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First published Tue May 13, 2003; substantive revision Thu May 14, 2009

Mereology (from the Greek μερος, ‘part’) is the theory of parthood relations: of the relations of part to whole and the relations of part to part within a whole. Its roots can be traced back to the early days of philosophy, beginning with the Presocratics and continuing throughout the writings of Plato (especially the Parmenides and the Thaetetus), Aristotle (especially the Metaphysics, but also the Physics, the Topics, and De partibus animalium), and Boethius (especially De Divisione and In Ciceronis Topica). Mereology occupies a prominent role also in the writings of medieval ontologists and scholastic philosophers such as Garland the Computist, Peter Abelard, Thomas Aquinas, Raymond Lull, Walter Burley, and Albert of Saxony, as well as in Jungius's Logica Hamburgensis (1638), Leibniz's Dissertatio de arte combinatoria (1666) and Monadology (1714), and Kant's early writings (the Gedanken of 1747 and the Monadologia physica of 1756). As a formal theory of parthood relations, however, mereology made its way into our times mainly through the work of Franz Brentano and of his pupils, especially Husserl's third Logical Investigation (1901). The latter may rightly be considered the first attempt at a thorough formulation of a theory, though in a format that makes it difficult to disentangle the analysis of mereological concepts from that of other ontologically relevant notions (such as the relation of ontological dependence). It is not until Leśniewski's Foundations of a General Theory of Manifolds (1916, in Polish) that a pure theory of part-relations was given an exact formulation. And because Leśniewski's work was largely inaccessible to non-speakers of Polish, it is only with the publication of Leonard and Goodman's The Calculus of Individuals (1940) that mereology has become a chapter of central interest for modern ontologists and metaphysicians.

In the following we focus mostly on contemporary formulations of mereology as they grew out of these recent theories—Leśniewski's and Leonard and Goodman's. Indeed, although such theories came in different logical guises, they are sufficiently similar to be recognized as a common basis for most subsequent developments. To properly assess the relative strength and weaknesses, however, it will be convenient to proceed in steps. First we consider some core mereological notions and principles. Then we proceed to an examination of the stronger theories that can be erected on this basis.

1. ‘Part’ and Parthood

A preliminary caveat is in order. It concerns the very notion of parthood that mereology is about. The word ‘part’ has many different meanings in ordinary language, not all of which correspond to the same relation. Broadly speaking, it can be used to indicate any portion of a given entity, regardless of whether the portion itself is attached to the remainder, as in (1), or detached, as in (2); cognitively salient, as in (1)-(2), or arbitrarily demarcated, as in (3); self-connected, as in (1)-(3), or disconnected, as in (4); homogeneous, as in (1)-(4), or gerrymandered, as in (5); material, as in (1)-(5), or immaterial, as in (6); extended, as in (1)-(6), or unextended, as in (7); spatial, as in (1)-(7), or temporal, as in (8); and so on.

(1) The handle is part of the mug.
(2) This cap is part of my pen.
(3) The left half is your part of the cake.
(4) The cutlery is part of the tableware.
(5) The contents of this bag is only part of what I bought.
(6) That area is part of the living room.
(7) The outermost points are part of the perimeter.
(8) The first act was the best part of the play.

All of these cases illustrate the notion of parthood that forms the focus of mereology. Often, however, the English word ‘part’ is used in a restricted sense. For instance, it can be used to designate only the cognitively salient relation of parthood illustrated in (1) and (2) as opposed to (3). In this sense, the parts of an object x are just its “components”, i.e., those parts that are available as individual units regardless of their interaction with the other parts of x. (A component is a part of an object, rather than just part of it; see e.g. Tversky 1989). Clearly, the properties of such restricted relations may not coincide with those of parthood broadly understood, so the principles of mereology should not be expected to carry over automatically.

Also, the word ‘part’ is sometimes used in a broader sense, for instance to designate the relation of material constitution, as in (9), or the relation of mixture composition, as in (10), or even a relation of conceptual inclusion, as in (11):

(9) The clay is part of the statue.
(10) Gin is part of martini.
(11) Writing detailed comments is part of being a good referee.

The mereological status of these relations, however, is controversial. For instance, although the constitution relation exemplified in (9) was included by Aristotle in his threefold taxonomy of parthood (Metaphysics, Δ, 1023b), many contemporary authors would rather construe it as a sui generis, non-mereological relation (see e.g. Wiggins 1980, Rea 1995, and Thomson 1998). Similarly, the ingredient-mixture relationship exemplified in (10) is subject to controversy, as the ingredients may involve significant structural connections besides spatial proximity and may therefore fail to retain certain important chemical characteristics they have in isolation (see Sharvy 1983). As for cases such as (11), it may simply be contended that the term ‘part’ appears only in the surface grammar and disappears at the level of logical form, e.g., if (11) is paraphrased as “A good referee is one who writes detailed comments.” (For more examples and tentative taxonomies, see Winston et al. 1987, Iris et al. 1988, and Gerstl and Pribbenow 1995.)

Finally, it is worth stating explicitly that mereology assumes no ontological restriction on the field of ‘part’. The relata can be as different as material bodies, events, geometric entities, or spatial regions, as in (1)-(8), as well as abstract entities such as propositions, sets, types, or properties, as in the following examples:

(12) The conclusion is part of the argument.
(13) The domain of quantification is part of the model.
(14) The suffix is part of the official file name.
(15) Rationality is part of personhood.

(The example in (11) may perhaps be read as expressing a mereological relation between properties, too.) Thus, although both Leśniewski's and Leonard and Goodman's original theories betray a nominalistic stand, reflecting a conception of mereology as an ontologically parsimonious alternative to set theory, there is no necessary link between the analysis of parthood relations and the philosophical position of nominalism.[1] As a formal theory (in Husserl's sense of ‘formal’, i.e., as opposed to ‘material’) mereology is simply an attempt to lay down the general principles underlying the relationships between an entity and its constituent parts, whatever the nature of the entity, just as set theory is an attempt to lay down the principles underlying the relationships between a set and its members. Unlike set theory, mereology is not committed to the existence of abstracta: the whole can be as concrete as the parts. But mereology carries no nominalistic commitment to concreta either: the parts can be as abstract as the whole. David Lewis's Parts of Classes (1991), which provides a mereological analysis of the set-theoretic universe, is a good illustration of this ontological neutrality of mereology. (It should be noted, however, that this way of conceiving of mereology has sometimes been challanged, the worry being that very different part-whole relations may hold between different kinds of entity. We shall not pursue this option here, but see e.g. Mellor 2006 for a representative example. See also Uzquiano 2006 for some worries concerning the alleged universality and topic-neutrality of mereology.)

2. Basic Principles

With these provisos, and barring for the moment the complications arising from the consideration of intensional factors (such as time and modalities), we may proceed to review some core mereological notions and principles. Ideally, we may distinguish here between (a) those principles that are simply meant to fix the intended meaning of the relational predicate ‘part’, and (b) a variety of additional, more substantive principles that go beyond the obvious and aim at greater sophistication and descriptive power. Exactly where the boundary between (a) and (b) should be drawn, however, is by itself a matter of controversy.

2.1 Parthood as a Partial Ordering

The obvious is this: regardless of how one feels about matters of ontology, if ‘part’ stands for the general relation exemplified by (1)-(8) and (12)-(15) above, then it stands for a partial ordering—a reflexive, transitive, antisymmetric relation:

(16) Everything is part of itself.
(17) Any part of any part of a thing is itself part of that thing.
(18) Two distinct things cannot be part of each other.

As it turns out, virtually every theory put forward in the literature accepts (16)–(18), though it is worth mentioning some misgivings that may, and occasionally have been, raised.

Concerning reflexivity (16), for example, one natural worry is that many legitimate senses of ‘part’ do not countenance saying that a whole is part of itself. Rescher (1955: 10) famously objected to Leonard and Goodman's theory on these grounds, citing the biologists' use of ‘part’ for the functional subunits of an organism as a case in point. Clearly, however, this is of little import. Taking reflexivity (and antisymmetry) as constitutive of the meaning of ‘part’ amounts to regarding identity as a limit (improper) case of parthood. A stronger relation, whereby nothing counts as part of itself, can obviously be defined in terms of the weaker one, hence there is no loss of generality (see section 2.2 below). Vice versa, one could frame a mereological theory by taking proper parthood as a primitive instead. This is merely a question of choosing a suitable primitive. (Of course, if one thinks that there are or might be objects that are not self-identical, for instance because of the loss of individuality in the quantum realm, or for whatever other reasons, then such objects would not be part of themselves either, yielding genuine counterexamples to (16). Here, however, we stick to a notion of identity that obeys traditional wisdom, which is to say a notion whereby identity is an equivalence relation subject to Leibniz's law.)

The transitivity principle, (17), is a bit more controversial. Several authors have observed that many legitimate senses of ‘part’ are non-transitive. Examples would include: (i) a biological subunit of a cell is not a part of the organ of which that cell is a part; (ii) a handle can be part of a door and the door of a house, though a handle is never part of a house; (iii) my fingers are part of me and I am part of the team, yet my fingers are not part of the team. (See again Rescher 1955, Cruse 1979, and Winston et al. 1987, respectively; for other examples see Lyons 1977: 313, Iris et al. 1988, Moltman 1997, Johansson 2004, and Johnston 2005 inter alia). Arguably, however, such misgivings stem again from the ambiguity of ‘part’. What counts as a biological subunit of a cell may not count as a subunit, i.e., a distinguished part of the organ, but that is not to say that it is not part of the organ at all. Similarly, if there is a sense of ‘part’ in which a handle is not part of the house to which it belongs, or my fingers not part of my team, it is a restricted sense: the handle is not a functional part of the house, though it is a functional part of the door and the door a functional part of the house; my fingers are not directly part of the team, though they are directly part of me and I am directly part of the team. It is obvious that if the interpretation of ‘part’ is narrowed by additional conditions (e.g., by requiring that parts make a functional or direct contribution to the whole), then transitivity may fail. In general, if x is a φ-part of y and y is a φ-part of z, x need not be a φ-part of z: the predicate modifier ‘φ’ may not distribute over parthood. But that shows the non-transitivity of ‘φ-part’, not of ‘part’. And within a sufficiently general framework this can easily be expressed with the help of explicit predicate modifiers (Varzi 2006a).

