Augustine of Hippo

First published Wed Sep 25, 2019; substantive revision Fri Apr 26, 2024

Augustine of Hippo was perhaps the greatest Christian philosopher of Antiquity and certainly the one who exerted the deepest and most lasting influence. He is a saint of the Catholic Church, and his authority in theological matters was universally accepted in the Latin Middle Ages and remained, in the Western Christian tradition, virtually uncontested till the nineteenth century. The impact of his views on sin, grace, freedom and sexuality on Western culture can hardly be overrated. These views, deeply at variance with the ancient philosophical and cultural tradition, provoked however fierce criticism in Augustine’s lifetime and have, again, been vigorously opposed in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries from various (e.g., humanist, liberal, feminist) standpoints. Philosophers keep however being fascinated by his often innovative ideas on language, on skepticism and knowledge, on will and the emotions, on freedom and determinism and on the structure of the human mind and, last but not least, by his way of doing philosophy, which is—though of course committed to the truth of biblical revelation—surprisingly undogmatic and marked by a spirit of relentless inquiry. His most famous work, the Confessiones, is unique in the ancient literary tradition but greatly influenced the modern tradition of autobiography; it is an intriguing piece of philosophy from a first-person perspective. Because of his importance for the philosophical tradition of the Middle Ages he is often listed as the first medieval philosopher. But even though he was born several decades after the emperor Constantine I had terminated the anti-Christian persecutions and, in his mature years, saw the anti-pagan and anti-heretic legislation of Theodosius I and his sons, which virtually made Catholic (i.e., Nicene) Christianity the official religion of the Roman Empire, Augustine did not live in a “medieval” Christian world. Pagan religious, cultural and social traditions were much alive in his congregation, as he often deplores in his sermons, and his own cultural outlook was, like that of most of his learned upper-class contemporaries, shaped by the classical Latin authors, poets and philosophers whom he studied in the schools of grammar and rhetoric long before he encountered the Bible and Christian writers. Throughout his work he engages with pre- and non-Christian philosophy, much of which he knew from firsthand. Platonism in particular remained a decisive ingredient of his thought. He is therefore best read as a Christian philosopher of late antiquity shaped by and in constant dialogue with the classical tradition.

Translations from Greek or Latin texts in this entry are by the author, unless otherwise stated. Biblical quotations are translated from Augustine’s Latin version; these may differ from the Greek or Hebrew original and/or from the Latin Vulgate.

1. Life

Augustine (Aurelius Augustinus) lived from 13 November 354 to 28 August 430. He was born in Thagaste in Roman Africa (modern Souk Ahras in Algeria). His mother Monnica (d. 388), a devout Christian, seems to have exerted a deep but not wholly unambiguous influence on his religious development. His father Patricius (d. 372) was baptized on his deathbed. Augustine himself was made a catechumen early in his life. His studies of grammar and rhetoric in the provincial centers of Madauros and Carthage, which strained the financial resources of his middle-class parents, were hoped to pave his way for a future career in the higher imperial administration. In Carthage at the age of ca. 18, he found a mistress with whom he lived in a monogamous union for ca. 14 years and who bore him a son, Adeodatus, who was baptized together with his father in Milan and died a little later (ca. 390) aged 18. Ca. 373 Augustine became a “hearer” (auditor) of Manicheism, a dualistic religion with Persian origins that, in Northern Africa, had developed into a variety of Christianity (and was persecuted by the state as a heresy). His adherence to Manicheism lasted for nine years and was strongly opposed by Monnica. Though probably active as a Manichean apologist and missionary, he never became one of the sect’s “elect” (electi), who were committed to asceticism and sexual abstinence. In 383 he moved to Milan, then the capital of the western half of the Empire, to become a publicly paid professor of rhetoric of the city and an official panegyrist at the Imperial court. Here he sent away his mistress to free the way for an advantageous marriage (a behavior presumably common for young careerists at that epoch). At Milan he underwent the influence of Bishop Ambrose (339–397), who taught him the allegorical method of Scriptural exegesis, and of some Neoplatonically inclined Christians who acquainted him with an understanding of Christianity that was philosophically informed and, to Augustine, intellectually more satisfactory than Manicheism, from which he had already begun to distance himself. The ensuing period of uncertainty and doubt—depicted in the Confessiones as a crisis in the medical sense—ended in summer 386, when Augustine converted to ascetic Christianity and gave up both his chair of rhetoric and his further career prospects. After a winter of philosophical leisure at the rural estate of Cassiciacum near Milan, Augustine was baptized by Ambrose at Easter 387 and returned to Africa, accompanied by his son, some friends and his mother, who died on the journey (Ostia, 388). In 391 he was, apparently against his will, ordained a priest in the diocese of the maritime city of Hippo Regius (modern Annaba/Bône in Algeria). About five years later (ca. 396) he succeeded the local bishop. This ecclesiastical function involved new pastoral, political, administrative and juridical duties, and his responsibility for and experiences with an ordinary Christian congregation may have contributed to modify his views on grace and original sin (Brown 2000: ch. 15). But his rhetorical skills equipped him well for his daily preaching and for religious disputes. Throughout his life as a bishop he was involved in religious controversies with Manicheans, Donatists, Pelagians and, to a lesser extent, pagans. Most of the numerous books and letters he wrote in that period were part of these controversies or at least inspired by them, and even those that were not (e.g., De Genesi ad litteram, De trinitate) combine philosophical or theological teaching with rhetorical persuasion (Tornau 2006a). Polemics against his former co-religionists, the Manicheans, loom large in his work until about 400; the debate with them helped to shape his ideas on the non-substantiality of evil and on human responsibility (Kudella 2022). The Donatist schism had its roots in the last great persecution at the beginning of the fourth century. The Donatists saw themselves as the legitimate successors of those who had remained steadfast during the persecution and claimed to represent the African tradition of a Christian “church of the pure”. Since 405 the Donatists were subsumed under the imperial laws against heresy and forced to re-enter the Catholic church by legal means; these measures were intensified after a conference at Carthage (411) had marked the official end of Donatism in Africa (Lancel & Alexander 1996–2002; Dupont, Gaumer & Lamberigts 2015). By way of his assiduous writing against the Donatists, Augustine sharpened his ecclesiological ideas and developed a theory of religious coercion based on an intentionalist understanding of Christian love. Pelagianism (named after the British ascetic Pelagius) was a movement Augustine became aware of around 412. He and his African fellow-bishops managed to get it condemned as a heresy in 418. While not denying the importance of divine grace, Pelagius and his followers insisted that the human being was by nature free and able not to sin (possibilitas). Against this view, Augustine vigorously defended his doctrine of the human being’s radical dependence on grace, a conviction already voiced in the Confessiones but refined and hardened during the controversy. The last decade of Augustine’s life is marked by a vitriolic debate with the Pelagianist ex-bishop Julian of Aeclanum who accused Augustine of crypto-Manicheism and of denying free will while Augustine blamed him and the Pelagianists for evacuating Christ’s sacrifice by denying original sin (Drecoll 2012–2018; Lamberigts 2014). Controversy with pagan traditionalists seems to have reached a peak after 400, when Augustine refuted a series of objections against Christianity apparently extracted from Porphyry’s treatise Against the Christians (Letter 102; Bochet 2011), and after 410, when the city of Rome had been sacked by Alaric and his Goths. The City of God, Augustine’s great apology, was prompted by this symbolic event, though it is by no means just a response to pagan polemics. Though his mother’s name may suggest a Berber or Punic origin, there is little in Augustine’s work to indicate an African rather than a Roman identity (but see van Oort 2023; on the presence of Punic in Roman North Africa, Jongeling 2004–2010). There was however a tradition of distinctly African Christianity, of which he was both a part and whose Donatist variety he fiercely combated (Wilhite 2017: 240–263). Augustine’s life ended when the Vandals besieged Hippo; he is said to have died with a word of Plotinus on his lips (Possidius, Vita Augustini 28.11, after Plotinus, Enneads I 4.7.23–24).

2. Work

Augustine’s literary output surpasses the preserved work of almost all other ancient writers in quantity. In the Retractationes (“Revisions”, a critical survey of his writings in chronological order down to 428 CE) he suggests a threefold division of his work into books, letters and sermons (Retractationes 1, prologue 1); about 100 books, 300 letters, and 600 sermons have survived. Augustine’s literary career after his conversion began with philosophical dialogues. The first of these, written in Cassiciacum in 386/7, deal with traditional topics such as skepticism (Contra Academicos), happiness (De beata vita), providence and evil (De ordine) and the immortality of the soul (Soliloquia, De immortalitate animae). Augustine continued to pursue these issues in dialogues on the immateriality of the soul (De quantitate animae, 388), language and learning (De magistro, 388–391), freedom of choice and human responsibility (De libero arbitrio, begun in 388 and completed perhaps as late as 395) and the numeric structure of reality (De musica, 388–390). The treatise De vera religione (389–391) is a kind of summa of Augustine’s early Christian philosophy. After the start of his ecclesiastical career he abandoned the dialogue form, perhaps because he realized its elitist and potentially misleading character (G. Clark 2009; Catapano 2013; on the pedagogy and philosophical method of the dialogues, Kenyon 2018). Of the works from his priesthood and episcopate, many are controversial writings against the Manicheans (e.g., Contra Faustum Manichaeum, around 400), the Donatists (e.g., Contra litteras Petiliani, 401–405; De baptismo, 404) and the Pelagians (e.g., De spiritu et littera, 412; Contra Iulianum, 422; De gratia et libero arbitrio, 424–427; and his last and unfinished work Contra Iulianum opus imperfectum, which preserves a substantial portion of the otherwise lost treatise Ad Florum by his Pelagian adversary Julian of Aeclanum; V. Müller 2022). Among the philosophically most interesting of these works are De utilitate credendi (391–392, a defense of faith/belief against Manichean rationalism), De natura boni (399, a concise anti-Manichean argument for the doctrine that evil is a privation of goodness rather than an independent substance), De natura et gratia (413–417, a reply to Pelagius’ treatise De natura) and De correptione et gratia (426/427, refuting a Christian version of the Stoic ‘Lazy Argument’ that had been put forward against Augustine’s doctrine of grace). Augustine is however most famous for the five long treatises with a wider scope he composed between 396 and 426. The Confessiones (ca. 396–400; Toom 2020), probably his most original work, is “philosophy in autobiography” (Mann 2014) rather than an autobiography in a modern sense. It shows how an individual life—Augustine’s own—is made sense of by God’s providence and grace as well as by his creation and economy of salvation. De doctrina christiana (begun in 396/7 but completed only in 426/7) is a handbook of biblical hermeneutics and Christian rhetoric; it delineates the semiotic dichotomy of “things” (res) and—especially linguistic—“signs” (signa) and critically assesses the importance of the classical disciplines for the biblical exegete. De trinitate (begun in 399 and completed in 419 or perhaps as late as 426) has impressed modern philosophical readers by its probing analyses of the human mind as an “image” of the Divine Trinity. De Genesi ad litteram (401/2–416) is an attempt at winning a philosophically justifiable cosmology from the opening chapters of Genesis. Here as in most of Augustine’s works philosophy is inseparable from biblical exegesis. The monumental apologetic treatise De civitate dei (begun in 412, two years after the sack of Rome, and completed in 426; Meconi 2021) argues that happiness can be found neither in the Roman nor the philosophical tradition but only through membership in the city of God whose founder is Christ. Among many other things, it has interesting reflections on the secular state and on the Christian’s life in a secular society. The sermons document Augustine’s ability to adapt complex ideas to a large and not overly learned audience. Two long series on the Psalms (Enarrationes in Psalmos, ca. 392–422) and the Gospel of John (In Iohannis evangelium tractatus, ca. 406–420) stand out; a series of sermons on the First Letter of John (In epistulam Iohannis ad Parthos tractatus decem, 407) is Augustine’s most sustained discussion of Christian love. The letters are not personal or intimate documents but public writings that are part of Augustine’s teaching and of his ecclesiastical politics. Some of them reach the length of full treatises and offer excellent philosophical discussions (Letter 155 on virtue; Letter 120 on faith and reason; Letter 147 on the “seeing” of God).

3. Augustine and Philosophy

From ancient thought Augustine inherited the notion that philosophy is “love of wisdom” (Confessiones 3.8; De civitate dei 8.1), i.e., an attempt to pursue happiness—or, as late-antique thinkers, both pagan and Christian, liked to put it, salvation—by seeking insight into the true nature of things and living accordingly. This kind of philosophy he emphatically endorses, especially in his early work (cf., e.g., Contra Academicos 1.1). He is convinced that the true philosopher is a lover of God because true wisdom is, in the last resort, identical with God, a point on which he feels in agreement with both Paul (1 Corinthians 1:24) and Plato (cf. De civitate dei 8.8). This is why he thinks that Christianity is “the true philosophy” (Contra Iulianum 4.72; the view is common among ancient, especially Greek, Christian thinkers) and that true philosophy and true (cultic) religion are identical (De vera religione 8). In case of doubt, practice takes precedence over theory: in the Cassiciacum dialogues Monnica, who represents the saintly but uneducated, is credited with a philosophy of her own (De ordine 1.31–32; 2.45). At the same time, Augustine sharply criticizes the “philosophy of this world” censured in the New Testament that distracts from Christ (Colossians 2:8). In his early work he usually limits this verdict to the Hellenistic materialist systems (Contra Academicos 3.42; De ordine 1.32); later he extends it even to Platonism because the latter denies the possibility of a history of salvation (De civitate dei 12.14). The main error he faults the philosophers with is arrogance or pride (superbia), a reproach that does not weigh lightly given that arrogance is, in Augustine’s view, the root of all sins. Out of arrogance the philosophers presume to be able to reach happiness through their own virtue (De civitate dei 19.4, a criticism primarily directed against the Stoics), and even those among them who have gained insight into the true nature of God and his Word (i.e., the Platonists) are incapable of “returning” to their divine “homeland” because they proudly reject the mediation of Christ incarnate and resort to proud and malevolent demons instead, i.e., to the traditional pagan cults and to theurgy (Confessiones 7.27; In evangelium Iohannis tractatus 2.2–4; De civitate dei 10.24–29; Madec 1989). In his first works Augustine epitomizes his own philosophical program with the phrase “to know God and the soul” (Soliloquia 1.7; De ordine 2.47) and promises to pursue it with the means provided by Platonic philosophy as long as these are not in conflict with the authority of biblical revelation (Contra Academicos 3.43). He thereby restates the old philosophical questions about the true nature of the human being and about the first principle of reality, and he adumbrates the key Neoplatonic idea that knowledge of our true self entails knowledge of our divine origin and will enable us to return to it (cf. Plotinus, Enneads VI.9.7.33–34). While these remain the basic characteristics of Augustine’s philosophy throughout his career, they are considerably differentiated and modified as his engagement with biblical thought intensifies and the notions of creation, sin and grace acquire greater significance. Augustine is entirely unaware of the medieval and modern distinction of “philosophy” and “theology”; both are inextricably intertwined in his thought, and it is unadvisable to try to disentangle them by focusing exclusively on elements that are deemed “philosophical” from a modern point of view.

4. The Philosophical Tradition; Augustine’s Platonism

Augustine tells us that at the age of eighteen Cicero’s (now lost) protreptic dialogue Hortensius enflamed him for philosophy (Confessiones 3.7), that as a young man he read Aristotle’s Categories (ib. 4.28) and that his conversion was greatly furthered by his Neoplatonic readings (ib. 7.13) as well as by the letters of Paul (ib. 7.27; Contra Academicos 2.5). He is more reticent about Manichean texts, of which he must have known a great deal (van Oort 2012). From the 390s onwards the Bible becomes decisive for his thought, in particular Genesis, the Psalms and the Pauline and Johannine writings (even though his exegesis remains philosophically impregnated), and his mature doctrine of grace seems to have grown from a fresh reading of Paul ca. 395 (see 7.6 Grace, Predestination and Original Sin).

