Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Christian Wolff

First published Mon Jul 3, 2006

Christian Wolff (1679-1754), also known as Christian von Wolfius, was a Rationalist philosopher of the German Enlightenment. His corpus includes over 26 titles, spanning more than 42 quarto volumes, with contributions primarily in the areas of mathematics and philosophy. He is often regarded as the central historical figure who links the philosophical systems of Leibniz and Kant. Although Wolff's influence was largely isolated to German schools and universities during and shortly after his lifetime, he did receive some international acclaim. He was a nonresident member of all four major European scientific academies: the Royal Society of London in 1709; the Berlin Academy in 1711; the St Petersburg Academy in 1725; and the Paris Academy in 1733. To his credit, he is the first philosopher recognized to furnish Germans with a complete system of philosophy in their own language (Beck 1969, 274).

According to Kant, in the “Preface” to the Critique of Pure Reason (2nd ed), Wolff is “the greatest of all dogmatic philosophers.” Wolff's “strict method” in science, Kant explains, is predicated on “the regular ascertainment of principles, the clear determination of concepts, the attempt at strictness in proofs, and the prevention of audacious leaps in inferences” (Kant, 1998, 120). Like many other philosophers of the Modern period, such as Descartes, Hobbes, and Spinoza, Wolff believed the method of mathematics, if properly applied, could be used to expand other areas of human knowledge. Perhaps more so than any of his contemporaries, Wolff took this style of exposition to an extreme. A familiar criticism of Wolff, even in his own lifetime, is that his works are long-winded and often involve overly complicated demonstrations. Arguably, Wolff's most direct impact on the history of western philosophy resides not in any one of his own particular works, but rather on the influence he had on the German undergraduate university curriculum. The more notable beneficiaries of the Wolffian systematization of philosophy include the early Kant, Alexander Baumgarten (1714-1762), Samuel Formey (1711-1797), Johann Christoph Gottsched (1700-1766), Martin Knutzen (1713-1751), Georg Friedrich Meier (1718-1777), and Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786).

1. Biographical Sketch[1]

Wolff was born 24 January 1679 in Breslau in the province of Silesia (now modern day Poland) to parents of modest means. Baptized Lutheran, Wolff's early education was a hybrid of Protestant and Catholic scholasticism. At the age of 20, he enrolled at the University of Jena and pursued a course of study in theology, physics, and mathematics. In 1703, under the supervision of von Tschirnhaus at the University of Leipzig, Wolff completed a doctoral dissertation entitled: Philosophia practica universalis, methodo mathematica conscripta (‘On Universal Practical Philosophy, Composed from the Mathematical Method’).

After a string of one-year teaching positions at Gdansk, Weimar, and Giessen, Wolff obtained a full time position in 1707 at the University of Halle (as professor of mathematics and natural philosophy). Lecturing initially in the areas of mathematics and physics, Wolff later picked up courses in philosophy and quickly earned a favorable reputation among students. During the next 15 years he enjoyed a prolific period, publishing his main works in mathematics as well as the beginnings of his philosophical system (most notably his German Logic in 1712 and his German Metaphysics in 1719). Wolff's corpus is typically divided into his German and Latin works, respectively. During roughly the first 20 years of his career, Wolff's primary concern was with producing his German works.

On 8 November 1723, Wolff was exiled from Prussia by King Frederick-Wilhelm I (also known as the “Soldier King”).[2] Wolff's rationalistic approach to the disciplines of theology and morality was sharply criticized by the Pietist contingent at Halle. During the early 1720s the Pietists slowly gained favor with the King, which eventually led to Wolff's banishment. On the basis of a lecture on the moral philosophy of the Chinese, where Wolff advocated the autonomy of moral philosophy from religion, Wolff was unfairly accused of fatalism. It is alleged that after it was explained to Frederick-Wilhelm I that Wolff's endorsement of ‘pre-established harmony’ (in another work) implicitly denied culpability for army deserters, the militaristic King called for Wolff's removal. Perhaps ironically, the King's censure of Wolff, rather than damaging the philosopher's reputation, is one of main contributing factors that lead to Wolff's international acclaim. Once the evidence against Wolff was brought to light and weighed by Europe's intellectual community, it was the Prussian monarchy's provincialism that was exposed, not Wolff's iconoclast ideas. During his years of exile, Wolff gained employment with the University in Marburg and his primary efforts were directed at completing a Latin presentation of his theoretical philosophy. The following is a list of what is sometimes referred to as Wolff's Marburg-Latin writings: the Latin Logic (1728); the Preliminary Discourse (1728); the Ontology (1730); the Cosmology (1731); the Empirical Psychology (1732); the Rational Psychology (1734); and the Natural Theology, in 2 vols. (1736-37).

In 1740, Wolff was asked to return to Halle by Frederick the Great, the son of Frederick-Wilhelm I. Wolff was initially invited to preside over the newly reorganized Berlin Academy, a position he was intended to share with Voltaire.[3] However, as Voltaire declined the offer, Wolff elected to return to his old position at Halle and serve the Academy only as a nonresident member. After his return, Wolff's primary energy was directed at his practical philosophy. In addition to publishing a massive 8 volume work on the Law of Nature, which investigates knowledge of good and evil actions, from 1740-1748, Wolff produced a 5 volume work on his Moral Philosophy from 1750 to 1754.

2. Relationship with Leibniz

Wolff is usually described as a disciple or follower of Leibniz and there are both good and bad reasons for accepting this characterization. On the one hand, central tenets of Wolff's philosophical system closely resemble those advanced by Leibniz. The commitment to viewing metaphysics as a demonstrative a priori science, the emphasis on formulating rigorous definitions, and the extensive use of the Principle of Sufficient Reason are three striking points of agreement. Wolff appears not only to accept the principles and methods of analysis posed by Leibniz, but he also identifies opponents to his system, such as Descartes, Spinoza, and the Atomists, that Leibniz was famous to oppose in his own. When Wolff completed his Latin dissertation that earned him the title of Privatdozent in 1703, the treatise was sent to Leibniz and a correspondence was spawned between them lasting nearly thirteen years.[4] In 1706, Leibniz recommended Wolff for the Professorship at Halle (the post Wolff held for seventeen years until his dismissal); and in 1711, Leibniz sponsored Wolff's membership to the Berlin Academy. It is also reported that during the year of Leibniz's death in 1716, Leibniz visited Wolff in Halle when returning to Hanover from Vienna.[5] A few years later, Wolff undertook two specific projects to honor Leibniz's memory. The first was a short treatise on the life of Leibniz, published in 1717, in the journal Acta Eruditorum, and the second project was a “Foreword” to the German edition of the Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, first published in 1720.[6] There is no question that both men were well acquainted with each other and that Leibniz was instrumental in advancing Wolff's career.[7]

To describe Wolff as a disciple of Leibniz, however, is misleading in several respects. First and foremost, this characterization undercuts the important philosophical differences that exist between the two men. Second it misconstrues the nature of their relationship and the type of intellectual exchange that transpired between them. During the early part of Wolff's career, and the period when he corresponded with Leibniz, Wolff's primary focus was in the field of mathematics. It is maintained that Wolff was the first to teach calculus formally in Germany.[8] According to Gottsched, Wolff's biographer and colleague from Leipzig, when Wolff arrived at Halle in 1707, mathematics was “entirely neglected, nay quite unknown, in that place.”[9] With the exception of his German Logic (first published in 1712), Wolff's energy early in his career was directed at producing a four-volume Elements of All the Mathematical Sciences [German edition 1710, and Latin edition 1713] as well as a Mathematical Lexicon [1716]. In this light, it is perhaps not surprising to find the bulk of the Wolff-Leibniz correspondence dedicated to issues in mathematics.[10] Although they also exchanged ideas on philosophical topics (e.g., Wolff was particularly interested in Leibniz's view on the notion of perfection) the nature of their philosophical correspondence centered primarily on ethics and philosophical theology.

