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Meister Eckhart

First published Wed Jan 4, 2006

Education and culture were the two driving forces behind European urban development in the 13th and 14th centuries. Among the mendicant orders that had settled in the cities were the Dominicans (ordo fratrum praedicatorum), dedicated to promoting in their teaching, way of life, and preaching the ideal of man’s self-discovery—self-cultivation—as a singular cultural value. The dynamics of this self-discovery can be said to be two-fold. For, on one hand, man discovers himself by liberating himself from himself and therewith finding—in himself—what transcends him. On the other hand, what man finds in himself displays its own movement as all that remains when his self-discovery has reached its end. In this developmental context, Meister Eckhart directed his theoretical analysis towards elucidating the self-movement of intellect as such, in its differentiation, as a movement representing in practical terms the only possible form of life. Indeed, in this era of radical social upheaval, Eckhart put forward the dynamics of intellect (reason, rationality) as the genuine wealth possessed by those who are poor in spirit. His philosophical formulations and theological statements served, in their reciprocal convergence, to unfold in theoretical terms the dynamics of intellect with a view to recommending the practice of processive reason as the exemplary form of life. Eckhart explained these dynamics mostly on the basis of texts from the Holy Scriptures, whose philosophical content he set out through philosophical arguments—something he was able to do because he regarded the Holy Scriptures as a work of philosophy (cf. Echardus, In Ioh. n. 444; LW III, 380, 12–14: “evangelium contemplatur ens in quantum ens”: “the Gospel treats of being insofar as it is being”—Aristotle, as was well known, having defined the object of metaphysics in precisely this manner). Yet Eckhart’s explanations of these dynamics were also based on philosophical theses closely linked to notions from the Holy Scriptures. In both cases, he claimed to give unreserved expression to the new and rare (nova et rara) in propagating what was for him the only possible form of life: that of processive reason or of processes directed by reason. In so doing, Meister Eckhart dedicated his life to philosophy: as a philosopher holding a chair of theology at the University of Paris, as a philosopher leading the Dominican Order, and as a philosopher occupying the preacher’s pulpit.

1. Life of Meister Eckhart

Eckhart was born in 1260 in Hochheim (Thuringia). He entered the Dominican Order quite early, and received most of his education in the Studium Generale in Cologne that Albert the Great had founded in 1248. In 1286 Eckhart went to Paris to study. From 1294 until 1298, he was Prior of the Convent of Erfurt, at the same time carrying out the office of Vicar of Thuringia. Eckhart was promoted to Master of Theology at Paris in 1302 and taught as Professor there in the academic year 1302/1303. He was elected Provincial of the newly founded Province of Saxony in 1303, and held this office until 1311. In 1307 Eckhart also took over the administration of the Province of Bohemia as Vicar General. When the Provincial Chapter of the Province of Teutonia elected him Provincial in 1310, the election was not accepted by the General Chapter in Naples (1311). Instead, Eckhart was sent once more to Paris. After teaching there for a second period, Eckhart went to Strasbourg in 1313, where from 1314 to 1322 he was increasingly active as a preacher caring for Dominican convents there. From 1323 on, Eckhart resided in Cologne, most likely at the Studium Generale, and probably as Lecturer. During this time, the campaigns against him began that led, in 1326, to the opening of an inquisitional proceeding. In its course Eckhart submitted a reply to the syllabus of errors attributed to him, protesting as well against the proceeding itself, which was then continued at the Papal Court in Avignon. It resulted in the papal bull In agro dominico from Pope John XXII, issued on March 27, 1329, condemning 17 articles from this syllabus as heretical and 11 more as suspect of heresy. Eckhart, however, did not live to see his condemnation; he died sometime before April 30, 1328—probably on January 28, 1328, possibly in Avignon.

