Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Lorenzo Valla

First published Thu May 14, 2009

Lorenzo Valla (c. 1406–1457) was one of the most important humanists of his time. In his Elegantiae linguae Latinae, an advanced handbook of Latin language and style, he gave the humanist program some of its most trenchant and combative formulations, bringing the study of Latin to an unprecedented level. He made numerous contributions to classical scholarship. But he also used his vast knowledge of the classical languages and their literatures as a tool to criticize a wide range of ideas, theories, and established practices. He famously exposed the Donation of Constantine—an important document justifying the papacy's claims to temporal rule—as a forgery. He compared, for the first time, St. Jerome's translation of the Bible with the Greek text of the New Testament, thereby laying the foundations of critical biblical scholarship. In his Repastinatio dialectice et philosophie (Re-ploughing of Dialectic and Philosophy), also known as his Dialectics, he attacked scholastic-Aristotelian thought from an essentially linguistic point of view. Already highly controversial in his own times, Valla's works continue to provoke heated debate in modern times.

1. Life and Works

Valla did not have an easy life. Equipped with a sharp and polemical mind, an even sharper pen and a sense of self-importance verging on the pathological, he made many enemies throughout his life. Born in Rome in (most likely) 1406 to a family with ties to the papal curia, Valla as a young man was already in close contact with some major humanists working as papal secretaries such as Leonardo Bruni (1370–1444) and Poggio Bracciolini (1380–1459). Another was his uncle Melchior Scrivani, whom Valla had hoped to succeed after his death; but opposition from Poggio and Antonio Loschi (1365/8–1441) must have led the pope to refuse to employ him. Valla had criticized an elegy by Loschi, and had also boldly favored Quintilian over Cicero in a treatise which has long considered to be lost; but a lengthy anonymous prefatory letter has recently been found and ascribed, convincingly, to the young Valla (Pagliaroli 2008; it turns out not to be a comparison between Cicero's theory of rhetoric and Quintilian's handbook, as scholars have always assumed, but a comparison between a declamation of Ps-Quintilian, Gladiator—the declamations were considered to be the work of Quintilian in Valla's time—and one of Cicero's orations, Pro Ligario.) Valla's Roman experience of humanist conversations found an outlet in his dialogue De voluptate (On Pleasure), in which the Christian concepts of charity and beatitude are identified with hedonist pleasure, while the “Stoic” concept of virtue is rejected (see below). Valla would later revise the dialogue and change the names of the interlocutors, but his Epicurean-Christian position remained the same.

Meanwhile he had moved to Pavia in 1431, stimulated by his friend Panormita (Antonio Beccadelli, 1394–1471)—with whom he was soon to quarrel—and had begun to teach rhetoric. He had to flee Pavia, however, in 1433 after having aroused the anger of the jurists. In a letter to a humanist jurist friend of his, Catone Sacco (1394–1463), Valla had attacked the language of one of the lawyers' main authorities, Bartolus of Sassoferrato (1313–1357). After some travelling, in 1435 Valla found employment at the court of Alfonso of Aragon (1396–1458), who was trying to capture Naples. Though complaining about the lack of time, books and fellow humanists, Valla was immensely productive in this phase of his career. In 1439 he finished the first version of his critique of scholastic philosophy. Two years later he finished his Elegantiae linguae Latinae, a manual for the correct use of Latin syntax and vocabulary, which became a bestseller throughout Europe. As a humanist in the court of a king who was fighting against the pope, Valla demonstrated that the Donation of Constantine, which had served the papacy to claim worldly power, was a forgery. In the same years he composed a dialogue on free will and began working on his annotations to the standard Latin translation of the Bible, comparing it with the Greek text of the New Testament. He also wrote a dialogue On the Profession of the Religious (De professione religiosorum), in which he attacked the vow of obedience and asceticism taken by members of religious orders. Further, he worked on the text of Livy, wrote a history of the deeds of Alfonso's father, and began re-reading and annotating Quintilian's Institutio oratoria (Education of the Orator) in a manuscript which is still extant (Paris, Bibliothèque Nationale de France, lat. 7723). But Valla's philological approach and his penchant for quarreling made him enemies at the Aragonese court. After his patron Alfonso had made peace with the pope in 1443, Valla's role as an anti-papal polemicist may have shrunk. His enemies took advantage of the situation. The immediate occasion was Valla's denial of the apostolic origin of the Symbolum Apostolicum (Apostle's Creed). In a letter, now lost, to the Neapolitan lawyers he argued that a passage from Gratian's Decretum that formed the basis of the belief in the apostolic origin of the Creed was corrupt and needed emendation. Powerful men at the court staged an inquisitorial trial to determine whether Valla's works contained heretical and heterodox opinions. In preparation for the trial Valla wrote a self-defense (and later an “Apology”), but was rescued from this perilous situation by the intervention of the king. The whole affair must have fuelled Valla's wish to return to Rome. In 1447 he made peace with the pope and became an apostolic scriptor (scribe), and later, in 1455, a papal secretary. In these years he revised some of his earlier works such as the Repastinatio and his notes on the New Testament, and translated Thucydides and Herodotus into Latin; his work on Thucydides, in particular, was to have an important impact on the study of this difficult Greek author. Always an irascible man, he continued to engage in quarrels and exchanged a series of invectives with his arch-enemy Poggio. He died in 1457, still working on a second revision of his Repastinatio (that is, the third version). He was buried in the Lateran.