The most lasting philosophical influence on Augustine is Neoplatonism. He does not specify the authors and the exact subjects of the “books of the Platonists” (Confessiones 7.13) translated into Latin by the fourth century Christian Neoplatonist Marius Victorinus (ib. 8.3) he read in 386. In the twentieth century there was an ongoing and sometimes heated debate on whether to privilege Plotinus (who is mentioned in De beata vita 4) or Porphyry (who is named first in De consensu evangelistarum 1.23 ca. 400) as the main Neoplatonic influence on Augustine (for summaries of the debate see O’Donnell 1992: II 421–424; Kany 2007: 50–61). Today most scholars accept the compromise that the “books of the Platonists” comprised some treatises of Plotinus (e.g., Enneads I.6, I.2, V.1, VI.4–5) and a selection from Porphyry (Sententiae and, perhaps, Symmikta Zetemata). In any event, the importance of this problem should not be overrated because Augustine seems to have continued his Neoplatonic readings after 386. Around 400 he had Porphyry’s Philosophy from the Oracles at his disposal; in De civitate dei 10 (ca. 417; DeMarco 2021) he quotes from his Letter to Anebo and from an otherwise unattested anagogic treatise titled, in the translation used by Augustine, De regressu animae, the influence of which some have suspected already in Augustine’s earliest works. For the philosophy of mind in the second half of De trinitate he may have turned to Neoplatonic texts on psychology. While the exact sources of Augustine’s Neoplatonism elude us, source criticism has been able to determine some pervasive features of his thought that are doubtlessly Neoplatonic in origin: the transcendence and immateriality of God; the superiority of the unchangeable over the changeable (cf. Plato, Timaeus 28d); the ontological hierarchy of God, soul and body (Letter 18.2); the incorporeality and immortality of the soul; the dichotomy of the intelligible and the sensible realms (attributed to Plato in Contra Academicos 3.37); the non-spatial omnipresence of the intelligible in the sensible (Confessiones 1.2–4; Letter 137.4) and the causal presence of God in his creation (De immortalitate animae 14–15; De Genesi ad litteram 4.12.22); the existence of intelligible (Platonic) Forms that are located in the mind of God and work as paradigms of the sensible things (De diversis quaestionibus 46); the inwardness of the intelligible and the idea that we find God and Truth by turning inwards (De vera religione 72); the doctrine of evil as lack or privation of goodness; the understanding of the soul’s love of God as a quasi-erotic desire for true beauty (Confessiones 10.38; cf. Rist 1994: 155). A distinctly Platonic element is the notion of intellectual or spiritual ascent. Augustine thinks that by turning inwards and upwards from bodies to soul (i.e., from knowledge of objects to self-knowledge) and from the sensible to the intelligible we will finally be able to transcend ourselves and get in touch with the supreme being that is none other than God and Truth and that is more internal to us than our innermost self (Confessiones 3.11; MacDonald 2014: 22–26; Augustine’s biblical proof text is Romans 1:20, quoted, e.g., ib. 7.16). Ascents of this kind are ubiquitous in Augustine’s work (e.g., De libero arbitrio 2.7–39; Confessiones 10.8–38; De trinitate 8–15). Whether the condensed versions in the Confessiones (7.16; 7.23; 9.24–26) should be read as reports of mystical experiences is difficult to determine (Kenney 2005). An early version of the Augustinian ascent is the project—outlined in De ordine (2.24–52) but soon abandoned and virtually retracted in De doctrina christiana—of turning the mind to the intelligible and to God by means of a cursus in the liberal (especially mathematical) disciplines (Pollmann & Vessey 2005; Kenyon 2018: 101–140). It is remotely inspired by Plato’s Republic and may have had a Neoplatonic precedent (Hadot 2005), though use of Varro’s work on the disciplines cannot be excluded (Shanzer 2005). As late as De civitate dei 8 (ca. 417) he grants, in a brief doxography organized according to the traditional fields of physics, ethics and epistemology, that Platonism and Christianity share some basic philosophical insights, viz. that God is the first principle, that he is the supreme good and that he is the criterion of knowledge (De civitate dei 8.5–8; cf. already De vera religione 3–7). In spite of these important insights, Platonism cannot however lead to salvation because it is unable or unwilling to accept the mediation of Christ. It is, therefore, also philosophically defective (De civitate dei 10.32).

Cicero is Augustine’s main source for the Hellenistic philosophies, notably Academic skepticism and Stoicism. As a part of his cultural heritage, Augustine quotes him and the other Latin classics as it suits his argumentative purposes (Hagendahl 1967). His early ideal of the sage who is independent of all goods that one can lose against one’s will is inherited from Stoic ethics (De beata vita 11; De moribus 1.5; Wetzel 1992: 42–55). Though the implication that the sage’s virtue guarantees his happiness already in this life is later rejected as illusory (De trinitate 13.10; De civitate dei 19.4; Retractationes 1.2; Wolterstorff 2012), the Christian martyr can be styled in the manner of the Stoic sage whose happiness is immune to torture (Letter 155.16; Tornau 2015: 278). Augustine’s “inner-life” ethics of love has some Stoic overtones and may partly have been inspired by Seneca’s version of Stoic intentionalism (Tornau 2023). Augustine’s Manichean past was constantly on his mind, as his incessant polemics shows; its precise impact on his thought is however difficult to assess (van Oort (ed.) 2013; Fuhrer 2013; BeDuhn 2010 and 2013; van Oort 2020). The claim of Julian of Aeclanum that with his doctrine of predestination and grace Augustine had fallen back into Manichean dualism has appealed to some modern critics, but Julian must ignore essential features of Augustine’s thought (e.g., the notion of evil as privatio boni) to make his claim plausible (Lamberigts 2001).

5. Theory of Knowledge

5.1 Skepticism and Certainty

Augustine’s earliest surviving work is a dialogue on Academic skepticism (Contra Academicos or De Academicis, 386; Fuhrer 1997; Foley 2019/2020: vol. 1). He wrote it at the beginning of his career as a Christian philosopher in order to save himself and his readers from the “despair” that would have resulted if it could not be proven that, against the skeptic challenge, truth is attainable and knowledge and wisdom possible (cf. Retractationes 1.1.1). The sense of despair must have been very real to him when, after having broken with Manicheism but still being unable to see the truth of Catholic Christianity, he decided to “withhold assent until some certainty lighted up” (Confessiones 5.25). His information about skepticism does not come from a contemporary skeptic “school”, which hardly existed, but from Cicero’s Academica and Hortensius. Much of the discussion in Contra Academicos is thus devoted to the debate between Hellenistic Stoics and skeptics about the so-called “grasping” or kataleptic appearance, i.e., the problem whether there are appearances about the truth of which one cannot be mistaken because they are evident by themselves (Bermon 2001: 105–191; Dutton 2016). Unlike the original Stoics and Academics, Augustine limits the discussion to sense impressions because he wants to present Platonism as a solution to the skeptic problem and to point out a source of true knowledge unavailable to the Hellenistic materialists.

Unlike modern anti-skeptical lines of argumentation, Augustine’s refutation of skepticism does not aim at justifying our ordinary practices and beliefs. To refute the Academic claim that, since the wise person can never be sure whether she has grasped the truth, she will consistently withhold assent in order not to succumb to empty opinion, he thinks it sufficient to demonstrate the existence of some kind of knowledge that is immune to skeptical doubt. His strategy therefore consists in pointing out 1) the certainty of self-referential knowledge (the wise person “knows wisdom”, Contra Academicos 3.6; the Academic skeptic “knows” the Stoic criterion of truth, ib. 3.18–21); 2) the certainty of private or subjective knowledge (I am certain that something appears white to me even if I am ignorant whether it is really white, ib. 3.26); 3) the certainty of formal, logical or mathematical, structures (ib. 3.24–29), knowledge of which is possible independently of the mental state of the knower, whereas the reliability of sense impressions differs according as we are awake or dreaming, sane or insane. Modern critics have not been very impressed by these arguments (e.g., Kirwan 1989: 15–34; for a defense, see Nawar 2019), and an ancient skeptic would rightly have objected that being limited to subjective or formal knowledge, they could not justify the dogmatists’ claim to objective knowledge of reality (cf. Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.13). Yet this is not Augustine’s point. To him it matters to have shown that even if maximal concessions are made to skepticism concerning the unknowability of the external world attainable by the senses, there remains an internal area of cognition that allows for and even guarantees certainty. This is why Contra Academicos ends with a sketch of Platonic epistemology and ontology and with an idiosyncratic if not wholly unparalleled reconstruction of the history of the Academy according to which the Academics were in fact crypto-Platonists who hid their insight into transcendent reality and restricted themselves to skeptical arguments to combat the materialist and sensualist schools dominant in Hellenistic times until authentic Platonism emerged again with Plotinus (Contra Academicos 3.37–43; the story is still told in Letter 118 of 410, where the renaissance of Platonism is however connected with the rise of Christianity). The only realities that meet the Hellenistic criterion of truth and guarantee absolute certainty by being self-evident are the Platonic Forms (Contra Academicos 3.39; cf. De diversis quaestionibus 9; Cary 2008a: 55–60). The “objects” of knowledge that appear in Augustine’s anti-skeptical arguments thus either are the Platonic Forms themselves or at least point out the way of accessing them. This squares with the early Augustine’s tendency to interpret the Forms, or at any rate the most basic among them, as “numbers”, i.e., as the formal and normative structures and standards that govern all reality and enable us to understand and evaluate it (De ordine 2.14; 16; De musica 6.57–58; O’Daly 1987: 101–102; Kenyon 2018: 38–44; see also 5.2 Illumination). Strictly speaking, Augustine’s anti-skeptical arguments do not justify the claim that knowledge can be derived from the senses; having sensible and mutable objects, they cannot but yield opinion or, at best, true belief. The later Augustine, in a more generous way of speaking, widens the term “knowledge” (scientia, to be distinguished from “wisdom”, sapientia) so as to include what we learn through sense perception and from reliable witnesses (De trinitate 15.21; cf. De civitate dei 8.7; Retractationes 1.14.3; Siebert 2018; see 5.3 Faith and Reason).

Augustine’s most famous anti-skeptical argument is what is commonly called his “cogito-like” argument because it is similar to (and probably inspired) the Cogito of Descartes (Matthews 1992; Menn 1998; Fuchs 2010). Like Descartes’, Augustine’s cogito establishes an area immune to skeptical doubt by inferring from my awareness of my own existence the truth of the proposition “I exist”. Even if I were in error in uttering this proposition, it would still be true that I, who am in error, exist (De civitate dei 11.26: si enim fallor, sum; for the exact reconstruction of this argument cf. Horn 1995: 81–87; Matthews 2005: 34–42). The argument does not yet appear in Contra Academicos but is easily recognized as a development of the argument from subjective knowledge (Contra Academicos 3.26); Augustine considers it a valid refutation of skepticism from his earliest (De beata vita 7) to his latest works (De trinitate 15.21; for further attestations see Soliloquia 2.1; De duabus animabus 13; De libero arbitrio 2.7; De vera religione 73; Confessiones 7.5; 13.12). The scope of the argument in Augustine is both wider and narrower than in Descartes. The Augustinian cogito lacks the systematic importance of its Cartesian counterpart; there is no attempt to found a coherent and comprehensive philosophy on it. On some occasions, however, it works as a starting point for the Augustinian ascent to God (De libero arbitrio 2.7, where the ascent leads to an understanding of God as immutable truth and wisdom; for a condensed version, cf. De vera religione 72–73, where Augustine even makes supra-rational Truth the source and criterion of the truth of the cogito itself). The most impressive example is the second half of De trinitate. Here the attempt to reach a rational understanding of the mystery of the Trinity by means of an inquiry into the structure of the human mind starts with an analysis of the mind’s inalienable self-love and self-awareness (see 6.2 The Human Mind as an Image of God; Augustine does not, however, claim that the mind’s certainty about itself entails a similar certainty about the nature of God). Augustine’s cogito argument is not limited to epistemology but can also be employed in an ethical context because it proves not only my existence and my thinking (and, by implication, my being alive) but also my loving and willing. I am as certain that I will as I am certain that I exist and live, and my will is as undeniably mine as is my existence and my life. Therefore, my volitions are imputable to me, and it is I who am responsible for my choices (and not some evil substance present in my soul but foreign to my own self, as, on Augustine’s interpretation, Manichean dualism would have it; cf. De duabus animabus 13; Confessiones 7.5; De civitate dei 5.10).

5.2 Illumination

Augustine’s theory of knowledge—his so-called doctrine of illumination—is a distinctly non-empiricist epistemology based on a probably Neoplatonic reading of Plato’s doctrine of recollection (Burnyeat 1987; MacDonald 2012b; King 2014a: 147–152; Karfíková 2017). Like Plato and his followers, Augustine thinks that true knowledge requires first-hand acquaintance; second-hand information, e.g., from reliable testimony, may yield true and even justifiable belief, but not knowledge in the strict sense. In the case of sensible objects—which, strictly speaking, do not admit of knowledge at all but only opinion—such first-hand acquaintance is possible through sense perception. Cognition of intelligible objects, however, can be neither reached empirically by means of abstraction nor transmitted to us linguistically by a human teacher (see 5.4 Language and Signs); rather, such cognition requires personal intellectual activity that results in an intellectual insight, which we judge by a criterion we find nowhere but in ourselves. The paradigm of this kind of cognition are mathematical and logical truths and fundamental moral intuitions, which we understand not because we believe a teacher or a book but because we see them for ourselves (De magistro 40, cf. De libero arbitrio 2.34). The condition of possibility and the criterion of truth of this intellectual insight is none other than God (a view attributed, with explicit approval, to the Platonists in De civitate dei 8.7), who, in the manner of a Neoplatonic immaterial principle, is both immanent and transcendent in relation to our soul. Augustine mostly explains this Platonizing theory of a priori knowledge by means of two striking images: the inner teacher and illumination. The former is introduced in the dialogue De magistro (ca. 390) and remains frequent especially in the sermons (e.g., In epistulam Iohannis ad Parthos tractatus decem 3.13; Fuhrer 2018b); according to it, Christ is present in our souls and by “presiding over” them like a teacher guarantees the truthfulness of our understanding (De magistro 38–39, cf. Ephesians 3:17 for the image and, for the idea that truth “lives in the inner man”, De vera religione 72). The latter appears first in the Soliloquia (1.12–15) and is ubiquitous in Augustine’s writings (cf. esp. De trinitate 12.24). It is ultimately derived from the Analogy of the Sun in Plato’s Republic (508a–509b; cf. Rist 1994: 78–79). In the Soliloquia Augustine says, in a manner strongly reminiscent of Plato, that just as the sun is both visible itself and illumines the objects of sight so as to enable the eye to see them, God is intelligible himself and illumines the intelligible objects (which are here identified with the objects of the liberal disciplines and subordinated to God) so as to enable reason (the “eye” of the soul) to activate its capacity for intellection. The later version in De trinitate explicitly presents divine illumination as an alternative to Platonic recollection and situates it in the framework of a theory of creation. Here Augustine says that the human mind has been created by God in such a way as to be “connected” to intelligible reality “from below” (subiuncta) and with a capacity (capacitas) that enables it to “see” the intelligibles in the light of intelligible truth, just as the eye is by nature able to see colors in the light of the sun. Obviously, “capacity” in this case does not mean pure potentiality (as in the tabula rasa theory endorsed by Augustine’s interlocutor Euodius in De quantitate animae 34) but comprises at least implicit or latent knowledge of moral and epistemological standards. Both images, if properly read, should preclude the misunderstanding that Augustine’s gnoseology makes human knowledge entirely dependent on divine agency, with the human being becoming merely a passive recipient of revelation (cf. Gilson 1943: ch. 4; Lagouanère 2012: 158–180 and Schumacher 2011 for the debates about Augustinian illumination in medieval and modern philosophy). Cognition does not simply result from the presence of Christ in our soul but from our “consulting” the inner teacher, i.e., our testing propositions that claim to convey a truth about intelligible reality (or even a general truth about sensible objects, cf. Letter 13.3–4) against the inner standards we possess thanks to the presence of Christ (De magistro 37–38; this way of “consulting” the inner truth is repeatedly dramatized in the Confessiones, e.g., 11.10; 11.31; Cary 2008b: 100). And while every human being is “illumined” by the divine light at least from behind so as to be able to pass true judgments about right and wrong or good and evil, in order to develop these natural intuitions to full knowledge or wisdom and to be able actually to lead a virtuous life, we need to convert to God, the “source” of the light (De trinitate 14.21). Thus, while all human beings are by nature capable of accessing intelligible truth, only those succeed in doing so who have a sufficiently good will (De magistro 38)—presumably those who endorse Christian religion and live accordingly. This strong voluntary element intimately connects Augustine’s epistemology with his ethics and, ultimately, with his doctrine of grace (on the parallel structure of cognition and grace in Augustine see Lorenz 1964). Like all human agency, striving for wisdom takes place under the conditions of a fallen world and meets the difficulties and hindrances humanity is subject to because of original sin.

