First published Thu Apr 10, 2003; substantive revision Sun Apr 4, 2021

Alcmaeon of Croton was an early Greek medical writer and philosopher-scientist. His exact date, his relationship to other early Greek philosopher-scientists, and whether he was primarily a medical writer/physician or a typical Presocratic cosmologist, are all matters of controversy. He is likely to have written his book sometime between 500 and 450 BCE. The surviving fragments and testimonia focus primarily on issues of physiology, psychology, and epistemology and reveal Alcmaeon to be a thinker of considerable originality. He was the first to identify the brain as the seat of understanding and to distinguish understanding from perception. Alcmaeon thought that the sensory organs were connected to the brain by channels (poroi) and may have discovered the poroi connecting the eyes to the brain (i.e. the optic nerve) by excising the eyeball of an animal, although it is doubtful that he used dissection as a standard method. He was the first to develop an argument for the immortality of the soul. He used a political metaphor to define health and disease: The equality (isonomia) of the opposing powers which make up the body (e.g., the wet, the dry, the hot, the cold, the sweet, the bitter etc.) preserves health, whereas the monarchy of any one of them produces disease. Alcmaeon discussed a wide range of topics in physiology including sleep, death, and the development of the embryo. It is unclear whether he also presented a cosmology in terms of opposing powers, but we do have some testimonia concerning his views on astronomy. Alcmaeon had considerable impact on his successors in the Greek philosophical tradition. Aristotle wrote a treatise responding to him, Plato may have been influenced by his argument for the immortality of the soul, and both Plato and Philolaus accepted his view that the brain is the seat of intelligence.

Life and Works

1.1 Medical Writer or Philosopher?

Alcmaeon, son of Peirithous (otherwise unknown), lived in the Greek city of Croton on the instep of the boot of Italy. Diogenes Laertius, in his brief life of Alcmaeon (VIII. 83), asserts that he wrote mostly on medical matters. There is, however, little direct evidence for his work as a practicing physician. Later writers in the medical tradition, such as Galen (DK A2), treat him as a philosopher-scientist rather than as a physician, so that some scholars (Mansfeld 1975; cf. Perilli 2001 for a critique) have concluded that he was not a doctor at all but rather a typical Presocratic physiologos (writer on nature). The majority of scholars, however, because of Diogenes’ remark and because of the focus on the functioning of the human body in the testimonia and fragments, refer to Alcmaeon as a physician-philosopher. The historian Herodotus tells us that, in the second half of the sixth century, the physicians of Croton were the best in the Greek world (III. 131) and recounts in some detail the activities of the most prominent Crotoniate physician of the time, Democedes (III. 125–138). Thus, whether a practicing physician or not, Alcmaeon undoubtedly owes some of his interest in human physiology and psychology to the medical tradition in Croton. In the fifth century, it is difficult to draw clear lines between the work of a medical writer/physician and a philosopher/scientist. Presocratic cosmologies of this period devoted some attention to questions of human physiology and medicine, and conversely the early treatises in the Hippocratic corpus often paid some attention to cosmology (see Aristotle, Resp. 480b23 ff.). The earliest Presocratic cosmologies in Ionia (e.g., those of Anaximander and Anaximenes) did not deal with physiology, and it is possible that the new interest in physiology in cosmologies of the fifth century (e.g., those of Empedocles and Anaxagoras) was due to the influence of Alcmaeon (Zhmud 2012a, 366; 2014, 100).

1.2 Was Alcmaeon a Pythagorean?

Croton is also famous as the center of Pythagoras’ activity from ca. 530, when he left Samos. Alcmaeon addressed his book to three men who may have been Pythagoreans:

Alcmaeon of Croton, son of Peirithous, said the following to Brotinus, Leon, and Bathyllus… (DK, B1)

We know nothing of Leon and Bathyllus, except that Iamblichus, in On the Pythagorean Way of Life (=VP), lists a Pythagorean named Leon from Metapontum and a Pythagorean Bathylaus from Poseidonia (Paestum), both Greek cities of southern Italy (VP 267). Bro(n)tinus is identified as a Pythagorean from Croton in some places (D.L. VIII. 42; Iamb. VP 132) and from Metapontum in others (VP 194, 267). He is either the father or the husband of Theano, who is in turn either the wife or student of Pythagoras. Does this “dedication” of his book to Pythagoreans indicate that Alcmaeon himself was a Pythagorean? Even if this is a dedication, it does not follow that Alcmaeon agreed with the views of his addressees. Comparison with Empedocles’ address to Pausanias suggests, moreover, that what we have is not a dedication but an exhortation or an attempt to instruct (Vlastos 1953, 344, n. 25). Comparison with other early Greek prose writers such as Hecataeus and Heraclitus shows that books could begin with criticism of the views of others so that Alcmaeon’s address to these Pythagoreans may be polemical (Kouloumentas 2018).

