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Walter Chatton

First published Tue Jun 20, 2006; substantive revision Mon Sep 10, 2007

Walter Chatton or more rarely "Catton" (c. 1290 – 1343) was an English theologian and philosopher who trained at Oxford around the same time as his famous colleague and frequent philosophical target, William of Ockham. More inclined to speculative metaphysics and less skeptical of reason than Ockham, Chatton was one of the most energetic and gifted critics of the influential brand of nominalism which arose in early fourteenth-century England around Ockham. As a constructive philosopher, Chatton was not a system-builder, but a defender of certain parts of the more systematic philosophy of John Duns Scotus, and an advocate of perspectivist accounts of cognition. Historically he is an interesting figure because he combined the realist tendencies of Scotism with the appreciation of logic and language we see in Ockham;  thus it is common to find Chatton defending Scotistic theses and criticizing Ockham using the same sorts of semantic ideas that Ockham himself popularized. His unyielding attacks on Ockham bore him fruit intellectually and otherwise:  we have evidence of Ockham changing his mind on several seminal issues as a direct result of Chatton's critiques. Moreover, he seems to have built a very successful ecclesiastical career, no doubt based in part on his cleverness; he served as an advisor to two popes, and earned for himself, but did not live long enough to enjoy, a bishopric in Wales. His stature as a theologian rose high enough in his lifetime that his opinions on sacramental efficacy were remembered and cited at the Council of Trent, two hundred years after his death.

Although his importance has long been known to Ockham specialists, complete critical editions of his work have only recently become available, and detailed scholarly analysis of his views, influence, and intellectual life are in a nascent stage. Consequently, this article will not summarize his positions under broad, modern headings such as ‘metaphysics’, ‘epistemology’, etc., but will rather present exposition and analysis of his contributions to several narrower problems which remain philosophically viable today.

1. Life

Chatton's life and career can be divided into four stages.[1]

Childhood, ordination, and philosophical training (birth to 1315). Walter Chatton was born between 1285 and 1290 in the small village of Chatton, just west of Durham, in the far north of modern England. He entered the Franciscan Order before the age of 14, and was ordained a subdeacon on 20 May, 1307. He very likely received his early education and philosophical training in the north as well.

Early bachelor of theology studies (1315 to 1321). During this period Chatton finished his early education and was sent south to Oxford to study theology. There he came in contact with William Ockham who was lecturing at Oxford at this same time, although at a slightly more advanced career stage. Chatton began to oppose Ockham very early and very vocally, and this opposition was to last the entire duration of his Oxford career (i.e., into the early 1330s).

Advanced bachelor studies and regency (1321 to 1333). We have the least amount of hard biographical data for this period, although it is clearly the most interesting and intense intellectual period of his life. Textual evidence allows us to argue with varying degrees of certainty that four of his five extant works – Reportatio, Lectura (which includes the separately edited Collatio et Prologus), Quodlibet, De paupertate evangelica, and Sermo de visione beatifica – were written during this period.[2] We have long possessed reasonable dates (although they are wide, in one case) for the first two of these works:  he probably delivered his Reportatio lectures during the academic biennium 1321–23, and his Lectura must have been written between 1324 and 1330.[3] The first three works listed above are of primary philosophical importance in his corpus. During this period Chatton delivered an important set of lectures in which Ockhamism is strenuously criticized (probably in London), completed his training at Oxford, and attained the final academic rank marking that achievement, regent master, in academic year 1329–1330.[4]

Later career in Avignon, and death (1333 to 1343/4). Chatton is known to have been in Avignon on 17 January, 1333. He was summoned there in order to participate in hearings against Thomas Waleys, and eventually he served as an advisor to Pope Benedict XII. His career took an excellent upward turn in 1343 when he was appointed bishop of the Welsh See of Asaph, but this good fortune reversed itself when it turned out the position was not really vacant. That winter, earthly good fortune gave up on Chatton completely, and he died in Avignon, late in 1343 or perhaps early 1344.[5]

2. Intellectual World

Three points should be noted about Chatton's intellectual environment. First, the theological context in which Chatton and his contemporary philosopher-theologians operated was religiously framed but not intellectually static or sterile. The central metaphysical tenets of the faith were treated as fixed-points, not hypotheses, but mediaeval Latin philosophers varied widely in their attitudes, and much of this variability is easily recognizable to modern people – there are skeptics, realists, nominalists, etc.

A second, connected point concerns the genres of mediaeval philosophical writing. Much of mediaeval philosophy was written in the form of commentaries or debates with contemporaries (sometimes polemical, sometimes not). There are no mediaeval ‘research articles’ and not many systematic, seemingly spontaneous meditations on philosophical topics by theologians. There was little concern, in short, with doctrinal or topical originality, broadly speaking.  Rather, to exposit past masters with clarity and ingenuity, to match wits skillfully with one's contemporaries – these were the chief activities of the philosopher-theologians. All Chatton's written works were commissioned in an academic or ecclesiastical context, hence all are in this way theological, but they contain much which almost any modern person would identify as philosophically interesting and innovative.

Third, it is useful to know that Chatton's immediate academic and intellectual world was small and intense, shaped mostly by figures and events at the University of Paris and at Oxford. His primary opponents, interlocutors, and sources were Aristotle and Augustine among the ancients, but among contemporaries and near-contemporaries he cites Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, William Ockham, Richard Campsall, Adam Wodeham, and Peter Auriol. In particular, much of his writing is so shaped by debates against Ockham (some of them conducted not only in writing but almost certainly face-to-face) that his mature views are nearly unintelligible in their details apart from Ockham's philosophy, and vice versa. Especially illustrative of this interdependence is Chatton's anti-Ockhamist ontological principle, often called his ‘anti-razor’.

