Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri Oct 10, 2008; substantive revision Fri Nov 21, 2008

Few moral judgments are more intuitively obvious and more widely shared than that promises ought to be kept. It is in part this fixed place in our intuitive judgments that makes promises of particular interest to philosophers, as well as a host of social scientists and other theorists. Another feature of promises that make them a topic of philosophical concern is their role in producing trust, and by so doing facilitating social coordination and cooperation. For this reason promises and related phenomena, such as vows, oaths, pledges, contracts, treaties and agreements more generally are important elements of justice and the law, and, at least in the Social Contract tradition, of the political order as well.

Promises are of special interest to ethical theorists, as they are commonly taken to impose moral obligations. Thus an explanation of how such obligations come about and how they function is necessary for a complete moral theory. The philosophical work on this is a body of literature that spans the ages. Outside of normative ethical theory and the related fields of legal theory and political philosophy, work on promises has been has also been done in the philosophy of language, action theory, rationality theory, game theory and other areas.

1. Promises and Promissory Obligations

For ethical theorists the central task is an explanation of promissory obligations: How is it that we come to have a moral obligation to do what we promise we will? The question is particularly difficult because promissory obligations differ from other sorts of moral obligations in a number of ways. Unlike paradigmatic moral duties, the duty not to harm for example, promissory obligations are not owed equally to everyone, but rather only those we have promised. For this reason promissory obligations are often categorized as ‘special’ obligations, of a piece with the obligations owed to family and friends. This feature makes promissory obligations especially problematic for consequentialist theories of morality. (See the entry on special obligations in this Encyclopedia.)

Further, promissory obligations are voluntary; we don't have to make promises, but we must keep them when we do. Moreover, promissory obligations aren't just contingent upon acts of the will, like the obligations we might incur by deliberately breaking another's property, but (at least it seems on first reflection) they are immediately created by acts of the will. When I promise to do something, it seems that by so doing I have created the obligation to do it. This feature makes promissory obligations a special puzzle for naturalistic ethical theories that hope to explain moral obligations without recourse to super-natural entities. The idea that we simply manufacture promissory obligations by speaking them, like an incantation, is decidedly mysterious. As Hume acidly remarked in the Treatise:

I shall further observe, that, since every new promise imposes a new obligation of morality on the person who promises, and since this new obligation arises from his will; it is one of the most mysterious and incomprehensible operations that can possibly be imagined, and may even be compared to transubstantiation or holy orders, where a certain form of words, along with a certain intention, changes entirely the nature of an external object, and even of a human creature. (Treatise, 3.2.5–14/15–524, emphasis in the original)

2. The Traditional theory—Virtue and the Natural Law

The traditional account of promissory obligation (the one Hume is mocking in the quote above) is the Natural Law view, and as such is originally Aristotelian. For Aristotle promise-keeping is mandated by the virtues, in particular honesty and justice (as well as liberality in cases of purely gratuitous promises):

Let us discuss them both, but first of all the truthful man. We are not speaking of the man who keeps faith in his agreements, i.e., in the things that pertain to justice or injustice (for this would belong to another excellence), but the man who in the matters in which nothing of this sort is at stake is true both in word and in life because his character is such. But such a man would seem to be as a matter of fact equitable. For the man who loves truth, and is truthful where nothing is at stake, will still more be truthful where something is at stake; he will avoid falsehood as something base, seeing that he avoided it even for its own sake; and such a man is worthy of praise. He inclines rather to understate the truth; for this seems in better taste because exaggerations are wearisome. (Nichomachean Ethics, iv. vii, 1127a-1127b)

The basic structure of the Aristotelian promissory theory is modified by Scholastic theorists, most importantly Aquinas (cf. Aquinas, ST II, q.88 & q.110). Aquinas used Aristotelian assumptions and techniques to expand and detail the theory, deriving from the intentions of the promiser and the underpinning virtues a ‘natural law’ governing promise keeping (cf. Gordley 1991, p.10ff).

Aquinas' Natural Law theory had substantial impact beyond ethical theory, in the realm of legal theory and jurisprudence (cf. Fried, 1981, Atiyah, 1984, Gordley, 1991). The later Scholastics would use Aquinas' insights and methods to develop a theoretical understanding of contract law, the effects of which are still evident in legal scholarship on contract law today (see Section 6.1, below). Later important commentators in the Natural Law tradition on promising include Grotius (De iure naturae, ii. xi.), Pufendorf (De iure naturae et gentium, iii. v. 9), Stair (Institutions of the Laws of Scotland, I. X.1) and others. For an excellent overview of these issues, see Chapter 1 of Gordley 1991.

While the Natural Law view began to wane in philosophical popularity during the Enlightenment with the gradual rejection of the Aristotelian metaphysics and methodology that underlay it, it never completely disappeared, and as noted the tradition was especially influential among legal theorists. There is also some important contemporary work being done in the tradition as well, especially Finnis 1980.

3. Contract Theory

The 17th Century saw the emergence of a new strand of moral theory, one that employed the notion of a mutual agreement or contract between the members of a community as a device for grounding moral principles. This ‘social contract’ movement also produced new approaches to promissory theory, but we should preface our discussion of these by distinguishing between two different types of projects that have historically occupied social contract theorists.