Valla's impact on the humanist movement was long-lasting and varied. His philological approach was developed by subsequent generations of humanists, and found, arguably, its first systematic expression in the work of Angelo Poliziano (1454–1494). His Elegantiae was printed many times, either in the original or in one of its many adaptations and abridgments made by later scholars. A copy of his annotations on the New Testament was found near Louvain by Erasmus (1467?-1534), who published it. Though many theologians complained about his ignorance of theology, Luther and Leibniz, each for his own reasons, found occasion to refer to Valla's dialogue on free will. Humanists found Valla's criticisms of Aristotelian-scholastic thought congenial, though not a few regarded his style as too aggressive and polemical. And though some humanists such as Juan Luis Vives (1492–1540) and Johann Eck (1486–1543) complained about Valla's lack of philosophical acumen, his critique of scholasticism has a place in the long transformation from medieval to modern thought—in which humanism played an important though by no means exclusive role.

2. Valla's Critique of Scholastic Philosophy

In his Repastinatio dialectice et philosophie, which is extant in three versions with slightly different titles, Valla attacks what he sees as the foundations of scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy and sets out to transform Aristotelian dialectic. As the title of the first version clearly indicates, he wants to “re-plough” the ground traditionally covered by the Aristotelian scholastics. The term repastinatio means not only “re-ploughing” or “re-tilling” but also “cutting back” and “weeding out.” Valla desires to weed out everything he regards as barren and infertile in scholastic thought and to re-cultivate the ground by sprinkling it with the fertile waters of rhetoric and grammar. His use of repastinatio indicates that he is setting out a program of reform rather than of destruction, in spite of his often aggressive and polemical tone. Book I is devoted mainly to metaphysics, but also contains chapters on natural philosophy and moral philosophy, as well a controversial chapter on the Trinity. In Books II and III Valla discusses propositions and forms of argumentation such as the syllogism.

His main concern in the first book is to simplify the Aristotelian-scholastic apparatus. For Valla, the world consists of things, simply called res. Things have qualities and do or undergo things (which he refers to as “things”). Hence, there are three basic categories: substance, quality, and action. At the back of Valla's mind are the grammatical categories of noun, adjective, and verb; but in many places he points out that we cannot assume that, for instance, an adjective always refer to a quality or a verb to an action (Repastinatio, 134–156; 425–442). These three categories are the only ones Valla admits; the other Aristotelian categories of accidents such as place, time, relation and quantity can all be reduced to quality or action. Here, too, grammar plays a leading role in Valla's thought. From a grammatical point of view, qualities such as being a father, being in the classroom, or being six-feet tall all tell us something about how a particular man is qualified; and there is, consequently, no need to preserve the other Aristotelian categories.

In reducing the categories to his triad of substance, quality, and action, Valla does not seem to have in mind “realist” philosophers who accepted the independent existence of entities such as relations and quantities over and above individual things. Instead, his aim is to show that many terms traditionally placed in other categories, in fact, point to qualities or actions: linguistic usage (loquendi consuetudo) teaches us, for example, that quality is the overarching category. Thus, to the question “of what kind”, we often give answers containing quantitative expressions. Take, for instance, the question: what sort of horse should I buy? It may be answered: erect, tall, with a broad chest, and so on. Valla's reduction of the categories often assumes the form of grammatical surveys of certain groups of words associated with a particular category: thus, in his discussion of time, he studies words like “day,” “year,” and a host of others; and his discussion of quantitative words treats mathematical terms such as line, point and circle. Of course, Valla does not deny that we can speak of quantity or time or place. But the rich array of Latin terms signify, in the final analysis, the qualities or actions of things, and nothing exists apart from concrete things. (Substance is a shady category for Valla, who says that he cannot give an example of it, much as Locke was later to maintain that “a substance is something I know not what”).

It is tempting to connect this lean ontology to that of William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347). The interests, approach and arguments of the two thinkers, however, differ considerably. Unlike Valla, Ockham does not want to get rid of the system of categories. As long as one realizes, Ockham says, that categories do not describe things in the world but categorize terms by which we signify real substances or real inhering qualities in different ways, the categories can be maintained and the specific features of, for example, relational or quantitative terms can be explored. Thus, Ockham's rejection of a realist interpretation of the categories is accompanied by a wish to defend the categories as distinct groups of terms. Valla, on the other hand, sees the categories as summing up the real aspects of things: hence, there are only substances, qualities, and actions, and his reductive program consists in showing that we have a vast and rich vocabulary in Latin that we can use for referring to these things. His questions about words and classes of words are not unlike those of Priscian (fl. 500–530) and other grammarians. (Priscian, for instance, had stated that a noun signifies substance plus quality, and pronouns substance without quality.)

Another good example of Valla's reduction of scholastic terminology, distinctions, and concepts is his critique of the transcendental terms. According to Valla, the traditional six terms—“being,” “thing,” “something,” “one,” “true,” and “good”—should be reduced to “thing” (Latin res) since everything that exists, including a quality or an action of a thing (also called a “thing”) is a thing. A good thing, for example, is a thing, and so, too, is a true thing. Valla's grammatical approach is evident in his rejection of the scholastic term ens. Just as “running” (currens) can be resolved into “he who runs” (is qui currit), so “being” (ens) can be resolved into “that which is” (id quod est). “That,” however, is nothing other than “that thing” (ea res); so we get as a result the laborious formula: “that thing which is”. We do not, however, need the phrase “that which is” (ea que est): “a stone is a being” (lapis est ens), or the equivalent phrase into which it can be resolved, “a stone is a thing which is” (lapis est res que est), are unclear, awkward, and absurd ways of saying simply that “a stone is a thing” (lapis est res). Valla also rejects other scholastic terms such as entitas (“entity”), hecceitas (“this-ness”) and quidditas (“quidity”) for grammatical reasons: these terms do not conform to the rules of word formation in Latin. While he is not against the introduction of new words for things unknown in antiquity (e.g., bombarda for “cannonball”), the terminology coined by the scholastics is a different matter entirely.

