Practical Reason

First published Mon Oct 13, 2003; substantive revision Tue Jan 14, 2020

Practical reason is the general human capacity for resolving, through reflection, the question of what one is to do. Deliberation of this kind is practical in at least two senses. First, it is practical in its subject matter, insofar as it is concerned with action. But it is also practical in its consequences or its issue, insofar as reflection about action itself directly moves people to act. Our capacity for deliberative self-determination raises two sets of philosophical problems. First, there are questions about how deliberation can succeed in being practical in its issue. What do we need to assume—both about agents and about the processes of reasoning they engage in—to make sense of the fact that deliberative reflection can directly give rise to action? Can we do justice to this dimension of practical reason while preserving the idea that practical deliberation is genuinely a form of reasoning? Second, there are large issues concerning the content of the standards that are brought to bear in practical reasoning. Which norms for the assessment of action are binding on us as agents? Do these norms provide resources for critical reflection about our ends, or are they exclusively instrumental? Under what conditions do moral norms yield valid standards for reasoning about action? The first set of issues is addressed in sections 1–3 of the present article, while sections 4–5 cover the second set of issues.

1. Practical and Theoretical Reason

Practical reason defines a distinctive standpoint of reflection. When agents deliberate about action, they think about themselves and their situation in characteristic ways. What are some of the salient features of the practical point of view?

A natural way to interpret this point of view is to contrast it with the standpoint of theoretical reason. The latter standpoint is occupied when we engage in reasoning that is directed at the resolution of questions that are in some sense theoretical rather than practical; but how are we to understand this opposition between the theoretical and the practical? One possibility is to understand theoretical reflection as reasoning about questions of explanation and prediction. Looking backward to events that have already taken place, it asks why they have occurred; looking forward, it attempts to determine what is going to happen in the future. In these ways, theoretical reflection is concerned with matters of fact and their explanation. Furthermore it treats these issues in impersonal terms that are accessible (in principle) to anyone. Theoretical reasoning, understood along these lines, finds paradigmatic expression in the natural and social sciences.

Practical reason, by contrast, takes a distinctively normative question as its starting point. It typically asks, of a set of alternatives for action none of which has yet been performed, what one ought to do, or what it would be best to do. It is thus concerned not with matters of fact and their explanation, but with matters of value, of what it would be desirable to do. In practical reasoning agents attempt to assess and weigh their reasons for action, the considerations that speak for and against alternative courses of action that are open to them. Moreover they do this from a distinctively first-personal point of view, one that is defined in terms of a practical predicament in which they find themselves (either individually or collectively—people sometimes reason jointly about what they should do together).

There is, however, a different way of understanding the contrast between practical and theoretical reason, stressing the parallels rather than the differences between the two forms of reflection. According to this interpretation, theoretical reflection too is concerned with a normative rather than a factual question, namely with the question of what one ought to believe. It attempts to answer this normative question by assessing and weighing reasons for belief, the considerations that speak for and against the particular conclusions one might draw about the way the world is. Furthermore, it does this from a standpoint of first-personal reflection: the stance of theoretical reasoning in this sense is the committed stance of the believer, not the stance of detached contemplation of one’s beliefs themselves (Moran 2001). Seen in this way, the contrast between practical and theoretical reason is essentially a contrast between two different systems of norms: those for the regulation of action on the one hand, and those for the regulation of belief on the other.

Theoretical reason, interpreted along these lines, addresses the considerations that recommend accepting particular claims as to what is or is not the case. That is, it involves reflection with an eye to the truth of propositions, and the reasons for belief in which it deals are considerations that speak in favor of such propositions’ being true, or worthy of acceptance. Practical reason, by contrast, is concerned not with the truth of propositions but with the desirability or value of actions. The reasons in which it deals are considerations that speak in favor of particular actions being good, or worthy of performance in some way. This difference in subject matter corresponds to a further difference between the two forms of reason, in respect of their consequences. Theoretical reflection about what one ought to believe produces changes in one’s overall set of beliefs, whereas practical reason gives rise to action; as noted above, it is practical not only in its subject matter, but also in its issue.

Two observations should be made about this way of understanding practical reason. First, the contrast just drawn might suggest that there is a categorial difference in the consequences of theoretical and practical reason, insofar as the former produces changes in our mental states, whereas the latter gives rise to bodily movements. But it would be misleading to contrast the two kinds of rational capacity in these terms. Practical reasoning gives rise not to bodily movements per se, but to intentional actions, and these are intelligible as such only to the extent they reflect our mental states. It would thus be more accurate to characterize the issue of both theoretical and practical reason as attitudes; the difference is that theoretical reasoning leads to modifications of our beliefs, whereas practical reasoning leads to modifications of our intentions (Harman 1986, Bratman 1987).

