Anselm of Canterbury

First published Thu May 18, 2000; substantive revision Sun Jul 16, 2023

Saint Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) was the outstanding Christian philosopher and theologian of the eleventh century. He is best known for the celebrated “ontological argument” for the existence of God in the Proslogion, but his contributions to philosophical theology (and indeed to philosophy more generally) go well beyond the ontological argument. In what follows I examine Anselm’s theistic proofs, his conception of the divine nature, and his account of human freedom, sin, and redemption.

1. Life and Works

Anselm was born in 1033 near Aosta, in those days a Burgundian town on the frontier with Lombardy. Little is known of his early life. He left home at twenty-three, and after three years of apparently aimless travelling through Burgundy and France, he came to Normandy in 1059. Once he was in Normandy, Anselm’s interest was captured by the Benedictine abbey at Bec, whose famous school was under the direction of Lanfranc, the abbey’s prior. Lanfranc was a scholar and teacher of wide reputation, and under his leadership the school at Bec had become an important center of learning, especially in dialectic. In 1060 Anselm entered the abbey as a novice. His intellectual and spiritual gifts brought him rapid advancement, and when Lanfranc was appointed abbot of Caen in 1063, Anselm was elected to succeed him as prior. He was elected abbot in 1078 upon the death of Herluin, the founder and first abbot of Bec. Under Anselm’s leadership the reputation of Bec as an intellectual center grew, and Anselm managed to write a good deal of philosophy and theology in addition to his teaching, administrative duties, and extensive correspondence as an adviser and counselor to rulers and nobles all over Europe and beyond. His works while at Bec include the Monologion (1075–76), the Proslogion (1077–78), and his four philosophical dialogues: De grammatico (probably 1059–60, though the dating of this work is much disputed), and De veritate, De libertate arbitrii, and De casu diaboli (1080–86).

In 1093 Anselm was enthroned as Archbishop of Canterbury. The previous Archbishop, Anselm’s old master Lanfranc, had died four years earlier, but the King, William Rufus, had left the see vacant in order to plunder the archiepiscopal revenues. Anselm was understandably reluctant to undertake the primacy of the Church of England under a ruler as ruthless and venal as William, and his tenure as Archbishop proved to be as turbulent and vexatious as he must have feared. William was intent on maintaining royal authority over ecclesiastical affairs and would not be dictated to by Archbishop or Pope or anyone else. So, for example, when Anselm went to Rome in 1097 without the King’s permission, William would not allow him to return. When William was killed in 1100, his successor, Henry I, invited Anselm to return to his see. But Henry was as intent as William had been on maintaining royal jurisdiction over the Church, and Anselm found himself in exile again from 1103 to 1107. Despite these distractions and troubles, Anselm continued to write. His works as Archbishop of Canterbury include the Epistola de Incarnatione Verbi (1094), Cur Deus Homo (1095–98), De conceptu virginali (1099), De processione Spiritus Sancti (1102), the Epistola de sacrificio azymi et fermentati (1106–7), De sacramentis ecclesiae (1106–7), and De concordia (1107–8). Anselm died on 21 April 1109. He was canonized in 1494 and named a Doctor of the Church in 1720.

2. The Theistic Proofs

2.1 “Faith Seeking Understanding”: The character and purpose of Anselm’s theistic proofs

Anselm’s motto is “faith seeking understanding” (fides quaerens intellectum). This motto lends itself to at least two misunderstandings. First, many philosophers have taken it to mean that Anselm hopes to replace faith with understanding. If one takes ‘faith’ to mean roughly ‘belief on the basis of testimony’ and ‘understanding’ to mean ‘belief on the basis of philosophical insight’, one is likely to regard faith as an epistemically substandard position; any self-respecting philosopher would surely want to leave faith behind as quickly as possible. The theistic proofs are then interpreted as the means by which we come to have philosophical insight into things we previously believed solely on testimony. But Anselm is not hoping to replace faith with understanding. Faith for Anselm is more a volitional state than an epistemic state: it is love for God and a drive to act as God wills. In fact, Anselm describes the sort of faith that “merely believes what it ought to believe” as “dead” (M 78). (For the abbreviations used in references, see the Bibliography below.) So “faith seeking understanding” means something like “an active love of God seeking a deeper knowledge of God.”

