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Kant's Philosophy of Religion

First published Tue Jun 22, 2004; substantive revision Fri Jul 31, 2009

Throughout his career, Immanuel Kant engaged many of the major issues that contemporary philosophy groups together under the heading “philosophy of religion.” These include arguments for the existence of God, the attributes of God, the immortality of the soul, the problem of evil, and the relationship of moral principles to religious belief and practice. In the writings from his so-called “pre-critical” period, i.e., before the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781, Kant was interested principally in the theoretical status and function of the concept of God. He thus sought to locate the concept of God within a systematically ordered set of basic philosophical principles that account for the order and structure of world. In developing his critical philosophy he proposed a new role for philosophical principles in understanding the order and structure of the world. As a result, the critical project had a significant impact upon his treatment of the status and the role of the concept of God within the theoretical enterprise of metaphysics. In addition, the critical philosophy provided a locus from which Kant could address other important dimensions of the concepts of God and religion more explicitly than he had done in his earlier writings. Chief among these are the moral and the religious import that human beings attribute to the concept of God. In view of these developments in Kant's thinking this entry thus will locate his earlier discussions of these topics within the general philosophical context of his pre-critical period; it will then reference his treatment of these topics after 1781 to key elements of his critical project. It will also highlight issues that remain important for philosophical inquiry into religion. These are the philosophical function of the concept of God, arguments for the existence of God, the relationship between morality and religion (including the notions of “moral faith” and “radical evil”), and the role of religion in the dynamics of human culture and history. A supplementary section, “The Influence of Kant's Philosophy of Religion,” discusses the impact of Kant's account of religion upon subsequent philosophical and theological inquiry.

1. Overview and background

Among the important early works of Kant that touched upon the topic of God are A New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (1755), Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), and The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763). These writings were shaped by his interest in problems in the natural sciences (or, in the terminology of his era, “natural philosophy”) and by an intellectual context in which rationalist philosophies stemming from the work of Leibniz and Wolff held general sway. His treatment of topics such as the relationship of the power of God to the order of the universe was thus primarily aimed in these and other early writings to situate an understanding of the concept of God within those fields of philosophical inquiry called “metaphysics” and “cosmology.” The former was concerned with articulating the general principles of all that is, while the latter focused on the physical principles governing the workings of the natural universe.

At this early stage, Kant's discussions of the concept of God do not focus primarily upon on what religious content and function this concept may have for humans and their activity — e.g., how God may be an object of worship. Their focus is more upon properly locating the concept of God within a systematically ordered set of basic philosophical principles that account for the order and structure of world. This interest in the theoretical status and function of the concept of God continues throughout Kant's entire career. One result is that even in much later writings his treatment of issues of interest to philosophers of religion will be found not only in treatises that focus on religion as a specific form of human activity (e.g., Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason) or in the courses on “philosophical theology” that he occasionally gave in the University of Königsberg (published after his death as Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion). Some of Kant's important analyses and arguments that bear on questions of religious concepts, beliefs and practices are found instead in the works written primarily to advance the agenda of the critical philosophy he inaugurated with the 1781 publication of the Critique of Pure Reason.

That project, inasmuch as it proposed a new role for philosophical principles in understanding the order and structure of the world, had a significant impact upon Kant's treatment of the status and the role of the concept of God within the theoretical enterprise of metaphysics. It also provided a locus in which Kant would address more explicitly a number of important issues connected with the religious import that human beings attribute to the concept of God. In consequence, Kant's critical philosophy developed, on the one hand, a more fundamental line of argument than he had previously deployed against standard rationalist accounts of God's relationship to the ordering of the world. In those accounts, the concept of God stood as the supreme constitutive element in such ordering, i.e., as the fundamental explanatory principle as well as the ultimate and absolute causal ground of the world. Against this view, Kant will argue that the concept of God properly functions only as a “regulative” — i.e., limiting — principle in causal accounts of the spatio-temporal order of the world. Kant's critical philosophy thus undercuts what rationalist metaphysics had offered as proofs for the existence of God. On the other hand, the critical philosophy does more than simply dismantle the conceptual scaffolding on which previous philosophical accounts of the concept of God had been constructed. In a positive vein, it more fully articulates an account of the function that an affirmation of God, made on the basis of what Kant terms “moral faith,” plays in human efforts to sustain conscientious moral endeavor throughout the course of life.

While Kant's scientific interests and the traditions of philosophical rationalism influenced the initial trajectory of his treatment of God as a key concept for metaphysics, other aspects of his historical and social context also played a role in setting the stage for his treatment of religion — particularly in the mature stages of his critical philosophy — as a feature of human life and culture. Among the most important was his upbringing in the milieu of Pietism, a reform movement within German Lutheranism that stressed inner religious conversion and upright conduct over doctrinal exactness. Kant's parents were Pietists and his early education took place in the Collegium Fridericianum, a school established by the Pietist pastor, F. A. Schultz. Kant retained an appreciation for the inner moral conscientiousness that Pietism sought to foster as fundamental to religion even as he reacted strongly against the external ritual and devotional practices of Christian public worship and prayer that Pietism continued to promote. A second important factor in the development of his philosophical approach to understanding religion was his long-standing interest in the variety of human cultures and the dynamics of human social interaction. This provided Kant with a perspective from which to view religion as principally a human phenomenon in which the various aspects of our human make-up — the sensible, the intellectual, the historical and the social — interact in ways that are significant for understanding humanity's role in the cosmos.