Leibniz published his Theodicy in 1710, and this work remained the only extended presentation of his philosophical ideas published in his lifetime. Apart from a handful of other smaller articles written on philosophical topics, most notably, Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas [1684], A Specimen of Dynamics [1695], and On Nature Itself [1698], there was relatively very little from which Wolff could have extracted a definitive statement of Leibniz's philosophy. Consider a remark by Leibniz to Nicolas Remond, in a letter dated July 1714:

Mr. Wolff has adopted some of my opinions, but since he is very busy with teaching, especially in mathematics, and we have not had much correspondence together on philosophy, he can know very little about my opinions beyond those which I have published.[11]

The philosophical works by Leibniz that we typically consider today to represent his mature philosophical views were published posthumously. The Principles of Nature and Grace appeared in 1718, The Monadology in 1720, and the New Essays Concerning Human Understanding as late as 1765. Although the early Kant and later German nationals had the benefit of these texts, Wolff really had no such luxury when publishing his German Metaphysics in 1719.

What is significant about considering the relationship between Wolff and Leibniz is that although there is clear evidence that Leibniz was a direct influence on Wolff, there is also equal evidence that testifies to Wolff's independence from Leibniz, particularly when Wolff was formulating and first presenting his philosophical views.[12] Recognizing Wolff's independence is perhaps important for understanding what the early Kant and his contemporaries understood by the expression ‘Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy.’ Instead of taking this expression to mean ‘the philosophy of Leibniz, interpreted and presented by Wolff and his followers,’ as it commonly is, it is best to understand the expression to mean ‘Wolff's Dogmatic Rationalism, corrected and improved through the posthumously discovered views of Leibniz.’ For the early Kant and his contemporaries, Wolff provided a far more systematic and much more thorough presentation of rationalist philosophy than Leibniz. The first collected edition of Leibniz's writings, Leibnitii opera omnia, was assembled by Ludovici Dutens in Geneva in 1768.[13] Yet by 1740, Wolff had already published the bulk of his writings, in both Latin and German editions, in metaphysics, cosmology, psychology, or philosophy of the soul, and natural theology. Unlike Leibniz, who preferred a more interactive style of philosophizing, focusing on specific problems, writing mostly short articles, and engaging specific thinkers in correspondence, Wolff's style of philosophizing was academic, pedagogical, and with the aim of building a system of philosophy by writing long detailed treatises.

3. Wolff's Conception of Philosophy

Identifying Wolff as an academic philosopher is helpful in understanding the exposition and development of his philosophical views. Early in his career, until shortly after his expulsion from Halle, Wolff primarily presented his work in the German vernacular. His reasons for choosing German, rather than Latin or French, the standard languages for academic philosophy at the time, were both tactical and theoretical. Before Wolff, there were very few philosophical works written in German. By providing treatises on logic and metaphysics, Wolff was able to service a noticeable gap in the German university curriculum while at the same time promote his own philosophical agenda. Prior to Wolff's contributions, the standard text books in philosophy were modeled after the largely outdated scholastic-Aristotelian system of Philipp Melanchthon (1497-1560).[14] Unlike English and French universities, which responded much more quickly to overthrowing scholasticism, German universities were slow to make such a change.[15]

But in addition to tactical reasons surrounding the advance of his career, Wolff also had deep-seated theoretical reasons for writing a German-language philosophy. He believed that the goal and purpose of philosophy should not only be rooted in what he calls “the pursuit of the knowledge of the truth” but also in its utility and the practical value it has for humans in their everyday life. In the “Preface” to his German Logic, he writes: “… a person should learn philosophy …[not with] a view to perceive the vicious taste of the schools for idle disputation and wrangling, but in order to [enjoy its] usefulness in future life….”[16] By writing a German-language philosophy, Wolff sought to transform philosophy from a discipline that had become mired in formalism and centered around traditionally defined topics to a discipline that had genuine practical value for German speaking undergraduates.[17]

The practical dimensions of Wolff's philosophy is an important, though often overlooked, feature of his thought. For Wolff, philosophy's aim is shaped by the very nature and structure of the human mind. Wolff believes, in particular, that there are two distinct levels of knowledge that humans can achieve. The first is “common” or “vulgar” knowledge, or as Wolff sometimes says “the natural way of thinking,” and the second is “scientific” knowledge. Scientific knowledge is divided into three basic categories (viz. historical, philosophical, and mathematical) and each category is again sub-divided into particular scientific disciplines.[18] According to Wolff, both common and scientific knowledge are grounded in the conviction humans display for attaining certainty in their beliefs. And unlike his rationalist predecessor Descartes, Wolff is untroubled by the sorts of challenges brought forth by skeptics concerning the possibility and reliability of human knowledge. For Wolff, a system of knowledge is simply an uncontroversial given fact of human experience.

4. On Human Science

According to Wolff, human knowledge should be understood primarily as an ability or disposition of the human mind to perceive facts about reality. That there are facts of reality, and that we can be certain we perceive these facts as facts, is established by Wolff in a moment of introspective self-discovery. Human consciousness, or the act of recognizing ‘the fact of human consciousness,’ is the starting point from which Wolff builds his entire system of Human Science. Wolff's thought experiment is Cartesian in design, insofar as he recognizes the existence of his soul to be an indubitable fact of reality, similar to what Descartes claims to discover in his Meditations on First Philosophy. However, Wolff's thought experiment is also more basically an exercise in common sense and thereby contrasts sharply with the Cartesian discovery of the cogito.[19]

In recognizing our own existence as conscious souls, Wolff believes that we reveal the intuitive knowledge, natural to all humans, that some of our beliefs are certain and indubitable. Self-discovery affords “knowledge of the truth,” on the one hand, and on the other hand, “knowledge of the truth that we can attain certainty in our beliefs.” Wolff's expression “knowledge of the truth” is somewhat archaic. But what he has in mind is that when humans recognize a particular fact of reality as a fact, we have “knowledge of the truth.” According to Wolff, there are essentially three facts that we know intuitively from the experience of self-discovery: (1) we exist as a souls/minds; (2) other (material) things exist outside us; and (3) we are certain of our existence and the existence of other things. This intuitive knowledge is typically presented and pointed out by Wolff at the very beginning of his philosophical treatises. In the opening paragraphs of his German Metaphysics, for example, he writes:

§1. We are conscious of ourselves and other things, this nobody can doubt who is not completely robbed of his senses; and who wants to deny what he would otherwise profess with his mouth.[20]

§5. We learn certitude when we are personally conscious of ourselves and of other things. It is clear [upon reflection], that when a person is conscious of himself and of other things, he must exist. Thus we are certain that we exist.[21]

And in the very first paragraph of the Preliminary Discourse, Wolff writes:

By means of the senses we know things which are and occur in the material world. And the mind is conscious of the changes which occur within itself. No one is ignorant of this. Let one merely direct one's attention to one's self….[for] knowledge acquired by the senses and by attention to ourselves cannot be called into doubt.

The important thing to keep in mind is that Wolff does not pretend to be giving a metaphysical proof of the existence of the soul and external world. He addresses the reader in the second person “we” and aims to refer to the common sense belief that humans exist as thinking beings within the material world. Acknowledging this two-fold fact of reality is simply a disposition or ability of the human mind. More precisely, for Wolff, it is a clear-cut example of “common” or “vulgar” knowledge of a historical (i.e., empirical) fact.

Self-discovery also involves the experience of being certain or having certitude. Wolff ultimately believes that this particular type of experience is an indication of a higher level ability of the human mind to know scientifically. Certitude is a natural goal of the human mind and a bridge between the common and scientific ways of perceiving the facts of reality.[22] In the “Author's Short View” to the German Logic, Wolff explains further:

I myself have experienced the power of logic in the case of aiming at certainty… I have considered in what manner we regularly proceed to common or vulgar knowledge, and pass on from one thought or notion to another; and I have with pleasure observed, that the natural way of thinking is the very same with that, which I distinctly describe in my logic; and of which, I first made mention in my Mathematical Lexicon, under the article, “Demonstration.” From which I learned two things: (1) That the artificial logic differs not from the natural, but rather is a distinct explanation thereof… [and]… (2) [t]hat when we consider the demonstrations in mathematics, we still proceed in the natural manner of thinking.[23]

According to Wolff, artificial logic provides the rules for reaching reliable conclusions in scientific disciplines. In the passage above, Wolff states that artificial logic differs from the natural way of thinking only insofar as the former is a ‘distinct’ explanation of the latter. Here Wolff is using the term ‘distinct’ in a technical sense. Something is distinct, (say) a term, notion or explanation, if the characters or marks of that thing can be distinguished, or picked out, when representing that thing to one's self or to another.[24] That the rules governing our natural way of thinking can be made explicit and formalized in an artificial logic is significant in two different respects. On the one hand, it implies that the logical principles needed for formulating sound judgments are already built into the very structure of the human understanding. Ultimately, Wolff believes that the Principle of Contradiction, the Principle of Sufficient Reason, and the Principle of Conceptual Implication (or Principle of the Syllogism) are all innate to the human mind. And on the other hand, the ability to make explicit an artificial logic allows for a reliable method to be employed in all areas of human inquiry. Ideally, according to Wolff, all the human sciences can be as demonstratively certain as mathematics and can be rationally ordered into a systematic and unified whole.