In order to illustrate what he means by “seeing things by ourselves” “in the light of truth”, Augustine often cites the example of the Socratic maieutic dialogue (De magistro 40; cf. De immortalitate animae 6; De trinitate 12.24), and in some passages of his early work he seems to subscribe to the Platonic doctrine of recollection (familiar to him from Cicero, Tusculan Disputations 1.57) in such a way as to imply the preexistence of the soul (Soliloquia 2.35, retracted in Retractationes 1.4.4; De immortalitate animae 6; De quantitate animae 34, retracted in Retractationes 1.8.2). It is difficult to tell whether the early Augustine literally believed in recollection and preexistence (Karfíková 2017; O’Daly 1987: 70–75; 199–207), not least because he was aware that some Neoplatonists interpreted Platonic recollection as an actualization of our ever-present but latent knowledge of the intelligible rather than as a remembrance of our past acquaintance with it (Letter 7.2, cf. Plotinus, Enneads IV.3.25.31–33; O’Daly 1976). If, as in De immortalitate animae 6, recollection is taken to prove the immortality of the soul (as it did in the Phaedo), it is hard to see how preexistence should not be implied. In any event, it is imprecise to say, as it is sometimes done, that Augustine gave up the theory of recollection because he realized that preexistence was at variance with Christian faith. In De civitate dei (12.14 etc.) Augustine emphatically rejects Platonic-Pythagorean metempsychosis or the transmigration of souls as incompatible with eternal happiness and the economy of salvation, and in De trinitate (12.24) the Meno version of the recollection theory, which implies transmigration, is rejected in favor of illumination. Yet it is a fallacy to claim that recollection entails transmigration. The early Augustine may have believed in preexistence (perhaps simply as a corollary of the immortality of the soul), but there is no evidence that he believed in the transmigration of souls; conversely, his rejection of transmigration did not prevent even the late Augustine from considering preexistence—at least theoretically—an option for the origin of the soul (Letter 143.6 from 412; cf. 6.1 Soul as a Created Being).

5.3 Faith and Reason

Whereas modern discussion tends to regard faith and reason as alternative or even mutually exclusive ways to (religious) truth, in Augustine’s epistemological and exegetical program the two are inseparable. He rejects the rationalism of the philosophers and, especially, the Manicheans as an unwarranted over-confidence into the abilities of human reason resulting from sinful pride and as an arrogant neglect of the revelation of Christ in Scripture (De libero arbitrio 3.56; 60; Confessiones 3.10–12). Against the fideism he encountered in some Christian circles (cf. Letter 119 from Consentius to Augustine) he insisted that it was good and natural to employ the rational capacity we have been created with to search for an understanding of the truths we accept from the authority of the biblical revelation, even though a true understanding of God will only be possible after this life when we see him “face to face” (Letter 120.3–4). In this epistemological and exegetical program, which since Anselm of Canterbury has aptly been labeled as “faith seeking understanding” (cf. De trinitate 15.2: fides quaerit, intellectus invenit) or “understanding of faith” (intellectus fidei), faith is prior to understanding in time but posterior to it in importance and value (De ordine 2.26; De vera religione 45; Letter 120.3; van Fleteren 2010). The first step toward perfection is to believe the words of Scripture; the second is to realize that the words are outward signs of an internal and intelligible reality and that they admonish us to turn to and to “consult” inner truth so as to reach true understanding and, accordingly, the good life (cf. 5.2 Illumination; 5.4 Language and Signs). Philosophical argument may be of help in this process; yet as Augustine notes as early as in Contra Academicos (3.43), it needs to be tied to the authority of Scripture and the Creed to prevent the frailty of human reason from going astray (cf. Confessiones 7.13). The Augustine of the earliest dialogues seems to have entertained the elitist idea that those educated in the liberal arts and capable of the Neoplatonic intellectual ascent may actually outgrow authority and achieve a full understanding of the divine already in this life (De ordine 2.26, but contrast ib. 2.45 on Monnica). In his later work, he abandons this hope and emphasizes that during this life, inevitably characterized by sin and weakness, every human being remains in need of the guidance of the revealed authority of Christ (Cary 2008b: 109–120). Faith is thus not just an epistemological but also an ethical category; it is essential for the moral purification we need to undergo before we can hope for even a glimpse of true understanding (Soliloquia 1.12; De diversis quaestionibus 48; De trinitate 4.24; Rist 2001). To a great extent, Augustine’s defense of faith as a valid epistemic category rests on a rehabilitation of true belief against the philosophical (Platonic and Hellenistic) tradition. Augustine neatly distinguishes “belief” (fides, the word he also uses for religious faith), which entails the believer’s awareness that he does not know, from “opinion” (opinio), defined by the philosophers as the illusion of knowing what one in fact does not know (De utilitate credendi 25; Letter 120.3). Without belief in the former sense, we would have to admit that we are ignorant of our own lineage (Confessiones 6.7) and of the objects of the historical and empirical sciences, of which, as Augustine asserts in a critique of Platonism, first-hand knowledge is rarely possible (De trinitate 4.21). The belief that a person we have not seen was or is just may trigger our fraternal love for him (De trinitate 8.7; Bouton-Touboulic 2012: 182–187; conversely, Augustine asks those who are united with him in fraternal love to believe what he tells them about his life, Confessiones 10.3). And obviously, the crucial events of the history of salvation, Jesus’ death on the cross and his resurrection, cannot be known but only believed qua historical events, even though qua signs they may lead to understanding by prompting us to an intelligible truth (De trinitate 13.2). Thus, while no doubt faith in revelation precedes rational insight into its true meaning, the decision about whose authority to believe and whom to accept as a reliable witness is itself reasonable (De vera religione 45; Letter 120.3). Even so, belief may of course be deceived (De trinitate 8.6). In ordinary life, this is inevitable and mostly unproblematic. A more serious problem is the justification of belief in Scripture, which, for Augustine, is the tradition and authority (auctoritas, not potestas) of the Church (Contra epistulam fundamenti 5.6; Rist 1994: 245).

5.4 Language and Signs

Augustine’s philosophy of language is both indebted to the Stoic-influenced Hellenistic and Roman theories of grammar and highly innovative (Rist 1994: 23–40; King 2014b). He follows the Stoics in distinguishing between the sound of a word, its meaning and the thing it signifies (De dialectica 5; De quantitate animae 66; cf. Sextus Empiricus, Adversus mathematicos 8.11–12 = 33B Long-Sedley), but he seems to have been the first to interpret language as such as a system of signs and to integrate it into a general semiotics (Fuhrer 2018a: 1696; Cary 2008b; Mayer 1969 and 1974). In his handbook of biblical exegesis and Christian rhetoric, De doctrina christiana (1.2; 2.1–4), Augustine divides the world into “things” and “signs” (i.e., things that, apart from being what they are, signify other things) and furthermore distinguishes between “natural” or involuntary signs (e.g., smoke signifying fire) and voluntary or “given” signs (a distinction akin, but not equivalent, to the older discussion about nature or convention as the origin of language). Language is defined as a system of given signs by means of which the speaker signifies either things or her thoughts and emotions (Enchiridion 22). In the exegetical framework of De doctrina christiana, the “thing” signified by the verbal signs of Scripture is God, the Supreme Being. Augustine therefore begins with a sketch of his theology and ethics centered around the notions of love of God and neighbor before he sets out his biblical hermeneutics which, again, posits love as the criterion of exegetical adequacy (Pollmann 1996; Williams 2001). The words of the Bible are external signs designed to prompt us to the more inward phenomenon of love and, ultimately, to God who is beyond all language and thought. This may be generalized to the principle that external—verbal and non-verbal—signs operate on a lower ontological level than the inward and intelligible truth they attempt to signify and that they are superseded in true knowledge which is knowledge not of signs but of things. This holds not only for words, even the words of Scripture, but also for the sacraments and for the Incarnation of Christ (Contra epistulam fundamenti 36.41). Augustine’s most sustained discussion of language, the early dialogue De magistro, asks how we learn things from words and relates linguistic signification to the epistemology of illumination (Nawar 2015). After a long discussion of how verbal signs signify things or states of mind and how they relate to other signs, it turns out, rather surprisingly, that we do not learn things from signs at all because in order to understand the meaning of a sign we already have to be acquainted with the thing signified. This is ultimately a version of Meno’s paradox, and Augustine solves it by introducing the metaphors of the inner teacher and of illumination, i.e., by means of an internalist theory of learning recognizable as a Neoplatonic interpretation of Platonic anamnesis (De magistro 38–40). This does not mean that words are useless. They inform us about things that are inaccessible to direct acquaintance and thus generate true belief; most importantly, they admonish us to “consult” the inner teacher and to understand things by ourselves (this, according to Augustine, is the whole point of the Socratic dialogue). This goes even for the acquisition of language itself: We understand the sign “bird-catching”, not simply by being shown a person engaged in that activity and being told that he is signified by that name, but by observing him and figuring out for ourselves what “bird-catching” means (ib. 32; on this and Wittgenstein’s criticism of what he took to be Augustine’s view of language acquisition, see Matthews 2005: 23–33). In the later books of De trinitate and in the sermons on the Trinity, Augustine frequently refers to a phenomenon called “inner word”, which he uses to explain the relation of the inner-Trinitarian Word or Logos from the Prologue of John (John 1:1) to Christ incarnate. Just as the spoken word signifies a concept that we have formed within our mind and communicates it to others, so Christ incarnate signifies the divine Logos and admonishes and assists us to turn to it (cf. De trinitate 15.20; De doctrina christiana 1.12; Sermon 119.7; 187.3). In De trinitate Augustine expands this to a theory about how the inner word or concept is formed (14.10; 15.25; cf. 15.43). The inner word is generated when we actualize some latent or implicit knowledge that is stored in our memory. It is not a sign, nor of linguistic nature (Augustine insists that it is neither Latin nor Greek nor Hebrew), but rather seems to be a kind of a-temporal intellectual insight that transcends language (cf. De catechizandis rudibus 3). Properly speaking, then, the theory of the inner word is not a linguistic theory at all.

6. Anthropology: God and the Soul; Soul and Body

6.1 Soul as a Created Being

Like most ancient philosophers, Augustine thinks that the human being is a compound of body and soul and that, within this compound, the soul—conceived as both the life-giving element and the center of consciousness, perception and thought—is, or ought to be, the ruling part. The rational soul should control the sensual desires and passions; it can become wise if it turns to God, who is at the same time the Supreme Being and the Supreme Good. In his Manichean phase, he conceived of both God and the soul as material entities, the soul being in fact a portion of God that had fallen into the corporeal world where it remained a foreigner, even to its own body (De duabus animabus 1; Confessiones 8.22). After his Platonist readings in Milan had provided him with the adequate philosophical means to think about immaterial, non-spatial reality (Confessiones 7.1–2; 7.16), he replaced this view, which he later represents as a rather crude dualism, with an ontological hierarchy in which the soul, which is mutable in time but immutable in space, occupies a middle position between God, who is totally unchangeable immaterial being (cf. MacDonald 2014), and bodies, which are subject to temporal and spatial change (Letter 18.2; De Genesi ad litteram 8.20.39; Catapano 2023). The soul is of divine origin and even god-like (De quantitate animae 2–3); it is not divine itself but created by God (the talk about divinity of the soul in the Cassiciacum dialogues seems to be a traditional Ciceronian element, cf. Cary 2000: 77–89; for a Plotinian interpretation see O’Connell 1968: 112–131). In De quantitate animae, Augustine broadly argues that the “greatness” of the soul does not refer to spatial extension but to its vivifying, perceptive, rational and contemplative powers that enable it to move close to God and are compatible with and even presuppose immateriality (esp. ib. 70–76; Brittain 2003). An early definition of soul as “a rational substance fitted for rule over a body” (ib. 22) echoes Platonic views (cf. the definition of the human being as “a rational soul with a body” in In Iohannis evangelium tractatus 19.15; O’Daly 1987: 54–60). Later on, when the resurrection of the body becomes more important to him, Augustine emphasizes—against Porphyry’s alleged claim that in order to be happy, the soul must free itself from anything corporeal—that it is natural and even desirable for a soul to govern a body (De Genesi ad litteram 12.35.68), but he nevertheless remains convinced that soul is an incorporeal and immortal substance that can, in principle, exist independently of a body (for a list of his arguments, see Catapano 2018). In the Soliloquia (2.24), following the tradition of Plato and of Cicero’s Tusculan Disputations, he proposes a proof for the immortality of the soul which he expressly introduces as an alternative to the final proof of the Phaedo (Soliloquia 2.23, cf. Phaedo 102d–103c). The proof is constructed from elements from Porphyry’s Isagoge and his Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (rather elementary texts that Augustine would have encountered long before his Platonic readings at Milan) and seems to be original with him (Tornau 2017; Tornau 2020: 58–73). It says that since truth is both eternal and in the soul as its subject, it follows that soul, the subject of truth, is eternal too. This is fallacious, because if truth is eternal independently of the soul it cannot be in the soul as in its subject (i.e., as a property), and if it is a property of the soul, it cannot ensure its eternity. In the incomplete draft of a third book of the Soliloquia preserved under the title De immortalitate animae, Augustine therefore modifies the proof and argues that soul is immortal because of the inalienable causal presence of God (= Truth) in it. It turns out however that even if this version of the proof is successful, it only demonstrates the soul’s eternal existence as a (rational) soul but not its eternal wisdom (De immortalitate animae 19; Zum Brunn 1969: 17–41 [1988: 9–34]; for a more optimistic reading, Kenyon 2018: 156–157), in the hope of which the interlocutors had set out to prove the immortality of the soul in the first place (Soliloquia 2.1). After De immortalitate animae, Augustine never returned to his proof. But neither did he disown it; as late as De trinitate (13.12), he endorses the Platonic axiom that soul is by nature immortal and that its immortality can, in principle, be proven by philosophical means. He also sticks to his conviction that immortality is a necessary condition of happiness but insists that it is not a sufficient condition, given that immortality and misery are compatible (cf. De civitate dei 9.15 on the misery of the wicked demons). True happiness will only be realized in the afterlife as a gift of God’s grace, when, thanks to the resurrection of the body, not just the soul but the human being as a whole will live forever. Resurrection, however, is not susceptible of rational proof; it is a promise of God that must be believed on Scriptural authority (De trinitate ib.).

Together with an essentially Platonic notion of the soul, Augustine inherits the classical problems of Platonic soul-body dualism. How can soul fulfil its task of “governing” the body (cf. De quantitate animae 22) if it is incorporeal itself? And how are corporeal and psychic aspects related to each other in phenomena that involve both body and soul, especially if, like passions and desires, these are morally relevant? These problems are further complicated by the Platonic axiom that incorporeal entities, being ontologically prior to corporeal ones, cannot be causally affected by them. Augustine’s solution is indebted to Plotinus’ strategy of making the relation of the soul to the bodily affections an essentially cognitive one (O’Daly 1987: 84–87; Hölscher 1986: ch. 2.2.1; Nash 1969: 39–59; Bermon 2001: 239–281). With Plotinus, he insists that sense perception is not an affection which the soul passively undergoes (as Stoic materialism would have it, where sensory perception was interpreted as a kind of imprint in the soul) but its active awareness of affections undergone by the body (De quantitate animae 41; 48; De Genesi ad litteram 7.14.20; Plotinus, Enneads I.4.2.3–4; Brittain 2002: 274–282; Nawar 2021; Karfíková 2021b: 253–257). In De quantitate animae, the framework of this theory is the general argument that the relation of soul to body must be conceived of not in terms of space but of “power” (see above). In De musica (6.11), this is developed into the idea that sense perception is the soul’s awareness of modifications of its own formative and vivifying activities that result from its reacting to the external impulses undergone by the body. In addition to the usual five senses, Augustine identifies a sensory faculty that relates the data of the senses to each other and judges them aesthetically (but not morally; De musica 6.5; 19); in De libero arbitrio (2.8–13) he calls this the “inner sense” (on the Aristotelian background cf. O’Daly 1987: 102–105).

In Neoplatonism it was disputed how soul, being immortal, immaterial and ontologically superior to body, came to be incorporated nevertheless. The basic options, present already in Plato’s dialogues, were either that the disembodied soul had “fallen” into the corporeal world because of some error (as in the Phaedrus myth) or that it had been sent into the cosmos by God to impart life and order to it (as in the Timaeus; for harmonizing Neoplatonic exegeses, see Plotinus, Enneads IV.8, and Macrobius, Commentary on Cicero’s Somnium Scipionis 1.10–14). Augustine addresses the issue in the horizon of his doctrine of creation and, in the period of the Pelagian Controversy, of the debate about the transmission of original sin (see 9. Gender, Women and Sexuality). In De libero arbitrio (3.56–59), he distinguishes the three options of creationism (God creates a new soul for every newborn body), traducianism (the soul is transmitted from the parents to the child like corporeal properties), and preexistence, which is subdivided into the Platonic options of voluntary or god-sent descent. After 412 all these options come to the fore again (Letters 143.5–11; 166; 190; and the treatise De anima et eius origine). Augustine discards none of them officially except for the notion, wrongly associated with Origenism, which was considered a heresy at the time, that incorporation was a punishment for a sin committed by the pre-existent soul (De civitate dei 11.23; cf. Letter 164.20). In practice, he narrows the debate down to the alternative between creationism and traducianism, which appear to have been the only options taken seriously by his Christian contemporaries. Augustine refused to take a stand till the end of his life, probably because neither option really suited his purposes (Rist 1994: 317–320; O’Connell 1987; Mendelson 1998): Creationism made original sin very difficult to explain; traducianism was functional in this respect, but it was a materialist and even biologist theory that ran counter to Augustine’s Platonism and was further compromised because it had been brought up by his African predecessor Tertullian (d. c. 220 CE), a Stoicizing corporealist who had ended his life as a heretic (Rist 1994: 123).

