Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Gabriel (-Honoré) Marcel

First published Tue Nov 16, 2004; substantive revision Wed Nov 17, 2004

Gabriel Marcel (1889-1973) was a philosopher, drama critic, playwright and musician. He converted to Catholicism in 1929 and his philosophy was later described as “Christian Existentialism” (most famously in Jean-Paul Sartre's “Existentialism is a Humanism”) a term he initially endorsed but later repudiated. In addition to his numerous philosophical publications, he was the author of some thirty dramatic works. Marcel gave the Gifford Lectures in Aberdeen in 1949-1950, which appeared in print as the two-volume The Mystery of Being, and the William James Lectures at Harvard in 1961-1962, which were collected and published as The Existential Background of Human Dignity.

1. Biographical Sketch

Marcel was born in 1889. His mother died when he was only four, and Marcel was raised by his father and aunt, who later married. He excelled in school, but did so without enjoying his studies prior to his encounter with philosophy. He associated with many of the prominent philosophers of his day, in part due to his hosting of the famous “Friday evenings.” Paul Ricoeur, Emmanuel Levinas, Jean Wahl, and Jean-Paul Sartre were among the many noted philosophers who attended these gatherings at one time or another. These informal gatherings were an occasion for engaged thinkers from a variety of perspectives to discuss together various philosophical themes, frequently ones Marcel himself was working on that week. After passing his agrégation in 1910, he taught philosophy intermittently in Sens, Paris, and Montpellier; however, his main professional occupations were that of drama critic (for Europe nouvelle and later for Nouvelles littéraires) and editor (for the Feux croisés series at Plon).

Marcel's philosophical legacy includes lectures, journal entries and dramatic works in addition to more orthodox philosophical expression in essays. Of these various genres, Marcel was perhaps most pleased with his dramatic works. In fact, reading between the lines of his autobiographical remarks, one can discern some puzzlement and no small amount of frustration at the success of his philosophical works and the relative obscurity of his dramatic works. Complicating the diverse expression of his ideas is the fact that Marcel was a consciously unsystematic philosopher, something he realized as early as the publication of his Journal métaphysique (1927). [1] Nevertheless, while the diverse expression of his thought and the related lack of systematicity cause some difficulty for those interested in Marcel's work, the main themes of his thought are present in many of his works. Especially noteworthy are: The Mystery of Being, Creative Fidelity, Homo Viator, Being and Having, Tragic Wisdom and Beyond and the concise “On the Ontological Mystery.”

Marcel's philosophical methodology was unique, although it bears some resemblance to both existentialism and phenomenology broadly construed. He insisted that philosophy begin with concrete experience rather than abstractions. To this end he makes constant use of examples in order to ground the philosophical ideas he is investigating. The method itself consists in “working…up from life to thought and then down from thought to life again, so that [one] may try to throw more light upon life” (Marcel 1951a, p. 41). Thus, this philosophy is a sort of “description bearing upon the structures which reflection elucidates starting from experience” (Marcel 1962a, p. 180). In addition, Marcel expressed a refreshing preference for philosophizing in ordinary language. He maintained that “we should employ current forms of ordinary language which distort our experiences far less than the elaborate expressions in which philosophical language is crystallized” (Marcel 1965, p. 158).

2. The Broken World and the Functional Person

In line with his preference for concrete philosophy that speaks in ordinary language, Marcel begins many of his philosophical essays with an observation about life. One of his central observations about life and experience, from which he is able to derive many of the philosophical distinctions that follow, is that we live in a “broken world.” A world in which “ontological exigence”—if it is acknowledged at all—is silenced by an unconscious relativism or by a monism that discounts the personal, “ignores the tragic and denies the transcendent” (Marcel 1995, p. 15). The characterization of the world as broken does not necessarily imply that there was a time when the world was intact. It would be more correct to emphasize that the world we live in is essentially broken, broken in essence, in addition to having been further fractured by events in history. The observation is intended to point out that we find ourselves hic et nunc in a world that is broken. This situation is characterized by a refusal (or inability) to reflect, a refusal to imagine and a denial of the transcendent (Marcel 1951a, pp. 36-37). Although many things contribute to the “brokenness” of the world, the hallmark of its modern manifestation is “the misplacement of the idea of function” (Marcel 1995, p. 11).

“I should like to start,” Marcel says, “with a sort of global and intuitive characterization of the man in whom the sense of the ontological—the sense of being, is lacking, or, to speak more correctly, the man who has lost awareness of this sense” (Marcel 1995, p. 9). This person, the one who has lost awareness of the sense of the ontological, the one who's capacity to wonder has atrophied to the extent of becoming a vestigial trait, is an example of the influence of the misapplication of the idea of function. Marcel uses the example of a subway token distributor. This person has a job that is mindless, repetitive, and monotonous. The same function can be, and often is, completed by automated machines. All day this person takes bills from commuters and returns a token and some change, repeating the same process with the same denominations of currency, over and over. The other people with whom she interacts engage her in only the most superficial and distant manner. In most cases, they do not speak to her and they do not make eye contact. In fact, the only distinction the commuters make between such a person and the automatic, mechanical token dispenser down the hall is to note which “machine” has the shorter line. The way in which these commuters interact with this subway employee is clearly superficial and less than desirable. However, Marcel's point is more subtle.

