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Giacomo Zabarella

First published Tue May 17, 2005

Giacomo (Jacopo) Zabarella (b. 1533 in Padua, d. 1589 in Padua) is considered the prime representative of Renaissance Italian Aristotelianism. Known most of all for his writings on logic and methodology, Zabarella was an alumnus of the University of Padua, where he received his Ph.D. in philosophy. Throughout his teaching career at his native university, he also taught philosophy of nature and science of the soul (De anima). Among his main works are the collected logical works Opera logica (1578) and writings on natural philosophy, De rebus naturalibus (1590). Zabarella was an orthodox Aristotelian seeking to defend the scientific status of theoretical natural philosophy against the pressures emanating from the practical disciplines, i.e., the art of medicine and anatomy. He developed the regressus method, which the Renaissance Aristotelians regarded as the proper method for obtaining knowledge in the theoretical sciences. At the turn of the seventeenth century Zabarella's writings were reprinted in Germany, where his philosophy had a notable following, especially among Protestant Aristotelian authors.

1. Life and Works

Giacomo (or Jacopo) Zabarella was born into an old and noble Paduan family on the 5th of September in 1533. From his father Giulio Zabarella he inherited the title of palatine count. Zabarella enjoyed a humanist education and entered the University of Padua, where he received the doctorate in 1553. Zabarella had many famous teachers, like Francesco Robortello in the humanities, Bernardino Tomitano in logic, Marcantonio Genua in physics and metaphysics, and Pietro Catena in mathematics. Unlike most of his contemporaries who had studied natural philosophy, Zabarella never took a degree in medicine. His entire teaching career was spent at his native university. He began his career in 1564 when he obtained the first chair (or professorship) of logic succeeding Bernardino Tomitano. Five years later he moved to the more prestigious and more lucrative second chair of the extraordinary professor of natural philosophy. In 1577 he was promoted to the first extraordinary chair of natural philosophy. Finally, in 1585, Zabarella obtained the second ordinary chair of natural philosophy, which he held until his death. The statutes of the University of Padua prevented him, as a native Paduan, from obtaining the first ordinary chair in natural philosophy. Zabarella died at the age of 56 on the 15th of October in 1589.

The publications of Zabarella reflect his teaching in the Aristotelian tradition. The first of his publications was Opera logica, which appeared in Venice in 1578. Zabarella had time to write this collection of logical works in 1576, when a plague raged in Veneto sending Zabarella into the countryside with his family. This was one of the very few times in his life when he left the city of Padua. Zabarella's next published work, Tabula logicae, came out two years later and his commentary on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics appeared in 1582. De doctrinae ordine apologia, which appeared in 1584, was a reply to Francesco Piccolomini who had criticised Zabarella's ideas on logic. The first of Zabarella's works in natural philosophy, De naturalis scientiae constitutione, came out in 1586. This introduction to the field was connected to his major opus in natural philosophy, De rebus naturalibus, the first edition of which was published posthumously in 1590. It contained 30 different treatises on Aristotelian natural philosophy and Zabarella wrote the introduction of the book only few weeks before his death. Zabarella's two sons edited his two incomplete commentaries on Aristotle's texts, which were also published posthumously: the commentary on Physics (1601) and the commentary on On the Soul (1605). (Mikkeli 1992, p. 19)

Giacomo Zabarella followed a very systematic style of writing in his publications. His idea was to build a coherent body of Aristotelian logic and natural philosophy. Therefore he was also interested in the classification of the disciplines and the relationships between various areas of academic learning. His use of Aristotle and other authorities was both eclectic and critical. Zabarella's sources thus included newly recovered Greek commentators such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, Philoponus, Simplicius and Themistius, as well as medieval commentators such as Thomas Aquinas, Walter Burley and Averroes. He read Greek and could therefore consult the Greek text of Aristotle and the commentators. He devoted much effort to presenting what he considered to be the true meaning of Aristotle's texts. However, he resisted the tendency of the humanists to expunge all medieval barbarisms, preferring philosophical precision to classical elegance. (W.R. Laird 2000, p. 695)