Diogenes Laertius, in his Lives of the Philosophers (3rd century AD), includes Alcmaeon among the Pythagoreans and says that he studied with Pythagoras (VIII. 83). Later authors such as Iamblichus (VP 104, 267), Philoponus (De An. p. 88), and the scholiast on Plato (Alc. 121e) also call Alcmaeon a Pythagorean. A majority of scholars up to the middle of the twentieth century followed this tradition. However, it is not true that the ancient “tradition is unanimous in presenting him as a Pythagorean” (Zhmud 2012a, 123). In fact, the majority of ancient sources do not describe him as a Pythagorean (e.g., Clement [DK 24A2], Galen [DK24A2], Aetius [DK 24A4, 6, 8–10, 13, 17–18], Censorinus [DK 24A13–14], and Chalcidius [DK A10]). The best argument for regarding him as Pythagorean would be his inclusion in Iamblichus’ catalogue of Pythagoreans at the end of his On the Pythagorean Life, if we could be sure that all parts of that catalogue go back to Aristoxenus in the fourth century, since Aristoxenus is a very knowledgeable source on Pythagoreanism (Zhmud 2012a, 122; 2012b, 241–43). However, certain parts of the catalogue are very unlikely go back to Aristoxenus and we cannot be certain that the inclusion of Alcmaeon was due to him (Huffman 2005, 297–99). Apart from this possibility regarding Aristoxenus, no one earlier than Diogenes Laertius (ca. 200 AD) calls Alcmaeon a Pythagorean. Aristotle wrote two books on the Pythagoreans but wrote a separate book on Alcmaeon. Aristotle and Theophrastus refer to him a number of times but never identify him as a Pythagorean, and this is the practice of the doxographical tradition (see A4, 6, 8–10, 13–14, 17–18, in DK 24). Simplicius (6th AD) reports that some have handed down the view that Alcmaeon is a Pythagorean but notes that Aristotle denies it (De An. 32.3). Most telling is Aristotle’s discussion of Alcmaeon in Metaphysics book I (986a22 ff.). He notes a similarity between Alcmaeon and a group of Pythagoreans in positing opposites as the principles of things but expresses uncertainty as to who influenced whom. Earlier scholars took this comparison of Alcmaeon to the Pythagoreans as confirmation that he was a Pythagorean. Most scholars of the last fifty years, however, have come to recognize that Aristotle’s treatment of Alcmaeon here suggests the exact opposite; it only makes sense to compare him with the Pythagoreans and wonder who influenced whom, if he is not a Pythagorean (e.g., Guthrie 1962, 341: “Aristotle … expressly distinguishes him from the Pythagoreans”). Certainly most of the opposites which are mentioned as crucial to Alcmaeon do not appear in the Pythagorean table of opposites, and there is no trace of the crucial Pythagorean opposition between limit and unlimited in Alcmaeon. The overwhelming majority of scholars since 1950 have accordingly regarded Alcmaeon as a figure independent of the Pythagoreans (e.g., Guthrie 1962, 341; Burkert 1972, 289; KRS 1983, 339; Lloyd 1991, 167; Kahn 2001; Riedweg 2005, 115; Primavesi 2012, 447. Zhmud [2012a, 121–124; 2014, 97–102] is the notable exception), although, as a fellow citizen of Croton, he will have been familiar with their thought.

1.3 Date

No issue concerning Alcmaeon has been more controversial than his date. Some have sought to date him on the basis of his address to Brotinus (e.g., Zhmud 2012a, 122). Brotinus’ dates are too uncertain to be of much help, however. If he is Theano’s father and Theano was Pythagoras’ wife, he could be a contemporary of Pythagoras (570–490) or even older. If he is Theano’s husband and she was a student of Pythagoras in his old age and thus twenty in 490, Brotinus could have been born as late as 520. This suggests that Brotinus could have been the addressee of the book any time between 550 and 450 BCE. The center of controversy, however, has been a sentence in the passage of Aristotle’s Metaphysics discussed above:

Alcmaeon of Croton also seems to have thought along similar lines, and either he took this theory over from them [i.e. the Pythagoreans] or they from him. For in age Alcmaeon was in the old age of Pythagoras, and his views were similar to theirs (986a27–31).

