First published Wed Jan 11, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Juan Piñeros Glasscock and Sergio Tenenbaum replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

There is an important difference between activity and passivity: the fire is active with respect to the log when it burns it (and the log passive with respect to the fire). Within activity, there is also an important difference between the acts of certain organisms and the activities of non-living things like fire: when ants build a nest, or a cat stalks a bird, they act in a sense in which the fire does not. Finally, there is a long-standing tradition in philosophy going back at least as far as Plato and Aristotle that recognizes an important distinction between the acts that (non-human) animals in general are capable of, and the special sorts of actions that human beings do intentionally, such as going to the store, making phone calls, protesting an injustice, or knitting a sweater. This tradition views the latter group as practical manifestations of our rational capacities.

Although this entry largely follows suit in focusing on intentional human action as a manifestation of reason, we flag from the start that there are other philosophical traditions that call this assumption into question. For example, Japanese (as well as Buddhist) philosophers have discussed the possibility of action without the need of a self (Kasulis 2019, section 5.3). And on one reading of the Daode Jing, the highest forms of human agency are, in some sense, beyond reason. This is one way to understand the notion of wuwei, or “nonaction,” which describes an ideal way of acting that is neither unconscious or involuntary, nor purposeful or goal-oriented (cf. Hansen 2020, section 9.4 and Wong 2021, section 4.1). Similarly, the Inner Chapters of the Zhuangzi may present a view of human action as going beyond thought and reason. By ceasing to think about his action, Butcher Ding, appears to achieve such a sublime level of harmony with his activity as to obviate the need for effort (3.2). On one reading, Zhuangzi is presenting a non-intellectualist account of skill, not unlike that defended by Dreyfus and Dreyfus (2004) as the highest form of expertise (Ivanhoe 1993). On a more radical reading, the Inner Chapters do not present a higher form of skill, but rather a more radical notion, Dao (way), opposing skill (Schwitzgebel 2019).[1]

The entry is divided in eight sections. Section 1 discusses the question “What is an action?”. Section 2 examines a classic account of intentional action in terms of causation, associated with Donald Davidson’s work. Section 3 considers the challenge that extended actions—actions that take more than an instant to accomplish—pose for such a theory, as explored especially in Michael Bratman’s work, and different reactions to this challenge. Section 4 considers the notion of practical knowledge, as presented by Elizabeth Anscombe, which has served as the basis for the most important rival account to causal theories. Section 5 explores foundational questions about the ontology of action. Section 6 considers the question: does action have a constitutive aim–something it aims at just by being an intentional action? Section 7 considers whether omissions are actions, and, if so, how various accounts might accommodate this. Finally, Section 8 explores whether animals can act intentionally.

1. About the Question: What is an Action?

The central question in philosophy of action is standardly taken to be: “What makes something an action?” However, we obtain different versions of the question depending on what we take as the contrast class from which actions are to be differentiated. The different questions in turn encode important presuppositions. First, we may understand the question as asking us to differentiate between intentional action and the notions of acting and activity considered above (cf. Hyman 2015). Most commonly, however, the question is taken in terms of Wittgenstein’s classic formulation: “What is left over if I subtract the fact that my arm goes up from the fact that I raise my arm?” (1953 [2010], §621). A common, though contested, reading of this passage is this: there are certain events of an arm’s going up that are actions, and some that are not (e.g. if someone tickles me in my sleep). What further factor does the action have that the event resulting from tickling lacks?

Many historical as well as contemporary thinkers hope to answer just this question. A simple answer, common in the early modern period (e.g. Descartes 1641 AT VII 57; Hobbes 1651/1668, i.6; Hume 1739–1740 T II.3.iii; SB 413–18), is that what distinguishes actions from other events is that they are the causal outcomes of desires, volitions, or acts of will. A modern version of this view, considered below, appeals instead to intentions, regarded as distinctive mental states. Despite the intuitiveness of these “standard” answers, there have been increasing worries that they are based on disputable assumptions. First, there is an assumption about the metaphysical category to which actions belong. Although it is natural to take them as events, some philosophers have argued that there are good reasons to group them under a different category. Second, the common reading of Wittgenstein’s question presupposes what has been called “additive” or “decompositional” conceptions of action (Ford 2011; Lavin 2015, 2013; cf. Boyle 2016): it is assumed that an account of action can be given in terms of distinct, and simpler components. However, a number of authors have argued that this reductive project is bound to fail (Anscombe 1995; Vogler 2001; O’Brien 2012; Levy 2013; Horst 2015; Valaris 2015; Della Rocca 2020, ch.4).

It has also been contended that philosophers who offer the standard answers make important methodological assumptions. These philosophers approach questions about agency as though they were on par with scientific questions to this extent: they seek mechanistic, or causal explanations of agency, explanations that can be grasped from an objective perspective. However, drawing inspiration from Kant, some philosophers contend that philosophy of action should be done from the agential perspective (Nagel 1989; Korsgaard 2009; Bilgrami 2012; Schapiro 2021); and other philosophers drawing from Aristotle and Frege have argued for similar views (Thompson 2008; Lavin 2013; Ford 2017). From a different standpoint, the standard methodology has been criticized as not being scientific enough. It has been argued that certain empirical results disprove some of the basic assumptions behind these answers. For example, Libet’s experiments have been taken to suggest that intentions are causally ineffective, and that to understand the true causes of action we would have to focus on neural processes (‘action potentials’) about which we could only learn through standard scientific methods (Libet 1985; Libet et al. 1993). Although these radical views are now widely held to be based on faulty conceptual and empirical grounds (e.g. Mele. 2010; Levy 2005; Brass, Furstenberg, and Mele 2019), surprising scientific results continue to challenge commonly held views in philosophy of action (see e.g. Wegner 2002 and Nahmias 2014 for critical discussion of recent findings).

In this entry we draw from the work of philosophers working through different methodological paradigms. We will not bring up these differences again, but they may be worth keeping in mind as we consider the various debates below.

2. Causalism and Causal Theories of Action

Possibly the most widespread and accepted theory of intentional action (though by no means without its challengers) is the causal theory of action, a theory according to which something counts as an intentional action in virtue of its causal connection to certain mental states. In fact, this view is often dubbed (following Velleman 1992) the ‘standard story of action’. Although other philosophers proposed similar views before, the contemporary causal theory of action, or “causalism,” was pioneered by Donald Davidson, especially the essays collected in Davidson (2001a). Davidson has contributed to many topics in the philosophy of action, such as action individuation, the logical form of action sentences, the relation between intention and evaluative judgments, among others, but here we will focus mostly on his arguments for, and his formulation of, the causal theory of action. In Action, Reasons, and Causes (ARC), Davidson provides an account of the nature of rationalizing explanations of actions, or what is often called ‘intentional explanations’. Such explanations explain the action by providing the reason why the agent acted. ARC tries to understand how a reason can explain an action. The two central theses of ARC, or modified versions of them, became subsequently widely, though certainly not universally, accepted. The first thesis is that the explanation of an action involves a “primary reason”: a belief and a desire pair that rationalizes the action by expressing the end pursued in the action (desire) and how the agent thought the action would accomplish this end (instrumental belief). So, for instance, in “Larry went to Gus the Barber because he wanted a haircut”, Larry’s action is explained by a desire (his wanting a haircut) and a belief, left implicit in this case (his believing that he could get a haircut by going to Gus the Barber). The second central thesis is that the primary reason is also the cause of the action.

2.1 Davidson’s Predecessors and the Central Arguments in the Debate

Davidson’s view in ARC is presented against a number of philosophers (mostly influenced by Wittgenstein), who, on his view, take action explanations to provide a different kind of understanding than causal explanations (for a sympathetic overview of this Wittgenstein-inspired work, see Sandis 2015). Some of the identified targets of the paper (such as Melden 1961) are clearly arguing for the views Davidson rejects. Others (such as Anscombe 1957 and Ryle 1949) do not clearly embrace the theses Davidson objects to, or at least not all of them. These philosophers took intentional explanations to display how an action is made intelligible or justified. So Melden says that “citing a motive [gives] a fuller characterization of the action; it [provides] a better understanding of what the [agent] is doing” (Melden 1961, 88). Similarly, Anscombe’s special sense of the question “Why?’, discussed below (section 4.1), is supposed to pick out the particular way in which actions are explained. This claim is not one that Davidson denies; according to Davidson, in intentional explanations, or ‘rationalizations’, ”the agent is shown in his Role of Rational Animal … There is an irreducible … sense in which every rationalization justifies: from the agent’s point of view there was, when he acted, something to be said for the action.“ (Davidson 1963, 690–1). But Melden, and other Wittgensteineans, argue that this kind of explanation cannot be a causal explanation. Melden’s central argument is the ”logical connection“ argument. According to Melden, since the supposedly causal antecedents of an action (mental items such as desires and intentions) are logically related to the intentional action (I would not count as intentionally signalling a turn if I did not desire/intend to signal a turn), the explanation of the action in terms of such mental items cannot be an explanation in terms of ”Humean causes“. After all, Humean causation connects events that are logically independent.

Davidson’s ARC exposes a crucial fallacy with Melden’s argument (similar problems had been pointed out by Annette Baier (then Annette Stoop) in Stoop 1962). Accepting Hume’s account of causal relations does not commit us to the view that any description of a cause is logically independent of any description of its effect. An event can only be described as ”sunburning“ if it is caused by exposure to the sun, but this does not mean that the cause of a sunburn is not a ”separate entity“ from the sunburn. We can describe an event as ”The event that caused X“ without thereby refuting Humeanism about causation. Davidson argues that, on the contrary, the mental items cited in an action explanation can only explain the action if they are also the cause of the action (the second central thesis of ARC). In our example above, Larry might have had other belief-desire pairs that rationalized his action of going to the barber. For instance, Larry might also have wanted a bottle of cream soda and believed that he could procure such an item at Gus the Barber. However, he did not (we may stipulate) go there because he wanted cream soda but because he wanted a haircut (and believed he could get one at Gus the Barber). The only way we can explain the difference between potentially rationalizing, but non-explanatory belief-desire pairs, is that the belief-desire pair that genuinely explains the action, the primary reason, also causes the action. The question of how non-causal theories can distinguish between merely potentially explanatory reasons for an action from the reasons that actually explain it became known as ”Davidson’s Challenge“ to non-causal theories of action (Mele 1992; Mele 2013).

2.2 Davidson on the Nature of Intentional Actions

Although initially presented as an account of the nature of action explanation, Davidson’s account also contains the basic structure of an understanding of human action: according to Davidson, a true action statement (of the form ”x φ-ed“) denotes an event, and more specifically, a bodily movement. A bodily movement is an action if, and only if, the event is an intentional action (Davidson 1971). Davidson does not say this explicitly,[2] but clearly on his view, an event is an intentional action under a certain description, if and only if, there is a true rationalizing explanation of the event under this description. Davidson (1971) (following Anscombe) points out that ”x φ-ed intentionally“ creates an intensional context; that is whether an action is intentional depends on how the action is described. To use Davidson’s example, if I flip a switch, I also turn on the light, and alert the burglar. On Davidson’s view ”flipping the switch“, ”turning on the light“, and ”alerting the burglar“ are all descriptions of the same action. The ”accordion effect“ (so dubbed by Feinberg 1965), characteristic of human action, makes it the case that the causal consequences of an intentional action provide further descriptions of human actions. If my flipping the switch caused the light to go on and the burglar to be alerted, then I also turned the light on and alerted the burglar. However, only the first two are intentional actions. On Davidson’s view, all these descriptions are descriptions of the same action; alerting the burglar is an action in virtue of the fact that these same bodily movements, under a different description, are a case of intentional action (flipping the switch). Thus Davidson concludes that, ”we never do more than move our bodies: the rest is up to nature“ (Davidson 1971, 23). We can see now how the claims developed in these papers provide us with a theory of action: an action is a bodily movement such that, under some description, the bodily movement is causally explained by a primary reason.

