First published Wed Mar 29, 2006; substantive revision Tue Mar 5, 2024

Pythagoreanism can be defined in a number of ways.

(1) Pythagoreanism is the philosophy of the ancient Greek philosopher Pythagoras (ca. 570–ca. 490 BCE), which prescribed a highly structured way of life and espoused the doctrine of metempsychosis (transmigration of the soul after death into a new body, human or animal).

(2) Pythagoreanism is the philosophy of a group of philosophers active in the fifth and the first half of the fourth century BCE, whom Aristotle refers to as “the so-called Pythagoreans” and to whom Plato also refers. Aristotle’s expression, “so-called Pythagoreans,” suggests both that at his time this group of thinkers was commonly called Pythagoreans and, at the same time, calls into question the actual connection between these thinkers and Pythagoras himself. Aristotle ascribes no specific names to these Pythagoreans, but the philosophy which he assigns to them is very similar to what is found in the fragments of Philolaus of Croton (ca. 470–ca. 390 BCE). Thus, Philolaus and his successor Eurytus are likely to have been the most prominent of these Pythagoreans. Philolaus posits limiters and unlimiteds as first principles and emphasizes the role of number in understanding the cosmos. Aristotle also identifies a distinct group of these so-called Pythagoreans who formulated a set of basic principles known as the table of opposites. Plato’s sole reference to Pythagoreans cites their search for the numerical structure of contemporary music and is probably an allusion to Archytas (ca. 420–ca. 350 BCE), who, as far as the evidence allows us to see, is the first great mathematician in the Pythagorean tradition. Starting from the system of Philolaus he developed his own sophisticated account of the world in terms of mathematical proportion.

(3) Many other sixth-, fifth- and fourth-century thinkers are labeled Pythagoreans in the Greek tradition after the fourth century BCE. By the late fourth century CE many of the most prominent Greek philosophers including Parmenides, Plato and Aristotle come to be called Pythagoreans, with no historical justification. There are nonetheless a number of thinkers of the fifth and fourth century BCE, who can legitimately be called Pythagoreans, although often little is known about them except their names. The most important of these figures is Hippasus. What criterion should be used to identify an early figure as a Pythagorean is controversial and there is debate about individual cases. Fourth-century evidence shows that Pythagoreanism gave an unusually large role to women for an ancient philosophical school. It is likely that the Pythagorean communities that practiced a way of life that they traced back to Pythagoras died out in the middle of the fourth century BCE.

(4) The last manifestation of Pythagoreanism, Neopythagoreanism, has been the most influential. Neopythagoreanism is not a unified school of thought but rather a tendency, stretching over many centuries, to view Pythagoras, with no historical justification, as the central and original figure in the whole Greek philosophical tradition. This Pythagoras is often thought to have received his philosophy as a divine revelation, which had been given even earlier to wise men of the ancient Near East such as the Persian Magi, the Hebrews (Moses in particular), and the Egyptian priests. All Greek philosophy after Pythagoras, insofar as it may be true, is seen as derived from this revelation. Thus, Plato’s and Aristotle’s ideas are viewed as derived from Pythagoras (with the mediation of other early Pythagoreans). Many pseudepigrapha are produced in later times in order to provide the Pythagorean “originals” on which Plato and Aristotle drew. Some strands of the Neopythagorean tradition emphasize Pythagoras as master metaphysician, who supposedly originated what are, in fact, the principles of Plato’s later metaphysics, the one and the indefinite dyad. Other Neopythagoreans celebrate Pythagoras as the founder of the quadrivium of mathematical sciences (arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and music), while still others portray him as a magician or as a religious expert and sage, upon whom we should model our lives. Neopythagoreanism probably began already in the second half of the fourth century BCE among Plato’s first successors in the Academy, but particularly flourished from the first century BCE until the end of antiquity. Neopythagoreanism has close connections to Middle and Neoplatonism and from the time of Iamblichus (4th c. CE) is largely absorbed into Neoplatonism. It was the Neopythagorean version of Pythagoreanism that dominated in the Middle Ages and Renaissance.

1. The Philosophy of Pythagoras

See the entry on Pythagoras.

2. The Most Prominent Pythagoreans of the Fifth and Fourth Century

2.1 Philolaus

See the entry on Philolaus.

2.2 Eurytus

In the ancient sources, Eurytus is most frequently mentioned in the same breath as Philolaus, and he is probably the student of Philolaus (Iamblichus, VP 148, 139). Aristoxenus (4th c. BCE) presents Philolaus and Eurytus as the teachers of the last generation of Pythagoreans (Diogenes Laertius VIII 46) and Diogenes Laertius reports that Plato came to Italy to meet Philolaus and Eurytus after the death of Socrates (III 46). In order to be the pupil of Philolaus, who was born around 470, and teach the last generation of Pythagoreans around 400, Eurytus would need to be born between 450 and 440. The sources are very confused as to which S. Italian city he was from, Croton (Iamblichus, VP 148), Tarentum (Iamblichus, VP 267; Diogenes Laertius VIII 46) or Metapontum (Iamblichus, VP 266 and 267). It may be that the Eurytus from Metapontum is a different Eurytus. It is possible that Archytas studied with Eurytus, since Theophrastus (Aristotle’s successor in the Lyceum) cites Archytas as the source for the one testimony we have about the philosophy of Eurytus (Metaph. 6a 19–22). In the catalogue of Pythagoreans at the end of Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life (267), Eurytus appears between Philolaus and Archytas in the list of Pythagoreans from Tarentum, which may thus suggest that he was regarded as the pupil of Philolaus and a teacher of Archytas.

According to Theophrastus (Metaph. 6a 19–22), Eurytus arranged pebbles in a certain way in order to show the number which defined things in the world, such as a man or a horse. Aristotle refers to the same practice (Metaph. 1092b8 ff.), and Alexander provides commentary on the Aristotelian passage (CAG I. 827.9). Aristotle introduces Eurytus as someone who regarded numbers as causes of substances by being the points that bound spatial magnitudes. He says that Eurytus made likenesses of the shapes of things in the natural world with pebbles and thus determined the number which belongs to each thing by the number of pebbles required. Scholars often treat Eurytus’ procedure as puerile and have sometimes not taken him seriously (Kahn 2001, 33), or suggested that Theophrastus is ironical in his presentation (e.g., Zhmud 2012, 410–411). There is, however, no obvious irony in Theophrastus’ remarks. He, in fact, presents Eurytus very positively as someone who showed in detail how specific parts of the cosmos arose out of basic principles, in contrast to other thinkers, who posit basic principles but do not go very far in explaining how the world arises from those principles. This positive presentation may reflect Theophrastus’ source, Archytas, who perhaps saw Eurytus as attempting to carry out Philolaus’ project of determining the numbers that give us knowledge of things in the world (Huffman 2005, 55; see also Netz 2014, 173–178).

How are we, then, to understand Eurytus’ procedure? It does not seem plausible to suppose that he simply drew a picture or an outline drawing of a man or a horse and then counted the number of pebbles required to make the outline (Riedweg 2005, 86) or fill in the picture, since the number would vary with the size of the drawing and the size of the pebbles. A large picture of a man would require many more pebbles than a small one, so that it would seem arbitrary which number to associate with man. This interpretation treats Eurytus as a mosaicist and is largely derived from Alexander’s testimony. Aristotle’s presentation supports another interpretation. He draws a parallel with those who arrange numbers of pebbles into shapes, such as a triangle or a square. This suggests that Eurytus had observed that, e.g., any three points in a plane determine a triangle and any four a quadrilateral. He may then have drawn the general conclusion that any shape or structure was determined by a unique number of points and tried to represent these by setting out the necessary number of pebbles. Thus, the complex structure of a three-dimensional object such as the human body would require a large number of points, but the number of points required to determine a human being could be expected to be unique and to differ from the number that determined any other object in the natural world, such as a horse (Kirk and Raven 1957, 313 ff.; Guthrie 1962, 273 ff.; Barnes 1982, 390–391; Cambiano 1998; Betegh 2014b, 89). It is important to note that nothing in these reports suggests that Eurytus thought that things were composed of numbers or that he regarded the points that defined a given thing as atoms of which things were made, as has sometimes been supposed (Cornford 1922–1923, 10–11). Instead, he is best understood as making a bold attempt to show that the structure of all things is determined by number and thus to provide specifics for Philolaus’ general thesis that all things are known through number. Another approach is to argue that no reference is being made to creating a picture out of pebbles. The pebbles refer instead to counters on an abacus, which the Greeks used for calculations. In this case Eurytus can be supposed to have started by identifying certain basic numerical properties with features of the world and then deriving the number of man or horse through calculations using the abacus (Netz 2014, 173–178).

2.3 Aristotle’s “So-called” Pythagoreans

Aristotle refers to the Pythagoreans frequently in his extant works, especially in the Metaphysics. There are several puzzles about these references. First, his usual practice is to refer to the Pythagoreans as a group rather than naming individuals. He mentions Philolaus and Eurytus by name only once each and Archytas four times. Yet, the basic Pythagorean system which he describes in most detail in Metaphysics 1.5 shows such strong similarities to the fragments of Philolaus that Philolaus must be the primary source (Huffman 1993, 28–94, Schofield 2012, 147), although some scholars emphasize that Aristotle clearly did use other sources (Primavesi 2012, 255) and even that Philolaus, while perhaps the acme of Pythagorean philosophy, might not have represented mainstream Pythagoreanism thus explaining why Aristotle refers to the Pythagoreans as a group rather than singling out Philolaus (McKirahan 2013). Second, he frequently refers to the Pythagoreans that he discusses as the “so-called” Pythagoreans. Why does he add the qualifying phrase “so-called?” This phrase indicates not that these are false Pythagoreans in contrast to some other true Pythagoreans but rather that this is the standard way of referring to these people, it is what people call them; but the phrase also indicates that Aristotle has reservations about the name. Aristotle is expressing his doubts about how or whether these figures are connected to Pythagoras himself, whom Aristotle regards as a wonder-working founder of a way of life rather than as participating in the tradition of Presocratic cosmology (Huffman 1993, 31–34. This view is criticized by Álvarez Salas 2021, who argues that Aristotle includes Pythagoras in his plural references to the Pythagoreans and treats him as part of the tradition of Presocratic cosmology and not just as a wonder-worker). It could also be that it is the very variety of sources that Aristotle is using that leads him to recognize that there are quite different stages in the develpment of Pythagoreanism and hence to wonder in what sense a figure like Philolaus who is at the end of that development should still be called a Pythagorean (Primavesi 2012).

The biggest puzzle, however, concerns the philosophical system that Aristotle assigns to the Pythagoreans. For the purposes of his discussion in the Metaphysics, he treats most Pythagoreans as adopting a mainstream system in contrast to another group of Pythagoreans whose system is based on the table of opposites (see section 2.4). The central thesis of the mainstream system is stated in two basic ways: the Pythagoreans say that things are numbers or that they are made out of numbers. In his most extended account of the system in Metaphysics 1.5, Aristotle says that the Pythagoreans were led to this view by noticing more similarities between things and numbers than between things and the elements, such as fire and water, adopted by earlier thinkers. The Pythagoreans thus concluded that things were or were made of numbers and that the principles of numbers, the odd and the even, are principles of all things. The odd is limited and the even unlimited. Aristotle criticizes the Pythagoreans for being so enamored of numerical order that they imposed it on the world even where it was not suggested by the phenomena. Thus appearances suggested that there were nine heavenly bodies orbiting in the heavens but, since they regarded ten as the perfect number, they supposed that there must be a tenth heavenly body, the counter-earth, which we cannot see. Later, Aristotle is also critical of the Pythagoreans for employing principles that do not derive from the sensible world, i.e., mathematical principles, even though all their efforts were directed at explaining the physical world (Metaphysics 989b29). How can they explain features of physical bodies such as weight or motion using principles which have no weight and do not move (990a8–990a16)? Indeed, it becomes clear that Aristotle interpreted the Pythagorean cosmogony as starting out by constructing the number one. The one then draws in the unlimited and produces the rest of the number series and evidently the cosmos at the same time. The number one and the other numbers from 1 to 10 are conceived of as physical entities (Metaphysics 1091a13–18). The puzzle is that Aristotle’s description makes clear that he is basically describing Philolaus’ system (e.g., the counter-earth, limit and unlimited, the generation of a one), yet a number of his central assertions are flatly contradicted by the surviving fragments of Philolaus. Most importantly, Philolaus never says that things are numbers or are made out of numbers. For Philolaus things are composed of limiters and unlimiteds held together by harmony (Frs. 1, 2 and 6) and unlimiteds appear to include physical things like fire and breath (Fr. 7, Aristotle Fr. 201). Numbers and the odd and the even do play a prominent role in Philolaus (Frs. 4–5), but there is no hint that they are understood as physical entites. Instead number has an epistemological role: all things are known through number (Fr. 4). How are we to explain this tension between what Aristotle reports and the fragments of Philolaus? One approach is to recognize that Aristotle is not giving a historical report of what the Pythagoreans said but an interpretation of what he found in Philolaus and others. He does not in fact know of any text in which the Pythagoreans said that things were numbers or were made of numbers. Instead this is a conclusion drawn by Aristotle; it is his summary statement of what the Pythagorean system amounts to. That this is what Aristotle is doing is suggested by another passage in the Metaphysics where he starts out by flatly stating that the Pythagoreans say that all things are numbers but then goes on to add “at least they apply mathematical theories to bodies as if they (the bodies) consisted of those numbers” (Metaphysics 1083b16). The “at least” and “as if” show that Aristotle is drawing an inference rather than referring to any explicit statement by the Pythagoreans that things are numbers. Thus for Philolaus there are analogies between numbers and things and numbers give us knowledge of things but Aristotle mistakenly takes this to be equivalent to saying that things are numbers or are made of numbers. Another approach is to argue that Aristotle was right that Philolaus and other Pythagoreans thought of the number one and other numbers as physical entities. The one constructed in Philolaus Fr. 7 is not just the primal physical unity but also the number one (Schofield 2012). At the opposite extreme, Zhmud argues that Aristotle has essentially invented this Pythagorean system with little regard for what any actual Pythagoreans said in order to serve as background for his account of Plato’s theory of principles (2012a, 438, 394–414). Another approach tries to mitigate the differences between Philolaus and Aristotle and suggests that Aristotle’s emphasis on number was derived from Pythagorean numerology that was independent of Philolaus but that was combined with material from Philolaus as a result of Aristotle’s decision to present one mainstream Pythagorean system (Primavesi 2014).

2.4 The Pythagoreans of the Table of Opposites

At Metaphysics 986a22, after presenting his account of the philosophy of “the so-called” Pythagoreans (985b23), which has strong connections to the philosophy of Philolaus, Aristotle turns to “others of this same group” and assigns to them what is commonly known as the table of opposites (the opposites arranged according to column [kata sustoichian]). These Pythagoreans presented the principles of reality as consisting of ten pairs of opposites:

limit unlimited
odd even
unity plurality
right left
male female
rest motion
straight crooked
light darkness
good bad
square oblong

Aristotle then contrasts these Pythagoreans with Alcmaeon of Croton, who said that the majority of human things come in pairs, and praises the Pythagoreans for carefully defining the pairs of opposites both in number and character, whereas Alcmaeon seemed to present a randomly selected and ill-defined group of opposites. Aristotle suggests that either Alcmaeon was influenced by these Pythagoreans or they by him. Aristotle was thus not sure of the date of these Pythagoreans but seems to entertain the idea that they either lived a little before Alcmaeon or a little after, which would make them active anywhere from the late 6th to the mid 5th century. Aristotle’s manner of introducing these Pythagoreans suggests that they are distinct from Philolaus and his pupil Eurytus and perhaps earlier (Schofield 2012: 156), but it is not possible to be more specific about their identity. It is possible that Aristotle only knows of the table through oral transmission and that there were no specific names attached to it.

The table shows a strong normative slant by including good in one column and bad in the other. In contrast, while Philolaus posits the first two opposites in the table, limit and unlimited, as first principles, there is no suggestion in the extant fragments of Philolaus that limit was good and unlimited bad. Opposites played a large role in most Presocratic philosophical systems. The Pythagoreans who posited the table of opposites differed from other early Greek philosophers not only in the normative view of the opposites but also by including strikingly abstract pairs such as straight and crooked and odd and even, in contrast to the more concrete opposites such as hot and cold, which are typical elsewhere in early Greek philosophy. Goldin (2015) argues that the table embodies the associations of concepts that formed the basis for the Pythagorean way of life and that Aristotle recognized that the table was a valuable early attempt to explain the world, although one that failed because it did not identify relationships of priority and posteriority among the principles. Similar tables of opposites appear in the Academy (Aristotle, Metaph. 1093b11; EN 1106b29 referring to Speusippus; Simplicius in CAG IX. 247. 30ff.), and Aristotle himself seems at times to adopt such a table (Metaph. 1004b27 ff.; Phys. 201b25). Later Platonists and Neopythagoreans will continue to develop these tables (see Burkert 1972a, 52, n. 119 for a list). The table of opposites thus provides one of the clearest cases of continuity between early Pythagoreanism and Platonism. Zhmud argues that the table has little to do with early Pythagoreanism and is largely a product of the Academy (2012: 449–452) and Burkert thought the table was a mixture of Academic and Pythagorean elements (1972: 51–52) but Aristotle’s discussion of it in connection with Alcmaeon clearly shows that he regarded it as belonging to the fifth-century and it is implausible to suppose that he confused the work of his contemporaries in the Academy with Pythagorean ideas that were developed over a century earlier. Goldin argues that we must accept Aristotle’s evidence that some Pythagoreans arranged principles in columns even if we cannot be sure they identified specifically the ten pairs listed by Aristotle (2015: 173). It may well be that the similarity between this Pythagorean table of opposites and later Academic versions led to the Neopythagorean habit, starting already in the early Academy, of mistakenly assigning the fundamental pair of opposites in Plato’s late metaphysics, the one and the indefinite dyad, back to Pythagoras (see on Neopythagoreanism below).

2.5 Archytas

See the entry on Archytas.

3. Other Pythagoreans of the Sixth, Fifth and Fourth Centuries

3.1 The Catalogue of Pythagoreans in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life: Who Counts as a Pythagorean?

Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life (4th c. CE) ends with a catalogue of 218 Pythagorean men organized by city followed by a list of 17 of the most famous Pythagorean women. Of these 235 Pythagoreans, 145 appear nowhere else in the ancient tradition. This impressive list of names shows the wide impact of Pythagoreanism in the fifth and fourth centuries BCE. To what extent is it reliable? A long line of scholars has argued that the catalogue has close connections to and is likely to be based on Aristoxenus in the fourth century BCE and is thus a reasonably accurate reflection of early Pythagoreanism rather than a creation of the later Neopythagorean tradition (Rohde 1871–1872, 171; Diels 1965, 23; Timpanaro-Cardini 1958–1964, III 38 ff.; Burkert 1972a, 105, n. 40; Zhmud 2012b, 235–244). This is up to a point a reasonable conclusion, since it is hard to see who would have been better placed than Aristoxenus to have such detailed information.

The arguments connecting Aristoxenus to the catalogue are not unassailable, however, and it is likely that the list has been altered in transmission, so that it cannot simply be accepted as the testimony of Aristoxenus (Huffman 2008a). No names on the list can be positively assigned to a date later than Aristoxenus, but this would be likely to be true, even if the list were compiled at a later date, since Pythagoreanism appears to have largely died out for the two centuries immediately following Aristoxenus’ death. Thus, Iamblichus does not mention any Pythagorean who can be positively dated after the time of Aristoxenus anywhere else in On the Pythagorean Life either. Scholars have also argued that Iamblichus cannot have composed the catalogue, since he mentions some 18 names that do not appear in the catalogue. This argument would only work, if Iamblichus were a careful and systematic author, which the repetitions and inconsistencies in On the Pythagorean Life show that he was not. While it is unlikely that Iamblichus composed the catalogue from scratch, it is perfectly possible that he edited it in a number of ways, while not feeling compelled to make it consistent with everything he says elsewhere in the text. There are some peculiarities of the catalogue that suggest a connection to Aristoxenus. Philolaus and Eurytus are listed not under Croton but under Tarentum, just as they are in one of the Fragments of Aristoxenus (Fr. 19 Wehrli = Diogenes Laertius VIII 46). On the other hand, some features of the catalogue are inconsistent with what we know of Aristoxenus. Aristoxenus’ teacher, Xenophilus, who is identified as from the Thracian Chalcidice in the Fragments of Aristoxenus (Frs. 18 and 19 Wehrli), is identified as from Cyzicus in the catalogue. Moreover, the legendary figure, Abaris, is included in the catalogue and even said to be from the mythical Hyperborea, whereas Aristoxenus is usually seen as resolutely trying to rationalize the Pythagorean tradition. Thus, while Aristoxenus is quite plausibly taken to be the author of the core of the catalogue, it is likely that additions, omissions, and various changes have been made to the original document and hence it is impossible to be sure, in most cases, whether a given name has the authority of Aristoxenus behind it or not.

The catalogue includes several problematic names, such as Alcmaeon, Empedocles, Parmenides and Melissus. Alcmaeon was active in Croton when the Pythagoreans flourished there, but Aristotle explicitly distinguishes Alcmaeon from the Pythagoreans and scholarly consensus is that he is not a Pythagorean (see the entry on Alcmaeon). Most scholars would agree that Empedocles was heavily influenced by Pythagoreanism; in the later tradition fragments of Empedocles are routinely cited to support the Pythagorean doctrines of metempsychosis and vegetarianism (e.g., Sextus Empiricus, Adversus Mathematicos IX 126–30). On the other hand, both in the ancient and in the modern world, Empedocles is not usually labeled a Pythagorean, because, whatever the initial Pythagorean influences, he developed a philosophical system that was his own original contribution. Parmenides is again not usually identified as a Pythagorean in either the ancient or modern tradition and, although scholars have speculated on Pythagorean influences on Parmenides, there is little that can be identified as overtly Pythagorean in his philosophy. The reason for Parmenides’ inclusion in the catalogue is pretty clearly the tradition that his alleged teacher Ameinias was a Pythagorean (Diogenes Laertius IX 21). There is no reason to doubt this story, but it gives us no more reason to call Parmenides a Pythagorean than to call Plato a Socratic or Aristotle a Platonist. It would appear that Melissus was included on the list because he was regarded in turn as the pupil of Parmenides. Inclusion in the catalogue thus need not indicate that a figure lived a Pythagorean way of life or that he adopted metaphysical principles that were distinctively Pythagorean; he need only have had contact with a Pythagorean teacher. It is possible that Aristoxenus included Parmenides and Melissus on the list for these reasons or that he had better reasons for including them (e.g., evidence that they lived a Pythagorean life), but it is precisely famous names such as these that would be likely to have been added to the list in later times, and they may well not have appeared in Aristoxenus’ catalogue at all.

Zhmud (2012a, 109–134) has argued that it begs the question to use a doctrinal criterion to identify Pythagoreans. We need to first identify Pythagoreans and then see what their doctrines are. Aristoxenus’ catalogue of Pythagoreans as preserved in Iamblichus is the crucial source. We should take the Pythagoreans on this list whom we can identify (the overwhelming majority are just names for us) and study their interests and activities in order to arrive at a picture of early Pythagoreanism. Of the 235 names there are only 15 about whom we know anything significant. Some of these are non-controversial (Hippasus, Philolaus, Eurytus and Archytas). However, Zhmud puts particular emphasis on a series of figures not typically regarded as Pythagoreans, e.g., Democedes, Alcmaeon, Iccus, Menestor,and Hippon. The range of interests of these figures leads him to conclude that there is no one characteristic that is shared by all Pythagoreans and that Wittgestein’s concept of a family resemblance should be employed to describe Pythagoreanism. Moreover, his reliance on figures like Alcmaeon and Menestor leads him to the surprising conclusion that natural science and medicine were more important than mathematics for the philosophical views of early Pythagoreans (2012a, 23). The foundation for this view of early Pythagoreanism is problematic since the scholarly consensus is that Alcmaeon was not a Pythagorean and it is also far from certain that Menestor was a Pythagorean (see below). As argued above, Iamblichus’ catalogue cannot be used mechanically as a guarantee that a given figure was a Pythagorean, because we cannot be sure that it always reflects Aristoxenus. What criteria should then be used?