2. Works

At the beginning of the academic year 1293/94 Eckhart held an inaugural lecture (Collatio in libros Sententiarum) that has been preserved. An academic sermon, the Sermo Paschalis a. 1294 Parisius habitus and the Tractatus super oratione dominica date from the same time. Between 1294 and 1298 Eckhart composed his Instructional Talks (Die rede der underscheidunge), table-talks for his confratres in the Erfurt monastery. From his first teaching period in Paris (1302/03) come the Quaestiones (Quaestio Parisiensis I, II and the rationes Equardi from one of the disputed questions of Gonsalvus Hispanus), as well as the Sermo die beati Augustini Parisius habitus, a feast-day sermon in honor of Augustine (August 18, 1302 or February 28, 1303), and perhaps two other Quaestiones. Between 1303 and 1310, during a General Chapter, Eckhart held the Sermones on Ecclesiastics 24: 23–27a and 24: 27b–31. In 1305 he began composing the Opus tripartitum, his major work, comprising three parts: the Opus propositionum (Work of Theses), with over 1,000 theses in 14 treatises, the Opus quaestionum (Work of Problems) and the Opus expositionum (Work of Interpretations). Much of the Opus tripartitum remained incomplete. What we have are the Prologus generalis in opus tripartitum, the Prologus in opus propositionum, the Prologus in opus expositionum I and II, and various commentaries (above all the Expositio sancti evangelii secundum Iohannem). Also preserved is an Opus sermonum containing drafts of Latin sermons. From the Strasbourg and Cologne period come the treatise Daz buoch der goetlîchen troestunge and the sermon Von dem edeln menschen. (The authenticity of the treatise Von abegescheidenheit has been disputed in the past, but it has been recently accepted once more as a work of Eckhart.) The most important German sermons also go back to this last period. Among these is Predigt 52, which due to its extremely innovative content was later translated from Middle High German into Latin.

3. Dietrich of Freiberg and Meister Eckhart

Of all those following in the tradition of Albert the Great who developed theories of the intellect in the 13th and 14th centuries, Dietrich of Freiberg went the furthest. In treating of the active intellect (intellectus agens), Dietrich identified a three-fold object, which, however, the intellect knows in a single intuition (uno intuitu): its principle (deus), its essence (essentia) and the totality of beings (universitas entium). According to Dietrich, the intellect knows its essence and all beings not only according to its essence, but also “in its principle, according to the mode of this very principle” (in suo principio secundum modum ipsius principii; cf. Dietrich of Freiberg, De intellectu et intelligibili II 37–40, ed. Mojsisch, 1977, pp. 175–77). This mode of knowing is the highest that we can identify. Before Dietrich, no one had formulated this mode of knowing in such a progressive manner by making such a radical claim. Nevertheless, Dietrich did not further elaborate how to think this mode of knowing in its individual moments, that is, the way the intellect actually knows “in its principle, according to the mode of this very principle”.

Meister Eckhart begins where Dietrich of Freiberg leaves off. Nowhere in his writings does Eckhart mention Dietrich by name, although they were personally acquainted, and although Dietrich used his influence to see that Eckhart received significant posts within the Dominican Order. Yet Eckhart goes a step beyond Dietrich by expanding upon what Dietrich had given only general expression to, unfolding how the intellect actually moves in itself and therewith demonstrating what it means for the intellect to know “according to the mode of this very principle”. Briefly put, understanding how the intellect returns to its principle, where it might know “according to the mode of its principle”, requires that we first identify the way in which this principle itself knows, so that we might then grasp how the intellect comes to know there.