This also gives us the barebones of a causal theory of action: according to ”causalists“, intentional action is explained in terms of mental states that are the causal antecedents, or concomitants, of the agent’s behaviour or bodily movement. Subsequent to Davidson, causalists have aimed to provide reductive explanations: intentional action is identified with behaviour or bodily movement (or in less ”ambitious“ versions of the view, a more general form of action, see Setiya 2011) whose causal antecedents (or concomitants) are certain specified mental states. Although Davidson himself is often portrayed as proposing a reductive analysis, he never presents any of his views as fulfilling such ambition and expresses skepticism that such analysis is possible given the problem of deviance (see below).

2.3 Mental states as the causal explanans of actions

The idea that an action is rationalized by its mental states is still very popular; much less so is the view that the only relevant states are beliefs and desires (though see Sinhababu 2017 for a modern defense of this simple ”Humean“ account). As Bratman (1987) argues, desires do not have the conduct-controlling and settling functions characteristic of intentions, and thus intentions seem to be better placed to be at the center of an account in which intentional actions are constituted by their causal genesis. My desire to have my teeth cleaned, when conjoined with my belief that in order to get my teeth cleaned I need to go to a dentist, will not result in my moving towards the dentist until I actually intend to go to the dentist. In fact, when Velleman comes to dub this kind of causal theory of action ”the standard story of action“, he explicitly describes the view as one in which intention plays a central role between the ”primary reason“ and the action. In the standard story, the agent’s ”desire for the end, and his belief in the action as a means … jointly cause an intention to take it, which in turn causes the corresponding movements of the agent’s body.“ (Velleman 1992, 461). Davidson (1970b) himself came to accept that intentions play an important role in the causation and constitution of action and that intentions could not be reduced to beliefs or desires. But common to all these views is the idea that human actions are events that bear the right kind of causal relation to certain mental states or events of the agent that also explain the action.

One alternative to the causal view understands agency as a form of irreducible agent-causation. Chisholm (1964) presents a classic version of the view; Alvarez and Hyman (1998) presents a radically different version which denies that agents cause the actions themselves; Mayr (2011) develops a version of the view that, unlike Chisholm’s version, tries to show that human agency is not essentially different from other forms of substance causation that we find in the natural world. A second alternative sees intentional explanations as teleological rather than causal explanations (Wilson 1980; Cleveland 1997; Schueler 2003; Sehon 2005); that is, an intentional explanation cites the goal, the purpose, or the reason for which the agent acted rather than the antecedent causes of the action. Defenders of this view also try to provide an understanding of the teleological structure of intentional action that denies that teleological explanations reduce to causal explanations; they are instead a sui generis form of explanation. One way this view can meet Davidson’s Challenge is to argue that the truth of certain counterfactuals distinguishes potential reasons from the actual reasons. For instance, it could be true that even though the fact that the asparagus was delicious was a potential reason for Mary to eat asparagus, she would not have eaten them if they were not healthy and she would have eaten them even if they were not delicious (Löhrer and Sehon 2016); such counterfactuals, on this view, are not grounded on causal relations between mental states and the bodily movements, but on the teleological structures that constitute intentional action. Finally, the causal account also contrasts with the neo-Aristotelian view in which human action is constituted, roughly, by a special form of practical knowledge (Anscombe 1957); on this view, in intentional action, ”knowledge is the [formal] cause of what it understands“ (see section 4 of this entry).

2.4 The Problem of Causal Deviance

Let us take the following as the general form of a (reductive) causal theory of action:

An event (bodily movement) B is an intentional action if and only if it is an event caused by mental states [S1, … Sn].

We can immediately see how to generate counterexamples to any such formula: find cases in which there is a causal path from [S1, …, Sn] to B, but not through the ”normal“ causal path that would presumably give rise to the bodily movement in a genuine case of action. This is the problem of deviance for the causal theory of action; Davidson himself was among the first who provided classical examples of such causal deviance for his own account of action (but Frankfurt 1978’s presentation of the problem was particularly influential):

A climber might want to rid himself of the weight and danger of holding another man on a rope, and he might know that by loosening his hold on the rope he could rid himself of the weight and danger. This belief and want might so unnerve him as to cause him to loosen his hold, and yet it might be the case that he never chose to loosen his hold, nor did he do it intentionally. (Davidson 1973, 153–4)

This is a case of what is often called ”primary deviance“ (Mele and Moser 1994), in which the bodily movements in question are not even actions, but the causal theory seems to imply they are. In contrast, in cases of ”secondary deviance’’, the theory misdescribes one of the consequences of the action as intentional when it clearly is not. The same Davidson paper provides an example of the latter:

A man may try to kill someone by shooting at him. Suppose the killer misses his victim by a mile, but the shot stampedes a herd of wild pigs that trample the intended victim to death. Do we want to say the man killed his victim intentionally? (Davidson 1973, 152–3)

There are very many attempts to solve the problem of causal deviance for a causal theory of action and we cannot cover in detail any of them or mention all of them; here we’ll just list a few influential strategies (and, of course, some solutions incorporate more than one of these strategies). The first appeals to the notion of a “proximate cause” (Mele 1992) such that an action is intentional only if, for instance, the formation of an intention to φ is the proximate cause of your φ-ing. Another family of solutions appeal to sensitivity and feedback conditions (Peacocke 1979; Bishop 1989; Smith 2012): the climber’s bodily movements would not count as an intentional action because they would not be sensitive to variations in conditions and information on what needs to be done (the climber would not release their hands differently if the rope turned out to be stickier or would not change their behaviour if they were to realize that the rope had a safety latch fastened to their hips). A different type of approach (though with some relevant similarities to the latter) takes the central problem for the Davidsonian approach, the reason why the problem of deviance is endemic to Davidson’s causalism, to be the attempt to understand action in terms of its causal antecedents, rather than its sustaining causes. For Frankfurt (1978) the relevant causal mechanisms involved must be guiding the action. Given that action is a form of purposive behaviour, we cannot hope to understand what distinguishes action from mere bodily movements by focusing on what precedes the action, rather than by what happens while the agent is acting. As Setiya puts it:

In the case of basic action, the crucial concept is that of guidance: when an agent intentionally φs, he wants to φ, and this desire not only causes but continues to guide behaviour towards its object. (It is this condition that fails in Davidson’s example). (Setiya 2007, 32)

In the case of secondary deviance, a seemingly promising approach is to require that a “non-basic” action counts as intentional only if (roughly) it follows the agent’s plan (Mele and Moser 1994). Davidson’s killer’s plan to kill his enemy did not involve a stampede, and thus it should not count as intentional action.

Another strategy has been developed by “empirically informed” philosophers, who hold that attention to the details of control mechanisms implemented at the cognitive level yields a response to the deviance problem. For example, it has been argued that cases of deviance involve lack of attention (Wu 2016), failures at the fine-grained level of motor (as opposed to distal and proximal) intentions (Mylopoulos and Pacherie 2019), or failures in the causal pathways responsible for flexible agency (Shepherd 2021).

Needless to say, there is no agreed upon solution to the problem of deviance (for general skepticism about the possibility of a solution see Anscombe 1995; Vogler 2001; O’Brien 2012; Levy 2013; Horst 2015; Valaris 2015); on the other hand, philosophers have also argued that competing accounts suffer from problems that parallel the problem of deviant causation for theories of action (Paul 2011b).

3. Extended Action

Davidson’s work focuses mostly on “punctual actions”, actions that take place very quickly, and that have already occurred. A typical example of an action for Davidson will be described by a sentence like “α flicked the switch” (see Davidson 1971). Flicking a switch happens almost instantaneously; moreover, when I describe my action as “flicked the switch”, the sentence picks up a completed event in which the action is already done. And flicking a switch, buttering toast, etc. are actions typically performed from beginning to end without interruption. In sum, Davidson’s typical examples of actions are short-lived, continuous, and completed actions. Davidson’s conception of an intention follows a similar pattern, focusing on intentions that are executed in actions that follow the aforementioned pattern. At first, Davidson takes intentions in (short-lived) action to be primary, and later (Davidson 1970b) expands the model to prospective intention (intentions for a future action), but still focusing mostly on intentions for a simply executed action that happens to lie in the future. However our actions often extend through long stretches of time, and seem to rely on future-directed intentions that govern very complex plans and activities. Moreover, we only seem to have a completed action when we are no longer engaged in the relevant activity (when it is true that I’ve crossed the street I am no longer engaged in the activities that constitute or are means to having crossed the street); agency arguably manifests itself only in action in progress (I am engaged in these activities while I am crossing the street). By keeping our focus on completed action, we risk losing sight of another seemingly essential feature of human action: that it extends through time under the guidance of the agent. Of course, this kind of initial focus on nearly momentary, completed actions does not necessarily mean that the theory cannot accommodate extended action that requires complex planning or action in progress (or any form of agency that necessarily stretches through time). But a number of philosophers have tried to either expand, modify, or reject Davidson’s theory to account for extended agency or action in progress, or to argue that a proper theory of action should focus on the nature and structure of action in progress (Thompson 2008; Ford 2018). This section will focus on extended agency of the former kind, and the relevance of action in progress will be discussed in section 4.

Michael Bratman’s work (Bratman 1987; 1999a; 2007; 2018, among others) was seminal in arguing for the importance of intentions, policies, and plans (all of which he classifies as intentions or planning states) in our understanding of how limited rational beings coordinate their actions through time and can pursue ends and projects through extended periods of time. Bratman’s planning theory of agency starts from rejecting Davidson’s account of intention, and replacing it with a new understanding of the function (and nature) of intentions and planning states. Davidson had identified intention with an “all-out” or unconditional judgment, “which, if we were to express it in words, would have a form like ”This action is desirable’“ (Davidson 1970b, 55); that is, an intention is a distinctive kind of evaluative judgment (”this action is good“ or ”this action is desirable“). On this view, to intend to φ is to have φ-ing as the conclusion of one’s practical reasoning. Bratman finds this view problematic in many ways, but arguably his most important objection to Davidson’s view is that Davidson’s theory of intention misses out one of the ”two faces“ of intentions. Intentions, on Bratman’s views, are tied not only to intentional action but also to coordinating plans (Bratman 1987); Davidson’s identification of intentions with certain evaluative judgments seems incapable of making room for the latter ”face“. However, this role of future-directed intentions in planning and coordinating action through time is essential to agency. Among our future-directed intentions, there are very specific intentions to, say, make huevos rancheros for brunch later today, but also more complex plans and projects (my plan to write a book on tricycles is also a specific, though not significantly filled out, intention for a specific action or set of actions), and policies (my policy to exercise once a week is a ”repeatable“, general, intention to perform various futures actions).[3]

Future-directed intentions have for Bratman at least two important functions in our deliberation: they have a settling function and a coordination function. Suppose I am deciding where I am spending my next vacation, and let us assume that I narrow it down to two possibilities: Poughkeepsie and Daytona Beach. At some point, typically much before my first vacation day, I will form an intention to go on one of these specific vacations (say to Daytona Beach), and this intention is independent of forming an evaluative judgment in favour of either option; I might be convinced that they are equally desirable, but I can only take one vacation a year. Forming the intention to go to Daytona Beach settles the question for me and ends deliberation on the matter. Since there is intrinsically no limit on how long I could spend deliberating, this settling function performs an important role in managing the cognitive resources of limited beings like us. But future-directed intentions also perform an important coordinating function in our extended agency. Going on vacation is a complex endeavour and we cannot successfully engage in this action without prior planning. If I am going to Daytona Beach, I need to plan how long I will stay, and what I will do when I am there, make hotel reservations, etc. These plans will also require more concrete plans as these actions unfold (if I plan to have snacks with me for the Indy-500, I need to plan which snacks, and then plan on where and when I will get them, and then plan on how I will get to the chosen grocery store, and so forth). Our capacity to form these different types of future-directed intentions (plans, policies, and more specific future-directed intentions) allows us to engage in these complex forms of extended agency (to be ”planning agents“ in Bratman’s words). In order to perform these functions, future-directed intentions must resist reconsideration and be stable through time. If I keep changing my mind after I form the intention to travel to Daytona Beach, my intention will not have settled the issue or foreclosed further deliberation. And it will also make both intrapersonal and interpersonal coordination impossible: if I expect I will change my mind, there’ll be no point in making hotel reservations at Daytona Beach. Moreover, these functions impose coherence constraints on my intentions: lack of means-ends coherence, for instance, will similarly prevent future-directed intention from functioning properly.