What can the inner reality of such a person be like? What began as tedious work slowly becomes infuriating in its monotony, but eventually passes into a necessity that is accepted with indifference, until even the sense of dissatisfaction with the pure functionalism of the task is lost. The unfortunate truth is that such a person may come to see herself, at first unconsciously, as merely an amalgamation of the functions she performs. There is the function of dispensing tokens at work, the function of spouse and parent at home, the function of voting as a citizen of a given country, etc. Her life operates on a series of “time-tables” that indicate when certain functions—such as the yearly maintenance trip to the doctor, or the yearly vacation to rest and recuperate—are to be exercised. In this person the sense of wonder and the exigence for the transcendent may slowly begin to wither and die. In the most extreme cases, a person who has come to identify herself with her functions ceases to even have any intuition that the world is broken.

A corollary of the functionalism of the modern broken world is its highly technical nature. Marcel characterizes a world such as ours—in which everything and everyone becomes viewed in terms of function, and in which all questions are approached with technique—as one that is dominated by its “technics.” This is evident in the dependence on technology, the immediate deferral to the technological as the answer to any problem, and the tendency to think of technical reasoning as the only mode of access to the truth. However, it is clear that there are some “problems” that cannot be addressed with technique, and this is disquieting for persons who have come to rely on technics. While technology undoubtedly has its proper place and use, the deification of technology leads to despair when we realize the ultimate inefficacy of technics regarding important existential questions. It is precisely this misapplication of the idea of function and the dependence on technics that leads to the despair that is so prevalent in the broken world.

3. Ontological Exigence[2]

“What defines man,” claims Marcel, “are his exigencies” (Marcel 1973, p. 34). Nevertheless, these exigencies can be smothered, perhaps even silenced, by despair. Such is the case in the example of the “functionalized” person. The broken world can smother transcendent exigencies, leaving only quotidian, functional needs intact. Ontological exigence, the need for transcendence, is linked to a certain dissatisfaction—one that is all the more troubling because one is unable to soothe this dissatisfaction by one's own powers. However, without a feeling that something is amiss, without the feeling of dissatisfaction, ontological exigence withers. This is why the functional person, the person who no longer even notices that the world is broken, is described as having lost the awareness of the ontological and the need for transcendence. In the face of this potential despair, Marcel claims that:

Being is—or should be—necessary. It is impossible that everything should be reduced to a play of successive appearances which are inconsistent with each other… or, in the words of Shakespeare, to “a tale told by an idiot.” I aspire to participate in this being, in this reality—and perhaps this aspiration is already a degree of participation, however rudimentary. (Marcel 1995, p. 15)[3]

Thus, ontological exigence is a need and a demand for some level of coherence in the cosmos and for some understanding of our place and role within this coherence. It is the combination of wonder and the attendant desire, not to understand the entire cosmos, but to understand something of one's own place in it.[4] Note that, for Marcel, ontological exigence is not merely a “wish” for being or coherence, but is an “interior urge” or “appeal.” “Otherwise stated, the [ontological] exigence is not reducible to some psychological state, mood, or attitude a person has; it is rather a movement of the human spirit that is inseparable from being human” (Keen 1984, p. 105).

4. Transcendence

Marcel is very clear that the term “transcendence” has, in his view, become degraded in modern philosophy. Transcendence cannot mean merely “going beyond” without any further specification. It must retain the tension of the traditional distinction between the immanent and the transcendent, one that emphasizes a vertical rather than a horizontal going beyond, a transcendence toward a height, a trans-ascendence.[5] Although the transcendent is juxtaposed with the immanent, Marcel insists that “transcendent” cannot mean “transcending experience.” “There must exist a possibility of having an experience of the transcendent as such, and unless that possibility exists the word can have no meaning” (Marcel 1951a, p. 46). The tendency to discount the idea of experiencing transcendence is the result of an objective view of experience. However, experience is not an object and therefore it cannot be viewed objectively. Speaking metaphorically, the essence of experience is not an “absorbing into oneself,” as in the case of taste, but “a straining oneself towards something, as when, for instance, during the night we attempt to get a distinct perception of some far-off noise” (Marcel 1951a, p. 47). Thus, while Marcel insists on the possibility of experiencing the transcendent, he does not thereby mean that the transcendent is comprehensible.

There is an order where the subject finds himself in the presence of something entirely beyond his grasp. I would add that if the word “transcendent” has any meaning it is here—it designates the absolute, unbridgeable chasm yawning between the subject and being, insofar as being evades every attempt to pin it down. (Marcel 1973, p. 193)

5. Being and Having

Marcel discusses being in a variety of contexts; however, one of the more illustrative points of entry into this issue is the distinction between being and having.[6] In some cases this distinction is one that is obvious and therefore not particularly illuminating. For example, most people would readily acknowledge a difference between having a house and being hospitable. However, there are other cases where the distinction between having something and being something is much more significant. For example, when we hope, we do not have hope. We are hope. Similarly, we do not have a belief. We are a belief.