First, anyone identified as a Pythagorean by an early source uncontaminated by the Neopythagorean glorification of Pythagoras (see below) can be regarded as a Pythagorean. This would include sources dating before the early Academy (ca. 350 BCE), where Neopythagoreanism has its origin, and Peripatetic sources contemporary with the early Academy (ca. 350–300 BCE, e.g., Aristotle, Aristoxenus and Eudemus), who, under the influence of Aristotle, defined themselves in opposition to the Academic view of Pythagoras.

Second, a doctrinal criterion is applicable. Anyone who espouses the philosophy assigned to the Pythagoreans by Aristotle can be regarded as a Pythagorean, although Aristotle presents that philosophy under an interpretation that must be taken into account. It is important that the use of such a doctrinal criterion be limited to quite specific doctrines such as limiters and unlimiteds as first principles and the cosmology that includes the counter-earth and central fire. Particularly to be avoided is the assumption that any early mathematician or any early figure who assigns mathematical ideas a role in the cosmos is a Pythagorean. Mathematicians such as Theodorus of Cyrene (who is included in Iamblichus’ catalogue) and Hippocrates of Chios (who is not) are not treated as Pythagoreans in the early sources such as Plato, Aristotle and Eudemus, and there is accordingly no good reason to call them Pythagoreans. Similarly, the sculptor, Polyclitus of Argos, stated that “the good comes to be … through many numbers,” (Fr. 2 DK), but no ancient source calls him a Pythagorean (Huffman 2002). As Burkert has emphasized, mathematics is a Greek and not just a specifically Pythagorean passion (1972a, 427).

Third, anyone universally (or almost universally) called a Pythagorean by later sources, and whom early sources do not treat as independent of Pythagoreanism, explicitly or implicitly, can be regarded as a Pythagorean. This would include figures embedded in the biographical tradition about Pythagoras and the early Pythagoreans, such as the husband and wife, Myllias and Timycha.

This last criterion is more subjective than the first two and difficult cases arise. The fifth-century botanist Menestor (DK I 375) is discussed by Theophrastus and called one of “the old natural philosophers” (CP VI 3.5) with no mention of any Pythagoreanism. In this case, the inclusion of a Menestor in Iamblichus’ catalogue is not enough reason to regard Theophrastus’ Menestor as a Pythagorean. On the other hand, although Aristotle treats Hippasus separately from the Pythagoreans, as he does Archytas, the almost universal identification of Hippasus as a Pythagorean in the later tradition and his deep involvement in the biography of early Pythagoreanism, show that he should be regarded as a Pythagorean (on Hippasus, see section 3.4 below). The fifth-century figure Hippo (DK I 385), who is derided by Aristotle and paired with Thales as positing water as the first principle (Metaph. 984a3), is a particularly difficult case. An Hippo is listed in Iamblichus’ catalogue under Samos and Censorinus tells us that Aristoxenus assigned Hippo to Samos rather than Metapontum (DK I 385.4–5). This makes it look as if Aristoxenus may be responsible for including Hippo in the catalogue. Burkert has also tried to demonstrate connections between Hippo’s philosophy and that of the Pythagoreans (1972a, 290, n. 62). On the other hand, neither Aristotle nor Theophrastus nor any of the Aristotelian commentators call him a Pythagorean and the doxographers describe this Hippo as from Rhegium (e.g., Hippolytus in DK I 385.17). It is thus not clear whether we are dealing with one person or two people named Hippo and it is doubtful that the Hippo discussed by the Peripatetics was a Pythagorean (Zhmud regards Hippo as well as Menestor and Theodorus as Pythagoreans — 2012a, 126–128). Those figures of the sixth, fifth and fourth century who have the best claim to be considered Pythagoreans will be discussed in the following sections.

3.2 The Earliest Pythagoreans: Brontinus, Theano, etc.

In the standard collection of the fragments and testimonia of the Presocratics, Cercops, Petron, Brontinus, Hippasus, Calliphon, Democedes, and Parmeniscus are listed as older Pythagoreans (DK I 105–113). Hippasus, who is the most important of these figures, will be discussed separately below (sect. 3.4). Of the rest only Brontinus, Calliphon and Parmeniscus appear in Iamblichus’ catalogue.

Brontinus is presented as either the husband or father of Theano (see section 3.3 below). Brontinus (DK I 106–107) is elsewhere said to have had a wife Deino and to be either from Metapontum or Croton. Little is known about him, but his existence appears to be confirmed by Alcmaeon, writing in the late sixth or early fifth century, who addresses his book to a Brontinus along with Leon and Bathyllus (Fr. 1 DK). The latter two may also be Pythagoreans, since a Leon is listed under Metapontum and a Bathylaus (sic) under Posidonia, in Iamblichus’ catalogue.

The elusive connection between Orphism and Pythagoreanism rears its head with Brontinus. In late antiquity there was a consensus that Pythagoras himself had been initiated into the Orphic mysteries and derived much of his philosophy from Orphism (Proclus, Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus, 3.168.8). Authors of the fifth century BCE know of no such initiation and often indicate that the influence went the other way by reporting that Pythagoras was, in fact, the author of supposed Orphic texts (Ion of Chios as reported in Diog. Laert. 8.8). Similarly, the fourth-century author, Epigenes, reports that Brontinus is supposed to be the real author of two works circulating in the name of Orpheus (West 1983, 9 ff.). In the end it is impossible to determine the relationship between Pythagoreanism and Orphism because of the difficulty of defining either movement precisely (see Betegh 2014a).

Cercops (DK I 105–106) is an even more obscure figure who is, again according to Epigenes, the supposed Pythagorean author of Orphic texts (West 1983, 9, 248), although Burkert doubts that he was a Pythagorean (1972a, 130).

To Petron (DK I 106) is ascribed the startling doctrine that there are 183 worlds arranged in a triangle, but he is only known from a passage in Plutarch, is not called a Pythagorean there and is probably a literary fiction (Guthrie 1962, 322–323; Burkert 1972a, 114).

A Parmeniscus (DK I 112–113) is called a Pythagorean by Diogenes Laertius (IX 20) and may be the same as the Parmiskos listed under Metapontum in Iamblichus’ catalogue. Athenaeus reports that a Parmeniscus of Metapontum lost the ability to laugh after descending into the cave of Trophonius, only to recover it in a temple on Delos, where the surviving inventory of the temple of Artemis records a dedication of a cup by a Parmiskos (Burkert 1972a, 154).

There no good reason to think that Democedes (DK I 110–112), the physician from Croton, was himself a Pythagorean, although he had some Pythagorean connections. He is famous from Herodotus’ account (III 125 ff.) of his service to the tyrant, Polycrates, and the Persian king, Darius. One late source names him a Pythagorean (DK I 112.21). Iamblichus mentions a Pythagorean named Democedes, who was involved in the political turmoil surrounding the conspiracy of Cylon against the Pythagoreans, but it is far from clear that this was the physician (VP 257–261). Herodotus never calls Democedes a Pythagorean nor do any other of the later sources (e.g., Aelian, Athenaeus, the Suda), nor does he appear in Iamblichus’ catalogue. A Calliphon, who could be Democedes’ father, is presented as an associate of Pythagoras by Hermippus (DK I 111.36 ff.) and appears in Iamblichus’ catalogue, so it is reasonable to regard him as a Pythagorean, although we know nothing more of him. It is reported (Herodotus III 137) that Democedes married the daughter of the Olympic victor, Milon, who was the Pythagorean, whose house was used as a meeting place (Iamblichus, VP 249). It was undoubtedly because Democedes came from Croton at roughly the time when Pythagoras was prominent there and because of the Pythagorean connections of his father and father-in-law that late sources came to label Democedes himself a Pythagorean. For an argument that Democedes was a Pythagorean see Zhmud 2012a, 120.

3.3 Pythagorean Women

Women were probably more active in Pythagoreanism than any other ancient philosophical movement. The evidence is not extensive but is sufficient to give us a glimpse of their role. At the end of the catalogue of Pythagoreans in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life, after the list of 218 male Pythagoreans, the names of 17 Pythagorean women are given (VP 267). Since this list is likely to be based on the work of Aristoxenus, it probably represents what Aristoxenus learned from fourth-century Pythagoreans, although we cannot, of course, be certain that some names were not inserted into the list after the time of Aristoxenus (see section 3.1 above and Dutsch 2020, 43–51 for a new sceptical reading of this catalogue). Eleven are identified as the wife, daughter or sister of a man but seven are simply identified by their region or city-state of origin, although the Echecrateia of Phlius listed seems likely to be connected to the Echecrates of Phlius who appears in Plato’s Phaedo. We know nothing else about most of the names on the list and thus cannot be sure in individual cases whether they belong to the sixth, fifth or fourth century. For a speculative reconstruction of the role of women in the Pythagorean society see Rowett (2014, 122–123), but this reconstruction partly depends on the speech that Iamblichus reports Pythagoras gave to the women of Croton upon his arrival (VP 54–57); however, while Pythagoras did give speeches to different groups, including women, the text of the speech in Iamblichus is probably a later fabrication (Burkert 1972a, 115). The Pythagoreans put particular emphasis on marital fidelity on the part of both men and women (Gemelli Marciano 2014, 145). There is also no reliable evidence for any writings by these women, although in the later tradition works were forged in the names of some of them and of other Pythagorean women not on the list (see Pellò 2022 and section 4.2 below).

The most famous name on the list is Theano who is here called the wife of Brontinus but who is elsewhere treated as either the wife, daughter or pupil of Pythagoras (Diogenes Laertius VIII 42; Burkert 1972a, 114). The role of women in early Pythagoreanism and the centrality of Theano is further attested by Aristoxenus’ contemporary, Dicaearchus, who reports that Pythagoras had as followers not just men but also women and that one of these, Theano, became famous (Fr. 40 Mirhday = Porphyry, VP 19). It is striking that Dicaearchus does not identify her as the wife of either Brontius or Pythagoras but simply as a follower of Pythagoras. In the later tradition a number of works were forged in her name (see section 4.2 below), but we have little reliable evidence about her (see Thesleff 1965, 193–201, for testimonia and texts; Delatte 1922, 246–249; Montepaone 1993; and Macris 2016). The second most famous name on the list is Timycha who, when ten months pregnant, reportedly bit off her own tongue so that she could not, under torture, reveal Pythagorean secrets to the tyrant Dionysius (Iamblichus, VP 189–194). This story goes back to Neanthes, writing in the late fourth or early third century and may rely on local Pythagorean tradition (Schorn 2014, 310). See also Macris 2016.

3.4 Hippasus and Other Fifth-century Pythagoreans: acusmatici and mathêmatici

Hippasus is a crucial figure in the history of Pythagoreanism, because the tradition about him suggests that even in the fifth century there was debate within the Pythagorean tradition itself as to whether Pythagoras was largely important as the founder of a set of rules to follow in living one’s life or whether his teaching also had a mathematical and scientific dimension. Hippasus was probably from Metapontum (Aristotle, Metaph. 984a7; Diogenes Laertius VIII 84), although Iamblichus says there was controversy as to whether he was from Metapontum or Croton (VP 81), and he is listed under Sybaris in Iamblichus’ catalogue (VP 267). He is consistently portrayed as a rebel in the Pythagorean tradition, in one case a democratic rebel who challenged the aristocratic Pythagorean leadership in Croton (Iamb. VP 257), but more commonly as the thinker who initiated Pythagorean study of mathematics and the natural world.

It is in this latter role that he is connected with the split between two groups in ancient Pythagoreanism, the acusmatici (who emphasized rules for living one’s life, including various taboos) and the mathêmatici (who emphasized study of mathematics and the natural world). Each group claimed to be the true Pythagoreans. Our knowledge of this split comes from Iamblichus, who unfortunately presents two contradictory versions, with the result that Hippasus is sometimes said to be one of the mathêmatici and sometimes one of the acusmatici. Burkert has convincingly shown that the correct version is that reported by Iamblichus at De Communi Mathematica Scientia 76.19 ff. (1972a, 192 ff.). According to this account, the acusmatici denied that the mathêmatici were Pythagoreans at all, saying that their philosophy derived from Hippasus instead. The mathêmatici for their part, while recognizing that the acusmatici were Pythagoreans of a sort, argued that they themselves were Pythagoreans in a truer sense. Hippasus’ supposed innovations, they said, were in fact plagiarisms from Pythagoras himself. The mathêmatici explained that, upon Pythagoras’ arrival in Italy, the leading men in the cities did not have time to learn the sciences and the proofs of what Pythagoras said, so that Pythagoras just gave them instructions on how to act, without explaining the reasons. The younger men, who did have the leisure to devote to study, learned the mathematical sciences and the proofs. The former group were the first acusmatici, who learned the oral instructions of Pythagoras on how to live (the acusmata = “things heard”), while the latter group were the first mathêmatici. Hippasus was thus closely connected to the mathêmatici in this split in Pythagoreanism but ended up being disavowed by both sides. For an attempt to further characterize the mathêmatici see Horky 2013. For more discussion of the acusmata see section 4.3 of the SEP article on Pythagoras.

It is difficult to be sure of Hippasus’ dates, but he is typically regarded as active in the first half of the fifth century and perhaps early in that period (Burkert 1972a, 206). The split in Pythagoreanism may have occurred after the main period of his work and was perhaps connected to the attacks on the Pythagorean societies by outsiders around 450 BCE (Burkert 1972a, 207), but certainty is not possible. Zhmud (2012a, 169–195) has argued that the split is an invention of the later tradition, appearing first in Clement of Alexandria and disappearing after Iamblichus. He also notes that the term acusmata appears first in Iamblichus (On the Pythagorean Life 82–86) and suggests that it also is a creation of the later tradition. He admits that the Pythagorean maxims did exist earlier, as the testimony of Aristotle shows, but they were known as symbola, were originally very few in number and were mainly a literary phenomenon rather than being tied to people who actually practiced them. The consensus view, which accepts the split, is based on Burkert’s argument that Iamblichus’account of the split between the acusmatici and mathêmatici can be shown to be derived from Aristotle (1972a, 196). Burkert later reaffirmed this position, although with a little less confidence, asserting that the Aristotelian provenance of the text is “as obvious as it is unprovable” (1998, 315). Indeed the description of the split in what is likely to be the original version (Iamblichus, On General Mathematical Science 76.16–77.18) uses language in describing the Pythagoreans that is almost an Aristotelian signature, “There are two forms of the Italian philosophy which is called Pythagorean” (76.16). Aristotle famously describes the Pythagoreans as “those called Pythagoreans” and also as “the Italians” (e.g., Mete. 342b30, Cael. 293a20). Thus, Aristotle remains the most likely source. One might also argue against the split on the grounds that there are no individuals in the historical record that can be confidently identified as acusmatici. Since the acusmatici were neither original nor full-time philosophers, however, and simply preserved the oral taboos handed down by Pythagoras, it is not surprising that they are not singled out for attention in the sources. Only a relatively small number of the names in Iamblichus’ catalogue can certainly be identified as mathêmatici and most of the others, particularly the 145 individuals whose names are only known from the catalogue, are likely to be acusmatici, who to a greater or lesser degree followed the Pythagorean acusmata, but left no other trace of their activity. In addition, a number of other Pythagoreans of the fifth and fourth century, who figure in anecdotes about the Pythagorean life are likely to be acusmatici (see below).

Hippasus is the first figure in the Pythagorean tradition who can with some confidence be identified as a natural philosopher, mathematician and music theorist. His connections are as much with figures outside the Pythagorean tradition as those within it. This independence may explain why neither Aristotle nor the doxographical tradition label him a Pythagorean, but he is too deeply embedded in the traditions about early Pythagoreanism for there to be any doubt that he was in some sense a Pythagorean. Aristotle pairs Hippasus with Heraclitus as positing fire as the primary element (Metaph. 984a7) and this pairing is repeated in the doxography that descends from Theophrastus (DK I 109. 5–16), according to which Hippasus also said that the soul was made of fire. Philolaus, who was probably two generations later than Hippasus, might have been influenced by Hippasus in starting his cosmology with the central fire (Fr. 7). For Philolaus, however, the central fire is a compound of limiter and unlimited, whereas Hippasus is presented as a monist and does not start from Philolaus’ fundamental opposition between limiters and unlimiteds.

There are only a few other assertions about the cosmology of Hippasus and most of these seem to be the result of Peripatetic attempts to classify him, such as the assertions that he makes all things from fire by condensation and rarefaction and dissolves all things into fire, which is the one underlying nature and that he and Heraclitus regarded the universe as one, (always) moving and limited in extent (DK I 109.8–10). More intriguing is the claim that he thought there was “a fixed time for the change of the cosmos” (Diogenes Laertius VIII 84), which might be a reference to a doctrine of eternal recurrence, according to which events exactly repeat themselves at fixed periods of time. This doctrine is attested elsewhere for Pythagoras (Dicaearchus in Porphyry, VP 19). Our information about Hippasus is sketchy, because he evidently did not write a book. Demetrius of Magnesia (1st century BCE) reports that Hippasus left nothing behind in writing (Diogenes Laertius VIII 84) and this is in accord with the tradition that Philolaus was the first Pythagorean to write a book.

Hippasus originates the early Pythagorean tradition of scientific and mathematical analysis of music, which reaches its culmination in Archytas a century later. The correspondence between the central musical concords of the octave, fifth, and fourth and the whole number ratios 2 : 1, 3 : 2 and 4 : 3 is reflected in the acusmata (Iamblichus, VP 82) and was thus probably already known by Pythagoras. This correspondence was central to Philolaus’ conception of the cosmos (Fr. 6a). Although the later tradition tried to assign the discovery to Pythagoras himself (Iamblichus, VP 115), the method described in the story would not in fact have worked (Burkert 1972a, 375–376). Hippasus is the first person to whom is assigned an experiment demonstrating these correspondences that is scientifically possible. Aristoxenus (Fr. 90 Wehrli = DK I 109. 31 ff.) reports that Hippasus prepared four bronze disks of equal diameters, whose thicknesses were in the given ratios, and it is true that, if free hanging disks of equal diameter are struck, the sound produced by, e.g., a disk half as thick as another will be an octave apart from the sound produced by the other disk (Burkert 1972a, 377). Hippasus, thus, may be the first person to devise an experiment to show that a physical law can be expressed mathematically (Zhmud 2012a, 310).

Another text associates Hippasus with Lasus of Hermione in an attempt to demonstrate the correspondence by filling vessels with liquid in the appropriate ratios. It is less clear whether this experiment would have worked as described (Barker 1989, 31–32). Lasus was prominent in Athens in the second half of the sixth century at the time of the Pisistratid tyranny and was thus probably a generation older than Hippasus. There is no indication that Lasus was a Pythagorean and this testimony suggests that the discovery of and interest in the mathematical basis of the concordant musical intervals was not limited to the Pythagorean tradition. Lasus and Hippasus are sometimes said to have been the first to put forth the influential but mistaken thesis that the pitch of a sound depended on the speed with which it travels, but it is far more likely that Archytas originated this view. In the later tradition Hippasus is reported to have ranked the musical intervals in terms of degrees of concordance, making the octave the most concordant, followed by the fifth, octave + fifth, fourth and double octave (Boethius, Mus. II 19).

Finally, Iamblichus associates Hippasus with the history of the development of the mathematics of means (DK I 110. 30–37), which are important in music theory, but Iamblichus’ reports are confused. It is likely that Hippasus worked only with the three earliest means (the arithmetic, geometric and subcontrary/harmonic) and that the changing of the name of the subcontrary mean to the harmonic mean should be ascribed to Archytas rather than Hippasus (Huffman 2005, 179–173).

The most romantic aspect of the tradition concerning Hippasus is the report that he drowned at sea in punishment for the impiety of making public and giving a diagram of the dodecahedron, a figure with twelve surfaces each in the shape of a regular pentagon (Iamblichus, VP 88). This is best understood as reflecting some sort of mathematical analysis of the dodecahedron by Hippasus, but it is implausible in terms of the history of Greek mathematics to suppose that he carried out a strict construction of the dodecahedron, which along with the other four regular solids is most likely to have first received rigorous treatment by Theaetetus in the fourth century BCE (Mueller 1997, 277; Waterhouse 1972; Sachs1917, 82). Nor is it clear why public presentation of technical mathematical analysis should cause a scandal, since few people would understand it. The most likely explanation is that the dodecahedron was a cult object for the Pythagoreans (dodecahedra in stone and bronze have been found dating back to prehistoric times) and that it was because of these religious connections that Hippasus’ public work on the mathematical aspects of the solid was seen as impious (Burkert 1972a, 460).

Another late story, which appears first in Plutarch, reports a scandal which arose when knowledge of irrational magnitudes was revealed, without specifying any punishment for the one who revealed it (Numa 22). In Pappus’ later version of the story, the person who first spread knowledge of the existence of the irrational was punished by drowning (Junge and Thomson 1930, 63–64). Iamblichus knows two different versions of the story, one according to which the malefactor was banished and a tomb was erected for him, signifying his expulsion from the community (VP 246), but another according to which he was punished by drowning as was the person (not specifically said to be Hippasus here) who revealed the dodecahedron (VP 247). Modern scholars have tried to combine the two stories and suppose that Hippasus discovered the irrational through his work on the dodecahedron (von Fritz 1945). This is pure speculation, however, since neither does any ancient source connect Hippasus to the discovery of the irrational nor does any source relate the discovery of the irrational to the dodecahedron (Burkert 1972a, 459). Some scholars nonetheless credit Hippasus with the discovery of irrationality (Zhmud 2012a, 274–278).

Some have argued that Hippasus was an important figure for the early Academy to whom Academic doctrines were ascribed in order give them his authority and even that he might be the Prometheus mentioned by Plato as handing down the method from the gods in the Philebus (Horky 2013). However, there is no explicit mention of Hippasus by any member of the Academy and he is a minor figure in fourth-century accounts of early Greek philosophy (e.g., Aristotle) so it is hard to see what authority he could give to Academic views.

The other major Pythagoreans of the fifth century were Philolaus and Eurytus, who are discussed above.

The name, but not too much more, is known of a number of other fifth century figures, who with varying degrees of probability may be considered Pythagoreans. To the beginning of the fifth century belongs Ameinias the teacher of Parmenides (Diogenes Laertius VIII 21). The athlete and trainer, Iccus of Tarentum, is listed in Iamblichus’ catalogue, but none of the other sources, including Plato, call him a Pythagorean. In the later tradition, he was famous for the simplicity of his life and “the dinner of Iccus” was proverbial for plain fare. Plato praises his self control and reports that he touched neither women nor boys while training. (Laws 839e; see Protagoras 316d and DK I 216. 11 ff.).

