Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Sep 8, 2003; substantive revision Mon Oct 9, 2006

Zombies are exactly like us in all physical respects but have no conscious experiences: by definition there is ‘nothing it is like’ to be a zombie. Yet zombies behave like us, and some even spend a lot of time discussing consciousness. This disconcerting fantasy helps to make the problem of phenomenal consciousness vivid, especially as a problem for physicalism.

Few people think zombies actually exist. But many hold they are at least conceivable, and some that they are ‘logically’ or ‘metaphysically’ possible. It is argued that if zombies are so much as a bare possibility, then physicalism is false and some kind of dualism must be accepted. For many philosophers that is the chief importance of the zombie idea. But the idea is also of interest for its presuppositions about the nature of consciousness and how the physical and the phenomenal are related. Use of the zombie idea against physicalism also raises more general questions about relations between imaginability, conceivability, and possibility. Finally, zombies raise epistemological difficulties: they reinstate the ‘other minds’ problem.

1. The idea of zombies

Descartes held that non-human animals are automata: their behavior is explicable wholly in terms of physical mechanisms. He explored the idea of a machine which looked and behaved like a human being. Knowing only seventeenth century technology, he thought two things would unmask such a machine: it could not use language creatively rather than producing stereotyped responses, and it could not produce appropriate non-verbal behavior in arbitrarily various situations (Discourse V). For him, therefore, no machine could behave like a human being. He concluded that explaining distinctively human behavior required something beyond the physical: an immaterial mind, interacting with processes in the brain and the rest of the body. (He had a priori arguments for the same conclusion, one of which foreshadows the ‘conceivability argument’ discussed below.) If he is right, there could not be a world physically like the actual world but lacking such minds: human bodies would not work properly. If we suddenly lost our minds our bodies might continue to run on for a while: our hearts might continue to beat, we might breathe while asleep and digest food; we might even walk or sing in a mindless sort of way (so he implies in his Reply to Objections IV). But without the contribution made by minds, behavior could not show characteristically human features. So although Descartes did everything short of spelling out the idea of zombies, the question of their possibility did not arise for him. The nearest thing was automata whose behavior was easily recognizable as not fully human.

In the nineteenth century scientists began to think that physics was capable of explaining all physical events that were explicable at all. It seemed that every physical effect has a physical cause: that the physical world is ‘closed under causation’. The developing science of neurophysiology was set to extend such explanations to human behavior. But if human behavior is explicable physically, how does consciousness fit into the story? One response — physicalism — is to insist that it is just a matter of physical processes. However, the phenomena of consciousness are hard to account for in those terms, and some thinkers concluded that something nonphysical must be involved. Given the causal closure of the physical, they also concluded that consciousness has no effects on the physical world. On this view human beings are ‘conscious automata’, as T. H. Huxley put it: all physical events, human behavior included, are explicable in terms of physical processes; and the phenomena of consciousness are causally inert by-products (see James 1890, Chapter 5). It eventually became clear that this view entailed there could be purely physical organisms exactly like us except for lacking consciousness. G. F. Stout (1931) argued that if epiphenomenalism (the more familiar name for the ‘conscious automaton’ theory) is right,

it ought to be quite credible that the constitution and course of nature would be otherwise just the same as it is if there were not and never had been any experiencing individuals. Human bodies would still have gone through the motions of making and using bridges, telephones and telegraphs, of writing and reading books, of speaking in Parliament, of arguing about materialism, and so on. There can be no doubt that this is prima facie incredible to Common Sense (138f.).

What Stout describes in this passage and finds ‘prima facie incredible’ is a ‘zombie world’: an entire world whose physical processes are closed under causation (as the epiphenomenalists he was attacking held) and exactly duplicate those in the actual world, but where there are no conscious experiences.

Similar ideas were current in discussions of physicalism in the 1970s. As a counterexample to the psychophysical identity theory there was an ‘imitation man’, whose ‘brain-states exactly paralleled ours in their physico-chemical properties’ but who felt no pains and saw no colors (Campbell 1970). It was claimed that zombies are a counterexample to physicalism in general, and arguments were devised to back up the intuition that they are possible (Kirk 1974a, 1974b). Other kinds of systems were envisaged which behaved like normal human beings, or were even functionally like human beings, but lacked the ‘qualia’ we have (Block 1980a, 1980b, 1981; Shoemaker 1975, 1981). (Qualia are those properties of experiences or of whole persons by which we are able to classify experiences according to ‘what they are like’ — what it is like to smell roasting coffee beans, for example. Even physicalists can consistently use this expression, although unlike dualists they take qualia to be physical. The phrase ‘absent qualia’ has come to be used primarily in connection with supposed counterexamples to functionalism rather than to physicalism in general.) The most systematic use of the zombie idea against physicalism is by David Chalmers (1996), some of whose contributions to the debate will be discussed below.