Related to this analysis is Valla's repudiation of what he presents as the scholastic view of the distinction between abstract and concrete terms, that is, the view that abstract terms (“whiteness,” “fatherhood”) always refer solely to quality, while concrete terms (“white,” “father”) refer to both substance and quality (Repastinatio, 21–30). In a careful discussion of this distinction, taking into account the grammatical categories of case, number, and gender, Valla rejects the ontological commitments which such a view seems to imply, and shows, on the basis of a host of examples drawn from classical Latin usage, that abstract terms often have the same meaning as their concrete counterparts (useful/utility, true/truth, honest/honesty). These terms refer to the concrete thing itself, that is, to the substance, its quality or action (or a combination of these three components into which a thing can be resolved). Again, Valla's main concern is to study the workings of language and how these relate to the world of everyday things, the world that we see and experience.

In describing and analyzing this world of things Valla is not only guided by grammatical considerations. He also uses “common sense” and the limits of our imagination as yardsticks against which to measure scholastic notions and definitions. He thus thinks that it is ridiculous to imagine prime matter without any form or form without any matter, or to define a line as that which has no width and a point as an indivisible quantity that occupies no space. Valla's idea is that notions such as divisibility and quantity are properly at home only in the world of ordinary things. For him, there is only the world of bodies with actual shapes and dimensions; lines and points are parts of these things, but only, as he seems to suggest, in a derivative sense, in other words, as places or spaces that are filled by the body or parts of that body. If we want to measure or sketch a (part of a) body, we can select two spots on it and measure the length between them by drawing points and lines on paper or in our mind, a process through which these points and lines become visible and divisible parts of our world (Repastinatio, 142–147; 427–431). But it would be wrong to abstract from this diagramming function and infer a world of points and lines with their own particular quantity. They are merely aids for measuring or outlining bodies. In modern parlance, Valla seems to be saying that ontological questions about these entities—do they exist? how do they exist?—amount to category mistakes, equivalent to asking the color of virtue.

The appeal to common sense (or what Valla considers as such) informs his critique of Aristotelian natural philosophy. He insists on commonplace observations and experiences as criteria for testing ideas and hypotheses. On this basis, many of Aristotle's contentions, so Valla argues, are not true to the facts (Repastinatio, 98–112). He rejects or qualifies a number of fundamental tenets of Aristotelian physics, for instance that movement is the cause of heat, that a movement is always caused by another movement, that elements can be transformed into one another, that each has its own proper qualities (heat and dryness for fire, heat and humidity for air, etc.), that there are pure elements, that the combination of heat and humidity is a sufficient condition for the generation of life, and so forth. Valla often uses reductio ad absurdum as an argumentative strategy: if Aristotle's theory is true, one would expect to observe phenomena quite different from the ones we do, in fact, observe. In arguing, for instance, for the existence of a fiery sphere below the moon, Aristotle had claimed that “leaden missiles shot out by force melt in the air” (De caelo II.7, 289a26–28). Valla rejects this claim by appealing to ordinary experience: we never see balls—whether leaden, iron, or stone, shot out of a sling or a cannon—heat up in the air; nor do the feathers of arrows catch fire. If movement is sufficient to produce heat, the spheres would set the air beneath in motion; but no one has ever observed this. Arguably, the importance of Valla's polemic here is not so much the quality of his arguments as the critical tendency they reveal, the awareness that Aristotle's conclusions often do not conform to daily experience. While he does not develop his critique in the direction of an alternative natural philosophy as later Renaissance philosophers such as Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588) and Francesco Patrizi of Cherso (1529–1597) would do, Valla contributed to undermining faith in the exclusive validity of the Aristotelian paradigm.

Valla also criticizes Aristotle's natural philosophy because, according to him, it detracts from God's power. In strongly polemical terms, he attacks Aristotle for his “polytheistic” ideas and for what Valla sees as his equation of God with nature (Repastinatio, 54–59). Valla wants to reinstate God as the sole creator of heaven and earth. To think of the cosmos in terms of a living animal or the heavens in terms of celestial orbs moved by intelligences is anathema to Valla (as it was to many medieval scholastics as well). The notion of God as First Mover is also rejected, since movement and rest are terms which should not be applied (except perhaps metaphorically) to spiritual beings such as God, angels, and souls.

Religious considerations also led Valla to find fault with another fundamental tenet of Aristotelian scholastic thought: the Tree of Porphyry (Repastinatio, 46–50; 389–391). Valla has several problems with the Tree. First of all, it puts substance, rather than thing, on top. For Valla, however, pure substance does not exist, since a thing is always already a qualified substance. He also thinks that there is no place for a human being in the Tree of Porphyry. Since the Tree divides substance into the corporeal and the spiritual, it is difficult to find a place for a human being, consisting of both soul and body. Moreover, the Tree covers both the divine and the created order, which leads to inappropriate descriptions of God and angels, to which the term “animal” should not be applied, since they do not have a body. Valla, therefore, divides Porphyry's Tree into three different trees: one for spiritual substance, one for corporeal substance, and one for what he calls “animal,” that is, those creatures which consist of both body and soul (Repastinatio, 49–50; 422–424). One might argue that what Valla gains over Porphyry by disentangling the supernatural from the natural order, he loses by having to admit that he cannot place Christ in any of his three trees, since he is not only human but also God.

