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Peter Frederick Strawson

First published Wed Sep 16, 2009

Peter Frederick Strawson (1919–2006) was an Oxford-based philosopher whose career spanned the second half of the twentieth century. He wrote most notably about the philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology and the history of philosophy, especially Kant.

Strawson's basic assumption is that we have no choice but to employ the core concepts of common-sense, those of body, person, space and time, causation, and also those of meaning, reference and truth. Their applicability does not have to be earned by a reduction to a supposedly more basic and secure realm of concepts, such as those of experience as conceived of by the empiricists, or those of science. There is no more basic or secure level of thought. He maintained, in various ways, that sceptical challenges to these categories are spurious and unwarranted. According to Strawson the proper task of metaphysics is to describe these indispensible notions and their interconnections. He opposed philosophical theories of language, such as Russell's or Davidson's, as he interpreted it, which overestimate the degree to which ordinary language is akin to formal languages, and he also opposed sceptical attitudes to the notions of meaning and truth along the lines developed by Quine and Dummett. Within Oxford, Strawson contributed in a major way to the weakening of Austin's influence and helped to re-establish there an engagement with abstract philosophical questions. The range and quality of Strawson's writings made him one of the major philosophers in the period in which he lived, and his work still attracts considerable attention.

1. Life

Peter Frederick Strawson was born, in London, on November 23, 1919. He studied Philosophy, Politics and Economics (PPE) at St. John's College, Oxford, between 1937 and 1940. His philosophy tutors were J.D. Mabbott, an eminent political philosopher, later to become Master of the college, and H. P. Grice, whom Strawson himself described as ‘one of the cleverest and most ingenious thinkers of our time’. (This quotation comes from Strawson's ‘Intellectual Autobiography’ contained in Hahn 1998. Strawson's account there of his life and thought contains much that is of philosophical interest, and it also reveals much about him as a person.) Strawson was then called up for military service and belongs to that generation of British philosophers, including Ayer, Hampshire, Hare, Hart and Wollheim, who saw service in the Second World War. His first post after the war was at Bangor, in Wales, but, after winning the prestigious John Locke Prize in Oxford (a prize awarded on the basis of a written examination to philosophy graduates in Oxford) he received an appointment at University College Oxford, which made him a Fellow in 1948. Two years later, in 1950, with the publication of ‘On Referring’ in Mind and his debate with Austin about truth, he achieved international fame.

His subsequent life as a philosopher was spent mostly in positions at Oxford, first as a Fellow at University College, and then, after 1968, as Gilbert Ryle's successor as Wayneflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy, at Magdalen College. Writing extensively, in both books and articles, about the philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology and the history of philosophy, he succeeded in redirecting Oxford philosophy away from the limitations which had to some extent been accepted under the influence of Austin, towards a re-engagement with some traditional and also some new abstract philosophical issues. He established from the early 1950s onwards a pre-eminence within Oxford philosophy, both through his publications but also by his quite exceptional critical abilities. Part of the way that Strawson's approach to philosophy contrasted with Austin's is that Strawson was committed to the value of publication, of books and articles, whereas Austin seemed content to develop his views and promulgate them in lectures and talks. Simultaneously, Strawson established himself as one of the leading philosophers in the world. His achievements were recognised by election in 1960 to the British Academy, the reception of a knighthood in 1977, and by many other honours. In 1998 he became the twenty sixth philosopher to have a volume devoted to him in the famous Library of Living Philosophers series, adding another British name to the list of recipients of this honour, previous ones being Whitehead, Russell, Moore, Broad and Ayer. He was probably the most famous and most discussed British philosopher within the academic world of philosophy from the 1950s until the late 1980s. His status is evidenced by the fact that his writings attracted the attention of, and were discussed by, the world's leading philosophers, including, Russell, Sellars, Putnam, Quine, Davidson and Kripke.

Strawson was married and had four children. He was a highly cultured man, with a passion for literature, especially poetry, large amounts of which he could recite and which he also wrote. In conversation, manners and appearance, the overwhelming impression was of elegance and effortless intelligence.

Strawson retired in 1987, but remained philosophically active until his death, in Oxford, on February 13, 2006.

2. Reference

Strawson published ‘On Referring’ in 1950. (Like Frege, Russell and, later, Kripke, Strawson made his name by writing about reference.) He subsequently modified and developed his views on reference, but the central claim of ‘On Referring’ is something he always defended. Strawson's title contains, of course, an allusion to Russell's famous article ‘On Denoting’, the central idea of which Strawson is criticising. Strawson's conception of the debate is that Russell offered his theory of descriptions as a complete account of the role of definite descriptions in English, (such expressions as ‘the queen of England’) whereas the truth is that the role of the word ‘the’ when embedded in definite descriptions cannot be captured in a single account. There are uses which Russell's theory does not fit because the phenomenon is simply more complex than Russell allowed. It is not, therefore, that Strawson is offering his own complete theory; it is, rather, that he is picking out uses for which, according to him, Russell's theory fails, and characterising them. Russell's theory had achieved the status of orthodoxy at the time that Strawson launched his attack on it. That this is the way to understand Strawson's contribution to the debate has the important consequence that it is no objection to his approach to point to uses of ‘the’ about which, arguably, Russell (or something close to Russell's view) might be correct. Such points do not touch Strawson's central claim. This undermines a number of responses to Strawson. Strawson's paper initiated a debate about definite descriptions that has run ever since its publication, and in which his views have remained central.