If zombies are to be counterexamples to physicalism, it is not enough for them to be behaviorally and functionally like normal human beings: plenty of physicalists accept that merely behavioral or functional duplicates of ourselves might lack qualia. Zombies must be like normal human beings in all physical respects, with the physical properties that physicalists suppose we have. This requires them to be subject to the causal closure of the physical, which is why their supposed lack of consciousness is such a challenge to physicalism. If, instead, their behavior could not be explained physically, physicalists would point out that in that case we have no reason to bother with the idea: there is plenty of evidence that our movements actually are explicable in physical terms, as the original epiphenomenalists realized (see e.g. Papineau 2002).

The usual assumption is that none of us is actually a zombie, and that zombies cannot exist in our world. The central question, however, is not whether zombies can exist in our world, but whether they, or a whole zombie world (which is sometimes a more appropriate idea to work with), are possible in some broader sense.

2. Zombies and physicalism

A good way to make the apparent threat to physicalism clear is by adapting a thought of Saul Kripke’s (1972, 153f.). Imagine God creating the world and deciding to bring into existence the whole of the physical universe according to a full specification P in purely physical terms. P describes such things as the distribution and states of elementary particles throughout space and time, together with the laws governing their behavior. Now, having created a purely physical universe according to this specification, did God have to do something further in order to provide for human consciousness? Answering Yes to this question implies there is more to consciousness than the purely physical facts can supply. If nothing else, it implies that consciousness requires nonphysical properties in the strong sense that such properties would not exist in a purely physical world: it would be a zombie world. Physicalists, on the other hand, are committed to answering No to the question. They have to say that by fixing the purely physical facts in accordance with P, God thereby fixed all the mental facts about the organisms whose existence is provided for by P, including facts about people’s thoughts, feelings, emotions, and experiences.

It seems clear that physicalists are committed to the view that the physical world specified by P is all there is, in which case all other true statements are alternative ways of talking about that same world. In this sense physicalists must hold that the mental facts ‘supervene’ on the physical facts, and that zombie worlds are not ‘possible’. To show that zombies are possible would therefore, it seems, be to show that the mental facts do not supervene on the physical facts: that a zombie world is possible and physicalism is false. That is why opponents of physicalism do not have to point to actual cases of zombiehood: it is enough if such things are possible.

Unfortunately the vocabulary of possibility and necessity has become rather slippery. Kripke in this context uses ‘logical possibility’ and ‘metaphysical possibility’ interchangeably; some apply ‘logical’ to a kind of possibility that others prefer to call ‘conceptual’ (Chalmers 1999, 477); others use ‘logical’ for ‘metaphysical or conceptual’ (as noted by Yablo 1999, 457n.; Latham 2000, 72f.). In what follows these adjectives will be avoided except in quotations: when the word ‘possible’ is used without qualification it is to be taken to mean just that the worlds, situations or states of affairs in question involve no contradiction, no matter how indirectly. Perhaps this use explains why the metaphor of God's creation seems so apt: God can do anything short of what involves a contradiction. We can also say that if a contradiction would be involved in the idea of a zombie world, then in the relevant sense the facts of consciousness ‘supervene’ on the physical facts. Now let us examine what has become the chief line of argument for the possibility of zombies: the ‘conceivability argument’.

3. The conceivability argument

The simplest version of the conceivability argument goes as follows:

(1) Zombies are conceivable.

(2) Whatever is conceivable is possible.

(3) Therefore zombies are possible.

(Kripke used a similar argument in his 1972. For versions of it see Chalmers 1996, 93-171; 1999; 2002; Levine 2001; Nagel 1974; Stoljar 2001.) Clearly the argument is valid. However, both its premisses are problematic. They are unclear as stated, and controversial even when clarified. A key question is how we should understand ‘conceivable’ in this context.