Some scholars have treated the Sicilian comic poet Epicharmus as a Pythagorean and argued that the growing argument which appears in a fragment of controversial authenticity ascribed to him in Diogenes Laertius (3.11) is thus Pythagorean in origin (Horky 2013, 131–140). However, no fifth- or fourth-century source identifies Epicharmus as a Pythagorean and he does not appear in the catalogue of Iamblichus. The earliest explicit mention of him as a Pythagorean is in Plutarch (Numa 9) in the first century CE. There is no compelling evidence that the reference to Epicharmus as a Pythagorean in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life 266 derives from the fourth-century historian Timaeus as Horky proposes (2013, 116). Burkert suggests that the information on Didorus in 266 might derive from Timaeus (1972, 203–204) but Iamblichus regularly combines material from a number of sources so that neither Burkert nor most scholars regard the passage as a whole as deriving from Timaeus (Schorn 2014 only mentions VP 254–264 as having material from Timaeus). Epicharmus has also been thought to be a Pythagorean because the growing argument which he uses for comic effect uses pebbles to represent numbers and refers to odd and even numbers. However, neither of the features is peculiarly Pythagorean; the concept of odd and even numbers belongs to Greek mathematics in general and not just to the Pythagoreans and the use of counters (pebbles) on an abacus is the standard way in which Greeks manipulated numbers (Netz 2014, 178; cf. Burkert’s doubts that there is anything Pythagorean in the Epicharmus fragment 1972a, 438). Most scholars regard Epicharmus’ Pythagoreanism as a creation of the later tradition (Zhmud 2012a, 118 and 2019b, 138–140; Riedweg 2005, 115; Kahn 2001, 87).

There is no reason to regard the physician Acron of Acragas as a Pythagorean, as Zhmud does (1997, 73; he appears to have changed his mind in 2012a, 116). Acron is a contemporary of Empedocles and is connected to him in the doxographical tradition (DK I 283. 1–9; Diogenes Laertius VIII 65). No ancient source calls him a Pythagorean. His name appears in a very lacunose papyrus along with the name of Aristoxenus (Aristoxenus, Fr. 22 Wehrli), but it is pure speculation that Aristoxenus labeled him a Pythagorean; Euryphon the Cnidian doctor of the fifth century, who was not a Pythagorean, also appears in the papyrus. Acron’s father’s name was Xenon, and a Xenon appears in Iamblichus’ catalogue, but he is listed as from Locri and not Acragas, so again this is not good evidence that Acron was a Pythagorean.

The Pythagorean Paron (DK I 217. 10–15) is probably a fiction resulting from a misreading of Aristotle (Burkert 1972a, 170). Aristotle reports the expression of a certain Xuthus, that “the universe would swell like the ocean,” if there were not void into which parts of the universe could withdraw, when compressed (Physics 216b25). Simplicius says, on unknown grounds, that this Xuthus was a Pythagorean, and scholars have speculated that he was responding to Parmenides (DK I. 376. 20–26; Kirk and Raven 1957, 301–302; Barnes 1982, 616).

Aristoxenus reports that two Tarentines, Lysis and Archippus, were the sole survivors when the house of Milo in Croton was burned, during a meeting of the Pythagoreans, by their enemies (Iamblichus, VP 250). A later romantic version in Plutarch (On the Sign of Socrates 583a) has it that Lysis and Philolaus were the two survivors, but it appears that the famous name of Philolaus has been substituted for Archippus, about whom nothing else is known. Aristoxenus goes on to say that Lysis left southern Italy and went first to Achaea in the Peloponnese before finally settling in Thebes, where the famous Theban general, Epaminondas, became his pupil and called him father. In order to be the teacher of Epaminondas in the early fourth century, Lysis must have been born no earlier than about 470. Thus the conflagration that he escaped as a young man must have been part of the attacks on the Pythagoreans around 450, rather than those that occurred around 500, when Pythagoras himself was still alive. The later sources often conflate these two attacks on the Pythagoreans (Minar 1942, 53). Nothing is known of the philosophy of Lysis, but it seems probable that he should be regarded as one of the acusmatici, since his training of Epaminondas appears to have emphasized a way of life rather than mathematical or scientific studies (Diodorus Siculus X 11.2) and Epaminondas’ use of the name father for Lysis suggests a cult association (Burkert 1972a, 179). In the later tradition, Lysis became quite famous as the author of a spurious letter (Thesleff 1965, 111; cf. Iamblichus, VP 75–78) rebuking a certain Hipparchus for revealing Pythagorean teachings to the uninitiated (see on the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha below, sect. 4.2).

Zopyrus of Tarentum is mentioned twice, in a treatise on siege-engines by Biton (3rd or 2nd century BCE), as the inventor of an advanced form of the type of artillery known as the belly-bow (Marsden 1971, 74–77). Zopyrus’ bow used a winch to pull back the string and hence could shoot a six-foot wooden missile 4.5 inches thick (Marsden 1969, 14). It is not implausible to suppose that this is the same Zopyrus as is listed in Iamblichus’ catalogue of Pythagoreans under Tarentum (Diels 1965, 23), although Biton does not call him a Pythagorean. The traditional dating for Zopyrus puts him in the first half of the fourth century (Marsden 1971, 98, n. 52), but Kingsley has convincingly argued that he was in fact active in the last quarter of the fifth century, when he designed artillery for Cumae and Miletus (1995, 150 ff.). In a famous passage, Diodorus reports that in 399 BCE Dionysius I, the tyrant of Syracuse, gathered together skilled craftsmen from Italy, Greece and Carthage in order to construct artillery for his war with the Carthaginians (XIV 41.3). It seems not unlikely that Zopyrus was one of those who came from Italy. There is no reason to suppose, however, as Kingsley (1995, 146) and others do, that Zopyrus’ interest in mechanics was connected to his Pythagoreanism or that there was a specifically Pythagorean school of mechanics in Tarentum (Huffman 2005, 14–17).

It is controversial whether this Zopyrus of Tarentum is the same as Zopyrus of Heraclea, who is not called a Pythagorean in the sources, but who is reported in late sources to have written three Orphic poems, The Net, The Robe and The Krater, which probably dealt with the structure of human beings and the earth (West 1983, 10 ff.). This Zopyrus could be from the Heraclea closely connected to Tarentum, but he might also be from the Heraclea on the Black Sea. A late source connects Zopyrus of Heraclea with Pisistratus in the 6th century (West 1983, 249), which would mean that he could not be the same as Zopyrus of Tarentum in the late 5th century. On the other hand, Orphic writings are assigned to a number of other Pythagoreans, and it is not impossible that the same person had interests both in Orphic mysticism and mechanics. Kingsley supposes that the myth at the end of Plato’s Phaedo is based in minute detail on Zopyrus’ Krater or an intermediary reworking of it (1995, 79–171), and tries to connect specific features of the myth to Zopyrus’ interest in mechanics (1995, 147–148), but the parallel which he detects between the oscillation of the rivers in the mythic account of the underworld and the balance of opposing forces used in a bow is too general to be compelling. The connection between Zopyrus and the Phaedo is highly conjectural and must remain so, as long as there are no fragments of the Krater, with which to compare the Phaedo.

A harmonic theorist named Simus is accused of having plagiarized one of seven pieces of wisdom inscribed on a bronze votive offering, which was dedicated in the temple of Hera on Pythagoras’ native island of Samos, by Pythagoras’ supposed son Arimnestus (Duris of Samos in Porphyry, VP 3). There is a Simus listed under Posidonia (Paestum in S. Italy) in Iamblichus’ catalogue of Pythagoreans, so that DK treated him as a Pythagorean (I 444–445) who, like Hippasus, stole some of the master’s teaching for his own glory. There is, however, no obvious connection between the two individuals named Simus except the name. Most scholars have thus treated Simus as if he were a harmonic theorist in competition with and independent of the Pythagorean tradition (Burkert 1972a, 449–450; West 1992, 79 and 240; Wilamowitz 1962, II 93–94).

What exactly he stole is very unclear. He is said to have removed seven pieces of wisdom from the monument and put forth one of them as his own. This is perhaps best understood as meaning that he took an inscribed piece of metal from the dedicated object, perhaps a cauldron (see Wilamowitz 1962, II 94). The inscription will have included all seven pieces of wisdom, but Simus chose to publish only one of them as his own, the other six being thus lost. The piece of wisdom he put forth as his own is called a kanôn (“rule”). West takes this as a reference to the monochord, which was called the kanôn, used to determine and illustrate the numerical ratios, which were related to the concordant intervals (1992, 240). Since, however, the kanôn seems to have been something inscribed on the dedication, along with six other pieces of wisdom, it is perhaps better to assume that the kanôn was a description of a set of ratios determining a scale (Burkert 1972a, 455; Wilamowitz 1962, 94). There must have been a scale in circulation associated with the name of Simus. The story that Duris reports is then an attempt by the Pythagoreans to claim this scale as, in fact, the work of Pythagoras or his son, which Simus plagiarized. Duris wrote in the first part of the third century BCE, so Simus has to be earlier than that. If the son of Pythagoras really made the dedication in the temple, this would have occurred in the fifth century, but it is unclear how much later than that Simus’ kanôn became known. West dates him to the fifth century, whereas DK places him in the fourth.

Iamblichus describes an ‘arithmetical method’ known as the bloom of Thymaridas (In Nic. 62), and elsewhere discusses two points of terminology in Thymaridas, including his definition of the monad as “limiting quantity” (In Nic. 11 and 27). Some scholars have dated Thymaridas to the time of Plato or before, but others argue that the terminology assigned to him cannot be earlier than Plato and shows connections to Diophantus in the third century CE (see Burkert 1972a, 442, n. 92 for a summary of the scholarship). There is also a Thymaridas in the biographical tradition, who may or may not be the same individual. In a highly suspect passage in Iamblichus, Thymarides is listed as a pupil of Pythagoras himself (VP 104) and a Thymaridas of Paros appears in Iamblichus’ catalogue and is mentioned in one anecdote (VP 239). There is also a worrisome connection to the pseudo-Pythagorean literature. A Thymaridas of Tarentum is presented in an anecdote (Iamblichus, VP 145) as arguing that people should wish for what the gods give them rather than praying that the gods give them what they want, a sentiment that is also found in a group of three treatises forged in Pythagoras’ name (Diogenes Laertius VIII 9). The anecdote is drawn from Androcydes’ work on the Pythagorean symbola or taboos. If this work could be dated to the fourth century, it would confirm an early date for Thymaridas, but all that is certain is that Androcydes’ work was known in the first century BCE and thus that the anecdote originated before that date (Burkert 1972a, 167). It seems rash, given this confused evidence, to follow Zhmud and regard Thymaridas as a younger contemporary or pupil of Archytas (2012a, 131). For more on Thymaridas see Macris 2016.

3.5 The Fourth Century: Aristoxenus, the Last of the Pythagoreans, and the Pythagorists

Aristoxenus (ca. 375– ca. 300 BCE) is most famous as a music theorist and as a member of the Lyceum, who was disappointed not be to named Aristotle’s successor (Fr. 1 Wehrli). In his early years, however, he was a Pythagorean, and he is one of the most important sources for early Pythagoreanism. He wrote five works on Pythagoreanism, although it is possible that some of these titles are alternative names for the same work: The Life of Pythagoras, On Pythagoras and His Associates, On the Pythagorean Life, Pythagorean Precepts and a Life of Archytas. None of these works have survived intact, but portions of them were preserved by later authors (Wehrli 1945). Aristoxenus is a valuable source because, as a member of the Lyceum, he is free of the distorted image of Pythagoras propagated during his lifetime by Plato’s successors in the Academy (see below, sect. 4.1) and because of his unique connections to Pythagoreanism.

He was born in Tarentum during the years when the most important Pythagorean of the fourth century, Archytas, was the leading public figure and his father, Spintharus, had connections to Archytas (Fr. 30 Wehrli). When Aristoxenus left Tarentum, as a young man, and eventually came to Athens (ca. 350), his first teacher was Xenophilus, a Pythagorean. Then he went on to become the pupil of Aristotle (Fr. 1 Wehrli). Some modern scholars are skeptical of Aristoxenus’ testimony, seeing his denial that there was a prohibition on eating beans and his assertion that Pythagoras was not a vegetarian and particularly enjoyed eating young pigs and tender kids (Fr. 25 = Gellius IV 11), as attempts to make Pythagoreanism more rational than it was (Burkert 1972a, 107, 180). On the other hand, his Life of Archytas is not a simple panegyric; Archytas’ foibles are recognized and his opponents are given a fair hearing. On Aristoxenus as a source for Pythagoreanism see most recently Zhmud 2012b and Huffman 2014b, 285–295.

Perhaps Aristoxenus’ most interesting work on Pythagoreanism is the Pythagorean Precepts, which is known primarily through substantial excerpts preserved by Stobaeus (Frs. 33–41 Wehrli). This work does not mention any Pythagoreans by name but presents a set of ethical precepts that “they” (i.e. the Pythagoreans) proposed concerning the various stages of human life, education, and the proper place of sexuality and reproduction in human life. There are also analyses of concepts important in ethics, such as desire and luck. Given Aristoxenus’ background, the Precepts would appear to be invaluable evidence for Pythagorean ethics in the first half of the fourth century, when Aristoxenus was studying Pythagoreanism. They might be expected to partially embody the views of his teacher Xenophilus. The standard scholarly view of this work, however, is that Aristoxenus plundered Platonic and Aristotelian ideas for the glory of the Pythagoreans (Wehrli 1945, 58 ff.; Burkert 1972a, 107–108). There are serious difficulties with the standard view, however (Huffman 2019). The analysis of luck that was supposedly taken from Aristotle is, in fact, in sharp conflict with Aristotle’s view (Mills 1982) and appears to be one of the views Aristotle was attacking. While the Precepts do have similarities to passages in Plato and Aristotle, they are at a very high level of generality and are shared with passages in other fifth and fourth century authors, such as Xenophon and Thucydides; it is the distinctively Platonic and Aristotelian features that are missing.

The Precepts are thus best regarded as what they appear on the surface to be, an account of Pythagorean ethics of the fourth century. This ethical system shows a similarity to a conservative strain of Greek ethics, which is also found in Plato’s Republic, but has its own distinctive features (Huffman 2019). The central outlook of the Precepts is a distrust of basic human nature and an emphasis on the necessity for supervision of all aspects of human life (Fr. 35 Wehrli). The emphasis on order in life is so marked that the status quo is preferred to what is right (Fr. 34). The Pythagoreans were particularly suspicious of bodily desire and analyzed the ways in which it could lead people astray (Fr. 37). There are strict limitations on sexual desire and the propagation of children (Fr. 39). Despite the best efforts of humanity, however, many things are outside of human control, so the Pythagoreans examined the impact of luck on human life (Fr. 41).

Aristoxenus is a source for the famous story of the two Pythagorean friends Damon and Phintias, which was set during the tyranny of Dionysius II in Syracuse (367–357). As a test of their friendship Dionysius falsely accused Phintias of plotting against him and sentenced him to death. Phintias asked time to set his affairs in order, and Dionysius was amazed when Damon took his place, while he did so. Phintias showed his equal devotion to his friend by showing up on time for his execution. Dionysius cancelled the execution and asked to become a partner in their friendship but was refused (Iamblichus, VP 234; Porphyry, VP 59–60; Diodorus X 4.3).

In Diodorus’ version, Phintias is presented as actually engaged in a plot against Dionysius and some argue that Aristoxenus’ version is an attempt to whitewash the Pythagoreans (Riedweg 2005, 40). On the other hand, Dionysius’ eagerness to join in their friendship, which occurs in both versions, is harder to understand if there really had been a plot (see Burkert 1972a, 104). There are two other considerations. First, Aristoxenus cites Dionysius II himself as his source, whereas it is unclear what source Diodorus used. Second, it is far from clear that Aristoxenus would object to the Pythagoreans plotting against a tyrant. Thus, there are good reasons for regarding Aristoxenus’ version as more accurate.

Cleinias and Prorus are another pair of Pythagorean friends, whose story may have been told by Aristoxenus (Iamblichus, VP 127), although they were not friends in the usual sense. Cleinias, who was from Tarentum, knew nothing of Prorus of Cyrene other than that he was a Pythagorean, who had lost his fortune in political turmoil. On these grounds alone he went to Cyrene, taking the money to restore Prorus’ fortunes (Iamblichus, VP 239; Diodorus X 4.1). Nothing else is known of Prorus, although some pseudepigrapha were forged in his name (Thesleff 1965, 154.13). It appears that Cleinias was a contemporary of Plato, since Aristoxenus reports that he and an otherwise unknown Pythagorean, Amyclas, persuaded Plato not to burn the books of Democritus, on the grounds that it would do no good, since they were already widely known (Diogenes Laertius IX 40). Cleinias was involved in several other anecdotes. Like Archytas he supposedly refused to punish when angry (VP 198) and, when angered, calmed himself by playing the lyre (Athenaeus XIV 624a). Asked when one should resort to a woman he said “when one happens to want especially to be harmed” (Plutarch, Moralia 654b). Several pseudepigrapha appear in Cleinias’ name as well.

Myllias of Croton and his wife Timycha appear in Iamblichus’ catalogue and are known from a famous anecdote of uncertain origin, which is preserved by Iamblichus (VP 189 ff.). They were persecuted by the tyrant Dionysius II of Syracuse, but Timycha showed her loyalty and courage by biting off her tongue and spitting it in the tyrant’s face, rather than risk divulging Pythagorean secrets under torture.

None of the Pythagoreans mentioned in the previous four paragraphs appear to have to have anything to do with the sciences or natural philosophy. Since their Pythagoreanism consists exclusively in their way of life, they are best regarded as examples of the acusmatici. Many scholars have regarded Diodorus of Aspendus in Pamphylia (southern Asia Minor), as an important example of what the Pythagorean acusmatici were like in the first half of the fourth century (Burkert 1972a, 202–204). Diodorus is primarily known through a group of citations preserved by Athenaeus (IV 163c-f), which describe him as a vegetarian who was outfitted in an outlandish way, some features of which later became characteristic of the Cynics, e.g., long hair, long beard, a shabby cloak, a staff and beggar’s rucksack (cf. Diogenes Laertius VI 13). The historian Timaeus (350–260), however, casts doubt on Diodorus’ credentials as a Pythagorean saying that “he pretended to have associated with the Pythagoreans” and Sosicrates, another historian (2nd century BCE; fragments in Jacoby) says that his outlandish dress was his own innovation, since before this Pythagoreans had always worn white clothing, bathed and wore their hair according to fashion (Athenaeus IV 163e ff.). Iamblichus, the other major source for Diodorus outside Athenaeus, also treats Diodorus with reserve, saying that he was accepted by the leader of the Pythagorean school at the time, one Aresas, because there were so few members of the school. He continues, perhaps again with disapproval, to report that Diodorus returned to Greece and spread abroad the Pythagorean oral teachings.

These sources clearly suggest that Diodorus was anything but a typical Pythagorean, even of the acusmatic variety. Burkert has argued that this reflects a bias of sources such as Aristoxenus, who wanted to make Pythagoreanism appear reasonable and emphasized the version of Pythagoreanism practiced by the mathêmatici rather than the acusmatici. In support of this conclusion, he argues that the two earliest sources present Diodorus as a Pythagorean without any qualifications (1972a, 204). It is important to look carefully at those sources, however. First, neither is a philosopher or a historian, who might be expected to give a careful presentation of Diodorus. The oldest is a lyre player named Stratonicus (died 350 BCE), who was famous for his witticisms, and the other, Archestratus (fl. 330 BCE), wrote a book entitled The Life of Luxury, which focused on culinary delights. Such sources might be expected to accept typical stories that went around about Diodorus without any close analysis.

In the case of our earliest source, Stratonicus, there is, moreover, once again evidence suggesting that Diodorus was not regarded as a typical Pythagorean. In describing Diodorus’ relationship to Pythagoras, Stratonicus does not use a typical word for student or disciple, but rather the same word (pelatês) that Plato used in the Euthyphro to describe the day-laborer who died at the hands of Euthyphro’s father. Diodorus is thus being presented sarcastically as a hired hand in the Pythagorean tradition, which is very much in accord with the later presentations of him as a poor man’s Pythagoras on the fringes of Pythagoreanism. Thus, rather than accusing the sources of bias against Diodorus, it seems better to accept their almost universal testimony that he was not a typical acusmatic but rather a marginal figure, who used Pythagoreanism in part to try to gain respectability for his own eccentric lifestyle.

Individuals known as “Pythagorists,” i.e. Pythagorizers, are ridiculed by writers of Greek comedy, such as Alexis, Antiphanes, Aristophon, and Cratinus the younger, in the middle and second half of the fourth century (see Burkert 1972a, 198, n. 25 for the evidence and 200, n. 41 for the dating). The most important of the fragments of these comedies that deal with the Pythagorists are collected by Athenaeus (IV 160f ff) and Diogenes Laertius (VIII 37–38). The term “Pythagorist” is usually negative in the comic writers (Arnott 1996, 581–582) and picks out people who share some of the same extreme ascetic lifestyle as Diodorus. A fragment of Antiphanes describes someone as eating “nothing animate, as if Pythagorizing” (Fr. 133 Kassel and Austin = Athenaeus IV 161a). In The Pythagorizing Woman, Alexis presents the vegetarian sacrificial feast that is customary for the Pythagoreans as including dried figs, cheese and olive cakes, and reports that the Pythagorean life entailed “scanty food, filth, cold, silence, sullenness, and no baths” as well as drinking water instead of wine (Frs. 201–202 = Athenaeus IV 161c and III 122f).

A number of these characteristics can be connected to the acusmata (Arnott 1996, 583), e.g., the lack of bathing may be a joke based on the acusma that forbids the Pythagoreans from using the public baths (Iamblichus, VP 83), Antiphanes (fr. 158) satirizes the acusmata’s bizarre list of foods that can be eaten (D.L. 8.19) by describing his Pythagoreans as searching for sea orach, and the silence or sullenness ascribed to the Pythagoreans in comedy accords not just with the acusmata but with early testimony about the Pythagoreans in Isocrates (Busiris 29) and Dicaearchus (Fr. 40 Mirhady). A fragment of Aristophon’s Pythagorist suggests that this ascetic life was based on poverty rather than philosophical scruple and that, if you put meat and fish in front of these Pythagorists, they would gobble them down (Fr. 9 = Athenaeus IV 161e). In a fragment of Alexis, after the speaker reports that the Pythagoreans eat nothing animate, he is interrupted by someone who objects that “Epicharides eats dogs, and he is a Pythagorean,” to which the response is, “yes, but he kills them first and so they are not still animate” (Fr. 223 + Athenaeus 161b). Epicharides and some other named figures may well be Athenians who are satirized by being assigned a Pythagorean life (Athenaeus 2006, 272). Another fragment of Aristophon’s Pythagorist reports that the Pythagoreans have a far different existence in the underworld than others, in that they feast with Hades because of their piety, but this just occasions the remark that Hades is an unpleasant god to enjoy the company of such filthy wretches (Fr. 12 = Diogenes Laertius VIII 38).

Both Alexis (Fr. 223 = Athenaeus IV 161b) and Cratinus the younger (Fr. 7 = Diogenes Laertius VIII 37) wrote plays entitled The People of Tarentum, which, although they may not have been primarily about Pythagoreans, featured depictions of them (Arnott 1996, 625–626). In this case, the Pythagoreans are again satirized for their simple diet, bread and water (which is called “prison fare”), and for drinking no wine. In these plays, however, the Pythagoreans are also presented as feeding on “subtle arguments” and “finely honed thoughts” and as pestering others with them, in a way that is reminiscent of Aristophanes’ treatment of Socrates in the Clouds.

