Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Mar 13, 2007

Since the 1970s, studies of risk have grown into a major interdisciplinary field of research. Although relatively few philosophers have focused their work on risk, there are important connections between risk studies and several philosophical subdisciplines. This entry summarizes the most well-developed of these connections and introduces some of the major topics in the philosophy of risk. It consists of five sections dealing with the definition of risk and with treatments of risk related to epistemology, the philosophy of science, ethics, and the philosophy of economics.

1. Defining risk

In non-technical contexts, the word “risk” refers, often rather vaguely, to situations in which it is possible but not certain that some undesirable event will occur. In technical contexts, the word has several more specialized uses and meanings. Five of these are particularly important since they are widely used across disciplines:

1. risk = an unwanted event which may or may not occur.

An example of this usage is: “Lung cancer is one of the major risks that affect smokers.”

2. risk = the cause of an unwanted event which may or may not occur.

An example of this usage is: “Smoking is by far the most important health risk in industrialized countries.” (The unwanted event implicitly referred to here is a disease caused by smoking.) Both (1) and (2) are qualitative senses of risk. The word also has quantitative senses, of which the following is the oldest one:

3. risk = the probability of an unwanted event which may or may not occur.

This usage is exemplified by the following statement: “The risk that a smoker's life is shortened by a smoking-related disease is about 50%.”

4. risk = the statistical expectation value of an unwanted event which may or may not occur.

The expectation value of a possible negative event is the product of its probability and some measure of its severity. It is common to use the number of killed persons as a measure of the severity of an accident. With this measure of severity, the “risk” (in sense 4) associated with a potential accident is equal to the statistically expected number of deaths. Other measures of severity give rise to other measures of risk.

Although expectation values have been calculated since the 17th century, the use of the term “risk” in this sense is relatively new. It was introduced into risk analysis in the influential Reactor Safety Study, WASH-1400, (Rasmussen et al., 1975). Today it is the standard technical meaning of the term “risk” in many disciplines. It is regarded by some risk analysts as the only correct usage of the term.

5. risk = the fact that a decision is made under conditions of known probabilities (“decision under risk” as opposed to “decision under uncertainty”)

In addition to these five common meanings of “risk” there are several other more technical meanings, which are well-established in specialized fields of inquiry. Some of the major definitions of risk that are used in economic analysis will be introduced below in section 5.

Although most of the above-mentioned meanings of “risk” have been referred to by philosophers, a large part of the philosophical literature on risk refers to risk in the more informal sense that was mentioned at the beginning of this section, namely as a state of affairs in which an undesirable event may or may not occur.

Terminological note: Some philosophers distinguish between “subjective” and “objective” probabilities. Others reserve the term “probability” for the subjective notion. Here, the former terminology is used, i.e. “probability” can refer either to subjective probability or to objective chances.

2. Epistemology

When there is a risk, there must be something that is unknown or that has an unknown outcome. Therefore, knowledge about risk is knowledge about lack of knowledge. This combination of knowledge and lack thereof contributes to making issues of risk complicated from an epistemological point of view.

In non-regimented usage, “risk” and “uncertainty” differ along the subjective—objective dimension. Whereas “uncertainty” seems to belong to the subjective realm, “risk” has a strong objective component. If a person does not know whether or not the grass snake is poisonous, then she is in a state of uncertainty with respect to its ability to poison her. However, since this species has no poison there is no risk to be poisoned by it. The relationship between the two concepts “risk” and “uncertainty” seems to be in part analogous to that between “truth” and “belief”.

Regimented decision-theoretical usage differs from this. In decision theory, a decision is said to be made “under risk” if the relevant probabilities are available and “under uncertainty” if they are unavailable or only partially available. Partially determined probabilities are sometimes expressed with probability intervals, e.g., “the probability of rain tomorrow is between 0.1 and 0.4”. (The term “decision under ignorance” is sometimes used in the case when no probabilistic information at all is available.)

Although this distinction between risk and uncertainty is decision-theoretically useful, from an epistemological point of view it is in need of clarification. Only very rarely are probabilities known with certainty. Strictly speaking, the only clear-cut cases of “risk” (known probabilities) seem to be idealized textbook cases that refer to devices such as dice or coins that are supposed to be known with certainty to be fair. In real-life situations, even if we act upon a determinate probability estimate, we are not fully certain that this estimate is exactly correct, hence there is uncertainty. It follows that almost all decisions are made “under uncertainty”. If a decision problem is treated as a decision “under risk”, this does not mean that the decision in question is made under conditions of completely known probabilities. Rather, it means that a choice has been made to simplify the description of this decision problem by treating it as a case of known probabilities. This is often a highly useful idealization in decision theory. However, in practical applications it is important to distinguish between those probabilities that can be treated as known and those that are uncertain and therefore much more in need of continuous updating. Typical examples of the former are the failure frequencies of a technical component that are inferred from extensive and well-documented experience of its use. The latter case is exemplified by experts' estimates of the expected failure frequencies of a new type of component.