Marcel's hallmark illustration of being and having is one that actually straddles the distinction between them: “my body.” My body, insofar as it is my body, is both something that I have and something that I am, and cannot be adequately accounted for using either of these descriptions alone. I can look at my body in a disassociated manner and see it instrumentally. However, in doing so, in distancing myself from it in order to grasp it qua object, qua something I have, it ceases to be “my” body. I can have “a” body, but not “my” body. As soon as I make the connection that the body in question is my body, not a body, it can no longer be something that I have pure and simple—this body also is me, it is what I am. On the other hand, it cannot be said that I simply am my body either. I can dispose of my body in certain circumstances by treating it instrumentally. A person who loses a limb in an accident is not less of a person and, therefore, there is a sense in which our bodies are objects that we have.

The ambiguous role played by my body not only points out the distinction between being and having, but also shows that we relate to other things and persons differently in these two modes. Having corresponds to things that are completely external to me. I have things that I possess, that I can dispose of—and this should make it clear that I cannot “have,” for example, another person. Having implies this possession because “having always implies an obscure notion of assimilation” (Marcel 1949, p. 83). While the encounter with otherness takes place in terms of assimilation when speaking of having, the encounter with otherness (e.g., other persons) can also take place on the level of being. In this case Marcel maintains that the encounter is not one that is purely external and, as such, it is played out in terms of presence and participation rather than assimilation.

Both being and having are legitimate ways to encounter things in the world; however, the misapplication of these two modes of comportment can have disastrous consequences.

6. Problem and Mystery

The notion that we live in a broken world is used—along with the person who is characteristic of the broken world, the functionalized person—to segue into one of Marcel's central thematic distinctions: the distinction between problem and mystery. He states that the broken world is one that is “on the one hand, riddled with problems and, on the other, determined to allow no room for mystery” (Marcel 1995, p. 12). The denial of the mysterious is symptomatic of the modern broken world and is tied to its technical character, which only acknowledges that which technique can address: the problematic. The distinction between problem and mystery is one that hinges, like much of Marcel's thought, on the notion of participation.

A problem is something which I meet, which I find completely before me, but which I can therefore lay siege to and reduce. But a mystery is something in which I am myself involved, and it can therefore only be thought of as a sphere where the distinction between what is in me and what is before me loses its meaning and initial validity. (Marcel 1949, p. 117)

A problem is a question in which I am not involved, in which the identity of the person asking the question is not an issue. In the realm of the problematic, it makes no difference who is asking the question because all of the relevant information is “before” the questioner. As such, a problem is something that bars my way, placing an obstacle in front of me that must be overcome. In turn, the overcoming of a problem inevitably involves some technique, a technique that could be, and often is, employed by any other person confronting the same problem. Thus the identity of the questioner can be changed without altering the problem itself. This is why the modern broken world only sees the problematic: the ‘problematic’ is that which can be addressed and solved with a technique, e.g., changing a flat tire on an automobile or downloading security software to fix a virus on one's computer.

When I am dealing with a problem, I am trying to discover a solution that can become common property, that consequently can, at least in theory, be rediscovered by anybody at all. But…this idea of a validity for “anybody at all” or of a thinking in general has less and less application the more deeply one penetrates into the inner courts of philosophy… (Marcel 1951a, p. 213)

Marcel often describes a mystery as a “problem that encroaches on its own data” (Marcel 1995, p. 19). Such a “problem” is, in fact, meta-problematic; it is a question in which the identity of the questioner is an issue. On the level of the mysterious, the identity of the questioner is tied to the question and, therefore, the questioner is not interchangeable. To change the questioner would be to alter the question. It makes every difference who is asking the question when confronting a mystery. Here, on the level of the mysterious, the distinctions “in-me” and “before-me” break down. Marcel insists that mysteries can be found in the question of Being (e.g., my ontological exigence), the union of the body and soul, the “problem” of evil and—perhaps the archetypal examples of mystery—freedom and love. For example, I cannot question Being as if my being is not at issue in the questioning. The question of being and the question of who I am (my being) cannot be addressed separately. These two questions are somehow incoherent if approached as problems; however, taken together, their mysterious character is revealed and they cancel themselves out qua problems.

Unlike problems, mysteries are not solved with techniques and therefore cannot be answered the same way by different persons—one technique, one solution, will not apply in the different cases presented by different persons. Indeed, it is questionable if mysteries are open to “solutions” at all. Nevertheless, it would be incorrect to call the mysterious a gap in our knowledge in the same way that a problem is. “The mysterious is not the unknowable, the unknowable is only the limiting case of the problematic” (Marcel 1949, p. 118).

Although a mystery may be insoluble, it is not senseless; and while its inexpressibility makes it inaccessible to communicable knowledge, it can still be spoken of in a suggestive way (Marcel 1964, xxv). Marcel notes in a journal entry dated December 18th, 1932 that:

The metaproblematic is a participation on which my reality as a subject is built… and reflection will show that such a participation, if it is genuine, cannot be a solution. If it were it would cease to be a participation in a transcendent reality, and would become, instead, an interpolation into transcendent reality, and would be degraded in the process… (Marcel 1949, p. 114)

Referring back to the idea of a broken world, the technical and the problematic are questions that are addressed with only “part” of a person. The full person is not engaged in the technical because a person's self, her identity, is not at issue. “At the root of having [and problems, and technics] there lies a certain specialization of specification of the self, and this is connected with [a] partial alienation of the self…” (Marcel 1949, p. 172). Problems are addressed impersonally, in a detached manner, while mysteries demand participation, involvement. Although some problems can be reflected on in such a way that they become mysterious, all mysteries can be reflected on in such a way that the mystery is degraded and becomes merely problematic.