Russell claimed that a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ says; ‘There is one and only one F and it is G.’ The difference from ‘An F is G’ is that the latter merely claims that there is a (G) F, whereas the use of the definite article imports the extra claim of uniqueness. Both are alike in making an existential claim about Fs, namely, there is an F, and hence, according to Russell, at least part of the role of ‘the’ is to be (or to introduce) what is called an existential quantifier. This, in a crude presentation, is Russell's Theory of Definite Descriptions. Against this Strawson argued, first, that it is unsupported. He claimed that Russell's main support for his theory is that a sentence such as ‘The king of France is bald’ remains meaningful even though there is no king of France. It's having meaning cannot, therefore, depend on there being a referent for the apparent subject expression. According to Strawson, Russell infers from that to the conclusion that the semantic role of the apparent subject expression in such sentences (i.e. ‘the F’) cannot be to refer to or designate an object, and must, rather, function as a quantifier. Against this Strawson suggested that the meaningfulness of ‘The F is G’ should be thought of as, roughly, there being rules as to what a use of the sentence in different circumstances will amount to. If the circumstances are right then it can be used in a referring way, if they are not then the use might not succeed in being an act of reference. Strawson's distinction between a sentence's having a meaning and the speech act performed by its use on an occasion is clearly sound and important. One question that was debated is whether Russell's reasons for his theory are all disarmed by the introduction of that distinction.

However, against the Russellian theory itself Strawson made the important point that the theory implies that a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ must count as false when used in circumstances where there is no F. (These cases are often described as ones involving ‘reference failure’). It must do so because, according to the theory, part of the role of ‘The F’ (at least in such declarative sentences) is to say that there is an F. Contrary to this, Strawson claims that we would not always regard a saying of ‘The F is G’ as false in such circumstances. We would not react by saying ‘That is false’ but would rather say something like ‘What do you mean?’ or ‘You must be under a misapprehension’. He suggested that in such circumstances the use amounts neither to saying something true nor to saying something false. It exhibits what came to be called a ‘truth-value gap’. In subsequent discussion it became clear, not that this criticism is definitely mistaken, but that it is difficult to determine what the truth value of sentences involving referential failure actually is. Strawson's main objection to Russell's account is, though, that it is simply obvious that sometimes we use ‘The F’ to refer to or pick out an object, and we do not then use it to say that there is an F.

Strawson's attitude is well presented in a later important paper where he says:

The distinction between identifying reference and uniquely existential assertion is something quite undeniable. The sense in which the existence of something answering to a definite description used for the purpose of identifying reference, and its distinguishability by an audience from anything else, is presupposed and not asserted in an utterance containing such an expression, so used, stands absolutely firm, whether or not one opts for the view that radical failure of the presupposition would deprive the statement of a truth-value. It remains a decisive objection to the theory of Descriptions … that … it amounts to a denial of these undeniable distinctions. (Strawson 1964, 85)

This passage reveals four important aspects of Strawson's approach to definite descriptions. The first is that his fundamental objection to Russell is that it is simply obvious to him as a sensitive and self –reflective user of language that the use of the word ‘the’ does not conform to the theory. Whatever puzzles there may be about language and reference their solution cannot require us to deny such obvious facts. It is a recurring theme in, or perhaps a recurring part of the method of, Strawson's philosophical discussion of language that some aspects of language are more or less obvious to us. Second, the contrast that strikes Strawson as especially obvious is that between saying that there is (one and only one) F and employing the definite description ‘The F’ in certain contexts. If, standing in front of our familiar car, I say to my family, ‘The car will not start’, I am hardly telling them that we have, or there is, a certain car. Why should I engage in a communicative act of that sort? It is the importance of this contrast that impressed Strawson, as opposed to the problem often now raised against Russell's theory, that the uniqueness commitment seems equally problematic. Strawson notes the issue about uniqueness but attends most to the assertion of existence problem. This reading of the nature of Strawson's main objection to Russell implies that a crucial question is whether it is an implication of Russell's analysis that the person employing the description ‘The F’ (in normal discourse) says that there is (one and only one) F. If that is not an implication of Russell's analysis then Strawson's main objection lapses. It might be also asked whether there must be any such problematic implication of analyses of descriptions in terms of quantifiers conceived in a more sophisticated way that emerged only after Russell wrote. Third, one central concept in Strawson's developed description of the role of such an expression as ‘The F’ is that it can be a device for what he calls identifying reference. Roughly, Strawson's idea is that the definite description is sometimes chosen to enable the audience to fix on or pick out as the subject matter of the claim an item of which they already know. In this role it cannot be that ‘the F’ tells them of the existence of such an F, since its role rests on the prior existence of such knowledge. Strawson provides a detailed analysis of this function in the first chapter of Individuals, as well as in the article from which the quotation above comes. Finally, a notion that Strawson introduced in his own description of the nature of definite descriptions and which surfaces in the quotation is that of presupposition. Strawson said that the use of a definite description standardly presupposes the existence of an object fitting the description even though it does not say, nor therefore entail, that there is such an object. This concept met with considerable resistance amongst philosophers but has had a colossal influence on linguists, who have tended to see it as a useful concept in the description of language (see Huang 2007, ch. 7). This paradox encourages us to ask whether it is more likely that linguists or philosophers have the better insight into language.

