which allows some women to use secular law to prosecute rape claims, thereby avoiding the traditional Hudood requirement of five male Muslim witnesses to establish a rape. Traditionalists objected that the legal changes would undermine traditional moral values thereby turning Pakistan into a “free-sex society.” But feminist scholars have noted that making rape easier to prove and prosecute at least arguably restricts sex, rather than promoting it. It simply creates restrictions on men rather than women. Thus, the language protesting the reform is significant. Similarly, when a traditionalist Jordanian parliament initially rejected the proposal to repeal the legal defense of honor killing in 2001, a spokesman described the justification for opposing the reform as opposing “an effort to destroy our Islamic social and family values by stripping a man of his humanity [and] not allowing him to get angry when he is surprised by his wife committing adultery” (Husseini 2007). Feminist scholars have thus demonstrated that control over framing the issues is crucial to how they get resolved.

Another example of such an issue, which has been critical in the lives of women, is that of reproductive autonomy. It is a plausible claim that women cannot be free and equal citizens if they do not control their own bodies, and this is the position taken by most feminists. Even feminists who personally oppose abortion almost always argue that it should still be legal. Some argue that controlling one's own body is a necessary condition for any other freedom (see e.g., Olsen 1993; Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; Peach 2002). Yet, perhaps the most common traditional view of women takes them to be vessels, the primary function of which is to propagate the species. It is the purpose and fulfillment (some say Divine purpose and fulfillment) of women to produce children: to be wives and mothers. Until the 20th century, the general presumption was that both the moral (and especially sexual) behavior and the reproductive function of women should properly be controlled by their husbands (or fathers) backed by the state. Within that general view, however, actual laws and practices regarding abortion and contraception varied enormously in different times and places. From ancient days to modern times some regimes were very restrictive and others rather liberal. A great deal of feminist research has been done to detail the history, as well as debate the implications of current laws and policies that have directed and allowed or constrained women's reproductive freedom (see e.g. Callahan & Knight 1989; Cohen & Taub 1984; Rhode 1997; or Peach 2002). Emotional language has often clouded rational discussion of these issues.

The abortion issue has caused serious dispute raising difficult legal questions in the U.S. and is far from settled despite Supreme Court decisions that purport to settle it. In the United States the protection of women's reproductive freedom from restriction by government is based on the right to privacy. Established in 1965 in the case of Griswold v. Connecticut (389 US 471) the Constitutional right to privacy protects individuals from state interference with certain decisions affecting their private lives, and particularly decisions about marriage, family, sexual intimacy, and procreation. While Griswold itself is a controversial case because the right to privacy is not explicitly stated in the Constitution, the Constitutional right to privacy in general has become a settled part of American law that is strongly supported in public opinion and highly unlikely to ever be reversed. It reflects a commitment to individual freedom (or family autonomy) that has been widely recognized as a fundamental right in many societies around the globe (see Allen 1988; DeCew 1997; Rhode 1997; and Peach 2002).

On the other hand, all societies accept some regulation of the public morals as a legitimate function of government, and consequently the scope of the right to privacy is highly controversial. In 1973 the case of Roe v. Wade (410 US 113) extended the right to cover a woman's decision to terminate a pregnancy by elective abortion, which set off a firestorm of protest and debate. Roe is best viewed as a compromise decision that attempts to balance two contradictory interests: namely, as the Court laid it out, a woman's interest in controlling her own body and reproductive life versus the state's interest in protecting potential life (Olsen 1993). A woman's interest in controlling her own body and reproductive life is fairly straight-forward, but questions can be asked about the state interest in protecting potential life. Again, the framing of the issue is critical.

The issue in Roe and its progeny is always cast as a problem of balancing two competing interests, but the state interest is always left vague. So, it might be asked, what is it exactly? What exactly does it mean for the state to have an interest in protecting potential (as opposed to actual) life? In Roe, after surveying the many different views about abortion, contraception, the human status of the fetus, or its ensoulment according to various religions at various times, the Court concludes that it has no basis for making a determination on the human status of the fetus. Yet, the Court asserts that the fact that the fetus is a potential human life is sufficient to support a state interest in protecting it. (This is a declaration unsupported by any argument or reason much less any explanation of what it means (see e.g. Olsen 1993, Peach 2002). Still, an argument can be constructed for this position within the context of Roe. In Roe the state interest is not actionable until after the fetus is “viable,” that is to say, it can survive outside the mother's womb, and thus, at least has some claim to be considered a separate individual. So it is arguable that at that point the state may have an interest in protecting it, as the state may have an interest in protecting the life of any individual. This may not be a decisive argument but it is not unreasonable if the goal is to balance two sharply contrasting interests (or views). And it is a position that (at least some) feminists can accept.

However, in more recent cases the Court has held that the state interest in protecting potential life may begin at the moment of conception even though the mother's interest outweighs it (Planned Parenthood v Casey, 505 US 833, 1992). Some feminists see this formulation as the tip of a wedge (Peach 2002). If the state interest in “protecting potential life” begins not at viability, but at conception, then why not allow state legislatures to give it some weight from the beginning? After all, what does it mean for the state to have an interest that has no weight at all? If it does have some weight should the Constitution be viewed as guaranteeing abortion on demand in the first months of pregnancy? Why can't a legislature require a woman to have good reasons—reasons a state legislature would recognize as good enough to outweigh the state interest in “protecting potential life,” which is now recognized as beginning at the moment of conception if the state legislature says it does. Shouldn't a state legislature be able to ban the general sale of abortifacient contraceptives in order to ensure that a woman has good enough reasons to use them? Is stem cell research a good enough reason to outweigh the state interest in protecting potential life from the moment of conception, or should state legislatures be able to ban such research even if it is privately funded? These are questions raised by the new interpretation of the state's interest, but both the questions and the new interpretation are hidden by the vague language in which the state's interest is formulated.

Here we must return to the question of what such a state interest could be. Why, having recognized the right to reproductive choice for women, would the state have an interest in preventing the exercise of reproductive freedom in the first months of pregnancy? Why would it have an interest in preventing the sale or distribution of abortifacient contraceptive devices (as such) that end a pregnancy within days of conception? Has the vague phrase “protecting potential life” become a euphemism for “preventing abortion”? Why would a modern secular state committed to individual freedom in an overpopulated world have any interest in interfering with any such decisions? The only possible answer is that there is some special status accorded to the human embryo, or fertilized egg that requires its protection from the moment it is fertilized. But that, feminists argue, is a religious view. It is an article of faith, which any individual is entitled to hold, but not entitled to enforce upon others. Thus, religious beliefs are being smuggled into state laws and the U.S. Constitution that have a disproportionate impact upon women. Furthermore, any such laws ought to be invalid in any secular state and are explicitly forbidden by the anti-establishment clause of the U.S. Constitution (Peach 2002). But the vague phrase “protecting potential life,” so central to all the Supreme Court's decisions on this complex issue, obscures all these critical implications. The fact is that the legal battle over abortion is between those who favor legal abortion and those who oppose it. If “protecting potential life” has become a code word for preventing abortion then it obscures the real issues and slants the debate in favor of those who oppose legalization. It is much harder to argue against “protecting potential life” than to argue against banning abortion. Furthermore, the language of the general campaign to restrict women's right to abortion is formulated to mystify the facts and appeal to emotions. A fertilized egg is characterized as ‘an unborn child‘. Doctors who perform abortions are called ‘murderers’. The prevalence of abortion in the US has been likened to the holocaust, and restricting abortion is called “protecting potential life”. The vague language of the Court has been all too susceptible to this manipulation (Peach 2002)

This detailed discussion is intended to show that even in a modern, secular, liberal state that is explicitly committed to individual freedom, women's fundamental liberties can be obscured and mystified by language and action that upholds and imposes longstanding restrictive modes of thought and custom that may not always be recognized as religious in origin, but that have no other real explanation. Second, such restrictions are often expressed in and defended by the use of religious language (such as ‘sacred-ness’ or ‘sanctity’) which is applied to controversial religious doctrines as though they were settled, basic and uncontroversial. (For example, the question of when life begins is a controversial one for Christians. Even the Catholic Church held different views about it at different times in history. But it is treated by abortion opponents as if it were religiously settled.) Thirdly, the aspirational language (e.g. not ‘fertilized eggs’ or ‘embryos’, but ‘potential life’ or ‘unborn children’) tends to obscure the issues and subvert rational argument with emotional appeals.