Second, it is important to be clear that in neither case do the characteristic modifications of attitude occur infallibly. There is room for irrationality both in the theoretical and the practical domain, which in its strongest form involves a failure to form the attitudes that one acknowledges to be called for by the considerations one has reflected on. Thus a person might end up reading a mystery novel for another hour, while at the same time judging that it would be better on the whole to go back to work on their paper for the upcoming conference. Practical irrationality of this latter kind is known as akrasia, incontinence, or weakness of will, and its nature and even possibility are traditional subjects of philosophical speculation in their own right. If we assume that this strong kind of practical irrationality is possible, however, then we must grant that practical reason is not automatically practical in its issue. A more accurate way to represent the consequences of practical reason would be to say that deliberation about action generates appropriate intentions insofar as an agent is rational (Korsgaard 1996a).

Intentions and beliefs are not the only attitudes that are answerable to reasons; emotions too have their reasons, understood as considerations by reference to which they can be justified or criticized. Thus it is appropriate or fitting for someone who is in the presence of imminent danger to feel fear, and by the same token fear is inapt or irrational if it is felt about something that is not dangerous at all. Though emotions are responsive to reasons, however, we do not typically form or modify them through processes of reflection or deliberation. Reflective modification of our beliefs and intentions, by contrast, is common, and commonly understood to involve an exercise of our capacities for theoretical and practical reason.

Reasoning is an inferential process that takes as input some attitudes of a subject, and yields as output the formation or modification of other attitudes. Inferential processes of this kind are involved in the paradigmatic cases in which we exercise our capacities for both theoretical and practical reason. In the practical case, however, there is an interesting question about how exactly to understand the new or modified attitudes that are the outputs of our reasoning about what to do. On a broad understanding of practical reasoning, it is an inferential process through which new intentions are formed or old ones modified. According to this view, we resolve through reasoning the question of what we are going to do (Broome 2013, McHugh and Way 2016). A narrower understanding has it that reasoning should be understood as an inferential process whereby we modify our beliefs, including our normative beliefs about what we ought to do. On this interpretation, practical reasoning, strictly speaking, is an inferential process through which we adjust our beliefs about action, including our beliefs about what we have reason to do; but the adjustments in our intentions that result from such reflection are not themselves conclusions of reasoning (Raz 2011, chap. 7). Agents who have resolved the question of what they ought to do still have a question to settle, about what they are going to do. But proponents of the narrower view would note that this further question is not one that is to be resolved through reasoning: once one has figured out what one ought to do, there is no practical reasoning left to be done.

Proponents of both the broader and the narrower accounts of reasoning should agree, however, that there are rational constraints on intentions. The akratic agent, for instance, is a paradigm of irrationality, and this means that there is some kind of requirement to intend to do what one believes one ought to do (just as there are rational norms that are violated when one is afraid of something that one knows to pose no real danger at all). Our capacity for practical reason must involve some capacity to modify our intentions in accordance with this requirement, otherwise practical reason will be practical only in its subject matter, but not in its issue.

2. Naturalism and Normativity

The connection of practical reason with intentional action raises large questions about its credentials as a capacity for genuine reasoning. As noted above, intentional action is not mere bodily movement, but reflects a distinctive attitude of the agent’s, viz., intention. To be in this kind of mental state is to have settled on a plan which one seeks to realize through one’s action. Intention seems in this respect to be strikingly unlike belief. Propositional attitudes of the latter sort have a representational function; they aim to fit the way the world is, so that if one discovers that the world is not how one previously took it to be, one will acknowledge pressure to modify one’s belief in the relevant dimension (pressure to which one will respond if one is not irrational). With intentions however things seem crucially different in this respect (Smith 1987). The intention to go shopping on Wednesday, for instance, is not a state that would or should be abandoned upon ascertaining or confirming that one has not (yet) gone shopping on Wednesday; rather a person with such an intention will ordinarily try to bring the world into alignment with the intention, by going shopping when Wednesday comes around. Intentions are in this way more like an architect’s blueprints than like sketches of an already-completed structure (Anscombe 1957; compare Velleman 1989).

Reflection on this contrast between belief and intention has led some philosophers to ask whether practical reason might not be something of a misnomer. The difficulty, in a nutshell, is to make sense of the suggestion that a genuinely rational process could by itself generate states with the peculiar function of intentions. Reason seems a capacity for cognitive operations, whereas intentions are distinctively noncognitive states, insofar as they do not aim to reflect independent facts of the matter about the way things happen to be in the world.

Expressivism represents one line of response to this skeptical worry about practical reason. Accounts of this kind offer interpretations of the normative and evaluative language that distinctively figures in practical reflection. As was seen in section 1, such reflection addresses an agent’s reasons for acting in one way or another; conclusions about such reasons are characteristically couched in evaluative terms, as claims about what it would be good to do, or as normative conclusions about the actions that one ought to perform. According to the expressivist, however, evaluative and normative claims of these kinds do not represent genuine cognitive achievements, judgments that are literally capable of being true or false. Rather they give expression to desires, sentiments, plans, and other pro-attitudes, the sorts of goal-directed noncognitive state that move people to action. The expressivist contends that we can make sense of the capacity of practical reason to generate states with the peculiar structure and function of intentions only if evaluative and normative assertions are understood along these lines.