2. Arts and Sciences

The Aristotelian distinction between arts (artes) and sciences (scientiae) serves as the starting-point for Zabarella's philosophical system. At the beginning of his Opera logica, Zabarella draws a distinction between the eternal world of nature and the contingent human world. From this distinction he proceeds to two corresponding kinds of knowledge, and two distinct methods of defining them. Zabarella maintained that, properly speaking, sciences are concerned with the eternal world of nature and thus are contemplative disciplines, whereas arts are concerned with the contingent world of human beings and thus are non-contemplative, being productive instead. The sciences in the proper sense of that term, as pertaining to demonstrative knowledge, are limited to those disciplines that deal with the necessary and eternal or with what can be deduced from necessary principles. Zabarella notes that Aristotle requires two kinds of certainty from science. One is in the knowable things, which are necessary as such (simpliciter); the other is in the mind of the scientist, who must be absolutely sure that things cannot be otherwise. The necessity involved is therefore both ontological, with respects to the objects known, and cognitive, with respect to the knowing subject. (Kessler 1998, p. 837)

The hierarchy of different disciplines was a widely debated topic in Renaissance philosophy.

Also Zabarella emphasized the hierarchical nature of the division between different disciplines; the whole of active philosophy aiming ultimately at the higher sphere of contemplation. Acoording to Zabarella, both in Plato and Aristotle happiness in the active life is not the ultimate goal for a human being. Instead it is contemplation, which is man's finest objective that may lead to total perfection. In Zabarella's view the purpose of active philosophy is to remove hindrance to the acquisition of knowledge and therefore contemplative philosophy is the ultimate end and master of all active philosophy. In productive disciplines (i.e., arts) it is not necessary to define the objects under production as strictly as in the contemplative sciences, because the productive arts do not aim at knowledge, and thus the knowledge they need do not have to be perfect.

Zabarella identifies therefore the basic difference between arts and sciences. Science deals with what already exists, but art is concerned with creation. The subject-matter of a science is immutable, but the subject-matter of an art is the formation of things as yet non-existent, but which can be made by human being. The contemplative philosopher is not interested in initiating anything, but rather wants to comprehend and arrange the forms of existing, eternal things. Moreover, the ultimate purpose of the contemplative science is the pursuit of knowledge for its own sake, but in the productive arts the end-result is an actual product. (Mikkeli 1997, pp. 212-213)

However, Zabarella was not concerned solely with the separation between the theoretical sciences and the practical and productive disciplines, but dealt also with the relationships and hierarchy among the theoretical sciences themselves. The contemplative or speculative sciences, for Zabarella, are in Aristotelian manner only three in number: divine science, also called metaphysics, mathematics, and natural philosophy. Zabarella presents these contemplative sciences as being the only defenders of true knowledge. Zabarella emphasised in many instances that each speculative science should demonstrate their own principles and not borrow them from metaphysics. According to Zabarella, each discipline can be distinguished from others either with respect to the object considered (res considerata) or with respect to the way of considering (modus considerandi). Natural philosophy, which deals with corporeal beings that have an inner principle of movement, differs from metaphysics (which contemplates being as being) and from mathematics (which deals with abstracted beings) in both ways. As a result, natural philosophy is autonomous and independent of both the other contemplative sciences.

Zabarella also developed a theory of the middle (or mixed) sciences that, contrary to the prevailing view, afforded sciences such as astronomy and optics full demonstrative status despite their borrowing principles from pure mathematics. Nevertheless, Zabarella's approach to the study of nature remained causal and qualitative in the traditional Aristotelian vein rather than mathematical. Therefore he gave little attention to the possible uses of mathematics as a tool for understanding the physical world. (Laird 1983, Ch. 8)

3. The Nature of Logic

Zabarella's introductory treatise on the nature of logic, De natura logicae, is basic to his teaching in logic. He defines logic as being neither a science nor an art, but, in keeping with the traditional meaning of the word organon, just an instrument (instrumentum) of the arts and sciences. As an instrumental discipline it furnishes a useful tool of inquiry for all the arts and sciences. Logic does not have a real subject of its own, but deals with concepts, which stand for real beings. In this it is comparable to grammar. The difference between grammar and logic is that the former is concerned with the perfect verbal expression of concepts, and hence is a linguistic discipline, while the latter invents second notions (notiones secundae) or second intentions, that are able to create order among concepts. Therefore logic serves to recognize the truth and distinguish it from falsehood in every instance. Logic is thus a rational discipline (disciplina rationalis) that is not itself philosophy, but springs from philosophy and is devoted to philosophical ends.