Finally, concerning the antisymmetry postulate (18), two sorts of worry are worth mentioning. On the one hand, some authors maintain that the relationship between an object and the stuff it is made of provides a perfectly ordinary example of symmetric parthood: according to Thomson (1998), for example, a statue and the clay it is made of are part of each other, yet distinct. As already mentioned, however, most contemporary authors are inclined to construe the relation of material constitution as a sui generis, non-mereological relation, or else to treat constitution itself as identity (hence, given (16), as a limit case of an antisymmetric parthood relation; see e.g. Noonan 1993). Since Thomson's motivations stem from a more general concern with issues of diachronic identity, it will be convenient to postpone the worry to a more general discussion of those issues (Section 3.2). On the other hand, one may wonder about the possibility of unordinary cases of symmetric parthood relationships. Thus, Sanford (1993: 222) refers to Borges's Aleph as a case in point: “I saw the earth in the Aleph and in the earth the Aleph once more and the earth in the Aleph ...”. In this case, a plausible reply is simply that fiction delivers no guidance to conceptual investigations: conceivability may well be a guide to possibility, but literary fantasy is by itself no evidence of conceivability (van Inwagen 1993: 229). However, one may observe that the possibility of mereological loops is not pure fantasy. In view of certain developments in non-well-founded set theory (i.e., set theory tolerating cases of self-membership and, more generally, of membership circularities—see Aczel 1988; Barwise and Moss 1996), one might indeed suggest building mereology on the basis of an equally less restrictive notion of parthood that allows for closed loops. This is particularly significant in view of the possibility of reformulating set theory itself in mereological terms—a possibility that is explored in the works of Bunt (1985) and especially Lewis (1991, 1993b) and Forrest (2002). Thus, in this case there is legitimate concern that one of the “obvious” meaning postulates for ‘part’ is in fact too restrictive. At present, however, no systematic study of non-well-founded mereology has been put forward in the literature, so in the following we shall confine ourselves to theories that accept the antisymmetry postulate along with relexivity and transitivity.

2.2. Other Mereological Concepts

It is convenient at this point to introduce some degree of formalization. This avoids ambiguities (such as those involved in the above-mentioned objections) and facilitates comparisons and developments. For definiteness, we assume here a standard first-order language with identity, supplied with a distinguished binary predicate constant, ‘P’, to be interpreted as the parthood relation. Taking the underlying logic to be the classical predicate calculus with identity,[2] the above minimal requisites on parthood may then be regarded as forming a first-order theory characterized by the following proper axioms for ‘P’:

(P.1) Reflexivity
(P.2) Transitivity
(Pxy ∧ Pyz) → Pxz
(P.3) Antisymmetry
(Pxy ∧ Pyx) → x=y

(Here and in the following we simplify notation by dropping all initial universal quantifiers. Unless otherwise specified, all formulas are to be understood as universally closed.) We may call such a theory Ground MereologyM for short[3]—regarding it as the common basis of any comprehensive part-whole theory.

Given (P.1)-(P.3), a number of additional mereological predicates can be introduced by definition. For example:

(19) Equality
EQxy =df Pxy ∧ Pyx
(20) Proper Parthood
PPxy =df Pxy ∧ ¬ Pyx
(21) Proper Extension
PExy =df ¬Pxy ∧ Pyx
(22) Overlap
Oxy =dfz(Pzx ∧ Pzy)
(23) Underlap
Uxy =dfz(Pxz ∧ Pyz)

An intuitive model for these relations, with ‘P’ interpreted as spatial inclusion, is given in Figure 1.

Figure 1
Figure 1. Basic patterns of mereological relations. (Shaded cells indicate parthood).

Note that ‘Uxy’ is bound to hold if one assumes the existence of a “universal entity” of which everything is part. Conversely, ‘Oxy’ would always hold if one assumed the existence of a “null item” that is part of everything. Both assumptions, however, are controversial and we shall briefly come back to them below.

Note also that the definitions imply (by pure logic) that EQ, O, and U are all reflexive and symmetric; in addition, EQ is also transitive—an equivalence relation. By contrast, PP and PE are irreflexive and asymmetric, and it follows from (P.2) that both are also transitive—so they are strict partial orderings. Since the following biconditional is also a straightforward consequence of the axioms:

(24) Pxy ↔ (PPxyx=y)

it should now be obvious that one could in fact use proper parthood as an alternative starting point for the development of mereology, using the right-hand side of (24) as a definiens for ‘P’. This is, for instance, the option followed in Simons (1987), where the partial ordering axioms for ‘P’ are replaced by the strict ordering axioms for ‘PP’. Ditto for ‘PE’, which was in fact the primitive relation in Whitehead's (1919) semi-formal treatment of the mereology of events (and which is just the converse of ‘PP’). Other options are in principle possible, too. For example, Goodman (1951) used ‘O’ as a primitive and Leonard and Goodman (1940) used its opposite:

(25) Disjointness
Dxy =df ¬Oxy

However, the relations corresponding to such predicates are strictly weaker than PP and PE and no biconditional is provable in M that would yield a corresponding definiens of ‘P’ (though one could define ‘P’ in terms of ‘O’ or ‘D’ in the presence of further axioms; see below ad (55)). Thus, other things being equal, ‘P’, ‘PP’, and ‘PE’ appear to be the only reasonable options. Here we shall stick to ‘P’.

Finally, note that identity could itself be introduced by definition, due to the following obvious consequence of the antisymmetry postulate (P.3):

(26) x=y ↔ EQxy

Accordingly, theory M could be formulated in a pure first-order language by assuming (P.1) and (P.2) and replacing (P.3) with the following variant of the Leibniz axiom schema for identity (where φ is any formula in the language):

(P.3′) Indiscernibility
EQxy → (φx ↔ φy)

One may in fact argue on these grounds that the part-relation is in some sense conceptually prior to the identity relation (as in Sharvy 1983: 234), and since ‘EQ’ is not definable in terms of ‘PP’ or ‘PE’ without resorting to ‘=’, the argument would also provide evidence in favor of ‘P’ as the most fundamental primitive. As we shall see in Section 3.2, however, the link between parthood and identity is philosophically problematic. In order not to compromise our exposition, we shall therefore keep to a language containing both ‘P’ and ‘=’ as primitives.

3. Decomposition Principles

Theory M may be viewed as embodying the common core of any mereological theory. Not just any partial ordering qualifies as a part-whole relation, though, and establishing what further principles should be added to (P.1)-(P.3) is precisely the question a good mereological theory is meant to answer. It is here that philosophical issues begin to arise.

Generally speaking, such further principles may be divided into two main groups. On the one hand, one may extend M by means of decomposition principles that take us from a whole to its parts. For example, one may consider the idea that whenever something has a proper part, it has more than one—i.e., that there is always some mereological difference (a remainder) between a whole and its proper parts. This need not be true in every model for M: a world with only two items, only one of which is part of the other, would be a counterexample, though not one that could be illustrated with the sort of geometric diagram used in Figure 1. On the other hand, one may extend M by means of composition principles that go in the opposite direction—from the parts to the whole. For example, one may consider the idea that whenever there are some things there exists a whole that consists exactly of those things—i.e., that there is always a mereological sum (or “fusion”) of two or more parts. Again, this need not be true in a model for M, and it is a matter of controversy whether the idea should hold unrestrictedly.

3.1. Supplementation

Let us begin with the first sort of extension. And let us start by taking a closer look at the intuition according to which a whole cannot be decomposed into a single proper part. There are various ways in which one can try to capture this intuition. Consider the following (from Simons 1987: 26–28):

(P.4a) Weak Company
PPxy → ∃z(PPzy ∧ ¬z=x)
(P.4b) Strong Company
PPxy → ∃z(PPzy ∧ ¬Pzx)
(P.4) Supplementation
PPxy → ∃z(Pzy ∧ ¬Ozx)

The first principle, (P.4a), is a literal rendering of the idea in question: every proper part must be accompanied by another. However, there is an obvious sense in which (P.4a) only captures the letter of the idea, not the spirit: it rules out the unintended model mentioned above (see Figure 2, left) but not, for example, an implausible model with an infinitely descending chain in which the additional proper parts do not leave any remainder (Figure 2, center).

The second principle, (P.4b), is stronger: it rules out both models as unacceptable. However, (P.4b) is still too weak to capture the intended idea. For example, it is satisfied by a model in which a whole can be decomposed into several proper parts all of which overlap one another (Figure 2, right), and it may be argued that such models do not do justice to the meaning of ‘proper part’: after all, the idea is that the removal of a proper part should leave a remainder, but it is by no means clear what would be left of x once z (along with its parts) is removed.

Figure 2
Figure 2. Three unsupplemented models. (Proper parthood relationships are represented by connecting lines going upwards.)

It is only the third principle, (P.4), that appears to provide a full formulation of the idea that nothing can have a single proper part. According to this principle, every proper part must be “supplemented” by another, disjoint part, and it is this last qualification that captures the notion of a remainder. Should (P.4), then, be incorporated into M as a further fundamental principle on the meaning of ‘part’? Most authors (beginning with Simons himself) would say so. Yet here there is room for disagreement. In fact, it is not difficult to conceive of mereological scenarios that violate not only (P.4), but also (P.4b) and even (P.4a). A case in point would be Brentano's (1933) theory of accidents, according to which a soul is a proper part of a thinking soul even though there is nothing to make up for the difference. (See Chisholm 1978; Baumgartner and Simons 1994.) Similarly, in Fine's (1982) theory of qua objects, every basic object (John) qualifies as the only proper part of its incarnations (John qua philosopher, John qua husband, etc.). Another interesting example is provided by Whitehead's (1929) theory of extensive connection, where no boundary elements are included in the domain of quantification: on this theory, a topologically closed region includes its open interior as a proper part in spite of there being no boundary elements to distinguish them—the domain only consists of extended regions. (See Clarke 1981 for a rigorous formulation.) One may rely on the intuitive appeal of (P.4) to discard such theories as implausible, but one may as well turn things around and regard the plausibility of such theories as a good reason not to accept (P.4) unrestrictedly. As things stand, it therefore seems appropriate to regard such a principle as providing a minimal but substantive addition to (P.1)–(P.3), one that goes beyond the mere “lexical” characterization of ‘part’ provided by M. We shall label the resulting mereological theory MM, for Minimal Mereology. (In fact, it can be checked that in the presence of (P.1) and (P.2), the Antisymmetry postulate (P.3) is derivable from (P.4) and is therefore redundant. For ease of reference, however, we shall continue to treat (P.3) as a basic axiom.)

3.2. Strong Supplementation and Extensionality

There is another way of expressing the supplementation intuition that is worth considering. It corresponds to the following axiom, which differs from (P.4) in the antecedent:

(P.5) Strong Supplementation
¬Pyx → ∃z(Pzy ∧ ¬Ozx)

Intuitively, this says that if an object fails to include another among its parts, then there must be a remainder. It is easily seen that, given M, (P.5) implies (P.4), so any theory rejecting (P.4) will a fortiori reject (P.5). (For instance, on Whitehead's boundary-free theory of extensive connection, a closed region is not part of its interior even though each part of the former overlaps the latter.) However, the converse does not hold. The diagram in Figure 3 illustrates a model in which (P.4) is true along with (P.1)-(P.3), since each proper part counts as a supplement of the other; yet (P.5) is false.

Figure 3
Figure 3. A weakly supplemented model.

The theory obtained by adding (P.5) to (P.1)-(P.3) is thus a proper extension of MM. We label this stronger theory EM, for Extensional Mereology, the attribute ‘extensional’ being justified precisely by the exclusion of countermodels that, like the one in Figure 3, contain distinct objects with the same proper parts. In fact, it is a theorem of EM that no composite objects with the same proper parts can be distinguished:

(27) (∃zPPzx ∨ ∃zPPzy) → (x=y ↔ ∀z(PPzx ↔ PPzy)).

