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Kant's Account of Reason

First published Fri Sep 12, 2008; substantive revision Tue May 12, 2009

Two of the most prominent questions in Kant's critical philosophy concern reason. The first, central to his theoretical philosophy, is the unprovable pretensions of reason in earlier “rationalist” philosophers, especially Leibniz and Descartes. The second, central to his practical philosophy, is the subservient role accorded to reason by the British empiricists—above all Hume, who declared, “Reason is wholly inactive, and can never be the source of so active a principle as conscience, or a sense of morals.” (Treatise,; see also the entry on Rationalism vs. Empiricism.) Thus the titles of two key works: the monumental Critique of Pure Reason, and the Critique of Practical Reason that is middle point of his great trio of moral writings (between the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals and The Metaphysics of Morals).

It is clear that practical reason is the foundation of Kant's moral philosophy. It is less clear what role reason plays in his theoretical philosophy. Kant insists that “metaphysics is utterly impossible, or at best a disorderly and bungling endeavour” if we do not separate “ideas of reason” from “concepts of the understanding” (Prolegomena §41, 4:329). But while he emphasises the solidity of the empirical knowledge gained via the latter, reason often appears to be merely a source of error and illusion. (This is especially so with regard to the most-read sections of the first Critique—the Aesthetic, Analytic and Dialectic.) But if this were so, the status of philosophical reasoning itself would stand in grave doubt. In addition, we might note that Kant rarely discusses reason as such. This leaves a difficult interpretative task: just what is Kant's general and positive account of reason?

This entry has the following structure. The first section sets out the role that reason plays in Kant's account of knowledge and metaphysics in the first Critique—something that is relatively uncontroversial in the secondary literature. The second section examines key aspects of reason in the moral philosophy, with especial reference to the second Critique. Reflecting Kant's canonical texts and the bulk of the secondary literature, these discussions of theoretical and practical reason are relatively independent of one another. The third section, therefore, considers how Kant's views of theoretical and practical reason may be related, emphasising especially the most prominent contemporary interpretation of Kantian reason, that of Onora O'Neill. The concluding remarks emphasise the potential philosophical interest of such a unified interpretation of Kant's account of reason.

1. Theoretical reason: reason's cognitive role and limitations

The first half of the Critique of Pure Reason argues that we can only obtain substantive knowledge of the world via sensibility and understanding (roughly, our capacities of sense experience and concept formation). The next large section—the “Transcendental Dialectic”—demolishes reason's pretensions to offer knowledge of a “transcendent” world, that is, a world beyond that revealed by the senses. (“Dialectic,” says Kant, is “a logic of illusion” (A293): so in his vocabulary, a dialectical idea is empty or false.) However, the Critique of Pure Reason should not be read as a demolition of reason's cognitive role. Kant certainly wants to delimit the bounds of reason, but this is not the same as arguing that it has no role in our knowledge. Three points are crucial: (§1.1) the relation of reason to empirical truth; (§1.2) its role in scientific enquiry; and (§1.3) the positive gains that come from appreciating reason's limits.[1] In addition, sound philosophical reasoning requires that reason gain knowledge of itself—a task that is begun, but not completed, in the first Critique (§1.4).

1.1 Reason as the arbiter of empirical truth

The first thing to observe is that Kant explicitly says that reason is the arbiter of truth in all judgments. Unfortunately, he barely develops this thought, and the issue has attracted surprisingly little attention in the literature. (But cf. Walker 1989: Ch. 4; Guyer and Walker 1990; Kant's Theory of Judgment, §§1.3, 1.4).[2] However, some basic points are clear from the text. We form judgments about the world around us all the time, without a second thought: we see a hand in front of us and judge it to exist; after a dream, we judge ourselves to have been dreaming and the dream's contents to be illusory; we see the sun rise and assume that it orbits the earth. A large part of Kant's philosophical efforts are devoted to showing that all these judgments rely on categories, such as cause and effect, that must order our sensory impressions. Only if a belief conforms to these conditions does it meet the “formal” conditions of truth. (Nonetheless, unless we are fundamentally confused about something, all our beliefs meet this formal condition.[3]) But there is a further question: which of our beliefs are actually (or “materially”) true, and which erroneous?

Kant begins with the observation that only once there is judgment can there be error: “It is correctly said that the senses do not err; yet not because they always judge correctly, but because they do not judge at all” (A293). For example, there is no error involved in the impressions of a dream, simply as such. But if someone were to get confused about her dreamed experience, and suppose that it had really happened, then she would be making a judgment—and a false one too. So Kant claims, “error is only effected through the unnoticed influence of sensibility on understanding, through which it happens that the subjective grounds of the judgment join with the objective ones” (A294). In the example, someone confuses a subjective ground of judgment (“I had this dream”) with an objective one (“these events took place”).[4]

How does reason enter the matter? Kant says the following: “For the law of reason to seek unity is necessary, since without it we would have no reason, and without that, no coherent use of the understanding, and, lacking that, no sufficient mark of empirical truth…” (A651=B679[5]). For example, suppose our dreamer believes she has won a lottery, but then starts to doubt this belief. To decide the truth, she must ask how far the belief connects up with her other judgments, and those of other people.[6] If it fails to connect up (we check the winning numbers, say, and see no match with the actual ticket), she must conclude that the belief was false. Or consider why we are sure that the sun does not orbit the earth, despite all appearances. Such a judgment cannot be squared with all our other judgments about the motions of planets and stars, judgments that have been unified by reason in the form of laws of gravity, momentum and so forth. It is in these unifying laws, discovered by Newton, that Kant sees proper confirmation of Copernicus' heliocentric hypothesis (Bxxii n; cf. §1.4 below), not in Galileo's observations of the heavens with the telescope. Consistency in observations is generally sufficient to confirm everyday knowledge claims. Scientific knowledge aspires to law-like completeness (e.g. the motion of all heavenly objects, and not only the movement of the sun relative to the earth).