Many philosophers are willing to concede that zombies are conceivable in some sense (e.g. Hill 1997; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Yablo 1999). However, that sense is sometimes quite broad. For example, a claim that ‘there are no substantive a priori ties between the concept of pain and the concept of C-fiber stimulation’ has been backed up by the point that ‘it is in principle possible to master either of these concepts fully without having mastered the other’ (Hill 1997, 76). By that standard, however, it would be conceivable that the ratio of a circle’s circumference to its diameter should be a rational number, when it isn’t. If conceivability in that sense entailed possibility, it would be both possible and impossible for that ratio to be rational; which would make conceivability in that sense useless for the purposes of the conceivability argument. So understood, premiss (1) of the argument would be easy to swallow; but premiss (2) would have to be rejected. Evidently, the lower the threshold for conceivability, the easier it is to accept (1) — but the harder it is to accept (2). So the kind of conceivability invoked in premisses (1) and (2) needs to be strongly constrained.

We can take it that the relevant notion is ‘ideal conceivability, or conceivability on ideal rational reflection’ (Chalmers 1999, 477; see also his 2002). Roughly, the idea is that the situation in question must be imagined in such a way that arbitrary details can be filled in without any contradiction revealing itself. Equivalently, it must not be possible to tell a priori that the claim is false. (For a different approach see Stoljar 2001.)

Joseph Levine discusses a version of the conceivability argument in his 2001. He views the conceivability of zombies as ‘the principal manifestation of the explanatory gap’ (79). What creates this gap, in his view, is the epistemological problem of explaining how the phenomenal is related to the physical. He sees no way to solve this problem, and thinks it remains even if zombies are impossible.

We now face two key questions: Are zombies conceivable in the sense explained? If zombies are conceivable, does it follow that they are possible? Only if the answer to each question is Yes will the conceivability argument succeed. Let us take them in that order.

4. Are zombies conceivable?

The intuitive appeal of the zombie idea can be overwhelming. Those who exploited it in the 1970s typically assumed without argument that zombies are not just conceivable but possible (e. g. Campbell 1970, Nagel 1970). Chalmers too, reactivating the idea, finds the conceivability of zombies ‘obvious’: he remarks that ‘it certainly seems that a coherent situation is described; I can discern no contradiction in the description’ (1996, 96). However, he recognizes that this intuition cannot be relied on. The nature of consciousness is after all hard to understand: what strikes some people as obviously possible could still turn out to be contradictory or incoherent (Nagel 1998; Stoljar 2001). (It used to seem conceivable that the ratio of a circle’s circumference to its diameter was a rational number; deep mathematical reasoning eventually proved it is not.) Clearly, those who maintain that zombies are conceivable must provide support for that claim, recognizing that, as an epistemic claim dependent on our cognitive abilities, it is defeasible. Some of the supporting reasoning on offer will be briefly noted in this section; typically it involves thought experiments.

4.1 Arguments for

One of these involves Dan (Kirk 1974a), whose behavior starts to show features which (the argument goes) suggest he is progressively being deprived of qualia in one sense modality after another, even though most of the time he continues to produce behavior that would have been appropriate if he had retained full consciousness. After all his sense modalities have been affected, his patterns of behavior revert to normal; but the suggestion is that it is at least intelligible to say he has become a zombie. However, this line of reasoning falls well short of establishing that zombies are really conceivable. It seems to depend on much the same cluster of intuitions as the original idea.

Another thought experiment (Kirk 1974b) involves a team of micro-Lilliputians who invade Gulliver’s head, disconnect his afferent and efferent nerves, monitor the inputs from his afferent nerves, and send outputs down his efferent nerves to produce behavior indistinguishable from what it would have been originally. The resulting system has the same behavioral dispositions as Gulliver but lacks sensations and other experiences — or so the argument runs. It would be reasonable to expect that if this system were restored to Gulliver’s original state the result would be a sentient human being again. But the argument is supposed to undermine the assumption that ‘his being sentient would be entailed by the fact that such modifications had been made’ (147). It is claimed that there is no rational principle on which a line could be drawn between cases where such an entailment held and cases where it did not. (Arguably there is such a rational principle, however: Kirk 1994, 2005.) The conclusion is then that the physical facts about us do not entail the psychological facts, contrary to the ‘Entailment Thesis’. Don Locke objected that materialists can consistently hold that zombies are possible provided they deny ‘the empirical possibility of mere Zombies’ (Locke 1976: for recent versions of a similar objection see 5 below).

