Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

First published Sat Jan 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jul 25, 2006

I have some of my properties purely in virtue of the way I am. (My mass is an example.) I have other properties in virtue of the way I interact with the world. (My weight is an example.) The former are the intrinsic properties, the latter are the extrinsic properties. This seems to be an intuitive enough distinction to grasp, and hence the intuitive distinction has made its way into many discussions in ethics, philosophy of mind, metaphysics and even epistemology. Unfortunately, when we look more closely at the intuitive distinction, we find reason to suspect that it conflates a few related distinctions, and that each of these distinctions is somewhat resistant to analysis.

1. Introduction

The standard way to introduce the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is by the use of a few platitudes. Stephen Yablo provides perhaps the most succinct version: “You know what an intrinsic property is: it's a property that a thing has (or lacks) regardless of what may be going on outside of itself.” (1999: 479). David Lewis provides a more comprehensive list of platitudes.

A sentence or statement or proposition that ascribes intrinsic properties to something is entirely about that thing; whereas an ascription of extrinsic properties to something is not entirely about that thing, though it may well be about some larger whole which includes that thing as part. A thing has its intrinsic properties in virtue of the way that thing itself, and nothing else, is. Not so for extrinsic properties, though a thing may well have these in virtue of the way some larger whole is. The intrinsic properties of something depend only on that thing; whereas the extrinsic properties of something may depend, wholly or partly, on something else. If something has an intrinsic property, then so does any perfect duplicate of that thing; whereas duplicates situated in different surroundings will differ in their extrinsic properties. (Lewis 1983a: 111-2)

As we shall see, the last claim Lewis makes (that duplicates never differ with respect to intrinsic properties) is somewhat controversial. The other way to introduce the subject matter is by providing examples of paradigmatic intrinsic and extrinsic properties. One half of this task is easy: everyone agrees that being an uncle is extrinsic, as is being six metres from a rhodadendron. The problem with using this method to introduce the distinction is that there is much less agreement about which properties are intrinsic. Lewis has in several places (1983a, 1986a, 1988) insisted that shape properties are intrinsic, but one could hold that an object's shape depends on the curvature of the space in which it is embedded, and this might not even be intrinsic to that space (Nerlich 1979), let alone the object. Lewis also mentions charge and internal structure as being examples of intrinsic properties.

1.1 Philosophical Importance

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties plays an essential role in stating several interesting philosophical problems. Historically, the most prominent of these has to do with notions of intrinsic value. G. E. Moore (1903: §18) noted that we can make a distinction between things that are good in themselves, or possess intrinsic value, and those that are good as a means to other things. To this day there is still much debate over whether this distinction can be sustained (Feldman 1998, Kagan 1998), and if it can which kinds of things possess intrinsic value (Krebs 1999). In particular, one of the central topics in contemporary environmental ethics is the question of which kinds of things (intelligent beings, conscious beings, living things, species, etc) might have intrinsic value. While this is the oldest (and still most common) use of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, it has not played much role in the discussions of the distinction in metaphysics, to which we now turn.

As P. T. Geach (1969) noted, the fact that some object a is not F before an event occurs but is F after that event occurs does not mean that the event constitutes, in any deep sense, a change in a. To use a well-worn example, at the time of Socrates's death Xanthippe became a widow; that is, she was not a widow before the event of her husband's death, but she was a widow when it ended. Still, though that event constituted (or perhaps was constituted by) a change in Socrates, it did not in itself constitute a change in Xanthippe. Geach noted that we can distinguish between real changes, such as what occurs in Socrates when he dies, from mere changes in which predicates one satisfies, such as occurs in Xanthippe when Socrates dies. The latter he termed ‘mere Cambridge’ change. There is something of a consensus that an object undergoes real change in an event iff there is some intrinsic property they satisfied before the event but not afterwards.