A major problem in the epistemology of risk is how to deal with the severe limitations that characterize our knowledge of the behaviour of unique complex systems that are essential for estimates of risk, such as the climate system, ecosystems, the world economy, etc. Each of these systems contains so many components and potential interactions that it is in practice unpredictable. However, in spite of this fundamental uncertainty, meaningful statements about some aspects of these systems can be made. The epistemological status of such statements, and the nature of the uncertainty involved, are in need of clarification.

In the risk sciences, it is common to distinguish between “objective risk” and “subjective risk”. The former concept is in principle fairly unproblematic since it refers to a frequentist interpretation of probability. The latter concept is more ambiguous. In the early psychometric literature on risk (from the 1970s), subjective risk was often conceived as a subjective estimate of objective risk. In more recent literature, a more complex picture has emerged. Subjective appraisals of (the severity of) risk depend to a large extent on factors that are not covered in traditional measures of objective risk (such as control and tampering with nature). If the terms are taken in this sense, subjective risk is influenced by the subjective estimate of objective risk, but cannot be identified with it. In the psychological literature, subjective risk is often conceived as the individual's overall assessment of the seriousness of a danger or alleged danger. Such individual assessments are commonly called “risk perception”, but strictly speaking the term is misleading. This is not a matter of perception, but rather a matter of attitudes and expectations. Subjective risk can be studied with methods of attitude measurement and psychological scaling (Sjöberg 2004).

3. Philosophy of science

Issues of risk have given rise to heated debates on what levels of scientific evidence are needed for policy decisions. The proof standards of science are apt to cause difficulties whenever science is applied to practical problems that require standards of proof or evidence other than those of science.

Two major types of errors are possible in a decision whether or not to accept a scientific hypothesis. The first of these consists in concluding that there is a phenomenon or an effect when in fact there is none. This is called an error of type I (false positive). The second consists in missing an existing phenomenon or effect. This is called an error of type II (false negative). In the internal dealings of science, errors of type I are in general regarded as more problematic than those of type II. The common scientific standards of statistical significance substantially reduce the risk of type I errors but do not protect against type II errors.

Many controversies on risk assessment concern the balance between risks of type I and type II errors. Whereas science gives higher priority to avoiding type I errors than to avoiding type II errors, the balance can shift when errors have practical consequences. This can be seen from a case in which it is uncertain whether there is a serious defect in an airplane engine. A type II error, i.e., acting as if there were no such a defect when there is one, would in this case be counted as more serious than a type I error, i.e., acting as if there were such a defect when there is none. (The distinction between type I and type II errors depends on the delimitation of the effect under study. In discussions of risk, this delimitation is mostly uncontroversial.)

In this particular case it is fairly uncontroversial that avoidance of type II error should be given priority over avoidance of type I error. In other words, it is better to delay the flight and then find out that the engine was in good shape than to fly with an engine that turns out to malfunction. However, in other cases the balance between the two error types is more controversial. Controversies are common, for instance, over what degree of evidence should be required for actions against possible negative effects of chemical substances on human health and the environment.

figure 1

Figure 1. The use of scientific data for policy purposes.

Such controversies can be clarified with the help of a simple but illustrative model of how scientific data influence both scientific judgments and practical decisions. Scientific knowledge begins with data that originate in experiments and other observations. (See Figure 1.) Through a process of critical assessment, these data give rise to the scientific corpus (arrow 1). Roughly speaking, the corpus consists of those statements that could, for the time being, legitimately be made without reservation in a (sufficiently detailed) textbook. When determining whether or not a scientific hypothesis should be accepted for the time being as part of the corpus, the onus of proof falls on its adherents. Similarly, those who claim the existence of an as yet unproven phenomenon have the burden of proof. These proof standards are essential for the integrity of science.