Not confining himself to arguing directly for the conceivability of zombies, Chalmers (1996) presents a series of five arguments against the view that there is an a priori entailment from physical facts to mental facts. Each of these arguments would directly or indirectly reinforce the intuitive appeal of the zombie idea. The first will be considered shortly; the other four appeal respectively to the alleged possibility of ‘inverted spectrum’ without physical difference; to the alleged impossibility of acquiring information about conscious experience on the basis of purely physical information; to Jackson’s ‘knowledge argument’; and to what Chalmers calls ‘the absence of analysis’: his point here being that his opponents ‘will have to give us some idea of how the existence of consciousness might be entailed by the physical facts’: in his view ‘any attempt to demonstrate such an entailment is doomed to failure’ (1996, 104).

His first argument goes roughly as follows. Suppose a population of tiny people disable your brain and replicate its functions themselves, while keeping the rest of your body in working order (see Block 1980). Each homunculus performs the functions of an individual neuron: some receive signals from the afferent nerve endings in your head and transmit them to colleagues (using cell phones); others receive signals from colleagues and transmit them to your efferent nerves; most receive and send signals to colleagues exactly as your own neurons do. Now, would such a system be conscious? Intuitively one may be inclined to say obviously not. Some, notably functionalists, bite the bullet and answer Yes. However, the argument does not depend on assuming that the system would not be conscious. It depends only on the assumption that its not being conscious is conceivable, an assumption many people find reasonable. In Chalmers’s words, all that matters here is that when we say the system might lack consciousness, ‘a meaningful possibility is being expressed, and it is an open question whether consciousness arises or not’ (1996, 97). Possibly, then — as we might suppose for argument’s sake — the system is not conscious. But if it isn’t, then it is already very much like a zombie. The only difference is that it has little people where a zombie has neurons. But why should that make a difference to whether the situation is conceivable? Why should switching from homunculi to neurons necessarily switch on the light of consciousness? (For doubts about the assumption that it is conceivable, in the relevant sense, that the homunculi-head lacks consciousness, see e.g. Loar 1997, 613f.)

Other considerations which seem to favor the zombie idea are offered by, for example, Block 1995, 2002; Levine 2001; Searle 1992. (Those physicalists who find pro-zombie reasoning persuasive tend to reject premiss (2) of the conceivability argument: the thesis that conceivability entails possibility, to be examined in 5 below.)

4.2 Arguments against

Now let us consider arguments against the conceivability of zombies, keeping in mind that what matters is ‘ideal conceivability’ (3 above).

Verificationism and the private language argument. Verificationism quickly rules out the possibility of zombies. However, such things as our ability to think and talk about our experiences are often taken to pose problems for verificationism; so to presuppose it when attacking the zombie idea is itself problematic. Much the same goes for Wittgenstein’s ‘private language argument’. Although not crudely verificationistic, it presupposes that in order for words to be meaningful, their use must be open to public checking. The definition of zombies entails that the presence of qualia cannot be checked by others, so Wittgenstein’s considerations, if sound, would prove that we cannot talk about our qualia. Since everyone (apart from eliminativists) assumes we can talk about our qualia, the checkability assumption implies that zombies are impossible. It therefore seems question-begging in this context.

Behaviorism and functionalism. Any arguments for behaviorism or functionalism are a fortiori arguments against the possibility of zombies, since zombies would satisfy all the behavioral and functional conditions for full consciousness. However, merely presupposing either of those positions would be question-begging. For responses, see Dennett 1991, 1995, 1999; Shoemaker 1999.

Can we really imagine zombies? Daniel Dennett thinks those who accept the possibility of zombies have failed to imagine them thoroughly enough: ‘when philosophers claim that zombies are conceivable, they invariably underestimate the task of conception (or imagination), and end up imagining something that violates their own definition’ (1995, 322. For a related point see Marcus 2004). Dennett believes his broadly functionalist model of consciousness in terms of ‘Multiple Drafts’ (see his 1991) explains ‘why our pains should hurt and why sex should strike us as so sexy’ (1995, 324). Given that account, he argues, we can see why the ‘putative contrast between zombies and conscious beings is illusory’ (325. See also his 1991; 1999). Contrary to what is presupposed by the zombie idea, he says, consciousness is ‘not a single wonderful separable thing … but a huge complex of many different informational capacities that individually arise for a wide variety of reasons. … It is not a separate organ or a separate medium or a separate talent’ (1995, 324). He compares health:

Supposing that by an act of stipulative imagination you can remove consciousness while leaving all cognitive systems intact — a quite standard but entirely bogus feat of imagination — is like supposing that by an act of stipulative imagination, you can remove health while leaving all bodily functions and powers intact. … Health isn’t that sort of thing, and neither is consciousness (1995, 325).