Some societies explicitly incorporate religious law into their legal systems, operate dual systems, or are expressly theocratic. (E.g. India and Pakistan have dual systems. Some states are theocratic—e.g. Iran or Bhutan.) Others are secular but faced with strong customary elements—e.g. Turkey or Jordan. This last is a matter of degree. To some extent all societies face the problem of customary resistance to reform, as illustrated by the US abortion dispute discussed above. In nations with a strong religious (or customary) influence on law, feminists may face difficult issues of how to interpret religious law into language more favorable to women's freedom, and/or how to interpret the language of customary law in a way that enables it to absorb feminist reforms over time. This is a special case of the general problem of entrenchment. It may involve challenging the religious establishment in three ways on matters of interpretation that are (traditionally) considered settled or fundamental. First, some customary doctrines have no particular basis in religious texts, although they are treated as though they do have (e.g. when life begins). Furthermore, some doctrines have a very general religious basis (e.g. women should be modest) but are interpreted in severe or detailed customs that are not required by the source (e.g. women must be entirely covered whenever they are in public). Finally, all religious interpretation is selective, so it must be determined whether a passage should be considered basic and eternal, or whether it was simply a reflection of particular customs or attitudes relevant to a particular time in history (e.g. adultery and blasphemy are capital offenses). Some innovative work has been done on these issues, for example, by exploring the distinction between shari'a (eternal) law and fiqh (custom or jurisprudence) in Islam, and by considering the interplay of dual systems (Jeffrey & Basu 1998; Reed & Pollitt 2002; Mir-Hosseini 2005). Much more research is needed. International exchange of ideas may help, but all such discussion is extremely delicate. Analyzing and challenging the language in which these and other issues are formulated is a crucial objective for feminist legal philosophers.

Beyond these issues of language and interpretation, freedom and equality for women may be impaired in (at least) three ways: 1) Restriction may be imposed overtly by law; 2) Restriction may be imposed by private (illegal) action which continues because laws against it are not enforced; 3) Restriction may be imposed by the institutional structure itself. Analyzing these problems and formulating legal reforms to address them are major objectives of feminist jurisprudence today. These issues will be outlined in the next three sections.

3. Removing Overt Legal Restrictions: Citizenship and Formal Equality

The mid-twentieth century women's movement began as a liberation movement. The idea was that women are entitled to be free and equal citizens—as free as men to participate in their societies, to pursue their ambitions and determine their own lives. This was at the time, a radical idea that led to some radical legal reform. And it still is a highly contested concept. While the basic right to free and equal citizenship (or formal equality) is taken for granted in many societies today, in some cultures women are still not equal citizens. Some are unable to vote, hold office, attend school, engage in business, or travel about freely. Some do not control their own reproductive lives, or access to their bodies, or the opportunity to pursue any life ambition other than marriage, or who their marriage partner will be. Some women have little control over any major decisions about their lives. In some societies they are banned by law from making all or some such decisions, and thereby are rendered dependent on those who can. Another way to put this point is to recognize that all the pursuits named above (and many others as well) are legally articulated and/or legally authorized activities, and the law of some societies makes women ineligible to participate in them. Women in these societies are controlled by overt legal restrictions or prohibitions. One of the most fundamental goals of global feminist jurisprudence is to oppose and reform these barriers to women's participation in the public sphere. The basic premise is that unequal citizenship constitutes second class status and there is no justification for imposing second class status on women. Equal citizenship is a presumptive value in the modern world. Feminists argue that anyone who wishes to maintain that half the human race is not entitled to it should at least have the burden of proof (MacKinnon 2006). However, in law the burden of proof always lies with the reformer. Precedent always favors the status quo. Thus, in those societies where tradition has relegated women to a lesser legal status, reformers have the burden of justifying any changes. This is not as easy or obvious as might be supposed. Much (although certainly not all) of the problem lies with the ancient and traditional view that difference implies inequality. For many centuries men and women have been viewed as significantly different, and since they are different it is appropriate and justified to treat them differently in law. This follows the principle of procedural justice articulated by Aristotle that like cases should be treated alike and different cases differently in proportion to their differences. So, on this view it seems that women can be citizens but not have the same rights as men.

The fact that women could be recognized as citizens and yet denied equal citizenship, or recognized as human and yet denied human rights, testifies to the power of the traditional assumption that difference implies inequality. Indeed, one of the reasons for the entrenchment of sexual inequality is precisely this assumption plus the fact that some differences between men and women are real. Historically, all such differences were greatly exaggerated, and in all but the biological sense there is no way to tell which differences are real and which are socially constructed. This is particularly true of psychological differences which can be and have sometimes been denied altogether. Gender, in particular, has been described as socially constructed by many feminists. Still, there are real differences. Only women bear children. Historically only women have been systematically subordinated because of their sex. And there are statistical differences: men tend to be larger and stronger. Women are much more at risk to be raped. Women are much more likely to be responsible for care-giving in the family. Women are likely to earn less for the same work, and likely to be segregated in jobs that pay less than work that is male dominated. Women are likely to be discriminated against on the basis of their sex whereas men almost never are. So there are real differences: physically necessary, statistically verifiable, psychologically possible, and historically grounded. The legal challenge today is how to acknowledge certain differences without entrenching stereotypes, reinforcing detrimental customs, or fomenting sexist socialization (Minow 1991; Rhode 1997). That is, the question is how to recognize difference to counteract discrimination without falling prey to the legal doctrine that difference implies inequality?

The initial (liberal) feminist approach was to argue strictly for formal equality, that is, to deny that any sexual difference was ever relevant to legal doctrine. This was an effective strategy for challenging overt legal restrictions on women and legally enforced exclusion. For example, in the US feminist lawyers following the initial lead of Ruth Bader Ginsberg in Reed v Reed, argued successfully that women could not (justly) be barred as a class from employment (e.g. police, fire fighters, or pilots) that required certain levels of size or strength, since some individual women could meet these requirements even if the average woman could not. Similarly, women ought not to be prohibited from admission to professions or educational institutions on the basis of sex, for sex is simply not relevant to ability to participate in them. Furthermore, a woman ought not to be fired for being pregnant as long as it does not impair her ability to perform her duties. The overall argument in all such cases was that whatever the standard of performance or admission, sex was irrelevant to meeting it, and so could not be used without exercising unjust discrimination. This approach—often called the assimilation model—has been very effective for countering overt legal barriers to women's equal participation as citizens. (See e.g. Taub and Williams 1993; for general overview see Bartlett and Kennedy 1991, or Smith 1993.)

Arguing for formal equality works well in cases of overt legal discrimination because at this point in time it is relatively easy to argue for, and hard to deny without some good explanation as to why one group should be treated less favorably than another. With the widespread acceptance of the idea that equal protection of law is a fundamental principle of justice, arguing simply for formal equality provides a very powerful position. Furthermore, some feminists have observed that demanding accommodations for differences between men and women may backfire to the disadvantage of women. For example, pregnancy and maternity leaves may have adverse effects on women's advancement in the work place (Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; Williams 2001). So, strategically, it may be better not to ask for such accommodations even if justice would support it. Women are better off, the argument goes, if they admit no difference as relevant to law (Taub & Williams 1993; and see generally Olsen 1995, Part I).