Other philosophers have noted that “faith seeking understanding” begins with “faith,” not with doubt or suspension of belief. Hence, they argue, the theistic arguments proposed by faith seeking understanding are not really meant to convince unbelievers; they are intended solely for the edification of those who already believe. This too is a misreading of Anselm’s motto. For although the theistic proofs are borne of an active love of God seeking a deeper knowledge of the beloved, the proofs themselves are intended to be convincing even to unbelievers. Thus Anselm opens the Monologion with these words:

If anyone does not know, either because he has not heard or because he does not believe, that there is one nature, supreme among all existing things, who alone is self-sufficient in his eternal happiness, who through his omnipotent goodness grants and brings it about that all other things exist or have any sort of well-being, and a great many other things that we must believe about God or his creation, I think he could at least convince himself of most of these things by reason alone, if he is even moderately intelligent. (M 1)

And in the Proslogion Anselm sets out to convince “the fool,” that is, the person who “has said in his heart, ‘There is no God’ ” (Psalm 14:1; 53:1).

2.2 The arguments of the Monologion

Having clarified what Anselm takes himself to be doing in his theistic proofs, we can now examine the proofs themselves. In the first chapter of the Monologion Anselm argues that there must be some one thing that is supremely good, through which all good things have their goodness. For whenever we say that different things are F in different degrees, we must understand them as being F through F-ness; F-ness itself is the same in each of them. Thus, for example, all more or less just things “must be more or less just through justice, which is not different in diverse things” (M 1). Now we speak of things as being good in different degrees. So by the principle just stated, these things must be good through some one thing. Clearly that thing is itself a great good, since it is the source of the goodness of all other things. Moreover, that thing is good through itself; after all, if all good things are good through that thing, it follows trivially that that thing, being good, is good through itself. Things that are good through another (i.e., things whose goodness derives from something other than themselves) cannot be equal to or greater than the good thing that is good through itself, and so that which is good through itself is supremely good. Anselm concludes, “Now that which is supremely good is also supremely great. There is, therefore, some one thing that is supremely good and supremely great – in other words, supreme among all existing things” (M 1). In chapter 2 he applies the principle of chapter 1 in order to derive (again) the conclusion that there is something supremely great.

In chapter 3 Anselm argues that all existing things exist through some one thing. Every existing thing, he begins, exists either through something or through nothing. But of course nothing exists through nothing, so every existing thing exists through something. There is, then, either some one thing through which all existing things exist, or there is more than one such thing. If there is more than one, either (i) they all exist through some one thing, or (ii) each of them exists through itself, or (iii) they exist through each other. (iii) makes no sense. If (ii) is true, then “there is surely some one power or nature of self-existing that they have in order to exist through themselves” (M 3); in that case, “all things exist more truly through that one thing than through the several things that cannot exist without that one thing” (M 3). So (ii) collapses into (i), and there is some one thing through which all things exist. That one thing, of course, exists through itself, and so it is greater than all the other things. It is therefore “best and greatest and supreme among all existing things” (M 3).

In chapter 4 Anselm begins with the premise that things “are not all of equal dignity; rather, some of them are on different and unequal levels” (M 4). For example, a horse is better than wood, and a human being is more excellent than a horse. Now it is absurd to think that there is no limit to how high these levels can go, “so that there is no level so high that an even higher level cannot be found” (M 4). The only question is how many beings occupy that highest level of all. Is there just one, or are there more than one? Suppose there are more than one. By hypothesis, they must all be equals. If they are equals, they are equals through the same thing. That thing is either identical with them or distinct from them. If it is identical with them, then they are not in fact many, but one, since they are all identical with some one thing. On the other hand, if that thing is distinct from them, then they do not occupy the highest level after all. Instead, that thing is greater than they are. Either way, there can be only one being occupying the highest level of all.

Anselm concludes the first four chapters by summarizing his results:

Therefore, there is a certain nature or substance or essence who through himself is good and great and through himself is what he is; through whom exists whatever truly is good or great or anything at all; and who is the supreme good, the supreme great thing, the supreme being or subsistent, that is, supreme among all existing things. (M 4)

He then goes on (in chapters 5–65) to derive the attributes that must belong to the being who fits this description. But before we look at Anselm’s understanding of the divine attributes, we should turn to the famous proof in the Proslogion.