Given the fragmentary nature of the evidence, it is unclear whether these ascetic Pythagoreans who engage in argument are the same as the Pythagorists in the other comedies, who are characterized by their filth and eccentric appearance. Certainly the latter are more reminiscent of Diodorus of Aspendus, while the former might be closer to what we know of someone like Cleinias. In the first half of the third century, the poet Theocritus still preserves a memory of these Pythagorists as “pale and without shoes” (XIV 5). The scholiast to the passage testifies to the continuing controversy about the Pythagorists by drawing a distinction between Pythagoreans who give every attention to their body and Pythagorists who are filthy (although another scholion reports that others say the opposite, see Arnott 1996, 581). A passage in Iamblichus (VP 80) similarly argues that the Pythagoreans were the true followers of Pythagoras, while the Pythagorists just emulated them.

In recent scholarship, the tendency has been to regard Diodorus and the Pythagorists as legitimate Pythagoreans of the acusmatic stamp, whose eccentricities are perhaps a little exaggerated in comedy. The extensive evidence from antiquity which argues that they were not true Pythagoreans is interpreted as bias on the part of conservative Pythagoreans of the hyper-mathêmatici sort, such as Aristoxenus, who wanted to disassociate themselves and Pythagoreanism in general from such strange people. This is a possible interpretation of the evidence, but, as the evidence for Diodorus shows, it is also quite possible that Diodorus and the more extreme Pythagorists depicted in comedy were in fact people with whom few Pythagoreans either of the mathêmatici or the acusmatici wanted to associate themselves. Many religious movements have a radical fringe, and there is little reason to think that Pythagoreanism should differ in this regard. In connection with his thesis that the acusmata were a literary phenomenon and that no one lived a life in accordance with them Zhmud argues that the Pythagorists of comedy are a creation of the comic stage and do not provide evidence for Pythagoreans living a life governed by acusmata (2012a, 175–183). It is true that many of the features of the Pythagorists are shared with Socrates as presented in the Clouds (subtle arguments, plain food, filthy clothes). Zhmud suggests that vegetarianism was added to this stock picture of the philosopher to give a Pythagorean color and that this vegetarianism was derived solely from the eccentric figure of Diodorus of Aspendus. However, as noted above there are more connections to the acusmata than just vegetarianism and it is hard to believe that the repeated jokes at the expense of those living a Pythagorean life had no correlate in reality other than Diodorus.

Perhaps the best way to evaluate the complicated evidence for fourth-century Pythagoreanism is to conclude that there were three main groups, each of which admitted some variation. There were mathêmatici such as Archytas who did serious research in the mathematical disciplines and natural philosophy but who also lived an ascetic life that emphasized self-control and avoidance of bodily pleasure. Other Pythagoreans such as Cleinias or Xenophilus may have done no work in the sciences but lived a Pythagorean life, which was similar to that of Archytas and followed principles similar to those set out in Aristoxenus’ Pythagorean Precepts. They may have observed some mild dietary restrictions and may be similar to the figures satirized in The Men of Tarentum as eating a simple diet but still engaged in subtle arguments. There was probably a continuum of people in this category with some following more or different sets of the acusmata than others. Finally there are the Pythagorean hippies such as Diodorus and the Pythagorists, who ostentatiously live a life in accord with some of the acusmata, but who take such an extreme interpretation of them as to be regarded as eccentrics by most Pythagoreans.

Diogenes Laertius reports, evidently on the authority of Aristoxenus, that the last Pythagoreans were Xenophilus from the Thracian Chalcidice (Aristoxenus’ teacher), and four Pythagoreans from Phlius: Phanton, Echecrates, Diocles and Polymnastus. These Pythagoreans are further identified as the pupils of Philolaus and Eurytus. Little more is known of Xenophilus beyond his living for more than 105 years (DK I 442–443). The Pythagoreans from Phlius are just names except Echecrates (DK I 443), to whom Phaedo narrates, evidently in Phlius, the events of Socrates’ last day in Plato’s Phaedo. Socrates’ interlocutors in the Phaedo, Simmias and Cebes, are often regarded as Pythagoreans, because they are said to have been pupils of Philolaus when he was in Thebes. They are also shown to be pupils of Socrates, however, and it is unclear that their connection to Philolaus was any closer than their connection to Socrates. They are not listed in Iamblichus’ catalogue as Pythagoreans; Diogenes Laertius includes them with other followers of Socrates (II 124–125). Echecrates might have been born around 420 and thus be a young man at the dramatic date of the Phaedo. Aristoxenus’ assertion that these were the last of the Pythagoreans would then suggest that Pythagoreanism died out around 350, when Echecrates was an old man.

Riedweg says that this claim is “demonstrably untrue” pointing to a Pythagorean, Lycon, who criticized Aristotle’s supposed extravagant way of life and to the Pythagorists discussed above (2005, 106). This seems slender evidence upon which to be so critical of Aristoxenus. Virtually nothing is known of Lycon, and Aristocles (1st-2nd c. CE), who recounts the criticism of Aristotle, says that Lycon “called himself a Pythagorean,” thus expressing some sort of reservation about his credentials (DK I 445–446). Aristoxenus’ assertion is probably to be understood as a general claim that, with the deaths of the Pythagoreans from Phlius around the middle of the fourth century, Pythagoreanism as an active movement was dead. This would be compatible with a few individuals still claiming to be Pythagoreans after 350.

This is not inconsistent with the existence of a few isolated individuals, who still claim to be Pythagoreans. Certainly, from the evidence available to modern scholars, Aristoxenus’ claim is largely true. From about 350 BCE until about 100 BCE, there is a radical drop in evidence for individuals who call themselves Pythagoreans. Iamblichus (In Nic. 116.1–7) appears to date the Pythagoreans Myonides and Euphranor, who worked on the mathematics of means, after the time of Eratosthenes (285–194 BCE) and hence to the second century BCE or later (Burkert 1972a, 442), but Iamblichus’ history of the means is very confused and they might belong to the rise of Neopythagoreanism in the first centuries BCE and CE. Kahn (2001, 83) sees a hint of Pythagorean cult activity in the spurious Pythagorean Memoirs, which must date sometime before the first half of the first century BCE, when they are quoted by Alexander Polyhistor (see section 4.2 below). A few other Pythagorean pseudepigrapha appear in the period (see further below, sect. 4.2), although it is unclear what sort of Pythagorean community, if any, was associated with them. Pythagoreanism is not completely dead between 350 and 100 (see further below, sect. 3.5), but few individual Pythagoreans or organized groups of Pythagoreans can be identified in this period.

3.6 Timaeus, Ocellus, Hicetas and Ecphantus

The names Timaeus of Locri and Ocellus of Lucania are famous as the authors of the two most influential Pythagorean pseudepigrapha (see below, sect. 4.2). In his catalogue of Pythagoreans, Iamblichus lists an Ocellus under Lucania and two men named Timaeus, neither under Locri. The later forgery of works attributed to Timaeus and Ocellus does not of course mean that Pythagoreans of these names did not exist, and it is possible that the Timaeus of Locri who is the main speaker in Plato’s Timaeus was an historical Timaeus (some have thought Plato uses him as a mask for Archytas, however). If they really did exist, however, nothing is known about them, since all other reports in the ancient tradition are likely to be based on Plato’s Timaeus or the spurious works in their name.

Some scholars have argued that Hicetas and Ecphantus, both of Syracuse, were not historical figures at all but rather characters in dialogues written by Heraclides of Pontus, a fourth-century member of the Academy. By a misunderstanding, they came to be treated as historical Pythagoreans in the doxographical tradition (see Guthrie 1962, 323 ff. for references). This theory arose because both Hicetas and Ecphantus are said to have made the earth rotate on its axis, while the heavens remained fixed, in order to explain astronomical phenomena, and, in one report, Heraclides is paired with Ecphantus as having adopted this view (Aetius III 13.3 =DK I 442.23). In addition Ecphantus is assigned a form of atomism (DK I 442.7 ff.) similar to that assigned to Heraclides (Fr. 118–121 Wehrli). It is not uncommon in the doxographical tradition for a report of the form “x and y believe z” to mean that “y, as reported by x, believes z,” so it is suggested that in this case “Heraclides and Ecphantus” means “Ecphantus as presented by Heraclides.” There is a serious problem with this ingenious theory. The doxographical reports about Hicetas and Ecphantus ultimately rely on Theophrastus (Cicero mentions Theophrastus by name at DK I 441.27), and it is implausible that Theophrastus would treat characters invented by his older contemporary, Heraclides, as historical figures. Theophrastus did accept the Academic glorification of Pythagoras (see on Neopythagoreanism below, sect. 4.1), but this provides no grounds for supposing that he accepted a character in a dialogue as a historical person (pace Burkert 1972a, 341).

The testimonia for Hicetas are meager and contradictory (DK I 441–442). He appears to have argued that the celestial phenomena are best explained by assuming that all heavenly bodies are stationary and that the apparent movement of the stars and planets is the result of the earth’s rotation around its own axis. He may also have followed Philolaus in positing a counter-earth, opposite the earth on the other side of a central fire, although, if he did, it is unclear how he would have explained why it and the central fire are not visible from the rotating earth. In Philolaus’ system the central fire remains invisible because the earth orbits the central fire as it rotates on its axis, thus keeping one side of the earth always turned away from the central fire. A little more is known about Ecphantus (DK I 442). He too is said to have believed that the earth moved, not by changing its location (as Philolaus proposed, in making the earth and counter-earth revolve around the central fire: see Section 4.2 of the entry on Philolaus), but by rotating on its axis.

Copernicus was inspired by these testimonia about Hicetas and Ecphantus, as well as those about Philolaus, to consider the motion of the earth (see below, sect. 5.2). Ecphantus developed his own original form of atomism. He is best understood as reacting to and developing the views of Democritus. He agreed with Democritus 1) “that human beings do not grasp true knowledge of the things that are, but define them as they believe them to be” (DK I 442.7–8; cf. Democritus Frs. 6–10) and 2) that all sensible things arise from indivisible first bodies and void. He differs from Democritus, however, in supposing that atoms are limited rather than unlimited in number and that there is just one cosmos rather than many. As in Democritus, atoms differ in shape and size, but Ecphantus adds power (dynamis) as a third distinguishing factor. He explains atomic motion not just in terms of weight and external blows, as the atomists did, but also by a divine power, which he called mind or soul, so that “the cosmos was composed of atoms but organized by providence” (DK I 442.21–22). It is because of this divine power that the cosmos is spherical in shape. This unique spherical cosmos is reminiscent of Plato’s Timaeus, but the rest of Ecphantus’ system differs enough from Plato that there is no question of its being a forgery based on the Timaeus. One testimony says that he was the first to make Pythagorean monads corporeal, thus differing from the fifth-century Pythagoreans described by Aristotle, who do not seem to have addressed the question of whether numbers were physical entities or not.

It is difficult to be sure of the date of either Hicetas or Ecphantus. Since, however, both seem to be influenced by Philolaus’ idea of a moving earth and since Ecphantus appears to be developing the atomism of Democritus, it is usually assumed that they belong to the first half of the fourth century (Guthrie 1962, 325–329). Hicetas does not appear in Iamblichus’ catalogue. There is an Ecphantus in the catalogue, but he is listed under Croton rather than Syracuse, so it cannot be certain whether he is the Ecphantus described in the doxography.

3.7 Plato and Pythagoreanism

There is currently a very wide range of opinions about the relationship of Plato to Pythagoreanism. Many scholars both ancient and modern have thought that Plato was very closely tied to Pythagoreanism. In the biography of Pythagoras read by Photius in the 9th century CE (Bibl. 249) Plato is presented as a member of the Pythagorean school. He is the pupil of Archytas and the ninth successor to Pythagoras himself. If this were true then Plato would certainly be the most illustrious early Pythagorean after Pythagoras himself. Some modern scholars, while not going this far, have seen the connections between Plato and the Pythagoreans to be very close indeed. Thus, A. E. Taylor in his great commentary on the Timaeus says that his main thesis is that “the teaching of Timaeus [in Plato’s Timaeus] can be shown to be in detail exactly what we should expect from an fifth-century Italian Pythagorean” (1928, 11), although Taylor does not regard these as Plato’s own teachings at the time. Guthrie in his famous history of ancient philosophy commented that Pythagorean and Platonic philosophy were so close that it is difficult to separate them (1975, 35). Recently it has been argued that Plato was so steeped in Pythagoreanism that he structured his dialogues by counting numbers of lines and placing important passages at points in the dialogue that correspond to important ratios in Pythagorean harmonic theory (Kennedy, 2010 and 2011). Thus, the vision of the form of beauty appears 3/4 of the way through the Symposium by line count and the ratio 3 : 4 corresponds to the central musical interval of the fourth. There are, however, serious questions about the methodology used (Gregory 2012) and it is a serious problem both that no one in the ancient world reports that Plato used such a practice and that the middle of the dialogue, which corresponds to the most concordant musical interval, the octave (2:1), does not usually contain the most philosophically important content. Another approach sees Plato as engaged with and heavily influenced by Pythagorean ideas in passages where the Pythagoreans are not specifically mentioned in dialogues such as the Cratylus (401b11–d7) and Phaedo (101b10–104c9) (Horky 2013). The problem is that in contrast to the Philebus, where the connection to Philolaus is clear (see below), the connections to the Pythagoreans in these passages are too indirect or general (e.g., the concepts odd and even and the number 3 in the Phaedo passage are not unique to the Pythagoreans) to be very convincing and partly depend on the doubtful assumption that Epicharmus was a Pythagorean (see section 3.4 above). The central text for many of those who see Plato as closely tied to Pythagoreanism is Aristotle’s comment in Metaphysics 1.6 that Plato “followed these men (i.e. the Pythagoreans according to these scholars) in most respects” (987a29–31). In contrast to these attempts to connect Plato closely to Pythagoreanism, most recent Platonic scholars seem to think Pythagoreanism of little importance for Plato. Thus two prominent handbooks to Plato’s thought (Kraut and Ebrey 2022; Benson 2006) and another book of essays devoted specifically to the Timaeus, (Mohr and Sattler 2010) hardly mention the Pythagoreans at all.

In recent studies of the topic that lie somewhere between these extremes, one approach is to argue that there is clear Pythagorean influence on Plato but that its scope is much more limited than often assumed (Huffman 2013). Plato explicitly mentions Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans only one time each in the dialogues and this provides prima facie evidence that Pythagorean influence was not extensive. Moreover, at Metaphysics 987a29–31 the “these men” that Aristole says Plato follows in most respects may not be the Pythagoreans but the Presocratics in general. Aristotle’s presentation as a whole mainly attests to Pythagorean influence only on Plato’s late theory of principles. It is often assumed that Plato owes his mathematical conception of the cosmos and his belief in the immortality and transmigration of the soul to Pythagoreanism (Kahn 2001, 3–4). However, the role of Pythagoreanism in Greek mathematics has been overstated and while Plato had contacts with mathematicians who were Pythagoreans like Archytas, the most prominent mathematicians in the dialogues, Theodorus and Theaetetus, are not Pythagoreans. It is thus a serious mistake to assume that any mention of mathematics in Plato suggests Pythagorean influence. The same is true of the immortality and transmigration of the soul in Plato, which are often assumed to be derived from Pythagoreanism. Some have also thought that Platonic myths and especially the myth at the end of the Phaedo draw heavily on Pythagoreanism (Kingsley 1995, 79–171). However, most of the contexts in which Plato mentions the immortality of the soul including the Platonic myths, suggest that he is thinking of mystery cults and the Orphics rather than the Pythagoreans (Huffman 2013, 243–254). On the other hand, in the Philebus (16c-17a) Plato gives clear acknowledgement of the debt he owes to men before his time who posit limit and unlimited as basic principles. The fragments of Philolaus and Aristotle’s reports on Pythagoreanism make clear that this is a reference to Philolaus and the Pythagoreans. The principles of limit and unlimited are clearly connected to Plato’s one and indefinite dyad and it is precisely these principles of Plato that Aristotle connects most closely to Pythagoreanism (Metaph. 987b25–32). Thus Plato’s evidence coheres with Aristotle’s to suggest that Pythagoreanism exerted considerable influence on Plato’s late theory of principles. It is also true that specific aspects of Plato’s mathematical view of the world are owed to the Pythagoreans, e.g., the world soul in the Timaeus is constructed according to the diatonic scale that is prominent in Philolaus (Fr. 6a). However, most of the Timaeus is not derived from Pythagoreanism and some of it in fact conflicits with Pythagoreanism (e.g., Archytas famously argued that the universe was unlimited while Plato’s in limited). The same is true for Plato as a whole. Isolated ideas such as the one and the dyad and the structure of the world soul show heavy Pythagorean influence, but there is no evidence that Pythagoreanism played a central role in the development of the core of Plato’s philosophy (e.g., the theory of forms).

A second approach is to argue that, while it is true that not all mentions of mathematics or all mentions of the transmigration of the soul derive from Pythagoreanism, nonetheless a central system of value that appears early in Plato’s work and persists to the end is derived from Pythagoreanism (Palmer 2014). Already in the Gorgias Plato argues that principles of order and correctness which are found in the cosmos and explain its goodness also govern human relations. Socrates here puts forth a much more definite conception of the good than in earlier dialogues. His complaint that Callicles pays no attention to the role played by orderliness and self-control and neglects geometrical equality (507e6–508a8) mirrors the emphasis on organization and calculation in contemporary Pythagorean texts such as Archytas Fr. 3 and Aristoxenus’ Pythagorean Precepts Fr. 35. It thus appears that “Socrates’” new insight into the good in Gorgias derives from Plato’s contact with the Pythagoreans after the death of the historical Socrates. Plato never abandons this Pythagorean conception of value and it can be traced through the Phaedo and Republic to late dialogues such as the Timaeus, where the cosmos is embued with principles of mathematical order, and Philebus, where the highest value is assigned to measure (66a). The question is whether this emphasis on measure and order is uniquely Pythagorean in origin.

4. Neopythagoreanism

Neopythagoreanism is characterized by the tendency to see Pythagoras as the central and original figure in the development of Greek philosophy, to whom, according to some authors (e.g. Iamblichus, VP 1), a divine revelation had been given. This revelation was often seen as having close affinities to the wisdom of earlier non-Greeks such as the Hebrews, the Magi and the Egyptians. Because of the belief in the centrality of the philosophy of Pythagoras, later philosophy was regarded as simply an elaboration of the revelation expounded by Pythagoras; it thus became the fashion to father the views of later philosophers, particularly Plato, back onto Pythagoras. Neopythagoreans typically emphasize the role of number in the cosmos and treat the One and Indefinite Dyad as ultimate principles going back to Pythagoras, although these principles in fact originate with Plato. The origins of Neopythagoreanism are probably to be found already in Plato’s school, the Academy, in the second half of the fourth century BCE. There is evidence that Plato’s successors, Speusippus and Xenocrates, both presented Academic speculations arising in part from Plato’s later metaphysics as the work of Pythagoras, who lived some 150 years earlier. After a decline in interest in Pythagoreanism for a couple of centuries, Neopythagoreanism emerged again and developed further starting in the first century BCE and extending throughout the rest of antiquity and into the middle ages and Renaissance. During this entire period, it is the Neopythagorean construct of Pythagoras that dominates, a construct that has only limited contact with early Pythagoreanism; there is little interest in an historically accurate presentation of Pythagoras and his philosophy. In reading the following account of Neopythagoreanism, it may be helpful to refer to the Chronological Chart of Sources for Pythagoras, in the entry on Pythagoras.

4.1 Origins in the Early Academy: Speusippus, Xenocrates and Heraclides in Contrast to Aristotle and the Peripatetics

The evidence for Speusippus, Plato’s successor as head of the Academy, is fragmentary and second hand, so that certainty in interpretation is hardly possible. In one passage, however, he assigns not just Plato’s principles, the one and the dyad, to “the ancients,” who in context seem likely to be the Pythagoreans (although Sedley 2021a, 17 suggests that the reference is to Parmenides), but also a development of the Platonic system according to which the one was regarded as beyond being (Fr. 48 Tarán; see Burkert 1972a, 63–64; Dillon 2003, 56–57). Some scholars reject this widely held view on the grounds that this fragment of Speusippus is spurious (Zhmud 2012a, 424—425, who cites other scholars; Tarán 1981, 350ff.; for a response see Dillon 2014, 251) and if this were true it would seriously weaken the case for supposing that Neopythagoreanism began already in the Academy. Speusippus also wrote a book On Pythagorean Numbers (Fr. 28 Tarán), which builds on ideas attested for the early Pythagoreans (e.g., ten as the perfect number, although Zhmud regards the perfection of ten as a Platonic rather than a Pythagorean doctrine 2012a, 404–09, and Speusippus’ book as the first work of arithmology, which only in the first century BCE is ascribed to the Pythagoreans [2016]). We cannot be sure, however, either that the title goes back to Speusippus or that he assigned all ideas in it to the Pythagoreans. Aristotle twice cites agreement between Speusippus and the Pythagoreans (Metaph. 1072b30 ff.; EN 1096b5–8), which might suggest that Speusippus himself had identified the Pythagoreans as his predecessors in these areas. Speusippus and Xenocrates denied that the creation of the universe in Plato’s Timaeus should be understood literally; when the view that the cosmos was only created in thought and not in time is assigned to Pythagoras in the later doxography (Aëtius II 4.1 — Diels 1958, 330), it certainly looks as if an idea which had its origin in the interpretation of Plato’s Timaeus in the Academy is being assigned back to Pythagoras (Burkert 1972a, 71). The evidence is not sufficient to conclude that Speusippus routinely assigned Platonic and Academic ideas to the Pythagoreans (Tarán 1981, 109), but there is enough evidence to suggest that he did so in some cases. Sedley 2021b argues that a famous mosaic from Pompeii portrays Speusppus as distracted from Platonic teaching by Pythagoreanism as represented by the figure of Archytas.

Speusippus’ successor as head of the Academy, Xenocrates, may actually have followed some version of the Pythagorean way of life, e.g., he was apparently a vegetarian, refused to give oaths, was protective of animals and followed a highly structured daily regimen, setting aside time for silence (Dillon 2003, 94–95 and 2014, 254–257; Burkert, however, argues that he rejected metempsychosis [1972a, 124]). Horky 2013b argues that Xenocrates’ account of the relation between Pythagoreanism and Platonism influenced Theophrastus but Sedley 2021a and 2021b distances Xenocrates from Pythagoreanism. Xenocrates wrote a book entitled Things Pythagorean, the contents of which are unfortunately unknown (Diogenes Laertius IV 13). In the extant fragments of his writings, he refers to Pythagoras by name once, reporting that “he discovered that the musical intervals too did not arise apart from number” (Fr. 9 Heinze). Several doctrines of Xenocrates are also assigned to Pythagoras in the doxographical tradition, e.g., the definition of the soul as “a number moving itself,” which Burkert (1972a, 64–65) argues that Xenocrates may have developed on the basis of Plato’s Timaeus (Plutarch, On the Generation of the Soul 1012d; Aëtius IV 2.3–4). This suggests that Xenocrates, like Speusippus, may have assigned his own teachings back to Pythagoras or at least treated Pythagoras as his precursor in such a way that it was easy for others to do so (Dillon 2003, 153–154; Zhmud [2012a, 55 and 426–427] disputes this interpretation).