On the other hand, formal equality is very limited. Since the strategy is to deny the significance (or often the very existence) of sexual differences, it provides no way to accommodate real differences. Thus, it provides no challenge to the traditional assumption that difference implies inequality. Consequently, it yields no challenge to entrenched (and often invisible) male norms, whether physical or historical. This deficiency was clearly illustrated in the debate over pregnancy benefits in the US. Equal protection analysis since the case of Reed v. Reed (404 US 71, 1971) had proceeded on the theory that women should be treated the same as men because for all relevant legal purposes they are the same. Then the question arose whether a state insurance program could exclude benefits for pregnancy. The plaintiffs argued that it was sex discrimination. The Supreme Court in Geduldig v Aiello (417 US 484, 1974) concluded that it was not. Since pregnancy did not affect all women, denying pregnancy benefits did not discriminate against women on the basis of sex. And furthermore, men and women were being treated exactly the same under the state program. Neither received pregnancy benefits. So men did not receive any benefits that women did not receive. And women did not receive any benefits that men did not receive. (This, by the way, is an example of the entrenchment of custom discussed in section one: the idea that any step that changes the status quo should be the smallest step possible.) The logical implication was that requiring a benefits program to include pregnancy benefits for women would entitle them not to equal rights, but to special rights; not to equal treatment but to special treatment (Olsen 1995; Smith 1993; Bartlett & Kennedy 1991).

Feminists were stunned. Indeed, many Court watchers were rather amazed by this breathtaking logical tour de force. Alliances splintered. Theories proliferated. And the “sameness/difference” debate appeared (Olsen 1995; Smith 1993; Bartlett & Kennedy 1991). Was the assimilation model a mistake? Are the differences between men and women more important than their similarities after all? Should women be treated as the same or different? Should they claim equal rights or special rights? There is no good answer if the questions are posed in this form. If equal treatment means identical treatment then women are saddled with clearly unequal burdens of pregnancy and (traditionally) with childcare and family maintenance as well. How can that be equal treatment? On the other hand, if women claim that their differences should be acknowledged and accommodated in law, they seem to be engaged in special pleading—asking for special benefits that men do not request or require (Rhode 1989 1997; Smith 1993; Olsen 1995).

The very formulation of the issue created a dilemma—a double bind that came from not being in control of the language of the debate, or from being an outsider to the standards of evaluation being assumed. Martha Minow (1991) called these “dilemmas of difference.” Dilemmas of difference arise when a decision is based on unstated norms that presume the status quo as universal and inevitable when in fact they reflect a particular point of view. Countering the dilemma in this case requires recognizing two points that can undermine the way the issue was initially formulated (or mis-formulated). First, the only way pregnancy benefits can be regarded as special treatment (in any insurance scheme) is if the norm against which they are being evaluated is male. If the standard was female, or even human, such benefits could not be considered special (or even unusual) since they are much more commonly needed than, say, benefits for a broken leg, or prostate cancer (neither of which were considered special). The underlying male standard is invisible because it is traditional for most workplaces. It is considered simply normal, but it needs to be exposed (as male) because in fact it is not equal. As one Justice pointed out in dissent, the result in Geduldig was that men receive full medical protection, while women receive only partial protection. This is one more manifestation of unconscious discrimination (Minow 1991; Rhode 1997).

Second, once male norms are recognized as just that—male norms—the connection between equality and difference must be corrected, since the very idea of difference raises the question: different from what? The traditional answer has been difference means different from the norm. If your case is the same as the standard case (the norm) then you cannot be treated differently: you must be included in the standard policy. But if the norm means male, then women will be denied equal protection of the law whenever they are different from men. That is the very approach that should have been invalidated by recognizing that women are entitled to equal protection. If this principle is taken seriously then it must be recognized that difference cannot imply inequality. An assertion of difference is a factual assessment. Equality is a political (or moral) standard. One does not automatically follow from the other. Thus, it was realized that the “sameness/difference” formulation of the debate needed to be transcended. Most feminists (and many other legal scholars as well) now recognize that the sameness/difference debate, and the dilemmas of difference that accompanied it were based on a misformulation of the issues that assumed unstated and biased traditional norms that entrench the male status quo and discriminate against women (and other groups as well) (Minow 1991; Rhode 1997; Smith 2005).

Of course, sex is not the only ground of discrimination. Some Critical Race Theorists and other feminist legal philosophers have both clarified and complicated the issue of equality and difference by pointing to discrimination based on race, class, ethnicity, sexual orientation, disability and age (Crenshaw 1989, 1996; Matsuda 1987; Allen 2005; Nussbaum 2006). The intersection of these factors creates a more nuanced description of human society as well as a more complex picture of what it means to be a woman. Identity is complex. We are all members of many communities. Discrimination is not uniform, and some feminists have pointed out that the problems of all cannot be represented by focusing on the concerns of white, middle class, professional women (Williams 1992, 1997; Crenshaw, et al 1996; Roberts 2002). All people, including feminists, have blind spots. Yet, these observations in no way undermine the general point, which was that difference does not imply inequality. On the contrary, if equal citizenship as formal equality means that laws should not be formulated for the benefit of some citizens at the expense of others, then this applies not only to sex, but to race, ethnicity, disability and so forth. If this argument is correct, it holds without regard to prior custom to the contrary. Thus it can be used at least to shift the burden of persuasion to those who would defend a tradition or precedent of unequal treatment. Equal citizenship presumes at least formal equality.

The claim of equal citizenship at least in terms of formal equality can also be viewed as a human rights issue. That is, another argument that can be used to rebut the presumption of custom and precedent that women should not be the legal equals of men is that as human beings women have a right to equal citizenship. Feminist legal scholars have been working on issues of women's human rights internationally for many years, at least since the United Nations was founded. But recently, especially since the 1980s, this effort has been aided by mass communication, international travel, and the internet. (See e.g. Rhode and Sanger, 04) International conferences have promoted dialogue and exchange of ideas on many issues ranging from honor killing to labor law. Some international groups (both NGOs and government sponsored projects or committees) are specifically focused on (what are often called) women's issues, such as violence against women and girls, women's economic viability, or women's health and reproductive issues. (See, e.g. links in the Other Internet Resources Section for CRLP, the Family Violence Prevention Fund, Wild for Human Rights, and WomenWatch, etc.) The collection of data by social scientists is more accurate and inclusive than ever in history, thus providing better foundations for analysis. Finally, collaborative research and comparative analysis of diverse legal systems and social customs have been constantly increasing for at least thirty years, and in virtually every society more women are available to engage in these efforts and more men have become interested in them. (See Jain 2005; Nussbaum & Glover 1995; Peters & Wolper 1995; Stark 2004, Rhode and Sanger 2005.)

The cumulative effect of all this activity has been to globalize both the issues and the approaches to them in several respects. First, it encourages conditions favorable to the conceptual revision needed for legal reform by providing a global perspective. This provides foundations for several feminist arguments against a restrictive status quo for women. It counts against the traditional argument that women are subordinate (or exclusively domestic) by nature. With so many counterexamples world wide, that argument can no longer be maintained. And that shifts the burden of persuasion. For example restriction of women is often (supposedly) justified as necessary to preserve longstanding custom. But subordination by custom requires justification, which a question-begging appeal to preserving custom rather obviously cannot supply. Furthermore, appeal to human rights focuses on the human status of women, thus providing a broader foundation for disputing, or at least limiting restrictive local customs (Jain 2005; Stark 2004; Schneider 2004, MacKinnon 2006).

Secondly, as nations join and sign international conventions and treaties that increasingly include rights for women, feminists are supplied with a foundation from which to argue that local laws must comply with these international commitments. For example, signing the Declaration on the Elimination of Violence Against Women implies that a nation is committed to that goal at least to the extent that it should enact and enforce laws against violence toward women. Ratifying the U.N. Declaration of Political and Civil Rights implies that a nation is at least committed to universal suffrage and more generally to equal citizenship. And increasing numbers of judges are looking to international documents as well as to judicial opinions in other nations as persuasive authority for decisions. Thus, international law and treaty commitments can be used to argue for national or local legal reform (Schneider 2004; Peters & Wolper 1995). Clearly, recognition not only that women are human beings (which is a point long, perhaps always, recognized in some abstract sense) but also that recognizing their status as human beings has implications about their rights is a step forward in the evolution of ideas about equality and justice. Human rights are equal rights. And they are equal rights that include the benefits and responsibilities of equal citizenship (Gould 2003; Stark 2004; MacKinnon 2006). So it is clear that the first step toward equality and freedom for women is the achievement of formal equality: the principle that law itself may not be used to restrict and disadvantage a particular class of people, to make them second class citizens. Yet, even if the goal of formal equality is achieved, law provides no protection unless it is enforced. Some legal feminists have argued that laws and treaties that exist on paper are ignored in fact when they apply to women. Legal rights officially acknowledged are not enforced in the face of customs that contradict them (MacKinnon 2006; Husseini 2007).