The first project is an attempt to ground political, legal and other justice-based obligations in the prior obligation to honor agreements. In this endeavor, the obligation to honor one's agreements is assumed independently of any appeal to the social contract, and the aim is to argue that the sorts of political and legal arrangements that exist between the citizen and the state are in fact agreements of the sort that would invoke the obligation. The figure most immediately associated with this project is Locke, especially in the Two Treaties on Government. The other project is to make the social contract out to be the ground of some (or all) moral principles, including (what is salient for our purposes) the principle mandating that we keep our promises or agreements. Hobbes' theory is the paradigm here, and he has a radical one—grounding all moral and political principles in the same way. Hume and Rawls (among others) offer social contract theories of more limited scope, as grounding the principles of ‘justice’ alone. Both projects attempt to ground moral principles in the social contract, but the Lockean one does so by appealing to the antecedently given obligation to honor agreements, while the Hobbesian project attempts to explain the duty of fidelity itself, as one of a piece with other moral principles, in terms of the social contract. It is these latter sorts of social contract theories that are our focus here, since they contain the new approaches to explaining promissory obligation.

Of the latter sort of contract theories, we should further make a distinction between Contractarians and Contractualists. Contractarians assume that the rules of morality must appeal to the rational self interest of all parties to the contract, and that people will accept them in pursuit of their own ends. Contractualists claim that the rules of morality are those that would or could be defensible to all others in the bargaining arrangement. The two sorts of contract theory have two different explanations of promissory obligations.

And we should lastly note that there seems to be an obvious circularity worry for contract theorists in their attempts to explain promissory obligation—since a contract (or agreement, or pact, or covenant, etc.) seems to be just the same sort of thing as a promise, or at least it would seem that they are closely enough related that one would be barred from using one of them to ‘explain’ the other on pain of vacuity. And indeed, an objection of this sort has been made to the Rawlsian contractualist approach (see section 3.4 below). But this apparent circularity is perhaps deceiving. To see why, we first need to distinguish between actual, flesh-and-blood arrangements, in the law or in society more generally, that we call ‘contracts’, and the theoretical apparatus that contract theorists use to ground moral principles, which is also called (more metaphorically) a ‘contract’. It's obviously viciously circular to ground promissory obligations in a contract of the former sort, but not the latter. Of course, to avoid this sort of circularity, the ‘contract’ invoked by contract theorists can't do its work by appealing to the fact that one has an obligation one to keep one's word in an agreement. But there are other, non-circular ways to appeal to the idea of the contract. Contractarians, for example, appeal to the rationality (in some utility-maximization sense of that notion) of obeying the terms of the ‘contract’ (i.e., honoring moral principles), while Contractualists generally appeal to the ‘reasonableness’ or the ‘fairness’ of the principles that are manifest in the social contract. Neither approach suffers from the shallow sort of circularity of just described, that of assuming the normative force they set out to explain.

3.1 Contractarianism

Contractarians explain promissory obligations in the same manner as other moral obligations grounded in the social contract—by arguing for the rationality (in the utility-maximization sense) of accepting the rule that we ought to keep our promises. The argument for the promising rule goes by appeal to the value that the practice of promising has for us as members of a society. The chief value of the practice of promising is social coordination and cooperation—promises (and cognate phenomena like contracts and agreements) allow people to trust one another, which in turn allows for all sorts of cooperative benefits, e.g. divisions of labor, solutions to coordination problems and collective action problems, exits from prisoners dilemmas, etc. The theory is first offered by Hobbes (Leviathan xiii-xv).

Hobbes' framework for assessing the rationality of moral rules assumes that the over-arching goal is to exit the state of nature into a civil society. In the Hobbesian state of nature, our expansive natural rights, our over-large appetites and our natural inclination to dominate result in constant, irresolvable conflict, what Hobbes called the war of all against all (xiii, p.88–89). Against this backdrop Hobbes claims that practices that allow us to escape this condition are ‘Laws of Nature’, i.e., mandates of rational self-interest, and that keeping promises is one of those practices (xv, p. 100 ff). Hobbes takes promises to be a part of the larger and more complex system of contract. A contract for Hobbes is a mutual transfer of rights in things. A covenant is a contract where one of the parties must perform after the other, and thus promises the first performer his later performance. Hobbes takes covenants to be the ‘fountain and original of justice’, and the keeping of covenants is a mandate of the Law of Nature (xiv, p. 100).

Hobbes' picture is complicated by the fact that he doesn't think that the appreciation of the fact that promise-keeping is rationally sufficient to guarantee compliance. He thinks this because he thinks that people are passionate creatures whose reason is often overwhelmed by those passions, and because he conceives of covenants as cases where the trust the promisee puts himself at risk by trusting the promiser. Such risk is forbidden by the first law of nature (self defense) unless the promisee has some very good reason to assume that the promiser won't betray his trust. And since mere reason isn't enough (ex hypothesi) to make that guarantee, promisees can't trust promisers. As such, Hobbes claims that promises made merely on the grounds of trust are not promises at all. (cf. xiv, p. 96, & xv, p. 102) Hobbes' solution is to ground promissory obligations not directly in the rationality of keeping promises, but rather in the rational fear of the sovereign, whose job it is to enforce contracts by punishing renegers. In this way, Hobbes has an indirect justification of promissory obligations by appeal to the rationality of promise-keeping: Rationality mandates the establishment of a sovereign, who will enforce contracts by threat of punishment. The existence of the plausible threat from the sovereign in turn makes promise keeping rational. So promises aren't a way to exit the state of nature, rather they are a necessary component of civil society made possible by the exit from the state of nature by the establishment of a sovereign.

Contractarian ethical theory underwent a revival in the 20th Century, with sophisticated versions developed in Narveson 1988 and Gauthier 1986. Contemporary theories, like Gauthier's, differ from traditional Hobbesianism in significant ways. For example, Gauthier premises the bargaining position not as an escape from the state of nature, but rather as a method for achieving an acceptable share of the potential cooperative surplus. Also, Gauthier proposes that the bargainers are constrained by a ‘Lockean’ proviso. The proviso forbids bettering one's bargaining position by worsening the position of other bargainers. The resultant theory is not dependent on the coercive force of an absolute political sovereign, and foresees a relatively liberal social order. But the general thrust of the theory of promissory obligations remains the same in the later theory—promising is a rational strategy, and thus promise-keeping is a moral obligation.