2.3 The argument of the Proslogion

Looking back on the sixty-five chapters of complicated argument in the Monologion, Anselm found himself wishing for a simpler way to establish all the conclusions he wanted to prove. As he tells us in the preface to the Proslogion, he wanted to find

a single argument that needed nothing but itself alone for proof, that would by itself be enough to show that God really exists; that he is the supreme good, who depends on nothing else, but on whom all things depend for their being and for their well-being; and whatever we believe about the divine nature. (P, preface)

That “single argument” is the one that appears in chapter 2 of the Proslogion. (Or so it is commonly said: but some interpreters understand the “one argument” as extending into chapter 3, and Holopainen 1996 argues that it is the formula “that than which a greater cannot be thought.”)

The proper way to state Anselm’s argument is a matter of dispute, and any detailed statement of the argument will beg interpretative questions. But on a fairly neutral or consensus reading of the argument (which I shall go on to reject), Anselm’s argument goes like this. God is “that than which a greater cannot be thought”; in other words, he is a being so great, so full of metaphysical oomph, that one cannot so much as conceive of a being who would be greater than God. The Psalmist, however, tells us that “The fool has said in his heart, ‘There is no God’ ” (Psalm 14:1; 53:1). Is it possible to convince the fool that he is wrong? It is. All we need is the characterization of God as “that than which a greater cannot be thought.” The fool does at least understand that definition. But whatever is understood exists in the understanding, just as the plan of a painting he has yet to execute already exists in the understanding of the painter. So that than which a greater cannot be thought exists in the understanding. But if it exists in the understanding, it must also exist in reality. For it is greater to exist in reality than to exist merely in the understanding. Therefore, if that than which a greater can be thought existed only in the understanding, it would be possible to think of something greater than it (namely, that same being existing in reality as well). It follows, then, that if that than which a greater cannot be thought existed only in the understanding, it would not be that than which a greater cannot be thought; and that, obviously, is a contradiction. So that than which a greater cannot be thought must exist in reality, not merely in the understanding.

Versions of this argument have been defended and criticized by a succession of philosophers from Anselm’s time through the present day (see ontological arguments). Our concern here is with Anselm’s own version, the criticism he encountered, and his response to that criticism. A monk named Gaunilo wrote a “Reply on Behalf of the Fool,” contending that Anselm’s argument gave the Psalmist’s fool no good reason at all to believe that that than which a greater cannot be thought exists in reality. Gaunilo’s most famous objection is an argument intended to be exactly parallel to Anselm’s that generates an obviously absurd conclusion. Gaunilo proposes that instead of “that than which a greater cannot be thought” we consider “that island than which a greater cannot be thought.” We understand what that expression means, so (following Anselm’s reasoning) the greatest conceivable island exists in our understanding. But (again following Anselm’s reasoning) that island must exist in reality as well; for if it did not, we could imagine a greater island – namely, one that existed in reality – and the greatest conceivable island would not be the greatest conceivable island after all. Surely, though, it is absurd to suppose that the greatest conceivable island actually exists in reality. Gaunilo concludes that Anselm’s reasoning is fallacious.

Gaunilo’s counterargument is so ingenious that it stands out as by far the most devastating criticism in his catalogue of Anselm’s errors. Not surprisingly, then, interpreters have read Anselm’s reply to Gaunilo primarily in order to find his rejoinder to the Lost Island argument. Sympathetic interpreters (such as Klima 2000 and Ward 2018) have offered ways for Anselm to respond, but at least one commentator (Wolterstorff 1993) argues that Anselm offers no such rejoinder, precisely because he knew Gaunilo’s criticism was unanswerable but could not bring himself to admit that fact.

A more careful look at Anselm’s reply to Gaunilo, however, shows that Anselm offered no rejoinder to the Lost Island argument because he rejected Gaunilo’s interpretation of the original argument of the Proslogion. Gaunilo had understood the argument in the way I stated it above. Anselm understood it quite differently. In particular, Anselm insists that the original argument did not rely on any general principle to the effect that a thing is greater when it exists in reality than when it exists only in the understanding.[1] And since that is the principle that does the mischief in Gaunilo’s counterargument, Anselm sees no need to respond to the Lost Island argument in particular.