3. Truth

The other very important debate that Strawson was involved in the early 1950s was that with Austin about truth. Viewed in terms of the politics of Oxford philosophy at that time the debate perhaps represents a power struggle between Austin, the hitherto acknowledged leader and Strawson the younger challenger. Philosophically, Strawson took exception to Austin's attempt (in Austin 1950) to formulate a reconstructed version of the correspondence theory of truth. Austin's account of truth is complex, but, roughly, he held that in saying that a statement is true one is saying that the state of affairs which a particular kind of linguistic convention, which he called the referential conventions, ensure are picked out by the use of the original sentence in the given circumstances, satisfy the conditions which another sort of convention — called the descriptive conventions — target the rest of the sentence onto. Austin's idea can be illustrated with an example. The sentence ‘The television is broken’ is governed by certain referential conventions which target it onto some state of affairs in the world involving a particular television set and there are also certain descriptive conventions built into the sentence linking it to a type of state of affairs (the containing-a-broken-television type) and the former state of affairs conforms to, or falls under, the descriptively correlated type. Strawson, in criticism, principally alleges that Austin had no clear conception of what the supposed referential conventions link sentences with. Is it objects — say the television? But if it is an object then that is not a state of affairs, and certainly not a fact. Strawson also argues that facts and states of affairs should not be regarded as things in the world. He suggests that we employ such nouns as ‘fact’ and ‘state of affairs’ as non-referential devices for expressing claims. Thus, I can say ‘It is a fact that P’ instead of simply saying ‘P’, but the former remark in no way introduces an entity beyond anything introduced in the second claim. (This might be labelled a redundancy theory of facts.) Having queried the ontology of Austin's account, Strawson, somewhat surprisingly seems prepared to allow that the conditions that Austin's account incorporates are, in effect, correlated with the truth of the sentence in question, but, he says, the fulfilment of these conditions is not what we are claiming to obtain when we say that it is true. It is simply obvious that remarks about truth are not remarks about linguistic conventions. This criticism seems to have a similar status to the central criticism of Russell. Strawson's point against Austin is that it is simply obvious that the theory cannot be correct because it is obvious to us as language users that when we speak of truth we are not talking about such things as referential (and descriptive) linguistic conventions. Finally, Strawson pointed out that Austin's account could only apply to a limited range of statements. If I say ‘There are no unicorns’ what are the referential targets of my remark?

Strawson's criticisms were taken by most people to have fatally wounded Austin's theory. The subsequent discussion occasioned by their debate primarily concerned some issues about the degree to which Strawson's criticisms as a whole were fair to Austin, and also whether the approach to truth that Strawson himself favoured was adequate. Strawson's, rather than Austin's account, became the focus of debate. Strawson himself returned to the former question in later articles, arguing persuasively that even on the most charitable interpretation Austin's idea of two sorts of conventions cannot be made sense of. Strawson himself favoured a view which took as the central insight about truth (one deriving from F. P. Ramsey) that to say that P is true is equivalent to saying that P. Strawson's own main contribution to working out this idea was to stress, even though changing his mind about how strongly to stress, the linguistic acts that the word ‘true’ enables us to perform. This leaves Strawson free to point out that even if Ramsey's equivalence is the fundamental core of the notion of truth, it would not follow that the expression ‘true’ is a redundant expression. The presence in our language of the term ‘true’ might be of great, indeed, indispensable, utility.

G. J. Warnock (in Warnock 1964) thought he discerned a problem in Strawson's account because the theory might not allow that in saying that a certain remark is true a speaker is saying something about that remark, which Warnock thought a desirable element in an account of truth. Rather, Warnock felt that according to Strawson the speaker is simply saying the same as the original remark. In his response Strawson pointed out that it is possible to incorporate reference to the statement in the analysis he gave of truth ascriptions. Thus, the claim ‘John's statement that P is true’ can be treated as equivalent to (say) ‘P, as John's statement said’. This is ingenious, but it leaves one aspect of Strawson's view unexplained, and it may have been this aspect that Warnock was trying to home in on. Strawson stressed that it was statements that were truth bearers. If, however, truth should not be thought of as a property of anything, then what is the point of carefully identifying the things that are its bearers? (On some of these issues, see Searle 1998.)

4. Logical Theory

Strawson published his first book An Introduction to Logical Theory in 1952. In it Strawson attempt to explain the nature, and the scope and limits, of formal logic. The eminence he had already achieved was reflected in the fact that it received a review by Quine in Mind. Strawson's aim, generated, in part, by his reflections on the correct treatment of definite descriptions, is to say what formal logic is. Strawson tries to explain or elucidate the central concepts of formal logic. One of these is the notion of entailment. Strawson favours explaining ‘P entails Q’ as ‘‘P and not Q’ is self contradictory’, and explains or elucidates the notion of self contradiction in terms of sentences saying nothing, in effect, they give and then take back simultaneously. Strawson then looks at the notion of form and of proof systems. He applies his ideas to traditional syllogistic logic as well as to modern propositional and predicate logic. It can be wondered how far his elucidation of the central notions is adequate, and it can also be wondered whether he attends to all the notions that need explanation in relation to formal logic (e.g., consistency and completeness). It is my impression that the main part of his book did not have a large influence on philosophers or logicians. However, three elements in his discussion had and continue to have considerable influence. He gave a fuller explanation of the notion of presupposition than he had previously provided. Second, Strawson asked how far the meaning of ordinary language connectives, such as ‘and’, ‘or’ and ‘if … then…’, can be equated with those of the truth functional connectives, such as ‘&’, ‘∨’, and ‘→’, that logicians employ. Strawson argued that there are significant differences. His conclusion is that these ordinary expressions do not have what might be called a precise logic. The question that Strawson asked has continued to be central in the philosophy of language, and there has been no resolution of it. Grice took an opposite view to Strawson and part of the point of his account of implication, as opposed to meaning or saying, was to generate an explanation for the data that Strawson appealed to in arguing for a semantic difference between ordinary language and formal logic, without having to postulate a semantic difference. Strawson himself later criticised Grice's theory, at least in relation to conditionals. This debate is still very active. The third element was the approach to the problem of induction that Strawson proposed in the final chapter. I shall describe that later when looking at Strawson's contribution to epistemology.