Zombies’ utterances. Suppose I smell roasting coffee beans and say, ‘Mm! Roasting coffee: I love that smell!’. Everyone would rightly assume I was talking about my experience. But now suppose my zombie twin produces the same utterance. He too seems to be talking about an experience, but in fact he isn’t because he’s just a zombie. Is he mistaken? Is he lying? Could his utterance somehow be interpreted as true, or is it totally without truth value? Nigel Thomas (1996) argues that ‘any line that zombiphiles take on these questions will get them into serious trouble’.

Knowing and referring to qualia. It is sometimes assumed that the view that zombies are possible entails epiphenomenalism; but that is not so. One may hold that zombies are possible while denying that the actual world is physically closed under causation: one might be an interactionist. In that case one will not define zombies as being like us in all physical respects, but only as like us to the extent that the physical events in our bodies are physically caused; those physical events that one holds are actually caused non-physically must be taken to have physical causes in zombies. (Chalmers claims the conclusion of his anti-materialist argument ‘is the disjunction of panprotopsychism, epiphenomenalism, and interactionism’: 1999, 493. See also his 1996, 150-160, and 6.1 below.) However, although the zombie idea does not entail epiphenomenalism (or parallelism) about the actual world, it does seem to entail that epiphenomenalism might have been true: that there are possible worlds subject to the causal closure of the physical, where each of our conscious counterparts consists of a body plus nonphysical, causally inert qualia. For the zombie idea implies a conception of phenomenal consciousness on which it would be conceivable that a person’s qualia should be stripped off like a jacket, leaving a fully functioning body. Given common assumptions, that would rule out causation by qualia in such a world (see e.g. Campbell 1970, 52, Chalmers 1996, 152; Kirk 2005, 42).

But, arguably, it is a priori true that phenomenal consciousness, whether actual or possible, involves being able to refer to and know about one’s qualia. If that is right, any zombie-friendly account faces a problem. According to the causal theory of reference — accepted by many philosophers — reference and knowledge require us to be causally affected by what is known or referred to (Kripke 1972); and it seems reasonable to take this too as true a priori if true at all. On that basis, in those epiphenomenalistic worlds whose conceivability we have just seen to follow from the conceivability of zombies — worlds where qualia are inert — our counterparts cannot know about or refer to their qualia. That contradicts the assumption that phenomenal consciousness involves being able to refer to qualia, from which it follows that such epiphenomenalistic worlds are not possible after all. Hence zombies are not conceivable in the relevant sense either, since their conceivability leads a priori to a contradiction. To summarize: if zombies are conceivable, so are epiphenomenalistic worlds. But by the causal theory of reference, epiphenomenalistic worlds are not conceivable; therefore zombies are not conceivable.

A response has been offered — originally to a slightly different objection — by Chalmers. On his account of ‘phenomenal judgments’ (roughly, judgments about qualia) the crucial consideration is that we are ‘acquainted’ with our experiences. This ‘intimate epistemic relation’ both ensures that we can refer to experiences and also justifies our claims to know about them. Since our zombie twins, in contrast, have no experiences, their quasi-phenomenal judgments are unjustified. Chalmers suggests that even if qualia have no causal influence on our judgments, their mere presence in the appropriate physical context partially constitutes the contents of the thoughts involved: it ensures that our thoughts are about those qualia. It also constitutes justification for our knowledge claims, he thinks, even if our experiences are not explanatorily relevant to making the judgments in question (Chalmers 1996, 172-209; 1999, 493f; see also his 2003).

The problem of epistemic contact. Just now it seemed that if zombies are conceivable, then epiphenomenalist and parallelist worlds are also conceivable. In that case the friends of zombies must explain how the qualia in such worlds — call them ‘e-qualia’ (epiphenomenal qualia) — could make any sort of intimate contribution to people’s lives; and here Kirk (2005) suggests the zombie idea faces a further difficulty. This emerges when we consider such things as attending to, thinking about, remembering, and comparing our experiences: activities that (we might say) bring us into ‘epistemic contact’ with those experiences. Such activities involve cognitive processing, which in turn involves changes causing other changes. Since e-qualia are causally inert, they themselves could not do that processing; so if they actually constitute our experiences (as epiphenomenalism and parallelism seem to imply) the necessary processing must be done by the body: presumably by the brain. Kirk argues that the conception of consciousness implied by the zombie idea would make it impossible for such processing to put us into epistemic contact with e-qualia, since that conception can appeal only to the assumed causation of e-qualia by neural processes or to their isomorphism with them. He argues roughly as follows that those factors would not be enough.