1.2 Reason in science

This brings us to the second key point offered in the Critique: reason's role in scientific knowledge. For information about the world, we are entirely dependent on sensibility and understanding. Nevertheless, reason is “the origin of certain concepts and principles” (A299/B355), leading Kant to define it as a “faculty of principles” (A299/B356) or the “faculty of the unity of the rules of understanding under principles” (A303=B358). The question for Kant is whether and how these concepts and principles—which he subsequently terms “transcendental ideas” (A311/B368)—might be justified.

Apart from ideas about objects that lie beyond sensory experience, such as God or the soul, we also form transcendental ideas about entities that are meant to constitute the ultimate basis of everything that might be experienced, such as the universe as a whole: Kant speaks of “world wholes” or cosmological ideas. Claims to objective knowledge about these cosmological ideas, such as the claim that the universe has a beginning in time or the opposing claim that it does not, inevitably lead us—or so Kant argues—into contradictions or “antinomies.” Yet science itself assumes that the world forms a well-ordered, systematic unity whereby all events can be subsumed under causal laws. Evidently, no set of experiences—necessarily finite in extent—could ever correspond to this apparently cosmological claim. Kant argues, however, that reason is justified in adopting certain principles concerning the ultimate basis of our experience of the world, so long as it does not treat these as knowledge claims. This is his distinction between the “constitutive” and “regulative” use of ideas. (See e.g. Buchdahl 1992; Friedman 1992c.)

Rather than being a source of knowledge (“constituting” it), reason indicates how we should proceed with (“regulate”) the knowledge we do have, so as to correct errors and achieve more comprehensive insights. Activities must have goals if they are not to degenerate into merely random groping (cf. Bvii, A834=B862); reason's is that of unity. When Kant speaks of the “unity of reason” in the first Critique, he means that reason gives “unity a priori through concepts to the understanding's manifold cognitions” (A302/B359; cf. A665=B693, A680=B780). This unity must be a priori since it cannot be given through any set of experiences. Instead it is presupposed: as applied to science, it is the task of looking for the greatest possible completeness and systematicity (cf. Guyer 1989), subsuming objects and events under the most all-encompassing laws. We do not know in advance how far we will succeed, or that nature is wholly law-like, but the principle that unity is to be sought after nonetheless forms (what Kant calls) a “maxim” or regulative principle of reason (A666=B694). By contrast, the claim that such unity does exist would represent a “constitutive principle,” the sort of “cosmological” knowledge claim that we cannot justify.

Kant's account of science, and especially the role of “teleological” or purposive judgment, is further developed in the Critique of Judgment. See Guyer 1990, Freudiger 1996, and Nuzzo 2005, as well as Kant's Aesthetics and Teleology, §3. On Kant's account of science more generally, see Wartenberg 1992, and Buchdahl 1992; on reason and science, see Neiman 1994: Ch. 2. The entry on Kant's Philosophy of Science considers Kant's view of the natural sciences, especially physics.

1.3 The limits of reason

The third point is the most well-known, and is considered in detail in the entry on Kant's Critique of Metaphysics. Kant demolishes a series of supposed proofs of the existence of God (“The Ideal of Pure Reason”) and the soul (“The Paralogisms”). He also demonstrates that we can just as well prove certain “world wholes,” such as unbounded space, as their opposites (“The Antinomies,” including the idea of an absolutely first cause: the problem of freedom as it is posed in the famous “Third Antinomy”). These sections have always been regarded as among the most convincing parts of the first Critique. Mendelssohn spoke for many of Kant's contemporaries in calling him the “all destroyer,” for devastating reason's pretences to transcendent insight.

Kant is certainly engaged in clearing the ground, but the exercise is not merely destructive. Not only is reason's self-knowledge at stake (§1.4); in addition, Kant sees that the failure to establish secure ground—as to what we can know—has been more damaging than any critique. In the hands of theologians and metaphysicians, reason has claimed knowledge that it cannot have, leading to empty battles of competing positions that invite outright scepticism. At the beginning of the Doctrine of Method (the last, least-read part of the first Critique) Kant alludes to the biblical story of Babel.[7] God punished the attempt to build “a tower that would reach the heavens” (A707=B735) with a confusion of languages, leaving people unable to understand one another and unable to cooperate in such hubristic ventures.[8] Again and again, reason dreams up variations on some very basic ideas—the immortal soul, God, freedom; what is more, it cooks up[9] more or less convincing proofs of these. Without the acid test of experience of a common world, people are bound to come up with conflicting versions of these ideas. Then they will either talk past one another, or fall into conflict—or, one of Kant's most abiding fears, be forced to submit to an unreasoned authority. In metaphysics, Kant refers to “the ridiculous despotism of the schools” (Bxxxv).[10] When we turn to the practical sphere, however, despotism is far from ridiculous: it is the last, brutal resort for securing some sort of coexistence among people who will not cooperate. Thus Kant often alludes to Hobbes, on whose theory peaceful order is only possible if an unaccountable sovereign power overawes all the members of society.[11] Interpretations that see Kantian reason as securing intersubjective order, so as to overcome threats of Babel-like hubris, conflict and despotism, include Saner 1967, O'Neill 1989, and Neiman 1994.

One of the most famous lines of the first Critique occurs in the second edition's Preface, where Kant says, “I had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx). Knowledge of the world as a whole, or of entities that transcend this world (the immortal soul or God) is not humanly possible: it is not possible via experience, and reason has no power to supply knowledge in its place. However, as indicated in §1.2, Kant argues that science is entitled to rely on certain principles that regulate its project, without yet being known as objects. In the final section of the Critique, Kant argues that knowledge is not the only end of reason: in its practical use, reason addresses our role within the world. It is this end that leads human beings to the ideas considered in the Dialectic.

Thus Kant proposes three questions that answer “all the interest of my reason”: “What can I know?” “What must I do?” and “What may I hope?” (A805=B833). We have seen his answer to the first question: I can know this world as revealed through the senses, but not the total sum of all that is (since the senses never reveal that) nor a world beyond this one (a supersensible world). Kant does not answer the second question until the Groundwork to the Metaphysics of Morals, four years later. (Arguably, he sees no need to answer the question in this form, since he is confident that people have long known what their duties consist in.[12]) But he does include some observations on hope—that is, faith in God and a future world. We certainly fall into error if we think reason can know a world beyond the senses. Indeed, Kant insists that such knowledge would corrupt practical reasoning, by imposing an external incentive for moral action—fear of eternal punishment and hope of heavenly reward, what he will later call “heteronomy.” Nonetheless, human reason still has an unavoidable interest in belief in God, immortality and freedom. Kant develops this claim more systematically in the second Critique, as discussed below (§2.3).