3. The Anti-Razor

3.1 Ontological Commitment

Philosophers frequently disagree about what is real. Sometimes they disagree so profoundly on this matter for so long a time that they see themselves as members of schools or parties in a conflict, or as part of larger historical trends that play themselves out over and over in the history of ideas. For example, some philosophers tend to argue for all kinds of invisible metaphysical structure in the world — that numbers, properties, causality, free will, etc., are all entities in their own right, somehow existing independently of our grasp or use of them, as real in their own way as the ordinary physical objects we seem constantly to rely on in daily life. We usually call such people ‘realists’. But others see this outlook as a theoretical extravagance, a needless proliferation of ontology. We tag partisans of such views ‘nominalists’.

It often happens that parties on either side of such debates will seek leverage against their opponents by articulating higher level rules meant to govern metaphysics itself – rules meant to apply, not to the question ‘What is real?’, but instead to the question ‘What methods of argument are rightly applied to the question "What is real?"’ In other words, philosophers sometimes argue not about what is real but about what is the best way to argue about what is real. The goal is often negative:  if a philosopher does not believe in the existence of some entity X, he or she may try to show that a philosophical opponent leans on a weak or irrational style of argumentation generally when arguing that X exists. Occasionally such debates show an intense connection with philosophy of language, since one common way to make a realist argument that X exists is to say that, for instance, certain sentences cannot be true or false unless entities like X exist. Under the influence of the articulate twentieth-century American philosopher W. V. O. Quine, this issue – when and whether certain facts about language require us to admit that certain kinds of entities exist – is often referred to as ‘ontological commitment’.

Quine himself was a nominalist, as was Ockham. Both of them repudiated certain realist styles of argumentation in the metaphysics of their own times. Ockham in particular was so famous for this attitude that we still discuss reductionary explanatory tendencies under the label ‘Ockham's razor’ — do not multiply entities beyond necessity.

3.2 The Chatton Principle

But as it is usually understood today, this is not a principle that Ockham believed in or defended; neither is it specific enough of a principle of ontological commitment to attach seriously and exclusively to one philosopher. Ockham's actual theory of ontological commitment was something like this:

No extra-mental distinction among extra-mental things (res) should be assumed unless it can be proved (a) by arguments from self-evident premises, or premises of indubitable experience or, (b) by unquestionable experience of extra-mental things, or (c) by some infallible authority such as the Bible, the Saints, or certain Ecclesiastical pronouncements.

Since it gives negative advice, telling us when not to make a distinction among things, it is reductive in orientation, and we might call it one example of a principle of parsimony. Ockham coupled this attitude to a complex and original theory of how sentences get to be true. When coupled these two theories yielded interesting arguments which reject the existence of motion, and of most relations.

Chatton seemed to think that relying on this standard would yield bad results in certain cases; in particular he thought that despite Ockham's insistence to the contrary, certain semantic arguments could be adduced to establish the existence of a restricted class of relations. He developed his attack on Ockham and supported his own ontological commitment to real relations with a counter-razor he called propositio mea = ‘my proposition’ and an ars respondendi = ‘a method of responding’, and also simply regula mea = ‘my rule’. I shall call it the ‘Chatton Principle’, to contrast with ‘Ockham's Razor’.

Here is an early general formulation of the Chatton Principle from Reportatio I d. 30, q. 1, a. 4:

  1. Consider an affirmative proposition, which, when it is verified, is verified only for things; if three things do not suffice for verifying it, one has to posit a fourth, and so on in turn [for four things, or five, etc.]. [Reportatio I, 10–48, p. 237, paragraph 57]

He states different versions of the Principle in other places, but throughout his career the basic idea is always the same:  we must admit that there are as many things as are required to make a certain proposition true.

Later on, due to the Principle's increasing importance to him, and to Ockham's direct criticisms of it (some of which are recorded, for example in his Quodlibeta Septem I.5), Chatton developed a long defense for the Principle and a richer formulation of it.  The richest formulation of the Principle we have is from Lectura I d. 3, q. 1, a. 1:

  1. Whenever an affirmative proposition is apt to be verified for actually existing things, if two things, howsoever they are present according to arrangement and duration, cannot suffice for the verification of the proposition while another thing is lacking, then one must posit that other thing.

Similar versions occur in his Collatio et Prologus.[6]

By itself, this principle is trivial, of course, since anyone would agree that we should posit as many entities as we need. But there is more to the theory than this. Chatton explicitly breaks his Principle into two parts for purposes of justification and for application as well. His full theory can be thought of as a two-stage meditation on ontology. Stage one is given in version 2 above. To summarize stage one, we could say that language can serve as a guide to ontology in a certain way; setting aside the passage of time and the occurrence of motion – think of an ‘ontological snapshot’, if you like – and given a true proposition p, we can investigate systematically the question of what kinds of things (what kind of ontological snapshot) are necessary to make p true, and hence we can conclude from p's truth that those kinds things must exist. The question at stake here is truth-makers. What this first part of the Chatton Principle says is (1) that the truth-makers of propositions are things (res), and (2) that, under certain conditions, propositions are a guide to ontology.

As noted, this is all well and good as far as it goes; we must posit as many things in reality as are sufficient to make the proposition true, when it is true. But all by itself this simply begs the question of sufficiency. Chatton sees this and so claims therefore that the Chatton Principle involves a second stage:

  1. Hence it is required to posit a second proposition … and it is this: those things are not sufficient to account for the fact that a proposition is true with which it is consistent that, in whatever way they are present according to arrangement and duration without a new thing, the proposition would be false. (Lect. I, d. 3, q. 1, a. 1, paragraph 17)

Here Chatton gives us a test for when a certain number of entities is insufficient to make a true sentence true. His test is phrased in terms of the consistency of the falsehood of the proposition and the existence of certain things without another. By studying other texts we are able to see that Chatton has in mind a kind of a priori version of Mill's methods. We are to imagine, within the absolute power of God, whether the causal powers attributed to the kinds of entities in a given ontological snapshot would be sufficient to make the proposition in question turn out true. If they are not, we then imagine other entities coming into being, adding each to the ontological snapshot one at a time, checking to see after each addition whether the proposition would at that point have to be true. So long as the insufficiency remains, we add another object to the picture. We check that the insufficiency remains via consistency: so long as there remains no manifest contradiction between the existence of the currently considered snapshot and the falsehood of the proposition, the insufficiency remains, and we must continue to posit more things. Given this method, it would seem to follow that, for any set of entities, if the causal powers of those entities are found wanting on the basis of consistency and yet the proposition in question were known to be true, then another kind of entity, with its attendant causal powers, would have to exist.