One consequence of the interplay of these multiple elements in shaping Kant's thinking is that no single work of his on religion — even his most extensive treatment in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason — provides a comprehensive overview of his analyses and reflections on religion. No one work brings them together into a systematically organized “philosophy of religion.” Any account of Kant's philosophical treatment of religious concepts and of the human phenomenon of religion, moreover, must attend not only to the context in which his own thinking on these matters took shape but also to developments and changes in his views that occur in the course of five decades of philosophical reflection. The rest of this entry thus will locate the more important works in which Kant's discussion of these topics takes place, first, within the general philosophical context of his so-called “pre-critical” period; it will then reference his treatment of these topics after 1781 to key points on the philosophical agenda of his critical project. As part of this chronologically ordered overview, it will highlight issues that Kant addresses which remain important for philosophical inquiry into religion. These are the philosophical function of the concept of God, arguments for the existence of God, the relationship between morality and religion (including his notion of “moral faith” and his treatment of “radical evil”), and the role of religion in the dynamics of human culture and history. A supplementary section will note a number of ways in which Kant's account of religion has influenced the subsequent course of philosophical and theological inquiry. Kant's treatment of these issues has been such that he can be considered one of the thinkers whose work helped to establish philosophy of religion as a distinct field for specialized philosophical inquiry. At the same time, his work on religion also placed important items on the agenda for subsequent theological discussions. A brief consideration will also be given to these theological consequences of his work, since they are sometimes overlooked in accounts of his philosophy of religion.

2. Kant's pre-critical discussions of God

Kant's early writings such as A New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (1755), Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, (1755), and The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763), engage the concept of God in terms of principles and arguments that had been framed by the metaphysical systems of Leibniz and Wolff as well as by the theoretical structure of Newtonian physics. Kant had not yet articulated a definitive break with the approach of the rationalist metaphysics of his predecessors, so his discussions presuppose the validity of the enterprise of constructing an adequate theoretical argument for the existence of God. Even so, he makes a number of points in these works that prefigure key arguments that his mature critical philosophy will later raise against the way rationalist metaphysics had traditionally treated the status and function of the concept of God. In particular, these works show that Kant was already concerned to address the three main lines of argument that he took these traditions characteristically to employ for demonstrating the existence of God: the ontological argument, the cosmological argument, and the physico-theological argument (Dell'Oro, 1994).

2.1 Arguments for the existence of God: Pre-critical period

Among the three early works noted above, Kant's most focused treatment of these arguments for the existence of God can be found in The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God. He classifies arguments for God under just two headings, one that moves to the affirmation of God from a rational concept of the possible, the second that moves from experiential concepts of existent things. The ontological argument, as well as the argument Kant himself poses in this work as the only valid one, fall under the first heading. The cosmological and the physico-theological arguments fall under the second heading.

With respect to the positions about the validity and value of theoretical arguments for the existence of God that Kant later espouses and which are considered his definitive views, there are three features worth noting from this earlier work:

First, he has already formulated a central feature of the main objection that he will raise against the ontological argument in the Critique of Pure Reason, namely, that existence is not a predicate. Kant's objection is directed against rationalist accounts that took the judgment “Something exists” to predicate a property — i.e., “existence” — that is included in the concept of that thing. (An example of a property so predicated would be “extension” as a property of the concept “physical object.”) Fundamental to the ontological argument is the view that “existence” is necessarily a property of the concept of God. This then functions as the decisive consideration for the conclusion that God must exist. Against this, Kant argues that in no case — even that of God — can we predicate “existence” to be a property that is included in the concept of any object. He illustrates this by pointing out that the difference between the one-hundred dollars in my pocket and the one hundred dollars I imagine to be in my pocket is not a difference in the concept of “one hundred dollars.” To say that something “exists” — even in the case of God — is not to predicate a property that its concept lacks if the thing did not exist.

Second, at this earlier stage of his philosophical development he holds, in contrast to the position he takes in his critical philosophy, that there can be a theoretical argument that validly leads to the conclusion that God exists; of note about the argument he proposes, moreover, is that it falls under the same heading under which he has classified the ontological argument, namely an argument that starts from a concept of the possible.

Third, he groups the cosmological and physico-theological arguments under a single heading as “cosmological,” inasmuch as he sees each making an inference to God from our experience of things as they exist in the world, but he already differentiates them from one another in terms of their relative cogency and persuasive power. One line of argument — which he will designate in his later terminology as the “cosmological argument” — moves in terms of a concept of causality to its conclusion that there must be a first necessary being. He does not consider this line of argument, which he sees as characteristic of metaphysics in the tradition of Wolff, to be valid. As in his later criticism of this argument in the first Critique, he sees it ultimately resting upon the same conceptual considerations that function within the ontological argument, most notably the claim that existence is a predicate. The other — which he will designate is his later terminology as the “physico-theological” argument — moves from observations of order and harmony in the world to its conclusion that there must be a wise creator of that order. This argument he also finds lacking in strict probative force; he nonetheless considers it an important marker of the dynamics of human reason to seek an explanatory totality, even though it does not thereby provide a sure demonstrative route to an affirmation of God.