3.2 Critiques of Contractarian Theory

A traditional problem for the contractarian approach is that it has difficulty accounting for cases where the breaking of an individual promise looks like it would produce more utility for the agent than keeping the promise. Intuitively it seems that many cases where keeping a promise would be less than completely advantageous to the promiser are still cases where the promiser has an obligation to keep them. Yet if we take it that morality only demands what is rational to further our interests, then it seems that the contractarian must say that in such sub-optimal cases, the promiser has no obligation to keep her promise.

Hobbes, who derided the rhetorical proponent of this problem as a fool, claims that it is never rational to break a promise (Lev. xv, p. 101 ff). Hobbes defends this firstly by reminding us that on his view, covenants made outside of the reach of a civil power with the capacity to enforce the contract by punishing the parties are not covenants at all, and thus all contracting parties have the reason of the sovereign's potential punishment to keep their promise. And even in ‘state-of-war’ cases, promise-keeping is always rational because the state of war requires one to band together with ‘confederates’ for safety, and having a reputation as a promise breaker will make such confederacy impossible.

This leaves only cases where a person feels that they might evade the sovereign's punishment, and that the benefits they would receive from so doing outweigh the dangers of being caught and punished. Hobbes then points out that the correct standard for judging the rationality of an action is one that rests on the expected returns of the action, and not the actual ones, and that in cases where promise breakers eluded detection the action could still be irrational, as the expected returns were insufficient to justify the risk. The tough cases for Hobbes are those where breaking a promise would result in the promise breaker escaping the reach of the sovereign altogether by becoming a sovereign, i.e., cases of revolution or usurpation. In such cases, Hobbes argues, promise breaking is still not rational because gaining a throne by revolution inspires those under the new tyrant to repeat the process, and unseat him in turn. These moves just don't seem sufficient to establish the general claim that the apparent expected return from breaking a promise is never the larger value, and indeed the general consensus among contemporary scholars is that Hobbes' reply to the fool is unsatisfying (cf. Baier 1985, pp. 206–7; Hampton 1986, pp. 78–9; Gauthier 1988, pp. 87–8, 1990, pp. 12, 136ff) although there have been some recent attempts to rehabilitate the view (cf. Kavka 1986, Hoekstra 1997).

Contemporary contractarian theory has a different sort of answer to the problem of the fool, invoking not the threat of the sovereign's punishment, but the advantage of promise-keeping as a cooperative endeavor. Gauthier (1986, pp.164ff), as an example, argues that promise-keeping is rational even in cases where the net value of reneging is larger than that of honoring the promise. Gauthier's reasoning is roughly the following: By constraining their pursuit of utility maximization in this fashion (always keeping promises regardless of the local utility value of doing so), agents can (ceteris paribus) jointly reach solutions to prisoner's dilemmas that are out of reach for the ‘foolish’ straightforward utility maximizers. What's required to escape a prisoner's dilemma is a reason for the participants to trust one another, specifically to trust that the other will do what they promise, even though it doesn't maximize their utility to do so. So only a partner who was disposed to keep promises even in cases where doing so wouldn't maximize his utility (i.e., a non-foolish promiser) could be relied upon to do his part in a prisoner's dilemma scenario, and thus only those sorts of promisers could reach the agreements that constitute these solutions.

3.3 Contractualism

The other branch of contract theory, contractualism, grounds promissory obligations by a similar appeal to the utility and value of the practice of promising, but in a less direct fashion. For contractualists, what makes a moral principle valid is its acceptability to those who are party to the contract, or to the bargaining situation that establishes it. Thus on such an approach the utility of the promising convention serves chiefly as a reason for the contractors to endorse a principle mandating that promises be kept, or as an argument that the putative contractors would do so. Perhaps the most influential contractualist theory of promising belongs to Rawls.

Although Rawls originally defended a Rule Utilitarian theory of promissory obligation (cf. Rawls 1955, see Sections 4.3 and 5.2 below), in A Theory of Justice (1971) he takes promissory obligations to be a matter of justice, and as such grounded in the (contractual) theory of justice, rather than in any more general moral theory. Rawls famously conceives of the principles of justice as the result of the deliberative choice of a representative group of the members of the society. The conditions of deliberation are together called the Original Position (OP), and agents in the OP are constrained in terms of the information they have, as information Rawls deems irrelevant to their deliberations on justice is excluded by what he calls the Veil of Ignorance. Agents in the OP first choose principles of what Rawls calls the basic structure of society, principles that determine in broad outline what the just arrangements of the basic institutions of the society will be, and then go on to choose other sorts of principles, e.g. principles governing the just conduct of individuals, as well as those governing justice in international affairs.

Unlike some contractualists (cf. Scanlon 2000, see section 6.2, below) Rawls conceives of promises not as sui generis moral actions, but as essentially institutional artifacts, and thus promissory obligations as institutional obligations, grounded in the same manner as all such obligations. These institutions are comprised of sets of rules that prescribe and proscribe certain sorts of behavior for the participants in the institution. The dicta of the rules are the contents of moral obligations. (Rawls 1971, p. 112) Rawls in turn grounds institutional obligations in what he calls the principle of fairness. The principle of fairness is a basic moral principle, chosen by contractors in the OP. But unlike its more famous Rawlsian cognate the difference principle, the principle of fairness is an individual principle, one that applies directly to individuals in the society, as opposed to the basic institutions of the society themselves. Rawls lays out the principle of fairness in the following way:

…[A] person is required to do his part as defined by the rules of an institution when two conditions are met: first the institution is just (or fair)…and second, one has voluntarily accepted the benefits of the arrangement or taken advantage of the opportunities it offers to further their own interests. (p.112)

So there are two conditions on an action's being an institutional obligation in the Rawlsian sense: (1) The institution whose rule calls for the action is just, and (2) The person has ‘voluntarily accepted the benefits’ of the institution.