Yet another member of the early Academy, Heraclides of Pontus (Gottschalk 1980), in a series of influential dialogues, further developed the presentation of Pythagoras as the founder of philosophy. In the dialogue, On the Woman Who Stopped Breathing, Pythagoras is presented as the inventor of the word “philosophy” (Frs. 87–88 Wehrli = Diogenes Laertius Proem 12 and Cicero, Tusc. V 3.8). Although some scholars have tried to find a kernel of truth in the story (e.g., Riedweg 2005, 90 ff., for a response see Huffman 2008b), its definition of the philosopher as one who seeks wisdom rather than possessing it is regarded by many scholars as a Socratic/Platonic formulation, which Heraclides, in his dialogue, is assigning to Pythagoras as part of a literary fiction (Burkert 1960 and 1972a, 65). Heraclides also assigns to Pythagoras a definition of happiness as “the knowledge of the perfection of the numbers of the soul” (Fr. 44 Wehrli), in which again the Platonic account of the numerical structure of the soul in the Timaeus appears to be fathered on Pythagoras. Other fragments show Heraclides’ further fascination with the Pythagoreans. He developed what would become one of the canonical accounts of Pythagoras’ previous incarnations (Fr. 89 Wehrli). Perhaps on the basis of the Pythagorean Philolaus’ astronomical system, he developed the astronomical theory, later to be championed by Copernicus, according to which the apparent daily motion of the sun and stars was to be explained by the rotation of the earth (Frs. 104–108; see on Hicetas and Ecphantus above, sect. 3.6). For a different view of Heraclides’ relation to the Pythagoreans see Zhmud 2012a, 427–432.

In contrast to the fascination with and glorification of Pythagoras in the Academy after Plato’s death, Aristotle did not treat Pythagoras as part of the philosophical tradition at all. In the surveys of his predecessors in his extant works, Aristotle does not include Pythagoras himself and he evidently presented him in his lost special treatises on the Pythagoreans only as a wonder-worker and founder of a way of life. While Aristotle did acknowledge close connections between Plato’s late theory of principles (One and Indefinite Dyad) and fifth-century Pythagoreans, he also sharply distinguished Plato from the Pythagoreans on a series of important points (Metaph. 987b23 ff.), perhaps in response to the Academy’s tendency to assign Platonic doctrines to Pythagoras. Aristotle’s students Eudemus, in his histories of arithmetic, geometry and astronomy and Meno, in his history of medicine, follow Aristotle’s practice of not mentioning Pythagoras himself, referring to individual Pythagoreans such as Philolaus or to the Pythagoreans as a group. Eudemus assigns the Pythagoreans a number of important contributions to the sciences but does not give them the decisive or foundational role found in the Neopythagorean tradition. Aristotle’s pupils Dicaearchus (Porphyry, VP 19) and Aristoxenus do mention Pythagoras but this is because they are focusing on the Pythagorean way of life and the history of the Pythagorean communities. Neither assign to Pythagoras or the Pythagoreans the characteristics of Neopythagoreanism. Aristoxenus is one of the most important and extensive sources for Pythagoreanism (see 3.5 above). He presents Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans in a positive manner but avoids the hagiography and extravagant claims of the later Neopythagorean tradition. The standard view is that he tries to emphasize the rational as opposed to the religious side of Pythagoras (e.g. Burkert 1972a, 200–205), but several fragments do highlight the religious aspect of Pythagoras’ work, assigning him the doctrine of metempsychosis (fr. 12) and associating him with the Chaldaean Zaratas (Fr. 13) and the Delphic oracle (Fr. 15). It is only by rejecting the authenticity of such fragments (as does Zhmud 2012a, 88–91) that Aristoxenus’ account is purged of religious elements. Dicaearchus’ account of Pythagoreas is also usually viewed as positive. He is supposed to have presented Pythagoras as the model of the practical life as opposed to the contemplative life (Jaeger 1948, 456; Kahn 2001, 68). However, Dicaearchus presents a very sarcastic account of Pythagoras’ rebirths according to which he was reborn as the beautiful prostitute Alco (Fr. 42) and careful reading of his other accounts of Pythagoras suggests that he may have presented him as a charismatic charlatan who bewitched his hearers (Fr. 42) and was seen as a threat to the established laws of the state and hence was refused entrance by such city-states as Locri (Fr. 41a). Thus, Aristoxenus and Dicaearchus were as divided in their interpretation of Pythagoras as were Heraclitus and Empedocles in earlier centuries. The Peripatetic tradition as a whole is in strong contrast, then, with the Academy insofar as it emphasizes Pythagoreans rather than Pythagoras himself. When Pythagoras is mentioned, it is mostly in connection with the way of life, and interpretations range from positive to strongly satirical but in either case avoid the hagiography of the Neopythagorean tradition.

It is then one of the great paradoxes of the ancient Pythagorean tradition that Aristotle’s successor, Theophrastus, evidently accepted the Academic lionization of Pythagoras, and identifies Plato’s one and the indefinite dyad as belonging to the Pythagoreans (Metaph. 11a27 ff.), although Aristotle is emphatic that this pair of principles in fact belong to Plato (Metaph. 987b25–27). Since Theophrastus’ work, Tenets in Natural Philosophy, was the basis of the later doxographical tradition, it may be that Theophrastus is responsible for the Neopythagorean Pythagoras of the Academy dominating the later doxography, the Pythagoras who originated the one and the indefinite dyad (Aëtius I 3. 8), but it may also be that the Pythagorean sections of the doxography were rewritten in the first century BCE, under the influence of the Neopythagoreanism of that period (Burkert 1972a, 62; Zhmud 2012a, 455).

The standard view has thus been that the Academy was the origin of Neopythagoreanism with its glorification of Pythagoras and its tendency to assign mature Platonic views back to Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans. At the very least, most scholars agree that the early Academy was heavily influenced by the Pythagoreans (Bonazzi 2023, 12, n. 35). Aristotle and the Peripatetics on the other hand diminish the role of Pythagoras himself and, while noting connections between Plato and the Pythagoreans, carefully distinguish Pythagorean tenets from Platonism. Zhmud has recently put forth a challenge to this view arguing the situation is almost the reverse: the Academy in general regards Pythagoras and Pythagoreans favorably but does not assign mature Platonic views to them, it is rather Aristotle who ties Plato closely to the Pythagoreans (2012a, 415–456).

4.2 The Pythagorean Pseudepigrapha

Although the origins of Neopythagoreanism are thus found in the fourth century BCE, the figures more typically labeled Neopythagoreans belong to the upsurge in interest in Pythagoreanism that begins in the first century BCE and continues through the rest of antiquity. Before turning to these Neopythagoreans, it is important to discuss another aspect of the later Pythagorean tradition, the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha. Many more writings forged in the name of Pythagoras and other Pythagoreans have survived than genuine writings. Most of the pseudepigrapha themselves only survive in excerpts quoted by anthologists such as John of Stobi, who created a collection of Greek texts for the edification of his son in early fifth century CE. The modern edition of these Pythagorean pseudepigrapha by Thesleff (1965) runs to some 245 pages.

There is much uncertainly as to when, where, why and by whom these works were created. No one answer to these questions will fit all of the treatises. Most scholars (e.g., Burkert 1972b, 40–44; Centrone 1990, 30–34, 41–44 and 1994) have chosen Rome or Alexandria between 150 BCE and 100 CE as the most likely time and place for these compositions, since there was a strong resurgence of interest in Pythagoreanism in these places at these times (see below). Thesleff’s view that the majority were composed in the third century BCE in southern Italy (1961 and 1972, 59) has found less favor. Centrone argues convincingly that a central core of the pseudepigrapha were forged in the first centuries BCE and CE in Alexandria, because of their close connection to Eudorus and Philo, who worked in Alexandria in that period (Centrone 2014a). For an overview of the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha see Centrone 2014a and Moraux 1984, 605–683.

A number of motives probably led to the forgeries. The existence of avid collectors of Pythagorean books such as Juba, King of Mauretania (see below), and the scarcity of authentic Pythagorean texts will have led to forgeries to sell for profit to the collectors. Other short letters or treatises may have originated as exercises for students in the rhetorical schools (e.g., the assignment might have been to write the letter that Archytas wrote to Dionysius II of Syracuse asking that Plato be freed; see Diogenes Laertius III 21–22). The contents of the treatises suggest, however, that the primary motivation was to provide the Pythagorean texts to support the Neopythagorean position, first adumbrated in the early Academy, that Pythagoras was the source of all that is true in the Greek philosophical tradition. The pseudepigrapha show the Pythagoreans anticipating the most characteristic ideas of Plato and Aristotle. Most of the treatises are composed in the Doric dialect (spoken in Greek S. Italy) but, apart from that concession to verisimilitude, there is little other attempt to make them appear to be archaic documents that anticipated Plato and Aristotle. Instead, Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophical positions are stated in a bald fashion using the exact Platonic and Aristotelian terminology. In many cases, however, this glorification of Pythagoras may not have been the final goal. The ancient authority of Pythagoras was sometimes used to argue for a specific interpretation of Plato, often an interpretation that showed Plato as having anticipated and having responded to criticisms of Aristotle. For example, in defense of the interpretation of Plato’s Timaeus, which defends Plato against Aristotle’s criticisms by claiming that the creation of the world in the Timaeus is metaphorical, a Platonist could point to the forged treatise of Timaeus of Locri which does present the generation as metaphorical but which can also be regarded as Plato’s source. These pseudo-Pythagorean treatises are adopting the same strategy as Eudorus of Alexandria and thus may be more important for debates within later Platonism than for Pythagoreanism per se (Bonazzi 2013). Given these motivations for the pseudepigrapha, it is no surprise that there is little in them that has any connection to genuine early Pythagoreanism. All that is Pythagorean are the names of the authors (which are derived in large part from Aristoxenus’ works on the Pythagoreans), the Doric dialect in which the works are written and a few general Pythagorean concepts such as harmony. The philosophical content is mostly derived from the Platonic and Aristotelian tradition and shows no awareness of the actual works of early Pythagoreans such as Archytas and Philolaus (see Zhmud 2019a).

One plausible explanation of the sudden proliferation of Pythagorean pseudepigrapha in the first century BCE and first century CE is the reappearance of Aristotle’s esoteric writings in the middle of the first century BCE (Kalligas 2004, 39–42). In those treatises Plato is presented as adopting a pair of principles, the one and the indefinite dyad, which are not obvious in the dialogues, but which Aristotle compares to the Pythagorean principles limit and unlimited (e.g., Metaph. 987b19–988a1). Aristotle can be read, although probably incorrectly, as virtually identifying Platonism and Pythagoreanism in these passages. Thus, Pythagorean enthusiasts may have felt emboldened by this reading of Aristotle to create the supposed original texts upon which Plato drew. They may also have found support for this in Plato’s making the south-Italian Timaeus his spokesman in the dialogue of the same name. It is thus not surprising that the most famous of the pseudepigrapha is the treatise supposedly written by this Timaeus of Locri (Marg 1972), which has survived complete and which is clearly intended to represent the original document on which Plato drew, although it, in fact, also responds to criticisms made of Plato’s dialogue in the first couple of centuries after it was written (Ryle 1965, 176–178). The treatise of Timaeus of Locri is first mentioned by Nicomachus in the second century CE (Handbook 11) and is thus commonly dated to the first century CE. Another complete short treatise (13 pages in Thesleff) is On the Nature of the Universe supposedly by the Pythagorean Ocellus (Harder 1966), which has passages that are almost identical to passages in Aristotle’s On Generation and Corruption. Since Ocellus’ work is first mentioned by the Roman polymath, Varro, scholars have dated it to the first half of the first century BCE. Although Plato was in general more closely associated with the Pythagorean tradition than Aristotle, a significant number of Pythagorean pseudepigrapha follow ‘Ocellus’ in drawing on Aristotle (see Karamanolis 2006, 133–135).

It is likely that in some cases letters were forged in order to authenticate these forged treatises. Thus a correspondence between Plato and Archytas dealing with the acquisition of the writings of Ocellus (Diogenes Laertius VIII 80–81) may be intended to validate the forgery in Ocellus’ name (Harder 1966, 39ff). A letter from Lysis to Hipparchus (Thesleff 1965, 111–114), which enjoyed considerable fame in the later tradition and is quoted by Copernicus, urges that the master’s doctrines not be presented in public to the uninitiated and recounts Pythagoras’ daughter’s preservation of his “notebooks” (hypomnêmata) in secrecy, although she could have sold them for much money (see Riedweg 2005, 120–121). Burkert (1961, 17–28) has argued that this letter was forged to authenticate the “Pythagorean Notes” from which Alexander Polyhistor (1st century BCE) derived his influential account of Pythagoreanism (Diogenes Laertius VIII 24–36 — see the end of this section and for Alexander see section 4.5 below). While some of Pythagoras’ teachings were undoubtedly secret, many were not, and the claim of secrecy in the letter of Lysis is used to explain both the previous lack of early Pythagorean documents and the recent “discovery” of what are in reality forged documents, such as the notebooks.

There are fewer forged treatises in Pythagoras’ name than in the name of other Pythagoreans and they are a very varied group suggesting different origins. Callimachus, in the third century BCE, knew of a spurious astronomical work circulating in Pythagoras’ name (Diogenes Laertius IX 23) and there may have been a similar work forged in the second century (Burkert 1961, 28–42). A group of three books, On Education, On Statesmanship and On Nature, were forged in Pythagoras’ name sometime before the second century BCE (Diogenes Laertius VIII 6 and 9; Burkert 1972a, 225). Heraclides Lembus, in the second century BCE, knew of at least six other works in Pythagoras’ name, all of which must have been spurious, including a Sacred Discourse (Diogenes Laertius VIII 7). The thesis that the historical Pythagoras wrote a Sacred Discourse should be rejected (Burkert 1972a, 219). There was also a spurious treatise on the magical properties of plants and the Golden Verses, which are discussed further below (sect. 4.5). On the spurious treatises assigned to Pythagoras see Centrone 2014a, 316–318.

Archytas appears to have been the most popular name in which to forge treatises, undoubtedly because of his connections to Plato and his fame in the first centuries BCE and CE, when the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha arose (Centrone 2021, 122–127). Archytas was seen as the crucial connection between Pythagoreanism and Plato and his successor Aristotle. Some 45 pages are devoted to pseudo-Archytan treatises in Thesleff’s collection as compared to 30 pages for Pythagoras. The most famous of the pseudo-Archytan texts is The Whole System of Categories, which, along with On Opposites, represents the attempt to claim Aristotle’s system of categories for the Pythagoreans. The pseudo-Archytan works on categories are very frequently cited by the commentators on Aristotle’s Categories (e.g., Simplicius and Syrianus) and were regarded as authentic by them, but in fact include modifications made to Aristotle’s theory in the first century BCE and probably were composed in that century (Szlezak 1972). Another treatise, On Principles, is full of Aristotelian terminology such as “form,” “substance,” and “what underlies”; On Intelligence and Perception contains a paraphrase of the divided line passage in Plato’s Republic. There are also a series of pseudepigrapha on ethics by Archytas and other authors (Centrone 1990. For more on the Archytan pseudepigrapha see the SEP article on Archytas). Philolaus, the third most famous Pythagorean after Pythagoras and Archytas, also turns up as the author of several spurious treatises, but a number of the forgeries were in the names of obscure or otherwise unknown Pythagoreans. Thus, Callikratidas and Metopos are presented as anticipating Plato’s doctrine of the tripartite soul and as using Plato’s exact language to articulate it (Thesleff 1965, 103.5 and 118.1–4). Although there are indications that some ancient scholars had doubts about the authenticity of the pseudo-Pythagorean texts, for the most part they succeeded in their purpose all too well and were accepted as genuine texts on which Plato and Aristotle drew.

Although the pseudepigrapha are too varied to admit of one origin, Centrone has recently argued that a core group of pseudepigrapha do appear to be part of a single project (2014a). They are written in Doric Greek (the dialect used in southern Italy where the Pythagoreans flourished) in order to give them the appearance of authenticity and share a common style. There are some twenty-five treatises belonging to this group and they include some of the most famous pseudepigrapha, including the work by ps.-Timaeus that was supposed to be Plato’s model, ps.-Archytas’ works on categories and ps.-Ocellus On the Universe. These treatises espouse the same basic system and seem designed to cover all the basic fields of knowledge. The system is based on theory of principles in which God is the supreme entity above a pair of principles, one of which is limited and the other unlimited, and which are identified with Aristotelian form and matter. This system is very similar to what is found in Eudorus, a Platonist working in Alexandria in the fist cenutury BCE. Starting from these principles a common system is then developed which applies to theology, cosmology, ethics, and politics. The connections to Eudorus and to Philo who also worked in Alexandria, very much suggest that this group of treatises was developed as a coherent project in Alexandria sometime in the first century BCE or the first century CE. A number of the pseudepigrapha were forged in the names of obscure Pythagoreans such as Theages or Metopus. Obviously such obscure authors can give little authority to the texts but it may be that the goal of composing texts espousing the same basic system in the names of a wide range of authors was to show the unity of the school (Centrone 2021, 120–121). One idiosyncratic view argues that the philosophical system of the pseudepigrapha did not arise around figures like Eudorus in the first century BCE but derives in part from a genuine tradtion of Hellenistic Pythagoreanism (Horky 2023, 20), but the evidence for this is meagre.

One important group of Pythagorean pseudepigrapha are those forged in the names of Pythagorean women. These texts had been seriously neglected by scholars until recently. Pomeroy 2013 provides some useful commentary but has serious drawbacks (see Centrone 2014b and Brodersen 2014). Huizenga 2013 is a reliable guide but Dutsch 2020 provides what is by far the most insightful treatment of the figure of the Pythagorean woman in (mostly later) antiquity as well as illuminating readings of the texts themselves. Many of the texts are collected in Thesleff 1965 under the names Theano, Periktione, Melissa, Myia and Phintys and taken together occupy about 15 pages of text. To Periktione are assigned two fragments from a treatise On the Harmony of a Woman. Periktione is the name of Plato’s mother and it is probable that hers is the famous name in which these works were forged. Two further fragments from On Wisdom are also assigned to her. These fragments show a strong similarity to fragments from a treatise with identical title by Archytas and are likely to have been assigned to Periktione by mistake. Two fragments from a work On the Temperance of a Woman are assigned to Phintys. For Theano, the most famous Pythagorean woman (see 3.3 above), one fragment of a work On Piety is preserved as well as the titles of several other works, numerous apophthegms and a number of letters. On Theano in the pseudepigraphal tradition see Huizenga 2013, 96–117 and Dutsch 2020. Melissa and Myia are represented by one letter each. Although a few of the texts deal with more universal philosophical topics (see Pellò 2022) most of the works focus on female virtue, proper marital conduct, and practical issues such as how to choose a wet nurse and how to deal with slaves. The advice is quite conservative, stressing obedience to one’s husband, chastity and temperance. There is little that is specifically Pythagorean and the connections are clearest with Stoicism (Dutsch 2020, 139). Since the authors are pseudonymous it is impossible to be sure whether they were in fact written by women using female pseudonyms or men using female pseudonyms (Huizenga 2013, 116). In the case of the letters Städele’s edition (1980) is to be preferred to Thesleff (1965). The letters of Melissa and Myia along with three letters of Theano are often found together in the manuscript tradition and may have come to be seen as offering a curriculum for the moral training of women (Huizenga 2013 and Dutsch 2020, 173–212). Due to the dearth of preserved writings by women from the ancient world some have been tempted to suppose that the writings are genuine works by the named authors. However, as demonstrated above, Pythagorean pseudepigrapha were very widespread and more common than genuine Pythagorean works. In such a context the onus of proof is on someone who wants to show that a work is genuine. The content of the writings by Pythagorean women is simply too general to make a convincing case that a specific writing could only have been written by the supposed author rather than by a later forger. In fact, the writings by women fit the pattern of the rest of the pseudepigrapha very well. They are generally forged in the name of famous Pythagorean women, whose names give authority to the advice imparted (Huizenga 2013, 117). How better could one impart force to advice to women than to assign that advice to women who belonged to the philosophical school that gave most prominence to women? The pseudepigrapha written in the names of Pythagorean women probably mostly date to the first centuries BCE and CE like the other Pythagorean pseudepigrapha, but certainty is not possible.

One of the most discussed treatises among the pseudepigrapha are the Pythagorean Notes, which were excerpted by Alexander Polyhistor in the first century BCE, who was in turn quoted by Diogenes Laertius in his Life of Pythagoras (VIII 24–33). Thus the Notes date before the middle of the first century BCE (probably towards the end of the third century BCE [Burkert 1972a, 53]) and are earlier than most pseudepigrapha. In Diogenes’ life the Pythagorean Notes serve as the main statement of Pythagoras’ philosophical views. The treatise is wildly eclectic, drawing from Plato’s Timaeus, the early Academy and Stoicism and the scholarly consensus is that the treatise is a forgery (Burkert 1961, 26ff., Long 2013, Laks 2014). It is tempting to suppose that some early material may be preserved amidst later material, but the text is such an amalgam that it is in practice impossible to identify securely any early material (Burkert 1961, 26; Laks 2014, 375). The Notes are well organized and present a complete if compressed philosophy organized around the concept of purity (Laks 2014). Starting from basic principles (the Platonic monad and dyad) they give an account of the world, living beings, and the soul ending with moral precepts (some of the Pythagorean acusmata). Kahn thought that the treatise reflected a Pythagorean community that was active in the Hellenistic period (2001, 83) but Long is more likely to be right that its learned eclecticism suggests that it is a scholarly creation (Long 2013, 158–159). A neglected Pythagorean pseudepigraphon is the treatise known as the Anonymus arithmologicus, which dates to the first half of the first century BCE. No actual fragments of the Anonymus survive and it is accordingly not included in Theseff’s collection of the pseudepigrapha. Its existence is deduced from parallel passages in later sources such as Philo and Theon that suggest a common source. It has been recently argued, however, that the Anonymus was a crucial influence on the later Neopythagorean tradition (Zhmud 2021). Only a few of the pseudepigrapha survive as complete treatises rather than fragments. One of the most interesting cases is the treatise of Bryson on the Management of the Estate, of which Stobaeus preserved two fragments in Greek but which survives entire in an Arabic translation (Swain 2013, Celkyte 2023).

4.3 Neopythagorean Metaphysics: Eudorus, Moderatus, Numenius and Hippolytus

“Neopythagorean” is a modern label, which overlaps with two other modern labels, “Middle Platonist” and “Neoplatonist,” so that a given figure will be called a Neoplatonist or Middle Platonist by some scholars and a Neopythagorean by others. It may well be that most of the figures discussed below are best regarded as part of the Platonic tradition so it has been suggested that the best description of them is as Pythagorising Platonists (Bonazzi, 2023, 103). There are several different strands in Neopythagoreanism. One strand focuses on Pythagoras as a master metaphysician. In this guise he is presented as the author of a theory of principles, which went even beyond the principles of Plato’s later metaphysics, the one and the indefinite dyad, and which shows similarities to the Neoplatonic system of Plotinus. The first Neopythagorean in this sense is Eudorus of Alexandria, who was active in the middle and later part of the first century BCE. He evidently presented his own innovations as the work of the Pythagoreans (Dillon 1977, 119). According to Eudorus, the Pythagoreans posited a single supreme principle, known as the one and the supreme god, which is the cause of all things. Below this first principle are a second one, which is also called the monad, and the indefinite dyad. These latter two are Plato’s principles in the unwritten doctrines, but Eudorus says they are properly speaking elements rather than principles (Simplicius, in Phys., CAG IX 181. 10–30). The system of principles described by Eudorus also appears in the pseudo-Pythagorean writings (e.g., pseudo-Archytas, On Principles; Thesleff 1965, 19) and it is hard to be certain in which direction the influence went (Dillon 1977, 120–121). On Eudorus’ connection to the pseudo-Pythagorean writings see also Bonazzi 2013 and Centrone 2014. Eudorus is a pivotal figure in the Platonic tradition in that he inaugurates the tradition in which philosophy is identified with exegesis of authoritative texts, notably the Timaeus, and because he clearly represents the turn to Pythagoreanism as crucial to understanding Plato in contrast to Hellenistic Platonism, which paid little attention to Pythagoras (Bonazzi 2023, 86–90). A generation after Eudorus, another Alexandrian, the Jewish thinker Philo, used a Pythagorean theory of principles, which is similar to that found in Eudorus, and Pythagorean number symbolism in order to give a philosophical interpretation of the Old Testament (Kahn 2001, 99–104; Dillon 1977, 139–183). Philo’s goal was to show that Moses was the first philosopher. For Philo Pythagoras and his travels to the east evidently played a crucial role in the transmission of philosophy to the Greeks (Dillon 2014). Philo like Eudorus has close connections to the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha (Centrone 2014).