Zabarella followed Averroes in dividing logic into two parts: universal logic, which is common to all subjects; and particular logic, which is specific to particular subjects. The first three books of Aristotle's Organon, the Categories, On Interpretation and the Prior Analytics constitute the universal part of logic. Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, Topics and Sophistical Refutations are said to deal with particular logic as much as they deal respectively with the demonstrative syllogism, the dialectical syllogism and the sophistical syllogism. Following the Neoplatonic commentators (above all Simplicius), Zabarella also included Aristotle's Rhetoric and Poetics within logic. The former is included because it teaches the use of the rhetorical syllogism or enthymeme, and rhetorical induction or example; the latter because it also teaches the use of example, not to persuasive ends, but for imitation.

Since logic, viewed as the universal instrument for distinguishing between the true and the false, differs according to the objects to which it is applied and the ends for which it is used, its nature depends on the realm of possible objects and ends. Rhetoric and poetics are special cases because they deal not with knowledge but with the political disciplines in so far as they are concerned with the good of the people. Sophistical syllogistic is another special case, because it is directed towards deception and prefers to use falsehood as its material. Dialectic and demonstration, however, are directed towards the expression of truth. Dialectic is aimed at the production of opinion, and delas with probable and contingent material; demonstration is dedicated to the acquisition of truth, and so it is exclusively occupied with necessary, true objects. (Kessler 1998, p. 837)

4. Orders of Presentation and Methods of Discovery

For Zabarella method also serves to differentiate the sciences from the arts. The term can be understood in two ways, either in a wide sense as a method of presenting existing knowledge, which he prefers to call an order (ordo) of presentation, or in a narrow sense as a method of discovering knowledge, for which he reserves method (methodus) in its proper understanding. According to Zabarella, ordo is an instrumental habitus through which we are prepared so to dispose the parts of each discipline so that the discipline may be taught as well and easily as possible.

As regards these methods of presentation, Zabarella denies Galen's view that these are four in number. Zabarella himself recognizes only two orders, the compositive and the resolutive. The order starts with what is either necessary or useful for teaching and learning. In the contemplative (or theoretical) sciences, which aim at perfect knowledge, order of presentation follows the so-called way of composition (compositio) from general principles to particular beings; in moral philosophy and in the arts, which aim at action or production, order follows the so-called way of resolution (resolutio) from the desired end to its first principles.

For Zabarella the methods in the strict sense of the word are intellectual instruments proceeding from the known to produce knowledge of the unknown. Such methods have argumentative force and they deal with specific problems of the disciplines instead of arranging the contents of a whole discipline, as do the orders of presentation. As with orders, Zabarella denied the possibility of more than two methods. He shows that other procedures, like the composition and division used in the hunt of definitions as well as the so-called dialectical syllogisms are not genuinely productive of knowledge and therefore not methods in the proper sense of the term.

Therefore he recognized only two methods, which he labeled demonstrative and resolutive. Demonstrative method (or composition) proceeds from cause to effect and involves demonstration “of the reasoned fact” or “most powerful” demonstration, best exemplified in the mathematical sciences. Resolutive method (or resolution) proceeds from effect to cause and, despite its name, also involves demonstration, but of an inferior kind, that is called demonstration “of the fact” or “from a sign”. Related to this alter type of demonstration is the process of induction (inductio), which is helpful for discovering principles that are known naturally but are not immediately evident. Zabarella believes that, by the force of induction, human intellect is capable of distinguishing the universal, which is hidden in particulars. Induction, or resolutive method makes up the first phase in the regressus-method, which was, in his opinion, the only proper method for natural philosophy.