6.2 The Human Mind as an Image of God

Augustine deploys what we may call his philosophy of the mind most fully in his great work on Nicene Trinitarian theology, De trinitate. Having removed apparent Scriptural obstacles to the equality and consubstantiality of the three divine persons (bks. 1–4) and having set out the grammar, as it were, of adequate speaking about the Trinity by distinguishing absolute and relative propositions about God and the three Persons (bks. 5–7; King 2012), he turns to an analysis of the human mind as an image of God (bks. 8–15; Brachtendorf 2000; Ayres 2010; Bermon & O’Daly (eds.) 2012; Drever 2013: 110–141; Lagouanère 2023). The basis for this move is, of course, Genesis 1:26–27. Augustine follows a long-standing Jewish and Patristic tradition, familiar to him from Ambrose, according to which the biblical qualification of the human being as an image of God referred not to the living body (a literalist reading vulnerable to the Manichean charge of anthropomorphism, cf. Confessiones 6.4) but to what is specifically human, i.e., the “inner man” (2 Corinthians 4:16, quoted, e.g., in De trinitate 11.1) or the mind (mens). Assuming, in a Platonist manner, that “image” in this case does not merely mean an analogy but a causal effect of the original that reflects the essential features of the latter on a lower ontological level, he scrutinizes the human mind for triadic structures that meet the Nicene requirements of equality and consubstantiality and may thus give a—however faint—understanding of the Triune God. The general pattern of his argument is the Augustinian ascent from the external to the internal and from the senses to God; but since human reason is, whether by nature or due to its fallen state, hardly capable of knowing God, Augustine this time is obliged to interrupt and re-start the ascent several times. The final book shows that the exercise of analyzing the human mind does have preparatory value for our thinking about the Trinity but does not yield insight into the divine by being simply transferred to it (De trinitate 15.10–11). The three elements Augustine discerns in all our cognitive acts from sense perception to theoretical reason or contemplation are: [1] an object that is either external to the mind (as in sense perception) or internal to it, in which case it is an image or a concept stored in our memory; [2] a cognitive faculty that must be activated or “formed” by the object if cognition is to come about; [3] a voluntary or intentional element that makes the cognitive faculty turn to its object so as to be actually formed by it. The last element ensures the active character of perception and intellection but also gives weight to the idea that we do not cognize an object unless we consciously direct our attention to it (MacDonald 2012b; Karfíková 2021b: 261–265). Though this triadic pattern is operative on all levels of human cognition, Augustine contends that only the mind’s intellectual self-knowledge on the level of contemplative reason (its “memory of itself, knowledge of itself and love of itself”) qualifies as an image of God because only here are the three elements as closely related to each other as in the Nicene dogma and because they are as inalienable as the mind’s immediate presence to itself (De trinitate 14.19). This idea is carefully prepared in Book 10, which contains one of Augustine’s most remarkable arguments for the substantiality of the mind and its independence of the body (Nawar 2022; Stróżyński 2013; Brittain 2012a; Matthews 2005: 43–52; Bermon 2001, 357–404). Augustine begins by arguing (in a manner reminiscent of his cogito-like argument; see 5.1 Skepticism and Certainty) that the mind always already knows itself because it is always present to and hence aware of itself. This pre-reflexive self-awareness is presupposed by every act of conscious cognition. If so, however, the Delphic command “Know thyself” cannot mean that the mind is to become acquainted with itself as if it had been unknown to itself before, but rather that it must become conscious of what it knew about itself all along and distinguish it from what it does not know about itself. As the mind in its fallen state is deeply immersed in sensible reality, it tends to forget what it really is and what it knows it is and confounds itself with the things it attaches the greatest importance to, i.e., sensible objects that give it pleasure. The result are materialist theories about the soul, which thus derive from flawed morality (De trinitate 10.11–12). If it follows the Delphic command, however, the mind will realize that it knows with certainty that it exists, thinks, wills etc., whereas it can at best merely believe that it is air, fire or brain (ib. 10.13). And as the substance or essence of the mind cannot be anything other than what it knows with certainty about itself, it follows that nothing material is essential to the mind and that its essence must be sought in its mental acts (ib. 10.16). Full self-knowledge is reached, then, when the mind’s inalienable self-awareness (se nosse, “to be acquainted with oneself”) is actualized to conscious “self-thinking” (se cogitare). How this relates to the mind’s pre-reflexive presence to itself is not entirely clear (for problems of interpretation, see, e.g., Horn 2012; Brittain 2012b; Karfíková 2021a), but Augustine seems to think that not only the mind’s intellectual self-thinking but already its immediate self-awareness is triadically structured and an image of the Triune God (De trinitate 14.7–14). Again, the ethical side of the theory should not be overlooked. As a strong voluntary element is present in and necessary for an act of cognition, what objects (imaginations, thoughts) we cognize is morally relevant and indicative of our loves and desires. And while the triadic structure of the mind is its very essence and hence inalienable, Augustine insists that the mind is created in the image of God, not because it is capable of self-knowledge, but because it has the potential to become wise, i.e., to remember, know and love God, its creator (ib. 14.21–22).

7. Ethics

7.1 Happiness

The basic structure of Augustine’s ethics is that of ancient eudaimonism (Holte 1962), but he defers happiness to the afterlife and blames the ancient ethicists for their arrogant conviction—resulting from their ignorance of the fallen condition of humankind—that they could reach happiness in this life by philosophical endeavor (De civitate dei 19.4; Wolterstorff 2012; for a more optimistic view, cf. the early De ordine 2.26). He takes it as axiomatic that happiness is the ultimate goal pursued by all human beings (e.g., De beata vita 10; De civitate dei 10.1; De trinitate 13.7, quoting Cicero’s Hortensius; for an interesting discussion of how the desire for happiness relates to our equally natural desires for pleasure and for truth cf. Confessiones 10.29–34; Matthews 2005: 134–145; Menn 2014: 80–95). Happiness or the good life is brought about by the possession of the greatest good in nature that humans can attain and that one cannot lose against one’s will (e.g., lib. arb. 1.10–12; especially in his early work Augustine shares the Stoics’ concern about the self-sufficiency and independence of the wise and happy person, cf. Wetzel 1992: 42–55). This structure Augustine inscribes into his Neoplatonically inspired three-tiered ontological hierarchy (Letter 18.2) and concludes that the only thing able to fulfil the requirements for the supreme good set by eudaimonism is the immutable God himself. The Supreme Being is also the greatest good; the desire of created being for happiness can only be satisfied by the creator. As Augustine puts in concisely in De beata vita (11): “Happy is he who has God”. Alternative formulations are “enjoyment of God” (De civitate dei 8.8; De trinitate 13.10), “contemplation of God” or “enjoyment of truth” (De libero arbitrio 2.35). To “have” God means in fact to know and, especially, to love God; Augustine therefore interprets Psalm 72:28 (“For me it is good to cling to God”) as a biblical telos formula or definition of the supreme and beatifying good (De civitate dei 10.18; Tornau 2015: 265–266). We are, in other words, happy, wise and virtuous if we turn to or “convert” to God. If we turn away from him and direct our attention and love to the bodies—which are not per se bad, as in Manicheism, but an infinitely lesser good than God—or to ourselves, who are a great good but still subordinate to God, we become miserable, foolish and wicked (Letter 18.2; De libero arbitrio 2.52–54; In Iohannis evangelium tractatus 20.11). Virtue is “love that knows its priorities” (ordo amoris, De civitate dei 15.22) whereas vice or sin perverts the natural order. Just as after the Fall all human beings are inevitably tainted by sin, we need to be purified through faith in order to live well and to restore our ability to know and love God (De diversis quaestionibus 68.3; Cary 2008a: 12–13). Augustine does not discard the intellectual element inherited from the ancient (Socratic) ethical tradition, and his notion of conversion is certainly inspired by Neoplatonist “return” (epistrophe), but Augustine enhances the ethical relevance of conversion and aversion by emphasizing their voluntary character (cf. already De immortalitate animae 11–12). The element of will or love is also crucial to the distinction between “enjoyment” (frui) and “use” (uti) that is first fully developed in De doctrina christiana, bk. 1 (c. 396) and remains basic for his ethical thought. Following the ancient insight that we pursue some goods for their own sake and others for the sake of other and greater goods, Augustine states that to “enjoy” a thing means to cling to it with love for its own sake whereas to “use” it means to love it for the sake of another thing which we want to enjoy. We love absolutely only what we enjoy, whereas our love for things we use is relative and even instrumental (De doctrina christiana 1.4). The only proper object of enjoyment is God (cf. De civitate dei 8.8 where the same view is attributed to the Platonists). Wickedness and confusion of the moral order results from a reversal of use and enjoyment, when we want to enjoy what we ought to use (all created things, e.g., wealth, bodies or ourselves) and to use what we ought to enjoy (this probably refers to the “carnal” understanding of religion of which Augustine often accuses the Jews). An obvious problem of this system is the categorization of the biblically prescribed love of the neighbor. Are we to enjoy our neighbor or to use her? Whereas natural moral intuition suggests the former, Augustine’s systematic seems to require the latter. The problem is inherited from ancient eudaimonism, where it takes some philosophical effort to reconcile the intuition that concern for others is morally relevant with the assumption that ethics is primarily about the virtue and happiness of the individual. Augustine is aware of the problem and gives a differentiated answer. In De doctrina christiana (1.20–21) he somewhat tentatively suggests that to love our neighbor means to use him, not because he is merely instrumental to our happiness but because we are enjoined to love him as ourselves and because we love ourselves rightly only if we refer our self-love to our desire to enjoy God. Love of the neighbor thus means to desire his true happiness in the same way as we desire our own. In substance, this remains Augustine’s view also in his later work (cf., e.g., In epistulam Iohannis ad Parthos tractatus decem 1.9), but he then prefers to avoid the counter-intuitive and potentially misleading talk about “using” fellow humans and replaces it by a description of fraternal love as “mutual enjoyment in God” (e.g., De trinitate 9.13; cf. already De doctrina christiana 1.35; 3.16; Rist 1994: 159–168; O’Donovan 1980: 32–36; 112–136). “In God” is presumably added to prevent the misunderstanding that we are to enjoy the neighbor “in herself” or “in ourselves” without reference to God. This would mean that we expect our true happiness from her, which no human can give; the result of this misdirection would be extreme misery in the case of the neighbor’s loss (cf. Confessiones 4.9–11 on Augustine’s excessive grief after the death of his friend; Nawar 2014; Stróżyński 2020).

7.2 Virtue

In principle Augustine follows the view of the ancient eudaimonists that virtue is sufficient or at least relevant for happiness. There are however several important modifications. (1) The entire structure is made dependent on God’s prevenient grace. True virtue guarantees true happiness, but there is no true virtue that is not a gift of grace. (2) Augustine accepts Cicero’s definition of virtue as the art of “living well” but emphatically rejects his equation of living well and living happily, i.e., the Stoicizing claim that a virtuous disposition is equivalent to happiness (De libero arbitrio 2.50; De civitate dei 4.21; De moribus 1.10; contrast Cicero, Tusculan Disputations 5.53). Our postlapsarian life on earth is inevitably the locus of sin and punishment, and even the saints are unable to overcome the permanent inner conflict between “the spirit” and “the flesh”, i.e., between good and evil volitions or rational and irrational desires in this life (De civitate dei 19.4, quoting Galatians 5:17). The perfect inner tranquility virtue strives for will only be achieved in the afterlife. (3) Augustine replaces the ancient definition of virtue as “right reason” (as in Stoicism) or “activity in accordance with reason” (as in the Aristotelian tradition) with a definition of virtue as love of God or, in later texts, as love of God and neighbor. Virtue is an inner disposition or motivational habit that enables us to perform every action we perform out of right love. There are several catalogues of the traditional four cardinal virtues prudence, justice, courage and temperance that redefine these as varieties of the love of God either in this life or in the eschaton (De moribus 1.25; Letter 155.12; cf. Letter 155.16 for the cardinal virtues as varieties of love of the neighbor; De libero arbitrio 1.27 for descriptions of the virtues in terms of good will). His briefest definition of virtue is “ordered love” (De civitate dei 15.22). This does not mean that virtue becomes non-rational (for Augustine love and will are essential features of the rational mind; see 6.2 The Human Mind as an Image of God), but it does mean that it becomes essentially intentional. The criterion of true virtue is that it is oriented toward God. Even if Augustine occasionally talks as if the four cardinal virtues could be added to the Pauline or theological virtues of love, faith and hope to make a sum of seven (Letter 171A.2), they are best taken as a subdivision of love, the only one of the Pauline virtues that persists in the eschaton (Soliloquia 1.14).

These modifications have several interesting consequences. Even though Augustine postpones the happiness that is the reward of virtue to the afterlife, he does not make virtue a means to an end in the sense that virtue becomes superfluous when happiness is reached. To the contrary, he insists that virtue will persist in the eschaton where it will be transformed into eternal unimpeded fruition of God and of the neighbor in God. Then it will indeed be its own reward and identical with happiness (Letter 155.2; 12). Both eschatological virtue and virtue in this life are thus love of God; they only differ in that the latter is subject to hindrances and temptation. For this reason, those who have true love of God—e.g., Christian martyrs—are happy already in this life, at least in hope (e.g., Confessiones 10.29; Tornau 2015). Augustine’s description of eschatological and non-eschatological virtues (Letter 155) is partly modelled on the Neoplatonic doctrine of the scale of virtues with its ascending hierarchy of social or civic, purificatory and contemplative virtues (Tornau 2013; Dodaro 2004a: 206–212; Dodaro 2004b). When analyzing virtue in this life, Augustine takes up the Stoic distinction, familiar to him from Cicero (De officiis 1.7–8), between a virtue’s final end (finis) and its appropriate action (officium; cf., e.g., Contra Iulianum 4.21; De civitate dei 10.18). The appropriate action that characterizes virtue in this life but is no longer needed in eternal bliss is to subdue the lower parts of soul to reason and to resist the temptations that emerge from the permanent conflict between good and bad volitions (as it were, a permanent “akratic” state; see 7.4 Will and Freedom) that results from our fallen condition (De civitate dei 19.4). As the examples of the best philosophers and the heroes of Rome’s glorious past teach, whom Augustine regularly accuses of love of glory, these actions may easily spring from other motivations than the true love of God. Augustine therefore distinguishes between true (i.e., Christian) virtue that is motivated by love of God and “virtue as such” (virtus ipsa: De civitate dei 5.19) that performs the same appropriate actions but is, in the last resort, guided by self-love or pride (ib. 5.12; 19.25). Among other things, this distinction underpins his solution of the so-called problem of pagan virtue (Harding 2008; Tornau 2006b; Dodaro 2004a: 27–71; Rist 1994: 168–173) because it permits ascribing virtue in a meaningful sense to pagan and pre-Christian paradigms of virtue like Socrates without having to admit that they were eligible for salvation. If a “teleological” perspective on virtue is adopted that exclusively focuses on ends, the virtues of the pagans must be judged vices rather than virtues and will be punished accordingly (De civitate dei 19.25, the passage from which the non-Augustinian phrase that pagan virtues are “splendid vices” seems to be derived; see Irwin 1999). An “operative” perspective however reveals that as far as appropriate actions are concerned, virtuous non-Christians differ from the foolish and wicked but are indistinguishable from virtuous Christians. From this point of view, Socrates is closer to Paul than to Nero, even though his virtue will not bring him happiness, i.e., eternal bliss. That he envisages a perspective on virtue that abstracts from the causal nexus of virtue and happiness is perhaps Augustine’s most significant departure from ancient eudaimonism.