Expressivism in this form suggests a naturalistic interpretation of practical reason, one that may seem appropriate to the enlightened commitments of the modern scientific world view. It is naturalistic metaphysically, insofar as it makes no commitment to the objective existence in the world of such allegedly questionable entities as values, norms, or reasons for action. If normative and evaluative claims do not represent genuine cognitive achievements, then their legitimacy does not depend on our postulating a realm of normative or evaluative facts to which those claims must be capable of corresponding. It is also naturalistic psychologically, insofar as it yields explanations of intentional human behavior that are basically continuous with explanations of the behavior of non-rational animals. In both the human and the non-human case, behavior is understood as the causal product of noncognitive attitudes, operating in conjunction with a creature’s factual representation of how things are in its environment. The special sophistication of human agency may be traced to the fact that humans have much more sophisticated linguistic methods for giving voice to their motivating noncognitive attitudes. Indeed, many contemporary expressivists would contend that these expressive resources are sufficiently powerful that we can explain by means of them the features of practical deliberation that initially give it the appearance of a genuine form of reasoning (Blackburn 1998, Gibbard 1990, Gibbard 2003).

Other philosophers remain unimpressed with this naturalistic approach to practical reason. One ground for dissatisfaction with it is the following. The expressivist strategy relies on an initial contrast between practical reflection on the one hand, and the genuine forms of cognitive activity characteristic of theoretical reasoning on the other. There has to be some important sense in which practical discourse does not satisfy the standards of rationality that distinguish authentic cognitive discourse in the literal sense; otherwise the contention that normative discourse is expressive rather than cognitive will lack any significant content. But the contrast between theoretical and practical reflection required for this purpose seems elusive. As we saw in section 1 above, theoretical reasoning appears to be no less a normative enterprise than practical reasoning. It is plausibly understood to concern itself with reasons for belief, the evidence and other considerations that speak for and against particular conclusions about the way things are in the world. To the extent this is the case, theoretical and practical reasoning would both seem equally problematic from the naturalistic perspective—assuming, that is, that it leaves no place for such normative considerations as reasons. But if naturalism calls into question the credentials of theoretical reason, it thereby undermines the contrast between genuine reasoning and noncognitive forms of normative and evaluative discourse on which expressivists themselves rely.

A different ground for concern about expressionism has to do with the distinction between normative judgment and intention. Expressivism makes sense of the fact that practical reason is practical in its issue by collapsing this distinction altogether. Normative reflection can bring about adjustments in our intentions because it just is a set of operations on our intentions (or intention-like practical states). Compliance with what we ordinarily think of as a rational requirement, to bring our intentions into alignment with our normative beliefs, is thus secured through a kind of conceptual fiat. The result is that there is no room, on this position, for the paradigmatic form of irrationality in practice represented by akrasia, whereby agents fail to do what they themselves believe they ought to do.

Many of those who reject expressivist accounts would endorse some variety of realism about the subject matter of practical reason. The basic commitment of realism in this domain is the idea that there are facts of the matter about what we have reason to do that are prior to and independent of our deliberations, to which those deliberations are ultimately answerable. Realists picture practical reason as a capacity for reflection about an objective body of normative truths regarding action (Skorupski 2010, Parfit 2011, Scanlon 2014). An alternative approach—different both from realism and from the kind of expressivism sketched above—is constructivism (Korsgaard 1997, Street 2008, Street 2010). This approach denies that practical reason is a capacity for reflection about an objective domain of independent normative facts; but it equally rejects the expressivist’s naturalistic suspicion of normativity. According to the constructivist, practical reason is governed by genuine normative constraints, but what makes these constraints normative is precisely their relation to the will of the agents whose decisions they govern. The principles of practical reason are constitutive principles of rational agency, binding on us insofar as we necessarily commit ourselves to complying with them in willing anything at all. The realm of the normative, on this approach, is not pictured as a body of truths or facts that are prior to and independent of the will; rather, it is taken to be ‘constructed’ by agents through their own volitional activity.

3. Reasons and Motivation

The capacity of practical reason to give rise to intentional action divides even those philosophers who agree in rejecting the expressivist strategy discussed above. Such philosophers are prepared to grant that there are normative and evaluative facts and truths, and to accept the cognitive credentials of discourse about this distinctive domain of facts and truths. But they differ in their accounts of the truth conditions of the normative and evaluative claims that figure in such discourse. We may distinguish the following two approaches.

The first of these, often referred to as internalism, holds that reasons for action must be grounded in an agent’s prior motivations (Williams 1981; cf. Finlay 2009). According to this influential position, a given agent s can have reason to do x only if x-ing would speak to or advance some element in s’s ‘subjective motivational set’. There must be some rational connection between s’s x-ing and the subjective motivations to which s is actually already subject; otherwise the claim that s has reason to x must be rejected, as false or incoherent. Behind this internalist position lies the idea that practical reason is practical in its issue. Internalists contend that we can make sense of the generation of new intentions through reasoning only if we assume that such reasoning is conditioned by motivational resources that are already to hand. Practical reason, on the internalist account, is the capacity to work out the implications of the commitments contained in one’s existing subjective motivational set; the upshot is that motivation is prior to practical reason, and constrains it.