It is this very distinction between the method of inquiry and the order of teaching that led Zabarella to a bitter controversy with his Paduan college Francesco Piccolomini (1523-1607). They both agreed that ethical inquiry must proceed by deduction from an understanding of the end. In Zabarella's view all the disciplines whose end is action should be explained in this same way. But Piccolomini could bring himself to admit that the order of teaching, in ethics as well as in in other practical disciplines, should follow this order of apprehension. Thus the fundamental question embedded in this dispute is the following: Is the order of teaching a particular discipline necessary or contingent? Zabarella argued for the former: both in discovery and in teaching, one should follow the synthetic order in the sciences and the analytic order in the arts. By making a sharp distinction between the method of discovery and the order of teaching, Piccolomini instead embraced a contingent view of pedagogical method. Wishing to teach others, Piccolomini saw his duty as that of starting out from first principles (a primis principiis). In such a case it is better to begin with the simpler matters and progress toward the end or goal. (Lines 2002, pp. 254-263)

Through their rival claims about ordo doctrinae Zabarella and Piccolomini revealed as well very different perceptions of academic and civil order, and very different ways of conceiving and pursuing the office of philosopher within that order. Zabarella wholeheartedly endorsed the purely contemplative nature of philosophy and the superiority of the contemplative life. (Mikkeli 1992, pp.25-35) He also was frequently dismissive in his treatment of the disciplines he regarded as active or operative, for example law, medicine, ethics, politics and mechanics. Piccolomini's position was sharply opposed. For him, philosophy is, indeed, crucial for the spiritual perfection of man. However, in the form of scientia civilis it is also the key to the this-wordly perfection that can be attained in the just administration of the Venetian republic. (Jardine 1997)

5. The Regressus-Method

The so-called regressus-method is a model for combining composition and resolution: the idea of this combinatory process is found in the Aristotelian tradition from Averroes on, and it was vitally revived among the Italian Aristotelians and medical authors. According to this method, the natural philosopher should first infer from the known effect the existence of the cause of this very effect. Sometimes he may use induction, but usually resolution, which was also called demonstratio quia or demonstration from the fact. Then in the second step, in the so-called demonstratio propter quid or demonstration from the reasoned fact (or composition), the natural philosopher should infer from the cause to the effect. The effect is now known through its cause, and hence in a scientific manner. (Risse 1983) The crucial problem with this procedure is how to avoid mere circular reasoning, or rather, how to make sure that the cause, whose existence is demonstrated in the first step, is indeed the cause of this very effect. From the beginning of the sixteenth century, it had become clear that it was necessary to introduce a third, intermediary step, which involved some kind of intellectual consideration (negotiatio intellectus). (Kessler 1998, p. 838)

Zabarella also had to face the question, how the intellect in fact made this mental consideration. He solves the problem in terms of his psychology of knowledge and calls this third step a mental examination (examen mentale). Since for him the task of this intermediary step is to make distinct the confused knowledge of the cause that was acquired through the first step, he refers to his work on the agent mind (Liber de mente agente) in which he develops an account of the transformation of confused into distinct knowledge through the analysis of a given whole in terms of its parts. He presents this process as the specific ability of the human mind. Thus once more method as a means of acquiring knowledge is based on the cognitive structure of knowing subject rather than on the ontological structure of the object of knowledge. In his commentary on the Posterior Analytics Zabarella identified Aristotle's proofs that the planets are near and that the moon is a sphere as instances of the regressus-method. Other examples of the same method he analyzed are Aristotle's proof of the existence of “first matter” (materia prima) from substantial change and his proof of an “eternal first mover” (primus motor aeternus) from local motion. (Wallace 1999, p.338)

The interminable discussion of the methodology of arts and sciences in the sixteenth century may be seen as an attempt to defend the scientific status of either the recently found autonomous sciences, like natural philosophy, or, on the other hand, the empirically based productive arts. The discussions of orders and methods, resolutions, compositions and the regressus-method are, therefore, not merely further elaborations of an old Aristotelian tradition, but also expressions of opinions in a lively debate concerning the changing relationships between various arts and sciences in sixteenth-century Italian universities. (Mikkeli 1997, p. 228)

6. The science of the soul

The most influential section in the Aristotelian tradition, where the relationship between the theoretical or speculative sciences is dealt with, is the beginning of Aristotle's treatise On the Soul. Aristotle gives two criteria for the hierarchy: the dignity of their subject-matter and the exactness of their demonstrations. In his posthumous commentary on De anima Zabarella raises the question of the hierarchy of the sciences. In most cases, in Zabarella's view, the science with a nobler subject-matter can be considered superior, but not always. All human knowledge can be compared and there are no grounds for giving either of these criteria absolute priority. In the contemplative sciences the nobility of the subject-matter should be considered superior to the causality of knowledge. In logic, however, where the instruments of science are considered, the nobler instrument is the one that is more precise and produces more certain knowledge.