Correctly understood, Anselm says, the argument of the Proslogion can be summarized as follows:

  1. That than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought.
  2. If that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought, it exists in reality.


  1. That than which a greater cannot be thought exists in reality.

Anselm defends (1) by showing how we can form a conception of that than which a greater cannot be thought on the basis of our experience and understanding of those things than which a greater can be thought. For example,

it is clear to every reasonable mind that by raising our thoughts from lesser goods to greater goods, we are quite capable of forming an idea of that than which a greater cannot be thought on the basis of that than which a greater can be thought. Who, for example, is unable to think … that if something that has a beginning and end is good, then something that has a beginning but never ceases to exist is much better? And that just as the latter is better than the former, so something that has neither beginning nor end is better still, even if it is always moving from the past through the present into the future? And that something that in no way needs or is compelled to change or move is far better even than that, whether any such thing exists in reality or not? Can such a thing not be thought? Can anything greater than this be thought? Or rather, is not this an example of forming an idea of that than which a greater cannot be thought on the basis of those things than which a greater can be thought? So there is in fact a way to form an idea of that than which a greater cannot be thought. (Anselm’s Reply to Gaunilo 8)

Once we have formed this idea of that than which a greater cannot be thought, Anselm says, we can see that such a being has features that cannot belong to a possible but non-existent object – or, in other words, that (2) is true. For example, a being that is capable of non-existence is less great than a being that exists necessarily. If that than which a greater cannot be thought does not exist, it is obviously capable of non-existence; and if it is capable of non-existence, then even if it were to exist, it would not be that than which a greater cannot be thought after all. So if that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought – that is, if it is a possible being – it actually exists. (This reading of the argument of the Proslogion is developed at length in Visser and Williams 2008, chapter 5.)

3. The Divine Nature

3.1 Proving the divine attributes

Recall that Anselm’s intention in the Proslogion was to offer a single argument that would establish not only the existence of God but also the various attributes that Christians believe God possesses. If the argument of chapter 2 proved only the existence of God, leaving the divine attributes to be established piecemeal as in the Monologion, Anselm would consider the Proslogion a failure. But in fact the concept of that than which nothing greater can be thought turns out to be marvelously fertile. God must, for example, be omnipotent. For if he were not, we could conceive of a being greater than he. But God is that than which no greater can be thought, so he must be omnipotent. Similarly, God must be just, self-existent, invulnerable to suffering, merciful, timelessly eternal, non-physical, non-composite, and so forth. For if he lacked any of these qualities, he would be less than the greatest conceivable being, which is impossible.

The ontological argument thus works as a sort of divine-attribute-generating machine. Admittedly, though, the appearance of theoretical simplicity is somewhat misleading. The “single argument” produces conclusions about the divine attributes only when conjoined with certain beliefs about what is greater or better. That is, the ontological argument tells us that God has whatever characteristics it is better or greater to have than to lack, but it does not tell us which characteristics those are. We must have some independent way of identifying them before we can plug them into the ontological argument and generate a full-blown conception of the divine nature. Anselm identifies these characteristics in part by appeal to intuitions about value, in part by independent argument. To illustrate Anselm’s method, I shall examine his discussions of God’s impassibility, timelessness, and simplicity.

According to the doctrine of divine impassibility, God is invulnerable to suffering. Nothing can act upon him; he is in no way passive. He therefore does not feel emotions, since emotions are states that one undergoes rather than actions one performs. Anselm does not find it necessary to argue that impassibility is a perfection; he thinks it is perfectly obvious that “it is better to be … impassible than not” (P 6), just as it is perfectly obvious that it is better to be just than not-just. His intuitions about value are shaped by the Platonic-Augustinian tradition of which he was a part. Augustine took from the Platonists the idea that the really real things, the greatest and best of beings, are stable, uniform, and unchanging. He says in On Free Choice of the Will 2.10, “And you surely could not deny that the uncorrupted is better than the corrupt, the eternal than the temporal, and the invulnerable than the vulnerable”; his interlocutor replies simply, “Could anyone?” Through Augustine (and others) these ideas, and the conception of God to which they naturally lead, became the common view of Christian theologians for well over a millennium. For Anselm, then, it is obvious that a being who is in no way passive, who cannot experience anything of which he is not himself the origin, is better and greater than any being who can be acted upon by something outside himself. So God, being that than which nothing greater can be thought, is wholly active; he is impassible.