7. Primary and Secondary Reflection

The distinction between two kinds of questions—problem and mystery—brings to light two different kinds of thinking or reflection. The problematic is addressed with thinking that is detached and technical, while the mysterious is encountered in reflection that is involved, participatory and decidedly non-technical. Marcel calls these two kinds of thinking “primary” and “secondary” reflection. Primary reflection examines its object by abstraction, by analytically breaking it down into its constituent parts. It is concerned with definitions, essences and technical solutions to problems. In contrast, secondary reflection is synthetic; it unifies rather than divides. “Roughly, we can say that where primary reflection tends to dissolve the unity of experience which is first put before it, the function of secondary reflection is essentially recuperative; it reconquers that unity” (Marcel 1951a, p. 83).

In the most general sense, reflection is nothing other than attention brought to bear on something. However, different objects require ifferent kinds of reflection. In keeping with their respective application to problem and mystery, primary reflection is directed at that which is outside of me or “before me,” while secondary reflection is directed at that which is not merely before me—that is, either that which is in me, which I am, or those areas where the distinctions “in me” and “before me” tend to break down. The parallels between having and being, problem and mystery, and primary and secondary reflection are clear, each pair helping to illuminate the others.

Thus, secondary reflection is one important aspect of our access to the self. It is the properly philosophical mode of reflection because, in Marcel's view, philosophy must return to concrete situations if it is to merit the name “philosophy.” These difficult reflections are “properly philosophical” insofar as they lead to a more truthful, more intimate communication with both myself and with any other person whom these reflections include (Marcel 1951a, pp. 79-80). Secondary reflection, which recoups the unity of experience, points the way toward a fuller understanding of the participation alluded to in examples of the mysterious.

8. The Spirit of Abstraction

Although secondary reflection is able to recoup the unity of experience that primary reflection dissects, it is possible that secondary reflection is frustrated. One example of the frustration of secondary reflection and the mysterious is the functional person; however, this is really just one example of a more general phenomenon: the person who has given in to the “spirit of abstraction.” When we engage in primary reflection without proceeding to the synthesizing, recollecting act of secondary reflection, we fall victim to what Marcel calls the spirit of abstraction. “As soon as we accord to any category, isolated from all other categories, an arbitrary primacy, we are victims of the spirit of abstraction” (Marcel 1962b, pp. 155-156).[7]

Abstraction, which is in essence the kind of thinking that characterizes primary reflection, is not always bad per se. However, neither is it, always an “essentially intellectual” operation (Marcel 1962b, p. 156). That is, contrary to what the successes of science and technology might tell us, we may succumb to the spirit of abstraction out of passional reasons rather than intellectual expediency. Abstraction—which is always abstraction from an embodied, concrete existence—can overcome our concrete existence and we may come to view abstracted elements of existence as if they were independent. As Marcel describes it: “it can happen that the mind, yielding to a sort of fascination, ceases to be aware of these prior conditions that justify abstraction and deceives itself about the nature of what is, in itself, nothing more than a method” (Marcel 1962b, p. 156). The significance of this phenomenon for Marcel would be difficult to overstate—indeed, in Man Against Mass Society, Marcel argues that the spirit of abstraction is inherently disingenuous and violent, and a significant factor in the making of war—and there is a sense in which his whole philosophical project is an “obstinate and untiring battle against the spirit of abstraction” (Marcel 1962b, p. 1).[8]

9. Disponibilité and Indisponibilité

Marcel emphasizes two general ways of comporting ourselves towards others that can be used as barometers for intersubjective relationships: disponibilité and indisponibilité. These words—generally translated as either “availability” and “unavailability” or, less frequently, as “disposability” and “non-disposability”—bear meanings for Marcel that do not fully come across in English. Therefore, in addition to the sense of availability and unavailability, Marcel suggests the addition of the concepts of “handiness” and “unhandiness” to his English readers in an attempt to clarify his meaning. Handiness and unhandiness refer to the availability of one's “resources”—material, emotional, intellectual and spiritual. Thus, the term disponibilité refers to the measure in which I am available to someone, the state of having my resources at hand to offer; and this availability or unavailability of resources is a general state or disposition. While it may appear that there is the possibility of a selfish allocation of one's resources, the truth is that when resources are not available, their inaccessibility affects both the other and the self. Marcel comments frequently on the interconnected nature of the treatment of others and the state of the self.

Indisponibilité can manifest itself in any number of ways; however, “unavailability is invariably rooted in some measure of alienation” (Marcel 1995, p. 40). Pride is an instructive example of indisponibilité, although the same state of non-disposability would also exist in a person who has come to view herself in functional terms, or one who is blinded by a purely technical world-view. Pride is not an exaggerated opinion of oneself arising from self-love, which Marcel insists is really only vanity; rather, pride consists in believing that one is self-sufficient (Marcel 1995, p. 32). It consists in drawing one's strength solely from oneself. “The proud man is cut off from a certain kind of communion with his fellow men, which pride, acting as a principle of destruction tends to break down. Indeed, this destructiveness can be equally well directed against the self; pride is in no way incompatible with self-hate…” (Marcel 1995, p. 32).

