Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Nov 15, 2004

An idiolect, if there is such a thing, is a language that can be characterised exhaustively in terms of intrinsic properties of some single person at a time, a person whose idiolect it is at that time. The force of ‘intrinsic’ is that the characterisation ought not to turn on features of the person's wider linguistic community. Some think that this notion of an idiolect is unstable, and instead use ‘idiolect’ to describe a person's incomplete or erroneous grasp of their language, where this latter is inherently social.

Several important debates have featured discussion of individualistic, personal, or private languages. Some are considered in other entries (see the entries on the language of thought hypothesis, private language, and reference). This entry will concentrate on two influential and broadly idiolectal positions in the philosophy of language and linguistics: Noam Chomsky's preference for I-languages over E-languages (Section 2), and Donald Davidson's rejection of languages conceived as shared conventional structures that make communication possible (Section 3). David Lewis's claim that languages are a convention is a common target for both, and is outlined in an Appendix. The entry begins (Section 1) with some general remarks about the ontology of languages.

1. Idiolects and Language Individuation

Key to the notion of an idiolect is the fact that there are two distinct ways of individuating a natural language, L:

L = the language with specific grammatical properties, as set out in a linguistic theory

L = the language possessed, or used, by some specific individual or population

Thus L can be thought of as that which is correctly described by a set of claims attributing various properties to it, including syntactic, phonological, morphological, semantic, and other properties. In this sense, languages are abstract objects. But languages can also be realized in the world, and it is in this guise that they become suitable objects of empirical investigation. The ‘realization’ of a language is more familiarly expressed as its being ‘possessed’, ‘known’, ‘spoken’, ‘understood’, or ‘used’ by an individual or population. Understanding how best to take the assertion that a natural language, as individuated in the clauses of a grammatical theory, is realized in (possessed by, etc.) a particular individual or population is a tricky matter. It is also fundamental to any philosophy of language.

To illustrate the contrast between these two ways of individuating a natural language, consider English. This can be conceived of as the abstract object described by a grammatical theory that might include clauses such as (1) and (2) below. This object is identical with the L that is somehow realized in a collective made up of typical inhabitants of countries such as Australia, England, Ireland, etc.

(1) ‘Blue’ is an adjective in L, and it refers to the property of being blue

(2) In L, adjectives immediately precede the noun phrases they qualify

It is to these inhabitants that one would look in developing a grammatical theory of English, were that one's ambition.

The properties of a dialect such as 17th century Somerset English are tied to a more narrowly circumscribed population with some affiliation to the English county of Somerset at that time. An idiolect is simply the result of slimming down still further to arrive at the language that, stipulatively, is somehow realized in a single individual at a particular time.

Although the properties of x's idiolect are tied stipulatively to intrinsic properties of x, this in itself does not mean that two distinct individuals could not share an idiolect, or have a pair of significantly overlapping idiolects. What makes a perspective on language idiolectal is not its insistence that languages cannot be shared, but that it drops any appeal to languages whose properties are tied essentially to a population. It will rely instead on an ontology of idiolects that more or less overlap. By contrast, non-idiolectal perspectives require an ontology that includes languages that can be grasped more or less adequately, the properties of which depend on characteristics of the community at large and not just of some specific member of that community.

Davidson and Chomsky have different understandings of what it is for a single person to realize an idiolect, though how far these different emphases reflect distinct but compatible agendas rather than fundamentally competing visions is not immediately clear.

For Chomsky, a language is realized in an individual if that individual's brain has certain characteristics. Specifically, the brain's ‘language faculty’ realizes an idiolect by ‘representing’ it, and a central task for theoretical linguists is to make what is represented explicit in the form of a theory. For all that, the brain properties that interest Chomsky are species-wide rather than unique to an individual. This seems paradoxical given the individualism that seems to follow from taking idiolects rather than shared languages as one's focus. But as will become clear (Section 2), Chomsky's ambition is to understand what it is about humans in general that enables them to acquire adult linguistic competence given the right environment. Thinking of languages as shared or communal objects does not, in his view, help in the development of an empirically plausible theory of this process, and is often a distraction.

Davidson's criterion for an idiolect's being realized in a particular individual has a behaviourist tinge, perhaps because of the intellectual debt he owes to Quine. Quine, in effect, individuates languages in terms of ‘translation manuals’ — roughly, semantic theories. A language individuated this way is realized in an individual if the translation manual successfully predicts her or his willingness to assent to different sentences in different circumstances. But Quine is loathe to allow that the manual is somehow represented within the brain of, or known by, the individual (Quine 1970). Davidson seems to be following this line when he refuses to attribute knowledge of the clauses of a Tarskian truth theory to those whom such a theory could be used to interpret (Davidson 1976; Davidson 1986, 1990). Many neo-Davidsonians (e.g., Larson and Segal 1995) follow Davidson in approaching semantic phenomena through the lens of recursive theories of truth (see Donald Davidson), but reject his latent behaviourism in favour of an ontology of languages that is closer in spirit to Chomsky's. For them, the clauses of a truth theory should consist of an explicit statement of something that individual speakers genuinely know, albeit tacitly. Tacit knowledge is supposed to be a cognitive state and not merely a disposition to behave.