The sentence in bold above is missing in one of the major manuscripts and Alexander makes no mention of it in his commentary on the Metaphysics. It does appear in the other two major manuscripts and in Asclepius’ commentary. A number of scholars have regarded it as a remark by a later commentator, which has crept into the text (e.g., Ross 1924, 152; Burkert 1972, 29, n.60) and this is the view of the most recent editor (Primavesi 2012, 447–8). It is a surprising remark for Aristotle to make, since he only refers to Pythagoras once elsewhere in all his extant writings and throughout this passage of the Metaphysics refers to the Pythagoreans or Italians in the plural. Other scholars regard the remark as genuine (e.g., Wachtler 1896; Guthrie 1962, 341–3; Zhmud 2012a, 122). Even if we accept the remark as genuine, the assertion that Alcmaeon “was” (egeneto) in the old age of Pythagoras is ambiguous. Does it mean that Alcmaeon was born in the old age of Pythagoras, or that he lived (flourished?) in the old age of Pythagoras? Diels emended the sentence to say that Alcmaeon was “young” in the old age of Pythagoras and this emendation is supported by a similar remark found in Iamblichus (VP 104). Although Diels accepted the text as Aristotelian, others have seen the parallel with Iamblichus as evidence that it is a remark by a later commentator and have pointed out that the report in Iamblichus involves several chronological impossibilities (e.g., that Philolaus was young in the old age of Pythagoras). Moreover, Diels’ text suggests that the purpose of the remark was to show Alcmaeon’s dependence on Pythagoras, which would show that the remark cannot be due to Aristotle, who has just distinguished Alcmaeon from the Pythagoreans and expressed doubts as to who influenced whom (Primavesi 2012, 447–8). Even if the remark is unlikely to go back to Aristotle, his doubts about who influenced whom suggest that Alcmaeon belonged to the late sixth or early fifth century (Schofield 2012, 156), which would argue against the late date of 440 adopted by Mansfeld (2013, 78, n. 1). One group of scholars thus dates the publication of Alcmaeon’s book to around 500 (Burkert 1972, 292; Kirk, Raven, Schofield 1983, 339 [early 5th]; Zhmud 2012a, 122 [not later than 490]) so that he would have been born around 540. Another group has him born around 510 so that his book would have been published in 470 or later (Guthrie 1962, 358 [480–440 BCE]; Lloyd 1991, 168 [490–430 BCE]). In either case Alcmaeon probably wrote before Empedocles, Anaxagoras, and Philolaus. He is either the contemporary or the predecessor of Parmenides. Attempts to date him on the basis of internal evidence alone, i.e. comparison of his doctrines with those of other thinkers, have led to the widest divergence of dates. Edelstein says that he may have lived in the late fifth century (1942, 372), while Lebedev makes him active in the late 6th (1993).

1.4 Alcmaeon’s Book and the Evidence for Its Contents

The ancient tradition assigns one book to Alcmaeon, which came to bear the traditional title of Presocratic treatises, On Nature (DK, A2), although this title probably does not go back to Alcmaeon himself. Favorinus’ report that Alcmaeon was the first to write such a treatise (DK, A1) is almost certainly wrong, since Anaximander wrote before Alcmaeon. Theophrastus’ detailed report of Alcmaeon’s account of the senses (DK, A5) and the fact that Aristotle wrote a treatise in response to Alcmaeon (D.L. V. 25) suggest that the book was available in the fourth century BCE. It is unclear whether Alcmaeon wrote in the Doric dialect of Croton or in the Ionic Greek of the first Presocratics (Burkert, 1972, 222, n. 21). The report that an Alcimon of Croton was the first to write animal fables might be a reference to a poet of a similar name. Fragment 5 in DK (“It is easier to be on one’s guard against an enemy than a friend.”) sounds very much like the moral of such a fable (Gomperz 1953, 64–5). Diels and Kranz (=DK) identify five other fragments of Alcmaeon (Frs. 1, 1a, 2, 3, 4) and arrange the testimonia under 18 headings. Fragments 1a, 3 and 4, however, are really testimonia which use language of a later date, although some of Alcmaeon’s terminology is embedded in them. The three lines of Fragment 1, which probably began the book, and the half line in Fragment 2 are the only continuous texts of Alcmaeon. Another brief fragment/testimonium should be added to the material in DK: “the earth is the mother of plants and the sun their father” (Nicolaus Damascenus, De plantis I 2.44; see Kirk 1956 and Lebedev 1993). There is also the possibility that Fr. 125 of the Spartan poet Alcman (“Experience is the beginning of learning.”) should, in fact, be assigned to Alcmaeon (Lanza 1965; Barnes 1982, 610).

2. Epistemology and Psychology

2.1 The Limits of Knowledge

Alcmaeon began his book by defining the limits of human knowledge:

Concerning things that are not perceptible [concerning mortal things] the gods have clarity, but insofar as it is possible for human beings to judge (tekmairesthai) … (DK, B1)

Such skepticism about human knowledge is characteristic of one strand of early Greek thought. Both Alcmaeon’s predecessors (e.g., Xenophanes B34) and his successors (e.g., Philolaus B6) made similar contrasts between divine and human knowledge, but in Alcmaeon’s case, as in these other cases, we do not have enough evidence to be sure what he intended. Most of the subjects that Alcmaeon went on to discuss in his book could not be settled by a direct appeal to sense perception (e.g., the functioning of the senses, the balance of opposites in the healthy body, the immortality of the soul). In this sense he was dealing largely with what is “not perceptible” (aphanes). Alcmaeon is decidedly not an extreme skeptic, however, in that he is willing to assign clear understanding about such things to the gods and by implication admits that even humans have clear understanding of what is directly perceptible. Moreover, while humans cannot attain clarity about what cannot be perceived, Alcmaeon thinks that they can make reasonable judgments from the signs that are presented to them by sensation (tekmairesthai). He thus takes the stance of the scientist who draws inferences from what can be perceived, and he implicitly rejects the claims of those who base their account of the world on the certainty of a divine revelation (e.g., Pythagoras, Parmenides B1).