(The analogue for ‘P’ is already provable in M, since P is reflexive and antisymmetric.) This goes far beyond the intuition that lies behind the basic supplementation principle (P.4). Does it go too far?

On the face of it, it is not difficult to envisage scenarios that would correspond to the diagram in Figure 3. For example, we may take x and y to be the sets {{z1}, {z1, z2}} and {{z2},{z1, z2}}, respectively (i.e., the ordered pairs <z1, z2> and <z2, z1>), interpreting ‘P’ as the ancestral of the improper membership relation (i.e., of the union of ∈ and =). But sets are abstract entities, and the ancestral relation does not generally satisfy (P.4) (the singleton of the empty set, for instance, or the singleton of any Urelement, would have only one proper part on the suggested construal of ‘P’). Can we also envisage similar scenarios in the domain of concrete, spatially extended entities, granting (P.4) in its generality? Admittedly, it is difficult to picture two concrete objects mereologically structured as in Figure 3. It is difficult, for example, to draw two extended objects composed of the same proper parts because drawing something is drawing its proper parts; once the parts are drawn, there is nothing left to be done to get a drawing of the whole. Yet this only proves that pictures are biased towards (P.5). Are there any philosophical reasons to resist the extensional force of (P.5) beyond the domain of abstract entities, and in the presence of (P.4)?

Here there is room for controversy. There are two sorts of worry worth considering. On the one hand, it is sometimes argued that sameness of proper parts is not sufficient for identity. For example, it is sometimes argued that: (i) two words can be made up of the same letters, as with ‘fallout’ and ‘outfall’ (Hempel 1953: 110; Rescher 1955: 10); or (ii) the same flowers can compose a nice bunch or a scattered bundle, depending on the arrangements of the individual flowers (Eberle 1970: §2.10); or (iii) a cat must be distinguished from the corresponding amount of feline tissue, for the former can survive the annihilation of certain parts (the tail, for instance) whereas the latter cannot by definition (Wiggins 1968; see also Doepke 1982, Lowe 1989, Johnston 1992, Baker 1999, Merav 2003, and Sanford 2003, inter alia, for similar or related arguments). On the other hand, it is sometimes argued that sameness of parts is not necessary for identity, as some entities may survive mereological change. If a cat survives the annihilation of its tail, then the tailed cat (before the accident) and the tailless cat (after the accident) are numerically the same in spite of their having different proper parts (Wiggins 1980). If any of these arguments is accepted, then clearly (27) is too strong a principle to be imposed on the parthood relation. And since (27) follows from (P.5), it might be concluded that EM is on the wrong track.

Let us look at these objections separately. Concerning the necessity of mereological extensionality, i.e., the left-to-right conditional in the consequent of (27):

(28) x=y → ∀z(PPzx ↔ PPzy).

it is perhaps enough to remark that the difficulty is not peculiar to extensional mereology. The objection proceeds from the consideration that ordinary entities such as cats and other living organisms (and possibly other entities as well, such as statues and ships) survive all sorts of gradual mereological changes. This a legitimate thought, lest one be forced into some form of “mereological essentialism” (Chisholm 1973, 1976). However, the same can be said of other types of change as well: bananas ripen, houses deteriorate, people sleep at night and eat at lunch. How can we say that they are the same things, if they are not quite the same? Indeed, (28) is just a corollary of the identity axiom schema

(ID) x=y → (φx ↔ φy).

and it is well known that this axiom schema calls for revisions when ‘=’ is given a diachronic reading. (See the entries Change and Identity over Time.) Arguably, any such revisions will affect the case at issue as well, and in this sense the above-mentioned objection to (28) can be disregarded. For example, on a traditional, three-dimensional conception of material objects, the problem of change is often accounted for by relativizing properties and relations to times and (ID) becomes

(ID′) x=y → ∀ttx ↔ φty).

(This can be done in various ways; see e.g. the papers collected in Haslanger and Kurtz 2006, Part III.) If so, then the specific worry about (28) would dissolve, as the relativized version of (P.5) would only warrant the following variant of the conditional in question:

(28′) x=y → ∀tz(PPtzx ↔ PPtzy)

(see Thomson 1983). Similarly, the problem would disappear if the variables in (28) were taken to range over four-dimensional entities whose parts may extend in time as well as in space (Heller 1984, Lewis 1986, Sider 2001), or if identity itself were construed as a contingent relation that may hold at some times or worlds but not at others (Gibbard 1975, Myro 1985, Gallois 1998). Such revisions may be regarded as an indicator of the limited ontological neutrality of extensional mereology. But their independent motivation also bears witness to the fact that controversies about the necessity of extensionality, and particularly about (28), stem from genuine and fundamental philosophical conundrums and cannot be assessed by appealing to our intuitions about the meaning of ‘part’.

The worry about the sufficiency of mereological extensionality, i.e., the right-to-left conditional in the consequent of (27):

(29) z(PPzx ↔ PPzy) → x=y,

is more to the point. However, there are various ways of resisting such counterexamples as (i)–(iii) on behalf of EM. Consider (i)—two words made up of the same letters. This, it can be argued, is best described as a case of different word tokens made up of distinct tokens of the same letter types. There is, accordingly, no violation of (29) in the opposition between ‘fallout’ and ‘outfall’ (for instance), hence no reason to reject (P.5) on these grounds. (Besides, even with respect to abstract types, it could be pointed out that the words ‘fallout’ and ‘outfall’ do not share all their proper parts: they share the same letters, but the string ‘lou’, for instance, is only included in the first word.) Of course, we may suppose that one of the two word-tokens is obtained from the other by rearranging the same letter-tokens. If so, however, the issue becomes once again one of diachronic non-identity, with all that it entails, and it is not obvious that we have a counterexample to (29). (See Lewis 1991: 78f.) What if our letter-tokens are suitably arranged so as to form both words at the same time? For example, suppose they are arranged in a circle (Simons (1987: 114). In this case one might be inclined to say that we have a genuine counterexample to (29). But one may equally well insist that we have got just one circular inscription that, curiously, can be read as two different words depending on where we start. Compare: I draw a rabbit that to you looks like a duck. Have I thereby made two drawings? I write ‘p’ on my office glass door; from the outside you read ‘q’. Have I therefore produced two letter-tokens? And what if Mary joins you and reads it upside down: have I also written the letter ‘b’? Surely then I have also written the letter ‘d’, as my upside-down office-mate John points out. This multiplication of entities seems preposterous. There is just one thing there, one inscription, and what it looks (or mean) to you or me or Mary or John is totally irrelevant to what that thing is. Similarly—it may be argued—there is just one inscription in our example, a circular display of seven letter-tokens, and whether we read it as a ‘fallout’-inscription or an ‘outfall’-inscription is irrelevant to its mereological structure. (Varzi 2008)

Case (ii)—the flowers—is not significantly different. The same, concrete flowers cannot compose a nice bunch and a scattered bundle at the same time. Case (iii), however, is more delicate. There is a strong intuition that a cat is something over and above the amount of feline tissue composing its tail and the rest of its body—that they have different survival conditions and, hence, different properties—so it may be thought that here we have a genuine counterexample to mereological extensionality (via Leibniz's Law). On behalf of EM, it should nonetheless be noted that the appeal to Leibniz's law in this context is problematic. Let ‘Tibbles’ name our cat and ‘Tail’ its tail, and grant the truth of

(30) Tibbles can survive the annihilation of Tail.

There is, indeed, an intuitive sense in which the following is also true:

(31) The amount of feline tissue composing Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body cannot survive the annihilation of Tail.

However, this intuitive sense corresponds to a de dicto reading of the modality, where the description in (31) has narrow scope:

(31a) In every possible world, the amount of feline tissue composing Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body has Tail as a proper part.

On this reading, (31) is hardly negotiable (in fact, logically true). Yet this is irrelevant in the present context, for (31a) does not amount to an ascription of a modal property and cannot be used in connection with Leibniz's law. (Compare: The number of planets might have been even; 9 is necessarily odd; hence the number of planets is not 9.) On the other hand, consider a de re reading of (31), where the description has wide scope:

(31b) The amount of feline tissue composing Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body has Tail as a proper part in every possible world.

On this reading, the appeal to Leibniz's law would be legitimate (modulo any concerns about the status of modal properties) and one could rely on the truth of (30) and (31) (i.e., (31b)) to conclude that Tibbles is distinct from the relevant amount of feline tissue. However, there is no obvious reason why (31) should be regarded as true on this reading. That is, there is no obvious reason to suppose that the amount of feline tissue that in the actual world consists of Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body—that amount of feline tissue that is now resting on the carpet—cannot survive the annihilation of Tail. Indeed, it would appear that any reason in favor of this claim vis-à-vis the truth of (30) would have to presuppose the distinctness of the entities in question, so no appeal to Leibniz's law would be legitimate to determine the distinctess (on pain of circularity). This is not to say that the putative counterexample to (29) is wrong-headed. But it requires genuine metaphysical work to establish it and it makes the rejection of the strong supplementation principle (P.5) a matter of genuine philosophical controversy. (Similar remarks would apply to any argument intended to reject extensionality on the basis of competing modal intuitions regarding the possibility of mereological rearrangement, rather than mereological change, as with the flowers example. On a de re reading, the claim that a bunch of flowers could not survive rearrangement of the parts—while the aggregate of the individual flowers composing it could—must be backed up by a genuine metaphysical theory about those entities. For more on this general line of defense on behalf of (29), see e.g. Lewis 1971: 204ff, Jubien 1993: 118ff and Varzi 2000: 291ff.)

3.3. Complementation

There is a way of expressing the supplementation intuition that is even stronger than (P.5). It corresponds to the following thesis, which differs from (P.5) in the consequent:

(P.6) Complementation
¬Pyx → ∃zw(Pwz ↔ (Pwy ∧ ¬ Owx))

This says that if y is not part of x, there exists something that comprises exactly those parts of y that are disjoint from x—something we may call the difference or relative complement between y and x. It is easily checked that this principle implies (P.5). On the other hand, the diagram in Figure 4 shows that the converse does not hold: there are two parts of y that do not overlap x, namely z1 and z2, but there is nothing that consists exactly of such parts, so we have a model of (P.5) in which (P.6) fails.

Figure 4
Figure 4. A strongly supplemented model violating complementation.