The most obvious way to use scientific information for policy-making is to employ information from the corpus (arrow 2). For many purposes, this is the only sensible thing to do. However, in risk management decisions exclusive reliance on the corpus may have unwanted consequences. Suppose that toxicological investigations are performed on a substance that has not previously been studied from a toxicological point of view. These investigations turn out to be inconclusive. They give rise to science-based suspicions that the substance is dangerous to human health, but they do not amount to full scientific proof in the matter. Since the evidence is not sufficient to warrant an addition to the scientific corpus, this information cannot influence policies in the standard way (via arrows 1 and 2). There is a strict requirement to avoid type I errors in the process represented by arrow 1, and this process filters out information that might in this case have been practically relevant and motivated certain protective measures.

In cases like this, a direct road from data to policies is often taken (arrow 3). This means that a balance between type I and type II errors is determined in the particular case, based on practical considerations, rather than relying on the standard scientific procedure with its strong emphasis on the avoidance of type I errors.

It is essential to distinguish here between two kinds of risk-related decision processes. One consists in determining which statements about risks should be included in the scientific corpus. The other consists in determining how risk-related information should influence practical measures to protect health and the environment. It would be a strange coincidence if the criteria of evidence in these two types of decisions were always the same. Strong reasons can be given for strict standards of proof in science, i.e. high entry requirements for the corpus. At the same time, there can be valid policy reasons to allow risk management decisions to be influenced by sound scientific indications of danger that are yet not sufficiently well-established to qualify for inclusion into the scientific corpus.

In a framework of expected utilities, the balance between type I and type II errors can be clarified with the aid of numerical estimates of the seriousness of the different types of errors. Let PI denote the probability of type I error and LI the value of the expected loss from such an error (acting as if there were a danger if there is none). Similarly, let PII denote the probability of type II error and LII the value of the expected loss from that type of error (acting as if there were no danger if there is indeed one). Then, in an expected utility framework, one should act as if the danger exists if PII×LII is greater than PI×LI but not if PI×LI is greater than PII×LII.

4. Ethics

Problems of risk have seldom been treated systematically in moral philosophy. A possible defence of this limitation is that moral philosophy can leave it to decision theory to analyse the complexities that indeterminism and lack of knowledge give rise to in real life. According to the conventional division of labour between the two disciplines, moral philosophy provides assessments of human behaviour in well-determined situations. Decision theory takes assessments of these cases for given, adds the available probabilistic information, and derives assessments for rational behaviour in an uncertain and indeterministic world. On this view, no additional input of moral values is needed to deal with indeterminism or lack of knowledge, since decision theory operates exclusively with criteria of rationality.

Examples are easily found that exhibit the problematic nature of this division between the two disciplines. Compare the act of throwing down a brick on a person from a high building to the act of throwing down a brick from a high building without first making sure that there is nobody beneath who can be hit by the brick. The moral difference between these two acts is not obviously expressible in a probability calculus. An ethical analysis of the difference will have to refer to the moral aspects of risk-taking as compared to intentional ill-doing. More generally speaking, a reasonably complete account of the ethics of risk must distinguish between intentional and unintentional risk exposure and between voluntary risk-taking, risks imposed on a person who accepts them, and risks imposed on a person who does not accept them. This cannot be done in a framework that treats risks as probabilistic mixtures of outcomes (unless, of course, these outcomes are so widely defined that they include all relevant moral considerations, including the various mental states involved at different points of times in the evaluated event).

Methods of moral analysis are needed that can guide decisions on risk-takings and risk-impositions. A first step is to investigate how standard moral theories can deal with problems of risk that are presented in the same way as in decision theory, namely as the (moral) evaluation of probabilistic mixtures of (deterministic) scenarios.

In utilitarian theory, there are two obvious, alternative approaches to such problems. One is the actualist solution. It consists in assigning to a (probabilistic) mixture of potential outcomes a utility that is equal to the utility of the outcome that actually materializes. To exemplify this approach, consider a decision whether or not to reinforce a bridge before it is being used for a single, very heavy transport. There is a 50% risk that the bridge will fall down if it is not reinforced. Suppose that a decision is made not to reinforce the bridge and that everything goes well; the bridge is not damaged. According to the actualist approach, the decision was right. This is, of course, contrary to common moral intuitions.

The other established utilitarian approach is the maximization of expected utility. This means that the utility of a mixture of potential outcomes is defined as the probability-weighted average of the utilities of these outcomes.