4. Enforcing Existing Law: Legal Protection from Private Injury

No individual is entitled to inflict gratuitous harm upon another. No one should have to live in fear. These are among the few uncontroversial principles accepted in all moral systems; and they form the core of the criminal law in every society. Keeping peace and order has long been considered to be the fundamental justification for the very existence of the state or legal authority. From earliest times the state was viewed as assuming a monopoly on power and an obligation to keep the peace. Many philosophers have explicitly supported this ideal, even those who argue for limitations on the state. J.S. Mill, for example, argued that the one true and legitimate reason for the interference of a state in the affairs of individuals is to prevent one person from harming another. Thomas Hobbes argued that peace (i.e. personal security) is the ultimate political value for which a rational individual would sign on to the social contract justifying state power to protect the security of every man from the potential threat of every other. And Montesquieu defined political liberty as the tranquility of mind that comes from not being subject to fear for one's safety. To achieve such tranquility of mind he proposed the separation of (governmental) powers to retard the abuse of power that could so threaten the security of citizens. The list could go on. From Confucius and Lao Tzu to Mohammed or Gandhi, personal security—freedom from fear— is an uncontroversial value that is expected to be secured and maintained by the state. Ancient laws from the Ten Commandments to the Code of Hammurabi have always prohibited individual citizens from harming one another. Over the centuries men have struggled to find legal and political mechanisms that would enable them to live together without fear.

Until the 20th century, however, these devices did not protect women from one of their most common sources of danger. Indeed, for all of history the most common threats to the personal security of women were not recognized as threats at all. And the most common harms were not recognized as harms. This is because one of the greatest sources of harm to women is men who know them: husbands, lovers, relatives, friends, employers. The extent and seriousness of this threat has always been denied, but at this point in time it is irrefutably established. Experts have documented that domestic violence is the leading cause of injury to women world wide, estimating that three to four million women and girls are affected every year. Statistics on rape are difficult to establish with certainty, but are thought to be equally high. Data on incest is even more difficult to gather, but there is considerable evidence that its occurrence is not uncommon (see Family Violence Prevention Fund). Although some countries refuse to collect official data, private studies indicate that no society is exempt from these problems. The American Medical Association has estimated the cost of domestic violence at five to ten billion dollars per year in the United States alone. It is hard to estimate the cost world wide. Responding to such studies, the United Nations Millennium Report declared violence against women to be a critically serious global issue (see WomenWatch).

While these problems are universal, their nature and incidence varies rather widely by culture. In the US, for example, about 1200 women are killed yearly by intimate partners, while authorities in Russia report that 12 to14 thousand women are killed by their husbands each year. India acknowledges similar statistics, noting that so-called “dowry murders” (which account for about 5000 killings yearly) are a serious cultural problem often masking murder as accidental death. In some cultures mutilation and disfigurement are prominent. Experts estimate 2200 women are disfigured yearly in Bangladesh. The statistics are even higher in Pakistan, where women are brutally burned by fire or acid and disfigured with razors or knives (Hassan 1998; Manderson 2003).

It is sometimes objected that women are equally violent, but this claim is insupportable. U.S. Bureau of Justice statistics indicate, for example, that about one third of female homicide victims are murdered by intimate partners as compared to about five per cent of male homicide victims (see Family Violence Prevention Fund, Report on Intimate Partner Violence) The international media in 2006 reported on a (male) Pakistani practice of throwing acid in the faces of women who were viewed as causing them dishonor. No retaliation by women in these cases was ever noted. Indeed, killing women who are perceived as causing dishonor to a man or his family is a prevalent occurrence in cultures as different as Jordan, Brazil and Bangladesh. And wife beating is practiced by men in every society of the globe (Stark 2004; Husseini 2007).

Historically law did not address such injuries. So, while the single greatest civil purpose of law has been to keep men from violating one another (the only greater being to repel foreign invasion), the violation of women by men has been considered either justified or inevitable, and in any case as unaddressable by law. Domestic chastisement was once considered legitimate discipline of one's wife and marital rape was legally impossible. Rape by an acquaintance (whether relative or employer) was made virtually impossible to prove by strict corroboration requirements and other rules of evidence, and was so devastatingly shameful to the victim that no one would pursue such a complaint. Incest, like rape, was always illegal but rarely admitted, let alone prosecuted. And sexual harassment (like sex discrimination) simply did not exist as legal claims until the 1960s or later (MacKinnon 1979; MacKinnon and Siegle 2004). So it is clear not only that equal protection of law for women was not recognized until recently, but also that the force of law was used to back male dominance. If a man were attacked on the street he could pursue his attacker in the courts of law. If a woman were attacked in her home she had no legal cause of action. It was considered a private matter. In important respects it still is (Rhode 1997; Schneider 2000; Estrich 1987, 2001).

In some ways the law has improved over the past 30 years or so, although the crime statistics have not. Domestic violence is now a crime in most societies, although the law against it is not well enforced (Schneider 2000; Manderson 2003). Rape laws have been reformed to some extent in some societies, although even the best still have far to go (Schulhofer 1998; Taslitz 1999; Estrich 2001). For example, most western nations no longer require corroboration of rape by witnesses. Feminist lawyers have worked hard to secure these legal reforms. International law has recognized the rape of women in war as a crime against humanity, and prosecutions have recently taken place for it for the first time in history. Sexual harassment and sex discrimination are now rather widely recognized as wrongful behavior and legal causes of action in a variety of forms. This is all progress of the sort discussed in the previous sections. That is, it reflects legal reform that recognizes claims for the rights of women that were not legally recognized in the past. This is a critical first step. Yet high crime statistics verify that the problem of violence against women remains a problem of major proportions, and conviction rates in no sense reflect a commitment to punishing these crimes Schulhofer 1998; Estrich 2001). This illustrates that reforming the law will have little effect unless there is also a commitment to enforcing it.

It also reflects a continuing and systematic bias against women, and testifies to the enduring legacy of patriarchal customs and attitudes of the worst sort. Once again the status quo is protected and social reform is reduced to the smallest step possible. Men may no longer have a legal right of chastisement, but if men who beat their wives are rarely charged, let alone prosecuted, and penalties are small even if a man is convicted, then his de facto power over his wife amounts to almost the same authority men always historically had. Similarly, a woman may no longer be legally required to remain with a husband who beats her, but if she has nowhere to go, no income or employment opportunities and children to support, then her restriction is almost the same as it was in the past (see Gendercide Watch; WomenWatch). Legal restriction is not the only way to subordinate women. Custom, religion, and socialization are usually adequate, and when they are not, brute force or the threat of it will suffice. That is, given long-standing customs of subordination, the traditional disparity of power, and the typical difference in size and strength between men and women, the threat of physical harm and the differential exercise of economic and political power is sufficient to maintain male dominance unless the law intercedes to counteract these forces (Rhode 1997; Schneider 2000; Manderson 2003; Husseini 2007).