Imagine that the relevant neural processes in my own brain caused, without being affected by, tiny patterns of electrical activity that were isomorphic to them. Would that make me able to attend to or compare those electric currents? Clearly not. I neither know nor believe anything about them; indeed I am in no sort of epistemic contact with them. From the epistemic point of view the currents might as well not exist. Kirk argues that this is a counter-example to the assumption that for something to be caused by, and isomorphic to, an individual’s cognitive processes would be enough to bring that individual into epistemic contact with it. Applying that result to the case of e-qualia, he argues that the causation of e-qualia by neural events isomorphic to them does not put anyone into epistemic contact with them. Like the electric currents, from the epistemic point of view they might as well not exist.

Yet isomorphism and body-to-qualia causation seem to be all that zombists can appeal to when explaining epistemic contact. If that is right, the notion of e-qualia involves a contradiction: it implies a conception of consciousness by which people are in epistemic contact with their e-qualia; at the same time it rules out the possibility of such contact. Kirk goes on to argue that all zombists, including interactionist ones, are committed to the view that an epiphenomenalistic world with e-qualia is at least conceivable. It follows that if those arguments eventually prove sound, zombies are not conceivable in the sense that matters here.

Do we understand ‘physical’? A different approach focuses on the commitments of physicalism rather than on those of dualism. Daniel Stoljar (2001) argues that there are two distinct notions of the physical, depending on whether one appeals just to the notions in physical theory or to the intrinsic properties of physical objects. There are correspondingly two versions of physicalism. Stoljar suggests that even if one of the corresponding two versions of the conceivability argument is sound, the other is not because (very roughly) physicalists can always object that, since we do not know enough about the physical world (in particular, about its intrinsic properties), we cannot ‘strongly’ conceive of the possibility of zombies.

For other attacks on the conceivability of zombies, see Cottrell 1999; Harnad 1995; Marcus 2004; Shoemaker 1999.

5. Does conceivability entail possibility?

Arguably the burden of proof is on those who claim a given description involves an impossibility. Chalmers remarks, ‘If no reasonable analysis of the terms in question points toward a contradiction, or even makes the existence of a contradiction plausible, then there is a natural assumption in favor of logical possibility’ (1996, 96). That looks like a prima facie case for premiss (2) of the conceivability argument. But this premiss faces a number of challenges. One source of objections is Kripke’s ideas on necessary a posteriori truths.

5.1 Objections based on a posteriori necessity

According to Kripke, statements such as ‘Water is H2O’, in spite of being knowable only a posteriori, are necessary. This is because ‘water’ refers to H2O in all possible worlds: it is a ‘rigid designator’. He himself used these ideas to argue against the psychophysical identity theory, suggesting that because it seems that our physical world could have existed without pain (for example), pain cannot be identical with anything physical. Kripke did not explicitly endorse the conceivability-entails-possibility claim; but he did suggest that if it appears to break down for some particular identity thesis, that is because we are mistaking some different thesis for the one in question. If for example it seems to us that water might not have been H2O, that is because we are not actually thinking of water, but of some other substance (on the lines of ‘the watery stuff’). Where no such alternative thought is available, as he supposed was the case with pain, conceivability does entail possibility (Kripke 1972).

A number of philosophers argue that these ideas actually facilitate the defense of physicalism. They urge that even if a zombie world is conceivable, that does not establish that it is possible in the way that matters. Conceivability is an epistemic notion, they say, while possibility is a metaphysical one: ‘It is false that if one can in principle conceive that P, then it is logically possible that P; … Given psychophysical identities, it is an ‘a posteriori’ fact that any physical duplicate of our world is exactly like ours in respect of positive facts about sensory states’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, 446. See also Hill 1997; Loar 1997, 1999). On this basis some philosophers reject even the assumption that conceivability is a guide to possibility, thereby challenging the assumption that the burden of proof is on those who deny the zombie possibility (Yablo 1993; Block and Stalnaker 1999).