Externalists reject this picture, contending that one can have reasons for action that are independent of one’s prior motivations. They typically agree that practical reasoning is capable of generating new motivations and actions. They agree, in other words, that if agent s has reason to do x, it must be possible for s to acquire the motivation to x through reflection on the relevant reasons. But they deny that such reasoning must in any significant way be constrained by s’s subjective motivations prior to the episode of reasoning. On this approach, practical reason is not conceived merely as a capacity for working out the implications of one’s existing desires and commitments; it equally involves the capacity to reason about what it would objectively be good to do, and to act on the basis of this kind of evaluative reflection. Normative reflection is thus taken to be independent of one’s prior motivations, and capable of opening up new motivational possibilities (Parfit 1997).

This disagreement is conventionally understood to be driven by diverging approaches to the explanation of intentional action. Internalists are impressed by the differences between intentions and the cognitive states that figure in paradigmatic examples of theoretical reasoning. Pointing to these differences, they ask how practical reason can succeed in producing new intentions if it is not based in something of the same basic psychological type: a motivation or desire that is already part of the agent’s subjective motivational equipment. Many externalists find this contrast between intentions and cognitive states overdrawn. They observe that we need to postulate basic dispositions of normative responsiveness to account for the capacity of theoretical reflection about reasons to affect our beliefs, and question why these same dispositions cannot explain the fact that practical reasoning is practical in its consequences. Cognitive or not, intentions belong to the broad class of attitudes that are sensitive to judgments, and this may account for the capacity of practical reflection to generate new intentions (Scanlon 1998, chap. 1). A third possibility is that intentions result from dispositions or capacities distinct from the psychic mechanisms that render theoretical rationality possible. Depending on how it is developed, this approach may offer a different way of accounting for the practical consequences of practical reflection, without assuming that reasons for action are grounded in an agent’s subjective motivations (Velleman 2000, chap. 8, Wallace 1999).

More recently, it has been maintained that the Humean approach has its basis not in a philosophical account of motivation, but rather in our understanding of what explains peoples’ reasons for action (Schroeder 2007). There are cases in which features of a person’s psychology make an obvious difference to what the person has reason to do. Some people like to dance, others detest this activity, and this difference in their “desires” appears to determine a corresponding difference in their reasons. Even in cases of this kind, however, it is far from obvious that differences in the agent’s “desires” are what ultimately explain their differing reasons (Scanlon 2014). Moreover, the fact that psychological factors might sometimes be relevant to the explanation of a person’s reasons does not entail that they always have explanatory relevance.

4. Instrumental and Structural Rationality

Among the substantive norms of practical reason, those of instrumental rationality have seemed least controversial to philosophers. Instrumental rationality, in its most basic form, instructs agents to take those means that are necessary in relation to their given ends. In the modern era, this form of rationality has widely been viewed as the single unproblematic requirement of practical reason. The instrumental principle makes no assumptions about the prospects for rational scrutiny of peoples’ ends. Rational criticism of this kind apparently presupposes that there are objective reasons and values, providing standards for assessment of ends that are independent from psychological facts about what people happen to be motivated to pursue. In line with the naturalistic attitude sketched in section 2, however, it may be doubted whether such independent standards can be reconciled with the metaphysical commitments of contemporary scientific practice. A world that is shorn of objective values or norms leaves no room for rational criticism of peoples’ ends, but only for Weberian Zweckrationalität: the rational determination of means to the realization of ends that are taken to be given, as a matter of human psychological fact.

This line of thought can be traced back to the philosophy of David Hume, who famously asserted that ‘Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions’ (Hume 1978, 415). Those attracted to the Humean approach should bear in mind, however, that instrumental rationality is itself the expression of an objective normative commitment. The instrumental principle says that we are rationally required to take the means that are necessary to achieve our ends; if the principle represents a binding norm of practical reason, then we are open to rational criticism to the extent we fail to exhibit this kind of instrumental consistency, regardless of whether we want to comply with the principle or not. If naturalism really entails that there can be no objective norms or values, it may be wondered how an exception can possibly be made for the instrumental requirement. A more consistently naturalistic position would be to reject even Zweckrationalität in favor of a skeptical attitude towards practical reason in all its forms (Hampton 1998)—an attitude that may well correspond to the intentions of the historical Hume (compare Dreier 1997, Millgram 1995). Further questions can be raised about the plausibility of the suggestion that the instrumental norm exhausts the requirements of practical reason. The norm says that one should take the means that are necessary relative to one’s psychologically-given ends. But how can the fact that a given means exhibits this kind of necessity give a person reason to choose the means, if the end is not itself something it would be valuable to achieve in some way? The instrumental principle seems to function as a binding norm of practical reason only if it is taken for granted that there are additional, independent standards for the assessment of our ends (Korsgaard 1997; Quinn 1993).