There are difficulties with the text of Fr. 1, which make its interpretation problematic. Some scholars exclude the material in brackets above because it is hard to see how to connect it to what precedes (e.g., Wachtler 1896), while others keep the material and suppose that we are to understand an “and” coordinating the phrase in brackets with what precedes it (e.g., DK 1952). Other scholars would place a semicolon or colon after “things that are not perceptible” so that up to the colon Alcmaeon is identifying his topic or the area of disagreement with this addressees, while after the colon he begins his own account (Kouloumentas 2018 following Gomperz). Gemelli Marciano (2007, 18–22), on the other hand, has suggested that the material in brackets above should be kept but made dependent on the immediately preceding phrase rather than coordinated with it, so that the fragment would read:

Concerning things that are not perceptible concerning mortals the gods have clarity, but insofar as it is possible for human beings to judge … (DK, B1)

If we regard Alcmaeon as primarily a doctor or medical thinker, rather than as a cosmologist, “things that are not perceptible concerning mortals” is likely to refer to the interior of the body and hidden diseases. Passages in the Greek medical writings of the fifth century provide clear parallels for the difficulty of knowing about the interior of the body and invisible maladies (Gemelli Marciano 2007, 20–21). On this reading Fr.1 is addressed to medical students. Parallels with medical treatises suggest that, after first raising difficulties about medical knowledge in these matters, Alcmaeon may have gone on to assert that these difficulties can be overcome with the proper teaching, the teaching that followed in his book. If this is the correct context in which to read the fragment, it is not so much about the limits of understanding as the success of medical teaching in overcoming apparent limits.

2.2 Understanding and Empiricism

According to Theophrastus, Alcmaeon was the first Greek thinker to distinguish between sense perception and understanding and to use this distinction to separate animals, which only have sense perception, from humans, who have both sense perception and understanding (DK, B1a, A5). Alcmaeon is also the first to argue that the brain is the central organ of sensation and thought (DK, A5, A8, A10). There is no explicit evidence, however, as to what Alcmaeon meant by understanding. The word translated as understanding here is suniêmi, which in its earliest uses means “to bring together,” so that it is possible that Alcmaeon simply meant that humans are able to bring the information provided by the senses together in a way that animals cannot (Solmsen 1961, 151). Animals have brains too, however, and thus might appear to be able to carry out the simple correlation of the evidence from the various senses, whereas the human ability to make inferences and judgments (DK, B1) appears to be a more plausible candidate for the distinctive activity of human intelligence. It is possible that we should use a passage in Plato’s Phaedo (96a-b = A11) to explicate further Alcmaeon’s epistemology. The passage is part of Socrates’ report of his early infatuation with natural science and with questions such as whether it is the blood, or air, or fire with which we think. He also reports the view that it is the brain that furnishes the sensations of hearing, sight, and smell. This corresponds very well with Alcmaeon’s view of the brain as the central sensory organ and, although Alcmaeon is not mentioned by name, many scholars think that Plato must be referring to him here. Socrates connects this view of the brain with an empiricist epistemology, which Aristotle will later adopt (Posterior Analytics 100a3 ff.). This epistemology involves three steps: first, the brain provides the sensations of hearing, sight and smell, then, memory and opinion arise from these, and finally, when memory and opinion achieve fixity, knowledge arises. Some scholars suppose that this entire epistemology is Alcmaeon’s (e.g., Barnes 1982, 149 ff.), while others more cautiously note that we only have explicit evidence that Alcmaeon took the first step (e.g., Vlastos 1970, 47, n.8).

2.3 Did Alcmaeon Practice Dissection?

Alcmaeon’s empiricism has sometimes been thought to have arisen from his experience as a practicing physician (Guthrie 1962). He has also been hailed as the first to use dissection, but this is based on a hasty reading of the evidence. Calcidius, in his Latin commentary on Plato’s Timaeus, praises Alcmaeon, along with Callisthenes and Herophilus, for having brought many things to light about the nature of the eye (DK, A10). Most of what Calcidius goes on to describe, however, are the discoveries of Herophilus some two centuries after Alcmaeon (Lloyd 1975, Mansfeld 1975, Solmsen 1961). The only conclusions we can reasonably draw about Alcmaeon from the passage are that he excised the eyeball of an animal and observed poroi (channels, i.e. the optic nerve) leading from the eye in the direction of the brain (Lloyd 1975). Theophrastus’ account of Alcmaeon’s theory of sensation implies that he thought that there were such channels leading from each of the senses to the brain:

All the senses are connected in some way with the brain. As a result, they are incapacitated when it is disturbed or changes its place, for it then stops the channels, through which the senses operate. (DK, A5)

There is no evidence, however, that Alcmaeon dissected the eye itself or that he dissected the skull in order to trace the optic nerve all the way to the brain. Alcmaeon’s account of the other senses, far from suggesting that he carried out dissections in order to explain their function, implies that he did not (Lloyd 1975; for a partial critique of Lloyd see Perilli 2001). Alcmaeon’s conclusion that all of the senses are connected to the brain may have been drawn from nothing more than the excision of the eye and the general observation that the sense organs for sight, hearing, smell, and taste are located on the head and appear connected to passages which lead inward towards the brain (Gomperz 1953, 69). It is striking in this regard that Alcmaeon gave no account of touch (DK, A5), which is the only sense not specifically tied to the head. It would be a serious mistake then to say that Alcmaeon discovered dissection or that he was the father of anatomy, since there is no evidence that he used dissection systematically or even that he did more than excise a single eyeball.