5. Individuals

In 1959 Strawson published his second book Individuals. It is ambitious, abstract, wide ranging and original, and it has continued to be read and discussed, especially the first half. Strawson coined the terms ‘descriptive metaphysics’ to capture his task and opposed that to what he called ‘revisionary metaphysics’. By using ‘metaphysics’ Strawson was primarily emphasising the abstractness and generality of his questions. A consequence of this generality, Strawson suggests, is that the methods needed for settling the questions are different in kind from those employed in debating less abstract conceptual or philosophical questions. One such method, employed in chapter 2, when exploring the sound world, involves imagining creatures with quite different experiences to our own, and trying to determine their capacities for thinking about objects. By calling it ‘descriptive’ Strawson means, in part, that he is not recommending revisions or additions to how we think, but I think the term also signals Strawson's conviction that there is a shared and universal conceptual scheme which we human beings have, and know that we have, and for which no justification in terms of more fundamental concepts or claims can be given. All, or almost all, we can do, therefore, is to describe and analyse it (or parts of it). As Strawson notes, his aim is to engage with one part of that total structure, namely our ability to direct our thoughts, and speech, onto items in the world. It is possible therefore to see Individuals as, in part, a development of Strawson's interest in reference.

Individuals is very much a book of two halves. In the first four chapters Strawson's focus is on our ability to refer to and think about items in our environment, including ourselves. In the second part, again of four chapters, the aim is to elucidate the distinction between subject expressions and predicate expressions. This latter task belongs more to philosophical logic or the philosophy of language than metaphysics, but the link is, according to Strawson, that the central cases of subject expressions are those picking out the entities to which we basically refer, the character of which it has been the task of the first half to determine. Since, in fact, the book's colossal and immediate impact was due primarily to the brilliance and originality of its first three chapters, I shall describe them in somewhat more detail than the rest of the book. The truth is that reading the argument developed in those chapters generates a continuous intellectual excitement, which the later chapters do not quite match. It is also true that issues to do with the subject-predicate distinction appeal to fewer people than do the issues focused on in the early part.

The question to which chapter 1 is devoted is whether there is a category of entities which we can think about without depending on thought about entities of other categories. The focus initially is not so much on thought as on linguistically referring to something when in conversation with an audience, and Strawson clarifies the relevant idea of talking about an item by invoking the notion of identifying reference which emerged in his theory of reference. Strawson proposes the following model of latching onto an identifying reference. One case is where the referent is picked out as a currently perceived item – say, this page. In such a case the audience succeeds when they pick out the same item in their own field of experience. The other is where it is picked out as falling under a description. Strawson's idea is that ultimately such descriptions need to relate the item in some way to currently perceived items – say, as the author of this page. (Such a two fold structure of thought was also accepted by Russell, but arguments in the theory of perception persuaded him that the perceived scene was private rather than, as Strawson holds, public.) Strawson's further idea is that the descriptive relations are fundamentally spatio-temporal. Thus my ability to think of James I rests on thinking of him as the person ascending the throne in 1603, the present time being 2008. Ultimately I fix on him via his place in a spatio-temporal framework which is centred on my currently perceived environment. Strawson further points out that since we need to update this relational framework over time as we move around, we need to be able to re-identify objects and also places encountered at different times. Strawson draws an epistemological conclusion from this. Since our ability to maintain a grasp on the spatio-temporal framework depends on acceptance of such identifications it is incoherent to be sceptical about the procedures we rely on to confirm them while still thinking in terms of the spatio-temporal framework itself. Strawson is then in a position to answer his fundamental question as to whether there is a basic category of items of reference. Obviously reference to theoretical entities is dependent, as is reference to experiences, which rests on reference to their subjects – for example, Mary's pain in her leg. Strawson's assumption seems to be that that leaves two candidates; material bodies (in a broad sense) and occurrences. Occurrences, however, cannot be basic since, standardly they are picked out dependently – e.g., the fire in that house - and, moreover, according to Strawson, they do not form a structured framework allowing the spatio-temporal framework to be grounded. Bodies (in a fairly inclusive sense) emerge as referentially basic.

Strawson next asks, in chapter 2, whether it is possible to think of objective entities in a conceptual scheme in which the basic entities are not bodies. Since, according to the initial argument, if referential thought rests on a spatio-temporal framework then it rests on thought about bodies, this question becomes; can there be thought about objective entities which is non-spatial? Strawson therefore investigates the idea of a creature with only auditory experience, the assumption being that auditory experience on its own is non-spatial. Just what objective notions would be available to such a creature? He imaginatively enters into the sound world to see how far ideas analogous to those that space makes available can be found. The best option relies on relating individual sounds to a continuous ‘master sound’ which, as it were, defines something analogous to space. Strawson himself appears to think this might work. Strawson's view seems to be that although spatio-temporal thinking rests on bodies, objective thinking cannot be shown to require spatio-temporal thinking, but even in the case of the sound world there is in the subject's thought something which performs a role analogous to the role that thought about space performs for us.