David Lewis (1986a, 1988) built on this point of Geach's to mount an attack on endurantism, the theory that objects persist by being wholly located at different times, and that there can be strict identity between an object existing at one time and one existing at another time. Lewis argues that this is inconsistent with the idea that objects undergo real change. If the very same object can be both F (at one time) and not F (at another), this means that F-ness must be a relation to a time, but this means that it is not an intrinsic property. So any property that an object can change must be extrinsic, so nothing undergoes real change. Lewis says that this argument supports the rival theory of perdurantism, which says that objects persist by having different temporal parts at different times. While this argument is controversial (see Haslanger (1989), Johnston (1987) and Lowe (1988) for some responses), it does show how considerations about intrinsicness can resonate within quite different areas of metaphysics.

The other major area where the concept of intrinsicness has been put to work is in stating various supervenience theses. Frank Jackson (1998) defines physicalism in terms of duplication and physical duplication, which are in turn defined in terms of intrinsic properties. This definition builds upon a similar definition offered by Lewis (1983b). Similarly, Jaegwon Kim (1982) defines a mind/body supervenience thesis in terms of intrinsic properties. As Theodore Sider (1993) notes, the simplest way to define the individualist theory of mental content that Tyler Burge (1979) attacks is as the claim that the content of a thinker's propositional attitudes supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker. And many internalist theories in epistemology are based around the intuition that whether a thinker is justified in believing some proposition supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker.

Most of the philosophical applications are independent of the precise analysis of intrinsicness, but work on this analysis has helped clarify debates in two ways. First, the distinction between the two notions of intrinsicness, discussed in section 2 below, helps clarify a number of these debates. More concretely, Theodore Sider's (2003) observation that most of the properties in folk theory are 'maximal' and hence not intrinsic provides a strong argument against various theories that appeal to the intuitive intrinsicness of some everyday property.

Though these are the most prominent uses of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, they by no means exhaust its uses. Many applications of the distinction are cited by I. L. Humberstone (1996), including the following. George Schlesinger (1990) uses the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties to state a non-trivial version of Mill's principle of the uniformity of nature, though Schlesinger gives his distinction a different name. Wlodzimierz Rabinowicz (1979) uses the distinction to formulate principles of universalizability for moral principles and natural laws. And E. J. Khamara (1988) uses a distinction between relational and non-relational properties to state a non-trivial version of the principle of Identity of Indiscernibles.

1.2 Global and Local

Whether a property is intrinsic, and whether some individual that has that property has it intrinsically, are different issues. The property being square or married is no doubt an extrinsic property; but it is a property that is had intrinsically by all squares (assuming being square is intrinsic). Once we have these two concepts, a ‘global’ concept of intrinsicness of properties, and a ‘local’ concept of a particular object being intrinsically such as to possess some property, we might wonder how they are connected. (The names ‘global’ and ‘local’ are taken from Humberstone 1996). In particular, we might wonder which of these should be primary in an analysis of intrinsicness.

At first glance, the principles (GTL) and (LTG) seem to connect the two concepts.

(GTL) If F is a (globally) intrinsic property, and a is F, then a is intrinsically F

(LTG) If every a that is F is intrinsically F, then F is a (globally) intrinsic property.

(GTL) is undoubtedly true, but (LTG) is more problematic. If the quantifier in it is actualist (i.e. only ranges over actual objects), then it is clearly false. Let F be the property being square or being inside a golden mountain. Even if the quantifier is possibilist, it is not clear that (LTG) should be true. For a problematic example, let F be the property being square or being such that the number 21 does not exist. Every possible object that is F is square, and hence intrinsically F, but it is not clear that F is an intrinsic property. This question (like a few others we will discuss below) turns on the metaphysics of properties. If two properties that are necessarily coextensive are identical (as Lewis believes), or are guaranteed to be alike in whether they are intrinsic or extrinsic (as Sider 1993 argues), then F will be intrinsic. If properties can be individuated more finely than this, and if their intrinsicness or otherwise turns on this fine-grained individuation, then maybe F is not intrinsic. We will return to this issue in some of the discussions below.