3. God and religion in Kant's critical philosophy

The shift in perspective that Kant takes in his critical philosophy — a shift that he designated a “Copernican revolution” — not only sharpens the earlier criticisms he had made of the ontological and cosmological arguments for the existence of God. It also leads him to conclude that no theoretical argument, even of the kind he had earlier advocated, can do so. Although there are many aspects to this shift in Kant's thinking, one that is centrally important to his treatment of God and religion is the urgent need he sees for human reason to become self-critical and self-limiting of both its powers and pretensions. A fundamental way in which Kant considers human reason to overreach its powers — and thus in need of self-limitation — is its ineradicable tendency to seek a unification of all theoretical principles into a final, comprehensive and absolute totality. Human reason seeks to move from an apprehension of a series of conditioned phenomena in space and time to the affirmation of a ground for such series that is represented as unconditioned, i.e., as independent of space and time. Human reason seeks to know what lies beyond the range of that to which Kant gives the technical term “experience” — i.e., our apprehension of objects as they are interrelated to one another in a spatio-temporal framework of causal laws. He considers any movement to claim knowledge outside the limits of experience to be problematic. It lies beyond the powers of human reason to bring us to any knowledge of an unconditioned ground for the framework within which we apprehend objects in their spatio-temporal relations.

This tendency to go beyond the limits of experience culminates in the representation of ideas of the soul, the world, and God as the final outcome of the efforts of reason to affirm what is absolutely unconditioned. Kant argues that it is mistaken to take these ideas as “constitutive” — i.e., as standing for objects that lie within the scope of our human powers of theoretical cognition. He thus denies that there can be any theoretically adequate basis for the arguments that the metaphysics of Leibniz and of Wolff put forward as theoretical proofs of the existence of God, for the independent subsistence and immortality of the human soul, and for the causal dependence of the world on an absolutely necessary first cause. Despite this denial of the adequacy of such theoretical proofs, Kant nonetheless takes the ideas of God, the soul, and the world to have a valid philosophical use as “regulative,” i.e., for guiding the direction of inquiry to be all the more encompassing in scope.

3.1 Arguments for the existence of God: Critical period

The arguments that Kant offers in the Critique of Pure Reason against the standard proofs of rationalist metaphysics for the existence of God are in continuity, for the most part, with his earlier treatment of these proofs. Although he now re-classifies the proofs for the existence of God under three headings, the physico-theological, the cosmological, and the ontological, his objections to them echo his earlier analyses. The ontological argument rests upon the false assumption that existence is a predicate. The physico-theological and the cosmological arguments can both be shown to rest upon the ontological argument and thus share its fatal defect. There also are notable developments in his arguments that lead him beyond the positions he had taken in those previous discussions. These developments are ones that play a significant role in many subsequent philosophical analyses of religion. They arise from what Kant enunciates as a central argument of his critical philosophy: Human reason is limited (finite), but because it constantly seeks to overstep those limits it requires a discipline to stay within those limits. The appropriate discipline to keep reason within its own limits, moreover, is the one that reason imposes upon itself. “Critique” — i.e., critical philosophy — is thus the method that makes it possible for us to impose such self-discipline upon our human uses of reason. Thus Kant's arguments against the adequacy of any theoretical proof for God exemplify “critique” by identifying one of the crucial limits that we must recognize and set upon our exercise of the power of reason.

Kant's treatment of the concept of God and religion in his critical philosophy, however, does not consist merely in this negative result that we must block reason from taking us along the theoretical paths that rationalist metaphysics had claimed will lead to a proof of God's existence. He argues that once we have disciplined human reason to stay off that theoretical path, we are then in a position to make an affirmation of God on the basis of what he terms the practical, i.e., moral, use of reason. As he writes in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1787), “I had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith.” He thus proposes what has come to be known as his “moral argument” for God and the immortality of the soul. In connection with this argument he also develops the concept of “moral faith.” Key elements of Kant's moral argument are first presented in the “Transcendental Doctrine of Method,” which is the final part of the Critique of Pure Reason, and are then further developed in “The Dialectic of Pure Practical Reason” of the Critique of Practical Reason (1788) and in §§ 86–91 of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). Elements of the notion of moral faith are found in the same texts, as well as in Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason (1793).

3.2 The “moral argument” for God

Kant's “moral argument” rests upon a set of claims about the relationship between a person's leading of a virtuous moral life and the satisfaction of that person's desire for happiness. Central to these claims is the specification that Kant gives to the notion of “the highest good” as the proper object for the moral (“practical”) use of human reason. Within the context of the moral argument, the “practical use of reason” consists in the exercise of our will to choose actions in view of — and solely in view of — their moral rightness. In Kant's technical terminology, in such a choice we will our actions on the basis of a “categorical imperative.” The “highest good” consists in a proper proportioning of happiness to accord with the measure of the virtue each person acquires in willing right moral actions. The highest good thus includes a harmonious proper proportioning of happiness to virtue for all moral agents. For the highest good to be the object of the practical use of reason means that the actions that I will to be moral actions — i.e., actions chosen on the basis of following the categorical imperative — must also be actions that will effect a proper proportioning of happiness to virtue not merely for myself but for all moral agents.