Any misgivings about (P.5) may of course be raised against (P.6). But what if we agree with the above arguments in support of (P.5)? Do they also give us reasons to accept the stronger principle (P.6)? The answer is in the negative. Plausible as it may initially sound, (P.6) has consequences that even an extensionalist may not be willing to accept. For example, it may be argued that although the base and the stem of this wine glass jointly compose a larger part of the glass itself, and similarly for the stem and the bowl, there is nothing composed just of the base and the bowl (=the difference between the glass and the stem), since these two pieces are standing apart. More generally, it appears that (P.6) would force one to accept the existence of a wealth of “scattered” entities, such as the aggregate consisting of your nose and your thumbs, or the aggregate of all mountains higher than Kilimanjaro. And since Lowe (1953) many authors have expressed discomfort with such entities regardless of extensionality. (One philosopher who explicitly accepts extensionality but feels uneasy about scattered entities is Chisholm 1987.) As it turns out, the extra strength of (P.6) is therefore best appreciated in terms of the sort of mereological aggregates that this principle would force us to accept, aggregates that are composed of two or more parts of a given whole. This suggests that any additional misgivings about (P.6), besides its extensional implications, are truly misgivings about matters of composition. We shall accordingly postpone their discussion to Section 4, where we shall attend to these matters more fully. For the moment, let us simply say that (P.6) is, on the face of it, not a principle that can be added to M without further argument.

3.4. Atomism and Other Options

One last important family of decomposition principles concerns the question of atomism. Mereologically, an atom (or “simple”) is an entity with no proper parts, regardless of whether it is point-like or has spatial (and/or temporal) extension:

(32) Atom
Ax =df ¬∃yPPyx

Are there any such entities? And if there are, is everything entirely made up of atoms? Does everything comprise at least some atoms? Or is everything made up of atomless “gunk” (in the terminology of Lewis 1970)? These are deep and difficult questions, which have been the focus of philosophical investigation since the early days of philosophy (see Sorabji 1983, Pyle 1995, or Holden 2004) and have been center stage also in many recent disputes in mereology (see, for instance, van Inwagen 1990, Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, Markosian 1998a, Mason 2000, Hudson 2007, and the paper collected in Hudson 2004; see also Sobociński 1971 and Eberle 1967 for some early treatments in the spirit of Leśniewski's Mereology and of Leonard and Goodman's Calculus of Individuals, respectively). Here we shall confine ourselves to a brief examination.

The two main options, to the effect that there are no atoms at all, or that everything is ultimately made up of atoms, correspond to the following postulates, respectively:

(P.7) Atomlessness
(P.8) Atomicity
y(Ay ∧ Pyx)

These postulates are mutually incompatible, but taken in isolation they can consistently be added to any mereological theory X considered here. Adding (P.8) yields a corresponding Atomistic version, AX; adding (P.7) yields an Atomless version, AX. Since finitude together with the antisymmetry of parthood (P.3) jointly imply that mereological decomposition must eventually come to an end, it is clear that any finite model of M (and a fortiori of any extension of M) must be atomistic. Accordingly, an atomless mereology AX admits only models of infinite cardinality. (A world containing such wonders as Borges's Aleph, where parthood is not antisymmetric, might by contrast be finite and yet atomless.) An example of such a model, establishing the consistency of the atomless versions of most mereological theories considered in this survey, is provided by the regular open sets of a Euclidean space, with ‘P’ interpreted as set-inclusion (Tarski 1935). On the other hand, the consistency of an atomistic theory is typically guaranteed by the trivial one-element model (with ‘P’ interpreted as identity), though we can also have models of atomistic theories that allow for infinitary decomposition. A case in point is provided by the closed intervals on the real line, or the closed sets of a Euclidean space (Eberle 1970). In fact, it turns out that even when X is as strong as the full calculus of individuals, corresponding to the theory GEM of Section 4.4, there is no purely mereological formula that says whether there are finitely or infinitely many atoms, i.e., that is true in every finite model of AX but not in any infinite atomistic model (Hodges and Lewis 1968).

One thing to notice is that, independently of their motivations, atomistic mereologies admit of significant simplifications in the axioms. For instance, AEM can be simplified by replacing (P.5) and (P.14) with

(P.5′) ¬Pxy → ∃z(Az ∧ Pzx ∧ ¬Pzy),

which in turns implies the following atomistic variant of the extensionality thesis (27):

(33) x=y ↔ ∀z(Az → (Pzx ↔ Pzy))

Thus, any atomistic extensional mereology is truly hyperextensional in Goodman's (1958) sense: things built up from exactly the same atoms are identical. An interesting question, discussed at some length in the late 1960's (Yoes 1967, Eberle 1968, Schuldenfrei 1969) and taken up more recently by Simons (1987: 44f) and Engel and Yoes (1996), is whether there are atomless analogues of (33). Is there any predicate that can play the role of ‘A’ in an atomless mereology? Such a predicate would identify the “base” (in the topological sense) of the system and would therefore enable mereology to cash out Goodman's hyperextensional intuitions even in the absence of atoms. The question is therefore significant especially from a nominalistic perspective, but it has deep ramifications also in other fields (e.g., in connection with the Whiteheadian conception of space mentioned in section 3.1, according to which space contains no parts of lower dimensions such as points or boundary elements; see Forrest 1996a and Roeper 1997). In special cases there is no difficulty in providing a positive answer. For example, in the AEM model consisting of the open regular subsets of the real line, the open intervals with rational end points form a base in the relevant sense. It is unclear, however, whether a general answer can be given that applies to any sort of domain. If not, then the only option would appear to be an account where the notion of a “base” is relativized to entities of a given sort. In Simons's terminology, we could say that the ψ-ers form a base for the φ-ers if and only if the following variants of (P.5′) and (P.8) are satisfied:

(P.5*) x ∧ φy) → (¬Pxy → ∃zz ∧ Pzx ∧ ¬Pzy)).
(P.8*) φx → ∃yy ∧ Pyx).

An atomistic mereology would then correspond to the limit case where ‘ψ’ is identified with the predicate ‘A’ for every choice of ‘φ’. In an atomless mereology, by contrast, the choice of the base would depend each time on the level of “granularity” set by the relevant specification of ‘φ’.

A second important consideration concerns the possibility of theories that lie between the two extreme options afforded by Atomicity and Atomlessness. For instance, it can be held that there are atoms, though not everything need have a complete atomic decomposition, or it can be held that there is atomless gunk, though not everything need be gunky. (The latter position is defended e.g. by Zimmerman 1996.) Again, formally this amounts to endorsing a restricted version of either (P.7) or (P.8) in which the variables are suitably restricted so as to range over entities of a certain sort:

(P.7φ) φx → ∃yPPyx
(P.8φ) φx → ∃y(Ay ∧ Pyx)

At present, no thorough formal investigation of such options has been entertained (but see Masolo and Vieu 1999). Yet the issue is particularly pressing when it comes to the mereology of the spatio-temporal world. For example, it is a plausible thought that while the question of atomism may be left open with regard to the mereological structure of material objects (pending empirical findings from physics), one might be able to settle it (independently) with regard to the structure of space-time itself. This would amount to endorsing a version of either (P.7φ) or (P.8φ) in which ‘φ’ is understood as a condition that is satisfied exclusively by regions of space-time. (Actually, it is hard to conceive of a world in which an atomistic space-time is inhabited by entities that can be decomposed indefinitely, so in this case it is reasonable to suppose that any theory accepting (P.8φ) for regions would also accept the stronger principle (P.8). However, (P.7φ) would be genuinely independent of (P.7) unless it is assumed that every mereologically atomic entity should be spatially unextended, an assumption that has been challenged extensively in recent literature; see e.g. Markosian 1998a, Parsons 2004, Simons 2004, Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2006, Hudson 2006a, McDaniel 2007, and Sider 2007.)

Similar considerations apply to other decomposition principles that may come to mind at this point. For example, one may consider a requirement to the effect that ‘PP’ forms a dense ordering, as already Whitehead (1919) had it:

(P.9) Density
PPxy → ∃z(PPxz ∧ PPzy)

As a general decomposition principle, (P.9) might be deemed too strong, especially in an atomistic setting. (Whitehead's own theory assumes Atomlessness.) However, it is plausible to suppose that (P.9) should hold at least with respect to the domain of spatio-temporal regions, regardless of whether these are construed as atomless gunk or as aggregates of spatio-temporal atoms.

Finally, it is worth noting that if one assumed the existence of a “null item” that is part of everything, corresponding to the postulate

(P.10) Bottom

then such an entity would perforce be an atom, and the antisymmetry axiom (P.3) would entail its uniqueness. Thus, no atomless theory is compatible with this assumption, whereas all atomistic theories—more precisely, all theories satisfying (P.10) along with the weak supplementation principle (P.4)—would collapse to triviality in view of the following immediate corollary:

(34) xy x=y

which asserts the existence of one and only one entity. (Perhaps ‘triviality’ is not quite the right word. According to some interpretations, for example, Spinoza held precisely that the whole universe is a giant extended simple, a view recently defended by Schaffer 2007. On the other hand, it should be noted that even in the absence of Atomicity and Atomlessness, (P.10) is not a popular choice, aside from Martin 1965, Bunt 1985, and very few other exceptions.[4])

4. Composition Principles

Let us now consider the second way of extending M mentioned at the beginning of Section 3. Just as we may want to fix the logic of P by means of decomposition principles that take us from a whole to its parts, we may look at composition principles that go in the opposite direction—from the parts to the whole. More generally, we may consider the idea that the domain of the theory ought to be closed under mereological operations of various sorts: not only mereological sums, but also products, differences, and more.

4.1. Upper Bounds

Conditions on composition are many. Beginning with the weakest, one may consider a principle to the effect that any pair of suitably related entities must underlap, i.e., have an upper bound:

(P.11ξ) ξ-Bound
ξxy → ∃z(Pxz ∧ Pyz).

Exactly how ‘ξ’ should be construed is, of course, an important question by itself—a version of what van Inwagen (1987) calls the Special Composition Question. A natural choice would be to identify ξ with mereological overlap, the rationale being that such a relation establishes an important tie between what may count as two distinct parts of a larger whole. As we shall see, with ξ so construed, (P.11ξ) is indeed rather uncontroversial. However, regardless of any specific choice, it is apparent that (P.11ξ) is pretty weak, as the consequent is trivially satisfied in any domain that includes a universal entity of which everything is part.

4.2. Sums

A somewhat stronger condition would be to require that any pair of suitably related entities must have a minimal underlapper—something composed exactly of their parts and nothing else. This requirement is sometimes stated by saying that any suitable pair must have a mereological “sum”, or “fusion”, though it is not immediately obvious how this requirement should be formulated in the formal language. Consider:

(P.12ξ,a) ξ-Suma
ξxy → ∃zw(Pzw ↔ (Pxw ∧ Pyw))
(P.12ξ,b) ξ-Sumb
ξxy → ∃z(Pxz ∧ Pyz ∧ ∀w(Pwz → (Oxw ∨ Oyw)))
(P.12ξ) ξ-Sum
ξxy → ∃zw(Ozw ↔ (Oxw ∨ Oyw))

In a way, (P.12ξ,a) would seem the obvious choice, corresponding to the idea that a sum of two objects is just a minimal upper bound of those objects relative to P. (See e.g. Eberle 1967, Bostock 1979, van Benthem 1983.) However, this condition may be regarded as too weak to capture the intended notion of a mereological sum. For example, with ξ construed as overlap, (P.12ξ,a) is satisfied by the model of Figure 5, left: here z is a minimal upper bound of x and y, yet z hardly qualifies as a sum “made up” of x and y, since its parts include also a third, disjoint item w. Indeed, it is a simple fact about partial orderings that among finite models (P.12ξ,a) is equivalent to (P.11ξ), hence just as weak.