For the person who is indisponible, other people are reduced to “examples” or “cases” of genus “other person” rather than being encountered qua other as unique individuals. Instead of encountering the other person as a ‘Thou’, the other is encountered as a ‘He’ or ‘She’, or even as an ‘It’.

If I treat a ‘Thou’as a ‘He’, I reduce the other to being only nature; an animated object which works in some ways and not in others. If, on the contrary, I treat the other as ‘Thou’, I treat him and apprehend him qua freedom. I apprehend him qua freedom because he is also freedom and not only nature. (Marcel 1949, pp. 106-107)

When I treat the other person as a He or She, it is because he or she is kept at arms length but within my grasp, outside of the circle that I form with myself in my cogito but inside the circle of “my world.”

The other, in so far as he is other, only exists for me in so far as I am open to him, in so far as he is a Thou. But I am only open to him in so far as I cease to form a circle with myself, inside which I somehow place the other, or rather his idea; for inside this circle, the other becomes the idea of the other, and the idea of the other is no longer the other qua other, but the other qua related to me… (Marcel 1949, p. 107)

When I treat the other person as a ‘Her’, I treat her, not as a presence, but as absent. However, when I treat the other as a ‘He’ or ‘She’ rather than a ‘Thou’, I become incapable of seeing myself as a ‘Thou’. In deprecating the other I deprecate myself.

If I treat the other person as purely external to me, as a ‘Her’, a generic Ms. X, I encounter her “in fragments” as it were. I encounter various aspects of the other person, elements that might be used to fill out a questionnaire or form (name, occupation, age, etc.). I am not present to the other person and I am closed off and indifferent to the presence she offers me. However, in encountering the other person in this manner—not as another person but as a case or example of certain functions, roles or characteristics—I myself cease to be a person, but take on the role, speaking metaphorically, of the pen that would record these disparate elements onto the form. Any other person could encounter the other in this impersonal manner. If this is the case, I myself have become interchangeable, replaceable. I have ceased to encounter her in the absolutely unique communion of our two persons. This functional view of the other and, consequently, of the self, is a direct result of the “spirit of abstraction.” When the other is encountered as a generic case, I who encounter am myself a generic case in the encounter. But the situation can be otherwise.

In contrast, “the characteristic of the soul which is present and at the disposal of others is that it cannot think in terms of cases; in its eyes there are no cases at all” (Marcel 1995, p. 41). The person who is disponible, who is available or disposable to others, has an entirely different experience of her place in the world: she acknowledges her interdependence with other people. Relationships of disponibilité are characterized by presence and communication between persons qua other, qua freedom—a communication and communion between persons who transcend their separation without merging into a unity, that is, while remaining separate to some degree. “It should be obvious at once that a being of this sort is not an autonomous whole, is not in [the] expressive English phrase, self-contained; on the contrary such a being is open and exposed, as unlike as can be to a compact impenetrable mass” (Marcel 1951a, p. 145). To be disponible to the other is to be present to and for her, to put one's resources at her disposal, and to be open and permeable to her.

It will perhaps be made clearer if I say the person who is at my disposal is the one who is capable of being with me with the whole of himself when I am in need; while the one who is not at my disposal seems merely to offer me a temporary loan raised on his resources. For the one I am a presence; for the other I am an object. (Marcel 1995, p. 40).[9]

10. “With” (avec)

Thus, while I encounter objects in a manner that is technical and objectifying, the encounter with the other person offers another, unique possibility: I can have a relationship “with” another person.

When I put the table beside the chair I do not make any difference to the table or the chair, and I can take one or the other away without making any difference; but my relationship with you makes a difference to both of us, and so does any interruption of the relationship make a difference. (Marcel 1951a, p. 181)

The word “with,” taken with its full metaphysical implication, corresponds neither to a relationship of separation and exteriority, nor to a relationship of unity and inherence. Rather, “with” expresses the essence of genuine coesse, i.e. of pluralism, of separation with communion (Marcel 1995, p. 39). As indisponibilité is illustrated with the example of pride, disponibilité is best illustrated in the relations of love, hope and fidelity.

Marcel—contra Kant—does not shy away from declaring that the participation in a relationship “with” someone has a significant affective element. It is not knowledge of the other that initially binds us to another person—though we may indeed grow to know something of the other—but “fraternity,” the sense that the other is beset by joys and sorrows common to the human family.[10] It is that which allows us, upon seeing the misfortune of another, to say, “There, but for the grace of God, go I.” To go to someone's side or to assist another out of a sense of “duty” is precisely not to be present to her. [11] The person who is disponible does not demure from saying that she truly does desire the best for the other person and that she truly desires to share something of herself with the other (Marcel 1964, 154). In fact, because disponibilité is only a philosophical way of describing what we mean by love and trust, disponibilité is inconceivable without this affective element.