Many proponents of the instrumental principle would agree that it does not generate reasons for action. The fact that a given means is necessary, relative to one’s given ends, is not a reason to take the means. The instrumental principle functions, rather, as a structural requirement on one’s attitudes (Broome 1999, Broome 2004). Thus, suppose one intends end E, and believes (truly) that E can be achieved only if one intends to do M. It appears that there are two ways in which one could revise one’s attitudes in response to these considerations, compatibly with the instrumental principle: one could form the intention to M, or one could abandon one’s original intention to E. The instrumental principle, considered in itself, is indifferent as between these two possibilities; it should be understood as a wide-scope requirement, governing combinations of attitudes, rather than a source of detachable normative conclusions about what one has reason to do. (Modus ponens represents a similar rational requirement in the domain of theoretical reason, governing combinations of beliefs.)

Rational requirements of this kind have recently become a subject of lively philosophical debate. The idea that there are structural requirements on our attitudes appears to be common ground among philosophers who differ significantly in their views about the nature and scope of practical reason. It is accepted by most Humeans, for instance, who believe that there is no scope for the rational criticism of individual ends, and also by Kantians, who think that the requirements of reason ultimately constrain us to choose in accordance with the moral law. From the perspective of practical and theoretical deliberation, we commonly grant the force of these structural requirements, acknowledging a kind of rational pressure to bring our beliefs and intentions into compliance with the instrumental principle and other standards of consistency and coherence.

Many philosophers take such structural requirements at face value, granting that practical reason is rightly governed by and responsive to these wide-scope demands. Indeed, it has influentially been argued that standards of good reasoning, in both the practical and the theoretical domain, derive exclusively from structural requirements of rationality of this kind (Broome 2013). But questions arise about this approach. For one thing, reasoning has a kind of directionality that is hard to make sense of solely in terms of the ideal of compliance with wide-scope requirements. Thus it isn’t good reasoning to give up the intention to achieve end E solely because one lacks the intention to take the necessary means M, even though, as we have seen, revising one’s attitudes in this way brings about compliance with the wide-scope requirement.

How, more generally, should we understand the relation between structural requirements and our reasons for action and belief? One view, held in common by Humeans and by some Kantian constructivists (see sec. 2 above), is that reasons are fundamentally derivative from rational requirements. What one has reason to do, on this view, is what one would desire or intend to do if one was fully rational (i.e. fully in compliance with the wide-scope structural requirements that govern one’s attitudes in combination).

For those who do not share this reductionist view, however, the status of rational requirements becomes more puzzling. One might hold that practical reason is ultimately answerable to two different kinds of constraints: to rational requirements on the one hand, and to independent facts about what one has reason to do on the other hand. But this position is potentially unstable. Once the independence of structural requirements from normative reasons is made clear, it is no longer obvious why we should care about whether our attitudes do or do not comply with the structural requirements. On this view, there is nothing wrong with failing to take the necessary means to your end, unless the end itself is one that you have compelling reason to pursue (Raz 2005). More generally, it has been argued that there are no independent requirements of structural rationality at all, and that the appearance of such requirements within the deliberative point of view can be explained by substantive features of the reasons to which both practical and theoretical reason are ultimately and properly responsive (Kolodny 2005).

5. Maximizing Rationality

Humean proponents of structural approaches to practical reason have attempted to accommodate the rational criticism of individual ends, without departing from the spirit of Zweckrationalität, by expanding their view to encompass the totality of an agent’s ends. Thus, even if there are no reasons or values that are ultimately independent of an agent’s given ends, the possibility remains that we could criticize particular intrinsic desires by reference to others in an agent’s subjective motivational set. An agent’s desire for leisure, for instance, might be subordinated insofar as its satisfaction would frustrate the realization of other goals that are subjectively more important to the agent, such as professional success. Practical reason, it might be suggested, is a holistic enterprise, properly concerned not merely with identifying means to the realization of individual ends, but with the coordinated achievement of the totality of an agent’s ends.

Many philosophers take this holistic approach to be the most promising way of thinking about the tasks of practical reason. It defines an important and difficult problem for practical reason to address, without departing from the metaphysically modest assumption that there is no court of appeal for the rational criticism of an agent’s ends that is independent of those ends themselves. The holistic approach finds its most sophisticated and influential expression in the maximizing conception of practical rationality. According to the maximizing conception, the fundamental task of practical reason is to determine which course of action would optimally advance the agent’s complete set of ends. Thus it is widely accepted that the rational action for a given agent to take is the one whose subjective expected utility—reflecting both the utility of possible outcomes, from the agent’s point of view, and the agent’s beliefs about the probability of those outcomes—is the highest.