Like other rationalist philosophers of his day, Wolff is committed to the idea that human knowledge is in a continuous state of progress and that everything, at least in principle, can be eventually explained.[25] And although human inquiry extends into many different subjects, there is, Wolff believes, an intelligible order and interconnectedness between all the different disciplines. Less concerned with justifying why certain disciplines are recognized as “legitimate” or “actual” disciplines of human knowledge, Wolff seeks to establish the method and proper procedure for attaining “knowledge of the truth” within each discipline. If certain groups of facts can be shown to follow from “well-grounded” assumptions and according to strict requirements of demonstration, the class of facts is deemed by Wolff to constitute a “science.” Wolff gives several definitions of the term science:

By science, I understand, that habit of the understanding, whereby, in a manner not to be refuted, we establish our assertions on irrefragable grounds or principles (§2, Chapter 1 of the German Logic).

By science here I mean the habit of demonstrating propositions, i.e., the habit of inferring conclusions by legitimate sequence from certain and immutable principles (§30 of the Preliminary Discourse).

Science is the capacity to prove from indisputable grounds everything one asserts or, in a word, the capacity to demonstrate; and in demonstration truths are connected together; therefore through science one knows the connection of truths, and thus science comes from reason (§383 of the German Metaphysics).[26]

Unlike the critical Kant, Wolff does not distinguish between the understanding and reason. So when he maintains that science is a “habit of the understanding” he means to claim that human reason, when properly employed, can discern groups of facts, establish a certain order and interconnectedness between these facts, and ultimately justify them as being certain parts of human knowledge. Put slightly differently, science is a disposition or ability of the human mind to conceive the facts of reality in an ordered and structured way. Individual sciences, therefore, such as philosophy, cosmology, or psychology, are simply the various sets, or subsets of demonstrable facts.

Wolff's system of Human Science is also structured according to a notion of rational order. The “order of science” pertains to the relationship not only between individual sciences but also between the sets of discoverable facts within each given discipline.[27] The central idea here is that certain truths are known prior to, and serve as a basis for discovering, other truths. And just as there are certain facts that are more fundamental and serve as a basis for discovering other facts, there are, Wolff believes, certain sciences whose subject matter is more basic and which ultimately stand as the foundation for other sciences that have a more specialized focus.[28] For example, in the “order of demonstration,” physics follows general cosmology which, in turn, follows ontology (or first philosophy).[29]

It appears, at first glance, that Wolff's insistence on the rational order of science simply follows from a dogmatic metaphysical claim about the structure of reality. A reasonable objection to Wolff might be that his conception of the rational order of human science is based on an unwarranted assumption about the harmonious order he believes to be present in all facets of reality. This harmonious order (the objection continues) illicitly presupposes that a Divine Architect has created everything according to a plan and thus the rational order of human science is simply an upshot of God's creative power. There are certainly passages of Wolff's works that lend support to such an objection.[30] However, to reduce Wolff's view of the rational order of human science to simply a dogmatic metaphysical claim really ignores the practical and common sense dimensions to his thought. An important part of the reason why Wolff believes that there is a rational order to human science is because of the progress he believes he has witnessed in such sciences as astronomy and optics, which he believes have utilized such an order when establishing various scientific truths.[31] By virtue of the very interconnectedness of the different disciplines (most notably, mathematics with physics and physics with astronomy) the claim for an intrinsic rational order among the sciences is seen by Wolff to be a pragmatic explanation for what is already largely observed and accepted as the status quo among many natural philosophers.[32] Unlike his predecessor Leibniz, Wolff was much more willing to embrace the advances brought in the name of Newtonian natural philosophy.

Now because of its subject matter, which includes the realm of both possible and actual things, philosophy is considered by Wolff to be the broadest and most fundamental science. In the classification of sciences given in his Preliminary Discourse, Wolff divides philosophy into two branches: practical philosophy, on one hand, and theoretical philosophy, on the other.[33] Practical philosophy deals (in general) with human actions and includes morality, politics, jurisprudence, and econmics. Theoretical philosophy, in contrast, deals with sets of possible and actual objects and is (itself) divided into three separate branches: (1) ontology, or metaphysics proper, (2) “special” metaphysics, which includes general cosmology, psychology and natural theology, and (3) physics.[34] Whereas ontology and general cosmology are considered by Wolff to be completely “pure” (or a priori) sciences, psychology, natural theology, and physics are considered to be based upon empirical (i.e., historical) principles.[35] As a brief aside, Wolff and the critical Kant hold very different views on the relationship between practical and theoretical philosophy. Whereas Wolff believes that all of practical philosophy is subordinated to metaphysics (i.e., ontology as well as the three sub-disciplines that comprise special metaphysics), the critical Kant argues for the independence of practical from theoretical principles. Wolff, in stark contrast, maintains that discoveries and conclusions made in practical philosophy are necessarily based upon prior conclusions drawn from ontology or metaphysics.

5. Philosophy as the ‘Science of Possibles’

Wolff gives the following definition of philosophy in his German Logic: “[p]hilosophy is the science of all possible things, together with the manner and reason of their possibility.”[36] Having briefly examined what the notion of science entails for Wolff above, consider now the other central notion of his definition (viz. the notion of “possible things”). This notion is a foundational concept of Wolff's ontology and is ultimately derived by him from the Principle of Contradiction [POC hereafter].

According toWolff, POC is the fundamental principle of human thought, the very first principle of “all metaphysical first principles,” and the “font [or source] of all certitude.”[37] It is regarded by him to be innate to the human mind as a self-evident logical axiom. In the Ontologia, he writes:

§27. We experience… [POC]… in the nature of our mind, in that, while it judges something to be, it is impossible at the same time to judge the same not to be….

§28. … [I]t cannot happen that the same thing simultaneously is and is not….

§30. … [For] … contradiction is simultaneity in affirming and denying.[38]

POC is the “font of all certitude” insofar as, if it were called into question, the most evident and secure judgments of human knowledge, such as knowledge of the self (as a thinking thing), could likewise be called into question. We recognize the necessity of our own existence by recognizing the psychological impossibility of denying it. But if it were possible both to affirm and also deny our own existence (simultaneously), then the experience of certitude that accompanies self-discovery would thereby be undermined. By attending to our mind, Wolff believes that we reveal both the logical and psychological meaning of impossibility. Impossibility, defined formally, is “that which involves a contradiction.”[39]

Now for Wolff, ‘possible’ and ‘possible thing’ are basically synonymous terms. What is possible as a concept is simply reducible to what is possible as a thing.[40] The realm of concepts and the ontological realm of objects converge in the Wolffian system.[41] A thing or “being” is defined as “that which does not involve a contradiction.”[42] A possible concept, consequently, is that which corresponds to a possible object.[43] This analysis of the concept of possible typifies Wolff's non-existential and essence-centered approach to ontology. Very briefly, Wolff's understanding of being (or what-is) involves regarding being in its most general sense. A being is ‘something’ if and only if it is intrinsically possible, and something is intrinsically possible, if and only if its predicates or “determinations” are not contradictory. ‘Nothing,’ in contrast, is simply a term that is empty of all content. In the ontological realm of objects there is literally no thing to which “nothing” corresponds.[44] Nothing, by definition, is not thinkable or conceivable.