Thus, Bratman, as well as a number of other philosophers afterwards (for instance, Holton 2004; Holton 2009; Yaffe 2010; Paul 2014), suggest that an account of planning agency reshapes our understanding of agency and practical rationality. Bratman (1987) argues, for instance, that certain dispositions for nonreconsideration are essential to understanding the rationality of limited agents like ourselves. Holton (2004; 2009) extends Bratman’s account to another function of a future-directed intention: resisting temptation when we expect preferences and judgment shifts. We achieve this, according to Holton, by forming resolutions: intentions to remain firm in our intentions, which are harder to reconsider than simple desires or (first-order) intentions. (See Paul 2011a for some skepticism about this extension.)

Bratman also tries to expand his planning theory to explain the rationality of acting on a future-directed intention even in cases in which judgment or preference shifts might seem to justify acting otherwise. In earlier work, Bratman (1999b) appeals to a ”no-regret“ condition; roughly, a requirement that we should not reconsider or revise an intention if we’ll regret having done so at the conclusion of our planned actions. In later work, Bratman (2018) appeals to the end of self-governance, an end that is typically shared by human agents, to explain the rationality of sticking to one’s intentions in face of temptation (for somewhat similar ideas in the context of cooperation, see Velleman 1997). According to Bratman, self-governance is a form of agency in which the agent acts from a standpoint that is truly his own; a self-governing agent is guided ”by attitudes that constitute where he stands“ (Bratman 2018, 159).[4] On this view, self-governance has both a synchronic and diachronic form. Synchronic self-governance requires a coherent practical standpoint at a time that can constitute where the agent stands in a coherent manner, while diachronic self-governance requires a coherent standpoint across different times when the agent’s plans stretch through an extended period. Since typically planning agents also have self-governance as one of their ends, the need for such a coherent standpoint generates reasons to conform to a requirement not to revise intentions not only in cases of temptation, but also in cases in which an agent forms a future-directed intention to choose one of a number of alternatives that are either indifferent or incommensurable. Even though in such cases an agent has sufficient reasons to act differently than she intends (since other options are just as good or at least on a par), self-governance requires that she preserves a coherent standpoint over time (for a different way to justify normative reasons against ”brute shuffling“ in terms of self-governance, see Paul 2014; for skepticism about some of these requirements against brute shuffling, see Ferrero 2010; Nefsky and Tenenbaum 2022).

Although these challenges to Davidson’s original theory of action are different from the challenges that focus on the nature of action in progress, some philosophers argue that they are not unrelated. Tenenbaum (2018; 2020) argues that understanding better the nature of intentional action as actions that are always extended through time, and the nature of the instrumental reasoning involved in intentional action in progress, makes Bratman’s appeal to a sui generis state of future-directed intention superfluous in our understanding of practical rationality. On this view, there is no difference between the rational requirements governing the various phases of an action in progress and the requirements governing the execution of a plan that contains various steps, or of a general intention that contains various instances (and thus purported requirements that are specific to future-directed intentions turn out to be redundant or spurious).

On a somewhat different vein, some philosophers have challenged the view that there is a significant metaphysical ”break“ between a prior intention and an action in progress. From the time I decide to make an omelet, to the time the finished product is on my plate, my agency unfolds in various stages and phases in pursuit of this end: I plan to make an omelet, I check which ingredients I need, I make sure that I leave myself enough time to go to the store while engaged in other activities in the morning, I buy the milk, go back home, melt the butter, break the eggs, drop them on the pan, and so forth. These are all parts, or phases, of the unfolding of the activity that, if nothing untoward happens, will result in my having made an omelet. Although we can impose various breaks and divide the process into ”intending“, ”preparing“, ”making the omelet“, these breaks are largely arbitrary from the point of view of the activity itself (Thompson 2008; Moran and Stone 2009; Ferrero 2017; Russell 2018); a metaphysics of intention that emphasizes differences risks losing sight of the continuity of the phenomena (for criticisms of these deflationary ideas about the differences between the various phases of the activity from intending to doing, see Yaffe 2010; Paul 2014).

4. Practical Knowledge

Whereas the central notion in Davidson’s theory of intentional action was that of causation, the central one in Anscombe’s is that of practical knowledge. In a famous passage, she appears to define intentional action as an event that manifests practical knowledge:

[W]here (a) the description of an event is of a type to be formally the description of an executed intention (b) the event is actually the execution of an intention (by our criteria) then the account given by Aquinas of the nature of practical knowledge holds: Practical knowledge is ‘the cause of what it understands’, unlike ‘speculative’ knowledge, which ‘is derived from the objects known’. (Anscombe 1957, §48)

Only recently practical knowledge has received sustained interest in philosophy of action. Much of the resulting work aims to clarify and defend Anscombe’s view (Moran 2004; Thompson 2008, 2011; Haddock 2011; Rödl 2011; Small 2012; Wolfson 2012; Marcus 2012; Stathopoulos 2016; Campbell 2018; Marcus 2018; Frey 2019; Valaris 2021); but several critics question her arguments, as well as application of the notion to the definition of intentional action (e.g., Houlgate 1966; Grice 1971; Paul 2009b; 2011b). In response, a number of scholars who still find inspiration in Anscombe have sought to accommodate the criticisms by giving up on some of her most ambitious claims. This section concentrates on contemporary debates about practical knowledge stemming from Anscombe’s discussion, but we start by briefly examining its origins in ancient Greek and mediaeval philosophy.

4.1 The Nature of Practical Knowledge

The idea that there is a distinctively practical form of knowledge traces back to Aristotle, who distinguished different ways ”by virtue of which the soul possesses truth“ (EE 5.3/NE 6.3). There are three theoretical forms by which a scientist grasps the truth: knowledge (epistêmê), wisdom (sophia), and comprehension (nous). Practical knowledge comes in two varieties: the knowledge of the skilled person about what she makes—skill (technê), and the knowledge of the virtuous person about her actions—practical wisdom (phronêsis).

Aristotle’s account of practical knowledge is complex, and our focus shall lie on three points of particular significance. First, Aristotle claimed that skill is the ”cause“ (aitia) of the things produced by it. For instance, he claimed that the craft of building is the cause of the house (Phys. 2.5, 196b26). Second, Aristotle imposed epistemic conditions on voluntary and, a fortiori, intentional action: according to him, to act voluntarily one must know, among other things, what one is doing, to whom, and why (NE 3.1 1111a3–6; EE 2.9 1225a36–b10). Third, Aristotle identified a distinctive kind of reasoning associated with practical knowledge, a form of reasoning traditionally rendered ”practical syllogism“ (though see Segvic 2011). Such reasoning begins from a certain good and its conclusion is an action. For instance, on the basis of thinking that walks are good after lunch, and that he has eaten lunch, a man might take a walk (DMA 7, 701a13–14). (For more on ancient views on action, see Parry 2021.)

Several mediaeval philosophers built on these Aristotelian ideas, especially to understand God’s knowledge of creation (see Schwenkler 2015). Anscombe (1957)’s account of practical knowledge draws on this tradition. She first characterizes intentional action as that to which a special sense of the question ”Why?“ applies, the sense that requests a reason for action (§5). Later, Anscombe appeals to Aristotle’s notion of practical reasoning to connect the notion of reason for action and the deliberative structure by which an agent determines how to attain a goal by acting (§33ff.). What the question ”Why?“ reveals, then, is the rational ”order“ of means-to-ends that define practical reasoning, and the answers reveal the descriptions under which the action is intentional.

To illustrate with her famous example of a man pumping water (§23): A man is moving his arms up and down. Why? Because he is operating a pump. Why? Because he is pumping water. Why? Because he is poisoning the inhabitants of the house (you see, the water is poisoned). Why? Because he wants to kill them to bring world peace. The question ”Why?“ has application only inasmuch as the agent recognizes himself as acting under the corresponding descriptions expressed by his answers. As Anscombe notes, if the man were asked ”Why are you pumping water?“ and he replied, ”I was not aware I was doing that“, then he would not be acting intentionally under that description (§6; §42). The descriptions that manifest the agent’s understanding of what she is doing are therefore intrinsic to the action: an action does not count as intentional under a description unless the agent grasps the action as such (under that description). Such grasp, therefore, cannot be a separate occurrence (§42).

This reveals at least one important sense in which practical knowledge is the ”cause of what it understands“. It is the formal cause because the agent’s grasp determines what the action is (an intentional action with a determinate content). In turn, this shows why, in the phrase Anscombe borrows from Aristotle’s Magna Moralia, ”the mistake is in the performance“ when it doesn’t conform to the judgment (§32): qua formal cause, the knowledge sets the standard for what is known. Whether, like Aristotle, Anscombe holds that practical knowledge is also an efficient cause is a complex, and disputed question (see Setiya 2016a for skepticism, and Piñeros Glasscock 2020a for endorsement).

One last important aspect of Anscombe’s conception of practical knowledge is the contention that an agent knows what she is doing ”without observation“ (1957, §8). This is because, intuitively, whereas I need to look at what is being written on the board to know what someone else is writing, I don’t need to look at what I am doing to know what I am writing. Beyond intuitive examples, however, it has proven difficult to explain what non-observational knowledge is.[5] Nevertheless, there are three points on which there is wide agreement. First, the class of practical knowledge is a proper subclass of the class of non-observational knowledge, one that also includes, for instance, knowledge of our limbs’s position (§§9–10). Second, to say that knowledge is non-observational is minimally to say that it is non-inferential. Third, and finally, the non-observational character of this knowledge is of the sort traditionally associated with mental states. Hence, one of the most remarkable theses of Intention is that public happenings—actions—could be known in the distinctive way traditionally reserved for internal mental states, so that there would be ”spontaneous knowledge of material reality“ (Rödl 2007, 121).

4.2 Arguments for a knowledge condition

Anscombe presents several arguments for the claim that to act intentionally an agent must know what she is doing (call this the ”knowledge condition’), and further arguments have been presented in the literature. This section surveys four influential arguments.

One argument has already been mentioned: If a person is asked, “Why are you φ-ing?” and she (sincerely) replies, “I didn’t realize I was φ-ing” then she wasn’t φ-ing intentionally. It would seem to follow that a person must know what she is doing if acting intentionally. However, this argument is unsound. First, the expression “I didn’t realize…” is colloquially used to express complete lack of awareness, rather than mere ignorance (Schwenkler 2019, 189). At most, then, the argument would show that the action cannot be completely beyond the agent’s purview. Second, even if the person’s state is in fact knowledge after the question is asked, this may be a conversational effect: By asking “Why are you φ-ing?”, the speaker intimates that the agent is φ-ing. This puts the agent in a position to know this, but not in a way that is tied to her agency.

A more promising argument, suggested by Anscombe and endorsed by some of her followers in some form (Setiya 2007; Marušić and Schwenkler 2018), appeals to the connection between action and assertion. It can be stated thus:

Premise 1:
If S is φ-ing intentionally, then she is in a position to correctly assert that she is φ-ing.

Premise 2:
One can correctly assert p only if one knows p.

Therefore, if S is φ-ing intentionally, she knows that she is φ-ing.