2. Notions of Intrinsicness

Many different distinctions have been called the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. As J. Michael Dunn (1990) notes, some authors have used ‘intrinsic’ and ‘extrinsic’ to mean ‘essential’ and ‘accidental’. Dunn is surely right in saying that this is a misuse of the terms. A more interesting distinction is noted by Brian Ellis (1991; discussed in Humberstone 1996: 206). Ellis suggests we should distinguish between properties that objects have independently of any outside forces acting on them (what we will call the Ellis-intrinsic properties), and those that they have in virtue of those outside forces (the Ellis-extrinsic properties). For many objects (such as, say, a stretched rubber band) their shape will be dependent on the outside forces acting on them, so their shape will be Ellis-extrinsic. If one is committed to the idea that shapes are intrinsic, one should think this means that the distinction between the Ellis-intrinsic and Ellis-extrinsic properties is not the same as the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. Such a judgement may seem a little hasty, but in any case we will turn now to distinctions that have received more attention in the philosophical literature.

2.1 Relational vs. Non-Relational Properties

Many writers, especially in the literature on intrinsic value, use ‘relational’ for the opposite of intrinsic. This seems to be a mistake for two reasons. The first reason is that many properties seem to be both be relational and intrinsic. For example, most people have the property having longer legs than arms, and indeed seem to have this property intrinsically, even though the property consists in a certain relation being satisfied. Maybe the property is not intrinsic if whether or not something is an arm or a leg is extrinsic, so perhaps this isn't a conclusive example, but it seems troubling. As Humberstone notes, some might respond by suggesting that a relational property is one such that if an object has it, then it bears some relation to a distinct thing. But this won't do either. Not being within a mile of a rhodadendron is clearly relational, but does not consist in bearing a relation to any distinct individual, as we can see by the fact that a non-rhodadendron all alone in a world can satisfy it.

A larger problem is that it seems being intrinsic and being relational are properties of two very different kinds of things. Consider again the property F, being square or being such that the number 21 does not exist. Assuming (as we do for now) that we can make sense of the relational/non-relational distinction, F is a relational property. But F is necessarily co-extensive with the property being square, which is surely non-relational. So two necessarily co-extensive properties can differ with respect to whether they are relational. We can put this point a few different ways. If any two properties that are necessarily co-extensive are identical, then being relational is not a property of properties, but a property of concepts, or in any case of some things individuated as finely as Fregean concepts. If we think that intrinsicness is not a property that makes such fine distinctions, then the relational/non-relational and intrinic/extrinsic distinctions are quite different, for they are distinctions between different kinds of things.

2.2 Qualitative vs. Non-Qualitative Properties

As noted above, one of the platitudes Lewis lists when isolating the concept of intrinsicness is that duplicates never differ with respect to their intrinsic properties. Lewis holds a further principle that may not be obvious from the above quote: that any property with respect to which duplicates never differ is intrinsic. Of course, this is only true if the quantifiers in it are interpreted as possibilist. Otherwise the property having a greater mass than any man that has ever existed will be intrinsic, since it never differs between actual duplicates. We will assume from now on that all quantifiers are possibilist, unless otherwise noted. And, following Humberstone, we will say that the properties that do not differ between duplicates are the qualitative properties, which is not to say they are not also the intrinsic properties.

Despite this two-way connection between intrinsicness and duplication, we do not yet have an analysis because the relevant concept of duplication can only be (easily) analysed in terms of intrinsic properties. In the next section we will look at the two ways Lewis has attempted to analyse that concept and hence break into the circle. But for now it is worth looking at some results that follow directly from the idea that intrinsic properties are those that do not differ between duplicates.

First, as Humberstone (1996: 227) notes, if this is our definition of intrinsicness, then we can easily analyse local intrinsicness in terms of global intrinsicness. An object x is intrinsically P iff all its duplicates are P, that is, if all objects that have the same (global) intrinsic properties as it does are P. And having this concept of local intrinsicness is quite useful, because it lets us explain what is right about an intuitively attractive (though ultimately mistaken) claim about intrinsic properties. Let P be an intrinsic property and Q a property such that an object's having Q is entailed by its having P. One might think in those circumstances that Q would be intrinsic, since its possession follows from a fact solely about the object in question, namely that it is P. This isn't right in general; to see why let P be the property of being square and Q be the property being square or being inside a golden mountain. For some objects that are Q their Q-ness follows from facts solely about the object, but for others it follows from facts quite extrinsic to the object in question. But, Humberstone notes, something similar is true. If x possess P intrinsically, and being P entails being Q, then x possesses Q intrinsically. This local concept of intrinsicness might also do philosophical work; presumably the intrinsic value of an object depends on which properties it intrinsically possesses, not on which intrinsic properties it possesses.