One important point to emphasize about Wolff's exposition of ontology is that existence (or the actual reality of being) is regarded exclusively as a determination or “mode” of possible things.[45] Although existing things are included in his overall description of reality, they are not as a class of objects his primary focus. More accurately, existing objects figure into Wolff's metaphysical account only insofar as existing objects are a subset of possible things.

To briefly recap, it is from POC, an innate principle of the human mind, that Wolff believes we first learn the meaning of possible and impossible. “The possible is that which does not entail any contradiction, or which is not impossible (Ontologia, §85).[46] Next, the definition of a possible thing or being is stipulated as ‘something which is intrinsically possible.” Crucial to Wolff's understanding of ontology is the distinction between something and nothing. Whereas something is that which is intrinsically possible and corresponds to a possible object, nothing is an empty term and cannot (strictly speaking) be thought of as something because there is no possible object to which it corresponds.

6. The Principle of Sufficient Reason

With the notions of ‘possible thing,’ ‘something,’ and ‘nothing’ firmly in hand, we can now explain the notion of reason (or ratio) that Wolff includes in his definition of philosophy. Insofar as the subject matter of philosophy concerns the realm of all possible things, Wolff believes that the task of the philosopher is to provide “the manner and reason” of their possibility. Warrant for this claim is grounded in the idea that everything, whether possible or actual, has a “sufficient reason” for why it is rather than not. In §56 of his Ontologia, he writes: “By sufficient reason we understand that, from which it is understood why something is [or can be].”[47] Unlike Leibniz who essentially restricts the notion of sufficient reason to “contingent truths of fact,” Wolff considers the notion to have a much broader scope of application to include the set of all possible objects and what Leibniz calls “necessary truths of reason.”[48] The idea that everything has a sufficient reason is presented formally by Wolff as the Principle of Sufficient Reason [PSR hereafter].

Wolff's most extensive treatment of the PSR appears in §§56-78 of his Ontologia. In this discussion, Wolff appears to give two separate accounts of the theoretical origin of the principle. On the one hand, in §70, Wolff provides a proof (or derivation) of PSR from POC and the notions of ‘something’ and ‘nothing.’ And, on the other hand, in §74, Wolff claims PSR is an innate principle of the human mind and a self-evident logical axiom. Although prima facie, it is unclear why Wolff attempts to advance both views, it is perhaps worth pointing out the difference between (1) being able to be demonstrate the truth of a proposition and (2) knowing the truth of a proposition because it is self-evident. While demonstrating the truth of a proposition yields knowledge of it, to know a proposition because it is self-evident may or may not mean the proposition is also demonstrable. There is no inconsistency, for example, in holding that one and same proposition is both self-evident and demonstrable. A proposition could be known immediately one way and yet, in another way, follow as a conclusion of a sound deductive argument.

Wolff believes that the self-evident nature of PSR becomes apparent when we consider three specific aspects of our rational/conscious experience. The first is that PSR is never contradicted by experience; the second is that we can recognize singular instances, or examples, of it in our experience of the world, and the third is that we have an inquisitive attitude toward our surroundings and future life.[49] For Wolff, these characteristics are not regarded as empirical evidence for PSR, but rather that PSR is a necessary presupposition for these characteristics to be a part of our conscious experience.[50] Thus by simply reflecting on the nature of our understanding of the world, Wolff believes that we arrive at the self-evident truth of PSR.

Now according to Wolff there are at least five self-evident (axiomatic) principles of human thought: POC, the Principle of Excluded Middle, the Principle of Certitude (or Principle of Identity), PSR, and the Principle of Conceptual Implication (or Principle of the Syllogism).[51] Of these five principles, only POC is indemonstrable in the sense that the truth of the principle cannot be proved to follow from a formal deductive inference. As we have seen, Wolff believes that we learn the truth of this principle by attending to the psychological experience of not being able to both affirm and deny our own existence in introspection. Thus only in a weak sense of ‘demonstration’ can Wolff claim to demonstrate the truth of POC. The remaining four self-evident principles, however, are demonstrable in the strict sense and each, he believes, can be derived from POC. His demonstration of PSR in §70 of the Ontologia is as follows:

Nothing exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist. That is, if something is posited to exist, something must also be posited that explains why the first thing exists rather than does not exist. For either (i) nothing exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist, or else (ii) something can exist without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist (§53). Let us assume that some A exists without a sufficient reason for why it exists rather than does not exist. (§56) Therefore nothing is to be posited that explains why A exists. What is more, A is admitted to exist because nothing is assumed to exist: since this is absurd (§69), nothing exists without a sufficient reason; and if something is posited to exist, something else must be assumed that explains why that thing exists.[52]

The crucial premise (italicized above) purports to reveal a contradiction that follows from the assumption that something exists without a sufficient reason.[53] Since “nothing” cannot both be something and nothing at the same time (according to POC), the conclusion (or PSR) is claimed to follow. In his early publication, New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition [1755], Kant provides a critique of this argument. In particular, he claims that Wolff's proof involves an equivocation with the term ‘nothing,’ and once the two different meanings of this term are identified (viz. nothing as the opposite of something, on one hand, and nothing as a non-being, on the other), the supposed contradiction, purported to follow from the assumption, cannot be established (AK 1:398).[54]

There are two important points to consider about Wolff's argument for PSR and Kant's subsequent analysis of it. First, whether or not Wolff succeeds in his task of proving PSR does not significantly detract from his basic conviction that all axiomatic principles of the human mind are derivable from POC. Strictly speaking, Wolff believes that POC is the only indemonstrable self-evident truth and that all true propositions can in theory be demonstrated to be true by means of a deductively sound argument. The latter part of this claim is certainly provocative. For according to Wolff, even empirical truths of fact, such as ‘this rock is now warm,’ are candidates for demonstration and deductive proof.[55] From this perspective, since PSR is self-evidently true, Wolff believes it can be demonstrated to be so (despite whether his proof presented in §70 of the Ontologia succeeds or not). In this respect, Kant's criticism of Wolff's proof, which certainly appears to be correct, cannot by itself serve to undermine Wolff's claim for the demonstrability of PSR from POC.

The second important point to keep in mind is that although the early Kant is critical of Wolff's demonstration of PSR, he does not challenge the principle's status as an innate principle.[56] The early Kant's criticism of Wolff's conception of PSR also involves the charge that Wolff does not clearly differentiate between the ‘logical’ and the ‘real’ (or metaphysical) use of the principle.[57] But even as Kant develops this criticism, and refines the distinction between logical and metaphysical principles in the first Critique, he never abandons the view that PSR (in its logical form) is innate and axiomatic to the human mind.[58]

For Wolff, the expression ‘to provide the reason of something’ can be taken in two different ways. On the one hand, if the something for which a reason is provided is regarded solely as a possible thing, then ‘reason’ stands to account for why that thing (as a possible thing) is the possible thing that it is. According to Wolff, every being is endowed with an essential nature. Possible things have natures insofar as they as are comprised of a number of non-contradictory determinations or predicates. Different sets of determinations, and the relationships among these determinations, serve as the principle of individualization within the realm of possible things. Hence, to provide the reason for a possible thing is simply to enumerate the determinations that make that thing the kind of possible thing that it is. Reason, in this sense, is regarded by Wolff as ratio essendi or the “reason of being.”

If, on the other hand, the something to which a reason is provided is an actual (i.e., existing) thing, then ‘reason’ stands to explain why that thing as an actual thing comes into existence. Reason, in this sense, is regarded as ratio fiendi or the “reason of becoming.” Recall that for Wolff existence is simply a predicate or determination of possible things. A familiar expression appearing in Wolff's writings is that existence is “the complement of possibility.”[59] The basic idea here is that existence, as a predicate, perfects a possible thing by making it actual and a “real individual.” Real individuals differ from nominal beings insofar as the former are “complete and determinate.” To be ‘complete and determinate,’ in Wolff's sense of the expression, means that every aspect or determination of a thing can be specified and that its determinations are sufficient to individuate it from all other things.[60] Nominal beings, although ‘complete,’ are indeterminate.[64] That is to say, although there is a certain set of specifiable determinations that is sufficient to pick out a given possible thing among all possible things, the total set of its determinations is not specifiable. A being, in the most general sense, is comprised of three different types of determinations: essentials, attributes, and modes. Essential determinations define the essential nature of a being and a being's attributes follow from, or are determined by, its essentials.[62] Whereas essentials and attributes are both necessary properties of a thing, modes are contingent or accidental properties. Thus to say a nominal being is indeterminate is to say that there are modes of it that may or may not be present. In the weakest sense, since existence is a mode, and nominal beings do not exist (as such) but are able to come into existence under certain conditions, all nominal beings are indeterminate.