7.3 Love

Love is a crucial and overarching notion in Augustine’s ethics. It is closely related to virtue and often used synonymously with will (e.g., De trinitate 15.38; in the cogito-like arguments, love and will are interchangeable, cf. De civitate dei 11.27 with Confessiones 13.12) or intention (intentio). Augustine’s basic text is, of course, the biblical command to love God and neighbor (Matthew 22.37; 39), which he is however prepared, throughout his life, to interpret in terms of Platonic erotic love (Rist 1994: 148–202). As in the Symposium and in Plotinus (Enneads I.6), love is a force in our souls that attracts us to the true beauty we find nowhere else but in and above ourselves; it drives us to ascend from the sensible to the intelligible world and to the cognition and contemplation of God (Confessiones 10.8–38, esp. 38). Even Christian fraternal love can be described, in a manner reminiscent of the Phaedrus, as a kind of seduction through another’s real or assumed righteousness (De trinitate 9.11). In a more general way, love means the overall direction of our will (positively) toward God or (negatively) toward ourselves or corporeal creature (De civitate dei 14.7; Byers 2013: 88–99; 217–231). The former is called love in a good sense (caritas), the latter cupidity or concupiscence (cupiditas), i.e., misdirected and sinful love (De doctrina christiana 3.16). The root of sin is excessive self-love that wants to put the self in the position of God and is equivalent with pride (De civitate dei 14.28). It must be distinguished from the legitimate self-love that is part of the biblical commandment and strives for true happiness by subordinating the self to God (O’Donovan 1980). In his earlier work, Augustine has some difficulties incorporating love of neighbor into the Platonic and eudaimonist framework of his thinking (De doctrina christiana 1.20–21, see 7.1 Happiness). After 400, in the context of his reflections on the Trinity and his exegesis of the First Epistle of John (esp. 1 John 4:8; 16, “God is love”), he finds the solution that love is by its very nature self-reflexive. In loving our neighbors, we of necessity love that love which enables us to do so itself, which is none other than God; love of God and love of neighbor are, accordingly, co-extensive and, ultimately, identical (De trinitate 8.12; In epistulam Iohannis ad Parthos tractatus decem 9.10). Right and perverse love or intention—charity or concupiscence—thus becomes the predominant and even the single criterion of moral evaluation; Augustine’s ethics may in this sense be labeled intentionalist (cf. Mann 1999 on Augustine’s “inner-life ethics”). He keenly insists that each and every action, even if it is externally good and impressive, can be motivated either by a good or an evil intention, by right or perverse love, by charity or pride. This goes for the actions prescribed by the Sermon of the Mount and even for martyrdom (In epistulam Iohannis tractatus decem 8.9, partly relying on 1 Corinthians 13:3). It is therefore impossible to give casuistic rules for external moral behavior. The only thing possible is the general recommendation to “Love and do what you will” (ib. 7.8), i.e., to take care that the inner disposition or intention behind one’s actions is love of God and neighbor and not self-love or pride. It is important not to misunderstand this as moral subjectivism, which Augustine’s ontological and ethical assumptions exclude. He never excuses evil deeds done “with the best intentions” or with a subjectively pure conscience, and he thinks that some actions, such as heresy, are always condemnable because they cannot possibly result from love (a point often made in the Donatist controversy). In a sense, his ideal agent is a successor of the Stoic and Neoplatonic sage, who always acts out of inner virtue or perfect rationality (the latter Augustine replaces with true love) but adapts his outward actions to the external circumstances (cf. Sextus Empiricus, Adversus Mathematicos 11.200–201 = 59 G Long-Sedley; Diogenes Laertius 7.121; Porphyry, Sententiae 32). Augustine’s intentionalism has, however, the ambivalent implication that, since love and will inevitably belong to the privacy of the mind, the inner motives for a person’s external agency are unknowable to anyone except the agent herself and God. On the one hand, this limits the authority of other people—including those endowed with worldly power or an ecclesiastical office—to pass moral judgments. Augustine repeatedly recommends withholding judgment so as to preserve humility (De civitate dei 1.26; Sermon 30.3–4). On the other hand, Augustine makes our inner motivational and moral life opaque even to ourselves and fully transparent only to God (Confessiones 10.7; In Iohannis evangelium tractatus 32.5). We can never be fully sure about the purity of our intentions, and even if we were, we could not be sure that we will persist in them. All human beings are therefore called to constantly scrutinize the moral status of their inner selves in a prayerful dialogue with God (as it is dramatized in the Confessiones). Such self-scrutiny may well be self-tormenting; the obsession of Western Christianity with inner latent guilt here has its Augustinian roots. The public staging of Augustine’s confession before God in the Confessiones may, among many other things, represent an attempt to remedy the loneliness of Christian self-scrutiny (cf. Confessiones 10.1–7).

Augustine’s intentionalism also provides him with arguments in favor of religious coercion. As the objective of right fraternal love is not the neighbor’s temporal well-being but his eternal happiness or salvation, we must not passively tolerate our fellow-humans’ sins but should actively correct them if we can; otherwise, our motivation would be inertia rather than love (In epistulam Iohannis ad Parthos tractatus decem 7.11; cf. Letter 151.11; Ad Simplicianum 1.2.18). Catholic bishops are therefore obliged to compel heretics and schismatics to re-enter the Catholic church even forcibly, just as a father beats his children when he sees them playing with snakes or as we bind a madman who otherwise would fling himself down a precipice (Letter 93.8; 185.7; and Letter 93.1–10 in general). Obviously, this is a paternalistic argument that presupposes superior insight in those who legitimately wield coercive power. While this may be acceptable in the case of the Church, which according to Augustine’s ecclesiology is the body of Christ and the embodiment of fraternal love, it turns out to be problematic when it is transferred to secular rulers (Augustine rarely does this, but cf. Letter 138.14–15; Tornau 2019). And as even the Church in this world is a mixed body of sinners and saints (see 8. History and Political Philosophy), it may be asked how individual bishops can be sure of their good intentions when they use religious force (Rist 1994: 242–245). Augustine does not address this problem, presumably because most of his relevant texts are propagandistic defenses of coercion against the Donatists.

7.4 Will and Freedom

Though other Latin philosophers, especially Seneca, had made use of the concept of will (voluntas) before Augustine, it has a much wider application in his ethics and moral psychology than in any predecessor and covers a broader range of phenomena than either Aristotelian boulesis (roughly, rational choice) or Stoic prohairesis (roughly, the fundamental decision to lead a good life). Augustine comes closer than any earlier philosopher to positing will as a faculty of choice that is reducible neither to reason nor to non-rational desire. It has therefore been claimed that Augustine “discovered” the will (Dihle 1982: ch. 6; Kahn 1988; contrast Frede 2011: 153–174 who, mainly on the basis of De libero arbitrio, emphasizes Augustine’s indebtedness to Stoicism; for an up-to-date overview on will in Augustine, see J. Müller 2024). Augustine admits both first-order and second-order volitions, the latter being acts of the liberum voluntatis arbitrium, the ability to choose between conflicting first-order volitions (Stump 2001; Horn 1996; den Bok 1994). Like desires, first-order volitions are intentional or object-directed and operate on all levels of the soul. Like memory and thought, will is a constitutive element of the mind (see 6.2 The Human Mind as an Image of God). It is closely related to love and, accordingly, the locus of moral evaluation. We act well or badly if and only if our actions spring from a good or evil will, which is equivalent to saying that they are motivated by right (i.e., God-directed) or perverse (i.e., self-directed) love (De civitate dei 14.7). With this basic idea in view, Augustine defends the passions or emotions against their Stoic condemnation as malfunctions of rational judgment by redefining them more neutrally as volitions (voluntates) that may be good or bad depending on their intentional objects (De civitate dei 9.4–5; 14.9; Wetzel 1992: 98–111; Byers 2012b). The mechanics of the will in Augustine’s moral psychology is strongly indebted to the Stoic theory of assent, which it however modifies in at least one respect. As in Stoicism, the will to act is triggered by an impression generated by an external object (visum). To this the mind responds with an appetitive motion that urges us to pursue or to avoid the object (e.g., delight or fear). But only when we give our inner consent to this impulse or withhold it, does a will emerge that, circumstances permitting, results in a corresponding action. The will is the proper locus of our moral responsibility because it is neither in our power whether an object presents itself to our senses or intellect nor whether we take delight in it (De libero arbitrio 3.74; Ad Simplicianum 1.2.21), and our attempts to act externally may succeed or fail for reasons beyond our control. The only element that is in our power is our will or inner consent, for which we are therefore fully responsible. Thus, a person who has consented to adultery is guilty even if his attempt actually to commit it is unsuccessful, and a victim of rape who does not consent to the deed keeps her will free of sin even if she feels physical pleasure (De civitate dei 1.16–28). Augustine therefore defines sin as “the will to keep or pursue something unjustly” (De duabus animabus 15). The second stage in the above structure, the involuntary appetitive motion of the soul, is reminiscent of the Stoic “first motions”, but it also corresponds to the “impulse”, which in Stoicism does not precede consent but follows it and immediately results in action. Temptations of this kind are, in Augustine, not personal sins but due to original sin, and they haunt even the saints. Our will must be freed by divine grace to resist them (Contra Iulianum 6.70; see, on this theory and its Stoic and Platonic background, Byers 2013: 100–150; J. Müller 2009: 157–161; Sorabji 2000: 372–384; Rist 1994: 176–177).

Augustine’s thinking about free will (liberum arbitrium or liberum voluntatis arbitrium) undergoes some development during his career. In the 390s, opposing the dualistic fatalism of the Manicheans, he uses the cogito-like argument (see 5.1 Skepticism and Certainty) to demonstrate that we are responsible for our volitions because we are as certain that we will as we are certain that we exist and think (De duabus animabus 13; De libero arbitrio 3.3; Confessiones 7.5; S. Harrison 1999). A contemporaneous definition of will as a movement of soul toward some object of desire emphasizes the absence of external constraint, and the ensuing definition of sin as an unjust volition (see above) seems to endorse the principle of alternative possibilities (De duabus animabus 14–15). In De libero arbitrio, free will appears as the condition of possibility of moral goodness and hence as a great good itself; but as it is not an absolute good (which is God alone) but only an intermediate one, it is liable to misuse and, hence, also the source of moral evil (De libero arbitrio 2.47–53). In his early exegesis of Paul’s chapter on divine election (Romans 9), Augustine is keen to establish that Paul did not abolish free will (Expositio quarundam propositionum ex epistula apostoli ad Romanos 13–18). With all this, Augustine is basically in harmony with the traditional view of early Christian theology and exegesis, which is still adopted in the 420s by Julian of Aeclanum when he blames Augustine for having fallen back into Manichean fatalism and quotes his early definitions against him (Julian, Ad Florum, in Contra Iulianum opus imperfectum 1.44–47). Things change with Ad Simplicianum 1.2 and the Confessiones. By c. 400 CE, Augustine had come to the conclusion that our ability to make choices was seriously impaired by the fallen condition of humankind and that it made little sense to talk about free will without reference to grace. The optimistic-sounding claim in the first book of De libero arbitrio (1.25–26; 29) that it is in our power to be good as soon as we choose to be good because “nothing is as completely in our will as will itself” was probably never the whole story; already in book 3 of the same work Augustine says that the cognitive and motivational deficiencies caused by Adam’s sin (“ignorance and difficulty”, ib. 3.52; S. Harrison 2006: 112–130) seriously compromise our natural ability to choose the good, and in his later, especially anti-Pelagian work he radicalizes this to the idea that original sin makes us unable to completely subdue our sinful volitions as long as we live, so that we live in a permanent state of “akrasia” or weakness of will (De natura et gratia 61–67; De civitate dei 19.4; De nuptiis et concupiscentia 1.35). But he never questions the principle that we have been created with the natural ability to freely and voluntarily choose the good, nor does he ever deny the applicability of the cogito argument to the will (cf. De civitate dei 5.10) or doubt that our volitions are imputable to us. What grace does is to restore our natural freedom; it does not compel us to act against our will. What this means is best illustrated by the narrative of Confessiones 8 (for particularly lucid interpretations, see Wetzel 1992: 126–138; J. Müller 2009: 323–335; for a good introduction, Drecoll 2020). Immediately before his conversion Augustine suffers from a “divided will”, feeling torn apart between the will to lead an ascetic Christian life and the will to continue his previous, sexually active life. Though he identifies with the former, better will rather than with the latter that actually torments him, he is unable to opt for it because of his bad habits, which he once acquired voluntarily but which have by now transformed into a kind of addictive necessity (ib. 8.10–12). Earlier philosophical traditions would have interpreted this “akratic” state as a conflict of reason and desire, and Manichean dualism would have attributed Augustine’s bad will to an evil substance present in but foreign to the soul, but Augustine insists that both wills were indeed his own. Using medical metaphors reminiscent of Hellenistic moral philosophy, he argues that his will lacked the power of free choice because the disease of being divided between conflicting volitions had weakened it (ib. 8.19; 21). His ability to choose is only restored when, in the garden scene at the end of the book, his will is reintegrated and healed by God’s call, which immediately frees him to opt for the ascetic life (ib. 8.29–30). Before, when he had just continued his habitual way of life, this had been a non-choice rather than a choice, even though, as Augustine insists, he had done so voluntarily. In substance, this remained his line of defense when, in the Pelagian controversy, he was confronted with the charge that his doctrine of grace abolished free will (De spiritu et littera 52–60; cf. De correptione et gratia 6). While the Pelagians thought that the principle of alternative possibilities was indispensable for human responsibility and divine justice, Augustine accepts that principle only for the first humans in paradise (Contra Iulianum opus imperfectum 1.47; 5.28; 5.40–42 etc.). In a way, by choosing wrongly Adam and Eve have abandoned free will both for themselves and for all humankind. Original sin transformed our initial ability not to sin into an inability not to sin; grace can restore ability not to sin in this life and will transform it into inability to sin in the next (De civitate dei 22.30; De correptione et gratia 33).

7.5 Will and Evil

Augustine’s notion of will is closely related to his thinking on evil. The problem of the origin of evil (unde malum), he claims, had haunted him from his youth (Confessiones 7.7). At first, he accepted the dualist solution of the Manicheans, which freed God from the responsibility for evil but compromised his omnipotence (ib. 3.12; 7.3). After having encountered the books of the Platonists, Augustine rejected the existence of an evil substance and endorsed the Neoplatonic view (argued, e.g., in Plotinus, Enneads I.8) that evil is in fact unsubstantial and a privation or corruption of goodness. In his mature view, which was largely developed during his anti-Manichean polemics, everything that has being is good insofar as it has been created by God. There are of course different degrees of goodness as well as of being (Letter 18.2), but everything that is real is good “in its degree”, and the hierarchical order of reality is itself a good creation of God (Bouton-Touboulic 2004). Augustine therefore rejects Plotinus’ view that prime matter is equivalent to prime evil, because the formlessness of matter is not pure negativity but a positive, and hence divinely created, capacity to receive forms (Confessiones 12.6; see 10. Creation and Time). A created being can be said to be evil if and only if it falls short of its natural goodness by being corrupted or vitiated; strictly speaking, only corruption itself is evil, whereas the nature or substance or essence (for the equivalence of the terms see De moribus 2.2) of the thing itself remains good (Confessiones 7.18; Contra epistulam fundamenti 35.39 etc.; for a systematic account, De natura boni 1–23; Schäfer 2002: 219–239). While this theory can explain physical evil relatively easily either as a necessary feature of hierarchically ordered (corporeal) reality (De ordine 2.51), as a just punishment of sin, or as part of God’s pedagogy of salvation (Letter 138.14), it leaves open the question of moral evil or sin itself. Augustine answers by equating moral evil with evil will and claims that the seemingly natural question of what causes evil will is unanswerable. His most sustained argument to this effect is found in his explanation of the fall of the devil and the evil angels, a case that, being the very first occurrence of evil in the created world, allows him to analyze the problem in its most abstract terms (De civitate dei 12.1–9; cf. already De libero arbitrio 3.37–49; Schäfer 2002: 242–300; MacDonald 1999). The cause can neither be a substance (which, qua substance, is good and unable to cause anything evil) nor a will (which would in turn have to be an evil will in need of explanation). Therefore, an evil will has no “efficient” but only a “deficient” cause, which is none other than the will’s spontaneous defection from God. The fact that evil agents are created from nothing and hence are not, unlike God, intrinsically unable to sin is a necessary condition of evil but not a sufficient one (after all the good angels successfully kept their good will). In this context Augustine, in an interesting thought experiment, imagines two persons of equal intellectual and emotional disposition of whom one gives in to a temptation while the other resists it; from this he concludes that the difference must be due to a free, spontaneous and irreducible choice of the will (De civitate dei 12.6). Here at least Augustine virtually posits the will as an independent mental faculty.

7.6 Grace, Predestination and Original Sin

From the Middle Ages onwards, Augustine’s theology of grace has been regarded as the heart of his Christian teaching, and with good reason. As he points out himself, his conviction that human beings in their present condition are unable to do or even to will the good by their own efforts is his most fundamental disagreement with ancient, especially Stoic, virtue ethics (De civitate dei 19.4; Wolterstorff 2012). After and because of the disobedience of Adam and Eve, we have lost our natural ability of self-determination, which can only be repaired and restored by the divine grace that has manifested itself in the incarnation and sacrifice of Christ and works inwardly to free our will from its enslavement to sin. Confession of sins and humility are, therefore, basic Christian virtues and attitudes; the philosophers’ confidence in their own virtue that prevents them from accepting the grace of Christ is an example of the sinful pride that puts the self in the place of God and was at the core of the evil angels’ primal sin (De civitate dei 10.29).