Most theoretical linguists disavow themselves of any fundamental commitment to a folk ontology of languages, which might include English, Hungarian, Tagalog, Old Norse, etc. They allow that the existence of such a folk ontology is important to acknowledge, particularly for sociolinguists, since its existence makes a difference to linguistic and wider political practice. But the objects actually posited by this ontology are felt to be ill-suited for scientific enquiry. The operating notion of a language is instead that of an idiolect, often in Chomsky's developed sense of this term (an I-language). So although a label like ‘Hungarian’ will inevitably be used in practice, it is normally intended to be thought of as convenient shorthand for ‘The idiolect of some arbitrary but typical inhabitant of present-day Hungary’.

Grounds for the rejection of folk ontologies differ. One widely offered reason is that determining a folk language's properties is, unavoidably, a prescriptive (ergo non-scientific) exercise. One example often cited is the case of the English word ‘livid’. The “proper” or dictionary meaning of this word is pale or bluish. Most English speakers lean towards thinking it means red. Similarly, to the consternation of some who claim to know what English really is, English speakers regularly split infinitives, and see the use of ‘hopefully’ in (3) as no less acceptable than its use in (4) despite being a ‘Germanism’.

(3) Hopefully, all the passengers will escape by helicopter

(4) The passengers looked hopefully at the helicopter

The problem with these judgements is not that they are obnoxiously conservative. Even liberal takes on what counts as acceptable English are grounded in normative claims, such as: ‘If a significant minority of the population want to split their infinitives, then splitting infinitives is okay’, or ‘If the use of a word with a novel meaning is found to have occurred five times in print, that meaning is included in our dictionary’. It is not specific manifestations of normativity but normativity per se, seemingly unavoidable in the determination of the properties of English (and other languages in the folk sense), that is unwelcome in the present context.

A different case against adopting the folk ontology is that the delineation of a population as speakers of a single language is often driven by socio-political considerations. Serbo-Croatian ceased to exist as a language along with the old Yugoslavia in the 1990s. Or again, some Dutch dialects are closer in linguistic respects to neighbouring dialects of German than they are to dialects from the opposite edge of the Netherlands, despite being grouped with the latter but not the former as variants of the same language. This grouping is of no greater interest to a science of language than other legacies of the Treaty of Westphalia in 1648. The concern here is not well captured in the observation that languages in the folk sense are fuzzy. The special sciences are replete with fuzziness. Rather, the worry is that any object whose individuation conditions are determined by socio-political factors should not figure in the fundamental ontology of science. Since the same arguments against languages in the folk sense could be repeated for dialects in the folk sense, there is little to be gained by adopting a more fine-grained version of the folk ontology. For these reasons, if linguists countenance countable languages at all, they usually think in terms of idiolects or languages in some other technical sense of the word.

Many are critical of the idea that idiolects could be languages in their own right. Reasons vary, but most turn on the claim that linguistic practice is essentially social. Lewis regards a language as a community's solution to a co-ordination problem, the problem of fixing on an arbitrary but shared meaning for expressions for the sake of communication (see Appendix). A different kind of reservation has to do with the intuition that successful reference often depends on the existence within the speech community of experts or figures invested with an authority to fix what certain words means. For example, what species of tree a person is referring to when they use the word ‘elm’ may depend on the existence of people able to distinguish between elms and other trees in a way that the actual speaker is not. The latter is able to refer to the species only by using the word with an attitude of linguistic deference to these authorities (Putnam 1975). Others have claimed that the notion of an idiolect is incompatible with an intuition that ought to be respected: we can be wrong in what we take a word to mean (see Dummett 1983, 1991, ch. 4; George 1990; Wiggins 1997).

2. Chomsky on I-languages and E-languages

2.1 The Origins of Chomsky's Distinction: Competence vs. Performance

Chomsky's distinction between I- and E-languages is a more recent incarnation of his earlier distinction between linguistic competence and linguistic performance, first introduced in the course of criticising behaviourist approaches to language and mind (Skinner 1957; Chomsky 1959, 1965: 4-5). Linguistic competence is the underlying knowledge that gives rise to linguistic performance, i.e., observable behaviour.

By ‘linguistic competence’, Chomsky does not have in mind the competence we talk of when we say that someone ‘has only weak competence in Spanish’. For reasons sketched earlier, competence in this sense is a prescriptive notion, and so not one to which Chomsky would assign any place in a theory that purports to explain a natural phenomenon. Nor is this competence constituted by the ability a person has to speak or write as they do. Even if this interpretation of ‘competence’ is closer to ordinary usage than Chomsky's is, it would erase the very distinction Chomsky is insisting on between underlying knowledge and the performance made possible by this underlying knowledge. ‘Competence’, then, is to be interpreted as picking out a hypothetical body of unconscious knowledge that enters into but is not exhausted by its possessor's linguistic performance. This knowledge is embodied in a discrete ‘language faculty’, a component of the human brain.