Discerning the difference between the ‘reason of being’ and the ‘reason of becoming’ is important for understanding the different ways Wolff employs PSR in his exposition of metaphysics. Depending on how exactly ‘reason’ is interpreted, the principle, ‘nothing is without a sufficient reason for why it is rather than not’ may apply either to the realm of possibility or to the realm of actual reality. Toward the end of his Ontologia, Wolff makes an attempt to recognize formally two different versions of PSR as “the Principle of Being” and “the Principle of Becoming” (respectively).[63] As a Principle of Being, PSR stands as a definition of a thing's essential nature. Yet as a Principle of Becoming, PSR serves to furnish the causes, or grounds, for why a real individual comes into actuality.

7. Empirical Facts and Knowledge of Real Existence

To be sure, PSR is central to Wolff's entire exposition of metaphysics and figures prominently in all levels of his philosophical analysis.[64] In one respect, Wolff's commitment to this principle, and the extensive manner in which he employs it to establish various truths about reality, represents the very essence of his rationalism. That everything has a reason “from which it is understood” why it is rather than not is certainly no modest claim about the intelligibility of the universe. Even more so than his rationalist predecessors, such as Descartes and Leibniz, Wolff elevates the role of human reason as the premier instrument of human knowledge. If the reasons for things can be established from “well grounded assumptions” and as the result of a deductive chain of inference, every truth (or fact) about the world can potentially be included within Wolff's system of Human Science.

In retrospect, what is remarkable about Wolff's rationalism is that Wolff actively sought to defend his conception of reason against the rising tide of empiricism which at the time aimed to limit the role of reason as an instrument of human knowledge. During the 1720's and 1730's when Wolff published the bulk of his work in philosophy, Empiricists, such as Locke and Newton, announced that it was necessary to identify the “limits of the human understanding” and to “frame no hypothesis” about the natural world which could not be based on observation and experience. Unlike Descartes and to some extent Leibniz, Wolff advanced a rationalist philosophy within an intellectual climate that was downright hostile to the authority of reason. Yet instead of posing a counterattack, highlighting the deceiving nature of empirical knowledge and empiricism generally, Wolff sought to accommodate the claims of his adversaries.[65] In particular, Wolff aimed to include empirical knowledge as the foundation for philosophical knowledge and establish a definitive place for empirical knowledge within his system of Human Science.[66]

Recall that human scientific knowledge, for Wolff, is divided into three separate branches: mathematical, philosophical, and historical (or empirical) knowledge. In §17 of his Preliminary Discourse, he describes the central differences between these three ways of knowing as follows:

Mathematical knowledge differs from both historical and philosophical knowledge. For history rests in the bare knowledge of the fact. In philosophy we discover the reason of things which are or can be. And in mathematics we determine the quantities which are present in things. It is one thing to know the fact, another thing to perceive the reason of fact, and still another to determine the quantity of things.

Whereas historical knowledge is empirical and based upon recognizing the “bare facts” of experience, philosophical knowledge is knowing the reasons of things. This latter type of knowing may involve either knowing a thing's ‘reason of being’ (i.e., a thing's true philosophical definition) or a thing's ‘reason of becoming’ (i.e., knowing the causes and/or conditions that bring the thing into existence). Mathematical knowledge, in turn, involves knowing something of the world by virtue of the quantity that is present in a given object of knowledge. For Wolff, an object of knowledge may either be a thing in-and-of-itself (i.e., a thing as a finite and determinable unity) or it may be a collection or aggregate of finite, complete and determinate, real individuals.

Wolff divides the human mind into two basic faculties: the faculty of sense and imagination, on the one hand, and the faculty of understanding and reason, on the other. Because historical knowledge is based in experience, Wolff believes that it is through the faculty of sense that humans gain historical knowledge. And because philosophical knowledge is knowledge of the reasons of things, he believes that it is through the intellectual faculty of reason that humans gain philosophical knowledge. Mathematical knowledge, in contrast to both historical and philosophical knowledge, may either be gained through the senses or through reason. That is to say, Wolff believes that there are times when our “knowledge of the quantity of things” is determined empirically (i.e., by means of the senses), and other times when it is determined by reason (e.g., contained in a thing's Principle of Being).

According to Wolff, a true philosophical definition of a thing yields the sufficient reason for all its essential predicates and it is arrived at through the faculty of reason. However, knowledge of “real existence” (i.e., not just possible things but actual things of the world) cannot be attained through the understanding and reason, and therefore is derived through experience and historical fact. In §370 and §371 of his German Metaphysics, Wolff explains:

Because of that which one knows only by experience, one knows only that it is but does not see how it is connected with other truths, in knowledge from experience there is no reason. Hence experience is opposed to reason…We have, then, two ways by which we can reach the knowledge of truth: experience and reason. The former is based on the senses, and the latter on the understanding.

And somewhat earlier in §277 of this same work, he writes:

The faculty of distinctly representing to ourselves what is possible is understanding. In this, the understanding differs from the senses and imagination; for the latter can at most give clear, not distinct ideas; but when understanding is added, the same ideas become distinct….[67]

For Wolff, giving a definition for an object in the natural world begins first with experience and recognizing the empirical fact of its existence. However, since knowledge of such an object is admittedly confused or incomplete, as it is an object of sense, the faculty of reason is needed in order to yield distinct knowledge of it. According to Wolff, empirical (or historical) fact can only tell you, at best, that something exists, but not anything about the essential nature and properties of a thing. In order to know something substantive about an object of experience, such as its essential properties, the faculty of reason, exercised through the mind's philosophical way of knowing, must be employed.

In a strict sense, therefore, knowledge gained through the senses is limited to two basic kinds claims: claims of real existence, on one hand, and claims about the quantity present in things, on the other. Two things follow from Wolff's view of sensual knowledge that are perhaps worth noting. The first is that historical knowledge of bodies (or physical matter) is sufficient to give knowledge of their real existence. Since we have experience of our own body and other bodies local to it, we are guaranteed of the real existence of such things. The second consequence to follow from Wolff's view of sensual knowledge is that mathematical knowledge of the material world is sufficient to establish that the world is a plurality of co-existing bodies and that each individual body is a composite of parts. Even from our partial experience of the “world-whole”, Wolff believes that we can safely conclude that the world is a plurality of co-existing things and each given body is (itself) a composite whole.

8. Theoretical Philosophy

Philosophy is a science of possible and actual reality. According to Wolff's own taxonomy, theoretical philosophy is divided into three separate branches: ontology (or metaphysics proper), special metaphysics, and physics. Cosmology, as a branch of metaphysics, is a special or restricted science insofar as its subject matter deals with the ‘world-whole’ rather than ‘being in general’ (the subject matter of ontology). Although there is an important sense for Wolff in which ontology is relevant for, and even necessarily grounds cosmology and the other special sciences, cosmology (itself) stands in a grounding relationship to physics that is, yet again, a more narrow and specialized discipline.[68] Just as there are certain principles and certain truths established in ontology that are relevant for cosmology, there are certain principles and certain truths established in cosmology that are relevant for the more specialized science of physics. In fact, within Wolff's system there is complete uniformity from the top-down (so to speak), so that even principles of ontology are relevant for the discipline of physics. As might be expected, one such principle that enjoys such universal application is PSR.