Secondly, it follows from the definition that necessarily co-extensive properties are alike in being intrinsic or not. In particular, any property that every possible object has, such as being such that the number 21 exists, will be an intrinsic property. Robert Francescotti (1999) takes this to be a decisive mark against Lewis's theory, but others (e.g. Sider 1993, Weatherson 2001) have been willing to treat it as a philosophical discovery. It is crucial to the proof that Lewis's theory entails that this property is intrinsic that the quantifiers in the theory are possibilist. If we let the quantifiers range over the right kind of impossibilities (such as the situations of Barwise and Perry 1983, or the impossible worlds of Nolan 1997) then one can have duplicates that, for example, differ with respect to whether the number 21 exists. Since this approach has not been developed in any detail it is impossible to say at this time whether it would have serious untoward consequences.

Thirdly, the duplication relation is transitive, so any duplicate of a duplicate of David Lewis, is a duplicate of David Lewis. That means that being a duplicate of David Lewis is an intrinsic property of all those objects. While this might plausibly be a property that Lewis intrinsically possesses, it is somewhat surprising that it is intrinsic to all of his duplicates. Dunn (1990) reports that Lewis in conversation said that this property (being a duplicate of David Lewis) is equivalent to an infinite conjunction of intrinsic properties (the ones Lewis has) so it should turn out to be intrinsic.

Conversely, assuming the metaphysics of counterpart theory, none of these duplicates of David Lewis is David Lewis himself, so the property being (identical with) David Lewis turns out to be extrinsic on this account. Even if we drop the counterpart theory, and allow that objects in different worlds might be strictly identical, still not all duplicates of Lewis will be identical with Lewis, so the property being (identical with) David Lewis will still not be intrinsic. It might seem rather odd that a property so internal to Lewis should not be intrinsic. Yablo (1999) notes that in some cases, such as this one, we can make an argument for identity properties not being intrinsic. If it is essential to David Lewis that he be descended from a particular zygote Z, then the fact that something is David Lewis entails that something else is a zygote, and any property whose possession entails the existence of other objects is usually held to be extrinsic. Still, Yablo argues, it is very plausible that the identity properties of some things (especially atoms) should be intrinsic.

Finally, we can define relative notions of duplication, and hence relative notions of intrinsicness (Humberstone 1996: 238). To give just one interesting example, say that a property is nomically intrinsic iff it never differs between duplicates in worlds with the same laws. Then many dispositional properties might turn out to be nomically intrinsic, capturing nicely the idea that they are in a sense internal to the objects that possess them, while their manifestation depends both on external facts, and on the laws being a certain way.

2.3 Interior vs. Exterior Properties

J. Michael Dunn (1990) suggests that odd consequences of Lewis's theory are sufficient to look for a new concept of intrinsicness. He suggests that the notion of intrinsicness is governed by platitudes like the following. "Metaphysically, an intrinsic property of an object is a property that the object has by virtue of itself, depending on no other thing. Epistemologically, an intrinsic property would be a property that one could determine by inspection of the object itself - in particular, for a physical object, one would not have to look outside its region of space-time" (1990: 178) As Dunn notes, the metaphysical definition here is the central one, the epistemological platitude is at best a heuristic. On this view, being identical to X will be intrinsic (except in cases where X has essential properties rooted outside itself), while being a duplicate of X will not be. Also, having X as a part will be intrinsic, though it is not on Lewis's account.

Dunn argues that the appropriate logic in which to formulate claims of intrinsicness and to investigate what consequences they have is the relevant logic R, and he provides some of the details of how this should be done. But until we see a specific formulation of the idea (comparable in specificity to the accounts of Peter Vallentyne and Stephen Yablo, discussed below in section 3.3), we cannot comment on its consequences. Still, there is an intuitive distinction here, and it clearly differs from the distinction Lewis discusses.