One simple empirical reason for suspecting that the distinction between competence and performance corresponds to a difference in reality is that people occasionally lose the overt ability to speak or understand a language, only to re-acquire the ability later on, more or less instantaneously, with no re-learning required. The most plausible explanation of this recovery is that something — by hypothesis the patient's linguistic competence — never really went away. Only the temporary loss of a performance mechanism prevented it manifesting itself.

Behaviourist theories and methodology were intended to yield generalizations over performance per se, rather than discoveries about the competence that is manifest in but not constituted by this performance. The essence of Chomsky's criticism of this ambition was that linguistic performance is an interaction effect, with contributing factors additional to core linguistic competence including:

On the production side: Decisions over what to say, which words to use, how loud to speak, whether to speak in English, whether to use an idiom and if so which, whether to speak on the phone or send an email, as well as the presence or absence of verbal tics, hiccups, and whether one has a functioning larynx, whether those components of one's brain that enable vocalization are in good working order, etc.

On the understanding side: Whether a passing jet plane is drowning out all sound, whether one's capacity to distinguish phonemes is unaffected by, say, a stroke, whether one has functioning short-term memory, etc.

Attempting to come up with a systematic theory of an interaction effect of this complexity is very unlikely to succeed, nor is it obvious why one would hope to come up with one. Skinner's failure to provide anything like such a theory — manifest in his reliance on laboratory conditions to suppress the effects of humans' capacity to make free and rational decisions — was taken by Chomsky to reflect poorly on the project of developing a theory of performance, not on Skinner's specific execution of that project.

Chomsky's proposal is that the underlying body of knowledge is more fruitful an object of scientific enquiry than the performance phenomena it gives rise to in combination with a myriad of other factors — including the relatively distal ones listed above, but more immediately the cognitive systems that interface directly with the language faculty: the ‘conceptual-intentional’, perceptual, and speech-production systems. Performance phenomena are vital sources of evidence for any theory of competence but a complete understanding of them, he suggests, is quite possibly beyond the scope of scientific investigation. At the heart of a responsible and realistic science of language should be a theory of linguistic knowledge, not language use.

Chomsky's terminology has shifted over the years but his underlying concern with what speakers unconsciously know (or ‘believe’, or ‘cognize’ or ‘represent’) has remained. The contrast he draws between I-languages and E-languages can be understood against this background. The purpose of this particular terminological innovation is to cast suspicion on individual languages as they are conceived by supporters of non-Chomskian approaches to linguistic phenomena.

2.2 Chomsky's Distinction Elaborated

The canonical statement of the distinction is in Chomsky 1986, Ch. 2 (though see also Chomsky 1988, 1995; 2000). The ‘I’ in ‘I-language’ stands for ‘internal’. An I-language is an abstract state the ‘mind/brain’ can be in, an informational state or state of knowledge. In other words, it is a state of competence in the sense just given. The ‘E’ in ‘E-language’ stands for ‘external’. The properties of an E-language are ‘independent of the properties of the mind/brain’ (1986: 20). They cannot be read off from characteristics of the language module of the E-language's possessor, being determined at least partially by external characteristics such as their overt behaviour or the social or physical environment. The folk notion of a language could be regarded as an E-language notion, but Chomsky is also targeting several technical notions favoured by many who themselves would not necessarily embrace the folk notion.

‘I’ and ‘E’ are occasionally said by Chomsky to stand for terms other than ‘internalist’ and ‘externalist’. ‘I’ is sometimes said to stand for ‘individualistic’ and ‘intensionalist’, with ‘E’ sometimes standing for ‘extensionalist’ (e.g., Chomsky 1995: 26). A simple way through the potential confusion of this is to take the ‘internal/external’ contrast outlined above as basic, and see him as asserting the equivalence of the other contrasts with this basic one.

The use of ‘I-language’ for ‘individualistic’ is perhaps the most confusing, since the intended contrast would appear to be with social, non-idiolectal conceptions of a language, under which it is a community rather than an individual that possesses one. But some approaches that it would be proper to classify on the E-language side of Chomsky's contrast — Quine's, for example — are idiolectal in the sense introduced earlier. But when one considers why Quine and others insist on overt behaviour as the arbiter of what language a person speaks, their non-individualism becomes apparent. For Quine, and indeed for Davidson, what a person means when they speak is a matter of what it would be reasonable for others to interpret them as meaning while using as evidence only the speaker's observable behaviour. Anything internal is hidden and hence otiose.