Rawls then introduces three theoretical elements to explain promissory obligations in particular. The first is what he calls the rule of promising, or the central rule that constitutes the promising convention: “[I]f one says the words ‘I promise to do X’ in the appropriate circumstances, one is to do X, unless certain excusing conditions obtain.” Rawls' doesn't go into the circumstance and conditions mentioned in the rule in any great detail, but he does note that a promise must be voluntary and deliberate. He also notes that a proper rendition of such clauses is necessary to evaluate whether the institution of promising the rule defines is just (p. 346). The second piece of theory Rawls employs here is the notion of a bona fide promise. A bona fide promise is a promise that “arises in accordance with the rule of promising, when the practice [of promising] it represents is just.” And the third piece of theory is a moral principle targeted to promises directly, what Rawls call the Principle of Fidelity. The principle of fidelity is merely a derivative of the principle of fairness, fashioned specifically for the institution of promising. And it says simply that “[B]ona fide promises are to be kept” (p. 347).

Thus Rawls' explanation for the obligatory force of promises is roughly: If you make a promise under a just promising institution, then you are obligated to uphold that institution (and obey its rules) because to do otherwise would be to ‘free-ride’ on the institution in a manner forbidden by the principle of fairness.

3.4 Critiques of Contractualist Theory

The most detailed and sustained criticism of the later Rawlsian theory is found in the work of Michael Robins, especially his Promising, Intending and Moral Autonomy (1984). One particularly worrisome problem Robins’ cites is that the ultimate ground of the principle of fairness, which is the ground of the obligation not to free ride, and thus to keep promises, is something like an agreement between the bargaining parties, and that agreement amounts to set of promises that they will abide by these rules. But this means that the convention of promising is ultimately grounded in the promise we (hypothetically) make to keep our promise, and that seems blatantly circular (Robins 1984, p. 127ff).

The problem with explaining promissory obligations by reference to a prior promise to keep promises has been noted by commentators like Prichard (1940, p. 260) and others. Prichard proposes to ease the problem by pointing out that the prior agreement isn't exactly an agreement to keep agreements, but rather an agreement to use the word ‘promise’ in a certain way, but even he sees that this doesn't solve the deeper puzzle, and he leaves this puzzle explicitly unanswered “…what is that something implied in the existence of agreements which looks very much like an agreement and yet cannot, strictly speaking, be an agreement?” (p. 265)

Rawls tries to solve Prichard's puzzle by appealing to the principle of fairness, rather than directly to the ‘general agreement to keep agreements’, but Robins argues that this move doesn't stop the regress (Robins 1984, p. 127 ff). Robins frames his argument in terms of a dilemma: either the principle of fairness is sufficiently strong to generate to promissory obligations, in which case it is a principle of tacit consent, and thus the appeal is circular, or the principle of fairness is weak enough to avoid circularity, and thus too weak to ground promissory obligations. Robins argues for the first horn by claiming that in order for the principle of fairness to generate strong enough obligations against free riding to explain our obligations to keep promises, we must construe the ‘voluntary’ participation of promisers in the convention to mean something like explicit acceptance of the arrangement to pay the costs (obedience to the rules of the convention) in exchange for the benefits, and this looks like an agreement to keep promises by way of an agreement to the principle of fairness, which is the circle again. On the other hand, if we relax the demand of ‘voluntary participation’ to mean merely passive reception of the effects of the convention (like the stability and cooperative bounty of society) then we are like Nozick's radio station listener, apparently obligated to support the cooperative endeavor merely because we passively derive some benefit from it (cf. Nozick 1974, pp. 90–5). With Nozick, Robins claims that such a low standard for ‘voluntary participation’ necessary to engage the free riding principle would mean that people weren't, in fact obligated not to free ride (Robins, pp. 127–131).

4. Consequentialism

Consequentialist views of promissory obligation fall into two broad camps, corresponding to the difference between act and rule utilitarianism. Act utilitarians generally explain promissory obligations as arising from the negative consequences of breaking the promise, whereas rule utilitarians defend promissory obligations on the grounds that the rule of promise-keeping is productive of the best consequences.

4.1 Act Utilitarianism

Act utilitarians evaluate individual actions in light of the net utility produced by that action as compared to alternative actions. The right action is that which promotes the maximum net utility. On the face of it, this entirely general and comprehensive maxim leaves no room for considerations of prior promise. The fact that an agent promised someone something has no direct relevance to an act consequentialist appraisal of that agent's action at the time the promise is meant to be kept. If breaking the promise would promote more utility than keeping it, then the theory seems to mandate breaking the promise.

This counter-intuitive result has been offered as a criticism of act utilitarianism since its inception. That act utilitarians have difficulty in accounting for the force of promises is a touchstone for critics (cf. Prichard 1940, Ross 1930, Hodgson 1967). One line of criticism makes promissory obligations out to be a species of ‘social’ or ‘partial’ obligations, of a piece with the obligations we owe to friends and family. But act utilitarians do have some resources to accommodate our moral intuitions about promises, and the sort of theory they employ is held by more than just utilitarians (see Section 6, below).