Premise 2 is the standard claim that knowledge is the norm of assertion (Unger 1975; Slote 1979; Williamson 2000; DeRose 2002; Reynolds 2002; Hawthorne 2004). Premise 1 may also look innocuous; but, as we shall see, there may be cases that speak against it.

There are two more influential arguments inspired by Anscombe that have been used to defend the connection with knowledge. The first begins with the observation that a process in progress bears a non-accidental connection to its completion (Thompson 2011; Small 2012; Wolfson 2012; Valaris 2021). If a house is burning, it would not be an accident if it is burnt later; and if you are writing a letter, it won’t be an accident if it is written later. What distinguishes intentional action is that the non-accidental connection obtains in virtue of the agent’s representation—her intention—to act in some way. That the agent is writing a letter—even while she takes a break, cooks a snack, and goes to the bathroom—is true precisely because she represents herself as writing a letter, and this representation guides her proceedings. Intentions, in other words ground what Falvey (2000) calls the “openness of the progressive”: the fact that “a person may be doing something, in a suitably broad sense, when at the moment she is not doing anything, in a more narrow sense, that is for the sake of what she is doing in the broad sense” (p.22). Suppose, then, that an agent is intentionally φ-ing. Then it is true that she represents herself as doing so, the representation is true, and non-accidentally so. It is a short step to the conclusion that she knows that she is φ-ing.

The final argument is based on the claim that intentional action is action for a reason (Thompson 2013). An agent must therefore be in a position to give an answer fitting the schema:

I’m φ-ing because ψ.

Now, Thompson (2008) has argued that the most basic way of filling this schema is one where actions themselves occupy the ψ-position (i.e. where actions are given as reasons). For instance:

I am moving my hands because I am pumping water.

So, in what sort of relation must an agent stand to the fact that she is pumping water for a sentence like (2) to be true? Hyman (1999; 2015) has argued that the relation must be knowledge (though see Dancy 2000, ch.6). If, then, every intentional action description is one that the agent could substitute for ψ in (1), it follows that agents must know what they are doing when acting intentionally.

4.3 Objections to the knowledge condition

Davidson argued that the knowledge condition, and even a weaker belief condition, is vulnerable to counterexamples:

[I]n writing heavily on this page I may be intending to produce ten legible carbon copies. I do not know, or believe with any confidence, that I am succeeding. But if I am producing ten legible carbon copies, I am certainly doing it intentionally. (Davidson 1970b, 92)

In this case, Davidson argued that the agent is making 10 carbon copies intentionally despite not believing that he is (never mind knowing); and some recent empirical results appear to support this verdict (Vekony 2021). Hence, it seems that agents can φ intentionally without even believing that they are φ-ing.

For a long time, this and similar examples (e.g. Bratman 1987, 37, Mele 1992, ch.8) were taken as decisive refutations in the literature, but their force has been contested recently (Thompson 2011; Small 2012; Wolfson 2012; Stathopoulos 2016; Beddor and Pavese 2021; Pavese forthcoming). The impetus for many of these responses stems from Thompson’s work on the importance of aspect for action-theory. In particular, actions in progress display what Falvey (2000) has called “openness”, which corresponds to the inaptly-named “imperfective paradox” in the linguistic literature (more below): Someone can be doing something and never get around to have done it (e.g. I can be crossing the street, but never cross it). It is thus possible for someone to know that they are φ-ing even if they don’t, in fact, get to have φ-ed. To apply these considerations to Davidson’s argument, we need to distinguish between two cases. First, the normal case where the agent intends to make 10 carbon copies, but has the opportunity to correct and continue on if things go wrong (e.g. if he initially only makes 5, but then makes 5 more). Second, the one-shot case where the agent must make 10 carbon copies in one go (say, because he is competing in a copy-making tournament). In the normal case, it appears like the agent may know that he is making 10 carbon copies (even if he doesn’t know that he will complete the 10 in one go). So it raises no problems for the knowledge condition. What, then, of the one-shot case? Although here it may be granted that the agent doesn’t know that he is making 10 carbon copies, it is questionable whether he is making 10 carbon copies intentionally. The reason is that if he were to make 10 carbon copies as a result of pressing as hard as he can, this would be too much an accidental result of his performance. But, as we saw (see section 2.4), accidentality is incompatible with intentional action. Hence, in the normal case the agent acts intentionally while knowing, while in the one-shot case he doesn’t even act intentionally.

It is contentious whether the foregoing response works (see Kirley forthcoming, for criticism), but it shows that Davidson’s example is far from decisive. However, other examples appear to be immune from this type of response. For instance, Schwenkler (2019) presents a case of an agent who is trying to fill a cistern in the kind of environment where doubts that he is doing so are appropriate (e.g. where he is filling up one of many cisterns, but he knows several of them are broken, but not which). Suppose, however, that he is in fact filling up the cistern (it is not broken). If he does so to poison the inhabitants of the house, Anscombe’s question “Why?” appears to have application, which means that he is filling up the cistern intentionally, even though the best he could say is that “he thinks” he is doing so (Schwenkler 2019, 188–9; cf. Vekony, Mele, and Rose 2021; Shepherd & Carter forthcoming).

The key difference between this case and the carbon copier is that the agent remains fully in control of her action: the fact that he is filling up the cistern by moving his arms so and so is no accident. So, there is no reason to dispute the action’s status as intentional. Still, whatever belief the person might have is unsafe, as nearby beliefs (such as those relating to the other faucets) are false. Hence, it isn’t knowledge.

Building on similar considerations, Piñeros Glasscock (2020b) presents a version of Williamson (2000)’s anti-luminosity argument, aiming to show that the knowledge condition is incompatible with a safety principle, to the effect that to constitute knowledge, a representation could not easily be wrong. He argues that since agents can slowly transition from φ-ing to not-φ-ing through changes so small as to outstrip the agent’s discriminating capacities, agents must sometimes find themselves in situations where they are acting intentionally but either lack the confidence to possess knowledge, or, if they have it, it is misplaced. Either way, they do not know.

Together, these arguments force defenders of the knowledge condition into an uncomfortable position: if they wish to uphold the knowledge condition, they must reject safety for practical knowledge. However, this threatens to undermine the point of counting this as knowledge, given how epistemically frail it can be. On the other hand, it has been argued that a suitable understanding of the knowledge condition may evade these worries (Beddor and Pavese 2021; Valaris 2021).

4.4 Weakening the knowledge condition

The knowledge condition remains a controversial thesis in philosophy of action; but even those who reject it tend to hold that the connection between intentional action and knowledge is not accidental. Thus, there is a growing literature that aims to capture an important connection between knowledge and intentional action in weaker terms. These views can be categorized according to the term for which they recommend modification, whether (i) the practical state, (ii) the epistemic state, or (iii) the nature of the connection between them. (Naturally, since these are all compatible, some scholars recommend more than one revision.)

Though regarded as Anscombe’s central opponent, Davidson himself recommended a version of (i). According to him, although agents need not know what they are doing under every description under which they act intentionally, they must know what they are doing under at least one description under which the action is intentional (Davidson 1971, 51). The carbon copier, for instance, may not know that he is making 10 carbon copies, but he would have to know that he is making carbon copies, or that he is moving his hands, etc. Arguably, the idea that practical knowledge is restricted to knowledge of actions in progress is also a weakening of the thesis, since Anscombe appears to include also knowledge of future actions (§§51–2) and of completed actions such as the knowledge that I wrote my name on the board (§48) or even of what is written (§19). Indeed, it has been argued that imperfective and perfective knowledge are interdependent (Haase 2018). Finally, other weakenings include the view that agents must know what they intend (Fleming 1964), what they are trying to do/that they are trying (Searle 1985; cf. Grice 1971), or what basic actions they are performing (Setiya 2008; 2009; 2012). Since Anscombe’s thesis is strictly stronger than these, it follows that they will avoid certain problems that hers faces. However, it is not clear that such retreats help avoid the general problem, and restricting the thesis to more immediate occurrences—basic actions, intentions, or attempts—risks losing on the aforementioned feature that makes Anscombe’s view so interesting: the idea that we might bear the same intimate epistemic connection to something external as we bear to parts of our mental lives (Piñeros Glasscock 2020b).

Views that fall under (ii) have been influentially defended by several authors (Grice 1971; Harman 198;1997; Setiya 2007; 2008; 2009; 2012; Velleman 2001; Tenenbaum 2007; Ross 2009; Clark 2020). A popular version of this view rejects a knowledge condition in favor of a belief condition (Setiya 2007; Velleman 2001; Ross 2009; Clark 2020): if the agent φs intentionally [intends to φ], she believes that she is φ-ing [believes that she will φ]. Such a view is arguably better supported by some of Anscombe’s own arguments (such as the argument in terms of conversation dynamics above); and it seems to preserve a special place for actions as occurrences that are public but to which our minds bear a special epistemic relation. However, it has been argued that such views also suffer from problems, and fail to avoid counterexamples with the same structure as Davidson’s carbon copier, even though they are explanatorily weaker (Bratman 1991; Paul 2009a; 2009b; Levy 2018). Since authors like Setiya see the avoidance of counterexamples as a central payoff of the weakenings, it is unclear whether they are worth the costs in explanatory value.

Finally, views that fall under (iii) aim to show that even if there isn’t a relation of entailment between action and practical knowledge, there might yet be an interesting connection between them. For instance, some authors have argued that agents normally or generally know what they are doing (Peacocke 2003; O’Brien 2007; Gibbons 2010; Schwenkler 2015; 2019; Piñeros Glasscock 2020b); or that the kind of knowledge that agents have of their intentional action has special properties, such as being first-personal knowledge (Dunn 1998; Moran 2001; 2004; O’Brien 2007; Marcus 2012; Schwenkler 2019).

4.5 The possibility of practical knowledge

Regardless of whether one adheres to the knowledge condition (or some weakened version of the view), it is generally agreed that agents can have a special kind of knowledge by exercising their practical capacities in intentional action. However, what makes our practical capacities suitable source of knowledge? Anscombe devoted little attention to this question, but an answer to it could be the key to working out a version of (iii) in the previous section.

Here is a simple answer: A person can know that p (e.g. that she (herself) is walking), on the basis of exercising her will, because when she does so successfully p is true. Two related problems immediately arise for this simple account. First, truth is insufficient for knowledge. Minimally, epistemic warrant is also needed, but the simple account does not give even a hint as to how such warrant could be acquired through agency (Newstead 2006). Second, there are notorious cases that seem to meet the conditions provided by the simple answer, but where there isn’t knowledge. One case is lucky wishful thinking (Langton 2004), e.g., if partly on the basis of optimistic thinking I luckily pull off a jump I would not normally make. Another is pessimistic thinking (Harman 1986; 1997), e.g., if I trip partly on the basis of thinking that I will trip. In neither case do I possess knowledge on the basis of my thoughts, despite the thoughts bringing about the truth of their contents. At best, therefore, the simple answer is incomplete, and must be supplemented with a story that explains how it is that the characteristic thoughts of the agent differ from wishful and pessimistic thoughts, such as to provide epistemic warrant.

An influential account of this sort was provided in foundational work by Velleman (1989). Simplifying somewhat, Velleman argues that human beings have a core desire to know themselves. Like any desire, this one will motivate agents to satisfy it. In addition, they have the capacities to (a) have thoughts about what they are doing and will do, and (b) have thoughts that are self-referential, e.g. <this very thought won’t make me famous>. Suppose, then, that someone has the thought <I will go to the store in virtue of this thought>. Then, given the desire to know herself, the agent will be motivated to make this thought true. Hence, thought structures of this sort (‘intentions’) will give the agent reasons to believe that what she intends will be true.