11. Reciprocity

As implied in the emphasis on “with” and shown in the description of indisponibilité, it is not enough for one person to be disponible in order for the full communion of disponibilité to occur. It is entirely possible for one person to come to an encounter in a completely open and available manner, only to be rebuffed by the total unavailability of the other person. Ideally, a relationship of availability must include an element of reciprocity. However, the fact that reciprocity is necessary in an intersubjective relationship does not mean that reciprocity may be demanded of such a relationship. Disponibilité does not insist on its rights or make any claim on the other whatsoever. It is analogous to the situation of “a being awaiting a gift or favor from another being but only on the grounds of his liberality, and that he is the first to protest that the favor he is asking is a grace [que cette grâce demandée est une grâce], that is to say the exact opposite of an obligation” (Marcel 1962a, p. 55). Nevertheless, the fact that disponibilité does not demand reciprocity and the fact that some kind of relationship is indeed possible without such reciprocity do not alter that fact that such reciprocity must be present if the relationship is to fully flower. “One might therefore say that there is a hierarchy of choices, or rather invocations, ranging from the call upon another which is like ringing a bell for a servant to quite the other sort of call which is really like a kind of prayer” (Marcel 1951a, p. 179).

Marcel characterizes disponibilité as charity bound up with presence, as the gift of oneself. And therefore, at the extreme limit, disponibilité would consist in a total spiritual availability that would be pure charity, unconditional love and disposability. However, a problem arises here insofar as Marcel has insisted on an affective element in disponibilité. How is such a gift of self possible for temporal beings, persons for whom the vicissitudes of time may alter feelings or opinion of the other?

12. Opinion, Conviction, Belief

Marcel draws a sharp distinction between opinion and belief. Opinion always concerns that which we do not know, that with which we are not familiar. It exists in a position between impression and affirmation. It is often the case that opinions have a “false” basis, which is most clear in case of stereotypes and prejudices (“everybody knows that…”). Furthermore, opinions are invariably “external” to the things to which they refer. I have an opinion about something only when I disengage myself from it and hold it at “arm's length.” Nevertheless, we hold or maintain these opinions in front of others, and given the elusive foundations on which these opinions are based, it is easy to see how an opinion slides slowly from an impression we have to a claim that we make. This transition invariably takes place as part of an absence of reflection on the given subject and the entrenchment of the opinion due to repetition. Our opinions are often “unshakable” precisely because of the lack of reflection associated with them.

While opinions are unreflective and external, convictions—which are more akin to belief than opinion—are the result of extensive reflection and invariably concern things to which one feels closely tied. Like opinions that have entrenched themselves to the point of becoming actual claims, convictions are felt to be definitive, beyond modification. However, when I claim that nothing can change my conviction, I must either affirm that I have already anticipated all possible future scenarios and no possible event can change my conviction, or affirm that whatever events do occur—anticipated or unanticipated—they will not shake my conviction. The first possibility is impossible. The second possibility is based on a decision, a decision to remain constant whatever may come. However, upon reflection such a decision seems as over-confidant as the claim to have anticipated the future. By what right can I affirm that my inner conviction will not change in any circumstance? To do so is to imply that, in the future, I will cease to reflect on my conviction. It seems that all I am able to say is that my conviction is such that, at the present moment, I cannot imagine an alteration in it.

Belief is akin to conviction; it is, however, distinguished by its object. Marcel insists in many places that proper use of the term “belief” applies not to things “that” we believe, but to things “in which” we believe. Belief is not “belief that…” but is “belief in…” Belief that might be better characterized as a conviction rather than a belief; however, to believe in something is to extend credit to it, to place something at the disposal of that in which we believe. The notion of credit placed at the disposal of the other is another way of speaking about disponibilité. “I am in no way separable from that which I place at the disposal of this X… Actually, the credit I extend is, in a way, myself. I lend myself to X. We should note at once that this is an essentially mysterious act” (Marcel 1951a, p. 134). This is what distinguishes conviction from belief. Conviction refers to the X, takes a position with regard to X, but does not bind itself to X. While I have an opinion, I am a belief—for belief changes the way I am in the world, changes my being. We can now see how belief refers to the other, and how it is connected to disponibilité: belief always applies to “personal or supra-personal reality” (Marcel 1951a, p. 135). It always involves a thou to whom I extend credit—a credit that puts myself at the disposal of the thou—and thus arises the problem of fidelity.[12]

13. Creative Fidelity

The discussion of “creative fidelity” is an excellent place to find a unification, or at least a conjunction, of the various themes and ideas in Marcel's non-systematic thought. Ontological exigence, being, mystery, second reflection, and disponibilité all inform the discussion of creative fidelity, which in turn attempts to illustrate how we can experience these mysterious realities in more or less concrete terms.

The “problem” posed by fidelity is that of constancy. However, fidelity—a belief in someone—requires presence in addition to constancy over time, and presence implies an affective element. Mere constancy over time is not enough because “a fulfillment of on obligation contre-coeur is devoid of love and cannot be identified with fidelity” (Marcel 1964, xxii). Thus, the question is posed as follows. How are we able to remain disponible over time? How can we provide a guarantee of our “belief in” someone? Perhaps the best way to address this complex idea is to address its constituent parts: the problem posed by fidelity and the answer given by creativity.