So, why doesn't the law intercede? Given the formal recognition of domestic violence, rape, and sexual harassment as legally actionable harms, why are laws prohibiting them so inadequately enforced? Some feminists have argued that the pervasiveness, seriousness, and tenacity of these threats and the inadequacy of official responses reflect the patriarchal construction of gender itself on a model of dominance and submission. That is, the law reflects a way of thinking. According to this long-standing model masculinity means strength, forcefulness, aggressiveness, and domination. Femininity means delicacy, resistance, submission, and subordination. It makes the sexual game that of the male predator and the female prey. It makes coercion erotic. It also makes the distinction between persuasion and force a fine line that is easy to cross. If the distinction between normal sexual behavior and rape turns on a last minute decision by a woman to stop resisting and submit, then it will hardly be surprising if rape turns out to be a) very pervasive, and b) widely denied (MacKinnon 1989). Furthermore, if the very concept of masculinity—the meaning of manliness is not just strength but domination, then resorting to violence to enforce female subordination is a clear correlate of the model. Finally, if the natural relation between the sexes is taken to be both hierarchical and adversarial, then a male dominated legal system formulated by men from a male perspective is bound to protect the interests of men at the expense of women whenever the two conflict or are perceived to conflict. Thus, the patriarchal construction of gender makes domination the model of masculinity and rape (or at least power and submission) the model of sex (MacKinnon 1989; Schulhofer 1998, Schneider 2000; Estrich 1987, 2001; MacKinnon and Siegle 2004).

The feminist description and critique of the dominance model of sexuality has been widely misunderstood and commonly attacked as a condemnation of all sex, or as an indictment of all men as rapists. To some extent this was a response to a few exaggerated individual feminist claims that were highly publicized in the early 1970s. But in a more enduring sense it is due to several factors that illustrate the truth of feminist claims about the entrenchment of patriarchy as the status quo and the domination model of sexuality. Many feminists claim that the dominance model of sexuality is pervasive and universal: it is very common and applies everywhere. It affects how people think and interact in all cultures (MacKinnon 1989; Schneider 2000). This claim is susceptible to being reinterpreted by critics as a claim that every sexual act is an act of domination (or rape). Part of the reason for this difficulty is that once again feminists are arguing against the norm. If feminists are correct that domination is the patriarchal model of sexuality and patriarchy is the status quo, then it is not surprising if they appear to be arguing against sex itself. If sex is domination and feminists condemn domination, then feminists must condemn sex—according to anyone who cannot envision an alternative model of sex. Attacking feminists for their critique of the domination model, however, is attacking the messenger, since no feminist advocates the dominance model. They only describe and oppose it.

So, what is to be done? Early on feminists were rather divided about how to address this issue especially as a legal matter. Focusing on causes or influences, some feminists attempted to challenge media stereotypes for which they were criticized as censors. Some challenged the fashion and beauty industry with miniscule impact while suffering considerable personal ridicule for their efforts. Some focused on opposing pornography (especially violent pornography) as the symbol of the dominance model. Most of this turned out to be a losing battle in which the feminist message of opposing female subordination was converted into a Victorian condemnation of immoral sex, for which feminists were then criticized as prudes. All this illustrates the deep entrenchment of the domination model. Every attack is revised, reformulated, rephrased, reduced and if possible reversed altogether so that it fits the original model with as little conceptual revision or social restructuring as possible (Rhode 1997). It also shows that a conceptual model cannot be overcome by attack alone. It must be replaced by some other, more attractive or effective—way of thinking. Ultimately, the domination model (and with it rape and domestic abuse) will not die until it is replaced with a better model of masculinity (Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; MacKinnon and Siegle 2004).

In all these efforts the point was to attack the model directly by opposing the use and abuse of women as sex objects. While the particular campaigns failed, the basic underlying ideas seemed to get absorbed in a vague and general sort of way almost as if by osmosis. The ideas became somewhat accepted simply because people got used to them. And so, today the model of male dominance has been vaguely rejected by many individuals—both male and female, and by many societies as a formal principle. And the old model of femininity as weakness and dependence is rather widely rejected. Yet today, even in progressive societies that officially reject the old patriarchal model of sexuality in the abstract, its manifestations remain in legal doctrines, in public policy and in common attitudes and practices, even among men and women who believe they oppose it. It reflects an overarching world view that human beings have long been socialized to accept. Rejecting its manifestations requires identifying them.

Feminist scholars have identified many of these manifestations. Attitudes about rape and domestic violence provide many examples, not only in their continued prevalence, but also in official and informal responses to them. (While there are large and important differences between these two problems of violence toward women, the following are some similarities that have been noted.) Rape and domestic violence are (almost universally) illegal, but they are also widely denied or discounted. Deborah Rhode (1997) has called this phenomenon the “no problem” problem. It is often claimed that serious instances are rare and common instances are not serious. A victim's complaint is often viewed as exaggerated or even invented. And even if the victim is not considered to be lying outright, domestic violence and acquaintance rape are often viewed as personal matters. They are not “real crimes” like robbery or murder (unless the victim dies, and even then it is often discounted in cases of domestic abuse or honor killing. It is not as serious as a “real murder.”) And rape by an acquaintance is not “real rape.” Furthermore, it is said, these problems divert police from more important work, use up court time, and state resources. Police, clerks, judges, lawyers and juries often blame the victim and identify with the batterer or rapist. His conduct is considered inevitable, natural or at least understandable. She provoked him or tempted him. She made him angry or passionate. She controlled the situation, he did not; and she could have avoided it by altering her conduct, his being inevitable. And even, she deserved it because her behavior was unreasonable or dishonorable (Rhode 1997; Estrich 1987; Walker 1979; Schneider 2000).

Extensive statistical and scientific studies make clear that the attitudes noted above are unfounded in respect to male behavior being inevitable and women's behavior controlling the circumstances. There is no evidence that women can control the behavior of men who beat or rape them. And there is no evidence that most men cannot control their own violent behavior. Attitudes that excuse male violence are based on and reflect assumptions of male privilege and female subordination. They presuppose that ultimately men are entitled to dominate women, and women are expected to restrain themselves accordingly. Men are entitled to maintain control (of women) if necessary, by losing control (of their own behavior). So the problem is denied, and if it is acknowledged, responsibility for it is denied or shifted to the victim (Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; Hassan 1998; Manderson 2003; Husseini 2004; on sexual harassment see MacKinnon and Siegle 2004).

Another ground of denial is the view that these are private matters, not appropriate for law. Domestic disputes are better left to family members to resolve. The law should not intrude into the home and attempt to direct family life. And the intimacies of sexual interaction between acquaintances are too subtle and nuanced for legal intervention. Law is too blunt and clumsy an instrument to handle the intricacies of personal sexual conduct, it is claimed, even when it occurs in the context of employment or education, and involves men who are clearly in positions of power over the women who are the objects of their (unwelcome) attention (MacKinnon & Siegle 2004). In some societies sexual and family matters are left to religious and customary law, which may seriously disadvantage women by applying traditional rules that presume male dominance as an ancient heritage (Jeffry & Basu 1998; Hassan 1996; Reed & Pollit 2002; Manderson 2003; Husseini 2007).

It is true that law alone will not solve these problems. Education and research into their causes and solutions are needed. Yet, official and customary deference to male violence against women attests to the powerful patriarchal tradition that leaves men free to dominate women and leaves women without effective legal recourse to protect themselves. Some feminists have argued that violence against women (whether domestic abuse, rape, or sexual harassment) is best viewed as part of a systematically coercive environment that reinforces long-standing customs of male dominance (MacKinnon 1979; Schulhofer 1998; Schneider 2000). Women and girls are raped and abused precisely because they are female. The focus of abuse is not an accident. One problem with common legal approaches to violence against women is that each case is treated as an individual incident, an aberration from normal behavior. But it is not a coincidence that three to four million women and girls are violated every year and comparatively few men are ever convicted of causing this harm. It is part of a pattern, a cultural environment. This pattern discriminates against women. It was on this basis that Catharine MacKinnon (1979) argued successfully that sexual harassment should be recognized as a civil rights violation in the US: discrimination on the basis of sex. Great strides have been made in protecting women from sexual harassment, especially in the enactment of laws that recognize this conduct as illegal. But limits on enforcement are still great (MacKinnon and Siegle 2004).

Powerful feminist critiques of rape law have demonstrated that rape is treated differently from other crimes, none of which, for example, presume in advance that the victim is lying about the crime (Schulhofer 1998; Taslitz 1999; Schneider 2000). They have shown that sexist assumptions have produced unfair laws that fail to protect women and girls from sexual abuse and rape, as well as unfair trial procedures that not only fail to provide the victim her day in court, but that are so skewed and brutal that some victims have described them as second rapes. Some modest progress has been made in both law making and trial reform. Feminist lawyers have identified and described many of the deficiencies, but correcting them remains a challenge (Estrich 1987, 2001; Schulhofer 1998; Taslitz 1999).