8.1 Ontology (or Metaphysics Proper)

Recall that for Wolff a being in the most general sense is any possible thing. Possible things have essential natures insofar as they are composed of a number of noncontradictory determinations or predicates. The essence of any given possible thing is its Principle of Being, or principle of individualization. Whereas the essence of a simple being is defined by its essentials, or essential properties, the essence of a composite being is defined by the manner in which its parts are combined together. In §532 of his Ontologia, Wolff explains:

A being is called composed which is made up of many parts distinct from each other. The parts of which a composite being is composed constitute a composite through the link which makes the many parts taken together a unit of a definite kind.[69]

In one respect, simple beings and composite beings are not simply two different species of beings.[70] It is not the case, for example, that within the realm of all possible things simple beings exist separate from, and in addition to, composite beings. More accurately, at the nominal level of reality simples and composites result from an epistemological distinction imposed by a perceiving mind in its analysis of what “exists” (i.e. exists in a nominal sense). Strictly speaking, the only substantial things to exist at any level of reality are simple substances. Simples are defined by their essentials, and to borrow an expression from Gilson, essentials are both “compatible and prime.”[71] That is to say, the essential properties that define a given simple substance do not contradict one another, or cancel each other out, and they are (themselves) not determined by any other thing and/or property. In this light, Wolff's notion of substance is perhaps best regarded as a notion of essence, where each simple substance is a different set of compatible and prime essential properties.[72] Furthermore, essential properties should not be viewed as the accidents of substance because, according to Wolff, they are the substance itself. In Wolff's system, the accidents of substance are the properties that exist by virtue of a thing's essentials. And according to Wolff, there are three basic classes of accidents: proper attributes, common attributes, and modes.[73]

Proper and common attributes of substance follow from and are determined by a thing's essentials. Proper attributes are the properties of a thing that are determined by all the essentials taken together, and common attributes are the properties of a thing that are determined by only some, but not all, its essentials. Attributes (as such) are perhaps best understood as necessary accidents, since they are determined by and necessarily follow from a thing's essentials. Modes, in contrast, are only contingent accidents of substance. They are the properties of a thing that may or may not be present, and if actually present, they are causally the result of some contingent state of affairs. More precisely, the possible presence of any given mode follows from a substance's essentials, but the actual presence of a given mode is the result of something outside the substance's essence that is causally responsible for its presence in a being. At the nominal level of reality, composite beings exist insofar as the accidents of a certain simple substance, or set of simple substances, are linked and/or arranged together in a certain sort of way. In §789 of his Ontologia, Wolff writes: “[t]he essence of a composite being consists only in mere accidents for the essence of a composite consists in the manner in which its parts are combined with one another.”[74]

8.2 Cosmology

The notion of ‘extended-composite’ lies at the heart of Wolff's doctrine of the world-whole. Cosmology, as a special metaphysical science, is the study of the world-whole in general. The world, as such, is an extended composite of extended composites. In §544 of his German Metaphysics, Wolff explains:

The world is a collection of mutable things that are next to each other, follow upon one another, and are entirely connected with each other.[75]

In precise terms, Wolff believes the world is an extended whole that is composed of a finite number of interacting physical bodies. To better understand the types of cosmological claims that Wolff defends about the universe, it is perhaps helpful to consider first his conception of physical bodies. Ultimately, the conclusions that Wolff draws at the macroscopic level about the world-whole are simply extrapolated from his analysis of physical bodies. After considering Wolff's analysis of body, this section will conclude with an overview of Wolff's view of space, time and material extension.

Wolff's analysis of physical bodies is given from two different perspectives. First is the ‘bottom-up’ metaphysical account of bodies, where bodies are defined as aggregates of simple substances, and second is the ‘top-down’ mechanistic description, where the reality of bodies, given by the testimony of the senses, is explained in terms of interacting primitive corpusula (or corpuscles).[76] To facilitate our discussion, we should identify the three levels of description that Wolff employs when giving his two perspective account. Identifying these three different levels is helpful in understanding at what respective point the mechanical and metaphysical accounts each terminate or bottom out.

The ground floor (so to speak) is the atomic level that is occupied by a “multitude” of simple substances. Unlike simple substances at the nominal level of reality that lack the “mode of existence,” simples at the atomic level are real individuals (i.e., complete and determinate, actually existing beings). In addition to the term “simples,” Wolff also refers to these occupants of the atomic level as “elements” and “atoms of nature” (atomi naturae). Atomic elements (as such) are conceived by Wolff to be “unextended points of force” that lack internal motion (motus intestinus) but yet remain in a constant state of change. Each atomic element is defined, or individuated, by its own distinctive internal state and each is considered to be indivisible in-itself. Although later Wolffians, such as Friedrich Baumeister, would eventually refer to Wolff's atomic elements as “monads,” there is at least one important respect in which Wolff's atomic elements are different from Leibniz's monads.[77] Leibniz conceives monads as simple unextended substances, and hence Leibnizian monads are “windowless” substances that do not interact or influence one another. Wolff's atomic elements, in contrast, do interact and have real dynamic influence over each other.[78]

The second level of description that Wolff employs when giving his account of bodies is the microphysical level. The occupants of this level are the primitive parts of bodies which Wolff calls corpuscles or material atoms. In §186 of his Cosmologia, Wolff provides a helpful contrast between atoms of nature, on one hand, and material atoms, on the other:

That is called an atom of nature which is indivisible in itself because it is devoid of parts into which it can be divided. That is called a material atom which in itself is able to be divided, but for actually dividing it, existing causes in rerum natura are not adequate.[79]

Material atoms or corpuscles are indivisible in the sense that there is nothing within the world that is capable of reducing them into further parts. Corpuscles represent the lowest level of explanation that is possible within a mechanical account of bodies. Similar to the atomic level, the microphysical level lies beyond the boundaries of human perception. Wolff believes that although corpuscles are extended, fill space, and are endowed with the “force of inertia,” a precise statement of their size, magnitude, and shape cannot be empirically determined. It is unclear, for example, whether all corpuscles retain homogeneity with respect to their magnitude and shape. Yet because corpuscles are a species of composite beings, Wolff is confident that the essence of a corpuscle consists in the manner in which its parts are joined together. A corpuscle is an aggregate of atomic elements. Its component parts are simply the unextended points of force that occupy the atomic level.

The third level of description that Wolff employs when giving his account of bodies is the level of appearance or sensible reality. It is at this level that bodies and their phenomenal properties, such as extension, the force of inertia, and motor force (vis motrix), are described in mechanistic terms. In §793 of his Ontologia, Wolff writes:

I prefer that aggregates of simple substances, namely, those compound beings of which the material world is composed, be called bodies rather than simple substances…[80]

In a strict sense, a body is considered by Wolff to be a composite of composites. The interacting atomic elements (conceived as unextended points of force) give rise to primitive corpuscles and from the cohesion of corpuscles, a body is thereby constituted at the level of appearance. Wolff writes, … “each body has its origin in that which is not extended, although it is itself extended”(Cosmologia, §223).[81] At the level of appearance, bodies display a number of determinate properties. Each body has a specifiable size or magnitude (i.e., it can be measured), it occupies a fixed space or place (insofar as it is extended), it displays a certain shape, and it is divisible to the primitive corpuscles from which it is composed. Yet, according to Wolff, the properties of bodies should not be considered as the accidents of anything substantial because bodies are merely phenomenal manifestations of real, interacting, atomic elements. Even the principal properties of bodies used in the analysis of bodily change and motion (i.e., the properties used in mechanics), such as extension, the force of inertia, and motor force, are deemed by Wolff to be phenomenal properties.