The act utilitarian explanation for promissory obligations is that these obligations arise from the negative consequences that attend the breaking of promises, where these negative consequences are, at least in part, created by the effects of the promise on the promisee, specifically, the creation in the promisee of the expectation that the promiser will keep her promise. A sample list of utilitarianism that have either offered or defended such a view: Bentham (A Comment on the Commentaries, 1–1–6), Sidgwick (The Methods of Ethics 3–6), Narveson 1967, 1971, Singer 1975 and Ardal 1968, 1976.

In support of this picture utilitarians offer that promises are the sorts of things which are generally made because the promisee wants the thing promised, and so wants to be assured of getting it. Since a promise is designed to secure his trust, and that trust is then likely to be the source of much pain if it's disappointed, it's reasonable to assume that in most cases keeping ones promise will be productive of better consequences than breaking them, given the expectations of the promisee. And there are other potential negative consequences of breaking a promise (e.g. the loss of trust by ones familiars, the general erosion of trust in the practice of promises) that utilitarians can add to the negative side of the ledger. For an astute philosophical survey of Act Utilitarian approaches to promising see Atiyah (1981, pp. 30–79), also Robins (1984, pp. 140–143) and Vitek (1991, pp. 61–70).

4.2 Critiques of Act Utilitarianism

As mentioned above, the standard critique of the act utilitarian theory of promissory obligations is that it doesn't accord with our intuitive judgment that at least some promises that don't produce the maximum utility still ought to be kept. As an argument it is of a piece with most arguments against utilitarianism, in claiming that it has unacceptably counter-intuitive results in certain cases. One sort of counter-intuitive case that has received some recent attention is the so-called ‘Desert Island’ case, where a promise is made in isolation (on a desert island) to someone who then dies. The question is whether there is any obligation to keep the promise, given that the promisee can't have any expectations of its fulfillment (being dead) and that no-one else can know of the promise (cf. Nowell-Smith 1956, Narveson 1963, p. 210, Cargile 1964, Narveson 1967, pp. 196–7).

A more sophisticated problem outlined by Hodgson (1967, p. 38) and others is that a promising convention is broadly speaking incompatible with an act utilitarian society. This is so because such a convention couldn't get established (or couldn't be sustained) if people were aware that everyone was a consistent utility maximizer of the act utilitarian sort. If this were the case people would put no stock in promises, knowing that when the time came to keep the promise, the promiser would simply apply the utilitarian calculus, without regard to the fact that he had previously ‘promised’, as this is what being an act utilitarian means.

Note that the utilitarian cannot reply that we have failed to take into account the expectations of the promisee in our case, because the claim is that the promisee has no reason to generate any special expectations that the promiser will do what she promises, precisely because he knows the promiser to be an act utilitarian, and consequently knows that she will do what the utility calculus tells her is best, without thought of her promise. Of course, the promisee is free to generate some expectations that the promiser will keep her promise on the assumption that her promise is indicative of her at least having the (present) intention to perform the promised act. But, as Raz (1972), Kolodny and Wallace (2005) and others point out, the advising of the promisee of one's mere intention to do the promised act is insufficient ground for the sorts of expectations that are meant to attend promises.

3.4 Rule Utilitarianism

Rule utilitarians change the context of moral evaluation from individual acts to rules governing actions. The principle of utility is applied to rules and practices, rather than individual acts, and the best rule or practice is that produces the best over-all consequences. Some notable rule utilitarians are Urmson (1953), Brandt (1959), (1979), and Hooker (2000). Of special note here is Rawls' 1955 paper Two Concepts of Rules, which advanced a rule-utilitarian defense of promissory obligations and helped to focus the debate on promising (see section 6.1 below). It is considerations of exactly the sort that promises pose that rule utilitarians make this change (cf. Rawls 1955, and Brandt 1979, pp. 286–305). By changing the focus from act to rule, rule utilitarians are better able to explain our moral intuitions regarding individual cases of promise-keeping. But in particular, rule utilitarians claim that their theory can make sense of the origin and maintenance of the practice of promising itself. Unlike an act utilitarian society, promising and trusting in promises makes sense in a rule utilitarian society, because promisees can rest assured that promisers won't do the local utility calculation to determine whether or not to keep their promises, but rather will obey the rule of promising.

4.4 Critiques of Rule Utilitarianism

One influential critique of rule utilitarianism comes from David Lyons 1965 book Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism. In it Lyons argues that rule utilitarianism collapses to act utilitarianism, because for any given rule, in the exceptional case where breaking the rule produces more utility, the rule can always be sophisticated by the addition of a sub-rule that handles cases like the exception. But the validity of this process on the utilitarian framework holds for all cases of exceptions, and so the ‘rules’ will have as many ‘sub-rules’ as there are exceptional cases, which, in the end, is to abandon the rule and be guided by the principle of utility, to seek out whatever outcome produces the maximum utility.

Lyons renders a version of this criticism in terms of promises leveled at Rawls' version in Two Concepts of Rules (Lyons 1965, p. 182–195)—either rule utilitarians counsel us to keep promises where the outcome would be less than optimal or it claims that the rule of promise keeping admits of exceptions. But if the exceptions to the rule of promise keeping are all those cases where keeping a the promise is less than optimal, then the ‘rule’ is no more than a rule of thumb, and the actual principle governing decisions on promise-keeping is the principle of maximal utility.

Another problem for the rule utilitarian theory of promissory obligations is that it seems that utilitarian society couldn't establish a practice of promising, because prior to the establishment of the rule, people could have no expectations that promises would be kept. As such, those receiving the first promises would not be able to form the expectations necessary to make the rule actually productive of the best consequences. This is so because the consequential value of the rule of promise keeping depends on the expectations of promisees. Such expectations are the grounds of trust, and trust is how promising generates its benefits (cf. Robins 1984, p. 142–3). In response, Brandt argues for what he calls ideal rule utilitarianism, which makes the frame of reference for rule consideration not the actual rules available, but the ideal rule, i.e., the rule that would be optimific (productive of the best possible consequences), were it employed. There is substantial criticism of this move (cf. Diggs 1970). Again, the best survey of the rule-utilitarian approach to promising is Atiyah (1981, pp. 79–86).