Chalmers responds to this attack on the conceivability-entails-possibility thesis by exploiting a framework for elaborating Kripke’s ideas which, he thinks, leaves the thesis substantially intact. On this account there is certainly a difference between a posteriori and a priori necessary statements, but only one underlying kind of necessity and possibility: one space of possible worlds. He then claims that if entailments from the physical to the phenomenal are not a priori necessary, this framework shows they are not a posteriori necessary either — and that therefore phenomenal properties involve something over and above the physical. He rejects the further suggestion that there is a ‘strong’ metaphysical possibility, ‘distinct from and more constrained than logical possibility, and that arises for reasons independent of the Kripkean considerations’ (1996, 136-138; 1999, 483-489).

In presenting his case Chalmers makes extensive use of ‘two-dimensional’ semantics; it raises issues too complex to be discussed here. See Chalmers 1996, 131-138; 1999, 477-492; 2002; Jackson 1998; and for discussions, Brueckner 2002; Loar 1999; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Perry 2001, 169-208; Shoemaker 1999; Yablo 1999.

5.2 Other objections

Several other objections have been raised to premiss (2) of the conceivability argument; some are noted below.

‘Special factors’. One objection is that there are special factors at work in the psychophysical case which have a strong tendency to mislead us. For example it is claimed that what enables us to imagine or conceive of states of consciousness is a different cognitive faculty from what enables us to conceive of physical facts: ‘there are significant differences between the cognitive factors responsible for Cartesian intuitions [such as the intuition that zombies are logically possible] and those responsible for modal intuitions of a wide variety of other kinds’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, 449. See also Hill 1997). It is suggested that these differences help to explain the ease with which we seem able to conceive of zombies, and the difficulty we have in understanding the claim that they are nevertheless impossible. Making a comparable point, David Papineau (2002) urges that resistance to physicalism springs from a ‘dualist compulsion’ to think that consciousness is distinct from the physical. He suggests the source of this compulsion is the special character of the concepts we use when describing our experiences: in particular, it arises from the fact that, as he holds, our uses of these concepts ‘will standardly be accompanied by versions of the experiences referred to’ (105).

Must distinct concepts express distinct properties? Chalmers’s defence of the conceivability-entails-possibility thesis appeals to the view that if a zombie world is conceivable, then ‘there are properties of our world over and above the physical properties’ (1996, 133). Against this it is argued that even if a zombie world is indeed conceivable, it does not follow that there are nonphysical properties in our world. If that is right, physicalists can concede the conceivability of zombies while insisting that the properties in question are physical. ‘Given that properties are constituted by the world and not by our concepts’, Brian Loar comments, ‘it is fair of the physicalist to request a justification of the assumption that conceptually distinct concepts must express metaphysically distinct properties’ (Loar 1999, 467; see also his 1997).

Loar also argues that phenomenal concepts are ‘recognitional’, in contrast to physical concepts, which are ‘theoretical’. Phenomenal concepts, he says, ‘express the very properties they pick out, as Kripke observed in the case of ‘pain’’ (1999, 468). He thinks these points explain the conceivability of a zombie world, while maintaining that there is no possible world in which the relevant physical properties are distinct from consciousness. Chalmers objects that ‘there is nothing in Loar’s account to justify coreference’: 1999, 488.

Conditional analysis. Some objections rest on conditional analyses of the concept of qualia. The core idea, roughly, is that if there actually are certain nonphysical properties which fit our conception of qualia, then that is what qualia are, in which case zombies are conceivable; but if there are no such nonphysical properties, then qualia are whichever physical properties perform the appropriate functions, and zombies are not conceivable. It is argued that this approach enables physicalists to accept that the possibility of zombies is conceivable, while denying that zombies are conceivable (Hawthorne 2002; Braddon-Mitchell 2003. See Stalnaker 2002 for a related point).

More on the utterances of zombies. Consider a zombie world that is an exact physical duplicate of our world, so that in it all philosophers have zombie twins. In particular there are zombie twins of those who appeal to the conceivability argument. Katalin Balog (1999) argues that the utterances of these zombie-twin philosophers would be meaningful, although their sentences would not always mean what they do in our mouths. She further argues — to oversimplify — that if the conceivability argument were sound in actual philosophers’ mouths, then it would be sound in the mouths of zombie philosophers too. But since by hypothesis physicalism is true in their world, their argument is not sound. Therefore the conceivability argument used by actual philosophers is not sound either. If this argument works, it has the piquant feature that ‘the zombies that antiphysicalists think possible in the end undermine the arguments that allege to establish their possibility’ (502. Chalmers offers a brief reply in his 2003).