4. The Absolute Principle as Intellect without Being

In the initial stage of his career, Meister Eckhart composed some not very exciting table-talks for his confratres and, in his lost Commentary on the Sentences (Goris/Pikavé, 2001), most likely advocated doctrines based on the theology of Thomas Aquinas. Once back in Paris, however, Eckhart inaugurated his teaching with a bombshell. With a new thesis directed against Thomas Aquinas, as well as against his own Thomistic thinking prior to 1302, Eckhart contends that the absolute principle (or the absolute cause: God) is pure intellect and not being. According to this view, being (esse) is always caused and thus presupposes intellect, itself without being, as the cause of being. In line with Neoplatonic modes of thinking (cf. Liber de causis, cap. XI; Fidora/Niederberger, 2001, 76: “Causatum ergo in causa est per modum causae …”: “What is caused is in the cause in the mode of the cause …”), Eckhart holds that being is, in intellect, nothing other than intellect and, therefore, not simply being, but instead being that has been elevated to intellect. If someone should nonetheless object that in God knowing or anything else might be described as ‘being’, the proper response for Eckhart is that this ‘being’ still presupposes the knowing of intellect (“Et si tu intelligere velis vocare esse, placet mihi. Dico nihilominus, quod, si in deo est aliquid, quod velis vocare esse, sibi competit per intelligere”: “And if you wish to call intelligizing being, that is all right with me. Nonetheless, I say that if there is something in God that you wish to call being, it suits him through intelligizing”; cf. Echardus de Hochheim, Utrum in deo sit idem esse et intelligere n. 24, ed. Mojsisch, 1999, 192, 103–105). As the absolute cause, intellect is thought of as absolutely unlimited only if it is thought of as wholly without being. As such, intellect becomes the principle for absolute as well as contingent being. The alternative view—that knowing is simply identical with being (a position advanced by Sturlese, 1993a and von Perger, 1997 and again, with new argumentation, by Grotz, 2002)—disregards the more sweeping contention in Eckhart’s thesis that knowing is presupposed in every case of being. (Later, Nicholas of Cusa maintains accordingly that the maximum is without being, yet can be contracted to being; cf. Nicholas of Cusa, De docta ignorantia I, 6, ed. Hoffmann/Klibansky, 1932a, p. 14, 1: “Praeterea, contrahamus maximum ad esse et dicamus …”: “Besides, we might contract the maximum to being and say …”) Scholars such as Klibansky, however, as well as Imbach, 1976 have drawn attention to parallel passages in the German sermons that make it clear that for Eckhart absolute knowing is without being, indeed, that intellection is prior to being.

5. Univocal Causality

Between the uncreated and the created the predominant relationship is one of analogy, a relationship involving as well the disjunction of the two terms. Insofar as Eckhart in 1305 again takes up the theme of absolute being in its identity with God (esse est deus), he likewise gives expression to relationships of analogical causality, teaching that being as such, or absolute being (esse absolute), is what becomes restricted to determinate being (esse hoc et hoc), while determinate being is what brings it about that a this or a that (hoc et hoc) actually exists. Eckhart says ever again that the created is of itself pure nothing, indeed, even nothingness or nullity (nihileitas, nulleitas). The created is only because absolute being communicates itself to it—through determinate being—whereby determinate being, of course, is not in any position to communicate being as such, but only determinacy. That all of this is so, of course, is something that can be easily stated. Indeed, the metaphysics of being has always thrived on describing such structures, whether this being be absolute or determinate in nature.

Eckhart, however, breaks through that metaphysics of being with its analogical base by thinking through the relation of causality informing absolute being. We can assume at least hypothetically that a cause causes not only something dependent on it, but also something equal to it, namely that the cause causes in such a manner that it causes itself. But if it causes itself, it causes something which is itself also cause and at the same time cause of its cause. Such a mode of causality is called ‘univocal causality’. Our hypothesis of what could be thought in these terms turns into a certainty when we explore the structures of intellectual causality, for example, the relation between the act of thinking and what is thought, or between an ethical principle and an ethical principiate. Their relation is precisely what Eckhart takes advantage of in developing his theory of univocal causality. In these cases, it holds that the principle causes its principiate, and the principiate causes its principle. Even more: The principiate is in its principle nothing other than its principle. This means that the active (principle) is at the same time active and passive, being affected in the course of its activity (as principle). In turn, the passive (principiate) is at the same time passive  and active, being active in the course of its passivity (as principiate). Accordingly, a central proposition of Eckhart reads as follows: “[Principium et principiatum] … opponuntur relative: in quantum opponuntur, distinguuntur, sed in quantum relative, mutuo se ponunt …” (Echardus, In Ioh. n. 197; LW III, 166, 10–12: “[The principle and the principiate] … are opposed to one another relatively: Insofar as they are opposed, they are distinguished, but insofar as they are relative, they reciprocally posit themselves …”).