Several worries have been raised against Velleman’s view. One is that it makes dubious empirical claims, theorizing about the mind from the armchair. In response, Velleman (2000a) has provided empirical support for his more contentious psychological claim, that humans have a deep desire for self-knowledge. Another worry is that this epistemic mechanism still looks too much like wishful thinking, believing that something is the case just because one wants it to be so (Langton 2004; see Setiya 2008; Velleman 2014 for replies). Finally, it is unclear why, if an agent realizes that the content of her intention is not realized, she must make it true that it is, rather than simply give up the belief (that she will act in a certain way). After all, we can pursue the aim of knowing ourselves both by ensuring that beliefs about ourselves are true and by giving up beliefs about ourselves that are false.

Worries of this sort led Velleman to distinguish “directive” from “receptive” cognition (Velleman 2000, ch.7); but it has led others to consider the alternative view that practical knowledge is a standard form of inferential knowledge (Grice 1971; O’Shaughnessy 1980, 2003; Paul 2009a). On the most sophisticated inferentialist account, due to Paul (2009a), agents take advantage of the special knowledge they have of their intentions to make inferences about what is happening and will happen. Given that intentions are reliably executed, such inferences reliably yield knowledge. A more radical inferentialist alternative, suggested by authors like Carruthers (2011) on the basis of empirical evidence, is that we know our actions on the basis of the same processes by which we know others’ minds: we essentially predict what actions are most likely to happen, given what else we know about others’ motives and beliefs—it’s just that we know a lot more about our own minds. (Similar views about self-knowledge in general are defended by Gopnik 1993, and have their origin in Ryle 1949. For criticisms, see Boyle 2022; Levy 2022.)

Inferentialist accounts give up on a feature that was central to Anscombe’s understanding of practical knowledge, its immediate character (see e.g. O’Brien 2007). However, Paul (2009a) argues that the appearance of immediacy can be explained by the fact that inferences “can take place rapidly and automatically at a non-conscious level, without the mindful entertaining of premises or feeling of drawing a conclusion” (p.10). Yet, several challenges have been raised against inferentialist accounts, including: (i) that they can’t explain the tight nexus between intentional action and practical knowledge (Setiya 2007, 2008, 2009); (ii) that they can’t explain the first-personal character of practical knowledge (Wilson 2000; Schwenkler 2012); and (iii) that they at best give us alienated, observational knowledge (Piñeros Glasscock 2021).

There are, finally, several non-inferentialist stories about how practical knowledge is possible. Some accounts appeal to knowledge-how or skill as the state by which an intention ensures that its content is not only true but also justified, so as to amount to knowledge (Setiya 2012; Small 2012; Valaris 2021). Another view, due to O’Brien (2007), explains practical knowledge in terms of the exercise of deliberative capacities. The agent knows what she is doing because the selection of an action is done via the exercise of capacities that narrow options in terms of the practical possibilities of the agent. Others take practical knowledge to be inferential, but the inference in question is practical inference. On this view, practical knowledge is warranted by the practical considerations that constitute the agent’s practical reasoning (Harman 1997; Tenenbaum 2007; Ross 2009; Marušić and Schwenkler 2018; Campbell 2018; Frey 2019). Finally, some have tried to show that accounts of epistemic warrant or entitlement designed to explain how we can directly believe on the basis of perception might explain how we can directly believe on the basis of our wills (Peacocke 2003; Newstead 2006; Piñeros Glasscock 2020a). As this brief and incomplete summary indicates, there is not yet anything close to a consensus about how best to explain the epistemic standing for practical knowledge.

5. The Ontology of Actions

What are actions? The traditional answer is: they are events of a certain sort (e.g. events with a distinctive causal history). That, at any rate, is the letter of the views found in Anscombe (1957), Davidson (1963; 1967a; 1967b; 1985), and much subsequent literature. However, some scholars have recently argued that Anscombe’s position is better captured by the claim that actions are processes, and that there are philosophical advantages to this view. Yet, others take actions to be something else altogether. This section explains what this dispute is about, and explores some of its implications for other ontological debates such as the individuation of action. It then considers further important questions about the metaphysics of action, such as whether there must be basic actions, and whether Action constitutes a unified category.

5.1 Events, processes, and more

There are several reasons to categorize actions as events. A central one concerns their connection to causation (Davidson 1967a; Goldman 1970). Actions are directly implicated in causal relations: modifying Davidson’s example (pp.4–5), the burglar’s entering my house might cause me to turn on the light, which in turn might cause him to be startled. On the widespread assumption that events are the primary causal relata, it would follow that actions, such as my turning on of the light, are events.

Another argument for the event view is that it explains common inference patterns. As Davidson (1967b) noted, sentences attributing actions to agents admit of adjectival drop. Thus, a sentence like (3) entails (4), which in turn entails (5):

Donald buttered the toast in the bathroom at 12am.
Donald buttered the toast in the bathroom.
Donald buttered the toast.

Davidson suggested that the best way to account for these inferential relations is to assume that at the level of logical form these sentences quantify over events. So understood, the logical form of (3)–(5) would be as follows:[6]

\(\exists x(\textrm{Buttering}(x) \amp \textrm{By}(x, \textrm{Donald}) \amp \textrm{Object}(x, \textrm{toast})\ \amp \) \(\textrm{Location}(x, \textrm{bathroom}) \amp \textrm{Time}(x, \textrm{12am}))\)
\(\exists x(\textrm{Buttering}(x) \amp \textrm{By}(x, \textrm{Donald}) \amp \textrm{Object}(x, \textrm{toast})\ \amp\) \(\textrm{Location}(x, \textrm{bathroom}))\)
\(\exists x(\textrm{Buttering}(x) \amp \textrm{By}(x, \textrm{Donald}) \amp \textrm{Object}(x, \textrm{toast}))\)

The entailment relations are then easily explained through the classical rules for conjunction and existential quantification. This analysis, which has been highly influential in formal semantics, appears to entail that actions are events, entities with a spatiotemporal location (since they admit of spatiotemporal modifiers), that possess the properties denoted by adverbial modifiers (such as who was engaged in them, or what the object of the action was).

Finally, perhaps the most straightforward reason to hold that actions are events, is that this fits naturally with the way we speak about them. For instance, we say, “The event we observed last night turned out to be a theft”, or “The murder of that woman was a sad event”.

Against this view, a number of scholars have recently argued that actions (in the sense of concern for philosophy of action) are instead processes (Mourelatos 1978; Stout 1997; Hornsby 2012; Steward 2012; Charles 2018). To understand this claim, we first need to explain what the distinction amounts to. We can introduce it at an intuitive level in terms of the aspectual distinction between the following two sentences:

Donald is buttering the toast.
Donald has buttered the toast.

(6) refers to an ongoing occurrence in the midst of development. As such, many of its properties are still indeterminate and may change over time. It may be happening in the bathroom in a matter of seconds if Donald stays there; but he could take a break, forget about it, and continue on with it several minutes later in the kitchen. Moreover, the manner in which it takes place can change as it occurs: it may speed up (if Donald is suddenly in a hurry) or slow down (if Donald is distracted by a noise), and he may start doing it more mindfully, or distractedly. Indeed, however Donald is doing the buttering, it may happen that he never ends up having buttered the toast (a nearby scream might cause him to drop it in the toilet halfway through). This is sometimes called the “imperfective paradox”: in general, ⌜x is φ-ing⌝ does not entail ⌜x has φ’d⌝. By contrast, the event itself, denoted by (7), cannot speed up or slow down, nor change the manner in which it is done, since it is already complete. This is why it has a determinate temporal-spatial location in terms of which some have sought to individuate it (Lemmon 1967; Quine 1985; Davidson 1985). By contrast, processes do not have an essential temporal-spatial location: the same process of buttering that is now taking place at 12:01 could culminate in a minute or in an hour.

The most straightforward reason to think that actions are processes is that actions appear to have these properties, as is indicated by the examples used in the previous paragraph (Stout 1997; Steward 2012; Charles 2015; 2018). Thus, one’s action can speed up or slow down, be done in one way or another at different times in its history, and may culminate at different times. Indeed, an ongoing action may never be completed.

The connection between imperfective aspect and processes provides further impetus for the view that actions are processes (the argument to follow is based on Michael Thompson’s ideas (2008, 122–30), though he rejects the view that actions are processes, understood as particulars (pp.134–7)). After all, it seems essential to actions that they can enter into rationalizing explanations (Anscombe 1957; Thompson 2008; Wiland 2013; Ford 2015; 2017), and such explanations can easily be given in imperfective language. To see this, consider again Anscombe’s case of a man who operates a lever to pump poisoned water to a house, with the plan of killing the inhabitants (Anscombe 1957, §23). We could represent his thoughts as follows: “I am moving the lever up and down because I am pumping water to the house because I am poisoning its inhabitants.” Indeed, such formulations seem to express canonical answers to Anscombe’s special question “Why?” (Thompson 2008; Wiland 2013; Ford 2015). However, we cannot capture the same thoughts without imperfective expressions (Thompson 2008). The train of thought that goes, “I have moved the lever up and down because I have pumped the water because I have poisoned the inhabitants of the house” makes it sound like the man is acting on a conditional promise to move the lever if the men are killed by his hand. This suggests that whereas processes can directly enter into the kinds of rationalizing explanations definitive of intentional action, events cannot (except, perhaps, derivatively), which in turn suggests that actions are processes.

Finally, it has been suggested that the process view can better accommodate the type of direct guidance that Frankfurt identified as essential to intentional action (see above, section 2.4). It seems attractive to explain the nature of this direct guidance in terms of how substances in general cause changes by engaging in certain processes (Hornsby 2012), or in terms of the different ways in which an agent can manifest her agency in a process (slower, faster, more or less skillfully) (Charles 2018). And, as Steward (2012) suggests, this might give a substantial role to the agent in the explanation of action. By contrast, since events have settled natures and spatial-temporal properties, it seems that the agent can at best interact with them in the indirect way in which she interacts with other objects, such as a car.

It is only recently that an alternative to the event view has been clearly formulated and defended. As such, much work remains to be done in this area, and even among defenders of the process view there are important disagreements. One important disagreement is over whether processes are particulars (Galton 2006; Steward 2012; Charles 2018) or not (Stout 1997; Crowther 2011; Hornsby 2012; Crowther 2018; cf. Thompson 2008). Another disagreement is about whether a unique thing is a process and an event (at different times) (Steward 2012; Charles 2018), or whether the process and the event are distinct things (Stout 1997; Crowther 2011; Hornsby 2012; Charles 2015; Crowther 2018).

Regardless of how these questions are answered, a remaining challenge is to explain the unity between processes and events, the fact that there is a non-accidental connection between the process of buttering, and the event of one’s having buttered the toast that results if the action is successful (Haase 2022). Moreover, it is worth noting that although the process-view is the most important alternative available to the events-view, other proposals have been advanced recently, including the view that actions are thoughts (Rödl 2007; 2011; Marcus 2012; Valaris 2020). For example, Marcus holds that to act intentionally just is to judge that the action is to be done.

5.2 The Individuation of Action

The example of the pumper displays another important Anscombean thesis (endorsed by Davidson, see section 2.2 above): that a single event can instantiate different properties in terms of which it can be described. Thus, the same action is at once a moving of the hands, a pumping of water, and a poisoning. This was important for Anscombe because she held that actions are intentional only under some descriptions: for instance, even if the pumper’s energetic moves scare a nearby squirrel, the action would not be intentional under the description scaring of a squirrel.

The most influential alternative to this “coarse-grained” account is a “fine-grained” account that individuates actions (and events, more generally) in terms of their properties (Kim 1966; 1969; 1973; 1976; Goldman 1970). On this view, A and B are the same action just in case A has all and only the properties that B has; and for each set of such properties, there is an event. Since moving one’s hands, pumping water, and poisoning are distinct properties, this view entails that the pumper’s moving of his hands, his pumping of the water, and his poisoning of the inhabitants are distinct actions.