Now according to Wolff all sensible properties of bodies should be considered as secondary (or mind-dependent) qualities. In §144 of his Cosmologia, Wolff writes: “…extension is a phenomenon in the same sense in which color is accustomed to be called a phenomenon….”[82] And somewhat later in this same work, he states in §298: “[t]he force of inertia is called a phenomenon in the same sense in which all sensible qualities are called phenomena.”[83] Perhaps the best way to understand Wolff's view of sensible properties is to consider a quick comparison with Locke's corpuscularian view of bodies. For Locke, the primary qualities of bodies, such as extension, solidity, shape, size and texture give rise to the secondary qualities that we perceive in bodies, such as color, sound, taste, smell and temperature. According to Locke, secondary qualities are nothing in the objects themselves but are the result of certain “powers” inherent in the primary qualities of things which effect various sensations in us, such as the sensation of a certain color or temperature.[84] Thus it is by virtue of a body's micro-structure that we are able to perceive its secondary qualities. Wolff, for the most part, accepts this causal-corpuscularian theory of secondary qualities. However, unlike Locke, Wolff believes that all sensible properties are secondary qualities that result from a body's atomic structure. In very simplistic terms, sensible properties are for Wolff what color, sound, taste, smell and temperature are for Locke. For both philosophers, secondary qualities are phenomenal and mind-dependent properties having their causal origin in some objective (i.e., mind-independent) reality. For Locke, this reality is the independently existing corpuscles that comprise the material world; and for Wolff, this reality is the unextended points of force, or simple substances, that occupy his atomic level.[85]

Before explaining Wolff's view of how extended composites come into being (i.e., the causal process that allows us to form our ideas of extended objects), it is necessary to say a few prefatory words about his view of space and time. The notions of ‘place’ and ‘space,’ on one hand, and the notion of ‘time,’ on the other, figure in at different stages of Wolff's exposition of extended reality.

First and foremost, there is an important distinction in Wolff's cosmology between ‘general space‘ and ‘particular space.‘ Particular space (or a given place) is what an extended body “fills” or “occupies” by virtue of its corpuscular parts.[86] Its reality is derivative of the interacting atomic elements that give rise to individual corpuscles. For Wolff, a corpuscle's place simply results from a corpuscle's extension. A given place is conceived as an imaginary immobile container that has the same dimensions as the extended thing that occupies it.[87] General space, in contrast, is conceived as the perceived order of coexisting bodies. As explained above, the existence of bodies is established by Wolff experientially through historical and mathematical knowledge. In §45 and §46 of his German Metaphysics, Wolff explains:

If we pay attention to ourselves [as thinking things], we will find that we are conscious of many things outside ourselves. However, we set them apart from us in that we recognize that they are distinguishable from us, just in the same way as they are set beside each other, we recognize they are distinguishable from each other…. In that there are many things now which exist at the same time and which are presented apart (and yet at the same time different) from each other, such things come into being under a certain order. And as soon as we perceive this order we perceive space. Therefore, if we do not want to examine the matter differently than we recognize it, we must assume space is the order of such things which are simultaneous.[88]

Wolff's derivation of general space essentially involves three steps. First, knowledge of the self, as a thinking thing, affords a distinction between consciousness, on one hand, and consciousness of external things, on the other. Second, since that which is conscious (viz. the self) is different from that of which it is conscious (viz. the world), the self can recognize the historical and mathematical fact that it is conscious of many external things at one time (i.e., the world as a plurality). And third, since this empirical fact affords knowledge of real existences, the order or way the self represents these things is what becomes known as space. To borrow Kant's terminology, Wolffian space lacks “objective reality” because it is simply abstracted from the coexistence of things in the world, and therefore takes on purely a subjective character.[89]

In contrast to his theories of place and general space, Wolff holds a much more realistic theory of time.[90] In a strict sense, place and space serve an explanatory role for Wolff at two distinct levels of description (viz. the micro-physical level and the level of appearance). Since atomic elements are unextended, the concepts of place and space are considered by Wolff to be extraneous at the atomic level. Time, however, is not. Atomic elements are in time insofar as each element is in a constant state of change. In his most general description of time, Wolff writes: “[t]ime is the order of successive things in a continuous series” (Ontologia, §572).[91] Since each atomic element produces in-itself a constant and continuous series of changes, time is regarded by Wolff as the objective measure of such changes. One clear statement of the Wolffian view of the relationship between time and change can be found in a letter to Kant (dated 13 October 1770 ) from the Wolffian Johann Heinrich Lambert. Lambert writes:

All changes are bound to time and are inconceivable without time. If changes are real, then time is real, whatever it may be. If time is unreal, then no change can be real. I think, though, that even an idealist must grant at least that changes really exist and occur in his representations, for example, their beginning and ending. Thus time cannot be regarded as something unreal. It is not a substance, and so on, but a finite determination of duration, and like duration, it is somehow real in whatever this reality may consists.[92]

For Wolff, Lambert, and Moses Mendelssohn (also a Wolffian), time is real insofar as it is an objective measure of change.[93] Change is a constant feature of existing reality in that real individuals are finite and created beings with a determinate duration. Real individuals come into and go out of existence. Time, therefore, is applicable to the series of changes that occur within a given individual and, in the same respect, it is applicable to the totality of all the individuals that compose the world-whole. Thus for Wolff there is a meaningful sense in which real individuals and the world-whole (itself) are “in time.”[94] This is not to say, however, that time is granted its own ontological existence. In Lambert's words, time is not a substance (i.e., something real in-and-of itself). More precisely, time is the measure of the objective order of change that real things undergo.

Understanding the sense in which atomic elements are ‘in time’ is important for grasping the manner in which Wolff's atomic elements interact. Since atomic elements lack extension, the nature of atomic interaction is not spatial. It is not the case, for example, that Wolff's simple substances influence one another by physical contact and repulsion. Instead, atomic elements as unextended points of force affect, and are responsive to, degrees of change by communicating with each other in time. The series of changes internal to a given atomic element are the result of its own power (or motor force) as well as the motor forces of other elements to which it is connected. Ultimately Wolff believes that it is the interacting forces of a multitude of simple substances that gives rise to our idea of an extended object. In particular, we perceive extended objects at the level of appearance insofar as there are unextended points of force interacting in time at the atomic level. Our confused perception of this temporal interaction results in the idea of an extended object. Similarly to Locke, Wolff believes that it is the primitive qualities of a composite that produce, or effect in us, the various ideas we have of its secondary qualities. Since all sensible properties are considered by Wolff to be secondary qualities, extension, or a composite's extendedness, results from the primitive forces of a composite at the atomic level. The analogy that Wolff presents to help explain the phenomenal manifestation of extension involves a rapidly ringing bell.[95] According to Wolff, just as the impression we gain from a rapidly ringing bell is the sound of one prolonged peal, where the successive strikes of a bell's clacker are perceived as one monomial sound, our impression of extension is likewise the result of many successively acting atomic forces that give rise to our confused perception of one continuous extended object.

The notion of “extended-composite,” as already mentioned, is what ultimately stands at the heart of Wolff's doctrine of the world-whole. Insofar as the world is a composite being, it follows from the principles of Wolff's ontology that the world's essence consists in the manner in which its parts are linked together. The world's parts, as described from the standpoint of appearance, are simply the multitude of interacting physical bodies that are perceived in everyday life. And, if described from a metaphysical standpoint, the world's parts are conceived by Wolff to be the interacting unextended points of force that occupy his atomic level. Yet regardless of what standpoint or level of description is employed, it is clear that a necessary condition of the world's existence is that its parts need to be interconnected. According to Wolff, the world is conceived as a substantial whole (totum substantiale) by virtue of the fact that all of its parts form real reciprocal connections with one another. On the basis of this “interconnection-thesis” the world is defined formally by Wolff as ‘a whole which is not also a part.’[96]

8.3 Psychology (Empirical and Rational)

Wolff's philosophy of the soul (or mind) has both an empirical and rational component. In many ways, Wolff's commitment to empirical knowledge from a rationalistic standpoint is epitomized in his approach to psychology. Wolff believes, in broad outline, that he can first establish a set of principles about the soul based on observation and experience and then to go on to give an account (via conceptual analysis) of why and how the human soul is the way that it is. Introspection, or the empirical knowledge of one's own consciousness, is regarded by Wolff as a special case of knowledge. It provides the starting points for both proving the existence of the human soul and identifying its principal operations, such as cognition, perception, and apperception. In §1 of the “Prolegomenon” of his Empirical Psychology, Wolff gives the following description:

Empirical psychology is the science of establishing through experience the principles from which a reason is given of those things which occur in the human soul.

And similarly, at the very start of his Rational Psychology, §1 of the “Prolegomenon,” Wolff writes:

Rational Psychology is the science of those things which are possible through the human soul.