Finally, feminist legal scholars have proposed legislation and trial practice procedures that would treat domestic violence as part of a systematic cultural environment that discriminates against women (Schneider 2000). These proposals are regularly undermined by (well meaning) therapeutic models that treat domestic violence as individual psychological problems of anger management or substance abuse, etc, rather than as part of a wide-spread social problem. Medical approaches often depersonalize the issue as “family dysfunction” or neutralize it as “spouse abuse.” The male perpetrator seems to disappear and responsibility fades as though the harm were caused by a disease rather than by a violent man, a responsible human agent. Clearly countering entrenched acceptance of male violence against women will take long term concerted effort. Impressive gains have been made, but much more is needed (Schneider 2000; Hassan 1998; Manderson 2003; MacKinnon 2006; Husseini 2007).

Denial is a large aspect of the problem. In part, the statistics are so disturbingly high that no one wants to believe them—so they must be inflated, exaggerated. Everyone wants to believe that violence against women (whether battery or rape) is exceptional, not common, especially among men who know them. But perhaps it should be recognized that this behavior can be both exceptional and yet common. Suppose that the high end statistics are true: one man out of five commits rape or battery. It follows that four out of five do not. It is not normal. It is not inevitable. Even in the worst case most men do not do it. It is exceptional. But on the other hand, even if one man in ten commits rape or battery, or sexual harassment, that is all too common. It is much more common than other crimes, especially violent crimes such as robbery or assault (that is not domestic). It must be recognized as common social behavior that is condoned or even approved by destructive cultural attitudes that extol violence as manly and treat women as subordinate or even disposable. According to feminists, this is clear discrimination. If a society declines to enforce its laws against murder, rape and assault against women to the fullest extent, it not only fails to provide equal protection, it fails to provide any protection. According to feminists the fact that the most basic function of law—protection of personal security—is so inadequately provided to women illustrates the continuing patriarchal bias of law and social custom. Denying the seriousness of such harms trivializes the legitimacy of women's most basic interests. It is the failure of legal authority—policy makers, courts and juries—to address the harm of violence against women that is a clear denial of equal protection of law.

5. Re-conceptualizing Basic Institutions: The Public/Private Distinction

Violations of physical security are not the only harms that the law is intended to address. During the 20th century a cause of action for discrimination, i.e. for unjust, prejudicial treatment came to be recognized in many societies. The antecedents to such laws are found in earlier protections of unpopular religious or political minorities in the form of rights to free expression of religion, speech, and press. Various protections intended to ensure fair treatment of accused criminals are also of this class. In the U.S. this idea of preventing discrimination by law manifested itself explicitly in the Civil War Amendments to the Constitution that were intended to correct injustice toward former slaves. These laws lay fallow for almost 100 years, but after the 1940s American courts slowly began to enforce them (especially the equal protection clause of the 14th Amendment) in order to address unjust treatment based on race. Then the U.S. Congress passed the Civil Rights Act of 1964 which explicitly established rights not to be discriminated against on the basis of race, sex, religion or national origin in areas that included employment, education and governmental benefits. Many nations have similar laws (phrased in varying language) and these have been or could be of considerable benefit to women, especially where bias is overt and provable. Unfortunately, in much of the world today discrimination is far from overt, but no less effective for its increased subtlety. Furthermore, it is clear at this point that long standing customs that disadvantage women are not identified as discriminatory. Feminists are working to identify, interpret, and describe these social arrangements in terms that are acceptable, persuasive and useful to courts, legislatures, or other persons in power, such as employers. Thus, the very nature and meaning of discrimination is a significant challenge for feminist philosophy of law (Rhode 1997; Williams 2001; Fineman 2004; Allen 2005; Nussbaum 2006).

In some ways progress toward equality has been substantial in many parts of the world. But in other respects advances have been slow, even in progressive nations. Women have been active participants in the public sphere in large numbers in many societies for thirty years or more. Yet the great majority remain clustered in the bottom or middle ranks in otherwise male dominated professions, or segregated into traditionally female fields. Politics remain strongly male dominated. And the top echelons of business are still a male preserve (Estrich 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007). This phenomenon has long been known as the “glass ceiling.” Women have earned high level degrees at a rate that is roughly equal to that of men in virtually all fields in one society or another for three decades or more. This varies by culture. For example, women in the U.S. are socialized to believe that they are inadequate in science and math, so fewer American women pursue those degrees. But in Eastern Europe medicine and engineering have had strong female participation for 50 years. Over time discriminatory conditioning seems to have less effect as information proliferates and role models slowly increase. And yet proportionately few women manage to crack the glass ceiling. Progress is exceedingly uneven, and individual cases alone do not signal social change. Unique women—Golda Meier or Margaret Thatcher—have always been accepted as exceptional leaders. Today Angela Merkel is Chancellor of Germany, but Parliament and business are still strongly dominated by men there (as everywhere). Nancy Pelosi is US Speaker of the House, but the general ratio of women to men in Congress is less than one out of six and the top ranks of business and professional life remain predominantly male. Despite increased educational, political and employment opportunities for women, the feminization of poverty continues to increase while equality of power remains elusive. Women consistently earn less for comparable work in the same field, and female dominated occupations are consistently paid less than male dominated ones, even when the male occupations require less education and involve less responsibility (Estrich 2001; Rhode 1997; Williams 2001; Roberts 2002; Allen 2005; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007).

Feminist scholars are asking why. The answers to this question are extremely complex and of course not entirely legal or philosophical. They are psychological, sociological, economic, and political. The questions for legal scholars and philosophers are to what extent are traditional attitudes and institutional arrangements that disadvantage (or exploit) women maintained or reinforced by law, and how (if at all) can law be used to equalize them?

Many societies have laws against discrimination, but feminists and working women in general have found that having laws against discrimination does not eliminate it. It does tend to make it invisible or at least covert. Few employers today, for example, would say outright, “We are not hiring women for this job,” even if they are not. So, identifying bias is not always easy, and is even less easy to prove. Much is hidden, unconscious, or hard to articulate. And much is built into the structure of institutions. On a structural level working women face a double bind of two sorts. The first involves the structure of work itself. A woman (if she is lucky enough to have a choice) may pursue a career (or a living) in a female or male dominated field. If she chooses a male dominated field the structural elements of the workplace (i.e. the social expectations, psychological stereotypes, the physical plant and equipment, organization of hours, scheduling, duties, etc.) are male. That is, they reflect typical and customary male needs, interests, abilities, and circumstances (which generally include a wife who handles home and family responsibilities). This organization puts women at a disadvantage, some elements of which may be actionable as discrimination in many societies at this point. But they can be difficult to identify, articulate and especially to verify and challenge because the structural organization is embedded in traditional assumptions of ordinary life (Williams 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007).

On the other hand if a woman chooses a female dominated field it may be more accommodating toward traditional female needs and responsibilities, but the field itself reinforces the traditional division of labor and reflects the subordinate status of women. It will generally provide little advancement and low pay, and will usually involve male superiors with considerable power over promotion, duties and work environment. Feminists have argued that both sides of this double bind constitute discrimination against women, but the burden of persuasion is difficult. In either case feminists are arguing against the norm (Williams 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007).

Little has been done to address the subordinate status of female dominated fields, and this is largely due to denial of the problem. These tend to be areas of seriously entrenched bias. Some reformers have argued for the idea of “comparable worth,” which would require comparing unrelated fields (such as nursing with plumbing, or child care with truck driving) in terms of levels of skill, training or education, and responsibility needed in order to provide cross gender comparisons for pay equity (Rhode 1997). This idea has been regarded as generally unworkable and has gained few supporters other than feminists. Furthermore, union organization has been slow, and only minimally effective, although some women's unions and collectives have provided important benefits in some countries (Chen 1995; Carr, et al. 1996). Overall, women's fields are plagued by bias and stereotyping, especially in traditional fields. Surveys have shown that it is widely thought that female dominated occupations require less ability and deserve less pay than identical work in male dominated occupations, and even more so where the work is different (Rhode 1997; Williams 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005). And women of color and ethnic minorities face double discrimination which sometimes creates double the complexity for legally addressing their unjust disadvantage (Crenshaw 1989; Matsuda 1987; Roberts 2002; Allen 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007). Yet, the majority of women in all societies are employed in female dominated jobs and occupations. Feminists have barely cracked the surface of this difficult set of issues.