Anscombe complained that treating these as different actions would be like treating the author of David Copperfield and the author of Bleak House as different men, rather than a single author, Dickens (Anscombe 1979, 222). Indeed, the fine-grained view has similar counterintuitive implications. Consider: the properties of pumping water, pumping water while smiling, and pumping water at noon, are all different properties. So, the man who pumped water at noon while smiling would have engaged in three different pumpings according to the fine-grained view.

Moreover, the view threatens to undermine some basic inferences we are inclined to make about actions (Katz 1978). For instance, it seems obvious that from:

The table in the room is brown.

We can infer:

The table in the room = the brown table.

But, similarly, it seems that from:

The man’s pumping occurred at noon.

We can infer:

The man’s pumping = The man’s pumping at noon.

However, on the fine-grained view the inference to (11) is invalid since the two descriptions in (11) must refer to distinct events. Hence the defender of the fine-grained view is forced to reject a seemingly innocuous inference pattern.

These are serious problems, and it is not clear that defenders of the fine-grained view can do more than bite the bullets. However, it has been argued that the coarse-grained account has similarly counterintuitive implications (Goldman 1970; Thomson 1971). To see why, consider the following two sentences (true of the imagined pumper):

The man moved his hands before he poisoned the inhabitants.
The man caused the poisoning of the inhabitants by moving his hands.

We can paraphrase them using gerundival expressions as follows:

The man’s moving of his hands happened before the poisoning of the inhabitants.
The man’s moving of his hands caused the poisoning of the inhabitants.

Now, suppose we assume the claim that:

The man’s moving of his hands = the man’s poisoning of the inhabitants.

Then, by substitution, we arrive at the absurd:

The man’s moving of his hands happened before the man’s moving of his hands.
The man’s moving of his hands caused his moving of his hands.

It is natural to think that (14) is the culprit; but to hold that claims such as (14) are false seems to amount to rejecting the coarse-grained view of action individuation.

One possible response would be to hold that the contexts ⌜φ happens* before ψ⌝ and ⌜φ causes* ψ⌝ (the * marks tenselessness) are intensional in the φ and ψ positions (Anscombe 1969). If so, substitution of co-referents may change truth value in these contexts. Alternatively, one could attempt to explain these results pragmatically: the sentences sound odd in the same way as it sounds odd to say that “a man married his widow’, even though it is true (the man married her before she was a widow, of course!) (cf. Anscombe 1979). However, these are controversial semantic theses (for further intensionalist treatments, see Achinstein 1975; McDermott 1995; Wasserman 2004; for extensionalist treatments, see e.g., Davidson 1967a; Strawson 1985; Rosenberg and Martin 1979; Schaffer 2005; for an excellent review of research on causal contexts more generally, including pragmatic effects, see Swanson 2012).

A different response is suggested by the view that actions are processes. That view enables us to treat action descriptions as sometimes characterizing the different stages of the action (cf. Russell 2018). Then, appealing to Anscombe’s insight that we should treat claims about actions in parallel with claims about persons, we could say that the moving of one’s hands precedes and causes the poisoning in an analogous way as the acorn precedes and causes the oak. But just as there is a single organism in the latter case, there is a single action in the former, even though it seems at best paradoxical to say that I caused myself to exist, or that the oak caused the acorn.

Finally, the coarse- and fine-grained views obviously do not exhaust the conceptual landscape. A number of philosophers have offered individuation principles stricter than those advanced by coarse-grained theorists, but laxer than those advanced by fine-grained theorists (e.g. Ginet 1990). Charles (1984), for example, argues that Aristotle would individuate actions in terms of capacities. This allows us to say that the moving of one’s hands is the same action as the moving of one’s hands quickly (since a single capacity is thereby actualized), even though it is a different action from the poisoning, which actualizes a different set of capacities. The challenge for this view is to provide an account of the individuation of capacities independent of the account of the individuation of actions.

5.3 The Debate Over Basic Action

Consideration of cases like that of the pumper naturally raises a question about their structure: what kind of shape could such a rationalizing explanation take? Could it go on forever? To answer this, consider the pumper once more, and suppose he poisons the inhabitants of the house. It is true, then, that he poisoned the inhabitants of the house by pumping water, and he did this by moving his hands. Because the poisoning and the pumping are done by doing something else, they are called ”non-basic“ actions. However, it has been argued that there must be at least some actions that are ”basic’“, done not by doing anything else. Otherwise, we appear to be caught in various forms of a vicious regress.

For example, if to do A one must do B, and to do B one must do C, and so on ad infinitum, doing anything would seem to require doing an infinite number of things. More worrying, the beginning of action seems to be ”logically out of reach“ for the agent, since there is always something else that she would have to do before she begins to do anything (Danto 1979, 471). Again, it seems that for an agent to know what she is currently doing, she needs to know how to do the things by which she does it; but unless there is something that she can know how to do just by doing it, it will be impossible for her to know what she is doing at all (Hornsby 2013).

Arguments of this sort convinced most scholars that there must be basic actions (though see Baier 1971 and Sneddon 2001 for early dissent). The debate then centered on which actions are basic. Many scholars held that simple bodily movements, like moving a finger or raising an eyebrow, were basic, while others held that they could be more complex (tying one’s shoes), or that they must be simpler: perhaps only mental actions, or tryings were basic. After all, I move my finger by attempting to move it; and we need to distinguish between the attempt and the movement, since sometimes the attempt occurs without the movement (e.g. if my fingers are suddenly paralized) (Prichard 1945: Hornsby 1980; O’Shaughnessy 1980; see Cleveland 1997, ch.5 for criticism).

As several scholars have noted, part of what is at issue in this debate are different notions of basicness, corresponding to different understandings of the clause ”by doing something else“ (Baier 1971; Annas 1978; Hornsby 1980). It is common to draw a three-fold distinction: (i) know-how basicness; (ii) causal basicness; and (iii) teleological basicness. An action is know-how basic iff there is no other (type of) action by which the agent knows how to do the one in question. An action is causally basic iff there is no other (token) action that causes it. An action is teleologically basic iff there is no other (token) action by means of which the agent does it. To illustrate in a way that highlights the differences, consider pitching a baseball. Arguably, this action is know-how basic, since the pitcher may not know a more basic action by which to do it: of course, the agent may know how to move her hands independently, but she may be unable to move her hands in the particular way in which she does when she throws the baseball unless she were actually throwing the baseball. Whether the action is causally basic depends on whether we think there is another action that causes it, such as the pitcher’s moving of his hands. Finally, and independently of the question of causation, the action appears to be teleologically non-basic, since the moving of his hands is certainly both a means and an action by which the pitcher pitches. The consensus for many years was that there must be basic actions in all three senses.

However, this widespread consensus about teleological basicness has recently been called into question by Michael Thompson and other defenders of ”naive“ action theory (Thompson 2008, 107–119). Thompson considers the case of a person, P, who has pushed a stone from point α to ω. Let β be the halfway point between α and ω. It seems that if P pushed the stone from α to ω intentionally, then he pushed the stone from α to β intentionally. Now, let γ be the halfway point between α and β. Once again, it seems that P pushed the stone from α to γ intentionally. And so on. It seems, then, that there will always be a further action by which P pushed the stone. In other words, there is no basic action. Moreover, as a number of authors have noted (Small 2012; Lavin 2013), the argument can be generalized for virtually every action, since it can be presented in terms of a series of time-segments (instead of place-segments), and virtually every action takes place over time. (For critical discussion, see Ford 2018.)

Building on this argument, Lavin (2013) presents a further challenge to the view that there must be (teleological) basic action. Lavin’s argument centers on the relation of the agent to her actions. Consider first a non-basic action, like poisoning the inhabitants of the house. The agent’s relation to this action is itself an agential matter, since the agent poisons the inhabitants by doing something else intentionally (operating the pump). Now consider an arbitrary basic action, A. By definition, the agent doesn’t do A by doing anything else. However, this is an action that occurs through time, so, presumably there are happenings h1, h2, …, hn by which A takes place. But since h1, h2, …, hn are mere happenings, this means that the agent relates to A non-agentially. Now, Lavin grants that it may be possible sometimes for us to relate to our actions non-agentially; but it would be alarming if this was necessarily the case, as defenders of basic action are committed to hold. It would mean that agents are necessarily alienated from their actions, in the way labourers are alienated from their labour in Marx’s critique of capitalism. In turn, Lavin argues that this would make it impossible for agents to have self-knowledge of their own actions, since self-knowledge is grounded on our agential relation.

There is a growing literature responding to Thompson’s and Lavin’s challenges, both refining the arguments, or presenting objections to it (Setiya 2012; Hornsby 2013; Lynch 2017; Frost 2019; Small 2019). This is not surprising, since the debate about basic actions has important repercussions for other questions about the nature of intentional action. For example, Lavin (2013) holds that defenders of (teleologically) basic action are committed to a ”decompositional account“ of agency (see section 1). After all, if there are basic actions, we may be able to give an account of what makes something an action in terms of the non-agential relation an agent bears to her basic actions. Moreover, Ford (2017; 2018) notes that Thompson’s argument suggests a novel way to pursue action theory, one that defines action not in terms of reasons for action but, in the first instance, in terms of the means by which an action is pursued.The latter, Ford holds, better captures the agential perspective: in the context of deliberation, what the agent asks is How to pursue a particular course of action, rather than Why she is doing something. Finally, the debate may have repercussions for our understanding of the relation between skill and intentional action. For example, both Frost and Small suggest that at the most fundamental level, our agency depends on our exercise of practical skills by which we enter an instrumental order without consciously representing that order at the level of propositional thought (Small 2012; 2019; Frost 2019).

5.4 Making, Acting, and the Varieties of Agency

Nearly all contemporary philosophers treat intentional action as a unified category. Despite the many differences between moving a finger, running, hammering a nail, fixing a fridge, eating a sandwich, acting justly, keeping a promise, and marrying someone, all of these are treated as equally belonging to a single type: acting. The assumption is supported by natural language. After all, these are all legitimate answers to the question ”What are you doing?’.

Aristotle provides us with an alternative view that has had immense influence in philosophy. Throughout his writings, Aristotle distinguishes between “making” or “producing” (poíêsis) on the one hand, and “acting proper” (praxis) on the other (an early version of the distinction appears in Plato’s Charmides 163a–c). The two are distinguished by their success conditions (EE 5.2/NE 6.2 1139b1–4; EE 5.5/NE 6.5 1140b6–7). The success conditions for makings are external to them: one succeeds at making insofar as something external to the making obtains (the product). By contrast, the success conditions for proper actions are the actions themselves. This is why we pursue them for their own sake (ib.). By this standard, the activities of hammering a nail, or fixing a fridge count as makings, because the hammering is successful insofar as something external takes place: a nail is hammered in a wall, or a fridge is fixed. Precisely because the success conditions are external, it is possible to succeed at making something by luck (EE 5.4/NE 6.4 1140a17–20). By contrast, Aristotle would regard acting justly, keeping a promise, or marrying someone as proper actions. To succeed at these actions consists in doing the actions well. A coerced marriage is not a successful marriage. Hence, these actions cannot be done by luck. This distinction underlies the aforementioned distinction between two forms of human excellence in the practical sphere: skill (technê) is excellence at making (EE 5.4; NE 6.4 1140a6–23), and practical wisdom (phronêsis) is excellence at acting proper (EE 5.5/ NE 6.5 1140a25–30 et passim).