2.4 Sense Perception

Theophrastus says that Alcmaeon did not explain sensation by the principle of like to like (i.e. by the likeness between the sense organ and what is perceived), a principle which was used by many early Greek thinkers (e.g., Empedocles). Unfortunately he gives no general account of how Alcmaeon did think sensation worked (DK, A5). Alcmaeon explained each of the individual senses with the exception of touch, but these accounts are fairly rudimentary. He regarded the eye as composed of water and fire and vision as taking place when what is seen is reflected in the gleaming and translucent part of the eye. Hearing arises when an external sound is first transmitted to the outer ear and then picked up by the empty space (kenon) in the inner ear, which transmits it to the brain. Taste occurs through the tongue, which being warm and soft dissolves things with its heat and, because of its loose texture, receives and transmits the sensation. Smell is the simplest of all. It occurs “at the same time as we breathe in, thus bringing the breath to the brain” (DK, A5).

2.5 The Immortality of the Soul

Alcmaeon developed the first argument for the immortality of the soul, but the testimonia concerning it differ slightly from one another, and it appears to have been taken over and developed by Plato, so that it is very hard to determine exactly how to reconstruct Alcmaeon’s own argument. Barnes (1982, 116–120) and Hankinson (1998, 30–3) provide the most insightful analysis. Alcmaeon appears to have started from the assumption that the soul is always in motion. At one extreme we might suppose that Alcmaeon only developed the simple argument from analogy, which Aristotle assigns to him (De An. 405a29). The soul is like the heavenly bodies, which Alcmaeon regarded as divine and immortal (DK, A1, A12), in being always in motion, so it is also like them in being immortal. This is clearly fallacious, since it assumes that things that are alike in one respect will be alike in all others. The version in the doxographical tradition is more sophisticated (DK, A12). Alcmaeon thought that the soul moved itself in continual motion and was therefore immortal and like to the divine. The similarity to the divine is not part of the inference here but simply an illustrative comparison. However, Mansfeld has recently pointed out that the doxographical report in Aetius is just a paraphrase of Aristotle’s earlier report with the significant addition that the soul is self-moving. Examination of the context in Aetius shows that the self-motion of the soul, which is attested independently for Plato and Xenocrates, was projected back on Pythagoras and Thales, who are very unlikely to have held such a view. This context and Aristotle’s failure to assign self-motion to Alcmaeon makes it likely that the same projection occurred in the case of Alcmaeon, who thus is likely to have assigned continual motion but not self motion to the soul (Mansfeld 2014b, see also Laks 2018). The core of the simpler argument is the necessary truth that what is always in motion must be immortal. This is the assumption from which Plato starts his argument for the immortality of the soul at Phaedrus 245c, but how much of Plato’s analysis of what is always in motion can be assigned to Alcmaeon? Plato makes no mention of Alcmaeon in the passage. There are still serious questions for Alcmaeon, even on the more sophisticated version of the argument. We might well recognize that things with souls, i.e. things that are alive, are able to move themselves, and conclude that it is souls that bring this motion about. We might also conclude that the soul, as what moves something else, must be in motion itself (the synonymy principle of causation). But why did Alcmaeon suppose that the soul must be always in motion? (Hankinson [1998, 32] provides two possible answers and discusses the difficulties with them.) Horn argues that there is no obvious meaning to the idea that the human soul is in continual motion so that Alcmaeon must be talking about a world soul, which has the continual motion of the heavens (2005, 157–8). However, Mansfeld rightly argues that Aristotle’s report on Alcmaeon’s view of the soul is clearly about the human soul; since the soul being discussed is said to be similar to the heavenly motions it has to be distinct from them (2014a). Finally, what sort of motion is being ascribed to souls? The natural assumption might be that the soul’s motion is thinking, but, at this early point in Greek thought, Alcmaeon was more likely to have thought that, if the soul is going to cause motion in space, it too must be in locomotion. Plato describes the soul as composed of two circles with contrary motions, which imitate the contrary motions of the fixed stars and the planets, so that the soul becomes a sort of orrery in the head (Timaeus 44d). It has been suggested that this image is borrowed from Alcmaeon (Barnes 1982, 118; Skemp 1942, 36 ff.).

In Fragment 2, Alcmaeon is reported to have said that:

Human beings perish because they are not able to join their beginning to their end.