In the next chapter, entitled ‘Persons’, Strawson leaves behind speculation about concepts based on attenuated experiences, and focuses on our rich thought about ourselves. His argument involves a comparison between three conceptions of such thought. The first is what he calls the no-ownership view. It is the idea that we do not really refer to ourselves when we use the first person pronoun, even though we seem to. There is nothing that owns or has the experiences to which to refer. Strawson's response is to argue that once this view is developed genuine self reference emerges as involved in the theory's explanation of the illusion of ownership of experiences. It is worth asking whether it is a decisive objection to the no-ownership theory that an incoherence emerges in its standard explanation as to why the correctness of the theory does not strike people. Why must it supply such an explanation? The second conception is that deriving from Descartes, according to which, the item that ‘I’ picks out is something distinct from the physical body. Strawson argues that this conception collides with a basic principle about psychological thought; it says that one can ascribe experiences to oneself only if one is prepared to ascribe them to others. To fulfil this one must be able to pick out other subjects, and that means they cannot be, as Descartes claimed, non-spatial. Strawson concludes that when we self-refer we refer to an entity which has two sides or aspects, the physical and the mental, and not to a thing which possesses only the mental sort of feature, something else having the physical features. In effect, Strawson is representing ordinary thought as having the structure of what others have called a dual-aspect theory. Persons are things with two aspects – bodily and mental. He famously describes this as the idea that the concept of a person is a primitive concept. Second, since we can self-ascribe we must be able to other-ascribe, and that means that our methods for doing so must be adequate. As Strawson puts it, the criteria we employ for psychological ascription to others must be ‘logically adequate’. There cannot, therefore, be a genuine problem of other minds. Again, as in the first chapter, Strawson derives a significant epistemological consequence from his conceptual investigations. This famous chapter has exercised a fascination on philosophers thinking about ourselves and has been, perhaps, as much discussed as any piece of philosophical argument that Strawson wrote. (For interesting discussion of this chapter see Ayer 1963, and Martin 1969.)

Finally, Strawson takes Leibniz as an opponent of some of his major theses and considers whether Leibniz might be able to avoid his conclusions. He argues, displaying considerable ingenuity in suggesting different interpretations of Leibniz, that Leibniz does not escape the problems.

Individuals then shifts focus onto the subject-predicate distinction. Strawson's initial aim is, in effect, to show that a novel theory is required. There are two reasons. First, we lack a proper explanation as to why absolutely anything can be the reference of a subject expression but only universals can be what predicates express. Second, he classifies the different accounts on offer and argues that they are either open to objection, or open to the demand for further explanation. The contrast between subjects and predicates that Strawson himself proposes for the central cases is that understanding a subject expression depends on the possession of empirical information whereas the understanding of predicates does not. For example, to understand the name ‘James I’ I need to know something like; there was a king who ascended the throne in 1603. But to understand the predicate ‘… is triangular’ there is no empirical information about the world that I need to grasp. There need not be, or have been, any triangles at all. I have, rather, to grasp the principle of classification linked to the term. Strawson's proposal is ingenious, but faces a number of questions. First, is it clear that all predicates express principles of classification the grasp of which involves no empirical knowledge? Consider such natural kind involving predicates as ‘is gold’ or ‘is a dog’. Second, is it obvious that understanding subject expressions requires accepting the empirical claims, as opposed to merely knowing what the assumptions are? Third, what entitles Strawson to attach a priority within his account to empirical claims? Why is non-empirical discourse, such as mathematics, to be regarded as secondary? Strawson then attempts to explain some other elucidations of the subject-predicate distinction as deriving from his own suggestion, and to develop a more general criterion on the basis of his own account having captured the core cases. In the next chapter Strawson asks the very interesting and novel question whether, just as the employment of (the core type of) subject expressions presupposes empirical information, there is a type of proposition the truth of which is presupposed by subject-predicate propositions in general. He picks out what he calls feature-placing sentences, such as ‘It is raining’. Such a sentence does not designate an object and describe it, rather the sentence affirms the presence of a feature. Strawson argues that where there are true subject-predicate propositions there must also be true feature-placing sentences. That is his answer to the question.

Indivduals is far richer in argument than I have been able to convey. It occasioned, more or less immediately, considerable debate, and has continued to do so ever since. The epistemological conclusions that Strawson advanced, both about bodies and about other minds, were closely scrutinized. The overall arguments of the chapter on persons and the chapter on bodies were closely analysed. The contrast between descriptive and revisionary metaphysics, although briefly presented by Strawson, entered into the folk taxonomy of philosophy. As well as occasioning disagreement, Strawson's book stimulated, over time, a series of books all of which could be described as essays in descriptive metaphysics with a similar focus to, though not with identical conclusions to, Individuals. These include Gareth Evans’ The Varieties of Reference, John Campbell's Past, Space and Self, and David Wiggins, Sameness and Substance. (For a good general critical discussion of Individuals see Williams 1961.)