Zabarella, then, did not give one decisive criterion according to which all arts and sciences could be arranged into one single hierarchy. However, when dealing with the place of the science of the soul among the other sciences, Zabarella gives an description of the nobility of this part of natural philosophy. Zabarella opposed the definition of the science of the soul as a middle discipline between physics and metaphysics. He states that Aristotle did not only wish to compare the science of the soul with other sciences, but to compare it with other parts of natural science. In Zabarella's view it is obvious that the science of the soul is the most noble part of natural philosophy, the king and emperor of every other part, which are all dependent upon it, because it shows the first cause and the sum of everything that is in animals and in plants. The science of the soul is more exquisite and certain than all the parts of natural philosophy, because the causes of the science of the soul are more exact, not only to us, but also according to nature. (Mikkeli 1997, p. 220)

Zabarella's position here can be interpreted as an attempt to raise the status of an independent natural philosophy by emphasizing the nobility of the science of the soul. In fact, it seems that he wanted to elevate the status of De anima to that of a special science among other natural disciplines that is the noblest and most precise of all natural sciences on which all the other parts of natural philosophy could rely. What in the medieval times had perhaps been considered to be part of metaphysics was now the most valuable part of natural philosophy. Zabarella himself left the question of the immortality of the soul to the theologians, since Aristotle, as a natural philosopher, had not been explicit about it.

Zabarella reconstructed the process of intellection on the lines of sense-perception, that is that the intelligible species, produced concurrently by the phantasma and the illuminating agent intellect, moved the possible intellect into cognition. To be known, the phantasma, which was gained by sense-perception, had to undergo a double process. Itself material and consequently containing the universal structure needed in science only in a confused and unintelligible way, it had to be illuminated by the agent intellect, so that the universal in the individual was rendered distinct and intelligible. Since the illumination was generally required for any act of knowledge in the same way, its agent did not have to be an individual operating individually in the different acts of intellection, but rather could be an universal one, which rendered reality in general intelligible, thus serving as an all-embracing guarantee of intelligibility. The agent intellect could therefore be identified with God himself as the principle of intelligibility.

Therefore with the metaphysical requirements of intellection taken for granted, the main epistemological problem shifted to the manner in which the intelligible species was turned into a known object. Zabarella, considering the agent intellect as the divine cause of general intelligibility, could renounce innate principles and retain the Aristotelian teaching of the inductive acquisition of the first principles themselves. But Zabarella had instead the problem of restoring to the human mind an active faculty which would account for the act of judgement. Therefore he redefined the possible intellect as an active faculty as well. This equally active and passive human intellect (which Zabarella called patibilis instead of possibilis) considered all that was offered to it by the illuminated phantasma, contemplated whatever it wanted to, and in doing so selected and abstracted those structures it wished to know and through judging understood them and became itself the object of knowledge. For Zabarella intellection therefore was not a process automatically determined whenever an exterior impulse was given, but rather depended essentially on human will and intention. In Zabarella's view, the science of the soul was concerned with what was necessary and therefore always equally present in any human mind, even if unconsciously. Methodology, on the other hand, was concerned with the use a human being made of these natural faculties. Since this use could be true or false, better or worse, truth and error depended entirely on whether or not the correct method was being used. (Kessler 1988, p.530-534)

7. The Perfection of the Philosophy of Nature

Natural philosophy has to know and teach the very essence of natural beings. First, it has to deal with their basic principles, such as matter and motion, which are not natural beings themselves. These principles of natural philosophy are discussed in Aristotle's Physics. Moreover, natural philosophy has to deal with the accidents of natural beings understood through their causes. These are the subject of Aristotle's other writings on nature, from On the Heavens to On the Soul.

In De naturalis scientiae constitutione, the first treatise in his collected works on natural philosophy (De rebus naturalibus), Zabarella deals in detail with the questions of the order and perfection of the natural sciences. He claims, for example, that the book on minerals is necessary because the natural philosophy would otherwise be incomplete. The place of the book on minerals in Aristotelian corpus on natural philosophy is immediately after the book On Meteorology. Whether Aristotle himself wrote on minerals is questionable, but he at least recognized the importance of the subject. However, later both Theophrastus and Albertus Magnus wrote on this important subject. Thus Zabarella did not consider Aristotle's works as a complete corpus to which nothing could be added. In De methodis Zabarella states that Aristotle wrote on subjects of his own choice, but it would be an exaggeration to claim that he was incapable of making mistakes. Aristotle was not infallible and it would be erroneous to insist that he knew the truth of everything he wrote. Nevertheless, he was an outstanding scholar in Zabarella's view, who, for example, turned the study of logic into a discipline.