The main inspiration for Augustine’s doctrine of grace is, of course, Paul (even though remarks on human weakness and divine help are not absent from the ancient philosophical tradition and especially from Platonism which had had a strong religious side from the beginning; Augustine claims that with such utterances the Platonists inadvertently “confess” grace, cf. De civitate dei 10.29; 22.22). The radical view that the gifts of grace include not only external good works and the internal volitional disposition that allows us to perform them but even the very first beginnings of faith—in later technical terminology: that grace is not “cooperative” but radically “prevenient”—is however his own, and it took several years to take shape in his thought. There is some debate on the stages of this development (for diverging reconstructions, see Karfíková 2012; Cary 2008a; Drecoll 2004–2010; Drecoll 1999; emphasis on the shifts in Augustine’s thinking: Lettieri 2001; Flasch 1995; emphasis on continuity: C. Harrison 2006), but it is generally agreed that Augustine’s doctrine of grace reached its mature form c. 395–397 with Ad Simplicianum 1.2, after several years of intense reading and exegesis of Paul, and gained higher profile during the Pelagian controversy after 412. Augustine emphasizes the necessity of grace for both intellectual understanding and moral purification already in his earliest works (cf. esp. Soliloquia 1.2–6), but seems to have been concerned to leave room for human initiative at least with respect to faith and will (which would be in line with his concern, prominent throughout the 390s, to safeguard human responsibility against Manichean fatalism). In his early exegesis of Paul, he explains God’s apparently gratuitous election of Jacob and rejection of Esau (Romans 9:10–13) with God’s foreknowledge of Jacob’s faith and Esau’s infidelity (De diversis quaestionibus 68.5; Expositio quarundam propositionum ex epistula apostoli ad Romanos 60), a “synergistic” reading that relies on the assumption that salvation results from the cooperation of divine grace and human initiative and that had been standard in early Christianity since Origen. This explanation is explicitly rejected in Ad Simplicianum (1.2.5–6; 8; 11). In this pivotal text, Augustine, true to his program of “faith seeking understanding”, attempts an exegesis of Romans 9:9–29 that satisfies the philosophical requirements of God’s justice and benevolence while taking seriously the Pauline point that God’s election is entirely gratuitous and not occasioned by any human merit. The guiding intention of Romans 9, Augustine now says, is to preclude vainglory and pride (ib. 1.2.2) rather than to safeguard human responsibility (as had been his view in Expositio quarundam propositionum ex epistula apostoli ad Romanos 13–18; cf. John Chrysostom, Homilies on Romans, PG 60.559). Augustine rehearses all possible reasons for God’s election of Jacob—his good works, his good will, his faith and God’s foreknowledge of each—and discounts them all as amounting to an election from merit rather than from grace. Starting from the primordial willingness to heed God’s call to faith, then, everything that is good in Jacob must be considered a gift of divine grace. Free will has nothing to do with the reception of that gift because nobody can will to receive a divine call to faith nor to respond positively to it so as to act accordingly and perform good works out of love (Ad Simplicianum 1.2.21; for the Stoically-inspired theory of agency behind this see 7.4 Will and Freedom). While gratuitous election is, apart from being consoling, comparatively easily squared with the axioms of divine benevolence, justice and omnipotence, its corollary, the equally gratuitous reprobation and damnation of Esau, is a serious philosophical problem (ib. 1.2.8). If it is not to violate the principle of God’s justice, it obliges us to assume some kind of evil in Esau, which is however excluded by Paul’s explicit statement to the contrary (Romans 9:11). Augustine’s solution is his doctrine of original sin. Both Jacob and Esau have inherited Adam’s guilt that his sin has spread over all humankind—a debt that God remits for Jacob but exacts from Esau for reasons that, Augustine admits, necessarily elude human understanding but are certainly just. Since the Fall, humankind is nothing but a “lump of sin” that God might justly have damned as a whole but from which he has chosen to save some individuals and to transform them into “vessels of mercy” (ib. 1.2.16, cf. Romans 9:23). The notion of original sin was not invented by Augustine but had a tradition in African Christianity, especially in Tertullian. The view that original sin is a personally imputable guilt that justifies eternal damnation is, however, new with Ad Simplicianum and follows with logical necessity from the exegetical and philosophical claims made there about divine grace and election (Flasch 1995; contrast De libero arbitrio 3.52–55). The theory of Ad Simplicianum is illustrated, with great philosophical acumen and psychological plausibility, in the Confessiones (especially bk. 8) and remains in place during the Pelagian controversy till the end of Augustine’s life. Curiously, however, there are passages even in his anti-Pelagian work that seem aimed at safeguarding freedom of choice and, accordingly, admit of a “synergistic” reading (De spiritu et littera 60; Cary 2008a: 82–86 and, for a different interpretation, Drecoll 2004–2010: 207–208). After 412, pressed by his Pelagian opponents, Augustine paid increasing attention to the mechanics of the transmission of original sin. The result was a quasi-biological theory that associated original sin closely with sexual concupiscence (see 9. Gender, Women and Sexuality).

An obvious implication of Augustine’s theory of grace and election is predestination, a subject prominent in his last treatises against the Pelagians (e.g., De praedestinatione sanctorum, written after 426) but already implied in Ad Simplicianum. God decides “before the constitution of the world” (Ephesians 1:4), i.e., (in Neoplatonic terms) in the non-temporal way that matches his transcendent, eternal being (De civitate dei 11.21; see also 10. Creation and Time), who will be exempted from the damnation that awaits fallen humankind and who will not (“double predestination”). This knowledge is however hidden to human beings, to whom it will only be revealed at the end of times (De correptione et gratia 49). Until then, nobody, not even a baptized Christian, can be sure whether grace has given her true faith and a good will and, if so, whether she will persevere in it till the end of her life so as to be actually saved (De correptione et gratia 10–25; cf. 7.3 Love). Like the Stoic determinists before him, Augustine was confronted with the objection that his doctrine of predestination made all human activity pointless (“Lazy Argument”). While in Hellenism this had largely been a theoretical issue, it acquired practical relevance under the circumstances of monastic life: some North African monks objected to being rebuked for their misbehavior with the argument that they were not responsible for not (yet) enjoying the gift of divine grace (De correptione et gratia 6). Taking up ideas from De magistro and from Ad Simplicianum, Augustine replies that rebuke may work as an external admonition, even as a divine calling, that helps people turn to God inwardly and hence must not be withheld (De correptione et gratia 7–9). To the query that predestination undermines free will, Augustine gives his usual answer that our freedom of choice has been damaged by original sin and must be liberated by grace if we are to develop the good will necessary for virtue and happiness. The medieval and modern debate on whether grace is “irresistible” is, therefore, to some extent un-Augustinian (cf. Wetzel 1992: 197–206); some, especially later, texts do however present prevenient grace as converting the will with coercive force (Contra duas epistulas Pelagianorum 1.36–37; cf. already Ad Simplicianum 1.2.22; Cary 2008a: 105–110). A problem related to predestination but not equivalent to it is divine foreknowledge (Matthews 2005: 96–104; Wetzel 2001; for general discussion, Zagzebski 1991). Augustine inherits it from the Hellenistic discussion on future contingents and logical determinism that is best documented in Cicero’s De fato. His solution is that while external actions may be determined, inner volitions are not. These are certainly foreknown by God but exactly as what they are, i.e., as ours and as volitions and not as external compulsions (De civitate dei 5.9–10; cf. De libero arbitrio 3.4–11). This argument is independent of the doctrine of grace and original sin; it applies not just to fallen humankind but also to Adam and Eve and even to the devil, whose transgression God had, of course, foreseen (De civitate dei 11.17; 14.11).

8. History and Political Philosophy

Augustine’s City of God is not a treatise of political or social philosophy. It is an extended plea designed to persuade people “to enter the city of God or to persist in it” (Letter 2*.3). The criterion of membership in the city of God (a metaphor Augustine takes from the Psalms, cf. Psalm 86:3 quoted, e.g., in De civitate dei 11.1) and its antagonist, the earthly city, is right or wrong love. A person belongs to the city of God if and only if he directs his love towards God even at the expense of self-love, and he belongs to the earthly city or city of the devil if and only if he postpones love of God for self-love, proudly making himself his greatest good (De civitate dei 14.28). The main argument of the work is that true happiness, which is sought by every human being (ib. 10.1), cannot be found outside the city of God founded by Christ (cf. ib. 1, prologue). The first ten books deconstruct, in a manner reminiscent of traditional Christian apologetics, the alternative conceptions of happiness in the Roman political tradition (which equates happiness with the prosperity of the Empire, thus falling prey to evil demons who posed as the defenders of Rome but in fact ruined it morally and politically) and in Greek, especially Platonic, philosophy (which, despite its insight into the true nature of God, failed to accept the mediation of Christ incarnate out of pride and turned to false mediators, i.e., deceptive demons; bks. 8–10 have an interesting disquisition on Platonic demonology). Augustine’s approach in the second, positive half is Scriptural, creationist and eschatological; this fact accounts for the specific character of its historical dimension. The history of the two cities begins with the creation of the world and the defection of the devil and the sin of Adam and Eve (bks. 11–14; Wetzel 2012; Lagouanère 2023/24); it continues with the providentially-governed vicissitudes of the People of Israel (the first earthly representative of the city of God) and, after the coming of Christ, of the Church (bks. 15–17, supplemented by a survey of the concurrent secular history from the earliest Eastern empires to contemporary Rome in bk. 18); and it ends with the final destination (finis, to be understood both ethically as “ultimate goal” and eschatologically as “end of times”) of the two cities in eternal damnation and eternal bliss (bks. 19–22; for the structure and basic ideas of the City of God see O’Daly 1999). To a great extent, Augustine’s approach is exegetical; for him, the history of the city of God is, in substance, sacred history as laid down in Scripture (Markus 1970: 1–21). Obviously, however, the heavenly and earthly cities must not be confounded with the worldly institutions of the church and the state. In history, each of these, and the Church in particular, is a mixed body in which members of the city of God and the earthly city coexist, their distinction being clear only to God, who will separate the two cities at the end of times (ib. 1.35; 10.32 etc.). While the city of God is a stranger or, at best, a resident alien (peregrinus: ib. 15.1; 15.15) in this world and yearns for its celestial homeland, the earthly city is not a unified body at all but lies in continuous strife with itself because it is dominated by lust for power, the most widespread form of the archetypal sin of pride in political and social life (ib. 18.2). All this is in agreement with Augustine’s ideas on predestination and grace; the history of the two cities is essentially the history of fallen humanity. This dualistic account is however qualified when, in the part of the work that moves closest to social philosophy, Augustine analyzes the attitude a Christian ought to adopt to the earthly society she inevitably lives in during her existence in this world. Starting, again, from the axiom that all human beings naturally desire what is good for them, he innovatively determines the goal that every individual and every community in fact pursues as “peace” (pax), which, in his view, is largely equivalent with natural order and subordination. There are higher and lesser degrees of both individual and collective peace, e.g., the control of the emotions through reason, the subordination of body to soul, the subordination of children to parents in the family or a functioning hierarchical order in the state; at the top is “peace with God” or the subordination of the human mind to God (ib. 19.13; Weissenberg 2005). The lower forms of peace are relative goods and, as such, legitimately pursued as long as they are not mistaken for the absolute good. Political peace and order is sought by members of the city of God and the earthly city alike, but whereas the latter “enjoy” it because it is the greatest good they can attain and conceive of, the former “use” it for the sake of their peace with God, i.e., in order that they and others may enjoy an unhindered Christian religious life (ib. 19.17; 19.26; for “enjoyment” and “use” see 7.1 Happiness). Political peace is thus morally neutral insofar as it is a goal common to Christians and non-Christians. Augustine criticizes Cicero because he included justice in his definition of the state (Cicero, De re publica 1.39) and thereby gave the earthly state an inherent moral quality that in reality is the privilege of the city of God (De civitate dei 19.21; Salamito 2021, with a critique of the notion of “political Augustinianism”). He himself prefers a more pragmatic definition that makes the consensus about a common object of “love” (i.e., a common good agreed on by all members of the community) the criterion of a state; the moral evaluation is not a matter of the definition but depends on the evaluation of the goal it pursues (cf. 7.3 Love). The early Roman Empire, which strove for glory, was more tolerable than the Oriental empires that were driven by naked lust for power; the best imaginable goal pursued by an earthly society would be perfect earthly peace (ib. 19.24; Weithman 2001: 243–4). Christians are allowed and even called to work for the well-being of the societies they live in as long as they promote earthly peace for the sake of their citizens’ and their own true happiness; in practice, this will usually mean furthering Christian religion (ib. 5.25–6, on the Christian emperors Constantine and Theodosius; Letter 155.12; 16; Dodaro 2004b; Tornau 2013; Preuß 2022: 45–137). But the doctrine of the two cities deliberately precludes any promotion of the emperor or the empire to a providential and quasi-sacred rank. Not even Christians in power will be able to overcome the inherent wretchedness of fallen humanity (De civitate dei 19.6). Like the vast majority of ancient Christian theologians, Augustine has little or no interest in social reform. Slavery, meaning unnatural domination of humans over humans, is a characteristic stain of postlapsarian human life and, at the same time, an evil that is put to good effects when it secures social order (ib. 19.15; Rist 1994: 236–239). War results from sin and is the privileged means of satisfying lust for power (ib. 18.2; 19.7). Nevertheless, Augustine wrote a letter to refute the claim that Christianity advocated a politically impracticable pacifism (Letter 138; Tornau 2019). His Christian reinterpretation of the traditional Roman Just War Theory should be read in the framework of his general theory of virtue and peace (Holmes 1999). To be truly just according to Augustinian standards, a war would have to be waged for the benefit of the adversary and without any vindictiveness, in short, out of love of neighbor, which, in a fallen world, seems utopian (Letter 138.14). Wars may however be relatively just if they are defensive and properly declared (cf. Cicero, De officiis 1.36–37) or commanded by a just authority even short of the special case of the wars of the People of Israel that were commanded by God himself (Contra Faustum 22.74–78).

9. Gender, Women, and Sexuality

Outright misogyny is rare in Augustine, but he lived in a society and worked from a tradition—both Greco-Roman and Judeo-Christian—that took the natural and social subordination of women to men largely for granted (cf. Børresen 2013: 135 and, for a sketch of the social and familial realities of late-antique Roman Africa, Rist 1994: 210–213; 246–247). Augustine interprets the Genesis tale of the creation of woman (Genesis 2:18–22) to mean that, Eve having been created as a helper to Adam and for the sake of reproduction, she was subordinate to him already in paradise (De Genesi ad litteram 6.5.7; 9.5.9). This situation is exacerbated by the Fall; under the conditions of fallen humankind, marriage is, for the wives, a kind of slavery that they should accept with obedience and humility (as Monnica did; cf. Confessiones 9.19–20 and, on marriage in Augustine in general, E. Clark 1996). In his early anti-Manichean exegesis of Genesis, he allegorizes man as the rational and woman as the non-rational, appetitive parts of the soul (De Genesi contra Manichaeos 2.15, cf. De vera religione 78; De Genesi ad litteram 8.23.44; the pattern is well attested in the philosophical tradition). On the other hand, he insists—as until then few Christian theologians had done—that the meaning of the Genesis tale was not purely allegorical but that sexual differentiation had begun to exist in paradise and would persist in the resurrected bodies of the blessed because it was a natural part of God’s creation (De civitate dei 22.17). Following the Greek philosophical (in particular, Platonic) conviction that the soul and especially its highest, intellectual part is not gendered as well as the Pauline eschatological promise that in Christ “there is neither male nor female” (Galatians 3:28), Augustine argues that the words of Genesis 1:26–27 on the human being having been created in the image of God imply that woman is human like man because she has an intellectual soul and because it is not the gendered body but the intellectual soul that makes the human being an image of God (De Genesi ad litteram 3.22.34; Børresen 2013: 136–137; cf. also 6.2 The Human Mind as an Image of God; the view that woman is made in the image of God is far from uncontroversial in ancient Christianity). The inner tension of the view that woman is intellectually equal and, at the same time, by nature socially inferior to man makes itself felt in Augustine’s exegesis of Paul’s saying that women, but not men, should veil themselves because man is made in the image of God (1 Corinthians 11:7). Augustine compares man with theoretical and woman (the “helper” of Genesis 2:18) with practical reason and claims that while theoretical and practical reason together or reason in its entirety is an image of God just as the human being as such is, in virtue of its reason, an image of God, practical reason alone, being directed toward corporeal things and but a “helper” of theoretical reason, is not. (By implication, woman is an image of God qua human being, but not qua woman.) The practice enjoined by Paul is meant to signify this difference (De trinitate 12.10–13). This exegesis safeguards the godlikeness of woman against a widespread patristic consensus and, it appears, against Paul himself, but at the same time defends social inequality and even endows it with metaphysical and religious significance (Stark 2007a).