Kant's idea that reason has “interests,” or even “needs,” may seem strange, and is discussed by Kleingeld 1998a. For finite beings, reason is not transparently or infallibly given to consciousness (as some rationalist philosophers seemed to think), just as it cannot deliver transcendent truths. Thus reason “needs to present itself to itself in the process of gaining clarity about its own workings” (1998a: 97). That is, as the next section discusses, Kant views reason as essentially self-reflexive.

1.4 Reason's self-knowledge

The first Critique argues that metaphysicians have hitherto made no discernable progress in their enquiries. In the second edition Preface, however, Kant proudly proclaims that his book has put metaphysics on “the sure path of a science” (Bvii; cf Axiii). What, then, is the relation of metaphysics—or philosophical reasoning more generally—to those areas of human enquiry that do seem to generate certainty (geometry and mathematics) and the expansion of knowledge (science in general)?

Kant had long been clear that mathematics could provide no model for philosophising.[13] “Mathematics gives the most resplendent example of pure reason happily expanding itself without assistance from experience” (A712=B740). Though it would dearly love to do so, metaphysics cannot follow its course. This is not simply a rhetorical point, since many early modern philosophers had tried to do exactly this—Spinoza's Ethics is one example, Hobbes's political philosophy another (“so many houses of cards,” in Kant's view—A727=B755). Kant's basic argument is that mathematicians are justified in constructing objects or axioms a priori, because they work with intuitions (albeit very abstract ones: a line or the form of a triangle, say), rather than concepts. (See Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics [forthcoming].) This sort of procedure is not available to philosophers, who have no right to assume any a priori intuitions or axioms about metaphysical entities.

But if mathematics does not provide a model, the relation between metaphysics and the empirical sciences is also unpromising. In the first place, Kant has argued that experience cannot reveal metaphysical entities. We could never know, for instance, that we are free: like everything else we can know, human conduct is in principle open to fully determinate causal explanation. Second, experience cannot generate the sort of necessity Kant associates with metaphysical conclusions. (This is a long-standing bone of contention between Humean and Kantian accounts of knowledge—for instance, as to the basis of causation. See Kant and Hume on Causality.) That is, our investigation of the world, no matter how systematic or scientific, only reveals contingent facts: it cannot show that such-and-such must be the case. If we hold, for example, that scientific laws hold necessarily (e.g., “the same fundamental laws must hold at all times”), this is a metaphysical rather than an empirical claim.

Neither point, however, deters Kant from using the imagery of science and experiment to describe his own philosophical endeavours. Such metaphors are especially prominent in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique, where he writes:

Reason, in order to be taught by nature, must approach nature with its principles in one hand, according to which the agreement among appearances can count as laws, and, in the other hand, the experiment thought out in accord with these principles—in order to be instructed by nature not like a pupil, who has recited to him whatever the teacher wants to say, but like an appointed judge who compels witnesses to answer the questions he puts to them. (Bxiii)

In other words, reason, as “[self-]appointed judge,” does not sit by and merely observe whatever comes along. It actively proposes principled accounts of the phenomenon it investigates—that is, hypotheses. Then it devises experiments to confirm or disprove these.

As a characterisation of philosophical reasoning, this prompts Kant to optimism, but it may also cause puzzlement in his readers. Kant is optimistic, because what philosophy has to investigate is not the infinite scope of the empirical world, but rather “what reason brings forth entirely out of itself… as soon as [its] common principle has been discovered” (Axx). (One application of this idea is found in the Transcendental Dialectic of the first Critique, where Kant insists that there are only three transcendental ideas—the thinking subject, the world as a whole, and a being of all beings—so that it is possible to catalogue exhaustively the illusions to which reason is subject.) But there is also much room for puzzlement. Kant is suggesting that reason conduct an experiment upon itself—an idea that comes close to paradox. He also suggests that reason has a “common principle”—but nowhere in the first Critique does he explain what this consists in.

How Kant's “experiment” functions with regard to our everyday knowledge is well-known. His Copernican hypothesis (Bxvi f) is that experience is relative to the standpoint and capacities of the observer. Only on this basis, Kant contends, can we find an explanation for the structure of that experience (for example, its temporality or causal connectedness). The alternative, that we take a “single standpoint” and do not distinguish between objects of experience and those that are “merely thought… beyond the bounds of experience” (i.e., things-in-themselves), fails because it results in “an unavoidable conflict of reason with itself” (Bxviii n). However, this still leaves open awkward questions about philosophical knowledge, and reasoning more generally. That is, Kant's philosophical task is not just a matter of “compelling” sensibility and understanding to act as “witnesses”: reason stands before its own tribunal, too, and must give account of itself. (This metaphor is investigated by Stoddard 1988; Kant's juridical and political metaphors are given a central philosophical role by Saner 1967 and O'Neill 1989.) When reason decides to act as judge and jury in its own case, how can we expect the results to stand up to scrutiny?

Section 3 indicates the most thorough reply to this question in the literature, that offered by Onora O'Neill. To anticipate briefly: The general problem hinted at by Kant's metaphors—of reason's experiment upon itself, or compelling itself to give testimony—is that of reason's self-knowledge (cf Axi f). Kant assumes that we have a capacity of reason; but “reason grants [respect] only to that which has been able to withstand its free and public examination” (Axi n). We cannot, therefore, dogmatically invoke this capacity as an authority (“reason… has no dictatorial authority,” A738=B766), especially given how fallible it has proven in metaphysics (“how little cause have we to place trust in our reason if in one of the most important parts of our desire for knowledge it does not merely forsake us but even entices us with delusions and in the end betrays us!” Bxv). Kant's question, then, is how we might defend reason from various doubts and worries[14] and how we might discipline it without begging questions (for instance, by invoking claims or premises that themselves are open to doubt) (cf. O'Neill 1989: Ch. 1, 1992, & 2004). This would then be the central task of critique (cf Bxxxv): reason's self-reflexive examination of itself, which establishes its limits, its “common principle,” and its proper authority.