The breakthrough that Eckhart attains through his theory of univocal causality is exemplified by the relation between thinking and thought. For Eckhart, thinking presupposes no origin because a presupposed origin could only be thought by thinking and hence would be a thought of thinking, that is, itself thinking. Thinking is, then, for itself a presuppositionless origin, that is, it is its own principle: principium (Echardus, In Ioh. n. 38; LW III, 32, 11: “… ipsum principium semper est intellectus purus …”: “The principle itself is always pure intellect …”). Any thinking without act, however, is no thinking at all. Consequently, its own originative activity accrues to thinking, that is, insofar as it is a principle, the dynamics of its principiating: principiare. In this activity, however, thinking directs itself towards a thought that it has originated, that is, towards the product that is its principiate: principiatum. But since this thought is a thought of thinking, it is itself nothing other than thinking. The act of this thinking that has been thought is, then, retrograde. This thought, as thinking, is in turn principle, principiating and principiate, whereby this last is the original thinking. In this way, thinking thinks itself as thought and is therewith active thinking, while thought, insofar as it thinks its thinking, is itself thinking, and its thinking now thought. Consequently, both thinking and thought are at the same time active and passive.

Another example of univocal causality as conceived by Eckhart is found in the relation between justice and the just man. In the same vein as that sketched out with regard to the dynamics of thinking, justice is in the just man, and the just man is in justice. The just man is his just action, and this just action is likewise justice. Between the just man and justice, there is difference on account of the opposition between them, but because of their relationality they reciprocally include each other. Just as thought is the thought of thinking and therewith itself thinking, so, too, is what is just for Eckhart what is just of justice and therewith justice itself. From this we can draw, following Eckhart, a number of important conclusions.

A. For the just man, there is no why to his just action, no purpose or goal of this action. For the action of the just man has justice as its goal, and this goal is identical with the just man. Therefore, the just man has no goal external to himself. Instead, as justice, he is his own goal.

B. With the just man and with justice, there is no multiplicity. Justice is one, and the just man is one; thus, justice and the just man are one. Even if there are many just men: As just men, the many just men are one (Echardus, In Sap. n. 44; LW II, 366, 6–7: “… omnes iusti, in quantum iusti, unum sunt …”), indeed, they are even justice itself.

C. Justice, which is the just man, knows neither where nor when, that is, it knows neither space nor time, neither size nor quality, neither inside nor outside, neither over nor under, neither this side nor that side, neither above nor below, neither the activity of effecting nor the passivity of being effected. Hence, justice is indeterminate and does not accrue to anything else as an accident. Justice is something whose purpose lies in itself.

D. Consequently, the just man is in justice, which means: The just man is justice. This implies a reversal of the usual way of looking at things. Normally, a quality (qualitas) is what is found in an underlying subject (subiectum). With the spiritual perfections (perfectiones spirituales), however, the situation is different: The subjects are in the perfections, the just man is in justice. But in the realm of the spirit, being-in is nothing other than being-one. Hence, the just man, who is in justice, is justice itself. The just man does not possess justice, but rather is justice. Similarly, he who is free is freedom itself (Echardus, Predigt 28; DW II, 62, 3–5; cf. Predigt 10; DW I, 165, 2: “… und ich diu wîsheit selber bin, sô bin ich ein wîser mensche”; what applies in the cases of freedom and justice also applies in the case of wisdom). If he who is free merely possessed freedom, then this freedom would be something external to him, and he would never be freedom itself.

What is key is that by freedom Eckhart understands nothing other than self-consciousness or the I. It is never the case that the I wants something other, rather it wants only itself; the I never knows something other, rather it knows only itself; the I is never open for anything other, rather it is open for itself alone. Thus, the I is both cause of itself and conceives itself alone in itself. The itself known and wanted by the I, as well as defining its fundamental openness, is the other I—that is, the moment of self-relationality constitutive for the realm of the spirit.