2.4 Which is the real distinction?

If we grasp the three distinctions discussed above, we might well ask which of them is the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction? It is possible that this question has no determinate answer. Humberstone suggests that we have three interesting distinctions here, each of which can do some philosophical work, and there is not much interest in the issue of which of them is called the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. If we do decide to investigate this seriously, we should perhaps be prepared to be disappointed - there is no guarantee that there will be a fact of the matter which distinction the words ‘intrinsic’ and ‘extrinsic’ latch onto.

Should we just give up on identifying the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction; then, on pain of having some indeterminacy in our philosophical theories, we must reformulate the theories that are framed using this distinction, specifying which distinction should take the role of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in each case. Sider, in the course of defending the philosophical interest of the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction, makes a start on doing this. He notes that in the debates about supervenience, the distinction that is usually relevant is the qualitative/non-qualitative one. If we let being (identical to) X be an intrinsic property, then most of the supervenience theses discussed will be trivially true, because it will be impossible to have duplicates that are different objects, and hence impossible to have duplicates that differ with respect to the contents of their beliefs, or the justificatory status of their beliefs, or their phenomenal states, or whatever. But these theses are not trivially true; so if we are to formulate the distinctions this way, we had better not let identity properties be intrinsic in these contexts.

This, of course, does not show that the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction is the only one that can do philosophical work. Indeed, when trying to grasp what real change amounts to, it seems to be the interior/exterior distinction that is relevant. Say that a has b as a part, and consider the event whereby b is replaced in a by c, which happens to be a duplicate of b. This event seems to constitute a real change in a, not merely a Cambridge change, but it does not constitute a change in qualitative properties.

3. Attempts at Analysis

We will first look at two attempts to analyse the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction, and then at two more ambitious projects that aim to capture intrinsicness in all of its facets.

3.1 Combinatorial Theories

As Yablo noted, if an object has a property intrinsically, then it has it independently of the way the rest of the world is. The rest of the world could disappear, and the object might still have that property. Hence a lonely object, an object that has no wholly distinct worldmates, could have the property. Note that in the sense relevant here, two objects are only ‘wholly distinct’ if they have no parts in common, not if they are merely non-identical. The idea is that a lonely object could have proper parts. This is good, since having six proper parts is presumably an intrinsic property. Many extrinsic properties could not be possessed by lonely objects – no lonely object is six metres from a rhododendron, for example.

This suggests an analysis of intrinsicness: F is an intrinsic property iff it is possible for a lonely object to be F. This analysis is usually attributed to Kim (1982) (e.g. in  Lewis 1983a and Sider 1993), though Humberstone (1996) dissents from this interpretation. Both directions of the biconditional can be challenged.

Some objects change in mass over time: this is presumably an intrinsic property of those objects. If necessitarian theories of laws are true (as endorsed by Ellis 2001 and Shoemaker 1984), then there could not be a world with just that object, as the conservation of matter would be violated. If any kind of combinatorial analysis of intrinsicness can work, we have to assume something like Hume's dictum that there are no necessary connections between distinct existences. Indeed, all combinatorial theories of intrinsicness do assume this, and further that the range of what is possible can be taken as given in crafting a theory of intrinsicness. This might be thought problematic, since the best way to formally spell out Hume's dictum itself appeals to the concept of intrinsicness (Lewis 1986a: 87-91).

The analysis is only viable as an analysis of the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction, since it rules that being a duplicate of David Lewis is an intrinsic property. This feature, too, is shared by all combinatorial theories of intrinsicness.

The major problem with this analysis is that the ‘if’ direction of the biconditional is clearly false. As Lewis (1983) pointed out, the property being lonely is had by some possible lonely objects, but it is not intrinsic.