Moderatus of Gades (modern Cadiz in Spain), who was active in the first century CE, shows similarities to Eudorus in his treatment of Pythagorean principles. Plutarch explicitly labels him a Pythagorean and presents his follower, Lucius, as living a life in accord with the Pythagorean taboos, known as symbola or acusmata (Table Talk 727b). It is thus tempting to assume that Moderatus too lived a Pythagorean life (Dillon 1977, 345). His philosophy is only preserved in reports of other thinkers, and it is often difficult to distinguish what belongs to Moderatus from what belongs to the source.

He wrote a comprehensive eleven volume work entitled Lectures on Pythagoreanism from which Porphyry quotes in sections 48–53 of his Life of Pythagoras. In this passage, Moderatus argues that the Pythagoreans used numbers as a way to provide clear teaching about bodiless forms and first principles, which cannot be expressed in words. In another excerpt, he describes a Pythagorean system of principles, which appears to be developed from the first two deductions of the second half of Plato’s Parmenides. In this system there are three ones: the first one which is above being, a second one which is identified with the forms and which is accompanied by intelligible matter (i.e. the indefinite dyad) and a third one which is identified with soul. The first two ones show connections to Eudorus’ account of Pythagorean first principles; the whole system anticipates central ideas of the most important Neoplatonist, Plotinus (Dillon 1977, 346–351; Kahn 2001, 105–110).

Moderatus was a militant Neopythagorean, who explicitly charges that Plato, Aristotle and members of the early academy claimed as their own the most fruitful aspects of Pythagorean philosophy with only small changes, leaving for the Pythagoreans only those doctrines that were superficial, trivial and such as to bring discredit on the school (Porphyry, VP 53). These trivial doctrines have been thought to be the various taboos preserved in the symbola, but, since his follower Lucius is explicitly said to follow the symbola, it seems unlikely that Moderatus was critical of them. The charge of plagiarism might suggest that Moderatus was familiar with the pseudo-Pythagorean treatises, which appear to have been forged in part to show that Pythagoras had anticipated the main ideas of Plato and Aristotle (see Kahn 2001, 105).

It is with Numenius (see Dillon 1977, 361–379 and Kahn 2001, 118–133, and the entry on Numenius, especially section 2), who flourished ca. 150 CE in Apamea in northern Syria (although he may have taught at Rome), that Neopythagoreanism has the clearest direct contact with the great Neoplatonist, Plotinus. Porphyry reports that Plotinus was, in fact, accused of having plagiarized from Numenius and that, in response, Amelius, a devotee of Numenius’ writings and follower of Plotinus, wrote a treatise entitled Concerning the Difference Between the Doctrines of Plotinus and Numenius (Life of Plotinus 3 and 17). The third century Platonist, Longinus, to a degree describes Plotinus himself as a Neopythagorean, saying that Plotinus developed the exegesis of Pythagorean and Platonic first principles more clearly than his predecessors, who are identified as Numenius, his follower Cronius, Moderatus and Thrasyllus, all Neopythagoreans (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 20). Numenius also had considerable influence on Porphyry (Macris 2014, 396), Iamblichus (O’Meara 2014, 404–405) and Calcidius (Hicks 2014, 429).

Numenius is regularly described as a Pythagorean by the sources that cite his fragments such as Eusebius (e.g. Fr. 1, 4b, 5 etc. Des Places). He presents himself as returning to the teaching of Plato and the early Academy. That teaching is in turn presented as deriving from Pythagoras. Plato is described as “not better than the great Pythagoras but perhaps not inferior to him either” (Fr. 24 Des Places). Strikingly, Numenius presents Socrates too as a Pythagorean, who worshipped the three Pythagorean gods recognized by Numenius (see below). Thus Plato derived his Pythagoreanism both from direct contact with Pythagoreans and also from Socrates (Karamanolis 2006, 129–132). For Numenius a true philosopher adheres to the teaching of his master, and he wrote a polemical treatise, directed particularly at the skeptical New Academy, with the title On the Revolution of the Academics against Plato (Fr. 24 Des Places). Numenius presents the Pythagorean philosophy to which Plato adhered as ultimately based on a still earlier philosophy, which can be found in Eastern thinkers such as the Magi, Brahmans, Egyptian priests and the Hebrews (Fr. 1 Des Places). Thus, Numenius was reported to have asked “What else is Plato than Moses speaking Greek?” (Fr. 8 Des Places).

Numenius presents his own doctrine of matter, which is clearly developed out of Plato’s Timaeus, as the work of Pythagoras (Fr. 52 Des Places). Matter in its disorganized state is identified with the indefinite dyad. Numenius argues that for Pythagoras the dyad was a principle independent of the monad; later thinkers, who tried to derive the dyad from the monad (he does not name names but Eudorus, Moderatus and the Pythagorean system described by Alexander Polyhistor fit the description), were thus departing from the original teaching. In emphasizing that the monad and dyad are independent principles, Numenius is indeed closer to the Pythagorean table of opposites described by Aristotle and to Plato’s unwritten doctrines. Since it is in motion, disorganized matter must have a soul, so that the world and the things in it have two souls, one evil derived from matter and one good derived from reason. Numenius avoids complete dualism in that reason does have ultimate dominion over matter, thus making the world as good as possible, given the existence of the recalcitrant matter.

The monad, which is opposed to the indefinite dyad, is just one of three gods for Numenius (Fr. 11 Des Places), who here follows Moderatus to a degree. The first god is equated with the good, is simple, at rest and associates only with itself. The second god is the demiurge, who by organizing matter divides himself so that a third god arises, who is either identified with the organized cosmos or its animating principle, the world soul (Dillon 1977, 366–372). Numenius is famous for the striking images by means of which he elucidated his philosophy, such as the comparison of the helmsman, who steers his ship by looking at the heavens, to the demiurge, who steers matter by looking to the first god (Fr. 18 Des Places). Numenius’ argument that there is a first god above the demiurge is paralleled by a passage in another treatise, which shows connections to Neopythagorean metaphysics, The Chaldaean Oracles (Majercik 1989), which were published by Julian the Theurgist, during the reign of Marcus Aurelius (161–180 CE) and thus at about the same time as Numenius was active. It is hard to know which way the influence went (Dillon 1977, 363).

In The Refutation of all Heresies, the Christian bishop Hippolytus (died ca. 235 CE) adopts the strategy of showing that Christian heresies are in fact based on the mistaken views of pagan philosophers. Hippolytus spends considerable time describing Pythagoreanism, since he regards it as the primary source for gnostic heresy (see Mansfeld 1992 for this and what follows). Hippolytus’ presentation of Pythagoreanism, which groups together Pythagoras, Plato, Empedocles and Heraclitus into a Pythagorean succession, belongs to a family of Neopythagorean interpretations of Pythagoreanism developed in the first century BCE and the first two centuries CE and which also appear in later commentators such as Syrianus and Philoponus. Hippolytus’ interpretation shows similarities to material in Eudorus, Philo Judaeus, Plutarch and Numenius among others, although he adapts the material to fit his own purposes. He regards Platonism and Pythagoreanism as the same philosophy, which ultimately derives from Egypt. Empedocles is regarded as a Pythagorean and is quoted, sometimes without attribution, as evidence for Pythagorean views. According to Hippolytus the Monad and the Dyad are the two Pythagorean principles, although the Dyad is derived from the Monad. The Pythagoreans recognize two worlds, the intelligible, which has the Monad as its principle, and the sensible, whose principle is the tetraktys, the first four numbers, which correspond to the point, line, surface and solid. The tetraktys contains the decad, since the sum of 1, 2, 3 and 4 is 10, and this is embodied in the ten Aristotelian categories, which describe the sensible world. The pseudo-Archytan treatise, The Whole System of Categories, had already claimed this Aristotelian doctrine for the Pythagoreans (see 4.2 above). Finally, the intelligible world is equated with Empedocles’ sphere controlled by the uniting power of Love in contrast to the world of sense perception in which the dividing power of Strife plays the role of the demiurge (Refutation of all Heresies 6, 23–25).

4.4 Neopythagorean Mathematical Sciences: Nicomachus, Porphyry and Iamblichus

A second strand of Neopythagoreanism, while maintaining connection to these metaphysical speculations, emphasizes Pythagoras’ role in the mathematical sciences. Nicomachus of Gerasa (modern Jerash in Jordan) was probably active a little before Numenius, in the first half of the second century CE. Unlike Neopythagoreans such as Eudorus, Moderatus and Numenius, whose works only survive in fragments, two complete works of Nicomachus survive, Introduction to Arithmetic and Handbook of Music. More than anyone else in antiquity he was responsible for popularizing supposed Pythagorean achievements in mathematics and the sciences. The Handbook of Music gives the canonical but scientifically impossible story of Pythagoras’ discovery of the whole number ratios, which correspond to the basic concordant intervals in music: the octave (2:1), fifth (3:2), and fourth (4:3); he supposedly heard the concords in the sounds produced by hammers of varying weights in a blacksmith’s shop, which he happened to be passing (Chapter 6 — translation in Barker 1989, 256 ff.). In the next century, Iamblichus took this chapter over virtually verbatim and without acknowledgement in his On the Pythagorean Life (Chapter 26) and it was repeated in many later authors. The harmonic theory presented by Nicomachus in the Handbook is not original and is, in fact, somewhat retrograde. It is tied to the diatonic scale used by Plato in the Timaeus (35b-36b), which was previously used by the Pythagorean Philolaus in the fifth-century (Fr. 6a) and shows no awareness of or interest in the more sophisticated analysis of Archytas in the fourth century BCE. Nicomachus is not concerned with musical practice but with “what pure reasoning can reveal about the properties of a rationally impeccable and unalterable system of quantitative relations” (Barker 2007, 447). Nicomachus also relies heavily and without acknowledgement on a non-Pythagorean treatment of music, Aristoxenus’ Elementa Harmonica, many of the ideas of which he assigns to the Pythagoreans (e.g., in Chapter 2; see Barker 1989, 245 ff.).

The Handbook was influential because it put forth an accessible version of Pythagorean harmonics (Barker 2014, 200–202). Nicomachus provided a more detailed treatment of Pythagorean harmonics in his lost Introduction to Music. Most scholars agree that Books I-III and perhaps Book IV of Boethius’ De Institutione Musica are a close paraphrase, which is often essentially a translation, of Nicomachus’ lost work (see Bower in Boethius 1989, xxviii and Barker 2007, 445). Even more influential than his work on harmonics was Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic. Again Nicomachus was not an original or particularly talented mathematician, but this popularizing textbook was widely influential. There were a series of commentaries on it by Iamblichus (3rd CE), Asclepius of Tralles (6th CE), and Philoponus (6th CE) and it was translated into Latin already in the second half of the second century by Apuleius. Most importantly, Boethius (5th-6th CE) provides what is virtually a translation of it in his De Institutione Arithmetica, which became the standard work on arithmetic in the middle ages. On Boethius’ use of Nicomachus see Hicks 2014, 422–424.

In the Introduction to Arithmetic, Nicomachus assigns to Pythagoras the Platonic division between the intelligible and sensible world, quoting the Timaeus as if it were a Pythagorean text (I 2). He also assigns Aristotelian ideas to Pythagoras, in particular a doctrine of immaterial attributes with similarities to the Aristotelian categories (I 1). Nicomachus divides reality into two forms, magnitude and multitude. Wisdom is then knowledge of these two forms, which are studied by the four sciences, which will later be known as the quadrivium: arithmetic, music, geometry and astronomy. He quotes a genuine fragment of Archytas (Fr. 1) in support of the special position of these four sciences. Nicomachus presents arithmetic as the most important of the four, because it existed in the mind of the creating god (the demiurge) as the plan which he followed in ordering the cosmos (I 4), so that numbers thus appear to have replaced the Platonic forms as the model of creation (on forms and numbers in Nicomachus see Helmig 2007). It is striking that, along with this Platonization of Pythagoreanism, Nicomachus does give an accurate presentation of Philolaus’ basic metaphysical principles, limiters and unlimiteds, before attempting to equate them with the Platonic monad and dyad (II 18).

Another work by Nicomachus, The Theology of Arithmetic, which can be reconstructed from a summary by Photius and an anonymous work sometimes ascribed to Iamblichus and known as the Theologoumena Arithmeticae (Dillon 1977, 352–353), suggests that he largely returned to the system of principles found in Plato’s unwritten doctrines and did not follow Eudorus and Moderatus in attempts to place a supreme god above the demiurge. Nicomachus apparently presents the monad as the first principle and demiurge, which then generates the dyad, but much is unclear (Dillon 1977, 353–358). The Theology of Arithmetic may have been most influential in its attempt to set up an equivalence between the pagan gods and the numbers in the decad, which was picked up later by Iamblichus and Proclus (Kahn 2001, 116). Nicomachus also wrote a Life of Pythagoras, which has not survived but which Porphyry (e.g., VP 59) and Iamblichus used (Rohde 1871–1872; O’Meara 2014, 412–413).

After Plotinus (205–270 CE), Neopythagoreanism becomes absorbed into Neoplatonism. Although Plotinus was clearly influenced by Neopythagorean speculation on first principles (see above), he was not a Neopythagorean himself, in that he did not assign Pythagoras a privileged place in the history of Greek philosophy. Plotinus treats Pythagoras as just one among many predecessors, complains of the obscurities of his thought and labels Plato and not Pythagoras as divine (Enneads IV 8.11 ff.).

The earliest extant Life of Pythagoras is that of Diogenes Laertius, who was active ca. 200 CE. The most recent treatment of Diogenes’ life is Laks 2014, on which much of what follows depends. Unlike his successors Porphyry and Iamblichus (see below) Diogenes had no philosophical affiliation and hence no philosophical axe to grind in presenting the life of Pythagoras. Indeed, it is striking that his life shows little influence from the Neopythagorean authors discussed above. Diogenes draws on a wide variety of important sources, some going back to the fourth century and others deriving from the Hellenistic period. This material is put together in a very loose, sometimes undetectable, organizational structure. There is a notable section on Pythagoras’ supposed writings (VIII, 6–7). He shows particular interest in the Pythagorean way of life and quotes a large number of Pythagorean symbola for some of which his source was Aristotle (VIII 34–35). The main section on Pythagoras’ philosophical doctrines is a long quotation from the first-century polymath Alexander Polyhistor who claims to be in turn drawing on a treatise called Pythagorean Notes (VIII 24–33). For more on this treatise see the section on Pythagorean pseudepigrapha above (4.2). Diogenes quotes a number of passages satirizing Pythagoras, including Xenophanes’ famous puppy fragment, and presents some of his own epigrams making fun of the Pythagorean way of life (VIII, 36). However, other parts of his life present Pythagoras in a quite postive light so that it is hard to determine precisely what attitude Diogenes took towards Pythagoras (Laks 2014, 377–380).

The Life of Pythagoras by Plotinus’ pupil and editor, Porphyry (234–ca. 305) is one of our most important sources for Pythagoreanism (For what follows see Macris 2014). It was originally part of his now lost Philosophical History. Continuing interest in Pythagoras in later centuries led the Life of Pythagoras to be preserved separately and it is the only large section of the Philosophical History to survive. The Philosophical History ended with Plato and clearly regarded Platonic philosophy as the true philosophy so that Pythagoras seems to have been highlighted as a key figure in the development of Plato’s philosophy. Porphyry’s Life of Pythagoras is particularly valuable, because he often clearly identifies his sources. This same penchant for identifying and seeking out important Pythagorean sources can be seen in his commentary on Ptolemy’s Harmonics (2nd CE), in which he preserves several genuine fragments of the early Pythagorean Archytas, along with some pseudo-Pythagorean material. In the Life of Pythagoras Porphyry does not structure his information according to any overarching theme but instead sets out the information derived from other sources in a simple and orderly way with the minimum of editorial intervention. Although he cites some fifteen sources, some going back to the fourth century BCE, it is likely that he did not use most of these sources but rather found them quoted in the four main sources, which he used directly: 1) Nicomachus’ Life of Pythagoras, 2) Moderatus’ Lectures on Pythagoreanism, 3) Antonius Diogenes’ novel Unbelievable Things Beyond Thule, and 4) a handbook of some sort. Since these sources come from the first and second centuries CE, Porphyry basically provides us with the picture of Pythagoras common in Middle Platonism. This Pythagoras is the prototype of the sage of old who was active as a teacher and tied to religious mystery. However, he is not yet Iamblichus’ priviliged soul sent to save humanity (Macris, 2014, 390). Porphyry provides little criticism of his sources and, although his life has a neutral factual tone, in contrast to Diogenes Laertius in his Life of Pythagoras, he includes no negative reports about Pythagoras.

It would appear, however, that Pythagoras was not made the source of all Greek philosophy, but was rather presented as one of a number of sages both Greek and non-Greek (e.g., Indians, Egyptians and Hebrews), who promulgated a divinely revealed philosophy. This philosophy is, in fact, Platonic in origin as it relies on the Platonic distinction between the intelligible and sensible realms; Porphyry unhistorically assigns it back to these earlier thinkers, including Pythagoras. Pythagoras’ philosophy is thus said to aim at freeing the mind from the fetters of the body so that it can attain a vision of the intelligible and eternal beings (Life of Pythagoras 46–47). O’Meara thus seems correct to conclude that Porphyry was “…not a Pythagoreanizing Platonist … but rather a universalizing Platonist: he finds his Platonism both in Pythagoras and in very many other quarters” (1989, 25–29). Porphyry himself lived an ascetic life that was probably largely inspired by Pythagoreanism (Macris 2014, 393–394).

Porphyry’s pupil, Iamblichus (ca. 245–ca. 325 CE), from Chalcis in Syria, opposed his teacher on many issues in Neoplatonic philosophy and was responsible for a systematic Pythagoreanization of Neoplatonism (see O’ Meara 1989 and 2014), particularly under the influence of Nicomachus’ earlier treatment of Pythagorean work in the quadrivium. Iamblichus wrote a work in ten books entitled On Pythagoreanism. The first four books have survived intact and excerpts of Books V-VII are preserved by the Byzantine scholar Michael Psellus. Book One, On the Pythagorean Life, has biographical aspects but is primarily a detailed description of and a protreptic for the Pythagorean way of life. It might be that Iamblichus’ Pythagoras is intended in part as a pagan rival to Christ and to Christianity, which was gaining strength at this time. Porphyry, indeed, had written a treatise Against the Christians, now lost. In Iamblichus, Pythagoras’ miraculous deeds include a meeting at the beginning of his career with fishermen hauling in a catch (VP 36; cf. Matthew 1. 16–20; see Iamblichus, On the Pythagorean Life, Dillon and Hershbell (eds.) 1991, 25–26). O’Meara, on the other hand, doubts this connection to Christ (2014, 405 n. 21) and suggests that Iamblichus may have constructed Pythagoras as a rival to Porphyry’s presentation of Plotinus as the model philosopher (1989, 214–215). In the end we cannot be certain whether Iamblichus is responding to Porphyry or Porphyry to Iamblichus, but they can be seen as battling over Plato’s legacy (O’Meara 2014, 403). Porphyry in his Life of Plotinus and edition of his works is promoting Plotinus’ interpretation of Plato. Iamblichus, on the other hand, advocates a return to the philosophy that inspired Plato, Pythagoreanism. Pythagorean philosophy is portrayed by Iamblichus as a gift of the gods, which cannot be comprehended without their aid; Pythagoras himself was sent down to men to provide that aid (VP 1).

Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life is largely a compilation of earlier sources but, unlike Porphyry, he does not usually identify them. Rohde (1871–1872) argued influentially that On the Pythagorean Life was largely a compilation from two sources: Nicomachus’ Life of Pythagoras and a life of Pythagoras by Apollonius of Tyana. O’Meara argues that this underestimates both the extent to which Iamblichus reworked his sources for his own philosophical purposes and the variety of sources that he used (O’Meara 2014, 412–415). A particularly clear example of Iamblichus’ distintive development of ideas found in earlier sources can be seen in his treatment of the doctrine of the harmony of the spheres (O’Meara 2007). It is also true that the remaining books of On Pythgoreanism use a variety of sources. Book Two, Protreptic to Philosophy, is an exhortation to philosophy in general and to Pythagorean philosophy in particular and relies heavily on Aristotle’s lost Protrepticus. Book Three, On General Mathematical Science, deals with the general value of mathematics in aiding our comprehension of the intelligible realm and is followed by a series of books on the specific sciences. The treatment of arithmetic in Book IV takes the form of a commentary on Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic. Books V-VII then dealt with arithmetic in physics, ethics and theology respectively and were followed by treatments of the other three sciences in the quadrivium: On Pythagorean Geometry, On Pythagorean Music and On Pythagorean Astronomy. Iamblichus was particularly interested in Pythagorean numerology and his section on arithmetic in theology is probably reflected in the anonymous treatise which has survived under the title Theologoumena Arithmeticae and which has sometimes been ascribed to Iamblichus himself. It appears that here again Iamblichus relied heavily on Nicomachus, this time on his Theology of Arithmetic.

It is possible that Iamblichus used the ten Books of On Pythagoreanism as the basic text in his school, but we know that he went beyond these books to the study of Aristotelian logic and the Platonic dialogues, particularly the Timaeus and Parmenides (Kahn 2001, 136–137). Nonetheless, it was because of Iamblichus that Pythagoreanism in the form of numerology and mathematics in general was emphasized by later Neoplatonists such as Syrianus (fl. 430 CE) and Proclus (410/412–485 CE). Proclus is reported to have dreamed that he was the reincarnation of Nicomachus (Marinus, Life of Proclus 28). Proclus did treat Plato’s writings as clearer than the somewhat obscure writings of the Pythagoreans but his Platonism is still heavily Pythagorean (O’ Meara 2014, 415). The successors of Proclus appear to follow his and Iamblichus’ interpretation of Pythagoras (O’Meara 2013).

4.5 Pythagoreans as Relgious Experts, Magicians and Moral Exemplars: Pythagoreanism in Rome, The Golden Verses and Apollonius of Tyana

A third strand in Neopythagoreanism emphasizes Pythagoras’ practices rather than his supposed metaphysical system. This Pythagoras is an expert in religious and magical practices and/or a sage who lived the ideal moral life, upon whom we should model our lives. This strand is closely connected to the striking interest in and prominence of Pythagoreanism in Roman literature during the first century BCE and first century CE. Cicero (106–43 BCE) in particular refers to Pythagoras and other Pythagoreans with some frequency. In De Finibus (V 2), he presents himself as the excited tourist, who, upon his arrival in Metapontum in S. Italy and even before going to his lodgings, sought out the site where Pythagoras was supposed to have died. At the beginning of Book IV (1–2) of the Tusculan Disputations, Cicero notes that Pythagoras gained his fame in southern Italy at just the same time that L. Brutus freed Rome from the tyranny of the kings and founded the Republic; there is a clear implication that Pythagorean ideas, which reached Rome from southern Italy, had an influence on the early Roman Republic. Cicero goes on to assert explicitly that many Roman usages were derived from the Pythagoreans, although he does not give specifics. According to Cicero, it was admiration for Pythagoras that led Romans to suppose, without noticing the chronological impossibility, that the wisest of the early Roman kings, Numa, who was supposed to have ruled from 715–673 BCE, had been a pupil of Pythagoras.