Two women figure prominently in Augustine’s literary output (Power 1995; G. Clark 2015): his mother, Monnica (her name appears only in Confessiones 9.37), and his partner for fourteen years, the mother of Adeodatus. In the dialogues of Cassiciacum, Monnica represents a philosophical way of life based on the natural intuitions of reason and on an unshakable Christian faith together with a life according to the precepts of Christian morality (De beata vita 10; De ordine 1.31–32). She, and the uneducated but faithful in general, may not be able to reach happiness in this life by means of an ascent to the divine with the help of the liberal arts, but they will certainly see God “from face to face” in eternal bliss (De ordine 2.45–46). Behind this idealization may be the male Christian philosopher’s nostalgic desire for a “natural” holiness untainted by secular occupation and learning (Brown 1988: ch. 13, on the Greek theologians and bishops of the fourth century). Monnica’s prominence and idealization in the Confessiones has provoked much, and mostly fruitless, psychological speculation. Augustine represents her influence on his religious life as pervasive from his earliest years onwards and even compares her to the Mother Church (Confessiones 1.17). She embodies ideal Christian love of the neighbor (see 7.3 Love) in that she furthers Augustine’s Catholic faith with all her means (mostly, tears and prayer) and never indulges his Manicheism despite her motherly affection (e.g., Confessiones 3.19). With this she however combines, especially in the earlier books, more mundane motives, e.g., when she arranges a marriage for Augustine in the hope of both fencing his sexual concupiscence and assisting his worldly career (ib. 6.23). Like the other human influences on Augustine reported in the Confessiones, she is used by God as an instrument of his grace in a way she neither foresees nor wills. Only after Augustine’s conversion does she rise to saintly perfection, especially in the “vision of Ostia” when, shortly before her death, mother and son, after a long philosophico-theological conversation, reach a sudden insight into what contemplation of the transcendent God in eternal bliss must be like (ib. 9.24–25; Dupont & Stróżyński 2018). The chapter on the dismissal of Adeodatus’ mother for the sake of an advantageous marriage (ib. 6.25; Shanzer 2002; Miles 2007) has been unpalatable for many modern readers. Yet what is unusual about it is not Augustine’s behavior but the fact that he mentions it at all and, from hindsight, reflects on the pain it caused him. True to the deliberately counter-intuitive and often provocative procedure of the Confessiones, he singles out an emotion that, then as now, most people would have easily understood but which he nevertheless interprets as a mark of his sinful state because it resulted from the loss of a female body he had, in a kind of mutual sexual exploitation, enjoyed for the sake of pleasure (Confessiones 4.2; for the underlying defective view, common in antiquity, of erotic relationships cf. Rist 1994: 249) instead of “enjoying” his female neighbor “in God” and relating their mutual love to him (cf. 7.1 Happiness; compare Augustine’s excessive grief about the friend of his youth in Confessiones 4.9–11 and contrast his post-conversion mourning of Monnica, ib. 9.30–33).

Augustine’s views on sexuality are most prominent in his anti-Pelagian treatises, where he develops a theory about the transmission of original sin from the first couple in paradise to every human being born since, making sexual concupiscence the prime factor in the process (cf. E. Clark 1996 and 2000, who also takes into account Augustine’s Manichean past). In Augustine’s ethics, concupiscence (concupiscentia) does not have a specifically sexual meaning but is an umbrella term that covers all volitions or intentions opposed to right love (see Nisula 2012). The transgression of Adam and Eve did not consist in sexual concupiscence but in their disobedience, which, like the evil angels’ primal sin, was rooted in pride (see 7.5 Will and Evil). For this disobedience they, and all humankind with them, were punished with the disobedience of their own selves, i.e., the impossibility of fully controlling their own appetites and volitions and the permanent akratic state (the “coveting of the flesh against the spirit”, in the words of Galatians 5:17) that marks fallen humanity. The inability of human beings to control their sexual desires and even their sexual organs (witness the shameful experiences of involuntary male erection or of impotence: De civitate dei 14.15–16) is just an especially obvious example. Unlike most earlier Christian writers, Augustine thought that there was sexual intercourse in paradise and that there would have been procreation even without the fall; he did not share the encratic ideas of some ascetic circles who hoped to make good for the first sin through sexual abstinence, and he had comparatively moderate views on virginity and sexual continence (De sancta virginitate; Børresen 2013: 138; Brown 1988: ch. 19). But he thought that Adam and Eve had been able to control their sexual organs voluntarily so as to limit their use to the natural purpose of procreation; in paradise, there had been sexuality but no concupiscence (De civitate dei 14.21–23). Original sin had destroyed this ideal state, and since then sexual concupiscence is an inevitable concomitant of procreation—an evil that may be put to good use in legitimate marriage, where the purpose of sexual intercourse is the procreation of children rather than bodily pleasure (De nuptiis et concupiscentia 1.16; Contra Iulianum 3.15–16), but that nevertheless subjects every newborn human being to the domination of the devil from which they need to be freed through baptism (De nuptiis et concupiscentia 1.25–26; for energetic criticism of Augustine’s views on concupiscence, inter alia because of their impact on the sex morals of modern Christianity, see Pagels 1989, for moderate defense Lamberigts 2000).

10. Creation and Time

Just as the late-antique Platonists developed their cosmological thinking by commenting on Plato’s Timaeus, Augustine’s natural philosophy is largely a theory of creation based on an exegesis of the opening chapters of Genesis, on which he wrote five extended, and occasionally diverging, commentaries (De Genesi contra Manichaeos; De Genesi ad litteram liber imperfectus; Confessiones 11–13; De Genesi ad litteram; De civitate dei 11–14). The longest and most important of them is the Literal Commentary on Genesis (De Genesi ad litteram). “Literal” does not mean “literalist” but denotes the hermeneutic assumption that the text is really about the creation of the world (as opposed to a moralist or prophetic allegorical reading of the kind proposed in Augustine’s early De Genesi contra Manichaeos; the two approaches are compatible because Augustine, like Origen and the Jewish exegete Philo before him, believes in the existence of multiple layers of meaning in Scripture; see De Genesi ad litteram 1.1.1 and, in general, De doctrina christiana, bk. 3; on the exegetic principles of De Genesi ad litteram, Drews 2022). In line with his epistemology of illumination and his theory of verbal signs, Augustine takes the biblical creation tale as an “admonition” that prompts him to devise, with the help of the “inner teacher”, a rational theistic cosmology based on Trinitarian theology (for rejection of explanations that contradict the findings of the natural philosophers or the laws of nature cf., e.g., De Genesi ad litteram 2.9.21). In De Genesi ad litteram, in the Confessiones and, to a lesser extent, in De civitate dei Augustine presents his exegesis in a questioning manner and keeps the results open to revision. The reason is that, according to the hermeneutics developed especially in bk. 12 of the Confessiones, the authorial intention of the Scriptural text, or indeed of any text, cannot be recovered, so that—given that the truthfulness of Scripture can be taken for granted—different and even incompatible readings must be considered as adequate if they agree with what the text says and if they are sanctioned by the truth which we access inwardly through reason and which is, ultimately, God himself (see esp. Confessiones 12.27; 43; De doctrina christiana 3.38 where Augustine claims that the Holy Spirit providentially allowed for a plenitude of Scriptural meanings in order to prompt different people to different aspects of the truth; Williams 2001; van Riel 2007; Dutton 2014: 175–179; and, on the metaphysical and epistemological foundations of this hermeneutics, Cary 2008b: 135–138; Drews 2022: 9–24). The basic and recurrent features of Augustine’s cosmological thought are these (cf. Knuuttila 2001: 103–109; Mayer 1996–2002, each with references): God does not create in time but creates time together with changeable being while resting in timeless eternity himself (Confessiones 11.16; De Genesi ad litteram 5.5.12; the distinction of eternity and time is Platonic, cf. Timaeus 37c-38b; Plotinus, Enneads III.7.1). Creation occurs instantaneously; the seven days of creation are not to be taken literally but are a didactic means to make plain the intrinsic order of reality (Confessiones 12.40; De Genesi ad litteram 1.15.29). Like the demiurge in the Timaeus, God creates out of goodness, i.e., out of his good will and his gratuitous love for his creation (De civitate dei 11.24). In creation, all three persons of the Trinity are active, with, roughly, the Father accounting for the existence, the Son (to whom, in Augustine’s reading, the opening words of Genesis, in principio, refer) for the form or essence and the Holy Spirit for the goodness and orderliness of every created being (Confessiones 11.11; De civitate dei 11.24). As the causality of the Trinity makes itself felt everywhere in creation, Augustine likes to describe created beings in their relation to the divine cause in a triadic manner, using, e.g., the categories “measure”, “form” and “peace/order” (e.g., De vera religione 13; De natura boni 3; De civitate dei 12.5; cf. Schäfer 2000 and, for a very thorough discussion, du Roy 1966). These “traces” of the Trinity in creation must not be confused with the Trinitarian structure of the human intellect, which, alone among all created beings, is an image of God. Changeable being is not generated from God (which, according to the Nicene Creed, is true only of the Son) but created out of nothing, a fact that partly accounts for its susceptibility for evil. More precisely, God “first” creates formless matter out of nothing (which is why matter in Augustine, unlike in the Neoplatonists, has a minimal ontological status; cf. Confessiones 12.6; Tornau 2014: 189–194) and “then” forms it by conveying to it the rational principles (rationes; cf. Catapano 2022) that eternally exist in his mind (De diversis quaestionibus 46.2) or, as Augustine prefers to put it, in his Word, i.e., the Second Person of the Trinity. This formative process is Augustine’s exegesis of the biblical “word” of God (Genesis 1:1 and John 1:1). Incorporeal and purely intellectual beings, i.e., the angels, are created from intelligible matter which is created out of nothing and converted to the creator so as to be formed through the “hearing” of God’s word, i.e., by their contemplation of the Forms contained in God (De Genesi ad litteram 1.4.9–1.5.11, an idea inspired by the Neoplatonic pattern of abiding, procession and return). Corporeal being is created when the Forms or rational principles contained in God and contemplated by the angels are even further externalized so as to inform not only intelligible but also physical matter (De Genesi ad litteram 2.8.16; 4.22.39; for a thorough account of matter in Augustine’s exegeses of Genesis, Moro 2017).

All this is the framework of Augustine’s famous meditation about time in the Confessiones (11.17–41), whose context is an exegesis of Genesis and which constantly presupposes the distinction of time and eternity (much has been written on this text, but particularly illuminating treatments are Flasch 1993; Mesch 1998: 295–343; Matthews 2005: 76–85; Helm 2014; Hoffmann 2017; for a concise introduction, Karfíková 2020). Augustine opens the section with the question, “What is time?” (Confessiones 11.17) but in fact has no intention of giving a definition of time. Whereas his accounts outside the Confessiones center on cosmic or physical time, he here focuses on how we experience time from a first-person perspective and what it means for us and our relationship to ourselves and to God to exist temporally. In this sense, the purpose of the book is ethical rather than cosmological. Augustine begins by observing that though of the three familiar “parts” of time, past, present and future, none really exists (the past having ceased to exist, the future not existing yet, and the present being without extension), time doubtless has reality for us. This is so because time is present to us in the form of our present memory of the past, our present attention to the present and our present expectation of the future (ib. 11.26). The phenomenal proof of this claim is the experience of measuring time by comparing remembered or expected portions of time to each other or of repeating a poem we know by heart, when, as we proceed, the words traverse our attention (the present), passing from expectation (the future) to memory (the past; ib. 11.38). We would thus be unable to relate past, present and future events, to remember the history of our own lives and even to be aware of our personal identity if our being in time was not divided into memory, attention and expectation and, at the same time, unified by the connectedness and the simultaneous presence of these. This ambivalent state Augustine calls “a distention of the soul” (ib. 11.33; 38–39, perhaps echoing Plotinus, Enneads III.7.11.41); this is the closest Confessiones 11 comes to a definition of time. The stability of this precarious unity is however dependent on the higher unity of the eternal God—as the whole narrative of the Confessiones teaches, we cannot make sense of the memory of our life unless we perceive the ceaseless presence of God’s providence and grace in it. Toward the end of the book, Augustine introduces the Pauline “straining forward to what lies ahead” (Philippians 3:12–14)—as he reads it, the orientation or “intention” of the soul toward God—as a counterpoint to the soul’s distention in time and concludes with an exhortation to turn from the dispersion of temporal existence to the timeless eternity of God which alone guarantees truth and stability (ib. 11.39–41).

11. Legacy

Augustine’s impact on later philosophy is as enormous as it is ambivalent (for an overview, see Fuhrer 2018a: 1742–1750; for all questions of detail, Pollmann (ed.) 2013; for De trinitate, Kany 2007). Although he was soon accepted as a theological authority and consensus with him was regarded as a standard of orthodoxy throughout the Middle Ages and beyond, his views—or more precisely, the right way of interpreting them—continued to trigger controversies. In the ninth century the monk Gottschalk took Augustine’s doctrine of grace to imply double predestination (a term coined by him); he was opposed by John Scotus Eriugena. The philosophical discourse of early scholasticism (11th–12th centuries) largely centered on Augustinian themes. Anselm’s proof of the existence of God develops the argument of De libero arbitrio, bk. 2; his theory of freedom systematizes Augustine’s thinking about will, freedom and grace (Goebel 2019). The ethicists’ debates on will and conscience rest on the assumptions of Augustine’s moral intentionalism, and Abelard’s view that ethics is universal and applicable to both human and divine agency may be read as a response to the problems in Augustine’s theory of divine election. With the growing influence of Aristotle from the thirteenth century onwards, Augustine came to be interpreted in Aristotelian terms that had largely been unknown to himself. Thomas Aquinas and others had little interest in Augustine’s Platonism, and there was a certain tension between the medieval tendency to look for a teachable philosophical and theological system in his texts and his own way of philosophical inquiry that was shaped by the ancient tradition and left room for tentative argument and was open to revision. Medieval political Augustinianism projected the conflict of the Two Cities onto the Church and the State. Martin Luther (1483–1546) agrees with Augustine on the absolute gratuitousness of grace but does not follow the Augustinian (and scholastic) ideal of intellectus fidei and makes faith in the Gospel the decisive condition of salvation. In his debate with Erasmus on free will, he voices a quite Augustinian pessimism about human freedom. The variety of Protestantism that was inaugurated by Jean Calvin (1509–1564) accepts double predestination. In the seventeenth century Descartes’ cogito was soon recognized as an Augustinian idea and triggered a refreshed interest in Augustine’s epistemology. In the same epoch, the Jansenist movement put forward a radical interpretation of Augustine’s theology of grace and justification that was fiercely combated by the Catholic Church. In the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, the leading philosophers of Enlightenment, German Idealism and Romanticism showed little interest in Augustine, and even, in the case of Nietzsche, outright contempt. He remained, however, an important figure in Neoscholasticism or Neothomism, a philosophical reaction of Catholic philosophers against Enlightenment and Idealism which continued to inform Catholic theological scholarship on Augustine till the 1950s and beyond. In the twentieth century, Augustine’s philosophy of time (Confessiones 11) received enormous and unprecedented philosophical attention from thinkers like Edmund Husserl (1859–1938), Martin Heidegger (1889–1976) and Paul Ricœur (1913–2005), some of whom credited Augustine with their own subjectivist understanding of time. Hannah Arendt (1906–1975) wrote her doctoral dissertation on Augustine’s philosophy of love and blamed him, not uncommonly for her epoch, for degrading love of neighbor to an instrument of personal happiness. Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951) takes issue with what he considers Augustine’s view of language and language acquisition throughout his analysis of language in the Philosophical Investigations. Postmodernist thinkers (Jean-Luc Marion, John Milbank) have set Augustine’s notion of self, in which love is perceived as an integral part, against the purported egoism and isolation of the Cartesian subject, which is considered the hallmark and, as it were, the birth defect of modernity (for a non-Cartesian reading of Augustine that addresses postmodernist worries, see Drever 2013). Augustinian liberalism is a strand of contemporary (mainly English-speaking) political theology exploring the adaptability of Augustine’s ethical and anthropological thought to modern democratic ideas (Menke 2023; Lamb 2022). Postcolonial approaches, Black and African theology have developed diverse perspectives and evaluations, highlighting either Augustine’s African identity or reading him as a representative of Roman imperialism/colonialism (Wilhite 2013; on Augustine in colonial and postcolonial texts from the Maghreb, Gronemann 2021). Augustine’s early dialogues, with their inclusion of women, teenagers, and illiterate people, have appealed to the “Philosophy for All” movement (Kenyon 2021). While contemporary Western culture has little sympathy for Augustine’s yearning for an inner divine light or for his less than optimistic views about human autonomy and the secular, the richness of his thought continues to fascinate readers.