A great deal of work has been done to address the problems of women entering male dominated fields. The first step is to identify the problem. Like many issues of gender bias the problem of professional or employment discrimination is widely denied, and where it is admitted responsibility to correct it is denied. It is often claimed that the problem has been fixed. Discrimination is now rare, it is said. In fact a common perception is that because of affirmative action programs employment opportunities now unfairly favor women at the expense of men and unfairly favor minority races over predominant ones in some societies (without acknowledging the cultural bias that affirmative action programs are intended to counteract). Unfortunately, these attitudes are often held by those in positions of power with regard to hiring and advancement. And these opinions are maintained in the face of statistics that show that women (including minority women) are not advancing at the same rate as men and are distinctly in the minority at upper levels of business and professional life—not to mention politics (Estrich 2001; Kellerman and Rhode 2007). Many “reasons” are given to supposedly explain the “phenomenon” of women's failure to succeed in the public sphere. Perhaps the most important (and devastating) claim is that women's failure to crack the glass ceiling in substantial numbers shows that they cannot compete. After all, it is argued, the market is neutral. Bias in the market is counter-productive. So, if women are being excluded in the market it must show that they are not as competent as the men who are succeeding (Williams 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007).

Feminists have responded. Deborah Rhode (1997, 143) calls this the “myth of merit.” The market is not neutral, she argues. There is a strong general bias to maintain the status quo. All people are most comfortable with what they are used to. The market is historically male, so customers and co-workers (both male and female) often prefer men in roles that have traditionally been filled by men. This bias gets stronger as the level of prestige and power gets higher. Some men are uncomfortable working for a woman. Some feel more comfortable working in an all male environment. And many do not even realize it. Male mentoring systems (which may take place in the locker room, the basketball court or the golf course) often exclude or disadvantage women. Supposedly objective rules may be applied differently to men and women. For example, a woman may be told the company does not allow part time work, but a man may be allowed to “cut back” in order to pursue some valued activity, such as holding political office. And women are often graded or evaluated lower on the basis of gender alone. Many studies have shown this. One study switched names on resumes submitted by job applicants. Resumes were ranked higher when male names were attached to them, while the same resumes with female names were ranked lower. And some symphony orchestras have discovered that the number of women musicians selected rose dramatically when applicants auditioned anonymously from behind a screen. Such studies can be used as evidence in discrimination cases based on a claim called (in the US) “disparate impact.” If a policy can be shown to have a disparate impact on a disadvantaged class of people (such as women, certain racial or religious minorities, or the disabled, for example) it can be used as a ground for presuming discrimination, and thus shifting the burden of justification to the proponent of the policy. So, being able to show a pattern of discriminatory effect can be the basis for a legal claim. Feminists have argued that this cause of action should be expanded because it would be a very powerful tool for social or institutional reform. But precisely because it is so powerful, resistance to it is very strong (Taub and Williams 1993; Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; Williams 2001; Fineman and Daugherty 2005). Thus, a major current objective of feminist legal philosophy is to analyze institutional structures to show that the playing field is not equal, even if the players do not recognize their own bias.

Stereotyping is another side of this problem. Identical behavior in men and women is perceived differently. Socializing in a man is viewed as work related (e.g. networking); in a woman as frivolous (e.g. gossiping). Women's successes are often discounted or attributed to luck, whereas men's are viewed as due to skill, drive or intelligence. Facts that confirm preconceived ideas are more readily remembered than facts that contradict them. Women's mistakes confirm their incompetence, while men's mistakes tend to be discounted. Women must prove themselves, whereas men's authority is assumed (Williams 2001). For example, women with advanced degrees are not assumed to be experts, but men with the same degrees are accepted as authoritative by students or other audiences. And stereotypes of appropriate behavior for men and women work against advancement for women. Assertiveness is leadership in a man but abrasiveness in a woman. If a woman is non-threatening and deferential she may be well liked but not taken seriously. (She lacks leadership qualities.) If she is assertive she may not be liked or respected. And the higher level the position the more subjective the criteria of evaluation are for achieving it (Rhode 1997; Fineman and Daugherty 2005). Very high level positions are determined on qualities such as leadership, creativity, or intellectual promise which may translate into a very personal assessment on the part of the evaluator in terms of whom he relates to or views as similar to himself. On these amorphous grounds 99% of Fortune 500 CEOs and 98% of the top earners in the US are still men. This experience is not much different globally. And women still earn 75 cents (at best) to the male dollar, among those who work full time. Many women, however, work part time or in the informal sector, and for them the situation is considerably worse. They are viewed as “choosing to fail,” that is, they prefer (on balance) low pay, dead end jobs because it allows them to avoid competition (which women are said to dislike) and/or it enables them to meet responsibilities to home and family more easily (Estrich 2001; Williams 2001; Fineman and Dougherty 2005; Kellerman and Rhode 2007)

This leads to the second double bind faced by working women, a double bind reflected and reinforced, for example, by labor law, property law and family law, all of which (among other things) favor the primary (and generally male) wage earner over the (generally) female caregiver even though the majority of women (in most western societies) today are also wage earners (Williams 2001). As the workplace is currently structured, work and family responsibilities are not mutually compatible. This reflects the old traditional division of labor into public and private spheres of male and female responsibility. Early on feminists recognized the power of the theoretical distinction between the public and the private in the organizational structure of the family, the market and the state (Olsen 1983). Throughout history and in many societies today women have been relegated to the private domestic sphere and thus excluded from the powerful activities of market and politics. This dichotomy has been challenged by feminists on many levels. Joan Williams (2001), among others, has addressed one part of it as the “work/family conflict.” She points out that the long standing culture of domesticity (or the ideal of the domestic woman) divides roles by gender into the separate spheres of the perfect worker and the perfect mother. The perfect worker is available to work long hours or weekends, to relocate if necessary, take work home after hours, attend extra functions, and over all to offer undivided attention and allegiance to his work, without any distractions of family or other competing obligations. The first and foremost responsibility of the perfect worker is his work. This does not conflict with his family obligation, which is financial support. On the other hand, the perfect mother is on call twenty-four hours a day to be there for her children, to provide for the needs of her family. Her duties are domestic and personal, and not easily delegated; and her first and foremost responsibility is to take care of her family. Obviously a perfect mother cannot be a perfect worker and vice versa. This social structure is reflected and reinforced by law, which also favors the male role and treats the female domestic role as subordinate and dependent. This simply reflects tradition. Law could be reformed to counteract it (Williams 2001; Okin 1995).

Communist societies that purported to institute equality for women from the top down, so to speak, failed to accomplish their goal precisely by overlooking the obvious conflict between the perfect mother and the perfect worker. In fact the power of the domestic model of motherhood and the burden of women's domestic labor has been and is still repeatedly undervalued and under estimated. For example, in China, it has been noted, the Communist model of equality superimposed a thin veneer of equal gender relations over 5,000 year old patriarchal customs that strongly socialized women to the roles of obedient and deferential wife and daughter. Combining these norms with Communist women's equal obligations as workers created double obligations for women without any real recognition of the double role as a double burden (Li 1995). Some feminists have noted that the Soviet Communist idea of gender equality and its post-communist development created a triple burden, as women were expected to function in three roles: wife and mother; good worker or professional; and social activist (Petrova 1993). And today, as women enter the public sphere around the globe, they carry the burdens of the private sphere with them, because the institutional structure has not been changed to accommodate social and economic evolution, or to recognize the value of traditional women's work (Fineman 1995, 2004).