6. The Bounds of Sense

In 1966, seven years after the publication of Individuals Strawson published his third book, The Bounds of Sense. Strawson's aim is to isolate and defend what is valuable and worth preserving as opposed to those aspects he sees as the dubious in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. Strawson has no sympathy with Kant's description of his task as the explanation of the possibility of synthetic a priori judgements, the notions not being properly explained, and he substitutes the idea of determining what modifications of and combinations within conceptual schemes we can make sense of. Even if the Kantian notions are dubious it may be wondered whether Strawson own categories are clear enough to identify a theoretical goal. Strawson also abandons Kant's Transcendental Idealism, though he explores its interpretation with great care and considers why Kant might have adopted it. Any account true to Kant must at least credit his view with acceptance of the thesis that real objects, things in themselves, are unknowable and beyond our experience. But there seems no coherent way to fit ourselves as objects into such a framework. If we do receive appearances, as Kant claims, is that not actually a truth about ourselves that we know? Or is it only an appearance that we receive appearances? That is barely intelligible. The rejection of Transcendental Idealism requires Strawson to scrutinize Kant's arguments for it, and he very carefully and sympathetically analyses, and of course rejects, Kant's arguments about space and time, and geometry, and also the argument, presented in the Antinomies, that transcendental realism generates contradictions. Strawson further abandons much of Kant's talk of mechanisms of synthesis in the generation of proper experience. There seems no coherent way to explain what the materials are that such mechanisms work on, nor really how they work.

This leaves Strawson free to explore and evaluate the constructive and the destructive elements of the Critique. In his constructive phase Kant argues that our experience must be of recognisably independent objective items, which are spatial, temporal, and must satisfy some strong principles of permanence and causation. Strawson argues, with both care and brilliance, that Kant's arguments are, in various ways, defective, but that somewhat weaker, but nonetheless important, conclusions along similar lines can be defended. The most interesting part of Strawson's own argument is his defence of the claim that the experience of a self conscious creature must involve and be recognised as involving perception of objects. Strawson's reconstruction of the argument relies on the idea that the experiences of a self conscious creature must provide room for the thought of experience itself. But one can apply that notion only in the context of the application of categories of things which are not experiences. However, such categories can be available to a subject only if its experiences provide it with the grounds for applying them, which involves the idea that its experiences relate it to non-experiences, that is to say, independent things. Strawson then develops further requirements analogous to, but weaker than, those Kant advances in the Analogies. Kant's Dialectic also supplies Strawson with elements to develop as well as elements to reject. Strawson brings out the insights in the Paralogisms which undermine arguments for dualistic theories of the self. The chief problem for Kant is, according to Strawson, that his transcendental idealism prevents him from proposing a plausible and realistic account of ourselves.

The Bounds of Sense had an immediate impact and continues to be extremely influential. It altered the face of Kantian scholarship by suggesting novel and very well supported interpretations and criticisms of Kant. It represents a sympathetic reading of Kant that any account of him must now come to terms with. But it also, as Putnam remarks, ‘opened the way to a reception of Kant's philosophy by analytic philosophers’ (Putnam 1998 in Hahn 1998, 273). On one interpretation The Bounds of Sense represents a general and continuous essay in epistemology. Strawson's idea is that a traditional form of philosophical scepticism can be opposed by a style of argument that Kant himself developed, in which the claims about which the sceptic is sceptical can be shown to be involved in the sceptics’ own understanding of his position and view. Thus, the sceptics says that their experiences afford no knowledge of the objective world, but the ascription to themselves of experiences rests on and requires acceptance of the judgements they are sceptical of. The arguments which reveal the dependence are called Transcendental Arguments. As we saw, Strawson presented this same (or a related) style of argument in Individuals. In the years following its publication this anti-sceptical response was closely investigated, a large literature on it was generated, including notably a number of powerful contributions by the American philosopher Barry Stroud. (See Stroud 1968 and 1999.) One problem is that it is extraordinarily difficult to show that there are the conceptual dependencies which such transcendental arguments rely on. Interestingly, Strawson himself soon devised a different response to scepticism, but it is also true that the anti-sceptical approach that Strawson developed here remains appealing to a range of epistemologists, and this debate continues.

The chief issues that have been raised about The Bounds of Sense are the following. (1) Does Strawson himself provide a satisfactory identification of a good question that Kant's Critique can be regarded as trying to answer? At about the same time that Strawson published his book on Kant, Jonathan Bennett, in his book Kant's Analytic suggested that Kant's claims have to be regarded as unobviously analytic if they are to be correct. Is Strawson's conception better than this? (2) Is Strawson's interpretation of Kant – especially his account of transcendental idealism – correct? (3) Does Strawson defend the anti-sceptical transcendental arguments cogently?

7. Later Books

Strawson published three more books (other than collections of essays) in English (plus another in French which overlaps with one of those in English). In 1974 Subject and Predicate in Logic and Grammar appeared. Strawson himself described this book as ‘probably the most ambitious and certainly the one that has received the least attention’ (Strawson 2004, ix). .He is right about the second point but not, I suspect, about the first. It is an ambitious book, but can hardly be ranked above either Individuals or The Bounds of Sense in that respect! In the first part of it Strawson presents a revised version of his account of the normal subject-predicate distinction, and also presents a partial theory of one particular case of subject expressions, namely proper names. In this he was responding to the emergence of direct referential accounts of the kind that Kripke had made popular. The discussion of the subject-predicate distinction is clearer and more direct than the one achieved in Individuals. What Strawson particularly brings out is that in ordinary language predicates have a complex role, involving the indication of universals, the expression of exemplification, plus expression also of temporal aspects. This functional complexity explains the correctness of certain other accounts of the distinction. No consensus about the assessment of Strawson's proposal has emerged, the reason being that there has still been no very general interest in the subject-predicate distinction. In the second part, Strawson develops an approach to the understanding of grammar in which he attempts to relate grammar, in the sense of syntax, to much more basic functional specifications of the elements of a language.