2. Practical reason: morality and the primacy of pure practical reason

In the first Critique there are only hints as to the form Kant's moral theory would take,[15] and the account of practical reason in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and Critique of Practical Reason (1788) is radically new. Kant now claims to have discovered the supreme principle of practical reason, which he calls the Categorical Imperative. (More precisely, this principle is an imperative for finite beings like us, who have needs and inclinations and are not perfectly rational.) Notoriously, Kant offers several different formulations of this principle, the first of which runs as follows: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). (On the different versions of the Imperative, which Kant claims are equivalent, see Kant's Moral Philosophy, §§5-9.) Kant holds this principle to be implicit in common human reason: when we make moral judgments, we do so by this criterion, although invariably we do not articulate it as such.

The Categorical Imperative is not the only principle of practical reason that Kant endorses. At nearly the same level of generality is the principle underlying all “hypothetical imperatives.” (See Kant's Moral Philosophy, §4.) Imperatives of skill and prudence rely on the principle: “Whoever wills the end also wills (insofar as reason has decisive influence on his actions) the indispensable necessary means to it that are within his power” (4:417f; cf. 5:19f[16]). Following Hume, many philosophers hold that practical reasoning is essentially instrumental. They therefore see all practical demands as ultimately hypothetical, that is, conditional upon our having particular ends or inclinations (cf Kant and Hume on Morality, §6). Kant, however, sees the principle of hypothetical imperatives as subordinate to the categorical imperative (cf. Korsgaard 1997), since reason can also be the source of unconditional demands.

2.1 Freedom implies moral constraint in the form of the categorical imperative

Alongside the derivation of his supreme moral principle, the most difficult questions about Kant's view of practical reason centre on its relation to freedom. Although the broad outlines are consistent, Kant's views on this topic seem to shift more than usual across his critical writings. (See Kant's Moral Philosophy, §10 for a brief sketch, and Allison 1990 for a masterful, though not uncontroversial, account.) This and the following sub-section focus on Kant's central, radical claim that “freedom and unconditional practical law [that is, for any finite being, the Categorical Imperative] reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f). In other words, freedom implies that practical reason can be pure (non-instrumental, unconditional), and hence that we are subject to the demands of the Categorical Imperative; and our subjection to morality implies that we must be free.

Kant's argument from freedom to the Categorical Imperative is very short indeed (see Critique of Practical Reason, 5:19-30). If I am free to step back from all inclinations, those inclinations do not provide a compelling reason to act in any particular way. All that is left to determine my way of acting (my maxim, in Kant's terminology) is “the mere form of giving universal law” (5:27). By the “mere form of… law” Kant means that there must be some principle, some overall policy or structure, determining what I do—otherwise my actions would be merely random, and hence unintelligible: no-one would be able to follow them (not even me). More than this, no principle is truly law-like unless it abstracts from an agent's particular motivations and situation, so as to be followable by all. Only then can it be capable of “giving universal law.”

Although Kant sometimes writes as if it were difficult to see what practical reason requires (for instance, in his comments about practical wisdom: §3.2 below), he usually assumes that everyone readily grasps the fundamental principles which all can follow. That is, he is remarkably optimistic about people's capacity for independent moral insight. In the recent literature there is some consensus that Kant failed to recognise the complexity and difficulty of moral reasoning (cf. Herman 1993: Ch. 4; O'Neill 1996). The difficulty of judging what the categorical imperative requires, however, only arises if Kant has adequately justified it. In particular, his equation of mere law-likeness with principles that can be followed by all may seem much too quick. However, Kant also considers some other principles that may sound stable or law-like but go beyond the “mere form of law”—and thereby fail to be justifiable. To mention just two of the six candidates he discusses in the second Critique (5:39ff):

One possibility would be a policy of following my inclinations wherever they might lead (Kant identifies this view with Epicurus). Although this is a policy of sorts, and indeed one that a free agent could adopt, it goes beyond the “form of law” by taking substantive guidance from merely subjective factors. In doing so, it actually abandons law-likeness and intersubjective validity. Apart from the fact that my inclinations will surely change and clash, it is not a policy that everyone can follow: if they did, the results would be chaotic and defeat anyone's attempts to satisfy their inclinations. (That is, it is non-universalisable in the sense that it leads to a contradiction in the will. While we can conceive of a world of such agents, we cannot consistently will such a world. Cf Kant's Moral Philosophy §5.) More abstractly, such a policy gives weight to the particular conditions of one particular agent—conditions that have no authority to guide others' thought or action. So Kant says:

it is requisite to reason's lawgiving that it should need to presuppose only itself, because a rule is objectively and universally valid only when it holds without the contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another. (5:21)

A second possibility—in some respects, an inversion of the previous one—would be to disregard my own inclinations and submit to another's dictates, or perhaps the laws and customs my community. Kant mentions Mandeville, but Hobbes' solution to the “state of nature” offers a more familiar example. This requires everyone to submit to a single sovereign, and not to judge for himself what he should do. There are many problems with this solution, but for Kant the most fundamental one is that to submit to another's dictates is to give up the demand that those requirements be justified. However “benevolent” or “enlightened” the authority, its instructions would be unjustified in the fundamental sense that reasons are no longer relevant to those who submit. (Of course, to submit insofar as one finds an authority justified may be perfectly reasonable—except that it is not submission. It is actually a sort of cooperation, whereby we retain the right to exercise our own judgment. We often do this when we believe someone else is better able to judge a particular issue—when we accept “doctor's orders,” for example.)