Notice that Augustine also found it obvious that the eternal is better than the temporal. According to Plato’s Timaeus, time is a “moving image of eternity” (37d). It is a shifting and shadowy reflection of the really real. As later Platonists, including Augustine, develop this idea, temporal beings have their existence piecemeal; they exist only in this tiny sliver of a now, which is constantly flowing away from them and passing into nothingness. An eternal being, by contrast, is (to use my earlier description) stable, uniform, and unchanging. What it has, it always has; what it is, it always is; what it does, it always does. So it seems intuitively obvious to Anselm that if God is to be that than which nothing greater can be thought, he must be eternal. That is, he must be not merely everlasting, but outside time altogether.[2]

In addition to this strong intuitive consideration, Anselm at least hints at a further argument for the claim that it is better to be eternal than temporal. He opens chapter 13 of the Proslogion by observing, “Everything that is at all enclosed in a place or time is less than that which is subject to no law of place or time” (P 13). His idea seems to be that if God were in time (or in a place), he would be bound by certain constraints inherent in the nature of time (or place). His discussion in Monologion 22 makes the problem clear:

This, then, is the condition of place and time: whatever is enclosed within their boundaries does not escape being characterized by parts, whether the sort of parts its place receives with respect to size, or the sort its time suffers with respect to duration; nor can it in any way be contained as a whole all at once by different places or times. By contrast, if something is in no way constrained by confinement in a place or time, no law of places or times forces it into a multiplicity of parts or prevents it from being present as a whole all at once in several places or times. (M 22)

So at least part of the reason for holding that God is timeless is that the nature of time would impose constraints upon God, and of course it is better to be subject to no external constraints.

The other part of the reason, though, is that if God were in place or time he would have parts. But what is so bad about having parts? This question brings us naturally to the doctrine of divine simplicity, which is simply the doctrine that God has no parts of any kind. Even for an Augustinian like Anselm, the claim that it is better to lack parts than to have them is less than intuitively compelling, so Anselm offers further arguments for that claim. In the Proslogion he argues that “whatever is composed of parts is not completely one. It is in some sense a plurality and not identical with itself, and it can be broken up either in fact or at least in the understanding” (P 18). The argument in the Monologion goes somewhat differently. “Every composite,” Anselm argues, “needs the things of which it is composed if it is to subsist, and it owes its existence to them, since whatever it is, it is through them, whereas those things are not through it what they are” (M 17). The argument in the Proslogion, then, seeks to relate simplicity to the intuitive considerations that identify what is greatest and best with what is stable, uniform, and unchanging; the argument in the Monologion, by contrast, seeks to show that simplicity is necessary if God is to be – as the theistic proofs have already established – the ultimate source of his own goodness and existence.

3.2 The consistency of the divine attributes

Anselm’s success in generating a whole host of divine attributes through the ontological argument does present him with a problem. He must show that the attributes are consistent with each other – in other words, that it is possible for one and the same being to have all of them. For example, there seems at first glance to be a conflict between justice and omnipotence. If God is perfectly just, he cannot lie. But if God is omnipotent, how can there be something he cannot do? Anselm’s solution is to explain that omnipotence does not mean the ability to do everything; instead, it means the possession of unlimited power. Now the so-called “ability” or “power” to lie is not really a power at all; it is a kind of weakness. Being omnipotent, God has no weakness. So it turns out that omnipotence actually entails the inability to lie.

Another apparent contradiction is between God’s mercy and his justice. If God is just, he will surely punish the wicked as they deserve. But because he is merciful, he spares the wicked. Anselm tries to resolve this apparent contradiction by appeal to God’s goodness. It is better, he says, for God “to be good both to the good and to the wicked than to be good only to the good, and it is better to be good to the wicked both in punishing and in sparing them than to be good only in punishing them” (P 9). So God’s supreme goodness requires that he be both just and merciful. But Anselm is not content to resolve the apparent tension between justice and mercy by appealing to some other attribute, goodness, that entails both justice and mercy; he goes on to argue that justice itself requires mercy. Justice to sinners obviously requires that God punish them; but God’s justice to himself requires that he exercise his supreme goodness in sparing the wicked. “Thus,” Anselm says to God, “in saving us whom you might justly destroy … you are just, not because you give us our due, but because you do what is fitting for you who are supremely good” (P 10). In spite of these arguments, Anselm acknowledges that there is a residue of mystery here:

Thus your mercy is born of your justice, since it is just for you to be so good that you are good even in sparing the wicked. And perhaps this is why the one who is supremely just can will good things for the wicked. But even if one can somehow grasp why you can will to save the wicked, certainly no reasoning can comprehend why, from those who are alike in wickedness, you save some rather than others through your supreme goodness and condemn some rather than others through your supreme justice. (P 11)

In other words, the philosopher can trace the conceptual relations among goodness, justice, and mercy, and show that God not only can but must have all three; but no human reasoning can hope to show why God displays his justice and mercy in precisely the ways in which he does. (For a detailed and sympathetic reconstruction of Anselm’s arguments concerning justice and mercy, see Mann 2019.)

4. Freedom, Sin, and Redemption

4.1 Truth in statements and in the will

In On Freedom of Choice (De libertate arbitrii) Anselm defines freedom of choice as “the power to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake” (DLA 3). He explores the notion of rectitude of will most thoroughly in On Truth (De veritate), so in order to understand the definition of freedom of choice, we must look first at Anselm’s discussion of truth. Truth is a much broader notion for Anselm than for us; he speaks of truth not only in statements and opinions but also in the will, actions, the senses, and even the essences of things. In every case, he argues, truth consists in correctness or “rectitude.” Rectitude, in turn, is understood teleologically; a thing is correct whenever it is or does whatever it ought, or was designed, to be or do. For example, statements are made for the purpose of “signifying that what-is is” (DV 2). A statement therefore is correct (has rectitude) when, and only when, it signifies that what-is is. So Anselm holds a correspondence theory of truth, but it is a somewhat unusual correspondence theory. Statements are true when they correspond to reality, but only because corresponding to reality is what statements are for. That is, statements (like anything else) are true when they do what they were designed to do; and what they were designed to do, as it happens, is to correspond to reality.

Truth in the will also turns out to be rectitude, again understood teleologically. Rectitude of will means willing what one ought to will or (in other words) willing that for the sake of which one was given a will. So, just as the truth or rectitude of a statement is the statement’s doing what statements were made to do, the truth or rectitude of a will is the will’s doing what wills were made to do. In DV 12 Anselm connects rectitude of will to both justice and moral evaluation. In a broad sense of ‘just’, whatever is as it ought to be is just. Thus, an animal is just when it blindly follows its appetites, because that is what animals were meant to do. But in the narrower sense of ‘just’, in which justice is what deserves moral approval and injustice is what deserves reproach, justice is best defined as “rectitude of will preserved for its own sake” (DV 12). Such rectitude requires that agents perceive the rectitude of their actions and will them for the sake of that rectitude. Anselm takes the second requirement to exclude both coercion and “being bribed by an extraneous reward” (DV 12). For an agent who is coerced into doing what is right is not willing rectitude for its own sake; and similarly, an agent who must be bribed to do what is right is willing rectitude for the sake of the bribe, not for the sake of rectitude.

Since, as we have already seen, Anselm will define freedom as “the power to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake,” the arguments of On Truth imply that freedom is also the capacity for justice and the capacity for moral praiseworthiness. Now it is both necessary and sufficient for justice, and thus for praiseworthiness, that an agent wills what is right, knowing it to be right, because it is right. That an agent wills what is right because it is right entails that he is neither compelled nor bribed to perform the act. Freedom, then, must be neither more nor less than the power to perform acts of that sort.

4.2 Freedom and sin

Thus Anselm takes it to be obvious that freedom is a power for something: its purpose is to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake. God and the good angels cannot sin, but they are still free, because they can (and do) preserve rectitude of will for its own sake. In fact, they are freer than those who can sin: “someone who has what is fitting and expedient in such a way that he cannot lose it is freer than someone who has it in such a way that he can lose it and be seduced into what is unfitting and inexpedient” (DLA 1). It obviously follows, as Anselm points out, that freedom of choice neither is nor entails the power to sin; God and the good angels have freedom of choice, but they are incapable of sinning.