It becomes possible to see actual grammars as different ways to achieve these functional roles. Again, no consensus has emerged about this highly original way to think about grammar.

In 1985 Strawson published Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties. The book grew out of Strawson's Woodbridge Lectures at Columbia University in 1983. It is, in a sense, a book of philosophy about philosophy. In each chapter Strawson focuses on a philosophical dispute in which there is a strong tendency to deny the reality or existence of an aspect which common sense affirms. The term ‘skepticism’ in the title stands for this general sceptical tendency. One case is that of knowledge itself, denied by the philosophical sceptic. Another case is the denial of, for example, the reality of colour by scientifically inspired philosophers. A third example is the denial of the reality of thought and experience by a certain sort of materialist. In each case, Strawson's aim is to deny the denial, and to explain, as one might say, how philosophers can have their cake and eat it. The book is about philosophy in another sense, namely it employs and illuminates some ideas from earlier philosophers, especially Hume and Wittgenstein, and reveals Strawson's very deep understanding of them. The book marks, also, a further development in Strawson's engagement with epistemological scepticism. Strawson expresses agreement with some of his earlier critics (in particular Stroud) that transcendental arguments are problematic as anti-sceptical devices, and suggests instead that scepticism can be set aside because no-one is persuaded by sceptical arguments. Philosophical sceptical doubts are not serious doubts, and so are not to be taken seriously. This further twist in Strawson's epistemology has, again, inspired considerable debate, and no consensus has yet emerged. The chief worry is that Strawson's point that no one is remotely inclined to accept the sceptic's claim that there is no knowledge establishes at most that we regard such arguments as having the status of defending a paradoxical conclusion, which in itself does not explain why the conclusion is incorrect. That remains to be done. However, as well as being an original contribution to epistemology the book presents an approach to ontology which deserves to be called Oxonian, because it has been popular in Oxford. The idea is that there is no good reason not to be realists about most aspects of the world, including colour, mentality, and meaning, (and perhaps value) but that does not require the defence of a reduction to some features of a supposedly more fundamental realm. This can be called the idea of relaxed pluralism. Relaxed pluralism might be reasonable, and in the face of it supporters of reduction need to defend their approach, but it raises more issues than Strawson seems to allow. The requirement to say more seems especially clear when Strawson discusses the mind/body problem.

Finally, in 1992, Strawson published Analysis and Metaphysics: an Introduction to Philosophy. Strawson had given introductory lectures once he became a professor, and the lectures became this book. It is, again, a book about philosophy, contrasting different conceptions of the subject, and defending Strawson's own conception of the nature and value of analysis. Strawson's attitude is that the aim of analysis is to reveal conceptual links and connexions, thereby illuminating some features of our concepts, but that there is no favoured basic level of thought to which it is the goal of philosophical analysis to reduce everything else. Echoing the name for his conception of ontology, one might call that a conception of relaxed analysis. Strawson in fact repeatedly wrote about the nature of philosophy, and the views in this book are his final conclusions. It is also a book in which he practises what he preaches in relation to certain chosen areas, including, for example, the topics of causation and explanation, experience, meaning, and freedom. Whether it is a good introductory book or not, it is certainly a deep and interesting treatment of its topics for the non-beginner! Strawson himself prepares the reader by remarking brilliantly that the book ‘though introductory … is not elementary. There is no such thing as elementary philosophy. There is no shallow end to the philosophical pool’ (Strawson 1992, vii).

8. Some Themes in Strawson's Writings

Strawson contributed ideas to debates about a wide range of topics, only some of which can be described here. I have selected five areas to describe.

8.1 Perception

Strawson made a major contribution to the theory of perception. His conception is articulated to some extent in The Bounds of Sense, but also in a series of articles, of which the most famous is ‘Perception and Its Objects’ (1979). He suggests that the concept of perception should be analysed as a causal concept. His version of the causal theory differs from that of Grice, who also famously argued a similar analysis, in two main respects. First, Strawson argues for it in additional ways, notably by attempting to derive the conclusion from the idea that perception is essentially a method of acquiring knowledge. Strawson suggests that this requires that the concept of perception is a causal concept. Second, Strawson claims that Grice's attempt to spell out the right causal chain by picking it out via examples is circular, and he replaces it by invoking notions of match and range. Strawson's version attracted considerable attention. But more important, he emphasised that there is no way to describe perceptual experience in terms which are not physical-object concept involving. The attempt to do so he takes to be the crucial mistake of the traditional empiricist model, as represented, for example, in the thought of A. J. Ayer. According to Strawson we are not reading in or interpreting our experiences when we respond to them by making objective judgements. We are simply endorsing their content. Strawson therefore holds that it is myth to suppose that we can locate a level of claim on the basis of which we can defend the validity of our application of physical object concepts. Rather, our experience is ‘saturated’ by those concepts themselves. In a more recent terminology, Strawson holds that perception involves the occurrence in us of experiences having objective representational content, and that there can be hallucinations with a similar content but which are not properly perceptual because the complex causal requirements for being perceptual are not met.