In addition to references to Pythagoras himself, Cicero refers to the Pythagorean Archytas some eleven times, in particular emphasizing his high moral character, as revealed in his refusal to punish in anger and his suspicion of bodily pleasure (Rep. I 38. 59; Sen. XII 39–41). Cicero’s own philosophy is not much influenced by the Pythagoreans except in The Dream of Scipio (Rep. VI 9), which owes even more to Plato.

The interest in Pythagoras and Pythagoreans in the first century BCE is not limited to Cicero, however. Both a famous ode of Horace (I 28) and a brief reference in Propertius (IV 1) present Archytas as a master astronomer. Most striking of all is the speech assigned to Pythagoras that constitutes half of Book XV of Ovid’s Metamorphoses (early years of the first century CE) and that calls for strict vegetarianism in the context of the doctrine of transmigration of souls. These latter themes are true to the earliest evidence for Pythagoras, but the rest of Ovid’s presentation assigns to Pythagoras a doctrine that is derived from a number of early Greek philosophers and in particular the doctrine of flux associated with Heraclitus (Kahn 2001, 146–149).

This flourishing of Pythagoreanism in Roman literature of the golden age has its roots in one of the earliest Roman literary figures, Ennius (239–169 BCE), who, in his poem Annales, adopts the Pythagorean doctrine of metempsychosis, in presenting himself as the reincarnation of Homer, although he does not mention Pythagoras by name in the surviving fragments. Roman nationalism also played a role in the emphasis on Pythagoreanism at Rome. Since Pythagoras did his work in Italy and Aristotle even referred to Pythagoreanism in some places as the philosophy of the Italians (e.g., Metaph. 987a10), it is not surprising that the Romans wanted to emphasize their connections to Pythagoras. This is particularly clear in Cicero’s references to Pythagoreanism but once again finds its roots even earlier. In 343 BCE during the war with the Samnites, Apollo ordered the Romans to erect one statue of the wisest and another of the bravest of the Greeks; their choice for the former was Pythagoras and for the latter Alcibiades. Pliny, who reports the story (Nat. XXXIV 26), expresses surprise that Socrates was not chosen for the former, given that, according to Plato’s Apology, Apollo himself had labeled Socrates the wisest; it is surely the Italian connection that explains the Romans’ choice of Pythagoras. Cicero (not Aristoxenus as suggested by Horky 2011) connects the great wisdom assigned to the Samnite Herrenius Pontius to his contact with the Pythagorean Archytas (On Old Age 41). This Roman attempt to forge a connection with Pythagoras can also be seen in the report of Plutarch (Aem. Paul. 1) that some writers traced the descent of the Aemelii, one of Rome’s leading families, to Pythagoras, by claiming Pythagoras’ son Mamercus as the founder of the house.

Although Rome’s special connection to Pythagoras thus had earlier roots, those roots alone do not explain the efflorescence of Pythagoreanism in golden age Latin literature; some stimulus probably came from the rebirth of what were seen as Pythagorean practices in the way certain people lived. The two most learned figures in Rome of the first century BCE, Nigidius Figulus and Varro, both have connections to Pythagorean ritual practices. Thus we are told that Varro (116–27 BCE) was buried according to the Pythagorean fashion in myrtle, olive and black poplar leaves (Pliny, Nat. XXXV 160). Amongst Varro’s voluminous works was the Hebdomadês (“Sevens”), a collection of 700 portraits of famous men, in the introduction to which Varro engaged in praise for the number 7, which is similar to the numerology of later Neopythagorean works such as Nicomachus’ Theology of Arithmetic; in another work Varro presents a theory of gestation, which has Pythagorean connections, in that it is based on the whole number ratios that correspond to the concordant intervals in music (Rawson 1985, 161).

It is Nigidius Figulus, praetor in 58, who died in exile in 45, however, who is usually identified as the figure who was responsible for reviving Pythagorean practices. In the preface to his translation of Plato’s Timaeus, which is often treated as virtually a Pythagorean treatise by the Neopythagoreans, Cicero asserts of Nigidius that “following on those noble Pythagoreans, whose school of philosophy had to a certain degree died out, … this man arose to revive it.” Some scholars are dubious about this claim of Cicero. They point to the evidence cited above for the importance of Pythagoreanism in Rome in the two centuries before Nigidius and suggest that Cicero may be illegitimately following Aristoxenus’ claim that Pythagoreanism died out in the first half of the fourth century (Riedweg 2005, 123–124). While there may be some evidence that there were practicing Pythagoreans in the second half of the fourth century (see above section 3.5), it is hard to find anyone to whom to apply that label in the third and second centuries, so that, from the perspective of the evidence available to us at present, Cicero may well be right that Nigidius was the first person in several centuries to claim to follow Pythagorean practices. However, the sources for Nigidius are meager and there is no evidence that he was the leader of a large and powerful group. If there was an organized group at all, it is more likely to have been a smaller circle (Flinterman 2014, 344).

It is difficult to be sure in what Nigidius’ Pythagoreanism consisted. There is no mention of Pythagoras or Pythagoreans in the surviving fragments of his work nor do they show him engaging in Pythagorean style numerology as Varro did (Rawson 1985, 291 ff.). In Jerome’s chronicle, Nigidius is labeled as Pythagorean and magus; the most likely suggestion, thus, is that his Pythagoreanism consisted in occult and magical practices. Pliny treats Nigidius alongside the Magi and also presents Pythagoras and Democritus as having learned magical practices from the Magi. Cicero describes Nigidius as investgating matters that nature had hidden and this may be a reference to such magical lore (Flinterman 2014, 345). Nigidius’ expertise as an astrologer (he is reported to have used astrology to predict Augustus’ future greatness on the day of his birth [Suetonius, Aug. 94.5]) may be another Pythagorean connection; Propertius’ reference (IV 1) to Archytas shows that Pythagorean work in astronomy was typically connected to astrology in first century Rome.

What led Nigidius and Varro to resurrect purported Pythagorean cult practices? One important influence may have been the Greek scholar Alexander Polyhistor, who was born in Miletus but was captured by the Romans during the Mithridatic wars and brought to Rome as a slave and freed by Sulla in 80 BCE. He taught in Rome in the 70s. It is an intriguing suggestion that Nigidius learned his Pythagoreanism from Alexander (Dillon 1977, 117; For critiques of this suggestion see Flinterman 2014, 349–350 and Long 2013, 145). There is no evidence that Alexander himself followed Pythagorean practices, but he wrote a book On Pythagorean Symbols, which was presumably an account of the Pythagorean acusmata (or symbola), which set out the taboos that governed many aspects of the Pythagorean way of life. In addition, in his Successions of the Philosophers, he gave a summary of Pythagorean philosophy, which he supposedly found in the Pythagorean Notes (See section 4.2 above) and which has been preserved by Diogenes Laertius (VIII 25–35). The basic principles assigned to Pythagoras are those of the Neopythagorean tradition that begins in the early Academy, i.e., the monad and the indefinite dyad. Since Alexander also assigns to the Pythagoreans the doctrine that the elements change into one another, we might suppose that Ovid also used Alexander directly or indirectly, since he assigns a similar doctrine to Pythagoras in the Metamorphoses (XV 75 ff., Rawson 1985, 294).

It is necessary to look in a slightly different direction, in order to see how magical practices came to be particularly associated with Pythagoras and thus why Nigidius was called Pythagorean and magus. In the first century, it was widely believed that Pythagoras had studied with the Magi (Cicero, Fin. V 87), i.e. Persian priests/wise men. What Pythagoras was thought to have learned from the Magi most of all were the magical properties of plants. Pliny the elder (23–79 CE) identifies Pythagoras and Democritus as the experts on such magic and the Magi as their teachers (Nat. XXIV 156–160). Pliny goes on to give a number of specific examples from a book on plants ascribed to Pythagoras. This book is universally regarded as spurious by modern scholars, and even Pliny, who accepts its authenticity, reports that some people ascribe it to Cleemporus. We can date this treatise on plants to the first half of the second century or earlier, since Cato the elder (234–149 BCE) appears to make use of it in his On Agriculture (157), when he discusses the medicinal virtues of a kind of cabbage, which was named after Pythagoras (brassica Pythagorea).

A clearer understanding of this pseudo-Pythagorean treatise on plants and a further indication of its date can be obtained by looking at the work of Bolus of Mendes, an Egyptian educated in Greek (see Dickie 2001, 117–122, to whom the following treatment of Bolus is indebted). Bolus composed a work entitled Cheiromecta, which means “things worked by hand” and may thus refer to potions made by grinding plants and other substances (Dickie 2001, 119). Bolus discussed not just the magical properties of plants but also those of stones and animals. Pliny regarded the Cheiromecta as composed by Democritus on the basis of his studies with the Magi (Nat. 24. 160) and normally cites its contents as what Democritus or the Magi said. Columella, however, tells us what was really going on (On Agriculture VII 5.17). The work was in fact composed by Bolus, who published it under the name of Democritus. Bolus thus appears to have made a collection of magical recipes, some of which do seem to have connections to the Magi, since they are similar to recipes found in 8th century cuneiform texts (Dickie 2001, 121). In order to gain authority for this collection, he assigned it to the famous Democritus.

Since Democritus was sometimes regarded as the pupil of Pythagoreans (Diogenes Laertius IX 38), Bolus’ choice of Democritus to give authority to his work may suggest that someone else (the Cleemporus mentioned by Pliny?) had already used Pythagoras for this purpose and that the pseudo-Pythagorean treatise on the magical properties of plants was thus already in existence when Bolus wrote, in the first half of the second century BCE. An example of the type of recipe involved is Pliny’s ascription to Democritus of the idea that the tongue of a frog, cut out while the frog was still alive, if placed above the heart of a sleeping woman, will cause her to give true answers (Nat. XXXII 49). Thus, the picture of Pythagoras the magician, which may lie behind a number of the supposed Pythagorean practices of Nigidius Figulus, is based on little more than the tradition that Pythagoras had traveled to Egypt and the east, so that he became the authority figure, to whom the real collectors of magical recipes in the third and second century BCE ascribed their collections.

Nigidius’ revival of supposed Pythagorean practices spread to other figures in first century Rome. Cicero attacked Vatinius, consul in 48 and a supporter of Caesar, for calling himself a Pythagorean and trying to shield his scandalous practices under the name of Pythagoras (Vat. 6). The scandalous practices involved necromancy, invoking the dead, by murdering young boys. Presumably this method of necromancy would not be ascribed to Pythagoras, but the suggestion is that some methods of consulting the dead were regarded as Pythagorean. Cicero later ended up defending this same Vatinius in a speech which has not survived but some of the contents of which we know from the ancient scholia on the speech against Vatinius. In this speech Cicero defended Vatinius’ habit of wearing a black toga, which he attacked in the earlier speech (Vat. 12), as a harmless affectation of Pythagoreanism (Dickie 2001, 170). Thus, the title of Pythagorean in first century Rome carried with it associations with magical practices, not all of which would have been widely approved.

Another example of the connection between Pythagoreanism and magic and its possible negative connotations is Anaxilaus of Larissa (Rawson 1985, 293; Dickie 2001, 172–173). In his chronicle, Jerome describes him with the same words as he used for Nigidius, Pythagorean and magus, and reports that he was exiled from Rome in 28 BCE. We know that Anaxilaus wrote a work entitled Paignia (“tricks”), which seems to have consisted of some rather bizarre conjuring tricks for parties. Pliny reports one of Anaxilaus’ tricks as calling for burning the discharge from a mare in heat in a flame, in order to cause the guests to see images of horses’ heads (Nat. XXVIII 181). The passion for things Pythagorean can also be seen in the figure of king Juba of Mauretania (ca. 46 BCE – 23 CE), a learned and cultured man, educated at Rome and author of many books. Olympiodorus describes him as “a lover of Pythagorean compositions” and suggests that Pythagorean books were forged to satisfy the passion of collectors such as Juba (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca 12.1, p. 13).

The connection between Pythagoreanism and astrology visible in Nigidius can perhaps also be seen in Thrasyllus of Alexandria (d. 36 CE), the court astrologer and philosopher, whom the Roman emperor Tiberius met in Rhodes and brought to Rome. Thrasyllus is famous for his edition of Plato’s dialogues arranged into tetralogies, but he was a Platonist with strong Pythagorean leanings. Porphyry in his Life of Plotinus (20) quotes Longinus as saying that Thrasyllus wrote on Platonic and Pythagorean first principles (Dillon 1977, 184–185). Most suggestive of all is the quotation from Thrasyllus preserved by Diogenes Laertius (Diogenes Laertius IX 38), in which Thrasyllus calls Democritus a zealous follower of the Pythagoreans and asserts that Democritus drew all his philosophy from Pythagoras and would have been thought to have been his pupil, if chronology did not prevent it. It is impossible to be sure what Thrasyllus had in mind here, but one very plausible suggestion is that he is thinking of Democritus as a sage, who practiced magic, the Democritus created by Bolus, who was the successor to the arch mage Pythagoras, the supposed author of the treatise on the magical uses of plants (Dickie 2001, 195). Some have argued that the subterranean basilica discovered near the Porta Maggiore and dating to the first century CE was the meeting place of a Pythagorean community but the evidence for this suggestion is very weak (Flinterman 2014).

We cannot be sure whether the Pythagoreanism of Nigidius, Varro and their successors was limited to such things as burial ritual, magical practices and black togas or whether it extended to less spectacular features of a “Pythagorean” life. Q. Sextius, however, founded a philosophical movement in the time of Augustus, which prescribed a vegetarian diet and taught the doctrine of transmigration of souls, although Sextius presented himself as using different arguments than Pythagoras for vegetarianism (Seneca, Ep. 108. 17 ff.). One of these Sextians, as they were known, was Sotion, the teacher of Seneca, and it is Seneca who gives us most of the information we have about them. It is also noteworthy that Sextius is also reported to have asked himself at the end of each day “What bad habit have you cured today? What vice have you resisted? In what way are you better” (Seneca, De Ira III 36). Cicero tells us that it was “the Pythagorean custom” to call to mind in the evening everything said, heard or done during the day (Sen. 38, cf. Iamblichus, VP 164). The practice described by Cicero is directed at training the memory in contrast to Sextius’ questions, which call for moral self-examination. On Pythagoreanism in Rome see further Flinterman 2014.

Something similar to the Sextian version of the practice is found in lines 40–44 of the Golden Verses, a treatise consisting of 71 Greek hexameter verses, which was ascribed to Pythagoras or the Pythagoreans. The poem is a combination of materials from different dates, and it is uncertain when it took the form preserved in manuscripts and called the Golden Verses; dates ranging from 350 BCE to 400 CE have been suggested (see Thom 1995). It is not referred to by name until 200 CE. The Golden Verses are frequently quoted in the first centuries CE and thus constitute one model of the Pythagorean life in Neopythagoreanism, one that is free from magical practices. Much of the advice is common to all of Greek ethical thought (e.g., honoring the gods and parents; mastering lust and anger; deliberating before acting, following measure in all things), but there are also mentions of dietary restrictions typical of early Pythagoreanism and the promise of leaving the body behind to join the aither as an immortal. It is not clear that the treatise should be called pseudepigraphal, since it was not usually ascribed to Pythagoras himself but rather to unnamed Pythagoreans and may have been devised as moral instruction for beginners in a Pythagorean community (Thom 2021), although there is no direct evidence for this community.

Our most detailed account of a Neopythagorean living a life inspired by Pythagoras is Philostratus’ Life of Apollonius of Tyana. Apollonius was active in the second half of the first century CE and died in 97; Philostratus’ life, which was written over a century later at the request of the empress Julia Domna and completed after her death in 217 CE, is more novel than sober biography. According to Philostratus, Apollonius identified his wisdom as that of Pythagoras, who taught him the proper way to worship the gods, to wear linen rather than wool, to wear his hair long, and to eat no animal food (I 32). Some have wondered if Apollonius’ Pythagoreanism is largely the creation of Philostratus, but the standard view has been that Apollonius wrote a life of Pythagoras used by Iamblichus (VP 254) and Porphyry (Burkert 1972, 100), and the fragment of his treatise On Sacrifices has clear connections to Neopythagorean philosophy (Kahn 2001, 143–145). Rohde thought that large parts of Apollonius’s Life of Pythagoras could be found in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life, but recently more and more doubt has arisen as to whether the Apollonius who wrote the Life of Pythagoras used by Iamblichus is really Apollonius of Tyana (Flinterman 2014, 357).

Like Pythagoras, Apollonius journeys to consult the wise men of the east and learns from the Brahmins in India that the doctrine of transmigration, which Apollonius inherited from Pythagoras, originated in India and was handed on to the Egyptians from whom Pythagoras derived it (III 19). Philostratus (I 2) emphasizes that Apollonius was not a magician, thus trying to free him from the more disreputable connotations of Pythagorean practices associated with figures such as Anaxilaus and Vatinius (see above). Nonetheless, Philostratus’ life does recount a number of Apollonius’ miracles, such as the raising of a girl from the dead (IV 45). On Apollonius as a Pythagorean see further Flinterman 2014.

These miracles made Apollonius into a pagan counterpart to Christ. The emperor Alexander Severus (222–235 CE) worshipped Apollonius alongside Christ, Abraham and Orpheus (Hist. Aug., Vita Alex. Sev. 29.2). Hierocles, the Roman governor of Bithynia, who was rigorous in his persecution of Christians, championed Apollonius at the expense of Christ, in The Lover of Truth, and drew as a response Eusebius’ Against Hierocles. As mentioned above, there is some probability that Iamblichus intends to elevate Pythagoras himself as a pagan counterpart to Christ in his On the Pythagorean Life (Dillon and Hershbell 1991, 25–26).

The satirist Lucian (2nd CE) provides us with a hostile portrayal of another holy man with Pythagorean connections, Alexander of Abnoteichus in Paphlagonia, who was active in the middle of the second century CE. In Alexander the False Prophet, Lucian reports that Alexander compared himself to Pythagoras (4), could remember his previous incarnations (34) and had a golden thigh like Pythagoras (40). Lucian shows the not often seen negative side to both Pythagoras’ and Alexander’s reputations when he reports that, if one took even the worst things said about Pythagoras, Alexander would far outdo him in wickedness (4). Some have seen Alexander as largely a literary construction by Lucian with little historical basis but other evidence confirms that there were traveling Pythagorean wonder-workers in the early imperial period (Flinterman 2014, 359).

Despite these attacks on figures such as Apollonius and Alexander who modeled themselves on Pythagoras, the Pythagorean way of life was in general praised; the Neopythagorean tradition which portrays Pythagoras as living the ideal life on which we should model our own reaches its culmination in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life and Porphyry’s Life of Pythagoras

5. Pythagoreanism in the Middle Ages and Renaissance

The influence of Pythagoreanism in the Middle Ages and Renaissance was extensive and was found in most disciplines, in literature and art as well as in philosophy and science. Here only the highlights of that influence can be given (see further Heninger 1974, Celenza 1999, Celenza 2001, Kahn 2001, Riedweg 2005, Hicks 2014, Allen 2014, and the essays in Caiazzo, Macris and Robert (eds.) 2022 to all of whom the following account is indebted). It is crucial to recognize from the beginning that the Pythagoras of the Middle Ages and Renaissance is the Pythagoras of the Neopythagorean tradition, in which he is regarded as either the most important or one of the most important philosophers in the Greek philosophical tradition. Thus, Ralph Cudworth, in The True Intellectual System of the Universe asserted that “Pythagoras was the most eminent of all the ancient Philosophers” (1845, II 4). This is a far cry from the Pythagoras that can be reconstructed by responsible scholarship. Riedweg has put it well: “Had Pythagoras and his teachings not been since the early Academy overwritten with Plato’s philosophy, and had this ‘palimpsest’ not in the course of the Roman empire achieved unchallenged authority among Platonists, it would be scarcely conceivable that scholars from the Middle Ages and modernity down to the present would have found the pre-Socratic charismatic from Samos so fascinating” (2005, 128).

5.1 Boethius/Nicomachus, Calcidius, Macrobius and the Middle Ages

In the Middle Ages Pythagoras and Pythagorean philosophy were regarded as the height of Greek philosophical achievement, although, somewhat paradoxically Pythagoreanism was not still an active philosophy as were Platonism and Aristotelianism but instead belonged to an “imagined history” of philosophy (Hicks 2014, 420). The view of Pythagoreanism in the Middle Ages was heavily determined by three late ancient Latin writers: Calcidius, Macrobius and Boethius. It was in particular the mathematical Pythagoreanism of Nicomachus as transmitted by Boethius that determined the medieval picture of Pythagoras. In ethics, Christians were able to embrace some Pythagorean maxims such as the principle labeled Pythagorean by Boethius: “Follow God” (Consolation of Philosophy 1.4). Some attention was also paid to other Pythagorean symbola or acousmata as is shown later in this section. On the other hand the doctrine of metempsychosis was repugnant to Christian doctrine. John of Salisbury (Policraticus 7.10) says “When the Pythagoreans teach us about innocence, frugality and contempt for the world, we should listen to them; when they force souls that have ascended into the heavens back into the bodies of beasts, even Plato must be reftued, for on this point he followed Pythagoras too closely” (tr. Hicks, 2014, 419–20). When it comes to Pythagoras’ life it is crucial to recognize that Iamblichus’ and Porphyry’s lives of Pythagoras were not known in the Middle Ages so that Pythagoras’ activities were mostly known through passages from classical authors and church fathers (Hicks 2014, 421). Pythagoras was included in medieval encyclopedic works and was given particularly thorough treatment by Vincent of Beauvais (before 1200–1264) in his Speculum historiale (3.24–26), by John of Wales (fl. 1260–1283) in Compendiloquium (3.6.2) and in The Lives and Habits of the Philosophers ascribed to, but probably not actually composed by, Walter Burley (1275–1344; see Riedweg 2005, 129; Heninger 1974, 47; Hicks 2014, 421).

The most influential texts for the conception of Pythagoras in the Latin Middle Ages and early Renaissance were Boethius’ (480–524 CE) De Institutione Arithmetica and De Institutione Musica, which are virtually translations of the Neopythagorean Nicomachus’ (second century CE) Introduction to Arithmetic and Introduction to Music (this larger work is now lost, but a smaller Handbook of Harmonics survives). Boethius followed Nicomachus’ classification of four mathematical sciences depending on the nature of their objects (arithmetic deals with multitude in itself, music with relative multitude, geometry with unmoving magnitudes and astronomy with magnitude in motion). Boethius introduced the term quadrivium, “fourfold road” to understanding, to refer to these four sciences and following Nicomachus made Pythagoras the father of the quadrivium, a depiction which lasts throughout the Middle Ages (Panti 2022). In music theory, Boethius presents the Pythagoreans as taking a middle position, which gives a role in harmonics to both reason and perception. His presentation of the Pythagorean position was central to music theory for over a thousand years (Hicks 2014, 424 and 2022, 98–104). Boethius recounts the apocryphal story of Pythagoras’ discovery in a blacksmith’s shop of the ratios that govern the concordant intervals (Mus. I 10).