This has caused women to be at a serious disadvantage both at work and at home (Okin 1995; Williams 2001; Roberts 2002; Fineman and Dougherty 2005). In the workplace it has been noted that despite the many forms of discrimination described above, many women are able to progress quite well as long as they function as perfect workers (i.e. as men). These women also have the greatest legal resources to combat discrimination, which shows that the workplace has changed little and that the standard of evaluation is still male (Estrich 2001; Williams 2001; Fineman 2004). This precludes women from being mothers and still being treated as equals in the workplace. Many instances of discrimination appear to start when a woman becomes a mother, even if her work product has not changed. And many women find themselves in the double bind of being disliked and disapproved of as bad mothers or discounted and disrespected as uncommitted workers. This has been identified as discrimination and is often legally actionable. Joan Williams (2001) has called this additional barrier the “maternal wall,” and adds it to the “glass ceiling” as a form of illegal discrimination. But it remains difficult to prove and difficult to counteract. Feminist philosophers of law have offered a variety of proposals for counteracting it (Williams 2001; Rhode 1997; Estrich 2001; Fineman 2004; Allen 2005). Some societies handle the coordination of family and work better than others, and some progress has been made in some places, but the burdens of domestic labor in the private sphere remain greatly undervalued and largely invisible, and the stereotype of the domestic and nurturing mother is deeply entrenched.

The domestic caregiver in the form of the nurturing mother is one of the most mystified roles on the planet. She is honored in poetry and song. Holidays are addressed to her and yet her work is consistently discounted, undervalued and unpaid. The labor of love cannot be measured in money, it is said. And thus, in the courts of law the vast majority of women are gravely disadvantaged in divorce, child custody, and property settlement (Weitzman 1987, 1992; Williams 2001; Fineman 2004). In the economic sphere mothers are seriously disadvantaged, and as a result in the home they are left dependent on and vulnerable to male breadwinners. And in some societies the de-valued status of wives and daughters leaves them without inheritance, property, and in some cases without adequate food, health care, or education (Okin 1995; Sen 1995; Chen 1983, 1995; Carr, et al. 1996). Many feminist legal scholars have offered proposals for revising some family laws with some modest success. Some have suggested pay scales for traditional domestic duties, and alternative models for custody suits and property settlements (Williams 2001; Jain 1995; Olsen 1983). And some feminists have analyzed the domestic ideal itself, suggesting an alternative legal model of the family. Martha Fineman (1995, 2004) has argued that the state has no reason to reinforce and privilege the sexual family—the sexual relation between a man and a woman that is the traditional basis of marriage as a legal institution. Rather, the care-giving relation is what should be encouraged and supported by the state. This could be modeled on the ideal nurturing relation of mother and child, but should apply to any caregiver and dependent. One problem with the care-giving role is that it makes the care-giver dependent on another source of income, typically and traditionally a breadwinner. It is this dependent status of the care-giver that needs to be addressed in law and public policy, assuming that care-giving is a positive and indeed a crucial role in human life. According to this view, the myth of autonomy is an unfortunate side effect of a male perspective that tends to make the private domestic sphere both invisible and de-valued (Fineman 1995, 2004). And this issue is further complicated by the intersection of gender with race and class (Roberts 2002).

This de-valuation and invisibility has contributed directly to the feminization of poverty, which is now a problem of global proportions. Global poverty is getting worse, and increasingly women bear the brunt of it. Two billion people (about one out of three) live in extreme poverty on less than two dollars a day. About 800 million go to bed hungry every night, and eight million die from poverty related causes each year. More than seventy per cent of them (nearly three fourths) are female. So serious are the effects of extreme poverty on women (and girls) that the World Health Organization has named it a disease (Z59.5) and called it “the world's most ruthless killer” (Jain 2005, 138).

The reasons for the feminization of poverty are complex and differ in important respects by culture. Some women are poor because their society is poor—devastated by natural disasters or war and social turmoil, or sapped by corrupt officials or colonial powers. Some are refugees, and some are sick, old, or disabled. Many of the poor are children. It has been noted that extreme poverty for both men and women is attributable to a variety of entrenched traditional structures such as class or caste hierarchies, ethnic or religious discrimination and unequal land distribution (Carr, Chen & Jhabvala 1996). And often these long term structural problems are aggravated by globalization, world markets, economic restructuring and such recent trends in the world economy. Women's poverty results from all these factors: being part of a poor family, village, or region, but is compounded by the subordination of women within the family, community or social structure at large. When poverty is bad it is worse for women. When food and medicine are short the most deprived are women and girls. Norms of seclusion, exclusion from inheritance, lack of credit, lack of training and education all disadvantage women and girls. In all societies the poorest women carry compounded burdens of discrimination by race, class, caste or religion as well as sex discrimination (Roberts 1995; Matsuda 1987; Crenshaw 1989; Chen 1995).

Many programs have been proposed and initiated to alleviate this problem. Women's unions and cooperative associations have been formed. New models of credit and lending are being tested. The UN, various NGOs and Women's Organizations, as well as national and local organizations have been working to increase opportunities for literacy and employment for women and girls (Carr, Chen & Jhabvala 1996; Jain 2005; Nussbaum & Glover 1995). Yet poverty and polarization are increasing in many societies. Many feminists are now of the view that institutional reform is critical to the well being of women. The sharp distinction between public and private labor needs to be recognized as an artificial one (Fineman and Dougherty 2005). As noted by Chen (1983:220) “so long as policy-makers make the artificial distinction between the farm and the household, between paid work and unpaid work, between productive and domestic work, women will continue to be overlooked.” Thus, the interaction between private labor and the public good must be, and is beginning to be, acknowledged. For example, contributions of unpaid labor should be included in estimates of GDPs; contributions of work in the informal sector (which tends to be dominated by women and low income men) is increasingly being included in national and institutional studies potentially affecting economic policy; and unpaid domestic labor is now sometimes considered as having monetary value in court cases. This increases the visibility and leverage of women over their own lives. And yet the invisibility and de-valuation of women's work in the private sphere is deeply entrenched.

Some feminists have concluded that, like the dominance model of sexuality, the domestic model of women's unpaid labor may not be addressed by denouncing it directly. It may (also) require incremental erosion by addressing its causes and effects. That is, it must gradually be replaced with a better model. According to Chen, for example, (ideological) arguments for the equality of women in rural India and Bangladesh were met with great resistance, but when the approach was revised to provide pragmatic assistance for economic development to poor women that substantially improved their lives (and thus the lives of their families) resistance substantially decreased. Dreze and Sen (1989:58) have noted “considerable evidence that greater involvement in outside work does tend to go with less anti-female bias in intra-family distribution.” Respect for women apparently increases as their independence increases.

So many feminists have concluded at this point that it is critical to “mainstream” women into the public sphere, thereby increasing their visibility as economic contributors and thus, their control over their own lives. It is crucial to weaken the public/private distinction to make the general work environment more hospitable to parents and caregivers in general. And it is imperative to continue to raise feminist consciousness: to identify the bias of male norms, and yet to attend to the contextual surroundings necessary for an accurate assessment of complex human relations, as well as pragmatic solutions to longstanding entrenched inequality. Law is a critical tool in this effort (Okin 1995; Stark 2004; Williams 2000).

Law will always reinforce the status quo in general and well it should. That is its purpose. It is necessary for social stability. But as applied to particular practices and assumptions, it can be a tool of entrenchment or reform. It can be an anchor to the past or an engine for the future. Each function has its place. Feminist legal philosophy is an effort to examine and reformulate legal doctrine to overcome entrenched bias and enforced inequality of the past as it structures human concepts and institutions for the future.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

abortion | affirmative action | citizenship | civil rights | equality | exploitation | feminism, approaches to | feminist (interventions) | feminist (topics) | feminist (topics): perspectives on autonomy | justice | justice-inequalhealth | legal rights | liberty | parenthood and procreation | pornography: and censorship | privacy | rights | rights: human | social institutions | social minimum [basic income] | social norms | well-being


The editors would like to thank Samara Casewell for assistance with the bibliography.