The soul as an incorporeal substance is treated by Valla in a separate chapter (Repastinatio, 59–73; 408–410; 418–419). Rejecting the Aristotelian hylomorphic account, he returns to an Augustinian picture of the soul as a wholly spiritual and immaterial substance made in the image of God, and consisting of memory, intellect, and will. He rejects without much discussion the various functions of the soul (vegetative, sensitive, imaginative, intellectual), which would entail, he thinks, a plurality of souls. He briefly treats the five exterior senses but is not inclined to deal with the physiological aspects of sensation. The term “species” (whether sensible or intelligible) does not occur at all. The Aristotelian sensus communis—which the medieval commentary tradition on De anima had viewed as one of the internal senses, alongside imagination (sometimes distinguished from phantasia), memory, and the vis aestimativa (foresight and prudence)—is mentioned only to be rejected without further argument (Repastinatio, 73). Imagination and the vis aestimativa are absent from Valla's account, while memory, as the soul's principal capacity, appears to have absorbed all the functions which scholastics had divided among separate faculties of the sensitive soul. What may have provoked Valla's anger about the traditional picture is the seemingly passive role allotted to the soul in perception and knowledge: it seems to come only at the very end of a long chain of transmission, which starts with outer objects and concludes with a merely receptive tabula rasa. In his view, the soul is far more noble than the hylomorphic account of Aristotle implies, at least as Valla understands that account. He therefore stresses on various occasions the soul's dignified nature, its immortality, unity, autonomy, and superiority to both the body and the animal soul, comparing it to the sun's central place in the cosmos.

3. Valla's “Reform” of Aristotelian Logic

After Valla's attack on what he calls the fundamenta (foundations) of Aristotelian-scholastic metaphysics and natural philosophy, he turns to dialectic in Books II and III of his Repastinatio. For Valla, argumentation should be approached from an oratorical rather than a logical point of view. What counts is whether an argument works, which means whether it convinces one's adversary or public. The form of the argument is less important. Dialectic is a species of confirmation and refutation; and, as such, it is merely a component of invention, one of the five parts of rhetoric (Repastinatio, 175; 447). Compared to rhetoric, dialectic is an easy subject and does not require much time to master, since it considers and uses only the syllogism “bare”, as Valla puts it, that is, in isolation from its wider argumentative context (Repastinatio, 175); its sole aim is to teach. The rhetorician, on the other hand, uses not only the syllogism, but also the enthymeme (incomplete syllogism), epicheireme (a kind of extended reasoning) and example. The orator has to clothe everything in persuasive arguments, since his task is not only to teach but also to please and to move. This leads Valla to downplay the importance of the Aristotelian syllogism and to consider forms of argumentation that are not easily forced into its straightjacket. Among these are captious forms of reasoning such as the dilemma, paradox, and heap argument (sorites), and Valla offers a highly interesting analysis of these forms in the last book of the Repastinatio.

Without rejecting the syllogism tout court, Valla is scathing about its usefulness. He regards it as an artificial type of reasoning, unfit to be employed by orators since it is does not reflect the natural way of speaking and arguing. What is the use, for example, of concluding that Socrates is an animal if one has already stated that every man is an animal and that Socrates is a man? It is a simple, puerile, and pedantic affair, hardly amounting to a real ars (art). Valla's treatment of the syllogism clearly shows his oratorical perspective. Following Quintilian, he stresses that the nature of syllogistic reasoning is to establish proof. One of the two premises contains what is to be proven (que probatur), and the other offers the proof (que probat), while the conclusion gives the result of the proof—into which the proof “goes down” (in quam probatio descendit). It is not always necessary, therefore, to have a fixed order (major, minor, conclusion). If it suits the occasion better, we can just as well begin with the minor, or even with the conclusion. The order is merely a matter of convention and custom (Repastinatio, 282–286; 531–534).

These complaints about the artificiality of the syllogism inform Valla's discussion of the three figures of the syllogism. Aristotle had proven the validity of the moods of Figure 2 and 3 by converting them to four moods of Figure 1; and this was taught, for example, by Peter of Spain (thirteenth century) in his widely read handbook on logic, the Summulae logicales, certainly consulted by Valla here. Valla regards this whole business of converting terms and transposing propositions in order to reduce a particular syllogism to one of these four moods of Figure 1 as useless and absurd. While he does not question the validity of these four moods, he believes that there are many deviant syllogisms that are also valid, for instance: God is in every place; Tartarus is a place; therefore, God is in Tartarus. Here the “every” or “all” sign is added to the predicate in the major proposition. He says, moreover, that an entirely singular syllogism can be valid: Homer is the greatest of poets; this man is the greatest of poets; therefore, this man is Homer. And he gives many other examples of such deviant schemes. Valla thus deliberately ignores the criteria employed by Aristotle and his commentators—that at least one premise must be universal, and at least one premise must be affirmative, and that if the conclusion is to be negative, one premise must be negative—or, at any rate, he thinks that they unnecessarily restrict the number of possible valid figures.

In his discussion of the syllogism Valla does not refer to an important principle employed by Aristotle and his commentators: dici de omni et nullo (to be said/predicated about all and about none). To quote Peter of Spain's Summulae logicales: “To be said of every [dici de omni] is when there is nothing to to be taken under the subject [nichil est sumere sub subiecto] of which the predicate may not be said, like ‘every man runs’: here, running is said of every man, and under man there is nothing to to be taken of which running is not said. To be said of none [de nullo] is when there is nothing to be taken under the subject from which the predicate may not be eliminated, like ‘no man runs’: here, running is eliminated from any man at all [quolibet homine].” (Ed. L. M. de Rijk, Assen 1972, 43). As G. Leff paraphrases Ockham: “it denotes that in a universal affirmation the predicate can stand for everything for which the subject can stand, and conversely for the dictum de nullo.” (Leff, William of Ockham, Manchester 1975, 270 referring to E. Moody, The Logic of William of Ockham, London 1935, 214–215; cf. M. McCord Adams, William of Ockham, 2 vols., Notre Dame 1987, vol. I, 441.) This principle led Aristotle to conclude that only four moods of the first figure were immediately valid. That Valla does not make use of this fundamental condition is understandable from his oratorical point of view, since it would be an uninteresting or even irrelevant criterion of validity. It is therefore not surprising that he thinks that we might as well “reduce” the first figure to the second rather than vice versa. Likewise, from his oratorical point of view, he can only treat the third figure of the syllogism with contempt: it is a “completely foolish” form of reasoning; no one reasons as follows: every man is a substance; every man is an animal; therefore, some animal is a substance. In a similar vein, he rejects the use of letters in the study of syllogisms (Repastinatio, 297–300; 546–548).