By contrast, (P.12ξ,b) corresponds to a notion of sum (to be found e.g. in Tarski 1929 and Lewis 1991) that may seem too strong. It says that any pair of suitably related entities x and y have an upper bound all parts of which overlap either x or y. Thus, it rules out the model on the left of Figure 5, precisely because the third item is disjoint from both x and y; but it also rules out the model on the right, which depicts a situation in which z may be viewed as an entity truly made up of x and y insofar as it is ultimately composed of atoms to be found either in x or in y. Of course, such a situation violates the strong supplementation principle (P.5), but that's precisely the sense in which (P.12ξ,b) seems too strong: an anti-extensionalist might want to have a notion of sum that does not presuppose strong supplementation.

The formulation in (P.12ξ) is the natural compromise. Informally, it says that for any pair of suitably related entities x and y there is something that overlaps exactly those things that overlap either x or y. This is strong enough to rule out the model on the left, but weak enough to be compatible with the model on the right. In fact, (P.12ξ) is the formulation that best reflects the notion of sum, or fusion, to be found in standard treatments of mereology, and in the sequel we shall mostly stick to it. Note, however, that if the Strong Supplementation axiom (P.5) holds, then (P.12ξ) is equivalent to (P.12ξ,b). Moreover, it turns out that if the stronger Complementation axiom (P.6) holds, then all of these principles are trivially satisfied in any domain in which there is a universal entity: in that case, regardless of ξ, the sum of any two entities is just the complement of the difference between the complement of one minus the other. (Such is the strength of (P.6), a genuine cross between decomposition and composition principles.)

Figure 5
Figure 5. A suma that is not a sum, and a sum that is not a sumb.

The intuitive idea behind these principles is in fact best appreciated in the presence of (P.5), hence extensionality, for in that case the relevant sums must be unique. Just to confine ourselves to (P.12ξ), it is natural to consider the following definition (where ‘ι’ is the definite descriptor):

(35) Sum
x + y =df ιzw(Owz ↔ (Owx ∨ Owy)).

Then, given (P.12ξ), EM would immediately imply that this operator has all the properties one might expect (Breitkopf 1978). For example, as long as the arguments satisfy the relevant condition ξ,[5] + is idempotent, commutative, and associative:

(36) x = x + x
(37) x + y = y + x
(38) x + (y + z) = (x + y) + z

and well-behaved with respect to parthood:

(39) Pxy → Px(y + z)
(40) P(x + y)z → Pxz
(41) Pxyx + y = y

Indeed, here there is room for further developments. For example, just as the principles above assert the existence of a minimal underlapper for any pair of suitably related entities, one may at this point want to assert the existence of a maximal overlapper, i.e., not a “sum” but a “product” of those entities (see e.g. Eberle 1967). In the present context, such an additional claim would correspond to the following principle:

(P.13ξ) ξ-Product
ξxy → ∃zw(Pwz ↔ (Pwx ∧ Pwy)).

where ‘ξ’ must be at least as strong as ‘O’ (unless one assumes the Bottom principle (P.10)). In EM one could then introduce the corresponding binary operator:

(42) Product
x × y =df ιzw(Pwz ↔ (Pwx ∧ Pwy)).

and it can be shown that, again, such an operator would have the properties one might expect. For example, as long as the arguments satisfy the relevant condition ξ, × is idempotent, commutative, and associative, and it interacts with + in conformity with the the following distribution laws:

(43) x + (y × z) = (x + y) × (x + z)
(44) x × (y + z) = (x × y) + (x × z)

Now, obviously (P.13ξ) does not qualify as a composition principle in the main sense that we have been considering above, i.e., as a principle that yields a whole out of suitably related parts. Still, in a derivative sense it does. It asserts the existence of a whole composed of parts that are shared by suitably related entities. Be that as it may, it should be noted that such an additional principle is not innocuous unless ‘ξ’ expresses a condition stronger than mere overlap. For instance, we have said that overlap may be a natural option if one is unwilling to countenance arbitrary scattered sums. It would not, however, be enough to avoid embracing scattered products. Think of two C-shaped objects overlapping at both extremities; their sum would be a one-piece O-shaped object, but their product would consist of two disjoint, separate parts. Moreover, and independently, if ξ were just overlap, then (P.13ξ) would be unacceptable for anyone unwilling to embrace mereological extensionality. For it turns out that the Strong Supplementation principle (P.5) would then be derivable from the weaker Supplementation principle (P.4) using only the partial ordering axioms for ‘P’ (in fact, using only Reflexivity and Transitivity; see Simons 1987: 30f). In other words, unless ‘ξ’ expresses a condition stronger than overlap, MM cum (P.13ξ) would automatically include EM. This is perhaps even more remarkable, for on first thought the existence of products would seem to have nothing to do with matters of decomposition, let alone a decomposition principle that is committed to extensionality. On second thought, however, mereological extensionality is really a double-barreled thesis: it says that two wholes cannot be decomposed into the same proper parts but also, by the same token, that two wholes cannot be composed out of the same proper parts. So it is not entirely surprising that as long as proper parthood is well behaved, as per (P.4), extensionality might pop up like this in the presence of substantive composition principles. (It is, however, noteworthy that it already pops up as soon as (P.4) is combined with a seemingly innocent thesis such as the existence of products, so the anti-extensionalist should keep that in mind.)

4.3. Infinitary Bounds and Sums

We can get even stronger composition principles by considering infinitary bounds and sums. For example, (P.11ξ) can be generalized to a principle to the effect that any non-empty set of (two or more) entities satisfying a suitable condition ψ has an upper bound. Strictly speaking, there is a difficulty in expressing such a principle in a standard first-order language. Some classical theories, such as those of Tarski (1929) and Leonard and Goodman (1940), require explicit quantification over sets. (Goodman produced a set-free version of the calculus of individuals in 1951.) Others, such as Lewis's (1991), resort to the machinery of plural quantification of Boolos (1984). One can, however, avoid all this and achieve a sufficient degree of generality by relying on an axiom schema where sets are identified by predicates or open formulas. Since an ordinary first-order language has a denumerable supply of open formulas, at most denumerably many sets (in any given domain) can be specified in this way. But for most purposes this limitation is negligible, as normally we are only interested in those sets of objects or regions that we are able to specify. Thus, for most purposes the following axiom schema will do, where ‘φ’ is any formula in the language (and ‘ψ’ expresses the condition in question):

(P.14ψ) Strong ψ-Bound
(∃wφw ∧ ∀ww → ψw)) → ∃zww → Pwz)

(The first conjunct in the antecedent is simply to guarantee that ‘φ’ picks out a non-empty set.) The three binary sum axioms (P.12ξ,a), (P.12ξ,b), and (P.12ξ) can be strengthened in a similar fashion as follows:

(P.15ψ,a) Strong ψ-Suma
(∃wφw ∧ ∀ww → ψw)) → ∃zw(Pzw ↔ ∀vv → Pvw))
(P.15ψ,b) Strong ψ-Sumb
(∃wφw ∧ ∀ww → ψw)) → ∃z(∀ww → Pwz) ∧ ∀w(Pwz → ∃vv ∧ Ovw)))
(P.15ψ) Strong ψ-Sum
(∃wφw ∧ ∀ww → ψw)) → ∃zw(Ozw ↔ ∃vv ∧ Ovw))

For example, (P.15ψ) says that if there are some φ-ers, and if every φ-er satisfies condition ψ, then the φ-ers have a sum, understood as something that overlaps exactly those things that overlap some φ-er. It can be checked that all these generalized formulations include the corresponding finitary principles as special cases, taking ‘φw’ to be the formula ‘w=xw=y’ and ‘ψw’ the condition ‘(w=x → ξwy) ∧ (w=y → ξxw)’. And again, it can be shown that in the presence of the Strong Supplementation axiom, (P.15ψ) and (P.15ψ,b) are equivalent.

One could also consider here a generalized version of the Product principle (P.13ξ), asserting the conditional existence of a maximal common overlapper for any non-empty set of entities satisfying a suitable condition. Adapting from Goodman (1951: 37), such a principle could be stated as follows:

(P.16ψ) Strong ψ-Product
(∃wφw ∧ ∀ww → ψw)) → ∃zw(Pzw ↔ ∀vv → Pwv))

where ‘ψw’ must express a condition at least as strong as ‘∀vv → Owv)’ (again, unless one assumes the Bottom principle (P.10)). This principle includes the finitary version (P.13ξ) as a special case, taking ‘φw’ and ‘ψw’ as above, so the remarks we made in connection with the latter apply here. An additional remark, however, is in order. For there is a sense in which (P.16ψ) might tought to be redundant in the presence of infinitary sum principles such as (P.15ψ) and the like. Intuitively, a maximal common overlapper (i.e., a product) of a set of overlapping entities is simply a minimal underlapper (i.e., a sum) of their common parts; that is precisely the sense in which a product principle qualifies as a composition principle. Thus, intuitively, each of the infinitary sum principles above should have a substitution instance that yields (P.16ψ) as a theorem, at least when ‘ψw’ is as strong as indicated. However, it turns out that this is not generally the case unless one assumes extensionality. In particular, it is easy to see that (P.15ψ) does not generally imply (P.16ψ), for it may not even imply the binary version (P.13ξ). This can be verified by taking ‘ξxy’ and ‘ψw’ to express just the requirement of overlap, i.e., the conditions ‘Oxy’ and ‘∀vv → Owv)’, respectively, and considering again the the non-extensional model diagrammed in Figure 3. In that model, x and y do not have a ξ-product, since neither z1 nor z2 includes the other as a part. Thus, (P.13ξ) fails, which is to say that (P.16ψ) fails when ‘φ’ picks out the set {x, y}; yet (P.15ψ) holds, for both z1 and z2 are things that overlap exactly those things that overlap some common part of the φ-ers, i.e., of x and y.

In the literature, this fact has been neglected until recently (Pontow 2004). It is, nonetheless, of major significance for a full understanding of (the limits of) non-extensional mereologies. As we shall see in the next section, it is also important when it comes to the axiomatic structure mereology, including the axiomatics of the most classical theories.

4.4. Unrestricted Composition

The strongest versions of all these composition principles are obtained by asserting them as axiom schemas holding for every condition ψ, i.e., effectively, by foregoing any reference to ψ altogether. Formally this amounts in each case to dropping the second conjunct of the antecedent, i.e., to asserting the schema expressed by the relevant consequent with the only proviso that there are some φ-ers. For example, the following schema is the unrestricted version of (P.15ψ), to the effect that every specifiable non-empty set of entities has a sum:

(P.15) Unrestricted Sum
wφw → ∃zw(Ozw ↔ ∃vv ∧ Ovw))

The extension of EM obtained by adding every instance of this schema has a distinguished pedigree and is known in the literature as General Extensional Mereology, or GEM. It corresponds to the classical systems of Leśniewski and of Leonard and Goodman, modulo the underlying logic and choice of primitives. Similar theories can be obtained by extending EM with the unrestricted versions of (P.15ψ,a) and (P.15ψ,b). Two indicative examples may be found in Landman (1991) and Lewis (1991), respectively (though the latter relies on the machinery of plural quantification rather than schematic formulas), whereas a weaker theory endorsing only the unrestricted version of (P.14ψ) may be found in Whitehead (1919).