Although the distinction is barely mentioned in analytical philosophy, it has influenced other traditions, such as the Marxist one. From his earliest writings, Marx accepts an Aristotelian threefold analysis of labour in terms of the labourer, the process of labouring, and its product. Marx implicitly rejects the distinction between action proper and production, in favour of a dichotomy of his own between different forms of productions. This is because for Marx the characteristic activity of the human species is conscious free labouring: an activity that has no end beyond itself (it does not seek anything beyond the living activity that such labouring consists in) (Marx 1844a; 1844b; 1867). This is what Aristotle took as the distinguishing feature of proper actions, done for their own sake. One of Marx’s central criticisms of capitalist societies is that it prevents humans from engaging in such an activity. In capitalist societies, the labourer, the labour process, and the product all become commodities that serve as mere means for the enjoyment of the owner of labour and product (“the capitalist”). Members of capitalist societies are, in this sense, alienated (Marx 1844b; 1867). As such, capitalist societies make it impossible for humans to engage in their most fundamental life activity of free production, an activity that the Marxist tradition came to designate as “praxis” (Petrovic 1983), reappropriating the quite different Aristotelian notion.

Perhaps the most influential modern version of a distinction among types of practical activity is drawn by Arendt (1998). Arendt distinguishes between three kinds of practical activities: labour, work, and action. The most basic of these is labour, which Arendt conceives as simply an extension of our animal lives: a “metabolism” (Marx’s phrase) between the human animal and the world, characterized by a cycle of consumption and the production of goods to be consumed, and aiming at meeting our basic biological needs (p.69). Since this is a cycle, Arendt suggests that there is no sense of speaking here of means and ends: there is no fact of the matter as to whether the production of goods is for the sake of consumption, or the consumption for the sake of production (p.145; 155). Means and ends enter at the next level of practical activity, work (the Aristotelian poíêsis). Like Aristotle, Arendt takes the aim of working to be the finished work, the product, whether it be a work of art, like a painting, a tool, like a knife, or a way to safeguard living, like a house. The central importance of work lies in its ability to produce lasting products that lie beyond the activity of the producer (p.136; 144). Arendt contends that these products can begin to shape an objective world of objects that stands against the humans who produce them. However, the world does not emerge in its fullness except by way of the third level of practical activity, action (the Aristotelian praxis). Action is the means by which humans reveal themselves in the public sphere, a revelation needed to give reality to a personality that otherwise remains entirely unactualized in subjectivity. It is thus essentially communicative, and depends on other humans to whom one might make herself known (pp.38–49; 95; 202–7); and it depends, given its essential ephemeral nature, for its permanence in the continued existence of a polity that may preserve words and deeds in more enduring forms, like sculptures and tales. Ungoverned by either the natural laws of labor, or by the norms arising from a particular aim, action is for Arendt unproductive, free, and unpredictable. It is the distinguishing activity of human beings as such (p.177; 204–6).

The three-fold distinction serves as the basis for Arendt’s criticisms of both ancient writers, including Aristotle, and modern writers, including Marx. She criticizes Aristotle both for inconsistently assimilating action too much to work/production in his analysis of benefaction as producing a work (ergon) (p.196), and for subordinating it to theory (22–23). She criticizes Marx’s subsumption of practical activity in general under labour for its failure to provide meaning. She notes that Marx ends in the paradoxical position of concluding that that the aim of labour is freedom from labour, even though this is the activity he takes as definitive of humanity. In other words, Marx ends up concluding that the aim of human life is to do away with human life (p.89; 103; 105). For Arendt, however, this is not merely a theoretical deficiency, but a manifestation of a broader social tendency that goes back to Plato: the tendency to try to make action proper into that which is not—whether work or labour—to control what is essentially unpredictable and free.

The problems of subsuming practical activity in general to making find echoes in some contemporary thinkers. For example, Thompson (2008), following Baier (1970) and Mueller (1979), criticizes attempts like Castañeda’s (1970) and Chisholm’s (1970) of construing actions in terms of a schemas such as ‘bringing it about that p’; such propositional complexes, according to critics, threaten to undermine the practical form of the thought they mean to capture (cf. Hornsby 2016, Wilson 1980, pp.111–117 for further discussion). Arendt herself thought that this tendency underlay the attraction of utilitarianism, but she argued that, like Marxism, that view was incapable of ever giving further meaning to our practical endeavours (p.105). Korsgaard concludes with equal severity that given a distinction between praxis and poíêsis, “utilitarianism is not a moral theory, for utility is a property of [productions], not actions” (2009, p.18n26).

Regardless of what one thinks of these arguments, it is evident that the question whether practical activity comes in varieties, as Aristotle and Arendt thought, is potentially of enormous significance.

6. Constitutive Aim

The question of what, if anything, is the constitutive (or formal) aim (or end) of intentional actions is a question about whether there is anything that all actions necessarily pursue, irrespective of their particular ends. Some philosophers (Setiya 2016b) deny that there is a constitutive aim of acting or that there is something that every action as such aims at. On this view, there is no such thing as an aim contained in acting as such; each action just aims at its particular end. On the other hand, many philosophers try to derive important consequences for ethics from the idea that action or agency has a constitutive aim. However, we will leave aside the examinations of these claims and focus only on the question as it pertains to the characterization of agency. (Cf. Bagnoli 2017; 2022.)

6.1 Motivations and Different Versions of the View

What could motivate the idea that actions have a constitutive aim above and beyond the particular ends they pursue? An important consideration is that, arguably, only by appealing to a constitutive aim, can we evaluate actions and have a proper standard of practical reason. Much in the same way that the aim of belief (generally thought to be “truth” or “knowledge”) might provide a standard for theoretical reasoning and correct belief, a constitutive aim of action would provide a standard for practical reasoning and successful action. More specifically, it seems that some actions are successful in achieving their particular ends and yet are cases of practical failures in some deeper way, exhibiting what appears like practical irrationality or at least some form of practical ignorance. Suppose I have dreamt all my life to move to Seattle, and I finally secured a position in the city. However, as I arrive in Seattle and try to arrange my life, my life in Seattle is a great disappointment; even though there is nothing important that I found out about Seattle that I didn’t know already, I completely regret having pursued this end. Although I achieved my aim of moving to Seattle, my actions seem to have failed in an important way; arguably, I manifested my agency in a defective way.

Of course, one can explain my disappointment in many ways that do not seem to presuppose a constitutive aim of action: there were other ends that I had that conflict with moving to Seattle and I hadn’t fully appreciated this beforehand. Perhaps I no longer care about the things that made me want to move to Seattle; moving to Seattle was a means to ends I had abandoned and didn’t realize that it made no longer sense to pursue this end. But it is unclear that these observations will suffice; it seems that none of this might have happened and yet my move to Seattle was still a practical failure.

Let us take a concrete example: suppose the constitutive aim of action is happiness (see Frey 2019 for an argument that this is a view held by Aquinas). On this view, then, every action (directly or indirectly) aims at happiness, and the realization of an end that does not result in happiness is a shortcoming of my agency. Therefore, if my going to Seattle did not contribute to my happiness, or if, worse, it contributed to undermining it, then it was a defective case of agency. This failure is often thought to parallel the kind of internal failure involved in false beliefs: such beliefs supposedly fail to meet a standard internal to theoretical cognition.

Another, related, way to motivate the idea that action has a constitutive aim focuses on the standpoint of deliberation. When deliberating about what to do, it seems that I need to find an answer to the question “what to do” or “whether to φ” (Hieronymi 2005; 2006; Shah 2008); in the good case, my action expresses an adequate answer to this question. But how could I go about answering these questions if action did not have a constitutive aim; if there’s nothing that could count as the correct way of answering this question? Similarly, from the point of view of action explanation, some answers seem to provide an intelligible explanation of action while others seem to invite the question “but why would you aim at (want) that?” If you ask me “Why are we eating the jello?”, “Because it is blue” seems to invite further questions, while “Because I find the taste pleasant” brings the inquiry to an end. Anscombe argues that the search for further explanations ends when we hit a “desirability characterization”, something that is not just conceived as good but “really … one of the many forms of the good” (Anscombe 1957, §40).

There seems to be a parallel structure in the case of belief: in deliberating about what to believe, it seems that I must be similarly guided by an ideal of correct belief (Shah and Velleman 2006). In fact, philosophers who accept that there is a constitutive aim of action often compare action and belief (Velleman 1992; 1996; Tenenbaum 2007; 2012; 2018b; Schafer 2013). Belief is supposed to have truth as its constitutive aim, and just as belief is held, at least in the good case, in accordance with this constitutive aim (as Hume 1748 said, “a wise man … proportions his belief to the evidence”), intentional agency is guided by its constitutive aim.

There are various proposals of what the constitutive aim of an action might be. Perhaps the most traditional version of this view is the idea that the good is the constitutive aim of agency, possibly going back to Socrates (Protagoras 351a–8e; Gorgias 467c–8d). The notion of “good” involved here can be very thin, meaning no more than “considering matters aright” (Williams 1981) in the realm of practical reason; such views are versions of the thesis often called “the guise of the good” (Tenenbaum 2007; Clark 2010; Schafer 2013). According to the guise of the good, if I φ intentionally, then I must take φ-ing to be good. Arguably some other versions of the constitutive aim of agency are specifications of the thin notion of “good” or “human good” (see Boyle and Lavin 2010). Other constitutive aims that have been defended in literature are self-understanding or autonomy (Velleman 1989; 1992; 1996; 2009), self-constitution (Korsgaard 1996; 2008; 2009), and the will to power (Katsafanas 2013).

6.2 Objections

A number of challenges have been raised in the literature to the claim that there must be a constitutive aim of action. First, suppose we accept the causal theory of action: an intentional action just is the effect of a “primary reason”. On such a view, it seems that an intentional action is constituted by its causal antecedents, rather than by a necessary aim that one has in acting. However, causal theories are not incompatible with constitutivism. Since on these views, some of the causal antecedents of the action will be conative states (like an intention), the question of whether intentional action has a constitutive aim will depend on whether the conative state has a constitutive aim or whether a specific conative state must always figure on the genesis of intentional action. For instance, in Velleman’s early work (for instance, Velleman 1989), intentional action was an action that was caused by a desire for self-knowledge, and the content of such a desire was thus the constitutive aim of agency. Smith (2013; 2015; 2019) also develops a form of constitutivism that endorses the standard story of action.

Setiya raises a couple of important challenges to the idea that action has a constitutive aim. According to Setiya (2007), any theory of action needs to account for the fact that practical knowledge (or a belief condition in his version; see section 4 of this entry) is essential to intentional action. However, the belief condition seems to be conceptually independent of any constitutive aim of action, and thus accepting that both are constitutive of intentional action amounts to postulating an unexplained necessary connection.

Secondly, Setiya (2010) relies on the distinction between an explanatory reason and a normative reason to argue against the “guise of the good” (see Alvarez 2017 for a detailed account of the distinction); his argument there could be extended to other proposals for the constitutive aim of action. An intentional action is an action done for an explanatory reason, namely, a reason that explains why the agent acted as she did, in Anscombe’s special sense of the question ‘Why’. However, Setiya points out that an explanatory reason need not be a normative reason; in fact, any reason that the agent believes to be her reason to act can be an explanatory reason, even if the object of such a reason is not good in any way. But since the reasons that explain intentional action need not be good in any way, it seems false that the agent must act only on reasons that she regards to be good in some way, and thus that she aims at the good in acting.

Philosophers have tried to answer these challenges. One can argue that a knowledge or belief condition, to the extent that it is valid, is explained by the constitutive aim of action. Moreover, perhaps the possibility of a third-person explanation of an action in terms of explanatory reasons whose objects are not good in any way is compatible with the fact that from the first-person point of view, these objects must have been regarded to be good in some way. So even if the fact that Rugen kills his father explains why Inigo Montoya killed Rugen without providing a normative reason for it, it still might be the case that avenging his father must have appeared good to Inigo Montoya in some way if he killed Rugen intentionally (see Tenenbaum 2012).