Valla's insistence on examining and assessing arguments in terms of persuasion and usefulness leads him to criticize not only the syllogism but also other less formal modes of argumentation. These modes usually involve interrogation, resulting in an unexpected or unwanted conclusion or an aporetic situation. Some scholars have regarded Valla's interest in these less formal or non-formal arguments as an expression of a skeptical attitude towards the possibility of certainty in knowledge in general. Others have raised serious doubts about this interpretation. What we can say for sure, however, is that Valla was one of the first to study and analyze the heap argument, dilemma, and suchlike. The heap argument is supposed to induce doubts about the possibility of determining precise limits, especially to quantities. If I subtract one grain from a heap, is it still a heap? Of course. What if I subtract two grains? And so forth, until the heap consists of just one grain, which, to be sure, is an unacceptable conclusion. It seems impossible to determine the exact moment when the heap ceases to be a heap, and any attempt to determine this moment seems to involve an ad hoc decision, for a heap does not cease to be a heap due to the subtraction of just one single grain. Valla discusses a number of similar cases, and comments on their fallacious nature.

Dilemma, too, receives extensive treatment from him. This type of argument had been widely studied in antiquity. The basic structure is a disjunction of propositions, usually in the form of a double question in an interrogation, which sets a trap for the respondent, since whichever horn of the dilemma he chooses, he seems to be caught up in a contradiction and will lose the debate (“If he is modest, why should you accuse someone who is a good man? If he is bad, why should you accuse someone who is unconcerned by such a charge?”, Cicero, De inventione 1.45.83, cited by Valla Repastinatio, 321). It was also recognized that the respondent could often counter the dilemma by duplicating the original argument and “turning it back” (convertere) on the interrogator, using it as a kind of boomerang (“if he is modest, you should accuse him because he will be concerned by such a charge; if he is bad, you should also accuse him because he is not a good man”). Alternatively, he could escape the dilemma by questioning the disjunction and showing that there is a third possibility. There were many variations of this simple scheme, and it was studied from a logical as well as a rhetorical point of view with considerable overlap between these two perspectives.

In medieval times, dilemma does not seem to have attracted much theoretical reflection, though there was an extensive literature on related genres such as insolubilia and paradoxes, which were generally treated in a logical manner. It is, therefore, interesting to see Valla discussing a whole range of examples of dilemma. The rhetoric textbook by the Byzantine émigré George of Trebizond (1396–1486), composed about 1433, was probably an important source for him. This work might also have led Valla to explore the relevant places in Quintilian, Cicero, the Greek text of Aristotle's Rhetoric and perhaps other Greek sources. The example Valla discusses most extensively comes from Aulus Gellius and concerns a lawsuit between Protagoras and his pupil Euathlus (Repastinatio, 312–319; 562–568. Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae, 5.10.5–16). The pupil has promised to pay the second installment of the fees as soon as he has won his first case. He refuses to pay, however, and Protagoras takes him to court. If Euathlus loses the case, he will have to pay the rest of the fee, on account of the verdict of the judges; but if Euathlus wins, he will also have to pay, this time on account of his agreement with Protagoras. Euathlus, however, cleverly converts the argument: in neither case will he have to pay, on account of the court's decision (if he wins), or on account of the agreement with Protagoras (if he loses). Aulus Gellius thinks that the judges should have refrained from passing judgment because any decision would be inconsistent with itself. But Valla rejects such a rebuttal (antistrephon or conversio) of the dilemma and thinks that a response may be formulated as long as one concentrates on the relevant aspects of the case. Briefly put, Valla says that Euathlus cannot have it both ways and must choose one or the other alternative: he must comply either with his agreement with Protagoras or with the verdict passed by the judges. If they decide against Protagoras, he may try to reclaim his money in a second lawsuit. At any rate, there is no reason to despair; Aulus Gellius is, therefore, wrong in thinking that the judges should have refrained from passing a judgment. In all such cases, Valla argues, the conversion is not a rebuttal, but at best a correction of the initial argument (a correction, however, is not a refutation), and at worst a simple repetition or illegitimate shift of the initial position.

An important way of seeing through deceptive arguments is to consider the weight of words carefully, and Valla gives some further examples of fallacies which can easily be refuted by examining the meaning and usage of words and the contexts in which they occur (Repastinatio, 320–334; 568–578). He considers the fallacies “collected by Aristotle in his Sophistical Refutations as for the most part a puerile art,” quoting the Rhetorica ad Herennium (2.11.16) to the effect that “knowledge of ambiguities as taught by dialecticians is of no help at all but rather a most serious hindrance.” Valla is not interested in providing a comprehensive list of deceptive arguments and errors or in studying rules for resolving them. He does not mention, for example, the basic division between linguistic (in dictione) and extra-linguistic (extra dictionem) fallacies. In a letter to a friend, Valla lists some “dialecticians”—Albert of Saxony (c. 1316–1390), Albert the Great (c. 1220–1280), Ralph Strode (fl. 1350–1400), William of Ockham, and Paul of Venice (c. 1369–1429) —but there is no sign that he had done more than leaf through their works on sophismata and insolubilia (Valla 1984, 201). The few examples he gives seem to come from Peter of Spain's Summulae logicales. Nor was it necessary to have more than a superficial acquaintance with the works of these dialecticians in order to realize that their approach differed vastly from his. As he repeatedly states, what is required in order to disambiguate fallacies is not a deeper knowledge of the rules of logic but a recognition that arguments need to be evaluated within their wider linguistic and argumentative context. Such an examination of how words and arguments function will easily lay bare the artificial and sophistical nature of these forms of argumentation.