At this point we might ask what licenses us to conclude that the entity whose existence Chatton proves is indeed a res? Can't propositions get to be true and false for other reasons besides a res coming to be or passing away?  Chatton did not think they could, at least in most cases, and his Principle exhibits this commitment in version (2) above; the only way to add to an ontological snapshot is to add things (res) to the picture. Hence he relies on and is clearly committed to an assumption which says that if an existent makes a difference to truth then it must be a real thing (res). This assumption can be found in Aristotle (e.g., Physics, 225a 1–20) and was utilized extensively by Scotus (e.g., Ordinatio I d. 30 qq. 1–2, n. 41). Often called the principle of contradictories, it can be stated as follows: “There can be no passage from contradictory state to contradictory state without the generation or corruption of some thing (res).”

3.3 Ockham's Criticism of the Chatton Principle

Ockham explicitly rejects this assumption as needlessly profligate and it is precisely on this point that he attacked the Chatton Principle.[7] Ockham's strategy for overcoming Chatton's (and Scotus') realist results is two-fold: (1) he reforms the principle of contradictories by expansion; and (2) he capitalizes on this expansion by offering an alternative semantic account (connotation theory) which explains what happens when a proposition passes from being true to being false.

Ockham opens up the principle of contradictories by deriving from the proposition, “There can be no passage from contradictory to contradictory apart from the generation or corruption (of some thing)”, the following expansion:

It is impossible for contradictories to be successively verified for one and the same thing, except (i) on account of local motion of something, or (ii) on account of the passage of time, or (iii) on account of the production or destruction of some thing. (Ockham, Scriptum (=OTh IV), I, d. 30, q. 1, 396, lines 8–9)

Clearly this is just Scotus' principle of contradictories, expressed in clause (iii), with clauses (i) and (ii) added by Ockham. The thrust of Ockham's alteration is to recognize that there are more ways to account for change in truth value besides changes in what things there are; a change in time or a change of location can also explain it. But, if Ockham's version is correct and Scotus's is not, then Chatton's plurality argument using his Principle will not go through: we don't have to posit that n + 1 things exist if n things will not explain the truth of some true proposition, since the truth may be adequately explained simply by the passage of time or the occurrence of change. It is absolutely clear that Ockham's expansion of the principle of contradictories and Chatton's ‘howsoever they are present according to arrangement and duration’ clause in version (2) of the Principle above play off each other, and in these formulas we see some of the intense mutual influence between Ockham and Chatton.

Notice too that Chatton's clause essentially forces us to hold time and movement as constants, and only then ask what would make the true proposition true. In this way, he forces us to see that a res must in fact be posited in such cases, since there is no change of place or lapse of time to explain the passage from contradictory to contradictory. By itself this begs the question against Ockham, and Chatton's principle has no general leverage against Ockham. In the end the Chatton Principle had to be supplemented with direct attacks on Ockham's alternative semantics, viz., connotation theory.

4. Virtues and Intentions

Throughout the late 1320s and into the 1330s Chatton became increasingly interested in questions of virtue and vice, the objects of moral acts, and the role of intentions in ethics.[8] Much of what he says follows or agrees with Scotus and opposes Ockham.

Mediaeval philosophers often made much of the distinction between willing or intending to do a thing and actually doing it. Let A be any action that a human being might contemplate, choose, and want to execute. Then person P's willing A is considered an interior act with respect to A, because the willing is internal to the human soul. This is meant to contrast with the corresponding exterior act, that is, the event that P actually executes A. Note that A itself may be in some sense ‘interior’, e.g., let A = thinking well of my enemy. Then, although A is itself internal inasmuch as thinking takes place in my mind, nevertheless we can distinguish the interior act of willing to think well of my enemy from the exterior act thinking well of my enemy. Thus ‘interior’ and ‘exterior’ here signify primarily the distinction between choosing to do A and doing A, not so much the internal and external activities per se.

It was Ockham's considered view, evidenced in many of his writings, that only the interior act was properly regarded as meritorious or sinful; the corresponding exterior act makes no moral difference.  Ockham is unwilling to allow external factors to play any significant role in moral evaluation. Chatton argues against this in many ways, the most effective being theological: for example, Christ always willed to redeem humanity, so if willing were sufficient, then his exterior act of being executed on the cross was unnecessary. Similarly, intending to confess would be as meritorious as actually confessing. However, Chatton also points out several philosophical disadvantages to Ockham's overall position.

Ockham's insistence that the interior act alone is subject to moral appraisal leads him to pack as much as he can into the act of will to be evaluated, and Chatton often criticized this strategy as disingenuous. For example, Ockham seemed to think of the objects of moral acts as anything the intellect needs to consider in advising the will to act, including even the circumstances under which the act is done; acts are finely distinguished with circumstances as a part of their identity conditions. For example, we cannot evaluate the internal act ‘willing to tell a lie’, since it is too general; to properly identify and evaluate this interior act we must specify it with all its morally relevant circumstances. So, strictly speaking, we should rather evaluate whether it is right to will to tell a lie to cover up a certain fact, to a certain person, to whom we are related in a certain way, etc.