There is a common difficulty underlying all the untenable alternatives Kant considers. They look for substantive guidance from outside of reason itself—just as hypothetical imperatives only guide action if some end is taken for granted. In Kant's terms, this is heteronomy—that is, reasoning directed from the outside, by an authority that is merely assumed. The problem is to find ways of acting and thinking that are authoritative—that is, are entitled to guide everyone's acting and thinking. To gain this entitlement, they must be autonomous—that is, not dependent on an authority that itself refuses justification. Kant's injunction to look to the mere form of law at first appears to provide no guidance at all, and has often been reproached on this basis. Defenders of Kant's ethics argue that it represents a substantial constraint: to avoid all those ways of thinking and acting that cannot be followed by all. (For discussion see inter alia O'Neill 1989: Ch. 5; Herman 1993; Allison 1990: Ch. 10 §II.) If so, the autonomy of reason can point to the positive sense of freedom at the heart of Kant's practical philosophy. This is the possibility of acting in ways that do not presuppose “contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another” (5:21), and hence do not fall foul of others' demands for justification (cf. Brandom 1979).

2.2 How moral constraint implies freedom: Kant's “fact of reason”

In addition to claiming that freedom implies subjection to the Categorical Imperative, Kant also argues that moral obligation implies freedom. Throughout the critical writings, Kant argues that “nothing in appearances can be explained by the concept of freedom” (5:30). So he frequently insists that morality “exists in the sensible world [the world as known through the senses and by science] but without infringing on its laws” (5:43). Every action, considered as an event in the world of experience, must be considered as caused (whether we think of explanations given by neuroscience or physics or perhaps even psychology). Experience of the objective world therefore gives us no warrant for assuming freedom. Instead it is to our consciousness or subjectivity that Kant turns:

Ask [someone] whether, if his prince demanded, on pain of… immediate execution, that he give false testimony against an honourable man who the prince would like to destroy under a plausible pretext, he would consider it possible to overcome his love of life… He would perhaps not venture to assert whether he would do it or not, but he must admit without hesitation that it would be possible for him. He judges, therefore, that he can do something because he is aware that he ought to do it and cognises freedom within him, which, without the moral law, would have remained unknown to him. (5:30; cf. 5:155f)

Or as Kant also says, “the moral law, and with it practical reason, [have] come in and forced this concept [freedom] upon us” (5:30). In the next section, Kant introduces this idea in notorious terms, as a “fact of reason”: “Consciousness of this fundamental law may be called a fact of reason because one cannot reason it out from antecedent data of reason” (5:31; cf. 5: 6, 42f, 47, 55, 91, 104).

This “fact” has caused considerable controversy among commentators. One reason for this is that Kant is not altogether clear about what he takes this fact to demonstrate. Another is that he has repeatedly argued that morality cannot be based on facts about human beings, and must be revealed a priori (independently of experience). Yet another is that Kant speaks of “cognising the moral law,” when he is well aware that no author before him has formulated this moral law as he now does. A final source of difficulty is that this “fact, as it were” does not feature in his earlier treatise, the Groundwork, and does not appear again.

One school of thought—which includes many of the most influential Kant scholars, and is sympathetically represented in Allison 1990 (Chs. 12 and 13)—sees a fundamental change in Kant's thought here. Whereas Part III of the Groundwork seems to give a “deduction” (justification) of freedom, in the second Critique Kant sees that this project is impossible on his own premises. So he stops argument short by appealing to a supposedly indubitable fact. Others emphasise the clear continuities between the two works—in particular, Kant's continued reliance on common moral consciousness. For example, Łuków 1993 emphasises the parallel between the role played by Achtung (“respect” or “reverence” for morality) and the fact of reason. Kant refers to reverence in all his ethical writings: it is the only “feeling self-wrought by a rational concept [= the moral law]” (4:401n). As such, it clearly parallels what he now calls “the sole fact of pure reason” (5:31). (See also O'Neill 2002 and Timmermann [forthcoming].)

There are serious difficulties at issue in this scholarly dispute. But Kant's line of thought in the long passage just quoted is relatively clear: We all (most of us) recognise that there are situations where we ought to do something, even though it will cost us something that is very dear to us (i.e., we feel ourselves subject to an unconditional moral imperative); and so far as we really acknowledge this “ought,” we commit ourselves to believing that it will be possible for us to do this (i.e., that we are free); and this reveals something that we could hardly be certain of except on the basis of this encounter with ourselves.

Clearly, this line of thought is not immune to criticism. (Our feeling of moral constraint might be explained in terms of a Freudian super-ego, for instance.) But it enables us to see why Kant thought that moral awareness—unlike any other sort of experience—gives us a practical certainty of our freedom, being “a fact in which pure reason in us proves itself actually practical” (5:42). (“Practical certainty” because it is not knowledge of the same sort as empirical and scientific knowledge.) At the same time, if Kant is right that only the Categorical Imperative reveals those ways of acting that we can justify to others, then we can see why he claims, “freedom and unconditional practical law reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f).

2.3 The primacy of practical reason

Kant does not give a complete account of the relation of practical reason to theoretical reason in either the Groundwork or any later works. However, the second Critique does include an important section that bears on this question: “On the primacy of pure practical reason in its connection with speculative reason” (5:119-121). (See Gardner 2006 for recent discussion.) At the most general level, Kant's notion of autonomy already implied some sort of primacy for pure practical reason. In denying theoretical reason all insight into the supersensible (against various stripes of rationalism) and in denying normative authority to the inclinations (against Hume), Kant is also denying that theoretical or instrumental reasoning can supply authoritative reasons to act: only pure practical reason can do this. Now, however, Kant argues that pure practical reason has “primacy” even on the home turf of theoretical reason. That is, he argues that pure practical reason should guide some of our beliefs, as well as our actions.