Rae Langton and David Lewis (1998) designed a theory to meet this objection. Their theory resembles, in crucial respects, the theory sketched in an appendix to Dean Zimmerman's paper "Immanent Causation" (Zimmerman 1997). The two theories were developed entirely independently. We will focus on Langton and Lewis's version here, because it is more substantially developed, and more widely discussed in the literature. On their theory, a property F is independent of accompaniment iff the following four conditions are met:

  1. There exists a lonely F
  2. There exists a lonely non-F
  3. There exists an accompanied (i.e. not lonely) F
  4. There exists an accompanied non-F

Langton and Lewis's idea is that if F is intrinsic, then whether or not an object is F should not depend on whether or not it is lonely. So all four of these cases should be possible. Still, some extrinsic properties satisfy all four conditions. Consider, for instance, the property being lonely and round or accompanied and cubical. A lonely sphere suffices for (a), a lonely cube for (b), an actual cube for (c) and an actual sphere for (d). So they have to rule out this property. They do it by the following five-step process.

First, Langton and Lewis identify a class of privileged natural (or non-disjunctive) properties. Lewis (1983b) had argued that we need to recognise a distinction between natural and non-natural properties to make sense of many debates in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of mind, and suggested a few ways we might draw the distinction. We might take the natural properties to be those that correspond to real universals, or those that appear in the canonical formulations of best physics or regimented common sense, or even take the distinction to be primitive. Langton and Lewis say that it should not matter how we draw the distinction for present purposes, as long as we have it, and properties like being lonely and round or accompanied and cubical are not natural.

Secondly, they say properties are disjunctive iff they “can be expressed by a disjunction of (conjunctions of) natural properties; but are not themselves natural properties.” Thirdly, they say a property is basic intrinsic iff it is non-disjunctive and satisfies (a) through (d). Fourthly, they say two (possible) objects are duplicates iff they share the same basic intrinsic properties. Finally, they say F is an intrinsic property iff two duplicates never differ with respect to it.

Three objections have been pressed against this view. Stephen Yablo (1999) objected to the role of natural properties in the analysis, which he argued introduced irrelevant material, and implied that the theory was at best de facto, but not de jure, correct. Dan Marshall and Josh Parsons (2001) claimed that according to this definition, the property being such that a cube exists is non-disjunctive, but it satisfies (a) through (d), so it would be basic intrinsic, despite being extrinsic. Theodore Sider (2001) claimed that the theory could not handle maximal properties: properties of objects that are not shared by their large proper parts. Sider claims that being a rock is such a property: large parts of rocks are not rocks. So being a rock is extrinsic, since a duplicate of a large part of a rock might be a rock if it is separated from the rest of the rock. But, argued Sider, on some interpretations of ‘natural property’ it is natural, and hence basic intrinsic.

Brian Weatherson's (2001) theory was designed to meet these three objections. In his theory, combinatorial principles of possibility are not used to derive characteristics of individual intrinsic properties, as Kim and Langton and Lewis do, but characteristics of the whole set of intrinsic properties. He argues that this set, call it SI, will have the following properties:

The first two principles are closure principles on the set. The third principle says that any two intrinsic properties that can be instantiated can be instantiated together any number of times. And the fourth says that if objects having two intrinsic properties can be in two regions, and those two regions can be in a particular spatial relation, then the regions can be in that relation while filled by objects having those properties. The third principle suffices to show that being such that a cube exists could not be in SI, and the fourth to show that being a rock could not be.

Weatherson's theory does not entirely avoid appeals to a concept of naturalness, though the counterexamples that prompt the appeal are now much more recherché. Without such an appeal, then if F and G are intrinsic properties that atoms could have, nothing in his theory rules out the property being simple, lonely and F or being G from being intrinsic. There are a few ways for the appeal to go at this point, see Weatherson (2001) and Lewis (2001) for a few suggestions. The following moves, taken directly from Langton and Lewis, will probably work if any will. Say that the basic intrinsic properties are those non-disjunctive properties such that their membership in SI is consistent with the above four principles. Two objects are duplicates if they do not differ with respect to basic intrinsic properties. A property is intrinsic if it never differs between duplicates.