The maximizing conception of practical rationality has been influentially developed in decision theory and in the theory of rational choice (as studied, for instance, in modern economics). These disciplines articulate with mathematical precision the basic idea that practical rationality is a matter of consistency in action: people act rationally to the extent they do what is likely to bring about the best state of affairs, given both their preferences over the outcomes that may be brought about through their agency and their beliefs about the probability of those outcomes. Proponents of these theories sometimes claim for them the additional advantage of empirical adequacy, arguing that they are flexible enough to accommodate the full range of behaviors that human agents engage in, both within the marketplace and outside of it. Especially if one operates with the notion of ‘revealed preferences’—preferences, that is, that are ascribed to agents solely on the basis of actual behavior—then virtually anything an agent might choose to do could be interpreted as an attempt to maximize expected utility. Decision theory, on the resulting interpretation of it, becomes an all-encompassing framework for understanding free human behavior, according to which all agents who act freely are striving to produce outcomes that would be optimal, relative to their current preferences and beliefs.

If decision theory is interpreted in this way, however, then its relevance to the understanding of practical reason may appear correspondingly tenuous (compare Pettit and Smith 1997). The maximization of subjective utility is supposed to represent a normative ideal, one by appeal to which we can assess critically the deliberations of agents. In this guise, the attraction of the maximizing model lies in the idea that there can be rational requirements on action, stemming from the totality of an agent’s preferences and beliefs, even if we do not assume that there are independent, substantive standards for the critical assessment of individual ends. But this normative interpretation of maximizing rationality is tenable only if it is at least conceivable that individual agents might sometimes fail to satisfy its requirements—an‘ought’that it is not so much as possible to flout is not really an ‘ought’ at all (Lavin 2004). Thus the axioms of decision theory include constraints on an agent’s overall preferences (such as completeness and transitivity) that might be violated even by agents who are striving to satisfy their currently strongest desires. Such agents will be criticizable by the lights of decision theory insofar there is no consistent utility function that can be ascribed to them on the basis of their actual choices and behavior. The normative credentials of decision theory rest, then, on the plausibility of the axioms that are taken to define an individual utility function—axioms that may not be quite as innocent or uncontroversial as they appear (compare Mandler 2001).

Further questions arise about the plausibility of the normative requirement to maximize expected utility. Doubts have been expressed, for instance, in regard to the assumption that it is necessarily irrational to fail to select that action that would be optimal, relative to one’s preferences and beliefs. Perfectly rational agents often appear to be content with states of affairs that are ‘good enough’, from the perspective of their aims and desires, even when they know that alternatives are available that promise a higher return; they ‘satisfice’, rather than seeking to maximize the value of the outcomes achievable through their actions (Slote 1989). They also treat their past intentions and plans as defeasibly fixed constraints on deliberation, rather than attempting to maximize subjective utility anew in every situation they confront (Bratman 1987). Finally, they can adopt different attitudes toward risk, attaching greater importance to avoiding bad outcomes than to maximizing expected utility, as classically conceived (Buchak 2013). Defenders of the maximizing model contend that it is flexible enough to accommodate alleged counterexamples of these kinds (Pettit 1984). If not, however, there may be grounds for doubting that it represents a basic norm or practical reason.

A different issue about maximizing rationality concerns the set of desires or aims that is taken as fixed for purposes of applying the requirement of maximization. We may distinguish two basic approaches. The first and perhaps most common of these takes the subjective utility of alternative actions to be determined by the agent’s preferences at the time of deliberation. According to this interpretation of the maximization model, we are rational to the extent we do that which best promotes the totality of our present aims. A second and quite different interpretation results if we expand the set of desires that determine the subjective utilities of outcomes to include the totality of the agent’s preferences over time. According to this model, rational agents aim to maximize the satisfaction of all of their anticipated desires, accepting frustration of present preferences for the sake of greater satisfaction at later times. This interpretation of the maximizing model gives expression to the common idea that a certain prudential regard for one’s own future well-being is a requirement of practical reason (Nagel 1978, chaps 5–8). But if we take it to be a comprehensive account of rationality in action, the prudential interpretation can also appear to be an unstable compromise: if practical reason demands of us impartiality as between our present and future desires, should it not equally demand impartial consideration of the desires of other agents who may be affected by what we do? Why should we take the distinction between persons to be significant for the theory of practical reason, once we have denied such significance to the distinction between different times in the life of a single agent (Parfit 1984; compare section 5 below)?

However we define the class of desires that is subject to the requirement of maximization, we do not need to take those desires exactly as they are given. Many proponents of the maximizing approach suggest that an agent’s actual desires should be laundered somewhat before the demand to maximize is applied. For instance, if my desire for X is contingent on a false factual belief about the nature of X, then it is not obvious that practical reason requires that the desire be taken into account in determining what it is rational for me to do. A popular form of laundering would rule out desires of this kind, by subjecting to the requirement of maximization only those desires that would survive if the agent were factually well-informed about the objects of desire and the circumstances of action, and deliberating in a calm and focused frame of mind. Indeed, once we are in the business of laundering desires we can go still further, excluding from consideration desires that are substantively objectionable, even if they would survive the filter of corrected factual belief. To move into this territory, however, would clearly be to abandon the Humean framework of the original maximizing approach, assuming resources for the rational criticism of ends that are independent of the agent’s actual dispositions.