5. A Taxonomy of Promissory Theory: Conventionalism and Expectationalism

The above survey divides theories of promissory obligation along the lines of the underlying moral theory, and this is a useful taxonomical approach given that promissory obligations are to be explained as a type of moral obligation. But another way of classifying these theories found in the literature (cf. R S Downie 1985, Atiyah 1981, Viteck 1993) makes reference to the different approaches to promissory obligations in particular. This sort of taxonomy allows us to see the shape of the promissory theories more clearly, and allows us to classify objections as either directed at the promissory theory directly, or at the underlying moral theory. Most of the objections listed above are examples of the latter sort, in this section I will outline some of the former. The promissory taxonomy is also useful for highlighting philosophical work on particular issues in promissory theory as well as the work in related disciplines, such as legal theory, that are germane to one or another theoretical approach. (See Vitek 1993, p. 5ff, p. 243/fn40 for discussion of the taxonomy.)

There are two categories in the taxonomy: Those theories which explain promissory obligations by reference to the convention or practice of promising, and those which do so by appeal to the expectations that promises yield in their promisees. We can call the first group Conventionalists, and the second Expectationalists.

5.1 Conventionalism

Conventionalist theories share at least two central claims—(1) that promising is essentially a human convention, that is, a rule based practice or set of practices, and (2) That the practice of promising is very beneficial to both groups and to individuals who share the convention, by making trust-based cooperation and coordination possible.

The task for a conventionalist theory is to use these claims to explain why it is that we have an obligation to keep our promises. Conventionalists aim to supply a rationale that extends from general claims about the coordinative benefits of the promising convention to the demand that individuals keep their particular promises. In this category we find Natural Lawyers like Aquinas, Grotius and Pufendorf, Contractarians like Hobbes, Hume and Gauthier, Contractualists like Rawls and Rule Utilitarians like Brandt, Urmson and Hooker.

Natural Lawyers bridge the gap by claiming simply that the natural law mandates that we keep our promises. Contractarians bridge the gap by claiming that individual participation in (i.e., obedience to the rules of) the promising convention is rationally mandated, and different contractarians offer different reasons for this claim. Hobbes thinks that participation is rational due to the fear of punishment for reneging. Gauthier and others think that the rational appeal of the coordinative benefits of promising, specifically its potential for resolving prisoners dilemmas, is sufficient to make obedience rational (cf. Gauthier 1986, p. 167). Rule Utilitarians have a very similar approach, although the final mandate is moral, not rational. On that picture, the promising convention is composed of rules that are productive of the best circumstances, and as such deserve obedience not from rational, but from moral duty (cf. Rawls 1955).

Contractualists bridge the gap either by appealing directly to the terms of the contract, and claiming that promise-breaking is an unacceptable breach, as Kant does, or, in the more complicated case of the later Rawls of Theory of Justice, by claiming that a practice of promising that is both just and useful is an institution that contractors have a duty to uphold, which duty includes the duty not to ‘free-ride’ on the institution by not obeying its rules (i.e., making but not keeping promises).

5.2 Promises, Rules and Games

The conventional approach places great weight on the rule-governed nature of promising. As a result, there is a large body of work on issues related to rules, games, and other aspects of the conceptual framework. One such issue is the aptness of the metaphor of promising as a game. This debate begins with Rawls' 1955 article Two Concepts of Rules. In it Rawls distinguished between what he called the ‘summary’ conception of rules, in which rules are merely ‘rules of thumb’ i.e., guides to behavior based on reports of prior actions and their outcomes, and the ‘practice’ view of rules, which makes them out to be ‘logically prior’ to individual cases. One important claim Rawls makes about practice rules is that they do not merely regulate action, but are constitutive of it. Constitutive rules, like the rules of baseball, are necessary for us to perform (and even understand) game-based actions like ‘striking out’. Rawls argues that the promising convention is composed of (at least one) constitutive rule, i.e., ‘When you say ‘I promise’ or something similar, you must do what you say you will.’

Rawls' article provoked a large body of response and related work. Of particular note, John Searle adopts the framework and champions the notion of a ‘conventional’ promising game. Searle expands the framework by adding what he calls ‘conventional facts’ to it. Conventional facts are those facts that state something about the events in a conventional game. Saying that I have made a promise is a conventional fact. Searle argues in his 1964 article How to Derive ‘Ought’ from ‘Is’ that this approach can answer the centuries-old Humean challenge for an explanation of how to derive moral conclusions from empirical claims.

But many critics dispute Rawls' and Searle's analysis. One influential criticism originates with R. M. Hare. In his The Promising Game (1967) Hare argues that the obligation to obey a promise, on the constitutive-rule convention view, requires that we be obligated to play the game in order to ensure that we are obligated to keep our promises, but that such an obligation cannot come from inside the game itself. Mary Midgely's 1967 article “The Game Game” takes the argument further, in an attempt to refute Rawls' claim that the notion of constitutive rules can truly capture the nature of a game. There are many other commentators, e.g., Flew 1965, Lyons 1965, Zemach 1971, Viteck 1993. For an excellent overview of these issues see Viteck 1993, p. 118.

In addition to this work, there is also a corpus of work on promises in game theory and economic theory, stemming from the contractarian project of grounding promissory obligation in self-interested rationality. Some important elements of this literature are Harsanyi 1955, Gauthier 1986, Hardin 1988, Narveson 1988, Binmore 1994, Skyrms 1996 and Verbeek 2002.