John Hawthorne (2001) has suggested that all these combinatorial theories have a problem with properties of the form being R-related to something, where R is a perfectly natural relation that is neither reflexive nor irreflexive. Such properties are extrinsic, but Hawthorne suggests they will satisfy all the combinatorial principles, and their close connection to natural relations means that they will be natural enough to cause problems for all these combinatorial approaches.

In a recent paper, Gene D. Witner, William Butchard and Kelly Trogdon (2005), hereafter WBT, propose a different kind of variation on Langton and Lewis's analysis. They agree that the core idea of an analysis should be independence from accompaniment. But they argue that Lewis's notion of 'naturalness' is too mysterious to deliver a useful analysis. Instead they propose to use the idea that an individual has some properties in virtue of having other properties. Their analysis then is that F is intrinsic iff everything that has F has F intrinsically, and an object a has F intrinsically iff for every G such that a is F in virtue of being G, G is independent of accompaniment.

As WBT mention, their theory needs some relatively fine judgments about what properties are instantiated in virtue of which other properties in order to handle some hard cases, especially Sider's examples involving maximal properties. And they note that the theory seems to break down altogether over some impure properties, such as being identical to a for any a that can exist either alone or accompanied. This is a property that a has, but doesn't have in virtue of any distinct property. And that property is independent of accompaniment, so it is intrinsic. But intuitively a could have had a distinct duplicate, so being identical to a shouldn't count as intrinsic. WBT's solution is to say that the theory is only meant to apply to pure properties. This might not work as it stands. If a is the F then the property of being identical to the only actual F will also improperly count as intrinsic on their view for much the same reason. It might be better to say that their analysis is intended as an analysis of interior properties, rather than as an analysis of qualitative properties, unlike the other combinatorial theories.

3.2 Natural Kind Theories

In On the Plurality of Worlds, David Lewis presents a quite different analysis of intrinsic properties. As with the combinatorial theory that he and Rae Langton defend, it heavily exploits the idea that some properties are more natural than others. In fact, it rests even more weight on it. Here is Lewis's statement of the theory:

[I]t can plausibly be said that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic. Then we can say that two things are duplicates iff (1) they have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and (2) their parts can be put into correspondence in such a way that corresponding parts have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and stand in the same perfectly natural relations…Then we can go on to say that an intrinsic property is one that can never differ between duplicates. (Lewis 1986a: 61-2)

Like the combinatorial theories, this is an attempt at analysing qualitative intrinsicness. Anyone who thinks this is too modest an aim to be worthwhile will be disappointed. It rests heavily on the ‘plausible’ claim that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic, and, implicitly, that the perfectly natural properties are sufficient to characterise the world completely. The last assumption is needed because the theory rules out the possibility that there are two objects that share all their perfectly natural properties, but differ with respect to some intrinsic property or other. One consequence of these assumptions is that a world is fully characterised by the intrinsic properties of its inhabitants and the perfectly natural relations between those inhabitants. Lewis thinks this is true for the actual world, it is just his doctrine of Humean supervenience. (Lewis 1986b: i-xiii). But it might be thought a stretch to think it is true of all worlds.

In their paper of 1998, Langton and Lewis claim the only advantage of their theory over Lewis's old theory is that it makes fewer assumptions about the nature of natural properties. They also note that Lewis still believes those assumptions, but they think it is worthwhile to have a theory that gets by without them. It also seems that Lewis's new theory, perhaps as amended, provides more insight into the nature of intrinsicness.

3.3 Contractions

Peter Vallentyne (1997) develops a theory based around the idea that x's intrinsic properties are those properties it would have if it were alone in the world. He defines a contraction of a world as “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one solely by ‘removing’ objects from it.” (211) As a special case of this, an x-t contraction, where x is an object and t a time, is “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one by, to the greatest extent possible, ‘removing’ all objects wholly distinct from x, all spatial locations not occupied by x, and all times (temporal states of the world) except t, from the world.” (211) Vallentyne allows that there might not be unique x-t contraction; sometimes we can remove one of two objects, but not both, from the world while leaving x, so there will be one x-t contraction which has one of these in it, and another that has the other.

He then says that F is intrinsic iff for all x, t, all x-t contractions are such that Fx is true in the contraction iff it is true in the actual world. In short, a property is intrinsic to an object iff removing the rest of the world doesn't change whether the object has the property.