E. In summary, Eckhart can say: “… in spiritualibus conceptio est ipsa parturitio sive partus” (Echardus, In Exod. n. 207; LW II, 174, 3–4): In the realm of the spirit, conceiving is bearing or giving birth—and therefore (passive) suffering is (active) production. It should be noted that the motif of birth is one of Eckhart’s favorites, for example, when he holds that the divine Father bears his Son in the soul, more precisely: in the ground of the soul, and in this way he bears me as himself and himself as me. This motif, however, is not limited to theological contexts. It also finds application as a philosophical motif. Here, again, it is necessary to become accustomed to Eckhart’s usage. Where others speak of “causing” or “principiating”, Eckhart speaks of “bearing”. This kind of language must be approached carefully, however, and demands close scrutiny now more than ever. Such a hermeneutical approach is currently favored especially by Largier, Hasebrink and Köbele.

F. “Swer underscheit verstât von gerehticheit und von gerehtem, der verstât allez, daz ich sage” (Echardus, Predigt 6; DW I, 105, 2–3): “Whoever understands the theory of justice and the just man understands everything that I am saying.” With this statement, Eckhart commends to our attention the paradigm of univocal co-relationality in the just man and justice. On one hand, this paradigm composes the precondition for that analogical thinking that informs, among other things, the relation of the uncreated and the created. While Wilde, 2000 asserts, then, that univocal causality is subsumed in analogical causality, Eckhart’s theory is exactly the opposite. On the other hand, however, the paradigm of univocal causality refers to what, in line with Eckhart, must still be made thematic because, as what is first, it cannot be put into question: the one as unity.

6. One as Unity

The goal of the rational form of life—of living in and with the spiritual perfections at the level of that transcendental being or being (esse, ens) convertible with the termini transcendentes (the one, the true, and the good)—is living in and from the absolute one (in and from the divine nature as presuppositionless unity). If the ground of the soul, as something uncreated and uncreatable—attributes which Meister Eckhart’s contemporary Eckhart von Gründig explicitly ascribes to the ground or ‘little spark’ of the soul that Meister Eckhart often invokes (cf. Winkler, 1999), thus indicating that he in fact employed these attributes—if human reason—not as human, but as reason—is one with the divine nature or ground (Echardus, Predigt 5b; DW I, 90, 8: “Hie ist gotes grunt mîn grunt und mîn grunt gotes grunt”: “Here, God’s ground is my ground and my ground God’s ground”), then man is no longer simply on the way towards unity (unio). Instead, unity is something that has always already been achieved. This being-unified is alone what matters (Echardus, Predigt 12; DW I, 197, 8–9; Predigt 39; DW II, 265, 6–266, 2), because man as reason has left behind everything that stands in the way of his living in and from unity, and because the ground of the soul is more interior in this unity than it is in itself (Mojsisch 1983a, 140–141; 2001, 163–165). This is true equanimity—letting-go (Gelâzenheit)—as the goal of human life.

Living in and from unity in the manner envisioned by Eckhart as the end of self-discovery becomes possible through a change (metabole) in intellectual disposition. The possible intellect—which, as defined by Aristotle, can become all things (cf. De anima III 5, 430a14–15)—is able to know either as ordinary consciousness (in images, species of things) or as self-consciousness through self-knowledge (without images, free from images). The conversion in disposition—Plato speaks of a peristrophe of the soul (cf. Res publica VII, 521c5)—leads the possible intellect to the uncreated and uncreatable ground of the soul, whose movement, as a process of reason, reaches its goal in the absolute one (unialiter unum, a combination suggested by Proclus; Eckhart speaks of the luter pur clar Ein or indistinctum, the undifferentiated). This goal, however, is itself nothing other than the ground of the soul. The ground of the soul in the absolute one is its own goal because self-consciousness is nothing other than one and the one, because freedom is nothing other than one and the one, because moral responsibility for oneself and others—Eckhart speaks of justice—is nothing other than one and the one. Self-consciousness, freedom and justice are always and everywhere only themselves, having nothing ‘outside’ of, additional or foreign to them.