5.3 Promises as Speech Acts

A related body of work surrounds promises as speech acts, or actions that we perform by speaking. The locus classicus is J. L. Austin's 1955 book How to Do Things with Words. In it Austin defines two sorts of speech acts, or ‘performatives’: illocutions and perlocutions. Illocutions are those actions that we perform by uttering the words alone. Austin lists requesting, warning and announcing as examples. Alternatively, perlocutions are actions performed by speaking which require some particular effect of the speech in order to be successful. Austin cites persuading, explaining and alarming as examples of the latter sort of locution.

Austin takes promising to be an illocutionary act, that is, he takes it that promising is merely a matter of a certain form of utterance, under certain conditions. Moreover the reason he takes this to be is that he thinks that promising is a conventional act, one that invokes a certain practice to formalize the action. Austin thinks that in this way promises are just of a piece with many sorts of obligation-producing actions, such as betting, buying and contracting (p. 19)

Austin's linguistic distinction mirrors the crucial difference between the expectational and conventional theories of promising. On the conventionalist view that Austin adopts, promises are ‘conventional’ moves in the game, and as such one promises by ‘making the right moves’, i.e., saying the right sorts of things and otherwise obeying the rules of the game. For expectationalists, a promise is a perlocutionary act, as it's only successful if it actually produces the expectations in the promisee that the promise will be carried out. The investigation of promises as speech acts is furthered in the work of Rawls 1955, Alston 1964, 1994, Searle 1965, 1979, 1985, Jones 1966, Hanfling 1975, and Pratt 2001 among others.

5.4 Critiques of Conventionalism

There have been a number of influential critiques of conventionalist promissory theory as such, as opposed to the particular versions offered by Rawls (or Kant or Aquinas). Thomas Scanlon offers two criticisms of this sort, which he says persuaded him to abandon conventionalism (Scanlon 1999, p. 297 ff). The first is that such a view requires that promisers share a ‘convention’ or practice of promising First, that it requires the presence of a convention between the parties before promising is possible, and thus rules out promises between those who lack such a shared convention.

An example of why this is a problem is Scanlon's hypothetical ‘state of nature’ situation, in which two strangers of different societies meet on opposite sides of a river. Both have lost their respective hunting weapons to the other bank, and both realize that the other's weapon is at his feet, and that it is within his power to return the weapon to the stranger on the opposite bank. Scanlon argues that these two people can enter into a promissory arrangement to return the each other's weapons, with its attendant obligations, despite the fact that they do not share a social institution of promising, or indeed any social institution at all.

The second criticism is that the conventional view gets the harm of breaking a promise wrong. On the conventional view, when someone breaks a promise, they harm the convention of promising as a whole, and by extension, all those who rely on it. But this clashes with our firm intuition that a broken promise harms primarily the jilted promisee. In response to this, it is open to a conventionalist to move towards a ‘hybrid’ theory, one that invokes the convention to explain the source of the trust of the promisee, but explains the harm done in breaking a promise (and thus the ground of the obligation to keep one) as one of betraying that trust as per the expectationalist view (see section 6, below). This is roughly the route that Kolodny and Wallace (2003) take (see Section 6.3 below).

6. Expectationalism

The other approach to promissory obligations is an appeal to the expectations that promises create in their promisees. Theories of this sort generally agree that: (1) Promises are the sorts of things that are designed to invite the trust of promisee. (2) This trust is a valuable thing, and its betrayal causes harm to promisees. Thus expectational theorists conclude that the wrong in breaking a promise (and thus the ground of promissory obligation) is the production of this harm.

As we noted, this approach is traditionally adopted by consequentialists, particularly act utilitarians, since the betrayal of trust is precisely a negative consequence of an action that act utilitarians can countenance on their theory. But in the past 40 years many theorists with other normative frameworks have also adopted the view, e.g., Mcneilly 1972, MacCormick 1972, Anscombe 1981 (Ch. 1), Atiyah 1981 (Ch. 6), Melden 1981 (Ch. II), Thomson 1990 (Ch. 12), Scanlon 1990, 1999 (Ch. 7), Foot 2001 (Ch. 1) and Mason 2005.

There is a further distinction to be made, between those expectationalists that hold that a promisee must have experienced a tangible harm as the result of a broken promise for a wrong to have been committed, and those who hold that the mere disappointment is sufficient. We can call the first group Reliance theories, and the second Assurance theories. Legal theorists are more often reliance theorists, and moral theorists, like the act utilitarians and Scanlon, more often assurance theorists. See Atiyah 1981 (pp. 30–44) for a discussion of the distinction.

6.1 Promise, Contracts and the Law

The relationship between the law, contracts and promises is a long and tangled one. From its Aristotelian origins promissory theory has been intertwined with issues of contracts and agreements more generally. And since at least the time of Aquinas and especially with the works of the later Natural Lawyers like Grotius and Pufendorf, scholarly work on promising has been done with an eye towards informing the law of contract, and this in turn gave rise to a tradition of surveying such scholarship on the part of legal theorists in their work on both historical and contemporary issues in the law of contract. Finally, the law itself has methods for dealing with promises (as they are obviously the sorts of things that might lead to legal wrangling). Thus the legal practice regarding promises has some interest to theorists of promising as well. The result is two interlinked scholarly traditions and bodies of work.

In the history of contract law, the dominant tradition takes contract law to be based (normatively, at least) on the prior moral notion of promise and promissory obligation. Contemporary legal scholarship has both defenders of this view (Fried, Gordley) and detractors (Atiyah). For comprehensive surveys of these issues see Atiyah 1975, Simpson 1975, Fried 1981, Gordley 1991.