Even as Kant argues that it is necessary for us to will the highest good as the proper object of the practical use of our reason, he offers counter considerations that seem to show that such willing of the highest good will be futile. Chief among these considerations is that willing our actions to be moral is not sufficient to insure that they will effect the happiness appropriate to their virtue. This is so because Kant holds that, in willing actions to be moral, we exclude from the bases on which we choose them any consideration of the happiness such actions might effect for ourselves. Our choice of actions is moral to the extent that they are chosen because they are morally right actions, not because of the happiness they might effect for us. In addition, Kant recognizes that at least some of our right moral choices are likely to produce quite the opposite of happiness for us. A striking example he offers in the Critique of Practical Reason asks the reader to imagine a person presented with this choice: to perjure oneself so that the state can convict and execute an innocent person whom the ruler considers an enemy of the state, or, to refuse to commit perjury and thus be subject oneself to summary conviction and execution. Kant maintains that, in such a case we would judge that the morally right course of action is not to commit perjury. We would make this judgment, he maintains, in full recognition that following the right course of action would be at the cost of our own life and happiness. He also holds that we would make the judgment that not to commit perjury is the morally right course of action even if we were unsure that we would, if faced with this choice, act in accord with that judgment.

This case helps to illustrate why Kant thinks that human beings endeavoring to lead a moral life find themselves faced with a dilemma in which the practical use of their reason produces a seeming contradiction in the object of their willing. The practical use of our reason requires, on the one hand, that our choice of moral actions be independent of any consideration of their effectiveness in producing happiness for us. In fact, it will sometimes even require the choice of actions — as in the case of the individual who refuses to commit perjury — that produce results contrary to happiness. It thus seems that reason, in requiring us to will our actions on the basis of their moral rightness, i.e., on the basis of a categorical imperative, thereby forbids us to consider their effect on our happiness. On the other hand, the practical use of our reason also requires us to make the highest good, which Kant has defined as necessarily including happiness, an object of our will. This means that we must take our moral actions to be such that they will, in fact, bring about the happiness that is properly proportioned to their virtue, even though we have reasons to think that they will not do so. We have reason to think they may fail to bring us happiness not only because doing right actions may bring harmful results upon ourselves. It also seems that, even in cases when happiness does result from our actions, this comes about because those actions are part of the causal processes of the natural world that bring us satisfaction and pleasure. The rightness of the actions does not seem to have a role to play in such causal processes. This second requirement of reason on our willing of actions thus seems to enjoin us to expect our moral actions to bring about that which, precisely as moral actions, they do not have power to produce.

3.3 The antinomy of practical reason, the highest good and moral faith

Kant sees this conflict in the willing of our action arising from the tendency of reason to overstep its limits. In parallel with his discussion in the Critique of Pure Reason of similar conflicts that reason produces in its theoretical use, Kant terms this conflict the “antinomy” of practical reason. His account of this conflict, as well as its resolution, rest upon a distinction that is central to his entire project of critique; he used the same distinction in the first Critique to resolve antinomies in the theoretical use of reason. He employs a variety of terms to draw this distinction in the writings that set forth his critical philosophy, e.g., between “phenomenon” and “noumenon,” or between a “thing as appearance” and a “thing in itself.” For purposes of his moral argument, he expresses this distinction in terms of a contrast between the “sensible” and the “intelligible.” By this he means that, when we consider the relationship between our willing and our action, we have two different standpoints from which to view that relationship. From one standpoint, that of the sensible, we view our actions in terms of their capacity to be efficient causes of our happiness. This perspective on our actions in terms of their causal efficacy within a spatio-temporal framework is properly the domain of the theoretical use of our reason. From the other standpoint, that of the intelligible, we view our actions in terms of their moral rightness. This perspective views our actions in terms of their origin from the exercise of our freedom. For Kant, however, the exercise of our freedom cannot be conceptually encompassed within a framework of spatio-temporal causality. An account of our actions in terms of freedom is thus in the domain of the practical, not the theoretical, use of reason.

The antinomy of practical reason thus arises inasmuch as we fail to distinguish these two standpoints from one another. The consequences of such failure affect not only how we think about our moral action. Far more important for Kant are its consequences upon the very way we undertake moral action: Uncertainty about the efficacy of moral action for bringing about happiness discourages efforts to lead a fully moral life. There are two points of focus for such discouragement, each of which involves one of the requirements for our willing that we place upon ourselves in the practical use of our reason. One is that even the sustained moral effort of a lifetime does not seem sufficient for us to form the good will operative in our moral efforts into a “holy will,” the term Kant uses to designate the attainment of complete human moral perfection. We thus seem unable to meet in full the demand that practical reason, in the categorical imperative, makes upon us to be moral. The second focus for discouragement is the apparent incapacity of our moral actions, precisely in their capacity as moral, to effect happiness. We thus seem unable to meet the demand of practical reason that we make the highest good — which necessarily includes happiness — the object of our willing. In each case, the use of our reason places on us a requirement that seems impossible for us to meet. Such impossibility would make our moral efforts futile.