But if free choice is the power to hold on to what is fitting and expedient, and it is not the power to sin, does it make any sense to say that the first human beings and the rebel angels sinned through free choice? Anselm’s reply to this question is both subtle and plausible. In order to be able to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake, an agent must be able to perform an action that has its ultimate origin in the agent him- or herself rather than in some external source. (For convenience I will refer to that power as “the power for self-initiated action.”) Any being that has freedom of choice, therefore, will thereby have the power for self-initiated action. The first human beings and the rebel angels sinned through an exercise of their power for self-initiated action, and so it is appropriate to say that they sinned through free choice. Nonetheless, free choice does not entail the power to sin. For free choice can be perfected by something else, as yet unspecified, that renders it incapable of sinning.

In On the Fall of the Devil (De casu diaboli) Anselm extends his account of freedom and sin by discussing the first sin of the angels. In order for the angels to have the power to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake, they had to have both a will for justice and a will for happiness. If God had given them only a will for happiness, they would have been necessitated to will whatever they thought would make them happy. Their willing of happiness would have had its ultimate origin in God and not in the angels themselves. So they would not have had the power for self-initiated action, which means that they would not have had free choice. The same thing would have been true, mutatis mutandis, if God had given them only the will for justice.

Since God gave them both the will for happiness and the will for justice, however, they had the power for self-initiated action. Whether they chose to subject their wills for happiness to the demands of justice or to ignore the demands of justice in the interest of happiness, that choice had its ultimate origin in the angels; it was not received from God. The rebel angels chose to abandon justice in an attempt to gain happiness for themselves, whereas the good angels chose to persevere in justice even if it meant less happiness. God punished the rebel angels by taking away their happiness; he rewarded the good angels by granting them all the happiness they could possibly want. For this reason, the good angels are no longer able to sin. Since there is no further happiness left for them to will, their will for happiness can no longer entice them to overstep the bounds of justice. Thus Anselm finally explains what it is that perfects free choice so that it becomes unable to sin.

4.3 Grace and redemption

Like the fallen angels, the first human beings willed happiness in preference to justice. By doing so they abandoned the will for justice and became unable to will justice for its own sake. Apart from divine grace, then, fallen human beings cannot help but sin. Anselm claims that we are still free, because we continue to be such that if we had rectitude of will, we could preserve it for its own sake; but we cannot exercise our freedom, since we no longer have the rectitude of will to preserve. (Whether fallen human beings also retain the power for self-initiated action apart from divine grace is a tricky question, and one I do not propose to answer here.)

So the restoration of human beings to the justice they were intended to enjoy requires divine grace. But even more is needed than God’s restoration of the will for justice. In Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became A Human Being, or Why the God-Man?) Anselm famously attempts to show on purely rational grounds that the debt incurred by human sin could be suitably discharged, and the affront to God’s infinite dignity could be suitably rectified, only if one who was both fully divine and fully human took it upon himself to offer his own life on our behalf.


References in this article to Anselm’s works use the following abbreviations:

DLA = De libertate arbitrii
DV = De veritate
M = Monologion
P = Proslogion

All translations are my own.

Critical Edition

  • Niskanen, Samu, 2019. Letters of Anselm of Canterbury, Vol. I: The Bec Letters, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schmitt, Franciscus Salesius, 1936. “Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des hl. Anselm von Canterbury,” Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters Band 33, Heft 3 (1936): 22–43.
  • Schmitt, Franciscus Salesius, 1968. S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archiepiscopi Opera Omnia. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Friedrich Fromann Verlag.


  • Davies, Brian, and G. R. Evans (ed.), 1998. Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Thomas, 2007. Anselm: Basic Writings, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company. As supplemented by the Translations of Anselm, this is the only English translation by a single hand of all of Anselm’s treatises; it also includes selected prayers and letters and the Meditation on Human Redemption.