GEM is a powerful theory, and it was meant to be so by its nominalistic forerunners, who were thinking of mereology as a good alternative to set theory. How powerful is it? To answer this question, consider the following generalized sum operator:

(45) General Sum
σxφx =df ιzw(Ozw ↔ ∃vv ∧ Ovw))

Then (P.15) and (P.5) can be simplified to a single axiom schema:

(P.17) Unique Unrestricted Sum
xφx → ∃z(zxφx)

and we can introduce the following definitions:

(46) Sum
x + y =df σz(Pzx ∨ Pzy)
(47) Product
x × y =df σz(Pzx ∧ Pzy)
(48) Difference
xy =df σz(Pzx ∧ Dzy)
(49) Complement
~x =df σzDzx
(50) Universe
U =df σzPzz

Note that (46) and (47) yield the binary operators defined in (35) and (42) as special cases. Moreover, in GEM the generalized Product principle (P.16ψ) is also derivable as a theorem, with ‘ψ’ as weak as the requirement of mutual overlap, and we can introduce a corresponding functor as follows:

(51) General Product
πxφx =df σzxx → Pzx).

The full strength of the theory can then be appreciated by considering that its models are closed under each of these functors, modulo the satisfiability of the relevant conditions. To be explicit: the condition ‘DzU’ is unsatisfiable, so U cannot have a complement. Likewise products are defined only for overlappers and differences only for pairs that leave a remainder. In all other cases, however, (46)-(51) yield perfectly well-behaved functors. Since such functors are the natural mereological analogues of the familiar set-theoretic operators, with ‘σ’ in place of set abstraction, it follows that the parthood relation axiomatized by GEM has essentially the same properties as the inclusion relation in standard set theory. More precisely, it is isomorphic to the inclusion relation restricted to the set of all non-empty subsets of a given set, which is to say a complete Boolean algebra with the zero element removed—a result that can be traced back to Tarski (1935: n. 4). (Actually, Tarski's result refers to a stronger version of GEM in which infinitary sums are characterized using explicit quantification over sets, rather than schematic formulas. This is of course a relevant difference, in view of Cantor's 1891 theorem. For set-free formulations which, like those considered here, strictly adhere to a standard first-order language with a denumerable supply of open formulas, the correct way of summarizing the algebraic strength of GEM is this: Any model of this theory is isomorphic to a Boolean subalgebra of a complete Boolean algebra with the zero element removed—a subalgebra that is not necessarily complete if Zermelo-Frankel set theory with the axiom of choice is consistent. See Pontow and Schubert 2006, Theorem 34, for details and proof.)

Would we get a full Boolean algebra by supplementing GEM with the Bottom axiom (P.10), i.e., by positing the mereological equivalent of the empty set? One immediate way to answer this question is in the affirmative, but only in a trivial sense: we have already seen that (P.10) along with the Supplementation axiom (P.4) admits only of degenerate one-element models. Such is the might of the null item. On the other hand, suppose we introduce the following “non-trivial” counterparts for the parthood, overlap, and disjointness predicates:

(52) Non-trivial Parthood
Poxy =df Pxy ∧ ¬∀zPxz
(53) Non-trivial Overlap
Ooxy =dfz(Pozx ∧ Pozy)
(54) Non-trivial Disjointness
Doxy =df ¬Ooxy

and suppose we introduce a corresponding family of “non-trivial” operators for sum, product, etc. Then it can be shown that the theory obtained from GEM by adding (P.10) and replacing the (P.5) and (P.15) with the following “non-trivial” variants:

(P.5o) ¬Pyx → ∃z(Pozy ∧ ¬Oozx).
(P.15o) wφw → ∃zw(Oozw ↔ ∃vv ∧ Oovw))

is indeed a full Boolean algebra under the new operators. (See again Pontow and Schubert 2006.) This shows that, mathematically, mereology does indeed have all the resourses to stand as a robust and yet nominalistically acceptable alternative to set theory, the real source of difference being the attitude towards the nature of singletons (as already emphasized by Leśniewski 1916 and eventually clarified by Lewis 1991). As already mentioned, however, from a philosophical perspective the Bottom axiom is by no means a favorite option. The null item would have to exist “nowhere and nowhen”, said Geach (1949: 522), or perhaps “everywhere and everywhen”, and that is hard to swallow. One may try to justify the gulp in varous ways, perhaps even by construing the null item as the utimate incarnation of divine simplicity, as in Hudson (2006b: §6). But few minded philosophers would be willing to go ahead and swallow for the sole purpose of neatening up the algebra.

There are other equivalent formulations of GEM that are noteworthy. For instance, it is a theorem of every extensional mereology that parthood amounts to inclusion of overlappers:

(55) Pxy ↔ ∀z(Ozx → Ozy).

This means that in an extensional mereology ‘O’ could be used as a primitive and ‘P’ defined accordingly, as in Goodman (1951), and it can be checked that the theory defined by postulating (55) together with the Unrestricted Sum principle (P.15) and the Antisymmetry axiom (P.3) is equivalent to GEM (Eberle 1967). Another elegant axiomatization of GEM, due to an earlier work of Tarski (1929), is obtained by taking just the Transitivity axiom (P.2) together with the Sumb-analogue of the Unique Unrestricted Sum axiom (P.17). By contrast, it bears emphasis that the result of adding (P.15) to MM is not equivalent to GEM, contrary to the “standard” characterization given by Simons (1987: 37) and inherited by much literature that followed, including Casati and Varzi (1999) and an earlier version of this entry. This follows immediately from Pontow's (2004) counterexample mentioned at the end of Section 4.3, since the non-extensional model in Figure 3 satisfies (P.15), and was first noted in Pietruszczak (2000, n. 12). More generally, in Section 4.2 we have mentioned that in the presence of the ξ-Product postulate (P.13ξ), with ξ construed as overlap, the Strong Supplementation axiom (P.5) follows from the weaker Supplementation axiom (P.4). However, the model shows that the postulate is not implied by (P.15) any more than it is implied by its restricted variants (P.15ψ). Apart from its relevance to the proper characterization of GEM, this result is worth stressing also philosophically, for it means that (P.15) is by itself too weak to generate a sum out of any specifiable set of objects. In other words, fully unrestricted composition calls for extensionality, on pain of giving up both supplementation principles. The anti-extensionalist should therefore keep that in mind. (On the other hand, a friend of extensionality may welcome such a result as an argument in favor of adopting, not (P.15), but its Sumb-variant, i.e., the unrestricted version of (P.15ψ,b), for in MM that way of sanctioning unrestricted composition turns out to be enough to entail strong supplementation along with the existence of all products and, with them, of all sums. On this and related matters, indicating that the axiomatic path to “classical extensional mereology” is less clear than hitherto supposed, see Hovda 2009.)

Finally, it is worth recalling that the assumption of atomism generally allows for significant simplifications in the axiomatics of mereology. For instance, we have already seen that AEM can be simplified by subsuming (P.5) and (P.8) under a single atomistic supplementation principle, (P.5′). Likewise, it turns out that AGEM could be simplified by replacing the Unrestricted Sum postulate (P.15) with the more perspicuous

(P.15′) wφw → ∃zw(Aw → (Pwz ↔ ∃vv ∧ Pwv)))

which asserts, for any non-empty set of entities, the existence of a sum composed exactly of all the atoms that compose those entities (Eberle 1967).

4.5. Composition, Existence, and Identity

The algebraic strength of GEM, and of its weaker finitary and infinitary variants, is worth emphasizing, but it also reflects substantive mereological postulates whose philosophical underpinnings leave room for controversy. Indeed, all composition principles turn out to be controversial, just as the decomposition principles examined in Section 3. For, on the one hand, it appears that the weaker, restricted formulations, from (P.11ξ) to (P.15ψ), are just not doing enough work: not only do they depend on the specification of the relevant limiting conditions, as expressed by the predicates ‘ξ’ and ‘ψ’; they also treat such conditions as merely sufficient for the existence of bounds and sums, whereas ideally we are interested in an account of conditions that are both sufficient and necessary. On the other hand, the stronger, unrestricted formulations—most notably (P.15)—appear to go too far, as they commit the theory to the existence of a large variety of prima facie implausible, unheard-of mereological composites.

Concerning the first sort of worry, one could of course construe every restricted formulation as a biconditional expressing both a sufficient and necessary condition for the existence of an upper bound, or a sum, of a given pair or set of entities. But then the question of how such conditions should be construed becomes crucial, on pain of turning a weak sufficient condition into an exceedingly strong requirement. For example, in connection with (P.11ξ) we have mentioned the idea of construing ‘ξ’ as ‘O’, the rationale being that mereological overlap establishes an important connection between what may count as two distinct parts of a larger (integral) whole. However, as a necessary condition overlap is obviously too stringent. The top half of my body and the bottom half do not overlap, yet they do form an integral whole. The topological relation of contact might be a better candidate, as already urged in Whitehead (1919: 102). Yet even that would be too stringent. We may have misgivings about the existence of scattered entities consisting of totally unrelated parts, such as the base and the bowl of this wine glass or, worse, the head of this trout and the body of that turkey, or the collection of all my umbrellas and your left shoes. Yet in some cases such misgivings seem unjustified. In some cases, it appears perfectly natural to countenance wholes that are composed of two or more disconnected entities—a bikini, my copy of The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, a written sentence token consisting of separate word tokens (Cartwright 1975: 174f) or even the event of writing a sentence, especially a long one (Thomson 1977: 53f). More generally, intuition and common sense suggest that some mereological composites exist, not all; yet the question of which composites exist seems to be up for grabs. Consider a series of almost identical mereological aggregates that begins with a case where composition appears to obtain (e.g., the sum of all body cells that currently make up my body, the relative distance among any two neighboring ones being less than 1 nanometer) and ends in a case where composition would seem not to obtain (e.g., the sum of all body cells that currently make up my body, after their relative distance has been gradually increased to 1 kilometer). Where should we draw the line? In other words (and to limit ourselves to (P.15ψ)), what value of n would mark a change of truth-value in the soritical sequence generated by the schema

(56) The set of all φ-ers has a sum only if every φ is ψ

when ‘φ’ picks out my body cells and ‘ψ’ expresses the condition ‘less than n nanometers apart from another φ-er’? It may well be that whenever some entities fuse into a bigger one, it is just a brute fact that they do so (Markosian 1998b). But if we are unhappy with brute facts, if we are looking for a principled way of drawing the line so as to specify the circumstances under which the facts obtain, then the question is truly challenging. (This is, effectively, the Special Composition Question of van Inwagen 1987, 1990, an early formulation of which may be found in Hestevold 1981. In this literature, as well as in much literature that followed, such as Sanford 1993, Horgan 1993, Merricks 2001, or Markosian 2008, the question has been focused on the conditions of composition for material objects; more recently, Chant 2006 has raised it in relation to the ontology of actions. In its most general form, however, the question may be asked with respect to any domain of entities whatsoever.)