Some philosophers respond to the cases that invite desire-laundering by distinguishing between subjective and objective dimensions of practical reason. Our corrected desires, such philosophers maintain, are relevant to determining what it would be objectively rational for us to do, or what we objectively have reason to do. But we are often not in a position to grasp that our factual beliefs are false. When this is the case, we can hardly be faulted for failing to do what we objectively have most reason to do. In situations of this kind, it may be subjectively rational for us to strive to satisfy our actual desires, even if some of those desires would not survive correction of our mistaken but blameless factual beliefs.

6. Consequentialism, Value, and Moral Reason

If maximizing rationality is not the unproblematic requirement of practical reason that it initially seemed to be, what are the alternatives to it? Let us begin with the assumption that critical assessment of an agent’s individual ends is off-limits. This apparent truism has been questioned by some philosophers, who point out that many of our basic aims in life are rather inchoate; people want, for instance, to be successful in their careers, and loyal to their friends, without being clear about what exactly these ends require of them. To the extent one’s ends are indeterminate in this way, they will not provide effective starting points for instrumental, maximizing, or even satisficing reflection. We need to specify such ends more precisely before we can begin to think about which means they require us to pursue, or to generate from them a rank-ordering of possible outcomes. Here is a possible task for practical reason that does not fit neatly into the categories of instrumental or maximizing reflection, however broadly construed (Kolnai 2001,Wiggins 1987, Richardson 1994).

Practical deliberation about ends is not an easy or well-defined activity. There are no straightforward criteria for success in this kind of reflection, and it is often unclear when it has been brought to a satisfactory conclusion. These considerations encourage the Humean assumption—especially widespread in the social sciences—that there is no reasoning about final ends. On the other hand, how is one supposed to clarify one’s largest and most important ends, if not by reasoning about them in some way? Rather than exclude such reflection because it does not conform to a narrowly scientific paradigm of reason, perhaps we should expand our conception of practical reason to make room for clarificatory reflection about the ends of action. To do so would be to acknowledge that practical reason has an essentially heuristic dimension, one that is connected to the project of self-understanding. By working out the meaning and implications of such antecedent commitments as loyalty or success, for instance, we also help to get clear the values that define who we really are (Taylor 1985).

Humean models of practical reason rest on a basically consequentialist account of the relation of action to value. According to this account, value inheres ultimately in states of affairs, insofar as it is these that are the objects of subjective preference rankings. Actions are then judged rational to the extent they bring about states of affairs that are valuable in this way. It is a matter of controversy, however, whether this is the most plausible way of thinking about the rationality of action. Defenders of satisficing models, for example, think that a given action can be rational even when it is acknowledged by the agent that an alternative action would bring about a more valuable state of affairs. Alternatively, it might be maintained that we can judge an action rational without being able to arrive at any clear independent ranking of the state of affairs produced by it, as better or worse than the alternatives. Perhaps our judgments of the value of actions are ultimately parasitic on our convictions about the what there is reason to do or to admire; in that case, we will not be able to derive conclusions about reasons from antecedent premises in the theory of value (Scanlon 1998, chap. 2). Related questions have been raised about the basic consequentialist assumption that value attaches in the first instance to states of affairs. Thus it may seem to distort our understanding of friendship, for instance, to maintain that what friends value fundamentally are states of affairs (involving, say, joint activities with the friend); what people value as friends are rather concrete particulars or relations, such as the persons with whom they are befriended or their relationships with those persons. Building on this idea in the theory of value, it has been proposed that actions are rational insofar as they succeed in expressing the attitudes that it is rational to adopt toward the true bearers of intrinsic value: people, animals, and things (Anderson 1993).

A supposed advantage of this approach is its ability to explain the rationality of behaviors that seem intuitively sensible, but that are hard to fit into the consequentialist scheme (such as commitments deriving from one’s past involvement in an activity or project, which can look like an irrational weighting of ‘sunk costs’ to the consequentialist; compare Nozick 1993). But defenders of the consequentialist model contend that we can account in terms of it for rational actions that appear to resist treatment in consequentialist terms. For instance, if friends have special, ‘agent-relative’ reasons to attend to the interests of each other—and not merely reasons to promote the neutral value of friendship wherever it may be instantiated—this can be expressed in consequentialist terms by introducing person-indexed value functions, which rank possible states of affairs in terms of their desirability from the agent’s point of view (Sen 2000).