Kant defines primacy as “the prerogative of the interest of one insofar as the interests of others is subordinated to it” (5:119). He gives two reasons for thinking that practical reason has this “prerogative.”[17] First, practical reason can be “pure” or independent from “pathological conditions,” that is, our inclinations. So it is not conditioned by anything else—for instance, by a desire for happiness or merely subjective wishes. Second, Kant argues that we cannot leave the question of primacy undecided, because practical reason would otherwise come into conflict with theoretical reason. The interest of theoretical reason consists in expanding our knowledge and avoiding error—which means suspending all claims to knowledge beyond the bounds of experience. However, insofar as theoretical reason has interests at all, this is itself a practical matter, “since all interest is ultimately practical.” So Kant writes:

But if pure reason of itself can be and really is practical, as the consciousness of the moral law proves it to be [cf. §2.2 on the “fact of reason”], it is still only one and the same reason which, whether from a theoretical or a practical perspective, judges according to a priori principles; it is then clear that, even if from the first [theoretical] perspective its capacity does not extend to establishing certain propositions [e.g., the existence of God] affirmatively, although they do not contradict it, as soon as these same propositions belong inseparably to the practical interest of pure reason it [theoretical reason] must accept them. (5:121)

Kant's basic claim is not prima facie implausible—“all interest is ultimately practical and even that of speculative reason is only conditional and is complete in practical use alone” (5:121). But what he means by this, exactly, is a difficult matter of interpretation. (Cf. Neiman 1994: Ch. 3; Guyer 1997; Rauscher 1998.) Moreover, the uses to which Kant puts this argument are as controversial as any question in his philosophy, since he here reinstates—as items of faith rather than knowledge—all those ideas that the first Critique had argued to lie beyond human insight. (See further the entry Kant's Philosophy of Religion.)

To this end, Kant introduces the idea of a “postulate,” defined as “a theoretical proposition, though one not demonstrable as such, insofar as it is attached inseparably to an a priori unconditionally valid practical law” (5:122). “These postulates are those of immortality, of freedom considered positively (as the causality of a being insofar as it belongs to the intelligible world), and of the existence of God” (5:132).[18] The law to which they “attach” is, of course, the moral law. It enjoins us to act for the sake of duty, with no assurances that anything will follow from this for our own happiness or that of others.[19] This creates an “antinomy” or conflict between happiness and morality. While morality is, for Kant, the sole unconditional good for human beings, he certainly does not deny that happiness is an important good, and indeed the natural and necessary end of every human being (cf. 4:415). This leads him to the concept of “the highest good”[20]:

virtue (as worthiness to be happy) is the supreme condition of whatever can even seem to us desirable and hence of all our pursuit of happiness… and is therefore the supreme good. But it is not the whole and complete good for finite rational beings; for this, happiness is also required, and that not merely in the partial eyes of a person who makes himself an end, but even in the judgment of an impartial reason [i.e., the issue is not really about whether I will be happy if I act well, but about the fate of all human beings]… happiness distributed in exact proportion to morality (as the worth of a person and his worthiness to be happy) constitutes the highest good of a possible world. (5:110)

Kant's argument is bold but dubious. He holds that we must think of moral activity as having a real relation to happiness—a relation that is not merely possible or accidental, but one that really will come about. And yet we cannot think of human agency as anywhere near adequate to the task: “I [or indeed we] cannot hope to produce this [highest possible good] except by the harmony of my will with that of a holy and beneficent author of the world” (5:129). So, Kant argues, we must postulate God's existence, while a belief in immortality enables us to hope that we will come closer to virtue so as to be worthy of happiness. (Reath 1988 argues that Kant sometimes also deploys a more defensible, “secular” or this-worldly, notion of the highest good. Further recent discussion includes Kleingeld 1995 and Guyer 2000a & 2000b.)

3. The unity of theoretical and practical reason

We have seen one way in which Kant links theoretical and practical reason. In answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant invokes the primacy of practical reason, so that theoretical reason may accept the postulates of God, freedom and immortality “as a foreign possession handed over to it” (5:120). This argument finds little favour among contemporary authors, although its development has been taken up in some commentary on Kant's account of teleology, both in the Critique of Judgment (Guyer 1989; Freudiger 1996; see also Kant's Aesthetics and Teleology, §3) and before that work (Kleingeld 1998b). Kleingeld, for example, claims that theoretical and practical reason both lead to a “view of nature as divinely designed… [and] are united or combined through the belief that nature harmonises with morality” (1998b: 336). Such a position, however, lacks wider philosophical resonance. Most contemporary philosophers assume that the world does not “harmonise with” morality in this way—or, at any rate, that any such harmony is a human task, and not a matter of divine agency. (Again, cf. Reath 1988, and see also Guyer 2000b.)

The principal attempt to uncover the unity of Kantian reason in the light of contemporary philosophical concerns is Onora O'Neill's (1989, and subsequent essays). This section will focus on her central claim concerning the unifying role of the categorical imperative, and the principal bases for such a claim in Kant's texts. Although O'Neill's interpretation of Kantian reason enjoys considerable respect among Kant scholars, it should be added that it has not yet attracted a significant critical literature. (Among early reviews, see Engstrom 1992 and Wood 1992.)

3.1 Reason's “common principle”

In the original Preface to the first Critique, Kant had raised the idea of reason's “common principle”: “Nothing here can escape us, because what reason brings forth entirely out of itself cannot be hidden, but is brought to light by reason itself as soon as reason's common principle (gemeinschaftliches Prinzip) has been discovered” (Axx). Unfortunately, neither edition of the Critique addresses the question of what this principle might be.

This question is raised in the works on practical reason, but then postponed and never clearly answered. In the Preface to the Groundwork, Kant explains why the book is not entitled a Critique of Pure Practical Reason:

[A critique of pure practical reason] is not of such utmost necessity as [a critique of pure theoretical reason], because in moral matters human reason can easily be brought to a high degree of correctness and accomplishment, even in the most common understanding, whereas in its theoretical but pure use it is wholly dialectical [i.e., a source of illusion]… I require that the critique of pure practical reason, if it is to be carried through completely, be able at the same time to present the unity of practical with speculative reason in a common principle, since there can, in the end, be only one and the same reason, which must be distinguished merely in its application. (4:391)

In the second Critique, Kant compares the book's structure with the first Critique and comments: “such comparisons [are] gratifying; for they rightly occasion the expectation of being able some day to attain insight into the unity of the whole rational faculty (theoretical as well as practical) and to derive everything from one principle—the undeniable need of human reason, which finds complete satisfaction only in a complete systematic unity of its cognitions” (5:91). Kant's tone is confident, but the fact is that “insight into the unity of the whole rational faculty” has once more been postponed. (Prauss 1981 argues that Kant failed to achieve this insight, in part because he did not appreciate how cognitive success is a fundamentally practical goal. Förster 1992 discusses Kant's reflections on this topic in his final manuscript, the Opus Postumum.)