Pythagoreanism as found in Boethius’ Institutio Arithmetica was developed into the Medieval Christian Neopythagoren theology that is found particularly in the writings of Thierry of Chartres (1100–1150) and Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464). In this mathematical theology God is the source of all numbers and contains the arithmetical blueprints of the world (Albertson, 2022, 390). On the other hand, Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) primarily dervied his knowledge of Pythagoras and Pythagoreanism from his study of Aristotelian texts. He finds philosophical interest in three Pythagorean doctrines which he, like Aristotle, ultimately rejects: the transmigration of souls (which was almost universally rejected in the Middle ages – See Caiazzo 2022), number as a substantail principle of sensible things, the table of opposites as providing the basic principles of all reality. He also criticizes the Pythagorean doctrine of the harmony of the spheres (Borgo and Costa 2022).

The medieval picture of Pythagoras as a natural philosopher and the medieval understanding of his theory of the nature of the soul were heavily influenced by the Latin commentary on Plato’s Timaeus by Calcidius (4th century CE) and the Commentary on the Dream of Scipio by Macrobius (5th century CE). Calcidius regarded Plato’s Timaeus as a heavily Pythagorean document. Under the influence of the Neopythagorean Numenius, Calcidius assigned to Pythagoras the view that god was unity and matter duality (Hicks 2014, 429). Calcidius describes Plato’s World-Soul in a way that highlights its harmonic structure and Macrobius explicitly ascribes to Pythagoras the view that the soul is a harmony (Commentary on the Dream of Scipio 1.14.19). The doctrine of the harmony of the spheres, which portrays the cosmos as a harmony that is expressed in the music made by the revolutions of the planets, follows from the numerical structure of the World-Soul and was also assigned to Pythagoras by Calcidius. Most medieval Neoplatonic cosmoligies adopted the doctrine, but the reintroduction of Aristotle’s criticism of it in the thirteenth century caused many to abandon the theory until it was revived in the Renaissance by Ficino (Hicks 2014, 434). Later, Shakespeare refers to the doctrine memorably in The Merchant of Venice (V i. 54–65). Cicero’s presentation of it in the Dream of Scipio was also influential in the Renaissance (Heninger 1974, 3).

Pythagoras was also known for moral precepts in the Middle Ages (see Robert 2022) and one of the most important sources for these was St. Jerome’s Apology against Rufinus (402 CE). Jerome reported precepts such as “Avoid excess … in all thing alike” and the famous “Friends have all things in common.” In addition Jerome quoted several of the Pythagorean acousmata which he called aenigmata, e.g. “Never jump over the scale” and “Never stir the fire with the sword.” These aenigmata came to circulate separately from Jerome’s text and were known as the Aenigmata Aristotelis. The oldest evidence for them dates to the 9th century and they circulated widely in the 12th to 15th centuries. In the 14th century they came to be accompanied by a moral and theological commentary called Aenigmata moralizata. They were also incorporated into the Gesta Romanorum, which was one of the most widely circulated collections of moral examples in the Middle Ages. The first chapter of this work portrayed Aristotle as teaching the Pythagorean acousmata to Alexander the Great. The author then provides commentary on each of the acousmata, often appealing to Christian scripture. Moral maxims of Pythagoras also circulated in On the Foolishness of the Philosophers ascribed to a fictional character named Caecilius Balbus. Other Pythagorean sayings reached the Latin West through translations of Arabic gnomologies such as that by Al-Mubashshir (see below). Helinandus of Froidmont’s Chronicon (compiled between 1211 and 1223) was the basis for the medieval tradtion about the life of Pythagoras. It consisted of quotations from classical literature and the church fathers and provided a favorable portrait of Pythagoras, which stressed his moral virtue. Helinandus was closely followed, with some additional material, by Vincent of Beauvais (d. 1264) in The Mirror of History, John of Wales in his Compendiloquium de vita e dictis illustrium philosophorum and the Liber de vita et moribus philosophorum illustrium, which was usually ascribed to Walter Burley (b. 1275). “The collection of Pythagoras’ exempla and dicta served not only to provide material for scholarly works, but also provided clerics with a pagan mirror in which to contemplate, with shame, their own shortcomings” (Robert, 2022, 265).

Pythagorean influence also appeared at less elevated levels of medieval culture. A fourteenth-century manual for preachers, which contained lore about the natural world and is known as The Light of the Soul, ascribes a series of odd observations about nature to Archita Tharentinus, who is presumably intended to be the fourth century BCE Pythagorean, Archytas of Tarentum. These are mostly cited from a book, which was evidently forged in Archytas’ name and known as On Events in Nature. Some of the observations are plausible enough, e.g., that a person at the bottom of a well sees stars in the middle of the day, others more puzzling, e.g., that a dying man emits fiery rays from his eyes at death, while still others may have connections to magic, e.g., “if someone looks at a mirror, before which a white flower has been placed, he cries.” Some magical lore ascribed to an Architas is also found in the thirteenth-century Marvels of the World (ps.-Albertus Magnus), e.g., “if the wax of the left ear of a dog be taken and hung on people with periodic fever, it is beneficial…” These texts seem to continue the connection between Pythagoreanism and magic, which developed in the third and second centuries BCE, and is prominent in Rome during the first-century BCE (see above section 4.5).

Medieval Arabic biographical accounts of Pythagoras such as those of Abū al-Ḥasan Muḥammad ibn Yūsuf al-ʿĀmirī (d. 992) in his On the Afterlife and Abū l-Fatḥ Muḥammad al-Shahrastānī (11th-12th c.) in his Book of Religions and Sects presented Pythagoras as transmitting the Eastern wisdom of Egypt and Solomon to the West and as a sage who had direct experience of the celestial realms and heard the harmony of the spheres. One of the most important Arabic sources for Pythagoras is Abū al-Wafāʾ al-Mubashshir ibn Fātik’s (11th c.) Book of the Choicest Maxims and Best Sayings. It combines a biography of Pythagoras (a shortened and altered version of Porphyry’s Life of Pythagoras) with a collection of Pythagorean maxims. Al-Mubashshir regarded this gnomology as of more than historical interest and as genuinely helpful in religious and practical matters. Most of these maxims were derived from the Pythagorean Sentences but another important source is The Golden Verses, which had already been translated into Arabic in the 8th century. The Golden Verses were regarded by many in the Arabic world as the main source for the teaching of Pythagoras. Another important collection of anecdotes and sentences about Greek and Arabic philosophers was The Cabinet of Wisdom, which was put together around 1000 AD. Many of the sayings ascribed to Pythagoras are assigned to other thinkers in the Greek tradition. Pythagoras was presented as the first philosopher and as an ascetic. Some of the material in this collection is derived from the pseudepigraphal letter of Pythagoras to Hieron I (Thesleff 1965, 185), which was knows as The Letter of Pythagoras to the Tyrant of Sicily. Another set of maxims attributed to Pythagoras is found in The Spiritual Contents of Greek Maxims collected by Ibn Hindū (d. 1019 or 1029). The section on Pythagoras includes 14 sentences, all of which are not found in other Arabic gnomologies. The fifth one starts out “And he said to his son, I recommend ten things and you should learn them: do not appear to be harsh, do not drink with the one who is too eager, do not live with a jealous one …” (tr. Izdebska 2022). These gnomological collections do not include the Pythagorean symbola, which were however translated into both Syriac and Arabic and circulated in collections even more extensive than than those preserved in Greek. In the gnomological tradtion Pythagoras is especially presented as a teacher and moral guide for a community of followers. The Arabic doxographies such as those of Pseudo-Ammonius (second half of 9th century), who relied on Hippolytus’ Refutation of all Heresies (3rd century CE), and al-Shahrastānī (d. 1153) portrayed Pythagoras as a Neoplatonist, whose insights into the unity of god, whose essence is beyond human comprehension, and who transcends all other unities, could serve as a guide to crucial Islamic tenets such as God’s unity and oneness (De Smet, 2022). For more on Pythagoras in the Arabic tradition see Izdebska 2022. Nicomachus’ Introduction to Arithmetic was translated into Arabic twice. One translation in 822 CE was based on a previous Syriac translation and is lost and only now known through a Hebrew translation completed in 1317 CE (Freudenthal, 2022). The other was completed in the second half of the 9th century from the Greek and survives in one copy. These translations insured that Nichomachus exerted in important influence on Arabic mathematical treatises, teaching textbooks and encyclopedias (Brentjes, 2022).

5.2 The Renaissance: Ficino, Pico, Reuchlin, Copernicus and Kepler

In the Renaissance, Pythagoreanism played an important role in the thought of fifteenth- and sixteenth century Italian and German humanists. The Florentine Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499) is most properly described as a Neoplatonist. He made the philosophy of Plato available to the Latin-speaking west through his translation of all of Plato into Latin. In addition he translated important works of writers in the Neoplatonic and Neopythagorean tradition, such as Plotinus, Porphyry, Iamblichus and Proclus. From that tradition he accepted and developed the view that Plato was heir to an ancient theology/philosophy (prisca theologia) that was derived from earlier sages including Pythagoras, who immediately preceded Plato in the succession (Allen 2014, 435–436). Ficino like the Neopythagoreans had no conception of an early and a late Pythagoreanism, for him Pythagoreanism was a unity as indeed was the entire tradition of ancient theology (Celenza, 1999, 675–681). Ficino regarded works ascribed to the Chaldaean Zoroaster, the Egyptian Hermes Trismegistus, Orpheus and Pythagoras, which modern scholarship has shown to be forgeries of late antiquity, as genuine works on which Plato drew (Kristeller 1979, 131). Ficino provided a complete translation of the writings ascribed to Hermes Trismegistus into Latin as well as translations of 39 of the short Pythagorean sayings known as symbola, many of which are ancient, and Hierocles’ commentary on the pseudo-Pythagorean Golden Verses (Heninger 1974, 63 and 66). The Golden Verses (see Thom 1995) were, in fact, one of the most popular Greek texts in the Renaissance and were commonly used in textbooks for learning Greek; other pseudo-Pythagorean texts, such as the treatises ascribed to Timaeus of Locri and Ocellus, were translated early and regarded as genuine texts on which Plato drew (Heninger 1974, 49, 55–56). Indeed, Ficino regarded the Pythagorean pseudepigrapha as a whole as genuine and thought that Plato relied on these texts as well as direct influence from Pythagorean teachers such as Philolaus in composing Timaeus, Phaedo, Gorgias, Philebus, Sophist and Parmenides. He followed Iamblichus in regarding the Republic, and in particular the divided line passage, as composed under the influence of pseudepigrapha by Brontinus and Archytas (Robichaud 2018, 149–186). Ficino thought, moreover, that this whole pagan tradition could be reconciled with Christian and Jewish religion and accepted the view that Pythagoras was born of a Jewish father (Heninger 1974, 201). For Ficino and the Renaissance as a whole, Pythagoras was the most important of the Presocratic philosophers but he never overshadowed Plato, who was the highest authority, in part because there was no extensive body of texts by Pythagoras himself to compete with the Platonic dialogues (Allen 2014, 453).

Ficino translated Iamblichus’ four works on Pythagoreanism for his own use and Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life had particular influence on him. Ficino felt that in his time there was a need for a divinely inspired guide on earth and fashioned himself as such a prophet under the influence of Iamblichus’ presentation of Pythagoras as a divine guide sent by the gods to save mankind (Celenza 1999, 667–674). The Pythagorean musical practice that he found in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life, with its emphasis on the impact of music on the soul, shaped his own music making and his presentation of himself as a Pythagorean and Orphic holy man (Allen 2014, 436–440). Ficino and other Renaissance thinkers grappled with the challenge that the Pythagorean notion of metempsychosis presented to Christiantiy and how it might be reconciled with Christian views (Allen 2014, 440–446). Ficino was eager to absolve Plato from such a heresy. He does this in part by treating metempsychosis metaphorically as referring to the soul’s ability to remake itself, but he also emphasized that metempsychosis was not present in Plato’s latest work, Laws, and made the Pythagoreans scapegoats by suggesting that other passages in Plato refer not to Plato’s own doctrines but the Pythagoreans (Celenza 1999, 681–691). Ficino saw his own arithmology as Pythgorean and study of Neopythagorean mathematical treatises by Nicomachus and Theon led Ficino to conclude that Plato’s nuptial number in Book 8 of the Republic was 12 (Allen 2014, 446–450. For a full account of Pythagorean number mysticism in the Rennaissance see Brandt 2022). Ficino also mistakenly and paradoxically followed the Neopythagoreans in thinking that the Pythagoreans occupied the crucial position in the history of philosophy of the first philosophers to distinguish between the corporeal and incorporeal and to assert the superiority of the latter, an achievement that is more reasonably assigned to Ficino’s hero Plato (Celenza 1999, 699–706).

The Pythagorean symbola were important to Ficino and the Renaissance. They had already been interpreted as moral maxims by the early church fathers (e.g., Clement, Origen and Ambrose). Ambrose, for example, interpreted the Pythagorean “do not take the public path” to mean that priests should live lives of exceptional purity (Ep. 81). Jerome discussed 13 symbola in his Epistle Against Rufinus (see 5.1 above) and this list became the basis for medieval discussions of the symbola in texts such as the Speculum historiale of Vincent of Beauvais and the Lives and Habits of the Philosophers of Walter Burley (Celenza 2001, 11–12). Ficino particularly encountered them in Iamblichus’ On the Pythagorean Life and Protrepticus. For Ficino, their brevity was appropriate to revealing the supreme reality, since he argued that the closer the mind approaches to the One the fewer words it needs (Allen 2014, 450–451). In addition, he found them relevant to the preparation and purification of the soul (Celenza, 1999, 693). They were widely discussed by Ficino’s contemporaries and successors (Celenza 2001, 52–81). Some figures wrote treatises devoted to their interpretation (Ficino’s mentor Antonio degli Agli, his follower Giovanni Nesi [for an edition of Nesi’s work see Celenza 2001], Filippo Beroaldo the Elder and Lilio Gregorio Giraldi), while others discussed them as part of larger works (Erasmus and Reuchlin). Not everyone took the symbola seriously; Angelo Poliziano, the great Florentine philologist and professor, presents a satire on them in the fashion of Lucian, joking about Pythagoras’ ability to talk to animals and ridiculing the prohibition on beans (Celenza 2001, 33).

Ficino’s friend and younger contemporary, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494), advanced an even more radical doctrine of universal truth, according to which all philosophies had a share of truth and could be reconciled in a comprehensive philosophy (Kristeller 1979, 205). His Oration on the Dignity of Man shows the variety of ways in which he was influenced by the Pythagorean tradition. He equates the friendship that the Pythagoreans saw as the goal of philosophy (see, e.g., Iamblichus, VP 229) with the peace that the angels announced to men of good will (1965, 11–12); the Pythagorean symbola forbidding urinating towards the sun or cutting the nails during sacrifice are interpreted allegorically as calling on us to relieve ourselves of excessive appetite for sensual pleasures and to trim the pricks of anger (1965, 15); the practice of philosophizing through numbers is assigned to Pythagoras along with Philolaus, Plato and the early Platonists (1965, 25–26); Pythagoras is said to have modeled his philosophy on the Orphic theology (1965, 33). Finally, on the basis of the pseudo-Pythagorean letter of Lysis to Hipparchus, Pythagoras is said to have kept silent about his doctrine and left just a few things in writing to his daughter at his death. In observing such silence, Pythagoras is portrayed as following an earlier practice symbolized by the sphinx in Egypt and most of all by Moses, who indeed published the law to men but supposedly kept the interpretation of that law a secret. Pico equates this secret interpretation of the law with the Cabala, an esoteric doctrine in which the words and numbers of Hebrew scripture are interpreted according to a mystical system (1965, 30; see also Heptaplus 1965, 68).

Pico’s interest in reconciling the Cabala with Christianity and the pagan philosophical tradition, including Pythagoreanism, was further developed by the German humanist, Johannes Reuchlin (1445–1522). In the dedicatory letter for his Three Books On the Art of the Cabala (1517), which was addressed to Pope Leo X, Reuchlin says that as Ficino has restored Plato for Italy so he will “offer to the Germans Pythagoras reborn,” although he cannot “do this without the cabala of the Hebrews, because the philosophy of Pythagoras took its beginning from the precepts of the cabalists” (tr. Heninger 1974, 245). Thus, in an earlier work (De verbo mirifico) he had equated the four consonants in the Hebrew name for God, JHVH, with the Pythagorean tetraktys, and gave to each of the letters, which are equated with numbers as in Greek practice, a mystical meaning. The first H, which also stands for the number five that the Pythagoreans equated with marriage, is thus taken to symbolize the marriage of the trinity with material nature, which was equated with the dyad by the Neopythagoreans (Riedweg 2005, 130). In the 18th century Johann Jakob Brucker (1696–1770) in his Critical History of Philosophy looked back on Pico as spreading a disease that corrupted Reuchlin. Under the influence of Richard Bentley’s Dissertation upon the Epistles of Phalaris (1699) Brucker came to regard Porphyry and Iamblichus not only as wretched historians but also as having deliberately constructed their accounts of Pythagoras “in order to fabricate Pythagoras into an anti-Christian thaumaturge to rival Jesus” (Robichaud, 2022, 433).

At the level of popular culture, several fortune-telling devices were tied to Pythagoras, the most famous of which went under the name of the Wheel of Pythagoras (Heninger 1974, 237). Pythagoras was probably most widely known, however, through Ovid’s presentation of him at the beginning of Book XV of the Metamorphoses, which was immensely popular in the Renaissance (Heninger 1974, 50). Ovid recounts the story, which had already been recognized as apocryphal by Cicero (Tusc. IV 1), that the second Roman king, Numa, studied with Pythagoras. Pythagoras is presented inaccurately by Ovid as a great natural philosopher, who discovered the secrets of the universe and who believed in a doctrine of the flux of four elements. On the other hand, Ovid’s emphasis on the prohibition on eating animal flesh and on the immortality of the soul have some connection to the historical Pythagoras. In the Renaissance, Pythagoras was not primarily known for the “Pythagorean Theorem,” as he is today. Better known was the doubtful anecdote (Burkert 1960, Riedweg 2005, 90–97), going back ultimately to Heraclides of Pontus but known to the Renaissance mainly through Cicero (Tusc. V 3–4), that he was the first to coin the word “philosopher” (Heninger 1974, 29).

In the sixteenth century, Pythagorean influence was particularly important in the development of astronomy. The Polish astronomer Copernicus (1473–1543), in the Preface and Dedication to Pope Paul III attached to his epoch making work, On the Revolution of the Heavenly Spheres, reports that, in his dissatisfaction with the commonly accepted geocentric astronomical system of Ptolemy (2nd century CE), he laboriously reread the works of all the philosophers to see if any had ever proposed a different system. This labor led him to find inspiration not from Pythagoras himself but rather from later Pythagoreans and in particular from Philolaus. Copernicus found in Cicero (Ac. II 39. 123) that the Pythagorean Hicetas (4th century BCE — Copernicus mistakenly calls him Nicetas) had proposed that the earth revolved around its axis at the center of the universe and in pseudo-Plutarch (Diels 1958, 378) that another Pythagorean, Ecphantus, and Heraclides of Pontus (both 4th century BCE), whom Copernicus regarded as a Pythagorean, had proposed a similar view. More importantly, he also found in pseudo-Plutarch that the Pythagorean, Philolaus of Croton (5th century BCE), “held that the earth moved in a circle … and was one of the planets” (On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres 1. 5, tr. Wallis).

Copernicus reports to the Pope that he was led by these earlier thinkers “to meditate on the mobility of the earth.” Pythagorean influence on Copernicus was not limited to the notion of a moving earth. In the same preface he explains his hesitation to publish his book in light of the pseudo-Pythagorean letter of Lysis to Hipparchus, which recounts the supposed reluctance of the Pythagoreans to divulge their views to the common run of people, who had not devoted themselves to study (for further Pythagorean influences on Copernicus see Kahn 2001, 159–161). A number of the followers of Copernicus saw him as primarily reviving the ancient Pythagorean system rather than presenting anything new (Heninger 1974, 130 and 144, n. 131); Edward Sherburne reflects the common view of the late 17th century in referring to the heliocentric system as “the system of Philolaus and Copernicus” (Heninger 1974, 129–130), although in the Philolaic system it is, in fact, a central fire and not the sun that is at the center of the universe.

The last great Pythagorean was Johannes Kepler (1571–1630 — see Kahn 2001, 161–172 for a good brief account of Kepler’s Pythagoreanism). Kepler began by developing the Copernican system in light of the five regular solids (tetrahedron, cube, octahedron, dodecahedron and icosahedron), to which Plato appealed in his construction of matter in the Timaeus (see especially 53B-55C). He followed the Renaissance practice illustrated above of regarding Greek philosophy as closely connected to the wisdom of the Near East, when he asserted that the Timaeus was a commentary on the first chapter of Genesis (Kahn 2001, 162). In the preface to his early work, Mysterium Cosmographicum (1596), Kepler says that his purpose is to show that God used the five regular bodies, “which have been most celebrated from the time of Pythagoras and Plato,” as his model in constructing the universe and that “he accommodated the number of heavenly spheres, their proportions, and the system of their motions” to these five regular solids (tr. Heninger 1974, 110–111).

In ascribing geometrical knowledge of the five regular solids to Pythagoras, Kepler is following an erroneous Neopythagorean tradition, although the dodecahedron may have served as an early Pythagorean symbol (see on Hippasus in section 3.4 above and Burkert 1972, 70–71, 404, 460). Thus, this aspect of Kepler’s work is more Platonic than Pythagorean. The five solids were conceived of as circumscribing and inscribed in the spheres of the orbits of the planets, so that the five solids corresponded to the six planets known to Kepler (Saturn, Jupiter, Mars, Earth, Venus, Mercury). There were six planets, because there were precisely five regular bodies to be used in constructing the universe, corresponding to the five intervals between the planets. This view was overthrown by the later discovery of Uranus as a seventh planet. Kepler’s cosmology was, however, far from a purely a priori exercise. Whereas his contemporary, Robert Fludd, developed a cosmology structured by musical numbers, which could in no way be confirmed by observation, Kepler strove to make his system consistent with precise observations. Kahn suggests that we here see again the split “between a rational and an obscurantist version of Pythagorean thought,” which is similar to the ancient split in the school between mathematici and acusmatici (2001, 163).

Close work with observational data collected by Tycho Brahe led Kepler to abandon the universal ancient view that the orbits of the planets were circular and to recognize their elliptical nature. More clearly Pythagorean is Kepler’s consistent belief that the data show that the motions of the planets correspond in various ways to the ratios governing the musical concords (see Dreyer 1953, 405–410), so that there is a heavenly music, a doctrine attested for Philolaus and Archytas, which probably goes back to Pythagoras as well. For Kepler, however, the music produced by the heavenly motions was “perceived by reason, and not expressed in sound” (Harmonice Mundi V 7). In his attempt to make the numbers of the heavenly music work, he joked that he would appeal to the shade of Pythagoras for aid, “unless the soul of Pythagoras has migrated into mine” (Koestler 1959, 277).

Kepler has been described “as the last exponent of a form of mathematical cosmology that can be traced back to the shadowy figure of Pythagoras” (Field 1988, 170). It is true that Kepler’s work led the way to Newton’s mechanics, which cannot be described in terms of ancient geometry and number theory but relies on the calculus and which relies on a theory of physical forces that is alien to ancient thought. On the other hand, many modern scientists accept the basic tenet that knowledge of the natural world is to be expressed in mathematical formulae, which is rightly regarded as a central Pythagorean thesis, since it was first rigorously formulated by the Pythagoreans Philolaus ( Fr. 4) and Archytas and may, in a rudimentary form, go back to Pythagoras himself.


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