The contrast between ‘intensionalist’ and ‘extensionalist’ conceptions of languages is more precise, and maps more readily onto the internalist/externalist contrast just outlined. The terminology here derives from ways of specifying sets. To specify a set extensionally is just to list its membership, for example as:

{2, 3, 5, 6, 7}

To specify a set intensionally is to give a rule for its generation. For example, the set above could be specified using either of two extensionally equivalent intensions:

{x: x is less than ten and is either a prime positive integer or is the product of two distinct prime positive integers}

{x: x is a positive integer greater than one and less than ten, and there are no positive integers among its square or cube roots}

Likewise, abstract properties of a language could, in principle, be generated using alternative intensions or rule systems. For example, suppose a mapping of vocabulary strings onto ‘Grammatical/Ungrammatical’ could be effected using a rule system that derives passive constructions from active ones. Suppose further that this same mapping could be effected using a rule system that derives active constructions from passive ones. These two rules systems would be extensionally equivalent but intensionally distinct (Quine 1970). Similarly, two extensionally equivalent semantic theories could assign identical truth conditions to sentences in a language despite pairing the same proper name with distinct objects (Wallace 1977).

In its extentionalist/intensionalist guise, the E/I contrast comes to this. Let L be the language that is possessed by (realized in) a given user of language or speech community, under some conception of the realization relation. That conception is an extensionalist one if, were some theory θ to characterise L correctly, so too would any theory θ* that is extensionally equivalent to θ (figure 1).

Figure 1: E-languages admit of correct description by grammatical theories that are merely extensionally equivalent

For example, if what determines whether you possess English is that you make a suitable division of strings of vocabulary into the grammatical and the ungrammatical, there is no fact of the matter as to whether English is a passive-from-active or an active-from-passive language. By contrast, the conception will be intensionalist if discrimination can and ought to be made between extensionally equivalent theories that differ in their internal derivational structure (figure 2).

Figure 2: I-languages can be described correctly by one grammatical theory while other extensionally equivalent theories are incorrect

It is not hard to see why the intensionalist/extensionalist contrast is likely to track the internalist/externalist contrast. To illustrate how externalism can give rise to extensionalism, take the Quinean thought that a language in the abstract (a ‘translation manual’) is realized in a person if, and only if, it captures their dispositions to assent to particular sentences in particular circumstances (or ‘stimulus conditions’). This externalist position is also extensionalist since any two translation manuals will be equally adequate if they pair the same sentences with the same stimulus conditions, no matter how radically they differ in their clauses or derivational structures (Quine 1960). Another example is David Lewis's externalist conception of what it is for a language to be realized (see the Appendix for further details). According to him, a population realizes a language if it is governed by a convention that allows them to co-ordinate effectively with one another by uttering sentences of the language. So a language in the abstract, for him, is just a pairing of sentences with meanings, and a theory of the language is correct just in case it entails this pairing. In principle, two theories could differ in their internal structure but agree over which sentences are paired with which meanings (Lewis 1975: 175-178). At a very general level, what drives both Quine and Lewis is the assumption that to possess a language is to have an ability. So long as the output of a theory of this language, its theorems, describes this ability, the theory's internal structure is irrelevant. The theorems can be thought of as describing a function in extension. How the function is described in intension, i.e., what the theory's internal clauses are, adds nothing to the description of the ability. Internal theoretical structure may be relevant to how the ability is possessed, but how the ability is possessed is distinct from the ability itself.

Conversely, an internalist approach is likely to require discrimination between extensionally equivalent but intensionally distinct theories. Suppose θ is proffered as a theory of an individual speaker's competence, i.e., as an explicit statement of what they know, where this is internal in the sense that having such knowledge consists in facts about a speaker's brain rather than in overt performance. A different theory, θ*, might agree with θ in its output yet fail to capture the knowledge as it is represented, somehow, in the speaker's mind.

Even internalists would allow that some linguistic theories are mere notional variants of one another. At what point does notional variation become empirically significant difference? With mixed success, some philosophers have tried to spell out a criterion for empirical significance in terms of whether the structure of a theory of L is isomorphic to the structure of the realization of L in the brain of a given speaker.[1] For Chomsky, one way in which a difference between two extensionally equivalent theories might emerge is that, even when both are descriptively adequate, only one is explanatorily adequate. To see what he means by this we need to turn to his motives for adopting the I-language perspective. These are grounded in his nativism about language.

2.3 Why I-languages? Why not E-languages?

The main reason Chomsky offers for adopting the I-language perspective is that to study I-languages is to study something ‘more real’, less abstract, than E-languages.[2] Claims of relative reality are difficult to quantify, and this assertion has more bite when interpreted, as is apparently intended, as the assertion that I-languages have their place in a scientific study when there is no corresponding scientific study within which E-languages can be embedded.

The scientific study to which the notion of an I-language belongs is, not surprisingly, the Chomskian one, which seeks among other things to understand how we acquire language. Language acquisition can be described as the development in states of the brain from S0 through intermediate states into a relatively stable mature state, SM. S0 is the initial state common to all humans with no language impairment, abstracting away from differences that have nothing to do with language. Subsequent states arise through exposure to a specific linguistic environment. (It is safe to say that S0 is common to all biologically normal children because, for example, a child does not need to be of German descent to end up speaking German.) Nothing so far requires that these states be thought of as representational states of knowing a language. But thinking of them this way makes it easier to state and evaluate the debate between empiricist and nativist theories of language acquisition. Suppose that to be in state SL (0 ≤ LM) is to know a language L, i.e., to know a grammar for L, a grammar that a linguist might in principle make explicit in a theory of L. This is to conceive of language acquisition as a process in which children move through a sequence of states of knowledge of different languages (or I-languages, to prevent confusion with ‘languages’ in any other sense). The empiricist/nativist debate can now be couched as a debate over what information must already be represented in the initial state S0 if the environmentally provided information is to culminate in knowledge of the mature language M. Empiricists claim that none is.[3] Nativists claim that some is provided, in the form of innate knowledge of a language dubbed Universal Grammar (UG) by Chomsky (figure 3).