In the last chapter of De naturalis scientiae constitutione Zabarella discusses the question of the perfection of the natural sciences (De perfectione scientiae naturalis ac de eius ordine). Zabarella states that Aristotle's philosophy of nature may be perfect in structure and form, but it is incomplete in terms of its reference to natural beings. There is much Aristotle did not discuss at all and indeed much that was outside his cognisance. Although he dealt comparatively little with plants and animals, it is not difficult to pinpoint their proper palces in the Aristotelian system of the natural sciences. Therefore Zabarella emphasizes that Aristotle's philosophy of nature is complete at least in theory. Zabarella compares Aristotle's works on natural philosophy to the geometry and arithmetic of Euclid. There are many theorems which can be demonstrated from his works even if he did not himself actually write them. For Zabarella this is no reason to judge Euclid's geometry or arithmetic defective or incomplete. If Euclid had wished, he could have demonstrated all the particular cases, but his book would have become so enormous that it surely would have daunted the reader. Zabarella suggests that this is exactly why Euclid entitled his book The Elements, and from this foundation all the other theorems can be demonstrated.

In parallel view Zabarella thinks that Aristotle's natural philosophy can be called perfect, since it deals with all the knowledge that is possible for human intellect to obtain, either in practice or at least in theory. Also in his logical works Zabarella emphasizes the idea of a perfect natural philosophy, which consists of a perfect and distinct knowledge of natural beings through their causes. Zabarella reminds that scientific knowledge can never be called confused or imperfect. Therefore the scientific ideal Zabarella presents is profoundly different from the modern view of a scientist making new discoveries. According to Zabarella, science can be “new” only in a restricted sense; the work of a scientist is more like correcting the mistakes and filling the gaps in a ready-made Aristotelian world-system. (Mikkeli 1992; Mikkeli 1997, pp.214-215)

8. Natural philosophy and medicine

Among the Paduan Aristotelians Zabarella was probably the author who discussed most thoroughly the relationship between the philosophy of nature and medical art. While in subject-matter these disciplines were close to each other, in their essence and methodology they were far apart. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Zabarella did not consider medicine to subalternated to the philosophy of nature. Nor did he see the distinction between theoretical and practical medicine as accidental; instead he wanted to consider the whole art of medicine as operational. In spite of medicine's prominent place among the arts; Zabarella sharply denied its scientific status, and insisted that writers who claim that medicine is a science are mistaken. Neither the art of medicine nor its singular parts can be considered as science. For him it was enough to admit that it is the noblest of all arts.

In his De natura logicae (part of the Opera logica) Zabarella attacks writers who put medicine alongside the philosophy of nature among the sciences. Contemplative philosophy appropriates nothing from the productive arts, but instead the arts adopt everything from philosophy. No matter how valuable and precise medicine may be, it could never be a science because it is practised not for the sake of knowledge, but for an end product: that is, the maintenance or restoration of health. If knowledge of the human body is considered purely for its own sake, rather than for curative purposes, it should be called natural philosophy rather than medicine. Even if it were admitted that medicine could be practised for the sake of knowledge, it could not be called a pure science, because it does not explain the first causes, and without this comprehension the other causes cannot be clearly apprehended. Health cannot be fully comprehended and the goal of medicine cannot be achieved, if a physician does not comprehend all the parst of a human body and their nature, composition, purpose, and function.