This approach is also evident in Valla's analysis of the proposition of which a syllogism or argument consists. Propositions are traditionally divided according to quantity (universal of particular) and to quality (affirmative and negative). Quantity and quality are indicated by words that are called signa (markers, signs): “all,” “any,” “not,” “no one,” and so forth. In Book II of the Repastinatio, Valla considers a much wider range of words than the medieval logicians, who had mainly worked with “all,” “some,” “none,” and “no one”. To some extent, his aim is not unlike that of the dialecticians whom he so frequently attacks, that is, to study signs of quality and negation and how they determine the scope of a proposition. But for him there is only one proper method of carrying out such a study: examining carefully the multifarious ways in which these words are used in refined and grammatically correct Latin. Not surprisingly, Valla criticizes the square of contraries—the fourfold classification of statements in which the distinction between universal and particular and that between affirmative and negative are combined. A similar critique of the rather arbitrary restriction to a limited set of words is applied to the scholastic notion of modality (Valla Repastinatio, 237–244; 491–497). Scholastics usually treat only the following six terms as modals: “possible,” “impossible,” “true,” “false,” “necessary,” and “contingent.” Latin, however, is much more resourceful in expressing modality. Using criteria such as refinement and utility, Valla considers terms such as “likely/unlikely,” “difficult/easy,” “certain/uncertain,” “useful/useless,” “becoming/unbecoming,” and “honorable/dishonorable.” This amounts to introducing a wholly new concept of modality, which comes close to an adverbial qualification of a given action.

Valla's principal bêtes noires are Aristotle, Boethius, Porphyry, and Peter of Spain, but he also speaks in general terms of the entire natio peripatetica (nation of Peripatetics). He frequently refers to isti (those), a suitably vague label for the scholastic followers of Aristotle—including both dialecticians and theologians. It has often been claimed that Valla is attacking late medieval scholasticism; but it must be said that he does not quote any late medieval scholastic philosophers or theologians. He generally steers clear of their questions, arguments, and terminology. If we compare Valla's Repastinatio with, for example, Paul of Venice's Logica parva (The Small Logic), we quickly perceive the immense difference in attitude, argument, and approach. Moreover, as noted above, Valla's grammatical and oratorical approach is fundamentally different from Ockham's terminism. He probably thought that he did not need to engage with the technical details of scholastic works. It was sufficient for him to establish that there was a huge distance between his own approach and that of the scholastics. Once he had shown that the scholastic-Aristotelian edifice was built on shaky foundations, he did not care to attack the superstructure, so to speak. And Valla proved to his own satisfaction that these foundations were shaky by showing that the terminology and vocabulary of the scholastics rested on a misunderstanding of Latin and of the workings of language in general. But even though his criticisms are mainly addressed to Aristotle, Boethius, and Porphyry, his more general opinion of Aristotelianism was, of course, formed by what he saw in his own time. He loathed the philosophical establishment at the universities, their methods, genres, and, above all, their style and terminology. He thought that they were slavishly following Aristotle. In his view, however, a true philosopher does not hesitate to re-assess any opinion from whatever source; refusing to align himself with a sect or school, he presents himself as a critical, independent thinker (Repastinatio, 1–8; 359–363). Whether scholasticism had, indeed, ossified by the time Valla came on the scene is a matter of debate; but there is no question that this is how he and the other humanists saw it.

4. Moral Philosophy

The same critical spirit also infuses Valla's work on moral philosophy. In his dialogue, published as De voluptate in 1431, when he was still in his mid-twenties, and revised two years later under the title De vero bono (On the True Good), Valla presents a discussion between an “Epicurean,” a “Stoic,” and a “Christian” on an age-old question: what is the highest ethical good? The result of this confrontation between pagan and Christian moral thought is a combination of Pauline fideism and Epicurean hedonism, in which the Christian concepts of charity and beatitude are identified with hedonist pleasure, and the “Stoic” concept of virtue is rejected (Valla, De vero falsoque bono). Valla thus treats Epicureanism as a stepping-stone to the development of a Christian morality based on the concept of pleasure, and repudiates the traditional synthesis of Stoicism and Christianity, popular among scholastics and humanists alike. The substance of the dialogue is repeated in a long chapter in his Repastinatio (Repastinatio, 73–98; 411–418).

Valla's strategy is to reduce the traditional four virtues— prudence, justice, fortitude, and propriety (or temperance)—to fortitude, and then to equate fortitude with charity and love. For Valla, fortitude is the essential virtue, since it shows that we do not allow ourselves to be conquered by the wrong emotions, but instead to act for the good. As a true virtue of action, it is closely connected to justice and is defined as “a certain resistance against both the harsh and the pleasant things which prudence has declared to be evils.” It is the power to tolerate and suffer adversity and bad luck, but also to resist the blandishments of a fortune which can be all too good, thus weakening the spirit. Fortitude is the only true virtue, because virtue resides in the will, since our actions, to which we assign moral qualifications, proceed from the will.