3.4 The immortality of the soul

In response to this predicament, Kant affirms a principle that, with respect to choice and action, such practical use of our reason cannot require of us what is impossible. To the extent that we view these requirements of reason from the sensible perspective of spatio-temporal causality, they will seem impossible of fulfilment. When, however, we view them from the intelligible perspective within which we frame the exercise of freedom, their fulfilment can legitimately be “postulated” in terms of the immortality of the soul and of the existence of God. Thus, with respect to the requirement that we attain the complete moral perfection of a holy will, Kant holds that we are justified in affirming that we will have an unending and enduring existence after death, outside the framework of spatio-temporal causality, in which to continue the task of seeking moral perfection. He holds a similar view with respect to the requirement that the highest good be the object of our willing. Even though our moral actions do not seem to have the efficacy required in a spatio-temporal framework to produce the happiness proportioned to virtue that is a necessary component of the highest good, we are justified in affirming that there is a supreme cause of nature — i.e., God — that will bring this about, not merely for ourselves, but for all moral agents.

3.5 The postulates of practical reason and the categorical imperative

Kant terms immortality and the existence of God “postulates” in order to distinguish them from the “ideas” of the soul and of God that rationalist metaphysics had made objects of theoretical proofs. These “postulates of practical reason” are fundamental components in what Kant terms “moral faith.” The need for such moral faith arises in the context of our human efforts to sustain ourselves in consistent, life-long moral endeavor. The requirement of practical reason that we make the highest good the object of our will is crucial for sustaining us in this endeavor. Kant thinks that our efforts in that endeavor will falter, however, in the face of the predicament for our willing that the antinomy of practical reason poses for us. If we think that the highest good is impossible of attainment or that our actions have no bearing on its attainment, what basis do we then have for continuing our moral efforts?

Kant's response to this predicament is to appeal to the unconditioned character of the moral demand, i.e., the categorical imperative, that we place upon ourselves in exercising our freedom. Since our reason demands that we will our actions solely on the basis of their rightness, and since we acknowledge that we can do what reason demands, i.e., that we are free, then we have a basis in reason for affirming the possibility of meeting reason's correlative demand regarding the highest good. We can make the achievement of the highest good the object of our willing, even if it remains obscure to us exactly how this will eventually come about. Thus the immortality and the God that are postulated as necessary for bringing about, in concert with our own moral endeavors, the highest good are both objects of “moral faith.” Kant is insistent that the affirmation of God and immortality that is made on the basis of moral faith does not make them objects of theoretical knowledge. They are objects of moral faith inasmuch as their acknowledgment is a matter of a free assent that is legitimated, but not thereby coerced, by reason. In some measure, his account of moral faith complements his arguments against the traditional proofs for the existence of God inasmuch as Kant thinks that such proofs seek to coerce us intellectually into an acknowledgment of that which can only be appropriately affirmed by a response of our human freedom.

Kant's moral argument and his notion of moral faith have both been subject to different interpretations and evaluations by commentators on Kant's work. Some of these disputes, e.g., about the structure and validity of the moral argument, arise because Kant's own articulation of the argument varies in the writings in which he proposes it. Some of the more important objections to the moral argument center upon the coherence and adequacy of the distinction between the sensible and the intelligible perspectives that are central to both his statement and resolution of the antinomy of practical reason. The moral argument has also been criticized as an effort on Kant's part to transgress, in the name of the moral use of reason, the very limits he had set to the theoretical use of reason in the first Critique.

The interpretive problems and disagreements that arise about the content of the notion of “moral faith” and its significance for Kant's critical project are often themselves part of larger interpretive questions about the nature and scope of that project.(See Beiser 2006 for an overview of the main issues.) One focus for these issues is the set of three questions — “What can I know? What ought I do? For what may I hope?” — that Kant himself posed as expressing the central human concerns that he took to be at stake in the critical project. While the first question arises from the domain of the theoretical use of reason and the second from that of its practical use, the third is the one upon which Kant thinks that both uses of reason must eventually converge. The question of hope — and the notion of moral faith that Kant takes to be the proper response of human reason to that question — are thus centrally important to the unity of Kant's critical project (Neiman 1994). Kant's interpreters disagree over how successful he is — if at all — in answering the question of hope with the notion of moral faith.

A number of the occasional essays that Kant published in the 1780s and 1790s include treatments of some of the philosophical, cultural, and political dimensions of religion. An Answer to the Question: What Is Enlightenment? (1784) touches upon religious tolerance and the role of religion in public and political life. What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking? (1785) was Kant's contribution to a controversy involving F. H. Jacobi and Moses Mendelssohn that was sparked by Jacobi's claim that the recently deceased G. E. Lessing, one of Germany's leading intellectuals, had been an adherent of Spinoza's philosophy and thus, by implication, an atheist. (See Wood 1996b, and Beiser 1987 for accounts of this “pantheism controversy” and Lestition 1993 for the socio-political background of the controversy). In The Conjectural Beginning of Human History (1786) Kant utilizes the early chapters of the book of Genesis as a vehicle for sketching elements for a philosophy of history. In a similar fashion, in The End of All Things (1794) he makes use of another biblical text, the book of Revelation, to explore the moral significance of the Christian doctrine of the Last Judgment. The brief essay, On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy (1791), offers a reflection on the book of Job that serves to illustrate the antinomy of practical reason. This prefigures Kant's more extensive discussion in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793) of the relationship between morality and religion.