The expected utility criterion has been criticized along several lines. One criticism is that it disallows a common form of cautiousness, namely disproportionate avoidance of large disasters. For example, provided that human deaths are valued equally and additively, this framework does not allow that one prefers a probability of 1 in 1000 that one person will die to a probability of 1 in 100000 that fifty persons will die. The expected utility framework can also be criticized for disallowing a common expression of strivings for fairness, namely disproportionate avoidance of high-probability risks for particular individuals. Hence, in the choice between exposing one person to a probability of 0.9 to be killed and exposing each of one hundred persons to a probability of 0.01 of being killed, it requires that the former alternative be chosen. In summary, expected utility maximization prohibits what seem to be morally reasonable standpoints on risk taking and risk imposition.

However, it should be noted that the expected utility criterion does not necessarily follow from utilitarianism. Utilitarianism in a wide sense (Scanlon 1982) is compatible with other ways of evaluating uncertain outcomes (most notably with actual consequence utilitarianism, but in principle also for instance with a maximin criterion). Therefore, criticism directed against expected utility maximization does not necessarily show a defect in utilitarian thinking.

The problem of dealing with risk in rights-based moral theories was formulated by Robert Nozick: “Imposing how slight a probability of a harm that violates someone's rights also violates his rights?” (Nozick 1974, 7).

An extension of a rights-based moral theory to indeterministic cases can be obtained by prescribing that if A has a right that B does not bring about a certain outcome, then A also has a right that B does not perform any action that (at all) increases the probability of this outcome. Unfortunately, such a strict extension of rights is untenable in social practice. Presumably, A has the right not to be killed by B, but it would not be reasonable to extend this right to all actions by B that give rise to a very small increase in the risk that A dies — such as driving a car in the town where A lives. Such a strict interpretation would make human society impossible.

Hence, a right not to be risk-exposed will have to be defeasible so that it can be overridden when the increases in probability are small. However, it remains to find a credible criterion for when it should be overridden. As Nozick observed, a probability limit is not credible in “a tradition which holds that stealing a penny or a pin or anything from someone violates his rights. That tradition does not select a threshold measure of harm as a lower limit, in the case of harms certain to occur.” (Nozick 1974, 75)

The problem of dealing with risks in deontological theories is similar to the corresponding problem in rights-based theories. The duty not to harm other people can be extended to a duty not to perform actions that increase their risk of being harmed. However, society as we know it is not possible unless exceptions to this rule are accepted. The determination of criteria for such exceptions is problematic in the same way as for risk-based theories. All reasonable systems of moral obligations will contain a fairly general prohibition against actions that kill another person. Such a prohibition can (and should) be extended to actions that involve a large risk that a person is killed. However, it cannot be extended to all actions that lead to a small increase in the risk that a person is killed, since in that case it could not be allowed for instance to drive a car. A limit must be drawn between reasonable and unreasonable impositions of risk. It seems as if such a limit has to be based on concepts, such as probabilities, that are not part of the internal resources of deontological theories.

Contract theories may appear somewhat more promising than the theories discussed above. The criterion that they offer for the deterministic case, namely consent among all those involved, can also be applied to risky options. It could be claimed that risk impositions are acceptable if and only if they are supported by a consensus. Such a consensus, as conceived in contract theories, is either actual or hypothetical.

Actual consensus is unrealistic in a complex society in which everyone performs actions with marginal but additive effects on many people's lives. According to the criterion of actual consensus, any local citizen will have a veto against anyone else who wants to drive a car in the town where she lives. In this way citizens can block each other, creating a society of stalemates.

Hypothetical consensus has been developed as a criterion in contract theory in order to deal with inter-individual problems. It does not seem to be helpful in solving the problems of risk. As an example of this, the risks and uncertainties of real life are of a quite different nature than the hypothetical uncertainty (or ignorance) about one's own identity that is part of Rawls's initial situation. The argumentation that Rawls used to obtain a solution for these hypothetical uncertainties is based on features (such as the impossibility to obtain any form of probabilistic information) that do not apply to real-world risks. This is not surprising since uncertainties about social and natural risks are very different from the hypothetical uncertainty in the original position about whom one is representing. At least this variant of a hypothetical contract situation does not have resources to deal with the moral appraisal of risk.