Chatton opposed this view. The objects of moral acts can (and often should) be thought of in a far more reduced sense, including only the exterior action of the actor himself, which the intellect approves and which the will then wills (that is, the case of virtuous acts). Circumstances are, properly speaking, variables existing on the perimeter a moral act, while the objects and goals of acts are, properly speaking, more intimate to the act itself. Chatton admits that sometimes, when the will has a complex object that includes temporal, causal, or locative qualifiers, these ‘circumstances’ can be said in a certain way to be an object of the act. But such conditions, insofar as they are objects of the act, are therefore not in the same way the environment surrounding the act, and so are no longer really circumstances in those cases. There are two practical implications of this point. (1) Ockham writes and argues as though in his ethics he considers only internal factors in moral evaluation, and excludes the external completely, but this result is obtained only by sneaking in external factors through the back door, and building them into the objects of the will, making them internal only by ad hoc stipulation. (2) If, with Chatton and against Ockham, we reject the idea that every act of will must include all its circumstances as a partial object, we thereby make it possible to say that some acts of will are intrinsically good (or bad) no matter what circumstances they are done in. This possibility is important for Ockhamist ethics, because Ockham insists that there is (and indeed that there must be) at least one intrinsically good act of will, which he identifies with loving God for his own sake. But if we always roll the circumstances of an act up with the intended object of the act, then it is possible to make any seemingly virtuous act wicked by ‘in-building’ bad intent, and so no act can be intrinsically virtuous. Chatton constructs this example against Ockham:

For example, when I love my neighbor for the sake of God, it is required that love of God move me toward a love of neighbor. But this fact can be understood in two ways. (1) It can be understood that the object taken as a whole is loved, that is, the entire object neighbor for the sake of God. In this case the act that has this as an object can be done malevolently, say for the sake of desirability, or more for the sake of desirability than for the glory of God. (2) Alternatively, my friend could be loved by me for the sake of God in the sense that love of God itself is the very thing that moves me and causes my love of him. In this second case the love is virtuous. (Quodlibet question 12, paragraph 14.)

Similarly, a person could love God for his own sake for the sake of something unworthy:

I say that the act of ‘loving God for his own sake’ can, as a whole, be done malevolently; therefore, in order that it be done benevolently, some additional necessary factor must be present. It is clear that this act can be done malevolently, since a person can have as his total object loving God for his own sake for the sake of money. (Quodlibet question 12, paragraph 13)

It might be objected that loving God for his own sake for the sake of money is an impossible object for the will, since good and evil objects or motives cancel each other out. But it is not clear how this affects Chatton's point, since the human will really can (and sometimes does) have impossible objects and motives associated with it.

5. Future Contingents

5.1 A Fatalist Argument

What philosophers call the problem of future contingents goes together naturally with the related and more well-known problem of free will and determinism. In the Middle Ages, as now, we really find a cluster of several related problems radiating from a single common conundrum or paradox. One important difference is that the mediaeval problem has some theological branches that today receive less philosophical attention. For example, few modern philosophers seriously consider the seeming inconsistency between veridical prophecy and the contingency of the future, or whether angels of high rank can reveal future contingents to inferior angels, but these were important issues with their own test cases in the Middle Ages. Moreover, the problem was far more stark, severe, and difficult for mediaeval Christian thinkers than for modern secular philosophers, since it was doctrinally unacceptable to solve the problem by ejecting some element of the paradox – all elements of the paradox were important pieces of Christian doctrine. One felicitous consequence of this struggle is that some very original and deep philosophy was created and employed in an attempt to find a stable solution. I will briefly present the conundrum at the heart of the matter, and then examine Chatton's own radical and relatively original solution to the problem.[9]

Consider the following grouping of ideas, objects, and events in our universe (Chatton's usual Latin terms for certain cognates are distinguished in parentheses):

1. necessity 8. contingency (f. sg. contingentia, -ae)
2. universal causality 9. human free will
3. universal bivalence (=every proposition is determinately either true or false) 10. contingent things (n. pl. contingentia,-um)
4. God's foreknowledge 11. planning and working for the future
5. veridical prophecy 12. future contingent propositions (propositiones contingentes de futuro)
6. predestination 13. the undetermined future
7. providence 14. merit for good acts, freely done

No kind of strict paring between list entries across from each other on the right and left is intended here. Rather, we should notice three things. (1) All of the putative objects and phenomena on the left-hand under the heading RIGID are elements of the universe that are firm and unchanging, and their existence seems to entail a kind of immutability of reality; the world cannot be otherwise. (2) Those putative objects under OPEN, by contrast, seem indeterminate and loose, and their existence demands recognition of alternatives; the world can be otherwise. (3) It is common and quite attractive to believe in the existence of many of the elements on the left and on the right simultaneously, but it seems clear that the implications of that belief are often contradictory, entailing that one and the same piece of reality both can be otherwise and cannot be otherwise in the same way at the same time. In short, certain mixtures of these elements, right and left, are nearly irresistible parts of our total outlook on the universe, but unfortunately they seem to yield contradictions. Not every pairing of items yields a paradox, e.g., 1 and 8 do not. There can be both necessity and contingency in the world. The reader is invited to consider, however, just how many left-right pairings from these lists do seem both attractive and impossible.

There are as many possible solutions to these paradoxes as may be imagined, but there are really only three ways out; either: (1) accept the rigid element of reality at the expense of the open element, or (2) accept the open element at the expense of the rigid element, or (3) show that the contradiction between the two is only a seeming contradiction. Most mediaeval philosophers took this third approach in their solutions.

By the time Chatton was writing, it was quite common to present a basic fatalist or necessitarian argument to show that God's foreknowledge, which seems deeply connected to his providence, is not consistent with future contingent things and events. Here is Chatton's version of this standard fatalist argument:

Herein lies the difficulty of this question – if it were consistent with the contingency of future events that God knows future contingents, then this consequence would follow:  ‘God knew that the Antichrist will come;  therefore the Antichrist will come’. The antecedent of this consequence is necessary, as is the consequence itself, hence the consequent is necessary. But the [necessary] consequent ‘the Antichrist will come’ is not consistent with the contingency [of the future event the Antichrist comes]. Therefore [God's knowledge is not consistent with the contingency of the future].   (Reportatio I, d. 38, paragraph 2, p. 347)