Vallentyne notes that this definition will not be very enlightening unless we understand the idea of a contraction. This seems related to the objection Langton and Lewis (1998) urge against Vallentyne. They say that Vallentyne's account reduces to the claim that a property is intrinsic iff possession of it never differs between an object and its lonely duplicates, a claim they think is true but too trivial to count as an analysis. Their position is that we cannot understand contractions without understanding duplication, but if we understand duplication then intrinsicness can be easily defined, so Vallentyne's theory is no advance.

Stephen Yablo (1999) argues that this criticism is too quick. Vallentyne should best be understood as working within a very different metaphysical framework to Lewis. For Lewis, no (ordinary) object exists at more than one world, so Vallentyne's contractions, being separate worlds, must contain separate objects. Hence x-t contractions can be nothing other than lonely duplicates, and the theory is trivial. Yablo suggests that the theory becomes substantive relative to a metaphysical background in which the very same object can appear in different worlds. (In chapter 4 of Plurality Lewis has a few arguments against this idea, and Yablo has interesting responses to these arguments. A thorough investigation of this debate would take us too far from the topic.) If this is the case then we can get a grip on contractions without thinking about duplications - the x-t contraction of a world is the world that contains x itself, and as few other things as possible.

Josh Parsons (forthcoming — see Other Internet Resources) argues against this approach. He says that there is no good way to understand sentences like "In w, Prince Philip is not a husband", where w is the world consisting of just Prince Philip. More generally, we cannot make sense of what extrinsic properties x has in the x-t contraction.

3.4 Non-relationality

Robert Franscecotti (1999) recently outlined an analysis that takes the concept of intrinsicness as non-relationality to be primary. Francescotti takes a property to be extrinsic iff an object possesses it in virtue of its relations to other objects. So being a duplicate of Jack and being such that the number 17 exists are extrinsic, while being identical to Jack and being a vertebrate (i.e. having a vertebral column) are intrinsic. As noted above, this means that we must either have a hyper-intensional notion of properties, or we say that intrinsicness is a property of concepts, not of properties. Francescotti takes the former option.

Francescotti notes that not all relational properties are extrinsic. Having a vertebral column, for instance, seems to be relational in that it consists of a relation to a vertebral column, but it is also an intrinsic property. So he focuses on relations to distinct objects. The definition of intrinsicness goes as follows. First we define a d-relational property. F is d-relational iff:

(a) there is a relation R, and an item y, such that (i) x's having F consists in x's bearing R to y, and (ii) y is distinct from x; or

(b) there is a relation R, and a class of items C, such that (i) x's having F consists in there being some member of C to which x bears R, and (ii) at least one member of C to which x bears R is distinct from x; or

(c) there is a relation R, and a class of items C, such that (i) x's having F consists in x's bearing R to every member of C, and (ii) it is possible that there is a member of C that is distinct from x.

We then define intrinsic properties as being those that are not d-relational.

F is an intrinsic property of x =df x has F, and F is not a d-relational property of x.

Francescotti's theory provides intuitively plausible answers to all the cases he considers, provided of course that we identify the intrinsic/non-intrinsic distinction with the relational/non-relational distinction, rather than one of the other two distinctions considered in section two. Like the other three theories, it has one unexplained (or perhaps underexplained) primitive, in this case the consists-in relation. As Francescotti notes, following Khamara (1988), it won't do to say x's having F consists in x's bearing R to y just in case it is necessary that Fx iff xRy. That makes it too easy for having a property to consist in some necessary being (say God, or the numbers) being a certain way. Rather, he says, “x's having F, consists in the event or state, x's having G, just in case x's having F is the very same event or state as x's having G.” (599) Whether this can handle all the hard cases seems to depend how the theory of identity conditions for events and states turns out. (See the entries on Donald Davidson and events for some start on this.)


Other Internet Resources

These are all preprints of relevant papers, unless stated otherwise.

Related Entries

abstract objects | Davidson, Donald | events | identity: of indiscernibles | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | mereology | properties