The extension of credit to another is a commitment, an act whereby I commit myself and place myself at the disposal of the other. In extending credit to the other I am also placing my trust in her, implicitly hoping that she proves worthy of the credit I extend to her. However, we sometimes misjudge others in thinking too highly of them and at other times misjudge by underestimation. Recalling that there is an affective element of spontaneity involved in disponibilité, how can I assure that I will remain faithful to my present belief in the other? Like the question of conviction over time, my present fidelity to another can be questioned in terms of its durability. Though I presently feel inclined to credit the other, to put myself at her disposal, how can I assure that this feeling will not change tomorrow, next month, or next year? Furthermore, because I have given myself to this other person, placed myself at her disposal, when she falls short of my hopes for her—hopes implicit in my extension of credit to her—I am wounded.

However, the “failure” of the other to conform to my hopes is not necessarily the fault of the other. My disappointment or injury is frequently the result of my having assigned some definite, determinate quality to the other person or defined her in terms of characteristics that, it turns out, she does not possess. However, by what right do I assign this characteristic to her, and by what right do I judge her to be wanting? Such a judgment drastically oversteps—or perhaps falls short of—the bounds of disponibilité. In doing so, it demonstrates clearly that I, from the outset, was engaged in a relationship to my idea of the other—which has proved to be wrong—rather than with the other herself. That is to say that this encounter was not with the other, but with myself. If I am injured by the failure of the other to conform to an idea that I had of her, this is not indicative of a defect in the other; it is the result of my inappropriate attempt to determine her by insisting that she conform to my idea. When I begin to doubt my commitment to another person, the vulnerability of my “belief in X” to these doubts is directly proportional to the residue of opinion still in it (Marcel 1964, p. 136).

Nevertheless, practically speaking, there are innumerable times when my hopes for the other are not in fact met, when my extension of credit to the other—which is nothing less then the disposability of myself—results only in a demand for “more” by the other. Such situations invariably tempt me to reevaluate the credit I have put at the disposal of the other and to reassert the question of durability concerning the affective element of my availability to the other. Thus, again, the mystery of fidelity is also the question of commitment, of commitment over time

“How can I test the initial assurance that is somehow the ground of my fidelity? …this appears to lead to a vicious circle. In principle, to commit myself I must know myself, but the fact is I really only know myself when I have committed myself” (Marcel 1964, p. 163). However, what appears to be a vicious circle from an external point of view is experienced from within, by the person who is disponible, as a growth and an ascending. Reflection qua primary reflection attempts to make the experience of commitment understandable in general terms that would be applicable to anyone, but this can only subvert and destroy the reality of commitment, which is essentially personal and therefore, accessible only to secondary reflection.

Returning to the question of durability over time, Marcel insists that, if there is a possible “assurance” of fidelity, it is because “disposability and creativity are related ideas” (Marcel 1964, p. 53). To be disposable is to believe in the other, to place myself at her disposal and to maintain the openness of disponibilité. “Creative fidelity” consists in actively maintaining ourselves in a state of openness and permeability, in willing ourselves to remain open to the other and open to the influx of the presence of the other.

The fact is that when I commit myself, I grant in principle that the commitment will not again be put into question. And it is clear that this active volition not to question something again, intervenes as an essential element in the determination of what in fact will be the case…it bids me to invent a certain modus vivendi…it is a rudimentary form of creative fidelity. (Marcel 1964, p. 162)

The truest fidelity is creative, that is, a fidelity that creates the self in order to meet the demands of fidelity. Such fidelity interprets the vicissitudes of “belief in…” as a temptation to infidelity and sees them in terms of a test of the self rather than in terms of a betrayal by the other—if fidelity fails, it is my failure rather than the failure of the other.

However, this merely puts off the question of durability over time. Where does one find the strength to continue to create oneself and meet the demands of fidelity? The fact is that, on the hither side of the ontological affirmation—and the attendant appeal of Hope—fidelity is always open to doubt. I can always call into question the reality of the bond that links me to another person, always begin to doubt the presence of the person to whom I am faithful, substituting for her presence an idea of my own making. On the other hand, the more disposed I am toward the ontological affirmation, to the affirmation of Being, the more I am inclined to see the failure of fidelity as my failure, resulting from my insufficiency rather than that of the other.

Hence the ground of fidelity that necessarily seems precarious to us as soon as we commit ourselves to another who is unknown, seems on the other hand unshakable when it is based not, to be sure, on a distinct apprehension of God as someone other, but on a certain appeal delivered for the depths of my own insufficiency ad summam altitudinem… This appeal presupposes a radical humility in the subject. (Marcel 1964, p. 167)

Thus, creative fidelity invariably touches upon hope. The only way in which an unbounded commitment on the part of the subject is conceivable is if it draws strength from something more than itself, from an appeal to something greater, something transcendent—and this appeal is hope. Can hope provide us with a foundation that allows humans—who are radically contingent, frequently fickle, and generally weak—to make a commitment that is unconditional? Marcel acknowledges, “Perhaps it should further be said that in fact fidelity can never be unconditional, except where it is Faith, but we must add, however, that it aspires to unconditionality” (Marcel 1962a, p. 133).

14. Hope

Hope is the final guarantor of fidelity; it is that which allows me not to despair, that which gives me the strength to continue to create myself in availability to the other. But this might appear to be nothing more than optimism—frequently misplaced, as events too often reveal—that things will turn out for the best. Marcel insists that this is not the case. Following now familiar distinctions, he makes a differentiation between the realm of fear and desire on one hand and the realm of despair and hope on the other.