At first sight, this assertion might appear to conflict with Alcmaeon’s belief that the soul is immortal. It seems likely, however, that Alcmaeon distinguished between human beings as individual bodies, which do perish, and as souls, which do not (Barnes 1982, 115). There is no evidence about what Alcmaeon thought happened to the soul, when the body perished, however. Did he believe in reincarnation as the Pythagoreans did? No ancient source associates Alcmaeon with reincarnation and his sharp distinction between animals and human beings may suggest that he did not believe in it (Guthrie 1962: 354). He might have thought that the soul joined other divine beings in the heavens. The point of Fragment 2 may be that, whereas the heavenly bodies do join their beginnings to their ends in circular motion, humans are not able to join their end in old age to their beginning in childhood, i.e. human life does not have a cyclical structure. We might even suppose that the soul tries to impose such a structure on the body from its own circular motion but ultimately fails (Guthrie 1962, 353). It has been rather speculatively suggested that, since Alcmaeon explains sleep and waking by the blood retreating into the inner vessels and then expanding again into the outer vessels (see 3.2 below), it may be that this “circular motion” of the blood that fails in death (Kouloumentas 2018b).

3. Medical Doctrines

3.1 Health and Disease

Fragment 4 presents Alcmaeon’s account of health and disease:

Alcmaeon said that the equality (isonomia) of the powers (wet, dry, cold, hot, bitter, sweet, etc.) maintains health but that monarchy among them produces disease.

This is, in fact, not a fragment but a testimonium and much of the language comes from the doxographical tradition rather than Alcmaeon. The report goes on to say that Alcmaeon thought that disease arose because of an excess of heat or cold, which in turn arose because of an excess or deficiency in nutrition. Disease is said to arise in the blood, the marrow, or the brain. It can also be caused by external factors such as the water, the locality, toil, or violence. The idea that health depends on a balance of opposed factors in the body is a commonplace in Greek medical writers. Although Alcmaeon is the earliest figure to whom such a conception of health is attributed, it may well be that he is not presenting an original thesis but rather drawing on the earlier medical tradition in Croton. Perhaps what is distinctive to Alcmaeon is the use of the specific political metaphor and most scholars (e.g., Sassi 2007, 198; Jouanna 1999, 327; Kouloumentas 2014, 871) agree that the political terminology (isonomia, monarchia) goes back to him. Indeed, these terms are not found elsewhere in the Greek medical tradition. Just as Anaximander explained the order of the cosmos in terms of justice in the city-state, so Alcmaeon used a political metaphor to explain the order of the human body. It is commonly recognized that isonomia (equality) is not a specific form of government but rather a concept of political equality in terms of which forms of government are evaluated (Ostwald 1969, 108; Meier 1990, 162 calls it a “yardstick”, Vlastos 1981, 173–74 a “banner”). Its primary application is to democracies (Herodotus III.80) but it is also applied to moderate oligarchies that have democratic features (Thucydides III. 62.3–4). Although a significant number of scholars argue that there is a purely aristocratic application for isonomia as the equality of aristocratic peers in opposition to a tyrant (e.g., Raaflaub 2004: 95; Zhmud 2012a: 358), one of the most noted early adherents of this view later abandoned it (Ehrenberg 1956: 67) and it appears more likely that the term isonomia originated with the radical democracy which emerged in Athens in the late sixth century and was only applied in a secondary sense to moderate oligarchies (Vlastos 1973, 175–7; Ostwald 1969, 99–106). Is Alcmaeon’s use of the term simply descriptive of the equality of powers that is necessary for the healthy body, or does his use of the term to describe health suggest that he was in sympathy with radical democracy (Vlastos 1953, 363)? We simply have no direct evidence for Alcmaeon’s political views. However, Aristotle emphasizes that Alcmaeon posited an indefinite number of opposites as active in the human body in contrast to the Pythagoreans who specified ten pairs (see 4.2 below), which suggests that Alcmaeon’s “body” politic was not an oligarchy with a numerically defined group of peers but rather a democracy which gave equality to the full range of opposites. Mansfeld has recently argued that scholars are wrong to ascribe the key terms isonomia and monarchia to Alcmaeon (Mansfeld 2014a). Such a metaphorical use of isonomia is unparalleled at this early date and is much more likely to have been introduced later in the doxographical tradition. Moreover, monarchia may have been introduced by a doxographer familiar with its use in the famous debate on constitutions in Herodotus (III 80–3), where isonomia also appears (III 80). Mansfeld concludes that this origin of the terms from the doxography is more likely than assuming influence on Alcmaeon from the reforms of Cleisthenes. The difficulty with Mansfeld’s approach is that the striking thing about the report on Alcmaeon is precisely the political metaphor and it seems more plausible that his views were introduced into the doxography because of that metaphor than that his views were typical Greek views on disease and the metaphor only arose as an artefact of the doxographical tradition. If he did introduce the political metaphor then it is as probable as not that he used the terms ascribed to him, especially since both appear only a little later in Herodotus, although not with a metaphorical sense.