Figure 3: Competing empiricist and nativist accounts of language acquisition contrasted

Chomsky and others in the research programme associated with him have tried to show that the information taken from a child's environment is rarely sufficient to account for the adult competence they go on to achieve. They infer that anterior knowledge must be acting as mental stirrups. This argument for UG is an instance of what has come to be known as an argument from the poverty of the stimulus (see Laurence and Margolis 2001, and the entry on innateness and language). If it is sound then all natural human languages must be thought of as modifications of UG. Because all children assume unquestioningly that their linguistic environment conforms to the principles of UG, their language faculties develop accordingly, with the happy result that all linguistic environments do in fact conform to the principles of UG, rendering their initial assumption correct. Chomsky suggests that environmentally caused differences between languages are slight when set against the commonalities owed to our species inheritance.

It is now possible to see why Chomsky thinks it could turn out that just one of two extensionally equivalent theories of an I-language is acceptable. Suppose the theorems of θ and θ* are identical in describing some aspect of mature linguistic skill. If only θ is a modification of UG, then it must be θ and not θ* that is internally represented. This is what Chomsky means when he says that a theory must be explanatorily adequate and not merely descriptively adequate. Explanatorily adequate theories are consistent with UG, meaning that only the languages they describe could be acquired by a human child.

In summary: statements about I-languages (in the form of specific grammars) are ‘statements about the structures of the brain formulated at a certain level of abstraction from mechanisms’, rather than descriptions of an overt ability. This notion of an I-language earns its keep through its role in the project just described. By treating states on the path to normal mature linguistic competence in humans as states of knowledge, where what is known is an object (an I-language), an important empirical generalisation can be stated and confirmed: that the linguistic environment provides enough information for children to reach their mature state only when it is complemented with innate knowledge of a grammar for UG.

What about E-languages? Chomsky's complaint is that there is no legitimate project, or at least no legitimate scientific project, to which the notion of an E-language belongs as an essential ingredient. The case for this negative claim is similar to the case against performance theories outlined earlier. The properties of an E-language are determined by how an I-language is used, and as such their systematic characterisation in a theory will be practically impossible. They are, simply, unsuitable objects of scientific investigation.

One particularly controversial feature of Chomsky's case against E-languages is that it applies, he thinks, to theories of reference. If he is right, semantics as it is often pursued is a discipline in trouble. Notions like reference and truth could only belong to a theory of language use, since referring is something people do with words, not a standing relation between words and objects in the world. Unsurprisingly, then, intuitions about whether a statement is or would be true under particular conditions are susceptible to seemingly intractable contextual influences. Even if the extensional properties of language are tractable, it is unclear why we would want a systematic theory of them when they are so deeply mottled.[4]

2.4 Criticism of Chomsky's Preference for I-languages Over E-Languages

Resistance to I-languages and Chomsky's philosophy of language more generally has often centred on the nature of the realization relation at its heart. Chomsky has called this relation one of ‘knowledge’ of the grammar. This knowledge is not like knowledge as it has traditionally been conceived by philosophers, and his position has been criticized from the premise that genuine knowledge must be conscious, inferentially promiscuous, objective, and even that it must be verbalizable.[5] Chomsky has replied that his choice of the word ‘knowledge’ should be seen as inessential to his core claims. Its use is provocative but supererogative, a challenge to philosophers who place a priori constraints on what is to count as knowledge. He often backs away from this controversy by using ‘to cognize’ or ‘to represent’, specially introduced terms of art, to stand for the cognitive relation speakers bear to their I-language. These are less philosophically loaded than ‘to know’. Moreover, when he writes that “one task of the brain sciences…is to discover the mechanisms that are the physical realization of the state SL” (1986: 22), he is allowing that the exact nature of the relation is still unknown.

Other critics have argued that even if it is possible to talk about a speaker's knowledge of a linguistic theory, what a language is, and what linguists do or ought to investigate, is independent of any particular speaker's knowledge of it. Sometimes this is expressed in terms of the need to keep in mind a distinction between linguistics and psycholinguistics, where only the latter is concerned with the nuances of our knowledge of the objective features of language.[6]

The internalist conception of language has also been criticized for failing to allow for the deferential aspect of language use described by Hilary Putnam (Putnam 1975; Dummett 1991, Ch 4). Indeed, every argument for externalism about linguistic content would seem to be an argument against the I-language stance Chomsky adopts, and that debate is clearly a live one. Dummett claims that the notion of an idiolect is essentially a derivative one, since what we mean depends on what our words mean in their social context. An idiolect is, he claims, a partial grasp of a language, not a language proper. Chomsky's response to Putnam's scenarios has sometimes been conciliatory, insisting on compatibility between linguistic deference and the I-language perspective (Chomsky 1986: 18; see also Larson and Segal 1995). At other times he has rejected Putnam's intuitions as folk intuitions with no role to play in a science of language (Chomsky 1995).