Two things to note. (1) The coming of the Antichrist is a standard example of a future event that is anticipated but which seems contingent; however, there is no special importance attached to the content of the example; equally popular was the less dramatic example ‘Socrates will sit’. (2) A consequence is what we call a consecution today (something of the form ‘p therefore q’), but in this case we can, without distortion, model the reasoning by treating it as a conditional. The fatalist argues that (IF God knew the Antichrist will come THEN the Antichrist will come) is necessary, and moreover, the antecedent, ‘God knows the Antichrist will come’, is also necessary, since God's knowledge is certain and firm. But if (IF p THEN q) is necessary, and furthermore the antecedent p is necessary, it follows by uncontroversial logical principles that the consequent q is necessary; hence we can conclude that the coming of the Antichrist is necessary, which violates our assumption that the future is open. Chatton summarizes the fatalist argument this way:

This whole thing can also be made more compact with the formula: ‘God knew that a will be; therefore a will necessarily be’. (Reportatio I, d. 38, paragraph 2, p. 347)

This is the argument to be defeated. After brief consideration of some other views, including Peter Auriol's, which seems to have influenced him in certain respects, Chatton draws together the threads of his discussion into a solution that is quite original and radical, but which he supports only hesitantly, not apparently out of intellectual reservations but out of fear of falling into heresy. Although his hesitation makes it difficult to pin him down, a reasonably secure reconstruction of his ideas seems possible. His solution has two parts:  (1) He offers a counter-argument to the fatalist's reasoning, and (2) he clarifies the way God knows future contingents.

5.2 Chatton's Anti-Fatalist Argument

I present the first part of his solution as an annotated argument. First, we should state the fatalist argument generally. For any contingent object a we have:

  1. Necessarily (IF God knows that a will be THEN a will be).
  2. Necessarily God knows that a will be.
  3. Necessarily a will be.

Or, in modern notation:

  1. □(pq)
  2. p
  3. q

This argument is clearly valid by application of the K-axiom and modus ponens, i.e., by the K-axiom we can go from the necessity of the consequence, □(pq), to the necessity of both parts, □p→□q, and then we just apply modus ponens at line (2).[10]

Chatton rebuts this argument by denying the second premise. He claims that when ‘a’ names a contingent thing, the sentence ‘God knows that a will be’ is contingent, not necessary. His counter-argument is based on two pieces of philosophical analysis (premises 1 and 4 below), and a theory of equivalence (premise 7):

  1. To assert a sentence of the form ‘a will be’ really means either to assert:  (i) that ‘a will be’ is true, or (ii) that ‘a is’ will be true. These two expositions are non-equivalent, since one can be true while the other is false. [Explicit premise. Chatton claims to borrow this analysis from an opinion that was making the rounds at Oxford when he studied there.]
  2. If a names a contingent thing, then option (i) is right out, since this would entail that there is no reason to take trouble about the future. [Explicit premise. Chatton draws the fatalistic inference from option (i) and thereby rejects that option.]
  3. Therefore, option (ii) holds:  if ‘a’ names a contingent thing in ‘a will be’, we must understand the sentence ‘a will be’ to be equivalent to the following contingent sentence ‘"a is" will be true’. [From 1 and 2. ‘"a is" will be true’ must be contingent, because otherwise it is no different in meaning or fatalistic consequences from option (i).]
  4. From now on let ‘a’ name a contingent thing. Now, the sentence ‘God knows that a will be’, properly exposited, is equivalent to this conjunction:  ‘God knows a AND a will be’. [Explicit premise. This analysis is Chatton's original contribution.]
  5. Therefore the following expository equivalences hold:  ‘God knows that a will be’ = ‘God knows a AND a will be’ = ‘God knows a AND "a is" will be true’. [From 3 and 4.]
  6. ‘God knows a AND "a is" will be true’ has a contingent conjunct, namely the second conjunct. [From 3.]
  7. When a proposition is exposited by a conjunction, if one of the conjuncts of the exposition is contingent, the original proposition is as well. [Implicit premise.]
  8. ‘God knows that a will be’ is contingent. [From 5, 6, and 7.]

To sum up, the first part of Chatton's response comes to this:

  1. ‘God knows that a will be’ is equivalent to the conjunction ‘God knows a AND "a is" will be true’.
  2. The sentence ‘God knows a’ is of course necessary, but ‘"a is" will be true’ is contingent, therefore the conjunction of the two sentences is contingent.
  3. Therefore, since ‘God knows that a will be’ is equivalent to a contingent sentence, it is itself contingent.

Two remarks need to be made. First, premise 4 seems to have originated with Chatton, and he was followed in this by the next generation of Oxford theologians, for example, Robert Holcot.[11] Second, even if we accept this argument, Chatton still owes us an explanation of what the first conjunct means in the conjunction ‘God knows a AND "a is" will be true’. On the assumption that a is a contingent future thing, we can still sensibly ask, how can God possibly know this future contingent a?  Chatton admits that this conjunct is necessary, but this fact, together with the firmness of divine knowledge, seems to violate our sense of a's contingency; it seems we can just raise the problem of future contingents all over again, focusing on the left-hand conjunct. There is yet another problem. Does the fact that God knows contingent a entail that his knowledge changes when a comes into existence in time?  Fortunately, Chatton is aware of these difficulties and tries to solve them by distinguishing God's knowing a thing from his cognizing it.

5.3 God's knowing versus God's cognizing

Chatton claims it can still be true that God knows a when a is a future contingent object, provided we understand God's grasp of a as divine cognition:

… [T]he larger proposition ‘God knows that a will be’ is equivalent to this copulative sentence – ‘God knows a and a will be’. This I will concede, as long as the ‘knowing’ referred to in the definiendum is taken to be a cognition. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 28, p. 352.)

Chatton explains his idea of divine cognition by recourse to an analogy, a distinction, and a claim about all operations of the divine intellect.

Chatton's analogy is this: cognition is to knowledge as apprehension is to assent or assertion. Just as apprehension implies the mere grasp of something without additional judgment about it, so too cognition implies the mere grasp of something, without the additional affirmative judgment implied in the term ‘knowledge’.  Hence, when Chatton uses the phrase ‘God knows a’ in the above solution, it should be understood as ‘God cognizes a’, meaning that we are only talking about God's grasp of a, not about any kind of approval, disapproval, agreement, disagreement, etc. (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 39, paragraph 14, p. 363). In cognizing, the divine intellect is somehow holding a without confirming it, judging it, or creating it. Only one part of the divine intellect is in play, not divine assent or the divine will.