Valla's reductive strategy has a clear aim: to equate this essential virtue of action, fortitude, with the biblical concept of love and charity. This step requires some hermeneutic manipulation, but the Stoic overtones of Cicero's account in De officiis have prepared the way for it—ironically, perhaps, in view of Valla's professed hostility towards Stoicism—since enduring hardship with Stoic patience is easily linked to the Pauline message that we become strong by being tested (II Cor. 12:10, quoted by Valla). The labor, sweat, and trouble we must bear, though bad in themselves, “are called good because they lead to that victory,” Valla writes, echoing St Paul (Repastinatio, 88–89; 415). We do not, then, strive to attain virtue for its own sake, since it is full of toil and hardship, but rather because it leads us to our goal. This is one of Valla's major claims against the Stoics and the Peripatetics, who—at least in Valla's interpretation— regarded virtue as the end of life, that is, the goal which is sought for its own sake. Because virtuous behavior is difficult, requiring us to put up with harsh and bitter afflictions, no one naturally and voluntarily seeks virtue as an end in itself. What we seek is pleasure or delectation, both in this life and—far more importantly —in the life to come.

By equating pleasure with love, Valla can argue that it is love or pleasure that is our ultimate end. This entails the striking notion that God is not loved for his own sake, but for the sake of love: “For nothing is loved for its own sake or for the sake of something else as another end, but the love itself is the end” (Repastinatio, 417). This is a daring move. Traditionally, God was said to be loved for his own sake, not for his usefulness in gaining something else. Many thinkers agreed with Augustine that concupiscent love was to be distinguished from friendship, and, with respect to heavenly beatitude, use from fruition. We can love something as a means to an end (use), and we can love something for its own sake (fruition). But because Valla has maintained that pleasure is our highest good, God can only be loved as a means to that end.

It is therefore a moot point whether Valla successfully integrated Epicurean hedonism with Christian morality. He seems to argue that the Epicurean position is valid only for the period before the coming of Christ. In his unredeemed state, man is rightly regarded as a pleasure-seeking animal, who is governed by self-interest and utilitarian motives. After Christ's coming, however, we have a different picture: repudiating Epicurean pleasure, we should choose the harsh and difficult life of Christian honestas (virtue) as a step towards heavenly beatitude. Yet, the two views of man are not so readily combined. On the one hand, there is the positive evaluation of pleasure as the fundamental principle in human psychology—which is confirmed and underscored by the terminological equation of voluptas (pleasure), beatitudo (beatitude), fruitio (fruition), delectatio (delectation), and amor (love). On the other hand, Valla states apodictically that there are two pleasures: an earthly one, which is the mother of vice, and a heavenly one, which is the mother of virtue; that we should abstain from the former if we want to enjoy the latter; and that the natural, pre-Christian life is “empty and worthy of punishment” if not put in the wider perspective of human destiny. In other words, we are commanded to live the arduous and difficult life of Christian honestas, ruled by restraint, self-denial, and propriety (temperance), and, at the same time, to live a hedonist life, which consists of the joyful, free, and natural gratification of the senses.

Another of his targets is the Aristotelian account of virtue as a mean between two extremes. According to Valla, each individual vice is instead the opposite of an individual virtue. He makes this point by distinguishing between two different senses of the same virtue, showing that they have different opposites. So, while Aristotle regards fortitude as the mean between the vices of rashness and cowardice, Valla argues that there are two aspects to fortitude: fighting bravely and being cautious (for instance, in yielding to the victorious enemy), with cowardice and rashness as their respective opposites. Likewise, generosity is not the mean between avarice and prodigality, but has two aspects: giving and not giving. Prodigality is the opposite of the first aspect, avarice of the second, for which we should use the term frugality or thrift rather than generosity. More generally, the terminology of vices as defects and excesses and virtue as a mean is misleading; virtues and vices should not be ranked “according to whether they are at the bottom, or halfway up, or at the top.” Interestingly, a similar critique of Aristotle's notion of virtue as a mean between two extremes has been raised in modern scholarship (for example, by W. D. Ross).

Valla regards the Aristotelian notion of virtue as too static and inflexible, so that it does not do justice to the impulsive nature of our moral behavior. For him, virtue is not a habit, as Aristotle believed, but rather an affect, an emotion or feeling that can be acquired and lost in a moment's time. Virtue is the domain solely of the will. The greatest virtue or the worse vice may arise out of one single act. And because virtue is painful and vice tempting, one may easily slide from the one into the other, unlike knowledge, which does not turn into ignorance all of a sudden. Valla therefore frequently removes the notions of knowledge, truth, and prudence from the sphere of moral action. Virtues as affects are located in the rear part of the soul, the will, while the domains of knowledge, truth, and opinion reside in the other two faculties, memory and reason (Repastinatio, 73–74). This is not to say that the will is independent from the intellectual capacities. The affects need reason as their guide, and the lack of such guidance can result in vice. But Valla is not entirely clear as to what element we should assign the moral qualification “good” or “bad.” He identifies virtues with affects, and says that only these merit praise and blame (Repastinatio, 74); however, he also writes that the virtues, as affects, cannot be called good or bad in themselves, but that these judgments apply only to the will, that is, to the will's choice. This is underlined by his remark that virtue resides in the will rather than in an action (Repastinatio, 77). In his discussion of the soul, however, he frequently calls reason the will's guide (e.g., Valla Repastinatio, 75), and also says that the affects should follow reason, so that it, too, may be held responsible, in the final analysis, for moral behavior (even though he also explicitly denies that the will is determined by reason). Finally, pleasure, delectation, or beatitude are also called virtue by the equation of virtue with love and with charity (Repastinatio, 85).