3. Davidson's Claim That There Are No Such Things as Languages

Davidson's best known contributions to the philosophy of language revolve around his ‘bold conjecture’ that a meaning theory for a natural language could or should take the form of a truth theory for that language (see Davidson, Donald). But in Davidson 1986 he casts doubt on the usefulness of the received notion of a language, including his former self among those who worked with that notion. Davidson goes so far as to question whether any ‘philosophically important’ notion of a language, idiolectal or otherwise, is left once his arguments are taken on board.

The nature and ramifications of Davidson's skepticism are not easy to extract from his original paper, and nor is the argument for it. This is partly because of the rebarbative terminology he introduces to make his case. A second factor is his reluctance to treat meaning theories as objects of knowledge or of any other cognitive state (see Section 1 above). He thinks of meaning theories as statements of what it ‘would suffice’ to know in order to be in a position to interpret a speaker's utterance. It will simplify the exegesis here to set aside Davidson's latent behaviourism and take the neo-Davidsonian step of treating the clauses of truth/meaning theories applicable to particular speakers and interpreters as actually known by them.

3.1 What Davidson Aims to Show

Davidson's argument is intended to show that languages, if they are “anything like what many philosophers and linguists have supposed”, do not exist (1986: 446). He does not say which philosophers and linguists he has in mind, but somewhere near the centre of the cloud of positions he is criticizing is David Lewis's theory of expression meaning. Lewis treats a language as an association between expressions and meanings, realized in a particular community through a convention, i.e., a specific kind of regularity in the use of the expressions with these meanings. (The details set out in the Appendix are not essential to what follows.) These conventions enable linguistic communities to overcome the arbitrariness of the association of an expression with a particular meaning. Without such an association, communication would be miraculous.

Lewis's account of expression meaning is commonly regarded as a plausible and necessary supplement to an intention-based account of speaker's meaning. Speaker's meaning in the Gricean tradition is identified with the effect that, in performing a given utterance, the speaker intends, by means of the audience's recognition of this very intention, to produce in that audience (see Grice, Paul). The exact form the meaning-bestowing intention must take is a matter of controversy, but that is not of pressing relevance here. A theory of expression meaning will say what the meanings are of individual expressions, including whole sentences, as they are used by speakers in various contexts on different occasions. Some theory of expression meaning is needed to account for, first, the expectation on the part of the speaker that she or he will be interpreted as intended (a precondition for the formation of the intention), and second, the high success rate in uptake by the audience.

Grice originally related expression meaning to speaker's meaning by suggesting that “[expression] x means (timeless[ly]) that ‘so-and-so’ might as a first shot be equated with some statement or disjunction of statements about what ‘people’ (vague) intend…to effect by x” (Grice 1957: 385). Lewis's convention-based account of expression meaning is generally thought to be a vast improvement on this crude early attempt by Grice to complement his intention-based account of speaker's meaning. Lewis claims (roughly) that a sentence means what it does because there is a convention of speakers using the sentence with that meaning, and another of hearers attributing that meaning to uses of it. The language of a community is the sum of these conventionally determined associations between sentences and meanings.

Davidson denies that communication, i.e., intention formation on the part of speakers plus uptake by audiences, is made possible by languages in anything like this sense. His case is simple in outline. He tries to show that expression meaning cannot both play the role it in fact plays in communication and be a matter of convention. He prepares the ground by (a) clarifying that role, and (b) clarifying what would need to hold for conventional meaning to fill it.

(a) The role expression meaning plays in communication is to determine speaker's meaning up to but not beyond the point where conversational implicature takes over. Davidson puts this as the demand that expression meaning should deliver ‘first meaning’. To illustrate this, consider Grice's example of implicature:

A is writing a testimonial about a pupil who is a candidate for a philosophy job, and his letter reads as follows: “Dear Sir, Mr X's command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular. Yours, etc.” (Grice 1975, p. 33)

A's utterance involves nested intentions.[7] Ultimately, members of the appointment committee are intended to spot that, in writing these words, A means that Mr X is a poor candidate. But they are expected to do so only after interpreting him as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent. The nested sequence of intentions is thus:

(i) to utter (write) the sentence ‘Mr. X's command of English is excellent’

in order that:

(ii) the committee interpret his utterance as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent,

in order that:

(iii) the committee interpret his utterance as meaning that Mr. X is a poor candidate

in order that:

(iv) Mr. X not be offered the position.