Zabarella recognizes two different ways in which a physician can know the parts of a human body. First, he may learn them through perceptive knowledge and anatomical observations, thereby assimilating the matter of his discipline without understanding its rationale. A physician can also become familiar with the parst of human body through philosophy of nature where he may learn the reasons, which lie behind what he actually sees. Zabarella thinks Aristotle made the same distinction in his books the History of Animals and the Parts of Animals. In the first he relies on sense perception to classify the different parts of animals. In the second, he offers causal explanations for what he is considering. In Zabarella's opinion this order of understanding results from our own inability to comprehend everything at once. It is thus better to progress gradually from confuse to distinct knowledge. In De rebus naturalibus Zabarella points out that the art of medicine adopts the physiological part from the philosophy of nature. If medical writers want to know the anatomy of the human body, they must therefore follow Aristotle methodologically. Therefore they should not study the History of Animals, but instead the Parts of Animals, which shows us the functions of different parts of the bodies in question. The subject-matter of medicine involves maintaining or recovering health only in human beings, not in other animals. Since the whole discipline deals only with the human body, it cannot be a science in Zabarella's view. What a natural philosopher writes about animals, a medical writer should apply to human beings.

Zabarella moves from the universal and scientific discussion of natural philosophy to a consideration of its particular aspects from the standpoint of operation, not knowledge. Moreover, Zabarella believed that natural philosophy and medicine differ not only in their aims and subject-matters, but also in their methods. The resolutive method is proper to medicine and the compositive method to the philosophy of nature. A physician does not use demonstrations, and if he does, he borrows them from natural philosophy. In medical art the resolutive order of presentation proceeds from knowledge to cure. The end, that is maintaining or recovering health, is broken down into principles, on which the operation is then based. In the order of presentation Zabarella wants to differentiate between the presentation of a whole discipline and that of a part of it. For example, the first part of the art of medicine, physiology, has a compositive order as against the medicine as a whole, which is arranged according to a resolutive order. In Zabarella's view this shows that physiology does not really belong to medicine at all, but to natural philosophy, because in physiology the nature of a human body is studied apart from operation.

Zabarella's conclusion about the relationship between the art of medicine and natural philosophy is that the latter must consider the universal qualities of health and sickness, while the former concentrates on finding remedies for particular diseases. Zabarella suggests that Aristotle wrote a book of health and sickness of which nothing but a small fragment remains. These fragments are on the borderline of these two disciplines. Zabarella sums this up: where the philosopher ends, there the physician begins (ubi desinit philosophus, ibi incipit medicus). From the universal consideration of sickness and health the physician descends to the treatment of all particular diseases and to knowledge of their causes. While discussing the principles of medical art Zabarella compares anatomical principles with principles derived from natural philosophy. In his view, only the philosophy of nature, not anatomy, can provide a solid basis for medical practioners. (Mikkeli 1997, pp. 221-225)

9. Aftermath

From the things considered above, it becomes clear that Zabarella cannot be considered as a precursor of modern experimental science. In spite of its empirical basis, Zabarella's natural philosophy is not concerned with anything akin to experiment. Indeed, if experiments were to be developed, they would find their place in the productive arts rather than in natural philosophy. Zabarella did not use experiments in order to verify or falsify theories in the modern sense. (Schmitt 1969) However, he made observations of natural things, but they were just made to exemplify and illustrate the demonstrative reasoning used in the theoretical natural philosophy. (Rossi 1983, p.146)

During the past decades Zabarella's name has been linked to modern science. John Herman Randall published already in 1940 (and again in 1961) his famous idea on “the School of Padua” that would have been the precursor of modern science. Following Ernst Cassirer, Randall referred to the Renaissance discussions of regressus-method up to Zabarella as a preparation for Galileo Galilei's new method of natural science. However, the Aristotelian terminology and doctrines that Zabarella and Galileo share, seem for the most part to have been commonplaces of late medieval and Renaissance thought. Galileo may have known Zabarella's writings, but far more important source for Galileo was the Jesuit scholars, above all Paolo della Valle, working at the Collegio Romano at Rome. (Wallace 1999, p. 338)

Instead of overemphasizing the connection between Zabarella and Galileo, it should be noted that Zabarella's thought had a large impact among Protestant Aristotelians in Germany and in the Low Countries during the late sixteenth century and first part of the seventeenth century. Zabarella's clear and systematic interpretation of Aristotle's logic and natural philosophy was used as a basis for numerous Aristotelian textbooks printed in Germany. Also in the British Isles the Scholastic revival of the early seventeenth century owed much to Zabarella's writings. Even some modern scholars of Aristotle have still consulted his commentaries with profit.


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analytic/synthetic distinction | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotelianism: in the Renaissance | Aristotle | Galileo Galilei | Latin Averroism | natural philosophy: in the Renaissance | Neoplatonism: in the Renaissance