Another well-known challenge to the idea that actions have a constitutive aim is David Enoch’s “schmagency” objection (Enoch 2006; 2011); in this context, the objection raises the possibility that for any purported constitutive aim, one could spurn such an aim and merely “schmact” or be a mere “schmagent”—someone who behaves just like an agent except for having the constitutive aim of agency. Enoch’s objection, however, is specifically concerned with attempts to derive normative consequences from the constitutive aim of action (for further discussion, see Bagnoli 2017; 2022).

7. Omission

7.1 Different Ways of Not Acting

The scope of our inactivity is vast; at each moment, there are many things I don’t do. Right now, I am not competing in the Olympics, not writing poetry, not swimming in the English Channel, not flying over the moon, or taking a journey to the center of the earth. However, none of the things could be plausibly described as cases of omissions or refrainings; it would be odd if I were told that I was refraining from competing in the Olympics or omitting to fly over the moon. Philosophers often describe cases of omissions as cases of my failing to do something that I was somehow “supposed to do” (Bach 2010). Only some of my omissions are intentional or even voluntary: if my alarm does not go off and I miss my class because I overslept, I omitted to teach but not intentionally. On the other hand, if I fail to show up because I am protesting my university’s salary cuts, my omission was intentional. Intentional omissions and (intentional) refrainings are generally taken to be the only possible candidates for being instances of agency among not-doings (see Vermazen 1985 for an expression of this idea). Thus, we will focus on these cases. The categories of intentional omissions and refraining are not necessarily identical. If I refrain from striking my opponent in a fit of anger, it seems wrong to say that I omitted to strike her as there is no sense in which I was “supposed to” strike my opponent.

7.2 Agency, Omissions, and Refrainings

Suppose all the Faculty at State University are upset about the recently announced cuts, and each of them express their dissatisfaction but in different ways: Mary wears a T-shirt that says “No More Cuts”, Terry writes a letter to the local paper, and Larry simply decides not to go to the department’s holiday party. It seems that in all these cases, the Faculty members are manifesting their agency—they are all equally expressing their dissatisfaction with the cuts—even if Larry does so by (intentionally) not doing something. Such cases of refrainings and intentional omissions seem paradigmatic instances of agency and yet they do not seem to be cases of action: after all, the agent did nothing. But how could the absence of an action be a manifestation of agency? One might be tempted to avoid any puzzling conclusions by simply denying that omissions are absences; by, for instance, proposing that Larry’s intentional omission consists in doing whatever acting he did instead of engaging in the omitted action. So if he goes to the bar instead of going to the holiday party, Larry omits to go to the party by going to the bar and so his going to the bar and his omitting to go to the party are the same event. However, this view immediately encounters difficulties as it seems that I can intentionally omit to do things without engaging in any positive act. I can refrain from laughing at my enemy’s jokes just by staying still and I can intentionally omit things even while asleep (Clarke 2014): indeed, instead of going to the bar, Larry could have omitted to go to the party by simply sleeping through it.

Early attempts to explain how an agent might intentionally not do something, without claiming that intentional omissions and refraining are actions, go back at least to Ryle (1973); Ryle argues that negative “actions” are not actions, but what he calls “lines of actions’, a category that also includes general policies such as ”Take only cold baths“. More recently, Alvarez (2013) argues that the fact that omissions and refrainings can also manifest agency is a consequence of the fact that the power to act (intentionally) is a two-way power: a power to either do or not do something. Thus, when I refrain from driving my car, I manifest my agency not by engaging in an action, but rather by settling on not driving it (See Steward 2012; 2020 for further defense of the idea of agency as a two-way power).

7.3 Intentional Omissions and the Causal Theory of Action

If we accept that omissions are absences, or at least that they are not events, the possibility of intentional omissions seem to present a challenge to the causal theory of action. After all, if agency can be manifested without any events being present, it is difficult to see how agency can be explained in the terms of the standard story of action (that is, in terms of the causal history of the bodily movements that manifest our agency). Hornsby (2004) argues that the failure of the standard causal theory to account for omissions is symptomatic of its more general failure to locate the agent in an account of intentional action that reduces agency to causal connections between non-agential happenings.

There are at least two ways in which causal theorists try to answer these charges. One possibility is to argue that even though intentional omissions are absences, what makes them intentional is that facts about their causal history are analogous to the facts about causal history that make ”positive actions“ instances of agency (Clarke 2010; 2014). On this view, just as positive actions are caused by an intention, intentional omissions are cases in which the non-obtaining of a certain event is similarly explained by an intention. However, Sartorio (2009) argues that intentional omissions pose a serious challenge even to this broader understanding of the standard causal theory of action. Sartorio argues that intentional omissions are often not best explained by other events (such as the formation of an intention), but by the non-occurrence of certain events (the best explanation of why I omitted to help my friend move might be that I omitted to form the intention to help them, rather than that I did form the intention not to help them). Another strategy to make omissions compatible with the standard causal theory is to try to show that omissions are events, while avoiding the questionable view that the omission must be identified with what the agent intentionally did at the time of the omission (Payton 2021).

8. Animal Action

From the start, our focus has been on the intentional actions of fully developed rational agents. However, this raises the question: what about other beings, such as (non-human) animals? Can they act? If so, do they act in the same way as fully developed humans do? (Similar questions arise for children and robots, but our focus shall be on the growing literature on animal agency.)

At first sight, the question may seem uninteresting: Of course, animals can act! This seems to be a core commitment of our linguistic practices regarding animals, as we can truthfully assert claims like the following:

The cat is stealthily approaching the tree in order to hunt the bird.
Canela (a dog) wants you to give her a cookie—that’s why she is following you around.
The squirrel is digging in the yard because it thinks there are nuts there.

These sentences seem to attribute to animals the capacity to take means for remote ends, the capacity to desire objects and act in pursuit of these desires, and the capacity to employ their thoughts about their surroundings in the service of such pursuits. Unless we are skeptics about the folk-psychological concepts involved in these ascriptions, then, we should hold that animals are agents (but see Godfrey-Smith 2003, who holds that these folk concepts may be particularly problematic when applied to animals). It is not surprising, then, that Aristotle defined animal life in terms of the capacity for a type of action, movement in place (DA 432a), or that Kant attributes a faculty of desire to all animals, through which they actualize their representations (KpV9).

Despite all this, even Aristotle hedges on the ascription of action to animals: although he grants that they are capable of voluntary (hekusion) action (DMA 11, 703b2 et passim; NE 3.1, 1111a), he also says that only mature human beings are capable of action proper (praxis) (NE 3.1, 1111b). This is because action proper requires the capacity for deliberation, which animals lack. A modern version of this view is defended by Stoecker (2009), who argues that agency presupposes the capacity to act on the basis of ”arguments“ understood as grounds on which one might (reasonably) act. Similar reasons for skepticism about animal agency were influentially advanced by Davidson (1982; 2003). For, as we saw, Davidson takes it that intentional action is action for a reason; but acting for a reason requires possession of beliefs. Yet, Davidson held that ascription of belief makes sense only to beings who possess the concept of belief, which in turn requires the capacity for higher-order thought. Since Davidson assumed that animals possess neither concepts nor the capacity for higher-order thought, he concluded that animals are not capable of intentional action. (Davidson, to our knowledge, does not address the question whether animals are capable of acting simpliciter. However, he seems committed to saying that animals cannot act at all, given that he defines actions in terms of intentional actions: for him an action is an event that is intentional under a certain description, see Davidson 1971).

We can abstract from these considerations a more general form of argument for skepticism about animal agency, captured by the following schema:

  1. If A acts, A must possess features \(F_1, F_2, \ldots , F_n\). [Presuppositions for Agency Requirement]
  2. Animals don’t possess \(F_1, F_2, \ldots , F_n\). [Presuppositions Animals Lack]
  3. Therefore, animals do not act.

This schema is useful as a way to categorize sources of skepticism about animal agency, and different responses offered in the literature, depending on which premises are called into question.

A prominent way of criticizing the argument is to call premise 1 into question. For example, Steward (2009) criticizes Davidson’s view that agency requires the capacity to act for reasons (Premise 1 in Davidson’s argument). Her objection is based on empirical research suggesting that agency ascriptions are developmentally prior to propositional attitude ascriptions. She argues that implicit in these earlier ascriptions is a less demanding account of agency that presupposes more basic object-directed attitudes (as well as other capacities, such as subjectivity and agential control). Since animals possess these features, there is an important sense in which they act. Other arguments in a similar vein include Dretske’s (1999) argument to the effect that agency presupposes only the capacity for representing the world (understood, roughly, as a learned response whose operations are shaped by the environment through experience), and the idea defended by Korsgaard (2018), Sebo (2017), and Schapiro (2021) that animals act on the basis of simpler, perceptual-like, representations.

Other scholars grant the basic links between agency and reasons or means-ends reasoning but question further presuppositions of the argument. For example, some scholars grant that actions must be done for a reason, but hold that (some) animals meet this condition, since they are capable of having non-conceptual thoughts (Hurley 2003); they can engage in certain forms of inference in virtue of a non-linguistic sensitivity to inferential relations; and at least some of them (like chimpanzees) manifest a distinctive kind of sensitivity to reasons that doesn’t presuppose higher-order thought (Glock 2009; Arruda and Povinelli 2016). Using a similar strategy, Camp and Shupe (2017) grant that action presupposes the capacity to distinctively represent means and ends but argue that the features presupposed by such a capacity are more minimal than skeptics about animal agency assume: for example, they may include metacognitive resources that keep track of a state without representing it as such.

Finally, there are scholars who argue—largely based on empirical findings—against premise 2 on the grounds that animals possess the very capacities denied by skeptics of animal agency. For example, Kaufmann (2015) argues that chimpanzees are capable of a fairly sophisticated form of planning that meets the constraints of Bratman’s account of planning agency. They are thus capable of acting, even though they lack conceptual representations. The question whether some animals (and, if so, which) have beliefs has also been the subject of debate on the basis of empirical research. While both early and recent studies appeared to support the Davidsonian view that animals lack beliefs (Heyes and Dickinson 1990; Marticorena et al. 2011, Horschler, MacLean, and Santos 2020;), later research complicates the question (de Waal 2016; Krupenye et al. 2016).

Thus far, we have examined ways in which defenders of animal agency can play defense, by criticizing different parts of the argument for animal skepticism. When playing offense, defenders of animal agency commonly appeal to our common ways of speaking and thinking about animals, which, as noted, provide prima facie good grounds to ascribe them agency. In addition, it has been noted that the heightened conditions on agency commonly used to exclude animals would have counterintuitive effects for human actions. After all, many of our human intentional actions (such as habitual actions) do not seem to involve higher-order thought, or previous deliberation (a key insight that leads Hyman 2015 to distinguish different senses of ”acting’).

Moreover, several authors grant that full-fledged intentional human action is special, but argue that we must recognize a more basic form of agency for animals. (This appears to be the view favoured by Anscombe (1957), who held that animals could act intentionally, although not in the language-dependent way that humans could, where we can draw a significant distinction between the action itself and an expression of intention. See Gustafsson 2016; Marcus 2021). The need to recognize a more basic form of agency can be motivated by noting that otherwise the development of full-fledged human agency becomes developmentally mysterious, both at the inter- and intra-species level. Thus, unless we can ascribe agency to non-rational animals, it will be hard to explain how rational capacities might emerge in humans at the evolutionary level; and unless we ascribe agency to human infants, it will be hard to explain how conceptual capacities emerge (Cussins 1992; MacIntyre 1999; Lovibond 2006; Steward 2009; Fridland 2013).

In light of all these considerations, animal agency skepticism is nowadays a moribund view, with few defenders. However, even granting that animals are agents, important questions remain about the nature of this agency, and its connection to intentional or rational agency. Indeed, as scholars continue to investigate the topic in an empirically informed way, we may need to draw further distinctions to capture the richness of the forms of agency that are manifested across different species and stages of development in the animal kingdom.


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Both authors wish to thank Michael Kirley for his editorial assistance, research of special topics, and for several useful suggestions that improved this entry.

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