The second and third of these intended outcomes, but not the first or fourth, involve self-referring intentions that are characteristic of speaker's meaning: success in what is intended requires recognition of that intention by an intended audience. Davidson introduces a technical term, ‘first meaning’ in place of ‘literal’ or ‘expression’ meaning, since the latter are often laden with theoretical assumptions he wishes to avoid. The first meaning of an utterance is read off from the first intended outcome that is self-referring. So the first meaning of A's utterance is that Mr. X's command of English is excellent, since A intends his utterance to be interpreted by members of the committee as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent, and he will be successful in this only if they recognize the intention itself. The role of expression meaning in the determination of speaker's meaning is to deliver the utterance's first meaning, thus defined. Davidson's claim that convention-based accounts fail to capture expression meaning's role in communication is thus refined into the more specific claim that first meaning does not turn on convention.

(b) This particular example poses no threat to the equation of first meaning with conventional meaning, since there is apparently a match in this case. There is nothing to undermine the simple thought that what gives rise to recognition of the first meaning of the utterance, from which the implicated meaning can be extrapolated, is shared antecedent knowledge of all or part of a conventional language (perhaps as expressed in a theory of truth for those expressions if we follow Davidson's attempt to apply Tarski to natural language, but in any case as expressed in a system of rules, a compositional theory, that yields an association between sentences and meanings). But if this simple conventionalist picture is to generalize, says Davidson, three theses must be true:

First meaning is shared: interpretative success (at the level of first meaning) consists in an interpreter and an utterer assigning the same first meaning to the utterance.

First meaning is systematic: first meaning can be derived from the semantic properties of the parts of the uttered sentence, together with its structure.

First meaning is prepared: the resources needed to derive first meaning are available to both interpreter and utterer prior to the utterance.

The conventionalist position is thus refined into the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared. This, finally, is what Davidson rejects.

3.2 The Argument From Malaprops and Related Phenomena

His case turns on what to make of various conversational phenomena that are, or once were, marginalized by philosophers. The factor common to these phenomena is that “the speaker expects to be, and is, interpreted as the speaker intended, although the interpreter did not have a correct theory in advance” (1986: 440). Malaprops are a particularly transparent example. Here is Mrs. Malaprop addressing Captain Absolute in the exchange that gives Davidson his paper's title:

There, sir! An attack upon my language! What do you think of that? — an aspersion upon my parts of speech! Was ever such a brute! Sure if I reprehend anything in this world, it is the use of my oracular tongue, and a nice derangement of epitaphs! (Sheridan, The Rivals, Act III, Scene 3)

Captain Absolute manages to figure out the first meaning of Mrs Malaprop's utterance, which is that if she apprehends (understands) anything it is the use of her own vernacular tongue and a nice arrangement of epithets. Davidson offers a terminology-heavy but intuitive description of what is going on in this case, a description that applies equally to regular communicative exchange. He then argues that this description of communicative exchange is incompatible with the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared.

The intuitive description is couched in terms of prior theories and passing theories of first meaning, defined thus:

H's prior theory: How H is prepared in advance of S's utterance to interpret the expressions in it

S's prior theory: What S believes H's prior theory to be

S's passing theory: The theory S intends H to use to interpret the expressions in S's utterance

H's passing theory: How H in fact interprets the expressions in S's utterance

To illustrate, let S be Mrs. Malaprop and H be Captain Absolute. Then the prior and passing theories of each assign meanings to ‘epitaph’ as indicated:

The meaning of ‘epitaph’ in… S H
…their prior theory epithet epitaph
…their passing theory epithet epithet

Successful communication at the level of first meaning happens when S's and H's passing theories coincide for the expressions used — as it does in this example, despite disagreement in prior theories. Other permutations of agreement and disagreement are possible involving malaprops and other phenomena that, like malaprops, seem to call for a prior/passing theory treatment. Other phenomena include the use of metaphor, ambiguous expressions, incomplete sentences, and unfamiliar names, as well as performance errors like slips of the tongue or temporary confusion over whether to use ‘underestimated’ or ‘overestimated’ after ‘cannot easily be’. None of these sabotage the generalization that communicative success is agreement in passing theory, which often occurs despite lack of agreement between prior theories.

How is this supposed to undermine the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared, and hence the claim that expression meaning is conventional? Davidson's answer is that neither meaning according to prior theories nor meaning according to passing theories has all three of these properties. Specifically:

Prior theories are systematic and prepared, but not shared.

Passing theories are systematic and shared, but not prepared

He anticipates the tempting thought that two conversants ‘share the same language’ if their prior theories more or less overlap and in addition they each have a capacity to exploit ad hoc strategies for interpretation, such as that used by Captain Absolute and the theatre audience, i.e., searching for a similar sounding word that makes sense of the utterance in context. But these ‘principles of … inventive accommodation are not themselves reducible to theory, involving as they do nothing less than all our skills at theory construction’. In other words:

Such a capacity, though shared and prepared, is not systematic.

This last point resonates with Chomsky's claim that communication involves the interaction of many factors, including the general intelligence of the participants, ruling it out as an object for systematic investigation (see Sections 2.1. and 2.3).