Another difference between knowledge and cognition is that knowledge is necessarily of a present existent, whereas cognition does not have this restriction (Reportatio I, 10–48, d. 38, paragraph 42, p. 355). The upshot of the distinction in this context is that God cannot know future objects, for example, since they are not yet; however, he can cognize them.

Finally (and this claim he intends to apply to both divine cognition and divine knowledge), God's knowledge and cognition are neither mediated by propositions nor are they generally of propositions (Reportatio I, d. 39, paragraph 14, p. 363; Quodlibet, q. 1, paragraph 36). Chatton holds that God's intellectual activity is not discursive or representative in any way, and that the usual objects of divine intellectual activity are not propositions, but rather real things, that is, res. God does not require any mediator in the operation of his intellect with respect to creation; for example, he requires no concepts or propositions in order to know or to cognize. Rather, God directly cognizes (for example) the future contingent things (res) that he cognizes, whether those things are people, the shoes on their feet, or even occasionally and somewhat trivially, the spoken, written, or mental propositions they talk, write, or think with. God sees them all through a kind of direct vision or intuition. As noted above, Chatton was a realist about relations, and since relations are accidents inhering in their subjects, for God to cognize a future res is also for him to cognize the relational accidents of that res. So, in cognizing a res, God cognizes everything about it, and so directly cognizes all the situations or states of affairs of this res as well, Thus, his grasp of it is complete. Because it has no intermediary, God's cognition is not something separate from him; there is no determinate representation of a thing by which he cognizes. Consequently, divine cognition is, in a sense, not really distinct from God himself.

With the idea of divine cognition thus developed, we can now return to the problems we raised at the end of the last section. First, we asked:  How can ‘God knows a’ be necessary when a is both future and contingent?  After all, it seems the firmness of God's knowledge of a and the determinacy of his concepts of a are a sign that a cannot be otherwise. But now we have our answer. By ‘God knows a’ Chatton means only ‘God cognizes a’, and divine cognition is (1) non-judgmental and non-voluntaristic, (2) not necessarily of determinate existents, and (3) a complete, though non-discursive, direct awareness. Consequently, when God cognizes some future a, that cognition is in no way judgmental, confirming or otherwise approving of a, nor does it entail the existence of a, although it does grasp all that matters about a. In short, divine cognition is an omniscience that does not interfere in any way with the natural operation or condition of a, nor does it force a to exist, or imply it already does. The divine will is out of the picture; mere cognition of a is not causative of a. Neither do we have to worry about the rigidity of some structure called ‘God's knowledge’ and its relation to a. All divine intellection is direct, and so God does not have a body of propositions about a or any intermediary concepts of a by which he cognizes it.

In short, Chatton's view is that the necessity we detect in ‘God knows a’ attaches to God as a necessary cognizer, i.e., it attaches to the divine intellect alone, not to the objects it cognizes or to some distinct, determinate body of truths called ‘God's knowledge’. It is almost as if, for Chatton, ‘God cognizes [future contingent] a’ simply means,  ‘the all-seeing God exists and contingent a will exist’.

From these considerations we also get Chatton's answer to the second difficulty: Does God's knowledge of the world change when the world changes? Chatton can formulate his answer with the same notion of cognition. There is no change implied in God when contingent a comes into existence: (1) God's cognition has not changed, certainly, since cognition is indifferent to existence, but (2) God's knowledge has not changed either, at least not in any serious sense. For there are only three ways that God's knowledge could be said to change: (2a) it could be that the mental proposition ‘Socrates is sitting’ in God's intellect goes from being false to true, say, when standing Socrates sits, i.e., it literally changes truth value in God's mind; or (2b) it could be that Socrates is now sitting and before he was not, and so before God's knowledge contained the proposition ‘Socrates is not sitting’ but now it contains the proposition ‘Socrates is sitting’ instead; or similarly, (2c) it could be that Socrates is now sitting and before he was not, and so before God knew the non-seated Socrates which was signified by ‘Socrates is not sitting’ but now he knows the seated Socrates signified by ‘Socrates is sitting’.

(2a) and (2b) are not a problem because God's knowledge is not generally of propositions, nor is it mediated by them. And even when it is of propositions, there is nothing special about how he knows a proposition's shift from truth to falsity, as distinguished from any other form of change. (2c) is not a problem, because Chatton famously held that the thing signified by ‘Socrates is sitting’, is exactly the same as the thing signified by ‘Socrates is not sitting’.[12] God cognizes of every proposition when it will be true; he cognizes the "truth career" of each proposition. But he cognizes this at once, as of now. And when a proposition he cognizes becomes true, he knows it. But again, this is no change in God, who does not think discursively, but rather sees every created thing, including propositions, as res.

There are still many questions we would like answered here, of course. For example, what is the ontological status of the not-yet existing things that God cognizes?  Exactly what does God cognize when he cognizes a present non-existent?  These issues require a more extensive treatment than can be given here.

6. Indivisibilism

6.1 Infinite Divisibility and Continuity

When change seems smooth we often regard it as continuous. For example, we think that a color increasing continuously in intensity takes on every intermediate brightness value as it intensifies, and an object changing location continuously (i.e., moving) takes up every intermediate space between its starting point and its destination. Moreover, it is customary in geometry to assume the absolute continuity of the line, say. A line is absolutely smooth, divisible in thought at any location we like. An important point for the analysis of such cases is that the smoothness of continuous magnitudes and changes can be expressed by and correlated with infinite divisibility. A simple example makes this plain.