The work in which Kant offers his most extensive and systematic treatment of religion from the perspective of his critical philosophy is Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. In addition to its importance in the development of Kant's view of religion as discussed below, this work is notable because of the controversy over censorship that attended its publication, the reprimand then given to Kant in the name of the Prussian emperor, Friedrich Wilhelm II, and Kant's pledge not to publish on matters of religion, which he later considered abrogated upon the death of the emperor in 1797. (Extensive accounts of this controversy can be found in Wood 1996a and Di Giovanni 1996.) Kant published his own account of this controversy, including his justification for considering himself released from his pledge, in the “Preface” to The Conflict of the Faculties (1798). In the first essay in this three part work Kant defends the freedom of the philosopher to inquire into matters of religion. He places this defense in the context of a larger account of the difference between the work of philosophers and that of biblical theologians as distinct faculties in a university.

In the four essays that constitute Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (hereafter Religion) Kant articulates his understanding of religion as a human activity in terms of the account of human moral life he had developed in works such as the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), the Critique of Practical Reason (1788) and the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). The need for dealing explicitly with this relationship arises in consequence of Kant's further reflections on the notion of “the highest good” and its role in the resolution of the antinomy of practical reason. The demand that the highest good be the object of our willing inevitably gives rise, in Kant's view, to the question: “What is to result from this right conduct of ours?” Kant's treatment of this question allows him to set forth and defend the claim that even though “morality on its own behalf has no need of religion,” it is still the case that “morality leads inevitably to religion.”

3.6 Radical evil

Before Kant offers an answer to this question in Religion, however, he provides a more extensive account of the obstacles to right willing and right conduct than he offered in his earlier critical writings on moral philosophy. Central to this account is the development of the notion of “radical evil” in human moral life and of the moral conversion that is needed to overcome it. He presents the notion of radical evil in Book One of Religion under the guise of a philosophical counterpart to the Christian doctrine of original sin. His discussion of moral conversion in Book Two then parallels the Christian doctrine of redemption. Kant places particular emphasis upon human responsibility for both radical evil and moral conversion. Unlike original sin, which Christian belief has understood as inherited, radical evil is self-incurred by each human being. It consists in a fundamental misdirection of our willing that corrupts our choice of action. In Kant's terminology, it consists in an “inversion” of our “maxims,” which are the principles for action we pose to ourselves in making our choices. Instead of making the rightness of actions — i.e., the categorical imperative — the fundamental principle for choice, we make the satisfaction of one of our own ends take priority in the willing of our actions. We thus inculcate in ourselves a propensity to make exceptions to the demand of the categorical imperative in circumstances when such an exception seems to be in our own favor.

Overcoming radical evil requires a “change of heart” — i.e., a reordering of our fundamental principle of choice — that we are each responsible for effecting in ourselves. Effecting such a change, however, leaves unsettled our moral culpability for those choices that were made under the inverted maxim of evil. In the language of traditional Christian theology, what happens to the “old man” [sic] — and to the consequences of choices made under that guise — when conversion makes us “new”? In answer to this question, Kant reinterprets the Christian doctrine of the atonement through the death of Jesus Christ. He rejects the view of “vicarious atonement” — that Christ takes away the guilt of previous evil conduct by standing as a substitute for all of us — in favor of an “exemplary” one. Christ thus provides a model in which we recognize steadfast adherence in both word and action to the principle of moral rightness which we already possess in the categorical imperative as the principle for the exercise of our practical reason. (See Quinn 1986 for a construal of Kant's alternative to vacarious atonement that does not involve an exemplary role for Christ.) Such adherence to the principle of moral rightness is fundamental to what Kant considers to be the “religion of reason.”

Kant's account of moral conversion also touches upon another important theme in Christian theology: the nature and function of the activity of God in the process of moral regeneration. This process, under the heading of “justification,” was a central issue during the sixteenth century Reformation that lead to division of Christian churches in Europe. Christian theology conceptualized this activity of God in justification as part of its complex notion of “grace.” Against this background, Kant's account of human responsibility for turning away from radical evil has frequently been understood as leaving little or no room for the functioning of God's grace within this process. This would align Kant with a much earlier Christian heresy, Pelagianism, (combated by Augustine in the fifth century) that emphasizes the power of human beings to effect their own salvation (Michalson 1990, Wolterstorff 1991; for different assessments, see Mariña 1997 and Byrne 2007, Chapter 7). Similar issues arise concerning Kant's views of other Christian doctrines, such as divine providence, the incarnation, miracles and revelation, which seem to require that the activity of God intervene within the ordinary causal workings of the natural and human world. Kant makes the distinction between the sensible and the intelligible in such a way that it precludes making any theoretical claims about the possibility of interventions of these kinds: To the extent that our human apprehension of such interventions is cognized within the framework of spatio-temporal events and relations, we can account for them as part of the causal working of nature. What then stands in dispute about his view is the extent to which it still allows affirmation of the possibility of such divine interventions on the basis of moral faith. (See Savage, 1991 and Mulholland, 1991 for contrasting views.)

3.7 The ethical commonwealth

Kant's account of radical evil does not end, however, with the moral conversion of the individual. This is so because radical evil is occasioned by the social circumstances of human life and culture and it has social and historical consequences. As a result, the moral conversion of the individual — or even of many individuals — is not sufficient to overcome radical evil completely. Kant explores these social and historical dimensions in Books Three and Four of Religion. Whereas the first two books of Religion display important links between Kant's view of religion and the moral, epistemological, and metaphysical concerns of his critical philosophy, these last two books exhibit connections to his philosophy of human culture, society and history.