Secondary Literature

  • Baker, Lynne Rudder, 2013. “Updating Anselm Again,” Res Philosophica, 90: 23–32.
  • Burgess-Jackson, Keith, 2014. “Does Anselm Beg the Question?,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 76: 5–18.
  • Campbell, Richard, 2018. Rethinking Anselm’s Arguments: A Vindication of His Proof for the Existence of God, Leiden: Brill.
  • Davies, Brian, and Brian Leftow (eds.), 2004. The Cambridge Companion to Anselm, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ekenberg, Tomas, 2016. “Voluntary Action and Rational Sin in Anselm of Canterbury,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 24: 215–230.
  • Evans, G. R., 1978. Anselm and Talking about God, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1984. A Concordance to the Works of Saint Anselm, Millwood, NY: Kraus International Publications.
  • –––, 1989. Anselm, London: G. Chapman; reprinted 2001, London and New York: Continuum.
  • Gasper, G. E. M., and I. Logan (eds.), 2012. Saint Anselm of Canterbury and His Legacy, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • Heathwood, Chris, 2011. “The Relevance of Kant’s Objection to Anselm’s Ontological Argument,” Religious Studies, 47: 345–357.
  • Henry, Desmond Paul, 1967. The Logic of Saint Anselm, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Holopainen, Toivo, 1996. Dialectic and Theology in the Eleventh Century, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • –––,2020. A Historical Study of Anselm’s Proslogion Argument: Argument, Devotion and Rhetoric, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Hopkins, Jasper, 1972. A Companion to the Study of St. Anselm, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Klima, Gyula, 2000. “Saint Anselm’s Proof: A Problem of Reference, Intentional Identity and Mutual Understanding”, in G. Hintikka (ed.), Medieval Philosophy and Modern Times (Proceedings of “Medieval and Modern Philosophy of Religion”, Boston University, August 25–27, 1992), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 69–88. [Preprint of Klima 2000 available online]
  • Leftow, Brian, 1997. “Anselm on the Cost of Salvation,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 6: 73–92.
  • –––, 2009. “Anselmian Presentism,” Faith and Philosophy, 26: 297–319. [Leftow 2009 available online.]
  • Logan, Ian, 2009. Reading Anselm’s Proslogion: The History of Anselm’s Argument and its Significance Today, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Mann, William E., 2019. “Anselm on Divine Justice and Mercy,” Religious Studies, 55: 469–485.
  • Nash-Marshall, Siobhan, 2012. “Saint Anselm and the Problem of Evil, or On Freeing Evil from the Problem of Evil,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 455–470.
  • Oppenheimer, P., and Zalta, E., 1991. “On the Logic of the Ontological Argument,” Philosophical Perspectives 5: 509–529; reprinted in The Philosopher’s Annual: 1991, XIV (1993): 255–275.
  • –––, 2007. “Reflections on the Logic of the Ontological Argument,” Studia Neoaristotelica, 4(1): 28–34.
  • –––, 2011. “A Computationally-Discovered Simplification of the Ontological Argument,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 89(2): 333–349.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (ed.), 1965. The Ontological Argument, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books.
  • –––, 1974. God, Freedom, and Evil, Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans.
  • Rogers, Katherin A., 2007. “Anselmian Eternalism: The Presence of a Timeless God,” Faith and Philosophy, 24: 3–27. [Rogers 2007 available online.]
  • –––, 2009. Anselm on Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012. “Anselm on the Ontological Status of Choice,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 52: 183–198.
  • Smith, A.D., 2014. Anselm’s Other Argument, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Southern, R. W., 1990. Saint Anselm: A Portrait in Landscape, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stone, Jim, 1989. “Anselm’s Proof,” Philosophical Studies, 57: 79–94.
  • Special Issue, 2011. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, Volume 69.
  • Sweeney, Eileen, 2012. Anselm of Canterbury and the Desire for the Word, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Uckelman, Sara L., 2010. “The Ontological Argument and Russell’s Antinomy,” Logic and Logical Philosophy, 18: 309–312.
  • Visser, Sandra, and Thomas Williams, 2008. Anselm (Great Medieval Thinkers), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ward, Thomas M., 2018. “Losing the Lost Island,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 83: 127–134.
  • Williams, Thomas, 2016. “Anselm’s Quiet Radicalism,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, doi:10.1080/09608788.2015.1047734, [Preprint of Williams 2016 available online]
  • –––, 2023. Anselm: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 1993. “In Defense of Gaunilo’s Defense of the Fool,” in C. Stephen Evans and Merold Westphal (eds.), Christian Perspectives on Religious Knowledge, Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company, pp. 87–111.

Other Internet Resources

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