Think of a string of pearls. This necklace itself is not smooth, since each pearl is a discrete self-contained unit, sitting next to another pearl, that is, next to another discrete self-contained unit, with a slight gap in between each unit. Such an entity, composed of finite discrete units, can only be divided into these units finitely often. If we divide a pearl strand enough we eventually reach the level of an individual pearl –an indivisible atom in broad sense of the term – and we cannot divide further without changing the sort of dividing that we are doing. A pearl necklace has a lowest level of division.

The string that threads the pearls together is, by contrast, smoother; one part of the string is like any other. If I take a knife to the string I get the same results depending on where I cut; indeed, any division of the string seems to yield smaller bits of string. String of length 1 can be divided, string of length 1/2 can be divided, of length 1/4, and so on, and we seem not to reach a level where we move from string to non-string, that is, to a place where a metaphysical shift occurs from continuous to discrete. Thus the ability to be divided indefinitely, or as we say, infinite divisibility, is central to the idea of smoothness here. Of course, strictly speaking, actual physical string is not absolutely continuous. Modern atomic theory tells us that in fact physical strings are composed of physical atoms, which are discrete entities, so eventually we will reach a point where we shift from string to something else. String is not absolutely continuous, but only relatively continuous, that is, it is smoother, less gappy, than the pearl strand. But this leads us to ask: Is any part of reality absolutely continuous?

Return to the geometrical line. This is an abstraction, an idealization, not a physical thing. When we divide the geometrical line, we make a division in thought, not in physical matter, and so the problem that we had with the string disappears; no physical theory will ever intervene to tell us we have in fact cut a piece of line so small that we have changed to a new metaphysical category. There are no physical facts about mental abstractions, so nothing can tell us we have reached the atoms. Indeed, what could a spatial atom even be? The geometrical line seems absolutely continuous precisely because it seems infinitely divisible. And indeed infinite divisibility seems a hallmark of continuity.

It is possible to object here: "What about a point in the geometrical line? Isn't this a piece of a continuum so small that it cannot be divided?" Now it seems we need a distinction to keep this story working. We might say this: lines do not divide into points, but into intervals, and intervals always have some magnitude. By contrast, a point has no magnitude and is simply a location of cutting on the line. Having made this distinction, we can now answer the objection: we should say that an absolute continuum like a line divides into intervals of arbitrarily small magnitude (that is, pieces as small as you like), and that the locations for these division are specifiable as points, or as instants, if we are talking about time, say, or as point-intensities of a certain color.

However, given this distinction, we are not able to say that the line, or any continuum, is composed of indivisibles such as points, because then points would be the bottom level of the line, and we would have to say the line is not infinitely divisible after all. That contradicts continuity. But since points are vital to our thinking about lines, it seems we should be able to say more about how they occur there. This is one puzzle that animated mediaeval thinkers: how do the indivisible points on a continuous line relate to that line?

6.2 The Compositionality Thesis

It seems the sentence ‘A geometrical line contains indivisible points.’ is reasonable if it means ‘A geometrical line is divisible by indivisible points, anywhere you wish to divide it.’  But ‘A geometrical line contains indivisible points.’ seems unreasonable and even puzzling if it means ‘A geometrical line is composed of indivisible points’. In fact, any theory claiming that absolute continua are composed of indivisible elements seems very strange because continua are supposed to be infinitely divisible.

Let us call this odd-sounding claim – that continua are composed of indivisible elements – the compositionality thesis. Given the above explanation of continuity in terms of infinite divisibility, the compositionality thesis seems plainly untenable; it violates the useful distinction between points and beads; the compositionality thesis seems to say that the line contains points the way a bead necklace contains beads.

Most philosophers in the Middle Ages agreed that the compositionality thesis is wrong: points do not compose a line. And in general they denied that continua are composed of indivisible atoms. Yet despite all this, there were very bright people in the Middle Ages who believed and defended the compositionality thesis: they said that in fact continua were composed of indivisible atoms. Today we call these people indivisibilists and their view is called indivisibilism. Two of the most famous indivisibilists in England were Henry Harclay, who was head of Oxford University in 1312, and Walter Chatton.

Since indivisibilism was a minority view, and since there were many anti-indivisibilist arguments in the philosophical literature running all the way back to Aristotle, much of the time the indivisibilists spent explaining their own views was really spent defending themselves from these powerful attacks. Harclay and Chatton were no exception. However, some of Chatton's direct rebuttals of anti-indivisibilist arguments exhibit low mathematical acumen, and are not worth summarizing here. His positive views are, however, quite unique.

6.3 Chatton's Solution

Practically all indivisibilists, and certainly Henry Harclay, agreed with their opponents that continua are infinitely divisible; the indivisibilists simply insisted on a further point: that these infinitely divisible entities, say geometrical lines, nevertheless are composed of lowest elements which are themselves indivisible. Anti-indivisibilists saw a simple contradiction in this coupling, which the following argument brings out:

  1. If X is continuous then X is infinitely divisible.
  2. If X is infinitely divisible then each part of X is divisible.
  3. If X is composed of Y then Y is a part of X.
  4. Therefore, if any Y composes some X that is continuous, then Y must itself be divisible (in fact, Y must be infinitely divisible, just as X was).

But the indivisibilist view is that there are elements Y (=points) which compose a continuous X (=the line), and yet these points Y are not divisible at all. This directly contradicts the conclusion of the reasoning above. According to this argument, the problem with indivisibilism arises from thinking compositionally about the continuous, because there is a mismatch between the idea of compositionality on the one hand and the idea of infinite divisibility on the other. It is almost as though we could say the indivisibilist (mis)understands infinite divisibility to be division into points instead of division by points.

Because he would agree about premise (1), Harclay was forced to rethink the very idea of composition. He does this by finessing the notion of ‘touching’ in order to argue that although indivisibles can touch each other in the line they compose, they do not therefore have parts, and so are still properly indivisible. In this way Harclay can keep premise (1) and by side-stepping premise (2), avoid the conclusion in (4).