Whether or not we accept a consequentialist framework, questions in the theory of value would seem to be an important focus for practical reflection. Many philosophers are attracted to the idea that reasons for action are ultimately provided by the values that can be realized through action (Raz 1999). If this is right, and if we assume as well a realist or at least non-subjectivist conception of value, then a different way of thinking about the task of practical reason comes into view. This may be thought of not primarily as a matter of maximizing the satisfaction of the agent’s given ends, nor of specifying ends that are still inchoate, but rather as the task of mapping the landscape of value. This task in turn admits of a number of different interpretations. In the spirit of G. E. Moore, we might understand the evaluative reflection relevant to deliberation in consequentialist terms, as reflection about a non-natural property of goodness that is instantiated by states of the world; but this is not a very popular approach today. An influential alternative to it, inspired by Aristotle, holds that the proper focus of practical reflection is the question of what it would be to act well (Lawrence 1995, Foot 2001). According to this view, the values that are relevant to determining what an agent ought to do are those that are specifically connected to human agency, specifying what it would be to be good (or at least non-defective) as a human agent (Thompson 2008, Thomson 2008). Those attracted to pluralistic conceptions of the good take a more expansive view, suggesting that any concrete dimension of value that might be affected by action falls within the purview of practical deliberation (Raz 1999, Raz 2011).

Morality has provided an especially fertile source of examples and problems for the theory of practical reason. A defining question of moral philosophy is the question of the rational authority of moral norms: to what extent, and under what conditions, do people have compelling reasons to comply with the demands of conventional morality? (Alternatively: to what extent, and under what conditions, are people rationally required to comply with those demands?) Reflection on this question has produced some of the most significant and illuminating philosophical work in the theory of practical reason. Two divergent tendencies within this body of work can be singled out. Some accounts of moral reasoning proceed by relating it to patterns of reflection appropriate to other, non-moral domains, particularly the maximizing patterns canvassed in the section 5. Thus it has been argued that, though morality imposes constraints on the direct pursuit of individual utility, these constraints can be justified in the terms of ordinary economic rationality; the strategy of morally-constrained maximization is recommended on grounds of enlightened self-interest, and this in turn accounts for the authority of moral considerations to govern the practical reflection of individuals (Gauthier 1986). Other philosophers have tried to make sense of morality as a set of rational norms by assimilating it more directly to the maximizing conception. Consider utilitarianism and other consequentialist approaches to the normative structure of morality, which interpret moral rightness in terms of the value of the consequences (of actions, policies, institutions, or other objects of moral assessment). These theories derive at least some of their appeal from the fact that they apply to the moral domain the maximizing model of rationality that seems both familiar and appealing outside of moral contexts. Thus one way to argue for ethical consequentialism is to observe that it is the theory that results when we combine the requirement of maximization with a distinctively moral constraint of impartiality, applying the requirement to a set of preferences that includes those of all the persons (or other sentient creatures) potentially affected by our actions (Harsanyi 1982).

Opponents of this kind of ethical consequentialism stress the discontinuities between moral and non-moral patterns of reasoning. They argue that morality is a source of demands (such as prohibitions on murder and deception) that cannot be represented accurately within the framework of maximizing rationality (for example, Scanlon 1998, chap. 5). If this is correct, then we will be able to make sense of moral requirements, as norms that appropriately govern the reflections of individual agents, only if we expand our conception of the forms and possibilities of practical reason.

There are two connected features of moral norms that seem particularly significant in this connection. First, they are intuitively understood to represent agent-relative reasons for action (Nagel 1978). Thus, if I have promised that I will take you to the airport tomorrow afternoon, this consideration has a significance for me that it does not necessarily have for other agents. In particular, the importance to me of keeping my promise seems to be independent from the impersonal end of promissory fidelity. This shows itself in the fact that my reason to keep the promise I have made would be unaffected if I found myself in a scenario in which breaking my promise would lead five other agents to keep promises they would otherwise have flouted. Second, these agent-relative considerations have a distinctive function within practical deliberation. They are not merely considerations that speak in favor of the actions they recommend, but operate rather as practical requirements that presumptively constrain the agent’s activities. The fact that I have promised to take you to the airport tomorrow, for instance, is ordinarily a decisive basis for concluding that that is to be done. I do not need to weigh this consideration against other values that might be pursued under the circumstances; rather, the promissory commitment enters the deliberative field from the start in the deontic guise of an obligation.

There are divergent approaches that have been taken within ethical theory for making sense of these salient features of moral reason. Kantians for instance, take rational agents to impose the moral law on themselves when they act, where the law in question functions as a limiting condition on their pursuit of their ends (Korsgaard 1996b, O’Neill 1989). Proponents of virtue theory take it that compliance with some agent-centered requirements is partly constitutive of being a good human being (Foot 2001). A still different class of approaches understands moral norms in essentially interpersonal terms: either as demands that are imposed by agents on each other (Darwall 2009), or as relational requirements that define what we owe to each other, and that make possible relations of mutual recognition or regard (Scanlon 1998, Wallace 2019). These are very disparate ways of conceptualizing morality as a sui genesis domain of agent-centered obligations. They have in common, however, a commitment to the idea that reflection on the nature of morality can bring to light structures of practical reason that would not otherwise be salient.


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