In summary, the problem of appraising risks from a moral point of view does not seem to have any satisfactory solution in established moral theories. The following are three possible elements of a solution:

1. It may be useful to shift the focus from risks, described two-dimensionally in terms of probability and severity (or one-dimensionally as the product of these) to actions of risk-taking and risk-imposing. Such actions have many morally relevant properties in addition to the two dimensions mentioned, such as who exposes whom to a risk, issues of fairness and distribution, voluntariness, etc.
2. Important moral intuitions are accounted for by assuming that each person has a prima facie moral right not to be exposed to risk of negative impact, such as damage to her health or her property, through the actions of others. However, this is a prima facie right that has to be overridden in quite a few cases, in order to make social life at all possible. Therefore, the recognition of this right gives rise to what can be called an exemption problem, namely the problem of determining when it is rightfully overridden.
3. Part of the solution to the exemption problem may be obtained by allowing for reciprocal exchanges of risks and benefits. Hence, if A is allowed to drive a car, exposing B to certain risks, then in exchange B is allowed to drive a car, exposing A to the corresponding risks. In order to deal with the complexities of modern society, this principle must also be applied to exchanges of different types of risks and benefits. Exposure of a person to a risk can then be regarded as acceptable if it is part of an equitable social system of risk-taking that works to her advantage. (Such a system can be required to contain mechanisms that eliminate, or compensate for, social inequalities that are caused by disease and disability.)

5. Risk in economic analysis

Risks have a central role in economic activities. In capitalist market economies, taking economic risks is an essential part of the role of the entrepreneur. Decisions on investments and activities on financial markets can only be understood against the background of the risks involved. Therefore it is no surprise that modern economic theory, with its emphasis on mathematical models of economic activities, has developed several formal models of risk taking.

Portfolio analysis, which was developed in the 1950s by Harry Markowitz, James Tobin and others, was an important step forward in the economic analysis of risk. These authors employed a simple statistical measure, namely the standard deviation (or alternatively the variance, that is the square of the standard deviation) as a measure of riskiness. Hence, in a comparison between two investment alternatives, the one whose economic outcome is calculated to have the largest standard deviation is regarded as the most risky one. In a comparison between different such alternatives, each of them can be characterized by two numbers, namely its expectation value and its standard deviation or riskiness. Investors typically prefer investments with as high expectation values and as low riskiness as possible. However, investors differ in the relative weight that they assign to expectations respectively risk avoidance. Given these decision weights, an individual's optimal portfolio can be determined.

Since the late 1960s, alternative measures of risk have been developed. Perhaps the most influential of these was provided by Michael Rothschild and Joseph Stiglitz: If we move probability mass from the centre to the tails of a probability distribution, while keeping its mean unchanged, then we increase the risk associated with the distribution. A measure based on this principle (mean preserving spread) can be constructed that has more attractive mathematical properties than those of the older standard deviation measure.

Roughly speaking, a person is risk-averse if she prefers a certain outcome to a risky outcome with the same expected utility. A person's degree of risk aversion can be measured as her willingness to pay (or to accept a lower expected utility) in order to avoid a risk. Provided that an agent's utility function u(x) is twice continuously differentiable, her risk aversion at any point x can be measured as −u′′(x)/u′(x). Hence, a person with the utility function u1 is more risk averse at a point x than one with utility function u2 if and only if −u′′1(x)/u1(x) > −u′′2(x)/u2(x). This is the Arrow-Pratt measure of risk aversion. It has the advantage of being invariant under transformations of the utility function that preserve the preference relation that it represents (i.e. it is invariant under multiplication of the utility with a positive constant and addition of an arbitrary constant).

In later years, economic analysis has been increasingly influenced by studies in psychology and experimental economics. Such studies reveal that actual agents often do not conform with theoretically derived rationality criteria. One of the most popular descriptive theories that tries to capture actual behaviour under risk is prospect theory, which was developed by Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky around 1980. It distinguishes between two stages in a decision process. In the first phase, the editing phase, gains and losses in the different options are identified. They are defined relative to some neutral reference point that is usually the current asset position. In the second phase, the evaluation phase, the options are evaluated in a way that resembles expected utility analysis, but both utilities and probabilities are replaced by other, similar measures. Utility is replaced by a measure that is asymmetrical between gains and losses. Objective probabilities are transformed by a function that gives more weight to probability differences close to the ends than to those near the centre of the distribution. Thus it makes a greater difference to decrease the probability of a negative outcome from 2 to 1 per cent than to decrease it from 51 to 50 percent.

Prospect theory can explain some of the ways in which actual behaviour deviates from theoretical models of rational behaviour under risk. Hence the overweighting of probability changes close to zero or unity can be used to explain why people both buy insurance and buy lottery tickets. However, prospect theory is not plausible as a normative theory for rational behaviour under risk. Probably, normative and descriptive theories of risk will have to go in different directions.


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