Concerning the second worry, to the effect that unrestricted sum principles such as (P.15) would go too far, its earliest formulations are as old the principles themselves (see again Lowe 1953 and Rescher 1955 on the calculus of individuals, with replies in Goodman 1956, 1958). Here one popular line of response, inspired by Quine (1981: 10), is simply to insist that (P.15) is the only plausible option, disturbing as this might sound. Granted, common sense and intuition dictate that some and only some mereological composites exist, but we have just seen that it is hard to draw a principled line. On pain of accepting brute facts, it would appear that any attempt to do away with queer sums by restricting composition would have to do away with too much else besides the queer entities; for queerness comes in degrees whereas parthood and existence cannot be a matter of degree (though we shall return to this issue in Section 5). As Lewis (1986: 213) puts it, no restriction on composition can be vague, but unless it is vague, it cannot fit the intuitive desiderata. Thus, no restriction on composition could serve the intuitions that motivate it; any restriction would be arbitrary, hence gratuitous. And if that is the case, then the only non-arbitrary answer to the question, Under what conditions does a set have a sum?, would be the radical one afforded by (P.15): Under any condition whatsoever. (This line of reasoning is further elaborated in Lewis 1991: 79ff and is particularly congenial to authors adhering to a four-dimensional ontology of material objects; see e.g. Heller 1990: 49f, Jubien 1993: 83ff; Sider 2001: 121ff, and Hudson 2001: 99ff. For a recent endorsement see also Van Cleve 2008: §3.) Besides, it might be observed that any complaints about the counterintuitiveness of unrestricted composition rest on psychological biases that should have no bearing on the question of how the world is actually structured. Granted, we may feel uneasy about treating trout-turkeys and shoe-umbrellas as bona fide entities, but this is no ground for doing away with them altogether. We may ignore such entities when we tally up the things we care about in ordinary contexts, but this is not to say they do not exist. In the words of Van Cleve (1986: 145), even if one came up “with a formula that jibed with all ordinary judgments about what counts as a unit and what does not”, what would that show? The psychological factors that guide our judgments of unity simply do not have the sort of ontological significance that should be guiding our construction of a good mereological theory. (One residual problem, that such observations do not seem to address, concerns the status of cross-categorial sums. Absent any restriction, a pluralist ontology might involve trout-turkeys and shoe-umbrellas along with trout-promenades, shoe-virtues, color-propositions, and what not. At the limit, the universal entity U would involve parts of all ontological kinds. And there would seem to be nothing arbitrary, let alone any psychological biases, in the thought that at least such monsters should be banned. For a statement of this view, see Simons 2003; for a reply, see Varzi 2006b.)

A third worry, which applies to all (restricted or unrestricted) composition principles, is this. Mereology is supposed to be ontologically neutral. But it is a fact that the models of a theory cum composition principles tend to be more densely populated than those of the corresponding composition-free theories. If the ontological commitment of a theory is measured in Quinean terms—via the dictum “to be is to be a value of a bound variable” (1939: 708)—il follows that such theories involve greater ontological commitments than their composition-free counterparts. This is particularly worrying in the absence of the Strong Supplementation postulate (P.5)—hence the extensionality principle (27)—for then the ontological exhuberance of such theories may yield massive multiplication (see again section 3.2). But the worry is a general one: composition, whether restricted or unrestricted, is not an innocent mereological operation.

There are two lines of response to this worry (see Varzi 2000 and references therein). First, it could be observed that the ontological exuberance associated with the relevant composition principles is not substantive—that the increase of entities in the domain of a mereological theory cum composition principles involves no substantive additional commitments besides those already involved in the underlying theory without composition. This is obvious in the case of modest principles in the spirit of (P.11ξ) and (P.14ψ), to the effect that all suitably related entities must have an upper bound. After all, there are small things and there are large things, and to say that we can always find a large thing encompassing any given small things of the right sort is not to say much. But the same could be said with respect to those stronger principles that require the large thing to be composed exactly of the small things—to be their mereological sum. At least, this seems reasonable in the presence of extensionality. For in that case it can be argued that even a sum is, in an important sense, nothing over and above its constituent parts. The sum is just the parts “taken together” (Lewis 1991: 81); it is the parts “counted loosely” (Baxter 1988: 580); it is, effectively, the same portion of reality, which is strictly a multitude and loosely a single thing. This thesis, known in the literature as “composition as identity”, is by no means uncontroversial (see e.g. van Inwagen 1994, Forrest 1996b, Yi 1999, Merricks 2000, McDaniel 2008). If accepted, however, the charge of ontological exuberance loses its force: mereology is ontologically “innocent”. Indeed, if composition is identity, then the charge of ontological extravagance discussed in connection with unrestricted composition loses its force, too. For if a sum is nothing over and above its constituent proper parts, whatever they are, and if the latter are all right, there is nothing extravagant in countenancing the former: it just is them, whatever they are.

Secondly, it could be observed that the objection in question bites at the wrong level. If, given some entities, positing their sum were to count as further ontological commitment, then, given a mereologically composite entity, positing its proper parts should also count as further commitment. After all, every entity is distinct from its proper parts. But then the worry has nothing to do with the composition axioms; it is, rather, a question of whether there is any point in countenancing a whole along with its proper parts, or vice versa. And if the answer is in the negative, then there seems to be little use for mereology tout court. From the point of view of the present worry, it would appear that the only thoroughly parsimonious account would be one that rejects any mereological complex whatsoever. Philosophically such an account is defensible (see Rosen and Dorr 2002) and the corresponding axiom

(P.18) Strong Atomicity

is compatible with M (up to EM and more). But the immediate corollary

(57) Pxyx=y

says it all: nothing would be part of anything else and parthood would collapse to identity. (This account is sometimes referred to as mereological nihilism, in contrast to the mereological universalism expressed by (P.15) and the like; see van Inwagen 1990: 72ff.[6])

In recent years, further worries have been raised concerning mereological theories with substantive composition principles—especially concerning the the full strength of GEM. Among other things, it has been argued that the principle of unrestricted composition does not sit well with certain fundamental intuitions about persistence through time (van Inwagen 1990, 75ff), that it implies mereological essentialism (Merricks 1999), or that it leads to paradoxes similar to the ones afflicting naïve set theory (Bigelow 1996). Such arguments are still the subject of on-going controversy and a detailed examination is beyond the scope of this entry. For some discussion of the first sort of argument, see e.g. Rea (1998), McGrath (1998, 2001), Hudson (2001: 93ff), and Elder (2008). Hudson (2001: 95ff) also contains a discussion of the last point.

5. Indeterminacy and Fuzziness

We conclude by briefly considering a question that is not directly related to specific mereological principles but, rather, to the underlying notion of parthood that mereology seeks to systematize. All the theories examined above, from M to GEM and its variants, appear to assume that parthood is a perfectly determinate relation: given any two entities x and y, there is always an objective, determinate fact of the matter as to whether or not x is part of y. However, in some cases this seems problematic. Perhaps there is no room for indeterminacy in the idealized mereology of space and time as such; but when it comes to the mereology of ordinary spatio-temporal particulars (for instance) the picture looks different. Think of objects such as clouds, forests, heaps of sand. What exactly are their constitutive parts? What are the mereological boundaries of a desert, a river, a mountain? Some stuff is positively part of Mount Everest and some stuff is positively not part of it, but there is borderline stuff whose mereological relationship to Everest seems indeterminate. Even living organisms may, on closer look, give rise to indeterminacy issues. Surely Tibble's body comprises his tail and surely it does not comprise Pluto's. But what about the whisker that is coming loose? It used to be a firm part of Tibbles and soon it will drop off for good, yet meanwhile its mereological relation to the cat is dubious. And what goes for material bodies goes for everything. What are the mereological boundaries of a neighborhood, a college, a social organization? What about the boundaries of events such as promenades, concerts, wars? What about the extensions of such ordinary concepts as baldness, wisdom, personhood?

These worries are of no little import, and it might be thought that some of the principles discussed above would have to be revisited accordingly—not because of their ontological import but because of their classical, bivalent presuppositions. For example, the extensionality theorem of EM, (27), says that composite things with the same proper parts are identical, but in the presence of indeterminacy this may call for qualifications. The model in Figure 6, left, depicts x and y as non-identical by virtue of their having distinct determinate parts; yet one might prefer to describe a situation of this sort as one in which the identity between x and y is itself indeterminate, owing to the partly indeterminate status of the two outer atoms. Conversely, in the model on the right x and y have the same determinate proper parts, yet again one might prefer to suspend judgment concerning their identity, owing to the indeterminate status of the middle atom.

Figure 6
Figure 6. Objects with indeterminate parts (dashed lines).

Now, it is clear that a lot here depends on how exactly one understands the relevant notion of indeterminacy. There are, in fact, two ways of understanding a claim of the form

(58) It is indeterminate whether a is part of b,

depending on whether the phrase ‘it is indeterminate whether’ is assigned wide scope, as in (58a), or narrow scope, as in (58b):

(58a) It is indeterminate whether b is such that a is part of it.
(58b) b is such that it is indeterminate whether a is part of it.

On the first understanding—defended by authors such as Hughes (1986), Lewis (1993a) or McGee (1997)—the indeterminacy is merely de dicto, hence there is no reason to suppose that it is due to some objective deficiency in the parthood relation—no reason to require revisions in the apparatus of mereology itself. Perhaps the predicate ‘part’ is not fully precise after all, or perhaps ‘a’ or ‘b’ are vague terms. For example, the statement

(59) The loose wisker is part of Tibbles

may owe its indeterminacy to the semantic indeterminacy of ‘Tibbles’: our linguistic practices do not, on closer look, specify exactly which portion of reality is currently picked out by that name. In particular, they do not specify whether the name picks out something whose current parts include the wisker that is coming loose and, as a consequence, the truth conditions of (59) are not fully determined. But this is not to say that the stuff out there is mereologically indeterminate. Each one of a large variety of slightly distinct chunks of reality has an equal claim to being the referent of the vaguely introduced name ‘Tibbles’, and each such thing has a perfectly precise mereological structure: some of them currently include the lose whisker among their parts, others do not. (This is also one way of dealing with the so-called “problem of the many” of Unger 1980 and Geach 1980.) Likewise, with reference to Figure 6, the dashed lines would be “defects” in the models, not in the reality that they are meant to represent. In short, on a de dicto understanding, mereological indeterminacy need not be due to the way the world is (or isn't): it may just be an instance of a more general and widespread phenomenon of indeterminacy that affects our language and our conceptual apparatus at large. As such, it can be accounted for in terms of whatever theory—semantic, pragmatic, or even epistemic—one finds best suited for dealing with the phenomenon in its generality. (See the entry on Vagueness.) The principles of mereology, understood as a theory of the relation that the predicate ‘part’ is meant to express, would hold regardless.