Chatton also finesses premise (2), but he bluntly rejects premise (1) by asserting the astonishing claim that finite continua are composed of finitely many indivisibles. He seems to have been alone in this finitist view. The heart of his account involves clarifying the idea of ‘composition’. To the obvious question of how something continuous could be composed of finitely many indivisibles and not be gappy, Chatton responds that continua are only potentially divisible into indivisibles, not actually so divisible, so there are no actually existing indivisibles in this sense. He rejects the model discussed above, in which beads compose a necklace; in that example the beads have a separate existence in act, and each has a length which it lends to the necklace when strung onto it. But Chattonian indivisibles do not exist independently and then, when added together, yield continuous lengths. Existing only potentially, they compose the line in only in the reduced sense of being a part. Chatton's point is that any potential division of the line is in fact finite, and can yield at most finitely many parts. His conviction is not that there exist indivisible discrete building-blocks of material things, but that there is some level of division that is basic or lowest, a theoretical maximum. The indivisible elements at the theoretical maximum can, in the reduced sense explained above, be said to compose the continuous whole they are in because, as indivisibles, they do not have part touching parts, but instead they have nothing between them; they are immediate to each other and distinct in place.

Although Chatton seems thereby to evade some standard objections advanced against indivisibilism, in doing so he seems to have completely lost touch with some important mathematical intuitions and motivations that allow us to reason efficaciously about continua.  Even if it is partially defensible, it is not clear what Chatton's indivisibilist theory can do.

7. The Intellectio Theory of Concepts

In the last half of the twentieth century the most documented and discussed aspect of Chatton's thought concerned his views on human cognition and the metaphysics of concepts. He was not especially innovative on these topics, but he had considerable influence on contemporary debates, having brought about a dramatic change of heart in Ockham concerning the nature of general concepts.

Ockham famously rejected the existence of anything metaphysically universal outside the human mind; he was an uncompromising nominalist in the mediaeval debate on universals. His rejection followed, not from his razor, but from his conviction, supported through long argumentation, that the very idea of a ‘universal substance existing outside the mind’ was simply incoherent, contradictory, or false. No adequate theory of this idea had been or could ever be given; everything outside the mind is irreducibly individual, not on account of some distinct individuating force, as Scotus had said, but simply in se ipso. On his view, the only things in reality that could in any way be truly denominated ‘universal’ are the general concepts existing in the human mind, for example the concept man or the concept white. The general concept white is universal, but only in the following reduced, metaphysically innocuous sense: white applies to many individual things.

This line of thought led Ockham quite naturally to offer an account of the metaphysical status of general concepts. To what Aristotelian category do they belong?  Are concepts in the human mind substances, that is, ‘things’ in their own right, and so are in their own way as real and independent as people and horses?  Or are they instead accidents, that is, not stand-alone entities, but rather modifications of stand-alone entities, the way for Aristotle tall is not a stand-alone subject, but simply a way that a stand-alone subject can be?  Ockham began his career defending the first option, but ended it defending the latter. The cause of this transformation was the sustained attacks of Walter Chatton.

Ockham's early theory of concepts, often dubbed ‘the fictum theory’, was probably influenced in some measure by the work or at least the terminology of Peter Auriol. According to Ockham's first account, a concept is an Aristotelian substance, but not a normal material substance, such as a human being, nor a nonmaterial substance, such as an angel – such beings can be the subjects of accidents and so could be said to have esse subjectivum (=subjective being) – rather, concepts are in an entirely different class of substances, which have the sort of existence in the mind that an object fashioned by thought has, to wit, esse objectivum (the being of a thought-object), or, as he sometimes says, a concept is a fictum (=a mentally-fashioned being).

Chatton criticized this theory relentlessly, primarily on the ground that concepts as ficta are an unnecessary intermediary between the cognizer and the thing cognized, such that the cognizer would be immediately aware only of the general concept, and not of the individuals picked out by the general concept. In short, the fictum theory is not consistent with direct realism, which was a hallmark of Ockhamist epistemology. Chatton suggested that it made the most sense from an Aristotelian point of view to treat concepts as accidents, and not as substances at all. On Chatton's view, concepts are modifications of the soul, and in particular my concept of X is nothing more than my act of thinking about X. Concepts are not intermediaries that we then think with, but are rather simply our very acts of thinking themselves, i.e., my concept of X is just my intellectio (=act of thinking) of instances of X. In response to Chatton's criticism and his positive alternative, Ockham abandoned his fictum theory, at first with some hesitation, wavering between this early theory and Chatton's new intellectio model, subsequently embracing it more fully, and finally, in his most mature philosophical reflection on the topic, even arguing against the old fictum theory. The stages of Ockham's change of mind are well documented in the different versions of his commentary on the Sentences, and are even an important source for our dating of those different versions.

8. Conclusion

It is sometimes suggested that Walter Chatton was not a very original philosopher. There is some fairness in this claim, but it is also a little misleading. What is true is that he is not as recognizably important a figure today as Ockham or Aquinas, and that his philosophy tends to be negative (i.e., critical) and conservative in character, in the following respect:  in many of his writings we find him attacking the novel work of others, frequently Ockham, and sometimes defending the more accepted work of others, frequently Scotus. Moreover, he did not strive to develop and set out a unique systematic view of reality, that is, a system of his own. But, in fairness, such was not the goal of philosophical theology in the fourteenth century. Moreover, as the examples above show, Chatton was philosophically quite creative, and incisive in his attacks on Ockhamism. So while we find no evidence of a large following after his death (there was no large Chattonian ‘school’ or ‘movement’ that we know of), he did have considerable influence well into the middle of the fifteenth century in England, particularly on those who reacted strongly to Ockham's nominalism and semantic theory, and also in the intricate and intense debate over future contingents.


The majority of secondary literature on Chatton is in English, Italian, and French, but some important work is in German as well.

Chatton's Works


Sometimes Attributed but Doubtful

Important Primary Texts by Contemporaries of Chatton

Secondary Sources and Older Critical Editions of Chatton

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Duns Scotus, John | free will: divine foreknowledge and | future contingents: medieval theories of | medieval philosophy | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | modality: medieval theories of | Ockham [Occam], William | relations: medieval theories of | universals: the medieval problem of