In Book Three he argues that the emulation and competition that come with being part of society, a dynamic he terms humanity's “unsociable sociability,” trigger the preference for self that corrupts the individual's fundamental maxim of choice. The formation of civil and political society — which Kant envisions as leaving “the juridical state of nature” — makes it possible to place a limit upon a range of external actions that issue from such a corrupt maxim. This limit specifically bears upon actions through which we interfere with one another's freedom. Kant later enunciates this limit, in The Metaphysics of Morals (1797), as “the universal principle of right”: “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone's freedom in accordance with a universal law.” This limit has the positive effect of channeling our unsociable sociability into ways that lead to the development of culture and commerce. Kant sees this as a central way in which the causal workings of nature play a role in the moral progress of humanity. Even so, this limit cannot effect the moral change needed to leave what he calls “the ethical state of nature” in which the maxim of our actions remains inverted. Kant thus introduces a notion of “the ethical commonwealth” as the ideal form of human social relationship through which the social occasions and consequences of radical evil are to be overcome.

Kant had anticipated some of the features of the ethical commonwealth in earlier works. His discussion of the highest good in the “Transcendental Doctrine of Method” at the end of the Critique of Pure Reason characterizes the “moral world” as one that is constituted by the interrelation of rational beings in accord with moral laws. In The Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals he uses the image of a “kingdom of ends” to express the mutual relation that moral agents bear to one another when the categorical imperative serves as their principle of choice. Developing these earlier discussions into the notion of an ethical commonwealth allows Kant to explore further the social and historical dimensions of the religion of reason that he sees arising from morality.

3.8 Religion, society and history

Just as the central discussions of the previous books of Religion showed parallels to important Christian doctrines, the ethical commonwealth can be considered Kant's re-interpretation of the doctrine of the Church as “the kingdom of God on earth.” In what may be an echo of the Augustinian-Lutheran concept of the two kingdoms, Kant differentiates the external civil order of the political commonwealth from the internal moral order of the ethical commonwealth. A major consequence of this differentiation is that the external civil order of the state can be enforced by coercion while the moral order of the ethical commonwealth can come about only by the mutual exercise of human freedom. Even as Kant characterizes as “invisible” the bonds that link members of the ethical commonwealth to one another into a community of virtue, he also assigns this community a role in the visible historical and cultural dynamics through which humanity is to attain its moral destiny as a species. In this role the ethical commonwealth serves as a major link between Kant's account of religion and his philosophical treatments of the social dynamics that form political and cultural life in the course of human history. The ethical commonwealth shares key features with three important concepts that Kant uses to articulate his vision of the social dynamics that engage human freedom and properly respect the dignity of the persons who exercise it. These three are a republic constitution for the governance of nation-states, a cosmopolitan perspective on cultural and commercial interchange among nations, and perpetual peace among nations as “the highest political good.” Along with the ethical commonwealth they all presuppose a dynamic of equal mutual respect for all individuals in virtue of their moral freedom. They are all factors in forming the trajectory of human history toward what Kant sees as the moral destiny of humanity as a species.

Kant provides his most concrete specification of this destiny in terms of “perpetual peace,” a notion that he sketches in the essay Idea for A Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View (1784) and most fully articulates in Toward Perpetual Peace (1795). In the conclusion of Book Three, Division One of Religion, he describes the ethical commonwealth as the community of virtue that assures perpetual peace. This suggests that a full establishment of the inner moral order of the ethical commonwealth precedes the creation of an external political order that will be effective for sustaining peace among nations. In a later writing, The Conflict of the Faculties, Part Three: An Old Question Raised Again: Is the Human Race Constantly Progressing? (1798), Kant suggests the opposite relation: Securing an external political order of perpetual peace is a condition that needs to precede the establishment of an ethical commonwealth which is the achievement of an internal dynamic of moral harmony of intent among all free individuals. This poses a number of interpretive issues about the final destiny Kant envisions for individuals and for humanity as a species (Yovel, 1980). Does Kant think that the moral destiny of the human species is attainable in this spatio-temporal world as an outcome of human history? Or is it instead an “other-worldly” achievement? Or might it just be an ideal goal that can be increasingly approximated but never fully reached? A related question is whether the ethical commonwealth, or other notions, such as perpetual peace, that he uses to articulate elements of the moral destiny of humanity as a species, come to replace Kant's earlier affirmation of the immortality of individual souls as a postulate of practical reason. Finally, there are questions about the meaning and the consistency of Kant's use of the terms “providence” and “history” as factors in the trajectory of humankind towards its moral destiny (Kleingeld, 2001). Does Kant truly hold that there is a divine providential order guiding human moral efforts toward an harmonious final outcome? Or does he affirm, instead, only an immanent, impersonal dynamic of history that anticipates Hegel's notion of “the cunning of reason”?