3.2 Sleep, Embryology, and the Use of Analogy

Alcmaeon is the first to raise a series of questions in human and animal physiology that later become stock problems, which every thinker tries to address. He thus sets the initial agenda for Greek physiology (Longrigg 1993, 54–7; Lloyd 1966, 322 ff.). He said that sleep is produced by the withdrawal of the blood away from the surface of the body to the larger (“blood-flowing”) vessels and that we awake when the blood diffuses throughout the body again (DK, A18). Death occurs when the blood withdraws entirely. Hippocratic writers (Epid. VI 5.15) and Aristotle (H.A. 521a15) both seem to have adopted Alcmaeon’s account of sleep. It is very unlikely, however, that Alcmaeon distinguished between veins (the “blood-flowing vessels”) and arteries, as some have claimed. It is more likely that he simply distinguished between larger more interior blood vessels as opposed to smaller ones close to the surface (Lloyd 1991, 177). He probably argued that human seed was drawn from the brain (DK, A13). It has recently been suggested (König 2019), however, that he instead thought 1) that sperm came from the whole body, 2) that the brain was its transit port and 3) that it was ultimately a product of digestion. But no ancient source directly assigns any of these doctrines to Alcmaeon and the arguments in favor of them are very indirect. Contrary to a popular Greek view, which regarded the father alone as providing seed, a view that would be followed by Aristotle (Lloyd 1983, 86 ff.), Alcmaeon may have argued that both parents contribute seed (DK, A13) and that the child takes the sex of the parent who contributes the most seed (DK, A14). It has recently been suggested, however, that our sole source for these views (Censorinus) is mistaken and that, while Alcmaeon thought that both the male and female contributed to the child, only the male contributed seed (Leitao 2012: 278–79), the female contributing menses. According to one report, Alcmaeon thought that the head was the first part of the embryo to develop, although another report has him confessing that he did not have definite knowledge in this area, because no one is able to perceive what is formed first in the infant (DK, A13). These reports are not inconsistent and conform to the epistemology with which Alcmaeon began his book. It is plausible to suppose that he regarded the development of the embryo as one of the imperceptibles about which we can have no certain knowledge. On the other hand, he may have regarded it as a reasonable inference that the part of the body which controls it in life, i.e., the brain, developed first in the womb. Dissection is of obvious relevance to the debate about the development of the embryo, and Alcmaeon’s failure to appeal to dissection of animals in this case is further evidence that he did not employ it as a regular method (Lloyd 1979, 163). Alcmaeon studied not just humans but also animals and plants. He gave an explanation of the sterility of mules (DK, B3) and, if we can believe Aristotle, thought that goats breathed through their ears (DK, A7). More significantly, he used analogies with animals and plants in developing his accounts of human physiology. Thus, the pubic hair that develops when human males are about to produce seed for the first time at age fourteen is analogous to the flowering of plants before they produce seed (DK, A15); milk in mammals is analogous to egg white in birds (DK, A16). The infant in the womb absorbs nutrients through its entire body, like a sponge, although another report suggests that the embryo already feeds through its mouth (DK, A17). However, the text of the latter report should perhaps be amended from stomati [mouth] to sômati [body], thus removing the contradiction (Olivieri 1919, 34). Analogies such as these will become a staple item in later Greek biological treatises, but Alcmaeon is one of the earliest figures in this tradition.

4. Cosmology

4.1 Astronomy

As indicated in section 1 above, there is considerable controversy as to whether and to what extent Alcmaeon was a typical Presocratic cosmologist. Certainly the evidence for his cosmology is meager. There are three references to his astronomical theory (DK, A4). He is reported to have recognized that the planets have a motion from west to east opposite to the motion of the fixed stars. Some doubt that such knowledge was available at the beginning of the fifth century (Dicks 1970, 75). Others suggest that Anaximenes, in the second half of the sixth century, had already distinguished between the fixed stars, which are nailed to the ice-like vault of the sky, and planets which float on the air like leaves (DK13A7; Burkert 1972, 311). Alcmaeon’s belief that the sun is flat is another possible connection to Anaximenes, who said that the sun was flat like a leaf (DK13A15). Finally, another similarity to Ionian astronomy is found in Alcmaeon’s agreement with Heraclitus that lunar eclipses were to be explained by the turning of a bowl-shaped moon. One might have expected, however, that the moon would be flat like the sun (West 1971, 175).