Moreover, Valla's insistence on the will as the locus of moral behavior seems compromised by the predestinarianism advocated by the interlocutor “Lorenzo” in his dialogue De libero arbitrio (On Free Will). In this highly rhetorical work, Valla—if we can assume that Lorenzo represents Valla's own position—stresses that in his inscrutable wisdom God hardens the hearts of some, while saving those of others. We do not know why, and it is presumptuous and vain to inquire into the matter. Yet, somehow we do have free will, “Now, indeed, He brings no necessity, and His hardening one and showing another mercy does not deprive us of free will, since He does this most wisely and in full holiness” (Valla 1948, 177). So, we are free, after all, and God's foreknowledge does not necessitate the future; but how exactly Valla thinks his views settle these issues is not clear. Even though the tone of the piece is strongly fideistic, Valla does not shrink from discussing the issue of God's providence and free will, just as he had tried to analyze the Trinity in his Repastinatio.

In conclusion, Valla's moral thought can be described—with some justice—as hedonistic, voluntarist, and perhaps also empirical (in the sense of taking account of how people actually behave). On closer inspection, however, his account seems to contain the seeds of several ideas that are not so easily reconciled with one another. This is doubtless due, in no small measure, to his eclecticism, his attempt to bring into one picture Aristotelian ethics, the Stoic virtues of Cicero, the biblical concepts of charity and beatitude, and the Epicurean notion of hedonist pleasure— each with its own distinctive terminology, definitions, and philosophical context.

5. Evaluation

Valla's contributions to historical, classical, and biblical scholarship are beyond doubt, and helped to pave the way for the critical textual philology of Poliziano, Erasmus, and later generations of humanists. Valla grasped the important insight—which was not unknown to medieval scholars—that the meaning of a text can be understood only when it is seen as the product of its original historical and cultural context. Yet his attempt to reform or transform the scholastic study of language and argumentation—and, indeed, their entire mode of doing philosophy—is likely to be met with skepticism or even hostility by the historian of medieval philosophy who is dedicated to the argumentative rigor and conceptual analysis which are the hallmarks of scholastic thought. Nevertheless, while it may be true that Valla's individual arguments are sometimes weak, superficial, and unfair, his critique as a whole does have an important philosophical and historical significance. The following two points, in particular, should be mentioned.

First, the humanist study of Stoicism, Epicureanism, skepticism, and Neoplatonism widened the philosophical horizon and eroded faith in the universal truth of Aristotelian philosophy—an essential preparatory stage for the rise of early modern thought. In Valla's day, Aristotle was still “the Philosopher,” and scholastics put considerable effort into explaining his words. Valla attacks what he sees as the ipse dixit attitude of the scholastics. For him, a true philosopher does not follow a single master but instead says whatever he thinks. Referring to Pythagoras' modest claim that he was a not a wise man but a lover of wisdom (Repastinatio, 1), Valla maintains that he does not belong to any sect (including that of the skeptics) and wants to retain his independence as critical thinker. What the scholastics forget, he thinks, is that there were many alternatives in antiquity to the supposedly great master, many sects, and many other types of philosopher. In criticizing Aristotle's natural philosophy, for instance, he gave vent to a sentiment which ultimately eroded faith in the Aristotelian system. Valla rightly saw that Aristotle's conclusions were not in line with everyday observations. This does not, however, mean that he was developing a non-Aristotelian natural philosophy; his rejection of Aristotle's account of nature was primarily motivated by religious and linguistic considerations. Indeed, Valla's insistence on common linguistic usage, combined with his appeal to common sense and his religious fervor, seems at times to foster a fideism that is at odds with an exploratory attitude towards the natural world. But with hindsight we can say that any undermining of the faith in the exclusiveness of the scholastic-Aristotelian worldview contributed to its demise and, ultimately, to its replacement by a different, mechanistic one. And although the humanist polemic was only one factor among many others, its role in this process was by no means negligible. Likewise, in attacking Peripatetic moral philosophy, Valla showed that there were alternatives to the Aristotelian paradigm, even though his use of Epicureanism and Stoicism was rhetorical rather than historical.

The second point relates to the previous one. In placing himself in opposition to what he regarded as the Aristotelian paradigm, Valla often interprets certain doctrines—the syllogism, hypothetical syllogism, modal propositions, and the square of contraries—in ways they were not designed for. In such cases, we can see Valla starting, as it were, from the inside of the Aristotelian paradigm, from some basic assumptions and ideas of his opponents, in order to refute them by using a kind of reductio ad absurdum or submitting them to his own criteria, which are external to the paradigm. This moving inside and outside of the Aristotelian paradigm can explain (and perhaps excuse) Valla's inconsistency, for it is an inconsistency which is closely tied to his tactics and his agenda. He does not want to be consistent if this means merely obeying the rules of the scholastics, which in his view amounted to rigorously defining one's terms and pressing these into the straightjacket of a syllogistic argument, no matter what common sense and linguistic custom teach us. Behind this inconsistency, therefore, lies a consistent program of replacing philosophical speculation and theorizing with an approach based on common linguistic practice and common sense. But arguably it has also philosophical relevance; for throughout the history of philosophy a warning can be heard against abstraction, speculation, and formalization. One need not endorse this cautionary note in order to see that philosophy thrives on the creative tension between, on the one hand, a tendency to abstract, speculate, and formalize, and, on the other, a concern that the object of philosophical analysis should not be lost from sight, that philosophy should not become a game of its own—an abstract and theoretical affair that leaves the world it purports to analyze and explain far behind, using a language that can be understood only by its own practitioners.


Primary Sources: Selected Works by Valla

The 1962 reprint of Valla's Opera omnia, contains his most important writings. A new critical edition of his complete works has recently been launched: “Edizione Nazionale delle opere di Lorenzo Valla” (Florence: Polistampa). (The first volume, Raudensiane note, G. M. Corrias, ed., 2007, has appeared.)

Selected Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | Erasmus, Desiderius | free will | hedonism | providence, divine | sophismata [= sophisms] | Sorites paradox | square of opposition | Stoicism | syllogism: medieval theories of