By contrast, on the second way of understanding claims of the form (58), corresponding to (58b), the relevant indeterminacy is genuinely de re: there is no objective fact of the matter as to whether a is part of b, regardless of the words we use to describe the situation. For example, on this view (59) would be indeterminate, not because of the vagueness of ‘Tibbles’, but because of the vagueness of Tibbles itself: there simply would be no fact of the matter as to whether the whisker that is coming loose is part of the cat. Similarly, the dashed lines in Figure 6 would not reflect a “defect” in the models but a genuine, objective deficiency in the mereological organization of the underlying reality. As it turns out, this is not a popular view: already Russell (1923) argued that the very idea of wordly indeterminacy betrays a “fallacy of verbalism”, and some have gone as far as saying that de re indeterminacy is simply not “intelligible” (Dummett 1975: 314; Lewis 1986: 212) or ruled out a priori (Jackson 2001: 657). Nonetheless, several philosophers feel otherwise and the idea that the world may include vague entities relative to which the parthood relation is not fully determined has received considerable attention in recent literature, from Johnsen (1989), Tye (1990), and van Inwagen (1990: ch. 17) to Morreau (2002), Akiba (2004), Smith (2005), and Hyde (2008, §5.3), inter alia. Even those who do not find that thought attractive might wonder whether an a priori ban on it might be unwarranted—a deep-seated metaphysical prejudice, as Burgess (1990: 263) put it. (Dummett himself withdrew his earlier remark and spoke of a “prejudice” in his 1981: 440.) It is therefore worth asking: How would such a thought impact on the mereological theses considered in the preceding sections?

There is, unfortunately, no straightforward way of answering this question. Broadly speaking, two main sorts of answer may be considered, depending on whether (i) one simply takes the indeterminacy of the parthood relation to be the reason why certain statements involving the parthood predicate lack a definite truth-value, or (ii) one understands the indeterminacy so that parthood becomes a genuine matter of degree. Both options, however, may be articulated in a variety of ways.

On option (i) (initially favored by such authors as Johnsen and Tye), it could once again be argued that no modification of the basic mereological machinery is strictly necessary, as long as each postulates is taken to characterize the parthood relation insofar as it behaves in a determinate fashion. Thus, on this approach, (P.1) should be understood as asserting that everything is definitely part of itself, (P.2) that any definite part of any definite part of a thing is itself a definite part of that thing, (P.3) that things that are definitely part of each other are identical, and so on, and the truth of such principles is not affected by the consideration that parthood need not be fully determinate. There is, however, some leeway as to how such basic postulates could be integrated with further principles concerning explicitly the indeterminate cases. For example, do objects with indeterminate parts have indeterminate identity? Following Evans (1978), many philosophers have taken the answer to be obviously in the affirmative. Others, such as Cook (1986), Sainsbury (1989), or Tye (2000), hold the opposite view: vague objects are mereologically elusive, but they have the same precise identity conditions as any other object. Still others maintain that the answer depends on the strength of the underlying mereology. For instance, Parsons (2000: §5.6.1) argues that on a theory such as EM cum unrestricted binary sums,[7] the de re indeterminacy of (59) would be inherited by

(60) Tibbles is identical with the sum of Tibbles and the loose wisker.

A related question is: Does countenancing objects with indeterminate parts entail that composition be vague, i.e., that there is sometimes no matter of fact whether some things make up a whole? A popular view, much influenced by Lewis (1986: 212), says that it does. Others, such as Morreau (2002: 338), argue instead that the link between vague parthood and vague composition is unwarranted: perhaps the de re indeterminacy of (59) is inherited by some instances of

(61) Tibbles is composed of x and the loose whisker.

(for example, x could be something that is just like Tibbles except that the whisker is determinately not part of it); yet this would not amount to saying that composition is vague, for the following might nonetheless be true:

(62) There is something composed of x and the loose whisker.

Finally, there is of course the general question of how one should handle logically complex statements concerning, at least in part, mereologically indeterminate objects. A natural choice is to rely on a three-valued semantics of some sort, the third value being, strictly speaking, not a truth value but rather a truth-value gap. In this spirit, both Johnsen and Tye endorse the truth-tables of Kleene (1938) while Hyde those of Łukasiewicz (1920). However, it is worth stressing that other choices are available, including non-truth-functional accounts. For example, Akiba (2000) and Morreau (2002) recommend a form of “supervaluationism”. This was originally put forward by Fine (1975) as a theory for dealing with de dicto indeterminacy, the idea being that a statement involving vague expressions should count as true/false if and only it is true/false on every “precisification” of those expressions. Still, a friend of de re indeterminacy may exploit the same idea by speaking instead of precisifications of the underlying reality—what Sainsbury (1989) calls “approximants”, Cohn and Gotts (1996) “crispings”, and Parsons (2000) “resolutions” of vague objects. As a result, one would be able to explain why, for example, (63) appears to be true and (64) false (assuming that Tibbles's head is definitely part of Tibbles), whereas both conditionals would be equally indeterminate on Kleene's semantics and equally true on Łukasiewicz's:

(63) If the loose whisker is part of the head and the head is part of Tibbles, then the whisker itself is part of Tibbles.
(64) If the loose whisker is part of the head and the head is part of Tibbles, then the whisker itself is not part of Tibbles.

As for option (ii)—to the effect that de re mereological indeterminacy is a matter of degree—the picture is different. Here the main motivation is that whether or not something is part of something else is really not an all-or-nothing affair. If Tibbles has two whiskers that are coming loose, then we may want to say that neither is a definite part of Tibbles. But if one whisker is looser than the other, then it would seem plausible to say that the first is part of Tibbles to a lesser degree than the second, and one may want the postulates of mereology to be sensitive to such distinctions. This is, for example, van Inwagen's (1990) view of the matter, which results in a fuzzification of parthood that parallels in many ways to the fuzzification of membership in Zadeh's (1965) set theory, and it is this sort of intuition that also led to the development of such formal theories as Polkowsky and Skowron's (1994) “rough mereology” or Smith's (2005) theory of “concrete parts”. Again, there is room for some leeway concerning matters of detail, but in this case the main features of the approach are fairly clear and uniform across the literature. For let π be the characteristic function associated with the parthood relation denoted by the basic mereological primitive, ‘P’. Then, if classically this function is bivalent, which can be expressed by saying that π(x, y) always takes, say, the value 1 or the value 0 according to whether or not x is part of y, to say that parthood may be indeterminate is to say that π need not be fully bivalent. And whereas option (i) simply takes this to mean that π may sometimes be undefined, option (ii) can be characterized by saying that the range of π may include values intermediate between 0 and 1, i.e., effectively, values from the closed real interval [0, 1]. In other words, on this latter approach π is still a perfectly standard, total function, and the only serious question that needs to be addressed is the genuinely mereological question of what conditions should be assumed to characterize its behavior—a question not different from the one that we have considered for the bivalent case througout the preceding sections.

This is not to say that the question is an easy one. As it turns out, the “fuzzification” of the core theory M is rather straightforward, but its extensions give rise to various issues. Thus, consider the partial ordering axioms (P.1)-(P.3). Classically, these correspond to the following conditions on π :

(P.1π) π(x, x) = 1
(P.2π) π(x, z) ≥ min(π(x, y), π(y, z))
(P.3π) If π(x, y) = 1 and π(y, x) = 1, then x = y

and one could argue that the very same conditions may be taken to fix the basic properties of parthood regardless of whether π is bivalent. Perhaps one may consider weakening (P.2π) as follows (Polkowsky and Skowron 1994):

(P.2π′) If π(y, z) = 1, then π(x, z) ≥ π(x, y)

or one may consider strengthening (P.3π) as follows (Smith 2005):[8]

(P.3π′) If π(x, y) > 0 and π(y, x) > 0, then x = y.

But that is about it: there is little room for further adjustments. Things immediately get complicated, though, as soon as we move beyond M. Take, for instance, the supplementation principle (P.4) of MM. One natural way of expressing it in terms of π is as follows:

(P.4π) If π(x, y) = 1 and xy, then π(z, y) = 1 for some z such that, for all w, either π(w, z) = 0 or π(w, x) = 0.

There are, however, fifteen other ways of expressing (P.4) in terms of π, obtained by re-writing one or both occurrences of ‘= 1’ as ‘> 0’ and one or both occurences of ‘= 0’ as ‘< 1’. In the presence of bivalence, these would all be equivalent ways of saying the same thing. However, such alternative formulations would not coincide if π is allowed to take non-integral values, and the question of which version(s) best reflect the supplementation intuition would have to be carefully examined. (See e.g. the discussion in Smith 2005: 397.) And this is just the beginning: it is clear that similar issues arise with most other principles discussed in the previous sections, such as complementation, density, or the various composition principles. (See e.g. Polkowsky and Skowron 1994: 86 for a formulation of the unrestricted sum axiom (P.15).)

On the other hand, it is worth noting that precisely because the difficulty is mainly technical—the framework itself being fairly firm—now some of the questions raised in connection with option (i) tend to be less open to controversy. For example, the question of whether mereological indeterminacy implies vague identity is generally answered in the negative, especially if one adheres to the spirit of extensionality. For then is natural to say that non-atomic objects are identical if and only if they have exactly the same parts to the same degree—and that is not a vague matter (a point already made in Williamson 1994: 255). In other words, given that classically the extensionality principle (32) corresponds to the following condition:

(32π) If there is a z such that either π(z, x) = 1 or π(z, y) = 1, then x = y if and only if, for every z, π(z, x) = π(z, y)

it seems perfectly natural to stick to this condition even if the range of π is extended from {0, 1} to [0, 1]. Likewise, the question of whether mereological indeterminacy implies vague composition or vague existence is generally answered in the affirmative. Van Inwagen (1990: 228) takes this to be a rather obvious consequence of the approach, but Smith (2005: 399ff) goes further and provides a detailed analysis of how one can calculate the degree to which a given non-empty set of things has a sum, i.e., the degree of existence of the sum. (Roughly, the idea is to begin with the sum as it would exist if every element of the set were a definite part of it, and then calculate the actual degree of existence of the sum as a function of the degree to which each element of the set is actually part of it).

The one question that remains widely open is how all of this should be reflected in the semantics of our language, specifically the semantics of logically complex statements. As a matter of fact, there is a tendency to regard this question as part and parcel of the more general problem of choosing the appropriate semantics for fuzzy logic, which typically amounts to an infinitary generalization of some truth-functional three-valued semantics. The range of possibilities, however, is broader, and even here there is room for non-truth-functional approaches—including degree-theoretic variants of supervaluationism (as recommended e.g. in Sanford 1993: 225).


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artifact | Boolean algebra: the mathematics of | boundary | change | identity | identity: over time | Leśniewski, Stanisław | logic: fuzzy | logic and ontology | many, problem of | mereology: medieval | nominalism: in metaphysics | object | set theory | Sorites paradox | temporal parts | vagueness