The issues raised by the question of whether conceivability entails possibility are interesting independently of the mind-body problem. For other recent discussions see Block and Stalnaker 1999; Chalmers and Jackson 2001; Jackson 1998; Perry 2001; Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) 2002; Worley 2003.

6. Other issues

If zombies are genuinely possible, then not only is physicalism problematic: so are some widely held views on other topics. Here are three notable examples.

6.1 Mental causation

The zombie idea inverts the traditional problem of mental causation. Descartes accepted the common assumption that not only do physical events have mental effects, but mental events have physical effects. The difficulty for his dualism, it was thought, was to understand how a supposedly nonphysical mind can have physical effects. But if zombies are possible, it seems natural to suppose that qualia cannot have physical effects. If the physical world is causally closed, and if qualia are nonphysical, then it may seem that qualia have no role to play.

If that is the case, then it is hard to see any alternative to parallelism or epiphenomenalism, with the radical revision of common assumptions about mental causation that those views demand. True, as noted earlier, the friends of zombies do not seem compelled to be epiphenomenalists or parallelists. They may instead hold that the actual world is not physically closed under causation, and that nonphysical properties have physical effects. Or they may favor ‘panprotopsychism’, according to which what is metaphysically fundamental is not physical properties, but phenomenal or ‘protophenomenal’ ones (Chalmers 1991, 297-299; 1999, 492) — a view arguably compatible with the causal closure of the physical. But neither of those options is easy. Abandoning causal closure conflicts with empirical evidence; while the idea of phenomenal or quasi-phenomenal properties as fundamental is obscure. Besides, as also noted earlier, the conceivability of zombies seems to entail that epiphenomenalistic worlds are possible. (Perry goes further, arguing that the zombie idea simply presupposes epiphenomenalism: 2001, 71-80.)

6.2 The function of consciousness

The apparent possibility of zombies would seem to pose a problem for evolutionary theory. Why did creatures with qualia survive rather than zombie counterparts of those creatures? How could consciousness possibly have a function? Owen Flanagan and Thomas Polger have used the apparent possibility of zombies to support the claim that ‘There are as yet no credible stories about why subjects of experience emerged, why they might have won — or should have been expected to win — an evolutionary battle against very intelligent zombie-like information-sensitive organisms’ (1995, 321). Clearly those who do not accept the possibility of zombies face no such problem. One response on behalf of those who do accept it is to suggest that there might be fundamental laws linking the phenomenal to the physical. Such laws would not depend on whether conscious creatures ever happened to evolve, in which case, arguably, evolution poses no special problem (Chalmers 1996, 171).

6.3 Other minds

If qualia have no physical effects, then nothing will enable anyone to establish for certain that anyone else actually has qualia. Philosophers who believe they have a solid response to skepticism about other minds may therefore conclude that this consequence of the zombie idea is enough to condemn it. Others, however, may regard the skeptical consequence as ‘a confirmation’, on the ground that we actually are ignorant of others’ minds (Campbell 1970, 120). Of course not all responses to other minds skepticism imply that zombies are inconceivable.

7. Conclusion

There is not always a meeting of minds in this debate. Some physicalists believe the zombie idea and its relatives exert an irrational grip on anti-physicalist thinking, so that

… it is tempting to regard anti-physicalist arguments as rationalizations of an intuition whose independent force masks their tendentiousness (Loar 1997, 598).

Correspondingly, some anti-physicalists believe their opponents’ commitment results in turning a blind eye to the difficulties:

Some may be led to deny the possibility [of zombies] in order to make some theory come out right, but the justification of such theories should ride on the question of possibility, rather than the other way round (Chalmers 1996, 96).

Regardless of whether those pessimistic readings of the debate are correct, and of whether the zombie idea itself is sound or incoherent, it continues to stimulate fruitful work on consciousness, physicalism, phenomenal concepts, and the relations between imaginability, conceivability, and possibility.


Other Internet Resources

Both maintained by David Chalmers (Philosophy, Australian National University)

Related Entries

behaviorism | consciousness | consciousness: animal | dualism | epiphenomenalism | functionalism | identity theory of mind | knowledge-argument | mental causation | other minds | physicalism | private language | qualia | skepticism | supervenience | verificationism


Many thanks to David Chalmers and to Bill Fish for valuable detailed comments and suggestions on drafts of this entry.