Common to both approaches to psychology is a discussion the of soul's nature or true definition. In the empirical approach, the content of introspective experience allows for the construction of a nominal definition of the soul. A nominal definition is simply a thin description of something that awaits further elucidation. In Wolff's methodology, experience establishes the content of nominal definitions, and through the application of PSR, a thing's ‘real definition’ is then discovered. In §20 of the Empirical Psychology, for example, Wolff's thin description of the soul is “that being in us which is conscious of itself and of other things outside us.” The real definition of the soul, given in §66 of the Rational Psychology, in contrast, is as follows:

The essence of the soul consists in the force of representing the world by virtue of the soul's ability to sense … and by its corresponding body's situation in the world.

Several aspects of this definition deserve comment. First, similarly to Leibniz, Wolff believes the principal function of the soul is found in its power to “represent” (i.e., form thoughts about things). The mind/soul represents its surroundings, for example, insofar as a series of coordinated perceptions form the basis of one's conscious experience. The alterations that occur in the mind, according to Wolff, depend on the condition of one's sensory organs as well as the situation or place that one finds one's self in the world. In contrast to Leibniz, who maintains that the human soul is self-contained (or windowless), Wolff believes that the power to represent is a function of the soul and the way the soul is able to interact with its reality.

A second aspect of Wolff's real definition of the soul worth commenting on is how the notion of force (vis conatus) is absolutely central. After providing demonstrations of the soul's simple and immaterial nature, the focus of Wolff's Rational Psychology is on specifying the laws that govern the operation of its faculties. Wolff broadly construes the faculties as “active potencies” and attempts to explain, for example, the laws governing sensation and reflection, imagination and memory, and attention and intellection. As is sometimes noted, Wolff appears to be giving a “mechanics of the soul” in the middle sections of his Rational Psychology in a manner similar to the Newtonian who, with the laws of motion, gives an account of physical phenomena.[97]

The last major topic that occupies a spot in Wolff's psychology is his discussion of the mind-body problem. Discussed in both the empirical and rational treatments of the subject (although receiving far more attention in “Section III” of Rational Psychology), Wolff surveys the debate between the positions of ‘physical influx,’ ‘occasionalism,’ and ‘pre-established harmony.’ Offering an argument by elimination, Wolff cautiously sides with the proponents of pre-established harmony and maintains it is the best “philosophical hypothesis” that explains the appearance of mind-body interaction.[98]

8.4 Natural Theology

Wolff's two volume work on natural theology is the culmination to his treatment of ‘special metaphysics.’ Defined as “the science of those things that are possible through God,” natural theology represents the end of metaphysical inquiry insofar as metaphysics is concerned with the realm of all possible objects (§1 Natural Theology, vol. 1). Yet, at the same time, natural theology also provides a bottom-up justification for metaphysics insofar as metaphysics is concerned with actual existing beings of a contingent and created reality. In the “Prologue” to both volumes, Wolff indicates that natural theology has a threefold goal: (1) to prove the existence of God; (2) to determine the essential attributes of God; and (3) to determine the things that are possible given God's essential attributes (§ 4). For Wolff, there is an important interconnectedness between the disciplines of special metaphysics. Just as cosmology and psychology (together) provide the basis for advancing an a posteriori proof for God's existence, it is the result of theology's a priori proof whereby the inquiry into the causes of contingent reality is justified.

Wolff's a posteriori proof for God's existence (the primary topic of discussion of Volume 1) is as follows:

The human soul exists or we exist. Since nothing is without a sufficient reason why it is rather than is not, a sufficient reason must be given why our soul exists, or why we exist. Now this reason is contained in ourselves or in some other being diverse from us. But if you maintain that we have the reason of our existence in a being which, in turn, has the reason of its existence in another, you will not arrive at the sufficient reason unless you come to a halt at some being which does have the sufficient reason of its own existence in itself. Therefore, either we ourselves are the necessary being, or there is given a necessary being other and diverse from us. Consequently, a necessary being exists (§24, Natural Theology vol. 1).[99]

Crucial to the set-up of this argument is the distinction between an ens a se and an ens ab alio. An ens a se (or a being-in-and-from-itself) has all the essential determinations that guarantee its independent and self-sufficient nature. God is an ens a se precisely because God has the sufficient reason of his existence in his essence. An ens ab alio, such as the created material universe or a finite human soul, does not have its sufficient reason for its existence in itself. Rather, the world-whole or a finite human soul has the sufficient reason for its existence in the causal efficacy or nature of some other being. Unsurprisingly, the major premise to Wolff's a posteriori proof for God is PSR. From the impossibility of an actual infinite series, Wolff concludes, from the existence of a first uncaused cause, that God exists.[100]

Wolff's a priori proof for God's existence (the primary topic of discussion of Volume 2) is as follows:

God contains all compossible realities in the absolutely highest degree. But He is possible. Wherefore, since the possible can exist, existence can belong to it. Consequently, since existence is a reality, and since realities are compossible which can belong to a being, existence is in the class of compossible realities. Moreover, necessary existence is the absolutely highest degree. Therefore, necessary existence belongs to God or, what is the same, God necessarily exists (§21, Natural Theology vol. 2).[101]

From the notion of an ens perfectissimum (or most perfect being), Wolff purports to prove God is an ens realissimum (or real existing being). Like Leibniz before him commenting on the Cartesian ontological proof, Wolff believes God must first be shown to be possible in order to be shown to exist.[102] According to Wolff, arriving at the knowledge of God as an ens perfectissimum involves first contemplating the attributes that are present in the human soul, to a limited degree, and then extrapolating those attributes as unlimited qualities to God. Things are compossible insofar as they can coexist in the same subject. Since existence is a mode or reality for Wolff, existence is considered to fall within the class of compossible realities. And just as it is better to exist than not to exist, it is better to exist necessarily than just to exist contingently, therefore Wolff concludes that God's existence is necessary.

9. Practical Philosophy

The subject matter of Wolff's practical philosophy is restricted to those things that have to do with human action. In Wolff's Latin texts, practical philosophy is divided into four main disciplines: universal practical philosophy, natural law, politics, and moral philosophy. And just as ontology purportedly provides the foundational underpinnings for the disciplines of ‘special metaphysics’ in the theoretical realm, universal practical philosophy plays an analogous role for the disciplines of natural law, politics, and moral philosophy in the practical realm.

A central and perhaps unifying concept in Wolff's practical writings is the concept of ‘perfection.’ In an early letter to Leibniz, dated 4 May 1715, Wolff explains the importance that the concept serves in his ethics:

I need the notion of perfection for dealing with morals. For, when I see that some actions tend toward our perfection and that of others, while others tend toward our imperfection and that of others, the sensation of perfection excites a certain pleasure [voluptas] and the sensation of imperfection a certain displeasure [nausea]. And the emotions [affectus], by virtue of which the mind is, in the end, inclined or disinclined, are modifications of this pleasure and displeasure; I explain the origin of natural obligation in this way… From this also comes the general rule or law of nature that our actions ought to be directed toward the highest perfection of ourselves and others (Leibniz 1989, 231-232).

According to Wolff, the ultimate goal of human action is to attain, or at least approximate, the highest degree of perfection that is possible. Humans, as individuals or groups, should strive for perfection insofar as moral worth and goodness reside in the objective essence of humankind. In a strict sense, each person is obligated by the law of nature to instantiate perfection in his/her own life. Actions that tend toward perfection produce pleasure and actions that tend toward imperfection produce displeasure (or pain). In many respects, this consequentialist feature of Wolff's ethical theory resembles various forms of utilitarianism that were emerging in England during the mid-to-late eighteenth century.

Also central to Wolff's practical philosophy is its autonomy from theological doctrine. Although maintaining that a universal ethics is certainly compatible with the teachings of Sacred Scripture, Wolff is adamant that morality does not depend on revelation or God's divine commands. Advocating the separation of philosophy and religion is a theme that Wolff developed and defended throughout his entire career and it is a feature of his thought that secures him a place among other philosophers of Europe's Enlightenment.


Wolff's Principal Works[103]

German Texts

Latin Texts

Collections and English Translations

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

German Philosophy: in the 18th century, prior to Kant | intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties | Kant, Immanuel: and Leibniz | Kant, Immanuel: critique of metaphysics | Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of science | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: ethics | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: on causation | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: on the problem of evil | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: philosophy of mind | mathematics: inconsistent | Mendelssohn, Moses | rationalism vs. empiricism