However, as Onora O'Neill points out in a celebrated essay (1989: Ch. 1), the claims Kant has now made about practical reason actually commit him to a third claim concerning reason's “common principle.” Kant has argued that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of practical reason, and that practical reason has primacy over theoretical reason. It follows, therefore, that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of reason.—That the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of reason is, to be sure, a conclusion that Kant never states as such. But there are reasons for thinking that this ought to have been his view, and in some places he comes very close to making such a claim. (Rescher 2000 (Ch. 9) similarly emphasises the “isomorphism” of theoretical and practical reason. Rauscher 1998 notes that Kant's own use of the “primacy” of practical reason is more limited than O'Neill's, while endorsing O'Neill's overall case.)

Direct textual evidence for O'Neill's reading is slight. The clearest passage is a footnote (!) to Kant's essay “What is it to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” (1786):

To make use of one's own reason means no more than to ask oneself, whenever one is supposed to assume something, whether one could find it feasible to make the ground or the rule on which one assumes it into a universal principle for the use of reason. (8:146n)

The parallel with the first formulation of the Categorical Imperative—“act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421)—hardly needs spelling out. Kant now says: think only in accordance with that maxim that could be a universal law.[21] Differently put: thinking is an activity, and if the Categorical Imperative is indeed “categorical” then it applies to all our activities.

However, other strands of Kant's thought also support such an interpretation. The two that have attracted the most attention are Kant's “maxims of common human understanding” and his well-known account of the “public use of reason.”

3.2 The “maxims of common human understanding”

Kant sets out three “maxims of common human understanding” [= reason] which are closely related to the Categorical Imperative. They appear twice in his published writings, in relation to both our acting and our thinking.[22] The maxims are discussed by O'Neill 1989: Ch. 2 & 1992, and by Neiman 1994: Ch. 5.

In his last published work, the Anthropology, Kant presents the maxims in a practical context, as guidelines for achieving some degree of wisdom:

Wisdom, as the idea of a practical use of reason that conforms perfectly with the law [or: is perfectly law-like—gesetzmäßig-vollkommen], is no doubt too much to demand of human beings. But also, not even the slightest degree of wisdom can be poured into a man by others; rather he must bring it forth from himself. The precept for reaching it contains three leading maxims: (1) Think for oneself, (2) Think into the place of the other [person] (in communication with human beings), (3) Always think consistently with oneself. (7:200; cf. 228f)

The maxims also appear in the Critique of Judgment, where they are more closely related to the theoretical use of reason. This occurs in a famous section on the sensus communis or “community sense,” which Kant describes as:

a faculty for judging that… takes account (a priori) of everyone else's way of representing in thought, in order as it were to hold its judgment up to human reason as a whole and thereby avoid the illusion which, from subjective private conditions that could easily be held to be objective, would have a detrimental influence on the judgment. (5:293)

That is, the maxims are precepts for judging in accordance with “reason as a whole” and avoiding the distortions that can arise from “subjective private conditions.”

To think for oneself Kant describes as the maxim of unprejudiced thought; its opposite is passivity or heteronomy in thought, leading to prejudice and superstition.[23] To think in the place of everyone else is the maxim of enlarged (or broad-minded) thought. And always to think in accord with oneself is the maxim of consistent thought (5:294). Although the last maxim sounds more straightforward, Kant is careful to emphasise its difficulty: it “can only be achieved through the combination of the first two and after frequent observance of them has made them automatic” (5:295). Consistency—which we might also call law-likeness in thought—is far from automatic: it depends both on the genuine attempt to judge for oneself and the determination to expose one's judgments to the scrutiny of others. In other words, it involves regarding oneself, first, as the genuine author of one's judgments, and second, as accountable to others.

The maxims support, therefore, the thesis of a unified structure of theoretical and practical reasoning, and flesh out the implications of the Categorical Imperative. As a matter of thought, to reason is to discipline one's judgments so that others can follow them. As a matter of practical wisdom, it is to discipline one's actions so that others can adopt the same principles.

3.3 The public use of reason and the importance of communication

Kant's famous essay, “What is Enlightenment?” (1784), has been of particular importance to commentators concerned with Kantian reason and politics. (See O'Neill 1989: Ch. 2 & 1990; Velkley 1989; Deligiorgi 2005; Patrone 2008.) Kant's second maxim, “to think into the place of others,” shows that he regards communication as essential to making valid judgments and to acting wisely. Thus Kant writes: “…how much and how correctly would we think if we did not communicate with others to whom we communicate our thoughts, and who communicate theirs with us!”[24] Kant also describes the first maxim as the way to achieve “liberation from superstition,” which he equates with “enlightenment” (5:294).

In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant articulates both these thoughts in a political context, demanding that each of us “have the courage to use our own reason”:

Enlightenment is the human being's emergence from his self-incurred immaturity. Immaturity is the inability to use one's own understanding [= reason] without the guidance of another. This immaturity is self-incurred if its cause is not lack of understanding, but lack of resolution and courage to use it without the guidance of another. Sapere aude! [Dare to be wise!] Have courage to make use of your own understanding [= reason]! is thus the motto of enlightenment. (8:35)

Here, Kant is not primarily concerned with enlightenment as the activity or condition of an individual: rather as something that human beings must work towards together. For this, he says, “nothing is required but… the least harmful… freedom: namely, freedom to make public use of one's reason in all matters” (8:36). This is not the freedom to act politically. Rather, it is what we now call freedom of the pen—in Kant's words, the use of reason “as a scholar before the entire public of the world of readers” (8:37).

Kant's contrast is with the reasoning someone undertakes as an employee: as a civil servant or military officer or cleric of an established church. In each case, the employee is bound to fulfill the dictates of a given leader or organization: he uses his reason to decide the best way of achieving ends that have been laid down by others. (There is a loose parallel with instrumental reasoning, which decides the best means to achieve ends laid down by inclination. In Kant's terms, both are heteronomous—“directed by another.”) Although this sort of reasoning is often undertaken in what we now call “public offices”—as a state employee, for instance—Kant describes such uses of reason as private—that is, deprived of freedom and accountable only to a particular authority. By contrast, the public use of reason is not bound to any given ends and is accountable to all: one speaks as a member of “the society of citizens of the world” (8:37). In this capacity, the civil servant or cleric may reason freely, offering critical scrutiny of government policies or religious teachings, although he is still bound to enact these in his employment.