As to the influence of legal doctrines of promise on moral theory, one important trend noted by Atiyah (1981, pp. 5–8) is the movement in the latter half of the 20th Century towards a more expectational view of promising, caused in part by considerations from the common law. As Atiyha notes, there is a tension between the Natural Law promissory theory and the actual law of contract and promise plainly evident in the British common law. The source of the tension is the common law doctrine of ‘consideration’, which mandates that only promises given with ‘consideration’, i.e., given in exchange for something of value, are enforceable in the law. In other words, mere promises, given without consideration, are traditionally not indemnified by the law. Further, as Lon Fuller and William Perdue pointed out in an influential 1939 article “The Reliance Interest in Contract Damages”, the damages awarded by courts to those who have had a promise or contract broken is best understood as being proportional to the harm the plaintiff suffered in relying on the promise. These and other considerations argue for a theory of promises based on expectations and reliance, i.e., an expectational theory, as opposed to one based on conventions or natural duties, and this is what a number of philosophers and legal theorists have done.

6.2 Expectational Promissory Theory

In the last 20 years, Scanlon has outlined a comprehensive and detailed version of expectational promissory theory. Scanlon's theory is taxonomically interesting, in that while he adopts an expectational theory of promissory obligation, his underlying normative theory is straightforwardly contractualist. Scanlon proposes that the operative moral rules are those that no one at the bargaining table could ‘reasonably reject’. Scanlon claims that promissory obligations derive from another sort of more basic moral obligations, specifically obligations not to ‘unfairly manipulate’ others. One has a moral duty to keep one's promises because making a promise will lead others to believe that you will do what you promise. Breaking the promise is then tantamount to deceiving those one promised, and since one has a moral duty not to do this, one has a moral duty to keep one's promises.

Scanlon's principle governing a promise's generation of an obligation (the Principle of Fidelity, or Principle F) is:

Principle F:
If (1) A voluntarily and intentionally leads B to expect that A will do X (unless B consents to A's not doing so); (2) A knows that B wants to be assured of this; (3) A acts with the aim of providing this assurance, and has good reason to believe that he or she has done so; (4) B knows that A has the intentions and beliefs just described; (5) A intends for B to know this, and knows that B does know it; (6) B knows that A has this knowledge and intent, then, in the absence of special justification, A must do X unless B consents to X's not being done. (p. 304)

Principle F is reasonable (i.e., a real moral principle with normative force) because the reasons potential promisees have not to be deceived outweigh the reasons potential promisors have to deceive.

6.3 Critiques of Expectationalism

There are a number of criticisms and objections in the literature to the expectational approach to promissory obligations (in addition to the ones above focused more specifically on the act utilitarian version of it). One group of problems revolves around the claim that by making promises out to be merely expectation-producing mechanisms, expectationalists collapse the distinction between promising and other things, like advising, warning and threatening (cf. Raz 1972, Peetz 1977, see also Ardal 1979, in response).

Adjunct to these problems is the charge that the expectationalist can't explain why promissory expectations produce obligations, in a way that other expectations don't (cf. Raz 1972, Owens 2006). Elinor Mason, in a recent article on Scanlon's theory argues in favor of the collapse, claiming that promises are just one sort of inducement to trust, and the harm of breaking a promise is exactly the harm of misleading that might be performed by lying or otherwise deceiving (Mason, 2005).

In another vein, Margaret Gilbert (2004) has critiqued (Scanlonian) expectationalism on the grounds that the theory leaves no room for a right in the promisee.

Another traditional problem for expectational views is a charge of circularity (cf. Robins 1979, Prichard 1940, Warnock 1971). The problem is this: When I promise someone to do something then, if all goes well, as a result of my promise they come to trust that I will do that thing. But this trust, on the expectational view, is the source of my obligation to do what I promise. So it seems that the trust of my promisee is both the cause and the effect of my promise, and this seems an unacceptable circle. The problem is best framed in epistemic terms, as one of the reason that a promisee has to trust a promiser. The intuitively obvious reason for the trust of a promisee has is that the promiser has promised, and as such has placed herself under a moral obligation to do the deed. This belief, combined with beliefs about the moral rectitude of the promiser, give the promisee a sound reason to believe that the promiser will keep her promise. The problem for the expectational view is that the promisee, on such a view, can't rely on the fact of the promissory obligation as a reason to trust, since on this view that obligation rests on the prior fact of the trust itself. If the trust of the promiser is the ground of the moral obligation to keep a promise, then prior to the promisee coming to trust the promiser, no such obligation exists. So when the promisee goes searching for a reason to trust, the standard one is barred from consideration.

Moreover, if an expectationalist aims to offer a theory that explains promissory obligation without the invocation of a convention or practice of promising (like Scanlon does), then the other standard route to explaining promise trust is blocked. If there is a convention in place that governs promises, and if that convention is such as to inspire confidence in promisees that promisers will keep their promises, then promises can be said to generate the necessary expectations. But such a view is incompatible with the claim that conventions aren't necessary to explain promissory obligations. These objections are pressed by against Scanlon's theory by Pratt (2001) and by Kolodny and Wallace (2003).

Another traditional set of problems with the expectational approach is their difficulty in handling cases where the expectations that normally attend a promise are lacking. The Desert Island/Deathbed cases described above (Section 4.2) are one such problem, where the expectations are lacking because the promisee is dead. Scanlon discusses another sort of case, the Profligate Pal (Scanlon 1999, p. 312) where the promisee fails to have the standard expectations because the promiser (the profligate pal) has made and broken too many promises in the past. In such cases expectationalists must either admit that there is no obligation to keep the promise, which seems very counterintuitive, or come up with some reason for the obligation apart from the fact that the promise created expectations in the promisee.


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