Fear and desire are anticipatory and focused respectively on the object of fear or desire. To desire is “to desire that X” and to fear is “to fear that X.” Optimism exists in the domain of fear and desire because it imagines and anticipates a favorable outcome. However, the essence of hope is not “to hope that X”, but merely “to hope…” The person who hopes does not accept the current situation as final; however, neither does she imagine or anticipate the circumstance that would deliver her from her plight, rather she merely hopes for deliverance. The more hope transcends any anticipation of the form that deliverance would take, the less it is open to the objection that, in many cases, the hoped-for deliverance does not take place. If I desire that my disease be cured by a given surgical procedure, it is very possible that my desire might be thwarted. However, if I simply maintain myself in hope, no specific event (or absence of event) need shake me from this hope.

This does not mean, however, that hope is inert or passive. Hope is not stoicism. Stoicism is merely the resignation of a solitary consciousness. Hope is neither resigned, nor solitary. “Hope consists in asserting that there is at the heart of being, beyond all data, beyond all inventories and all calculations, a mysterious principle which is in connivance with me” (Marcel 1995, p. 28). While hope is patient and expectant, it remains active; and as such it might be characterized as an “active patience.” The assertion contained in hope reveals a kinship with willing rather than desiring. “Inert hope” would be an oxymoron.

No doubt the solitary consciousness can achieve resignation [Stoicism], but it may well be here that this word actually means nothing but spiritual fatigue. For hope, which is just the opposite of resignation, something more is required. There can be no hope that does not constitute itself through a we and for a we. I would be tempted to say that all hope is at the bottom choral. (Marcel 1973, p. 143)

Finally, it should be no surprise that “speaking metaphysically, the only genuine hope is hope in what does not depend on ourselves, hope springing from humility and not from pride” (Marcel 1995, p. 32). And here is found yet another aspect of the withering that takes place as a result of indisponibilité in general and pride in particular. The same arrogance that keeps the proud person from communion with her fellows keeps her from hope.

This example points to the dialectical engagement of despair and hope—where there is hope there is always the possibility of despair, and only where there is the possibility of despair can we respond with hope. Despair, says Marcel, is equivalent to saying that there is nothing in the whole of reality to which I can extend credit, nothing worthwhile. “Despair is possible in any form, at any moment and to any degree, and this betrayal may seem to be counseled, if not forced upon us, by the very structure of the world we live in” (Marcel 1995, p. 26). Hope is the affirmation that is the response to this denial. Where despair denies that anything in reality is worthy of credit, hope affirms that reality will ultimately prove worthy of an infinite credit, the complete engagement and disposal of myself.

15. Marcel in Dialogue

Three decades after his death, Marcel's philosophy continues to generate a steady stream of creative scholarship that, if modest in volume, nevertheless attests to his continued relevance for the contemporary philosophical landscape. Marcel's influence on contemporary philosophy is apparent, for example, in the work of Paul Ricoeur, his most famous student. Through Ricoeur, Marcel has influenced contemporary philosophy in and around the hermeneutic tradition. The pattern of “detour and return” that characterizes Ricoeur and some of his students closely resembles Marcel's dialectic of primary and secondary reflection.[13] Likewise, Marcel's understanding of otherness—illustrated by his image of “constellations,” conglomerations of meaningfully connected but non-totalizable beings—is an explicit challenge to philosophers of absolute otherness including Emmanuel Levinas, Jacques Derrida, and John D. Caputo, and a valuable resource for philosophers with a chiastic understanding of otherness, including Ricoeur and Richard Kearney. In addition, Marcel's philosophy offers rich possibilities for dialogue with contemporary ontologies struggling to address the problem of “being” without succumbing to ethical “violence” or “ontotheological” conceptions of God. As such, his philosophy should be of interest to scholars interested in the work of Martin Heidegger, Jean-Luc Marion, Merold Westphal and others philosophizing at the intersection of philosophy and theology. Finally, his insistence that philosophy should illuminate our lived experience and his insistence on concrete examples have much in common with thinkers who view philosophy as a “way of life,” including Pierre Hadot and Michel Foucault. The resources of Marcel's philosophy have only begun to be tapped, and one may hope that the recent republication of what are arguably Marcel's two most important works, The Mystery of Being (by St. Augustine's Press) and Creative Fidelity (by Fordham University Press), will help to fuel a renaissance in scholarship concerning this remarkable thinker.


Marcel was a very prolific writer, given that his work includes philosophy, drama, criticism, and musical compositions. The following bibliography merely scratches the surface of his extensive oeuvre. More complete bibliographies, which were consulted in collecting this selected bibliography, can be found in: (1) Lapointe, Francois H. and Claire, eds. Gabriel Marcel and His Critics: An International Bibliography (1928-1976). New York and London: Garland Publishing, 1977; (2) Schilpp, Paul Arthur and Lewis Edwin Hahn, eds. The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel. The Library of Living Philosophers, vol. 17. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1984; and (3) a fine bibliographic resource can be found at the website of the Gabriel Marcel Society (hyperlink below).

Works by Marcel

Works About Marcel

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bergson, Henri | Buber, Martin | Christian theology, philosophy and | existentialism | Ricoeur, Paul | Sartre, Jean-Paul