For Eckhart, this means that whoever is justice is always justice, because the I that would stand out from justice would no longer be an I. The I always already knows that it is justice, however, because in knowing itself as just, it knows itself as justice; for the just man is justice. The I knows that it is just, however, because otherwise it does not know at all and is not even an I at all. The I is what it is only as rationality, as a knowing which knows that it is and knows what it is. This I is not only cause of itself (causa sui; Eckhart, deepening the tradition of this concept, says sache mîn selbes: “cause of myself”; cf. Summerell, 2002). It is moreover the cause for God, insofar as God stands in relation to his creatures. For only the uncreated and uncreateable ground of the soul stands not in relation to creatures, but instead only in relation to itself (cf. Echardus, Predigt 52). The I that knows itself, wills itself, and is its own abode, and therewith the I that is, in univocal causality, cause of itself and yet, in this unity, the one rationality, is, according to Eckhart, what man ought to become and what man can become in taking on the true poverty of spirit. This is so since man has always been this I, is now this I, and always will be this I, even if he knows nothing of himself as this I.

Consequently, the movement of reason, as Eckhart presents it, takes its point of departure from absolute unity and, as a principle, takes on being. This principle knows itself and wills itself, thinking thought in this way as its principiate, the ground of the soul in its uncreatedness and uncreatability. Since this thought is a thought of thinking, however, and thus itself thinking, this thinking that has been thought principiates its own principle in retrograde fashion. (As Eckhart puts it, the Son is reborn in the Father.) This movement of reason, as one of self-discovery and self-cultivation, ends there, where it began, in presuppositionless unity, where it might begin anew. This is the fundamental process—taking place in and from unity—inherent to the self-knowing and self-willing I. Insofar as it knows itself and wills itself, this I is nothing other than what man is when he has transcended himself as a creature fraught with nothingness and entrusted himself to the movement of the ground of the soul, acknowledging this movement as the sole form of life: that of self-consciousness, freedom, and moral responsibility. 

7. Conclusion

Nicholas of Cusa, when asked what he had to say about Eckhart, remarked that he had never read in Eckhart that the creature was identical with the creator. At the same time, he praised Eckhart’s talent (ingenium) as well as his ardor (studium). Yet Nicholas also suggested that Eckhart’s books should be removed from the public sphere, since they contained much that was astute and useful (subtilita et utilia) for those who understood them, but the people were not ready for what, in Eckhart, contradicted the traditional doctrines of the learned world.

Aiebat tamen praeceptor se numquam legisse ipsum sensisse creaturam esse creatorem, laudans ingenium et studium ipsius; sed optavit, quod libri sui amoverentur de locis publicis, quia vulgus non est aptus ad ea, quae praeter consuetudinem aliorum doctorum ipse saepe intermiscet, licet per intelligentes multa subtilia et utilia in ipsis reperiantur. (Nicholas of Cusa, Apologia doctae ignorantiae, ed. Klibansky, 1932b, p. 25, 7–12)

Still, the teacher said that he had never read that he [Eckhart] thought that the creature was the creator, and praised his [Eckhart's] talent and ardor. Yet he wished that his [Eckhart's] books would be removed from public places; for the people are not ready for what he [Eckhart] often intersperses, contrary to the custom of other learned men, even though the intelligent find in them many astute and useful things.

What Nicholas gave voice to is not simply the divide between medieval and modern thought, as well as that between orthodoxy and unconventionality, that he himself most remarkably straddled. In fact, it remains a challenge even today to properly understand the Eckhartian thought that man is free only if he (not merely possesses but instead) is freedom. This is so, in part, because even scholarly language runs up against its limits in Eckhart. For we still cannot give adequate expression to the real meaning of the statement: “The free man is, if he is really free, freedom itself, yet only insofar as he is free.” For this very reason, however, it is all the more necessary to engage ourselves in Eckhart’s thinking instead of banning his writings from the public sphere. For if our thought counsels it, our language must change, indeed, not only the language of scholars, but that of the people as well.


A. Works by Meister Eckhart (Echardus de Hochheim)

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entriess

Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | analogy: medieval theories of | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Augustine, Saint | causation: medieval theories of | Cusanus, Nicolaus [Nicolas of Cusa] | Dietrich of Freiberg | hermeneutics | medieval philosophy | Neoplatonism | Plato