4.2 Opposites

Did Alcmaeon present a cosmogony or cosmology in terms of the interaction of pairs of opposites? Such a cosmology could be seen as yet another connection to earlier speculation in Ionia, since Anaximander’s cosmos is based on the “justice” established between conflicting opposites (DK12B1). Heraclitus is also a possible influence on Alcmaeon, since he seems to envisage an endless process of opposites turning into one another such as is proposed for Alcmaeon (Mansfeld 2014a, 91–2). Aristotle provides the primary evidence for such a cosmology in Alcmaeon (Metaph. 986a22 ff. = A3), but he compares Alcmaeon not to the Ionians but to a group of Pythagoreans who proposed a table of ten pairs of opposites. Alcmaeon agrees with these Pythagoreans in regarding the opposites as principles of things. Aristotle complains, however, that Alcmaeon did not arrive at a definite set of opposites but spoke haphazardly of white, black, sweet, bitter, good, bad, large, and small, and only threw in vague comments about the remaining opposites. It may well be that Alcmaeon’s primary discussion of opposites was in relation to his account of the human body (DK, B4; see the discussion of his medical theories above). Aristotle’s language supports this suggestion to some extent, when he summarizes Alcmaeon’s view as that “the majority of human things (tôn anthrôpinôn) are in pairs” (Metaph. 986a31). Isocrates (DK, A3) says that Alcmaeon, in contrast to Empedocles, who postulated four elements, said that there were only two, and, according to a heterodox view, Alcmaeon posited fire and earth as basic elements (Lebedev 1993). Most scholars follow Aristotle, however, in supposing that Alcmaeon thought that the human body and perhaps the cosmos is constituted from the balance of an indefinite number of opposites. Some have seen Alcmaeon’s unwillingness to adopt a fixed set of opposites as a virtue and a further sign of his empiricism, which is willing to accept that the world is less tidy than theoretical constructs, such as the Pythagorean table of opposites, would suggest (Guthrie 1962, 346).

5. Importance and Influence

Alcmaeon has been somewhat neglected in recent scholarship on early Greek philosophy (e.g., he hardly appears in Curd and Graham 2008, Long 1999 and Taylor 1997, the most recent surveys of the subject, but both Guthrie 1962 and now Zhmud 2012a and 2014 stress his importance). There would appear to be several reasons for this neglect. First, what remains of Alcmaeon’s book has little to say on the metaphysical questions about the first principles of the cosmos and about being, which have dominated recent scholarship on the Presocratics. Second, doubts about his date and about the focus of his investigations have made it difficult to place him in the development of early Greek thought. Finally, a more accurate appreciation of his use of dissection has deflated some of the hyperbolic claims in earlier scholarship about his originality. The extent of his originality and the importance of his influence depend to a degree on his dating. An extremely late dating for his activity (after 450 BCE) makes him appear to espouse the typical views of the age rather than to break new ground. If he was active in the early fifth century, his views are much more original. That Aristotle wrote a separate treatise in response to Alcmaeon argues in favor of his originality. He should probably be regarded as a pioneer in applying a political metaphor to the balance of opposites that constitute the healthy human body. The range of his work in biology is remarkable for the early fifth century and he may have initiated a physiological emphasis in Greek philosophy which was not present in Ionian philosophers, such as Anaximander and Anaximenes, and set the agenda in this area for later Presocratics (Zhmud 2012a, 366). It is sometimes said that his conception of poroi (channels), which connect the sense organs to the brain, influenced Empedocles’ theory of poroi, but the theories may share no more than the name. In Empedocles, all materials have pores in them, which determine whether they mix well with other objects. Sense organs also have pores, but these function not to connect the sense organ to the seat of intelligence (which for Empedocles is the heart) but to determine whether the sense organ can receive the effluences that are poured forth by external objects (Solmsen 1961, 157; Wright 1981, 230). Alcmaeon’s influence was significant in three final ways: 1) His identification of the brain as the seat of human intelligence influenced Philolaus (DK, B13), the Hippocratic Treatise, On the Sacred Disease, and Plato (Timaeus 44d), although a number of thinkers including Empedocles and Aristotle continued to regard the heart as the seat of perception and intelligence. 2) His empiricist epistemology may lie behind important passages in Plato (Phaedo 96b) and Aristotle (Posterior Analytics 100a). 3) He developed the first argument for the immortality of the soul, which may have influenced Plato’s argument in the Phaedrus (245c ff.).


Texts and Commentaries

  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, 1952, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (in three volumes), 6th edition, Dublin and Zürich: Weidmann, Volume 1, Chapter 24, pp. 210–216. Greek texts of the fragments and testimonia with translations in German. Referred to as [DK]. The testimonia for each author are indicated by an A and a number. So A5 is the fifth testimonia about Alcmaeon listed in DK. The B annotations refer to actual fragments of Alcmaeon in DK as opposed to the testimonia, second hand reports, etc., constituting the A annotations.
  • Laks, A. and Most, G., 2016, ‘Alcmaeon’, in Early Greek Philosophy: Western Greek Thinkers (Part 2), A. Laks and G. Most (eds.), Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library: Volume 5), pp. 737–771.
  • Timpanaro Cardini, M., 1958–64, Pitagorici, Testimonianze e frammenti, 3 vols., Firenze: La Nuova Italia, Vol. 1, pp. 124–153 (Greek texts of the fragments and testimonia with translations and commentary in Italian).
  • Wachtler, J., 1896, De Alcmaeone Crotoniata, Leipzig: Teubner (The only full-scale commentary devoted to Alcmaeon. Greek texts of the fragments and testimonia with commentary in Latin).

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