8.2 Language

Strawson's contribution to the philosophy of language is also far more extensive and important than so far indicated. He developed his views in relation to the leading ideas of others about language. One conception that he opposed is that of Quine. Writing with Grice, he argued that Quine's criticisms of the idea of analyticity rest on a commitment to a kind of reduction that itself is simply a dogma. Moreover, repeatedly over the next twenty years he argued that Quine's frankly sceptical approach to meaning, and related notions, is both unfounded and also wrong in that it deprives us of notions that we cannot do without, in the study of logic and language. Strawson also engaged with Davidson's account of meaning. His main engagement came in his inaugural lecture ‘Meaning and Truth’ (1969), but also elsewhere. Strawson suggests that truth is itself a notion secondary to saying (and communication) and cannot play the role in an account of meaning that Davidson proposed. His other reaction to the Davidsonian programme, which accepted a notion of logical form for natural language sentences specified in the complex formulae of predicate logic, was that there is no requirement to map ordinary language onto artificial logical structures, nor does that capture ordinary meaning anyway. This attitude of Strawson's placed him in opposition to a movement of thought that swept through Oxford's younger philosophers during the time he was a professor. What Strawson never quite achieved was an alternative explanation to Davidson's of what a theory of meaning should be. His attitude to truth, and his slogan that ordinary language has no precise logic, implied that centring an analysis of meaning on truth conditions and a search for logical forms in natural language expressible in the predicate calculus was not correct. Given these constraints though he did not indicate how we do understand linguistic utterances. Strawson also made important contributions, on a number of occasions, to the assessment of Austin's theory of speech acts, and also in relation to Grice's own model of meaning. Finally, he responded to the anti-realist approach developed by Dummett, which also gained its adherents, in ‘Scruton and Wright on Anti-Realism’ (1976), a brief but brilliant critique which argued that there are no obvious reasons to adopt the anti-realist account of truth, and moreover that it is hard to make it consistent with what appear to be obvious facts about the knowability (or unknowability) of our psychological lives and also the past.

8.3 History of Philosophy

Another theme that needs stressing is Strawson's engagement with the history of philosophy. The Bounds of Sense is an entire book devoted to Kant, but Strawson also wrote many other articles about him. In other places he wrote about Descartes, especially his account of selves, Hume, Leibniz, who is the hero or perhaps anti-hero of chapter 4 of Individuals, and about Spinoza, especially his theory of freedom. From the last century, he wrote about Wittgenstein, in a famous review of the Investigations, but also about Moore. These writings reveal both a deep knowledge and a deep understanding of these thinkers, never unsympathetic and always able to see the wood as well as the trees. Strawson had a sense of the age of philosophical problems and of the insights from the great dead philosophers that need preserving and renewing.

8.4 Scepticism and knowledge

I have plotted to some extent the development of Strawson's epistemological views, but have not described his earliest proposal in relation to the problem of induction. In An Introduction to Logical Theory he pioneered what came to be called the ‘analytical solution’, according to which there cannot be any question as to the rationality of the employment of induction, since by being rational we mean, amongst other things, using induction. The question whether induction is rational resembles, according to this approach, the question whether the law is legal. Since ‘being legal’ means ‘being in accordance with the law’, there can be no question about the legality of the law. This remains a discussed approach. In Individuals he talked of the satisfaction of certain conditions as being criterial for the ascription of some disputed claims, and justified that by transcendental arguments. The Bounds of Sense can be regarded as an extended anti-sceptical transcendental argument. Finally, in Skepticism and Naturalism he attempts to oppose the sceptic by appealing to the non-seriousness of sceptical arguments. The unity amongst all Strawson's proposals is that the response to scepticism is never the production of a proof or demonstration based on a level of thought external and prior to the discourse in question. Each solution aims to turn aside scepticism in some other way. Strawson's ingenuity in devising such responses is very impressive and he is the source of at least three major currently investigated anti-sceptical approaches.

8.5 Freedom and Resentment

Strawson always joked that he would turn to moral philosophy only when his powers were waning. He wrote very little about that, but his main contribution, ‘Freedom and Resentment’ (Strawson 1960), is perhaps now his most famous and widely discussed paper. Strawson's purpose is to dissolve the so called problem of determinism and responsibility. His argument is that our ‘reactive attitudes’ towards others and ourselves, such attitudes as gratitude, anger, sympathy and resentment, are natural and irrevocable. Their presence, therefore, needs no abstract entitlement from philosophy, which is simply irrelevant to their existence or justification. There cannot be abstract a priori principles locating general metaphysical conditions for such attitudes. His claim is that our practice of holding ourselves and each other responsible for actions is similarly natural and not dependent on general metaphysical requirements. Between determinism and responsibility there can be no conflict. One might see in this an application of some ideas of a Humean character to a domain to which Hume himself was not inclined to apply them.

9. Conclusion

Strawson did not seek to make disciples, nor did he write too much by way of defence of his views against critics (except, as it were, when he had to). However, he produced a continuous flow of original and profound, and elegantly expressed, philosophy dealing with a very broad range of topics. He thereby exerted a considerable influence on philosophy, both during his lifetime and, indeed, since his death.


Primary Literature

A. Books by Strawson

B. Selected Articles by Strawson

Secondary Literature

A. Books

The following books include collections of articles and journal issues, about P. F. Strawson.

B. Selected Books and Articles

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Austin, John Langshaw | descriptions | Grice, Paul | Kant, Immanuel | liberty | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | Russell, Bertrand | skepticism | truth