Davidson's argument can be summarized by tracing it back to his headline claim that there are no such things as languages as standardly conceived of by philosophers. If there were such things, they would be structures that could be described by systematic theories. And while prior and passing theories are somewhat systematizable, neither has both the other features philosophers usually attribute to languages: being antecedently grasped (‘prepared’), and common to both utterer and audience (‘shared’). He recommends, in effect, that philosophers of language drop their usual ontology of languages when trying to understand how communication occurs and switch instead to his ontology of passing and prior theories applicable to individuals at a time and in a context.

3.3 Reaction to Davidson's Argument

A common reaction to Davidson's argument has been to insist that, because the phenomena he introduces are special cases calling for special treatment, they fail to show that conventionalism is fundamentally mistaken. On this view, cases where there is a discrepancy between what Davidson calls passing theories and prior theories should be regarded as curios. They fail to dent the standard picture according to which antecedently shared systematic structures — languages — are responsible for the vast majority of successful communicative exchanges.

This may be to misinterpret the strategy behind Davidson's introduction of these “rogue” phenomena. He seems to offer them, not as counterexamples to the standard picture (in which case the above response would perhaps be legitimate), but as vehicles for the illustration of an alternative vision of communication that applies even in regular cases. Even when there is no discrepancy between S's and H's prior theories, H will still be in the position of having to confirm this for herself. That is, she must confirm that the meaning delivered by the prior theory makes the utterance a reasonable one. If it is, then she can carry it over into her passing theory of what has been said (the first meaning of the utterance). If not, she must develop a different passing theory. But general intelligence is implicated in the passage from prior theory to passing theory in all cases, even those where no alteration takes place. This suggests that arriving at first meaning is far less of an automated process than is often assumed. Deciding whether the deliverance of the prior theory is reasonable may require searching for implicatures that make sense of the utterance, an involved process. General intelligence, which one might think comes into play only after an interpretation for the uttered expressions, a first meaning, has been fixed, may in fact bear upon the fixing itself. Considering the rogue cases just makes the true order salient.

Davidson points to the extent and variety of cases where convergence in passing theories of first meaning (i.e., communicative success) demands work from the participants to overcome discrepancy between or underdetermination by the prior theories. Some cases other than simple malaprops were listed in the previous subsection, and developments in the philosophy of language since he wrote his paper have led many to consider how far semantics is penetrated by pragmatic considerations. Examples of so-called ‘pragmatic determinants of what is said’ (or, in Davidson's terminology, of first meaning) do not sit happily with a sharp divide between systematically context-sensitive expressions such as indexicals, and conversational implicature that only takes over when the interpretation of the uttered expressions is set.

Two examples reveal the problem. ‘At least’ as it appears in an utterance of:

‘His new wife is at least half his age’

is naturally interpreted to mean less than or equal to. But its interpretation in:

‘His newly adopted daughter is at least half his age’

is likely to be more than or equal. Recognition of this draws on background assumptions that are no part of linguistic competence if linguistic competence is tractable. Attention to pragmatic factors by both utterer and audience would seem to be essential to bridge the gap between prior and passing theories.

A second kind of case is:

‘Have you had breakfast?’

There is ongoing controversy over whether semantics alone delivers a determinate proposition for this (once a referent is assigned to the pronoun) or whether pragmatics is needed to distinguish between the following possible interpretations:

Have you had breakfast this morning?

Have you had breakfast, ever?

Some have claimed that pragmatic determinants of what is said are at work in every single utterance. Though these are not examples Davidson explicitly appealed to, they fit the pattern that led to his introduction of the prior-theory/passing-theory distinction. They suggest that the meaning of a sentence depends far more radically on the context of its utterance than had been assumed before Davidson claimed, of his own examples, that they “erased the boundary between knowing a language and knowing our way around in the world generally”.


Further Reading

McGilvray 1999 and Smith 1999 both provide clear introductions to Chomsky's philosophy of language and linguistics, including his E-/I-language distinction. Critical discussion can be found in four collections: Otero 1994 (Volume II), Antony and Hornstein 2003, Barber 2003 (first seven contributions), and McGilvray forthcoming. Chomsky's own non-technical writing is usually accessible. A sensible starting place would be the second chapter of Chomsky 1986 or the essays in Chomsky 2000.

Three papers in Davidson 1984 (‘What metaphors mean’, ‘Communication and convention’, and ‘Mood and Performances’) herald the anti-conventionalism of his 1986 essay, which is discussed in detail by Hacking 1986, Dummett 1986, and Pietroski 1994. Hacking addresses the extent to which Davidson's conclusion undermines his earlier philosophy of language. Dummett attempts to show that the notion of a prior theory presupposes the notion of a linguistic community, and hence of a shared language. For more recent work on alleged pragmatic determinants of what is said, see Stanley 2000, Borg 2004 and Szabo forthcoming.

The theory of conventions used in Lewis 1975 (see Appendix) is developed at length in Lewis 1969. The resulting theory of language is elaborated by Bennett 1976 and criticised in Burge 1975 and Laurence 1996, the latter from a Chomskian perspective.

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