Kant uses the concept of an ethical commonwealth in the second part of Book Three of Religion to outline the function of a religion of reason within the general historical movement of humanity toward its moral destiny. Book Four, in contrast, deals with a number of the concrete features of human religious practice and history. As in other parts of Religion Kant shows awareness of the range of the world's religions, but his primary focus continues to be upon Christianity. He first locates Christianity by reference to the prevailing Enlightenment conceptual construct of “natural religion.” He notes that, as a result the obstacles that arise from the finite and sensible character of our human make up, a purely natural religion is unable on its own to command the universal assent that is its due. There is thus an historical need for revelation to be added to the religion of reason. The purpose of this revelation, however, is not to add something essential that would be otherwise lacking in the religion of reason, but to serve as a vehicle for the free assent that the religion of reason invites as the response of an authentic faith. Once authentic faith is operative, the vehicle of revelation will no longer be necessary.

3.9 Kant's criticisms of organized religion

Kant sees a significant negative side in the concrete, historical character of the human reception of the religion of reason and its ancillary revelation. It is subject to the same dynamic of self-serving corruption that is the mark of radical evil. In consequence, Kant articulates in Book Four some of his strongest criticisms of the organization and practices of Christianity that encourage what he sees as a religion of counterfeit service to God. Among the major targets of his criticism are external ritual, superstition and a hierarchical church order. He sees all of these as efforts to make oneself pleasing to God in ways other than conscientious adherence to the principle of moral rightness in the choice of one's actions. The severity of Kant's criticisms on these matters, along with his rejection of the possibility of theoretical proofs for the existence of God and his philosophical re-interpretation of some basic Christian doctrines, have provided the basis for interpretations that see Kant as thoroughly hostile to religion in general and Christianity in particular (e.g., Walsh 1967). Other interpreters see Kant as trying to mark off a defensible rational core of Christian belief, but offer differing judgements about the success of his efforts. Some (e.g., Michalson 1999) evaluate these efforts as self-defeating, paving the way for a more radical denial of God such as Nietzsche's. Others (e.g., Collins 1967; Wood 1992) see Kant articulating an account of the dynamics linking morality and religious belief that has positive value for a believer's reflective appropriation and practice of faith.

3.10 Kant on religious language

Kant rarely frames his discussions of God, faith and religion in terms that explicitly focus on questions about the structure, use and limits of religious language. Yet a distinctively Kantian mode of engaging these questions can be articulated from the moral and anthropological focus he gives to his general treatment of God, faith and religious practice. This focus serves as a moral anthropology from which to situate the bearing that the language of religious belief and practice has upon human moral conduct. Central to this moral anthropology is the affirmation of the critical limits human finite reason must place upon itself regarding what may properly be said — and not said — about God and about the human relation to God. These limits align Kant with a long tradition of philosophical and theological apophaticism that stresses human cognitive incapacity to grasp and to articulate the transcendent; it thus insists that if anything at all may be properly and truly said of God, it is about what God is not. Kant's apophaticism, moreover, serves a particular purpose within his project of setting critical limits to the human use of reason: it helps to curb the efforts of the theoretical use of human reason (i.e., of the “natural disposition” to metaphysics that Kant identifies in the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics) to attain unconditioned and comprehensive intelligibility articulated in terms of a concept of God as ens realissimum. Failure to attend to these limits results in an anthropomorphism in speaking of the divine or in an idolatry that names the non-divine as divine. These are each deeply rooted human impulses that blur what Kant takes to be the radical difference between the human and the divine that is central to the integrity of human moral effort (Neiman 2002, 68–72). Each impedes the proper fulfillment of the human moral vocation of reciprocal autonomous responsibility in an ethical commonwealth. For Kant, it is thus what we do morally in virtue of our religious discourse — in our speech and in our silence about God —that provides the most fundamental marker for determining the meaning, propriety, and truth of that discourse.

4. God in the Opus Postumum

During his final years, Kant worked on a manuscript, left incomplete at his death, that has become known as the Opus Postumum. The manuscript contains sections in which Kant continues to explore the relationship between the concept of God and our consciousness of being moral agents, i.e., our consciousness that we can subject ourselves freely, through our acknowledgment of the categorical imperative, to the requirement of rightness in the choice of our actions. These reflections suggest that Kant may have been trying to draw a connection between the idea of God and the acknowledgment of the categorical imperative that is even more direct than that found in the moral argument. Such a connection would make the idea of God totally immanent within human moral consciousness (Förster, 2000). Given the fragmentary nature of the manuscript, it is difficult to reach a conclusive judgment on the content and significance of Kant's last reflections on God and religion.


Primary Literature

We cite the English translations only.

A. Pre-critical writings

B. Critical writings

1. The following texts focus most directly on religion. They are all found in Religion and Rational Theology, Wood, Allen W. and George Di Giovanni (trans. and ed.), 1996, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press:

2. Other writings from the critical period relevant to Kant's view of God and religion:

Secondary Literature

Works on Kant's pre-critical treatments of the concept of God

Kant's treatment of religion in his critical philosophy

The Influence of Kant's Philosophy of Religion

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

afterlife | evil, problem of | free will | German Philosophy: in the 18th century, prior to Kant | God: concepts of | Hartshorne, Charles | Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich | Kant, Immanuel: critique of metaphysics | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Kant, Immanuel: philosophical development | Kierkegaard, Søren | Mendelssohn, Moses | ontological arguments | providence, divine | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence | Wolff, Christian