Some commentators find Kant's emphasis on freedom of the pen elitist, and regret his emphasis on the importance of obedience. (See also Kant's Social and Political Philosophy, §§4, 6.) Between them, these bespeak a clear gulf between the practical and the theoretical. Nonetheless, the essay makes clear Kant's equation of reason with the aspiration to full publicity. “To use one's own reason” is to be engaged in the quest to address all “citizens of the world.” Our judgments and principles are only reasonable to the extent that they can be accepted by all—which means, among other things, that they cannot assume the authority of any particular organization or leader. In fact, Kant had already said this, in a famous passage from the Critique of Pure Reason:

Reason must subject itself to critique in all its undertakings, and cannot restrict the freedom of critique through any prohibition without damaging itself and drawing upon itself a disadvantageous suspicion. For there is nothing so important because of its utility, nothing so holy, that it may be exempted from this searching review and inspection, which knows no respect for persons. On this freedom rests the very existence of reason, which has no dictatorial authority, but whose claim is never anything more than the agreement of free citizens, each of whom must be able to express his reservations, indeed even his veto, without holding back. (A738f=B766f, translation slightly modified)

4. Concluding remarks

Kant's discussions of theoretical reason are not obviously connected to his account of practical reason. His accounts of truth, scientific method and the limited insights of theoretical reason are all complex, as is his view of practical reason and morality. No one doubts that knowledge and scientific enquiry, no less than action, are subject to demands of rationality. However, if Kant's account of reason is based—as O'Neill above all has argued—in avoiding principles of enquiry and of action that others cannot also adopt, it would be possible to see the underlying unity of these demands. We would understand, for example, why Kant so strenuously resists claims to transcendent insight. To give authority to such claims—those of revelation and religious authority, for example—would be irrational insofar as they rest on principles of belief that not all could adopt.

Underlying the difficulty of synthesising and interpreting Kant's account of reason is, of course, the enormous question of what reason is. Many philosophers—both contemporary and historical figures—proceed as if this were already clear. However, once this question—the question of reason's self-knowledge, as Kant puts it—is raised, it is difficult to see grounds for such confidence. While the secondary literature discussing her proposal remains limited, O'Neill's interpretation of Kant represents an ambitious and distinctive answer to this question. O'Neill (2000) situates the Kantian account of reason against three alternatives, which she labels the instrumental, the communitarian, and the perfectionist. The first remains very widespread: with Hume, it regards instrumental reasoning as fundamental (cf. Practical Reason, §4; Reasons for Action: Internal vs. External). The second sees reason as embedded within complex traditions: rationality is what a given tradition or community takes it to consist in (cf. MacIntyre 1988; Communitarianism). A third option, akin to the forms of rationalism that Kant opposed, is to see reason as an individual capacity to discern or intuit normative truths (cf. Moral Non-Naturalism, §3). Arguably, all three accounts fail in providing reasoned justification to one or another audience. The instrumental reasoner is accountable to no-one—in fact, to nothing apart from whatever desires or ends he happens to have. Someone who takes her particular tradition to define what beliefs and practices count as reasonable can have little to say to those who stand outside it. And the person who believes himself to intuit what is good or true will be mute—or worse—in the face of those who intuit differently.

On the interpretations advanced by Saner, O'Neill, Neiman and others, Kant was aware of all these options and rejected each. We saw above (§1.4) that Kant characterises reason in terms of a self-reflexive procedure. Reason is autonomous and submits to no external authority; it gains authority from submitting itself to critique; and critique involves rejecting any mode of thinking or acting that cannot be adopted by all. In less abstract terms, reason's self-scrutiny is scrutiny by all those who demand justification for any given mode of thought or action. Such a view does not ask us to rely on what others do accept (as the communitarian account does). It does not involve the fantasy that we already know or intuit what everyone should accept (as the perfectionist account does). It proposes, instead, a vision of human beings who are able (as instrumental reasoners are not) to step back from their particular situations and inclinations, in order to construct intersubjective order: communication and co-existence on terms that all can accept. Such an account depends on a particular interpretation of Kant's texts, and is both ambitious and highly complex in its ramifications. Nonetheless, if successful, it would capture two powerful attractions of Kant's philosophising: a universalism that transcends community boundaries, and a modesty that respects the limits of human insight.


Primary sources

Citations from Kant's works, except for the Critique of Pure Reason, are by volume and page numbers of the Akademie edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften (Berlin, 1902–); the Critique of Pure Reason is cited by the standard A and B pagination of the first (1781) and second (1787) editions respectively. The Groundwork is printed in Akademie volume 4 and the Critique of Practical Reason in volume 5; except where otherwise noted, references beginning with “4:” are to the Groundwork and those beginning with “5:” to the second Critique. The Akademie pagination will be found in the margins of all modern translations. The translations cited here are from the standard Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, as follows:

Secondary literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | Kant, Immanuel: aesthetics and teleology | Kant, Immanuel: and Hume on causality | Kant, Immanuel: and Hume on morality | Kant, Immanuel: and Leibniz | Kant, Immanuel: critique of metaphysics | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of mathematics | Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of religion | Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of science | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | morality and practical reason | motivation: moral | practical reason | practical reason: and the structure of actions | rationalism vs. empiricism | reasoning: moral | reasons for action: agent-neutral vs. agent-relative | reasons for action: internal vs. external


For comments on this entry, my thanks to Graham Bird, Tatiana Patrone, Alison Stone, Lea Ypi, and the referees for this Encyclopedia, Paul Guyer and R. Lanier Anderson. For additional assistance my thanks to Alix Cohen, Sebastian Gardner, Onora O'Neill and Jens Timmermann. My grateful thanks, too, to Nick Bunnin, for organising the Chinese philosophy summer school which gave me the opportunity to lecture on this topic.