Bibliographical tools


Bulletin Augustinien, included in the second issue of each year of the Revue d’Études Augustiniennes et Patristiques. Reports and reviews all publications on Augustine that appeared during the year.

Finding Augustine, an open access bibliographical collection on Augustine and his legacy produced by the Augustinian Historical Institute (Leuven, Belgium) and Villanova University.

More specialized:

Catapano, Giovanni, L’idea di filosofia in Agostino. Guida bibliografica, Padova: Il Poligrafo, 2000.

–––, 2021a, “Augustine”, in Duncan Pritchard (ed.), Oxford Bibliographies Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/obo/9780195396577-0422

Lazcano, Rafael, 2007, Bibliografía de San Agustín en lengua española (1502–2006), Guadarrama (Madrid): Editorial Revista Agustiniana.

–––, 2021, “Boletín bibliográfico de San Agustín en castellano (2007–2020)”, Ciudad de Dios. Revista Agustiniana, 234: 1031–1077.


Today critical editions of most of Augustine’s works are available. Almost all the books, the complete letters and a considerable portion of the sermons have been edited in the series

  • [CSEL] Corpus Scriptorum Ecclesiasticorum Latinorum (Wien: Holder, Pichler, Tempsky, latest volumes Berlin: De Gruyter) and
  • [CCL] Corpus Christianorum Series Latina (Turnhout: Brepols). New critical editions are continually being prepared and older ones replaced.

The Patrologia Latina edition [PL] (Jacques-Paul Migne (ed.), Paris 1877), which used to be the standard edition, is a reprint of the edition of the Benedictines of St.-Maur in Paris from the seventeenth century and naturally does not meet modern critical standards; it remains necessary only for about a third of the sermons for which modern editions are still lacking.

For a full list of Augustine’s works and the standard critical editions see

  • Augustinus-Lexikon 4 (2012–2018), pp. XI–XXXIV (available online); Fitzgerald (ed.) 1999, xxxv–il.

A complete work list is also found in Fuhrer 2018a: 1680–1687.


The most famous works of Augustine, Confessiones and De civitate dei, have often been translated in various modern languages, but for many of the other works only dated translations or none at all are available. The Zentrum für Augustinusforschung, Würzburg, provides a list of (mostly older) translations that are available online.


English translations of Augustine’s works down to 1999 are listed in Fitzgerald (ed.) 1999, xxxv–xlii. A nearly complete modern translation is:

  • [WSA] The Works of Saint Augustine. A Translation for the 21st Century, 46 vols., John E. Rotelle et al. (eds.), New York: New City Press, 1991–2019. Reliable and modern, but almost without annotation.

Two older series of Patristic writers in translation include selected works of Augustine:

  • [FC] The Fathers of the Church, Ludwig Schopp et al. (eds.), New York: Cima Publishing, 1947ff.
  • [ACW] Ancient Christian Writers. The Works of the Fathers in Translation, Johannes Quasten et al. (eds.), New York: Newman Press 1946ff.


The last complete translations of Augustine into French date from the nineteenth century. The—still incomplete—standard translation series is:

  • [BA] Bibliothèque Augustinienne. Œuvres de saint Augustin, Paris: Études Augustiniennes 1936ff. Bilingual editions with rich annotation that often comes close to a commentary. Especially important are the volumes on
    • Confessiones (BA 13–14, edited by Aimé Solignac et al., 1962),
    • De civitate dei (BA 33–37, edited by Guillaume Bardy and Guillaume Combès, 1959–1960),
    • De Genesi ad litteram (BA 48–49, edited by Paul Agaësse and Aimé Solignac, 1972) and
    • Letters 1–30 (BA 40/A, edited by Serge Lancel, Emmanuel Bermon et al., 2011).


No complete translation of Augustine’s work into German exists. Useful older translations are available in the series Bibliothek der Kirchenväter (BKV; 1st series: 8 vols., München: Kösel 1871–1879; 2nd series: 12 vols., München: Kösel 1911–1936; available online). An annotated bilingual edition of Augustine’s Opera omnia was begun in 2002:

  • [AOW] Augustinus: Opera—Werke, Wilhelm Geerlings, Johannes Brachtendorf, and Volker Henning Drecoll (eds.), Paderborn: Schöningh, 2002ff. 82 volumes planned, 14 completed.

A bilingual edition of the anti-Pelagian treatises with full annotation is:

  • Kopp, Sebastian, Thomas Gerhard Ring, and Adolar Zumkeller (eds.), 1955–2005, Sankt Augustinus—Der Lehrer der Gnade. Gesamtausgabe seiner antipelagianischen Schriften, 8 vols. (5 completed) + 3 vols. Prolegomena, Würzburg: Augustinus-Verlag.


  • [NBA] Nuova Biblioteca Agostiniana. Opere di Sant’Agostino. Edizione latino-italiana, 44 vols., Agostino Trapé et al. (eds.), Roma: Città Nuova Editrice, 1965–2010. Complete.
  • Spanish

  • [BAC] Obras completas de San Agustín. Edición bilingüe (Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos), 41 vols., Victorino Capánaga et al. (eds.), 1946–2002. Complete.


Except for the Confessiones and the Cassiciacum dialogues, detailed commentaries on Augustine’s writings are rare, especially in English. Here is a selection:

  • O’Donnell; James J., 1992, Augustine: Confessions, 3 vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press. Introduction, text and commentary. [O’Donnell 1992 available online]
  • Simonetti, Manlio et al. (eds.), 1992–1997, Sant’Agostino. Confessioni. 5 vols., Milano: Mondadori. Critically revised text, translation and commentary.
  • Flasch, Kurt, 1993, Was ist Zeit? Augustinus von Hippo. Das XI. Buch der Confessiones, Frankfurt/Main: Klostermann (2nd edition 2004).
  • Fuhrer, Therese, 1997, Augustin, Contra Academicos (vel De Academicis), Bücher 2 und 3, Einleitung und Kommentar, Berlin/New York: De Gruyter.
  • Watson, Gerard, 1990, Saint Augustine. Soliloquies and Immortality of the Soul, with an Introduction, translation and Commentary, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • Bermon, Emmanuel, 2007, La signification et l’enseignement. Texte latin, traduction française et commentaire du ‘De magistro’ de Saint Augustin, Paris: Vrin.
  • Trettel, Adam M., 2019, Desires in Paradise: An Interpretative Study of Augustine’s City of God 14, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
  • Foley, Michael P., 2019–2020, St. Augustine’s Cassiciacum Dialogues, Translation, Annotation, and Commentary. Volumes 1–4: Against the Academics, On the Happy Life, On Order, Soliloquies (and On the Immortality of the Soul), New Haven/London: Yale University Press.
  • Tornau, Christian, 2020, De immortalitate animae – Die Unsterblichkeit der Seele. Zweisprachige Ausgabe, eingeleitet, übersetzt und kommentiert, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
  • Brachtendorf, Johannes, and Volker Drecoll (eds.), 2021, Augustinus: De Genesi ad litteram. Ein kooperativer Kommentar, Leiden/Boston: Brill. (Chapters in German and English)
  • DeMarco, David C., 2021, Augustine and Porphyry. A Commentary on De ciuitate Dei 10, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
  • Bermon, Emmanuel, 2022, Saint Augustin. La correspondance avec Nebridius (Lettres 3–14). Texte latin et traduction française avec un commentaire, Leiden/Boston: Brill.

Reference Works

  • Augustinus-Lexikon, edited by Cornelius Mayer et al., Basel: Schwabe, 1986–2024. 5 volumes. Articles in English, French and German, lemmata in Latin. Also available online (license required).
  • Corpus Augustinianum Gissense, a Cornelio Mayer editum 3.0 (CAG-online), Basel: Schwabe. Searchable database of Augustine’s complete works in Latin, based on the most recent editions (including quotation search), and bibliographical database with over 50,000 titles. License required. Free access to the bibliographical database at the “Literatur-Portal” of Zentrum für Augustinusforschung, Würzburg (available online).
  • Drecoll, Volker Henning (ed.), 2007, Augustin Handbuch, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Fitzgerald, Allan D. (ed.), 1999, Augustine through the Ages. An Encyclopedia, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans. Encyclopedia in one volume, translated into
    • French: Saint Augustin. La Méditerranée et l’Europe, IVe–XXIe siècle, Paris: Édition du Cerf, 2005
    • Italian: Agostino. Dizionario enciclopedico, Roma: Città Nuova Editrice, 2007.
    • Spanish: Diccionario de San Agustín. San Agustín a través del tiempo, Burgos: Monte Carmelo, 2001.
  • Fuhrer, Therese, 2018a, “§ 144. Augustinus von Hippo”, in Christoph Riedweg, Christoph Horn, and Dietmar Wyrwa (eds.), Die Philosophie der Antike 5.2: Philosophie der Kaiserzeit und der Spätantike, Basel: Schwabe, pp. 1672–1750. With full bibliography down to 2018 (ib. pp. 1828–1853).
  • Pollmann, Karla (ed.), 2013, The Oxford Guide to the Historical Reception of Augustine, 3 vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Introductory and General

  • Alesanco Reinares, Tirso, 2004, Filosofía de San Agustín. Sintesis de su pensiamento, Madrid: Editorial Augustinus.
  • Brown, Peter, 2000, Augustine of Hippo. A Biography. A New Edition with an Epilogue, second edition, London: Faber & Faber (first edition 1967). Translated into
    • German: Augustinus von Hippo. Eine Biographie, Frankfurt: Societäts-Verlag, 1973, second edition 2000.
    • French: La vie de saint Augustin, Paris: Éditions du Seuil, 1971.
    • Italian: Agostino d’Ippona, Torino: Einaudi, 2005 (first edition 1971).
    • Spanish: Agustín de Hipona, Madrid: Acento, 2001.
  • Catapano, Giovanni, 2010a, Agostino, Roma: Carocci.
  • Gilson, Étienne, 1943, Introduction à l’étude de saint Augustin, second edition, Paris: Vrin. English translation: The Christian Philosophy of Saint Augustine, L.E.M. Lynch (trans.), New York: Random House, 1960.
  • Horn, Christoph, 1995, Augustinus, München: Beck.
  • Kirwan, Christopher, 1989, Augustine, New York: Routledge.
  • Matthews, Gareth B., 2005, Augustine, Malden: Blackwell.
  • Meconi, David Vincent and Eleonore Stump (eds.), 2014, The Cambridge Companion to Augustine, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 2014. Revised and enlarged edition of Stump and Kretzmann (eds.) 2001. doi:10.1017/CCO9781139178044
  • O’Donnell, James J., 2005, Augustine. A New Biography, New York: HarperCollins.
  • Rist, John M., 1994, Augustine. Ancient Thought Baptized, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stump, Eleonore and Norman Kretzmann (eds.), 2001, The Cambridge Companion to Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521650186
  • Vessey, Mark (ed.), 2012, A Companion to Augustine, Chichester: Blackwell. doi:10.1002/9781118255483
  • Wetzel, James, 2010, Augustine. A Guide for the Perplexed, London/New York: Bloomsbury.

Greek and Latin Authors Cited

  • Cicero, De officiis, Michael Winterbottom (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • –––, De re publica, Jonathan G.F. Powell (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • –––, Tusculanae disputationes, Max Pohlenz (ed.), Leipzig: Teubner, 1918.
  • Diogenes Laertius, Lives of eminent philosophers, Tiziano Dorandi (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013.
  • John Chrysostom, In epistulam ad Romanos homiliae, Jacques-Paul Migne (ed.), Patrologia Graeca 60, Paris, 1862, pp. 391–682.
  • Macrobius, Commentarii in Somnium Scipionis – Commentaire au songe de Scipion, Mireille Armisen-Marchetti (ed. trans.), 2 vols., Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2003.
  • Plato, Opera, Elizabeth A. Duke, et al. (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995 (vol. 1); John Burnet (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press 1901–1907 (vols. 2–5).
  • Plotinus, Opera, Paul Henry and Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (eds.), 3 vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1964–1982.
  • Porphyry, Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes, Erich Lamberz (ed.), Leipzig: Teubner, 1975.
  • Possidius, Sancti Augustini vita, Herbert T. Weiskotten (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1919.
  • Sextus Empiricus, Opera, Hermann Mutschmann et al. (eds.), 4 vols., Leipzig: Teubner, 1914–1962.
  • Long, Anthony A. and David N. Sedley (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Ayres, Lewis, 2010, Augustine and the Trinity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511780301
  • BeDuhn, Jason D., 2010, Augustine’s Manichaean Dilemma 1: Conversion and Apostasy, 373–388 C.E., Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • –––, 2013, Augustine’s Manichaean Dilemma 2. Making a “Catholic” Self, 388–401 C.E., Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Bermon, Emmanuel, 2001, Le cogito dans la pensée de saint Augustin, Paris: Vrin.
  • Bermon, Emmanuel and Gerard O’Daly (eds.), 2012, Le De Trinitate de saint Augustin. Exégèse, logique et noétique. Actes du colloque international de Bordeaux, 16–19 juin 2010, Paris: Études Augustiniennes.
  • Bittner, Rüdiger, 1999, “Augustine’s Philosophy of History”, in Matthews 1999: 345–360.
  • Bochet, Isabelle, 2011, “Les quaestiones attribuées à Porphyre dans la Lettre 102 d’Augustin”, in Sébastien Morlet (ed.), Le traité de Porphyre Contre les chrétiens. Un siècle de recherches, nouvelles questions. Actes du colloque international organisé les 8 et 9 septembre 2009 à l’Université de Paris IV-Sorbonne, Paris: Études Augustiniennes, pp. 371–394.
  • Børresen, Kari E., 2013, “Challenging Augustine in Feminist Theology and Gender Studies”, in Pollmann 2013: 135–141.
  • Bouton-Touboulic, Anne-Isabelle, 2004, L’ordre caché. La notion d’ordre chez saint Augustin, Paris: Études Augustiniennes.
  • –––, 2012, “Qu’il n’y a pas d’amour sans connaissance: étude d’un argument du De Trinitate, livres VIII–XV”, in Bermon and O’Daly 2012: 181–203.
  • Brachtendorf, Johannes, 2000, Die Struktur des menschlichen Geistes nach Augustinus. Selbstreflexion und Erkenntnis Gottes in De trinitate, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • –––, 2005, Augustins ‘Confessiones’, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • –––, 2012, “Time, Memory, and Selfhood in De Trinitate”, in Bermon and O’Daly 2012: 221–233.
  • Brittain, Charles, 2002, “Non-Rational Perception in the Stoics and Augustine”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 22: 253–308.
  • –––, 2003, “Colloquium 7: Attention Deficit in Plotinus and Augustine: Psychological Problems in Christian and Platonist Theories of the Grades of Virtue”, Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, 18: 223–275. doi:10.1163/22134417-90000043
  • –––, 2012a, “Self-Knowledge in Cicero and Augustine (De trinitate, X, 5, 7–10, 16)”, in Catapano and Cillerai 2012: 107–135.
  • –––, 2012b, “Intellectual Self-Knowledge in Augustine (De Trinitate 14.7–14)”, in Bermon and O’Daly 2012: 313–330.
  • Brown, Peter, 1988, The Body and Society. Men, Women and Sexual Renunciation in Early Christianity, New York: Columbia University Press. Translated into
    • German: Die Keuschheit der Engel. Sexuelle Entsagung, Askese und Körperlichkeit im frühen Christentum, München: Hanser, 1991.
    • French: Le Renoncement à la chair. Virginité, célibat et continence dans le christianisme primitif, Paris: Gallimard, 1995.
    • Italian: Il corpo e la società, Torino: Einaudi, 2010 (first edition 1992).
    • Spanish: El cuerpo e la sociedad, Barcelona: Muchnik, 1993.
  • Bubacz, Bruce, 1981, St. Augustine’s Theory of Knowledge. A Contemporary Analysis, New York: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Burnell, Peter J., 1992, “The Status of Politics in St. Augustine’s ‘City of God’”, History of Political Thought, 13(1): 13–29.
  • –––, 1995, “Concupiscence and Moral Freedom in Augustine and before Augustine”:, Augustinian Studies, 26(1): 49–63. doi:10.5840/augstudies19952612
  • Burnyeat, Myles F., 1987, “Wittgenstein and Augustine De Magistro”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 61: 1–24. Reprinted in Matthews 1999: 286–303 and in Doody, Eodice & Paffenroth 2018: 1–20. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/61.1.1
  • Byers, Sarah, 2012a, “Augustine and the Philosophers”, in Vessey 2012: 175–187. doi:10.1002/9781118255483.ch14
  • –––, 2012b, “The Psychology of Compassion: Stoicism in City of God 9.5”, in Wetzel 2012: 130–148. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139014144.008
  • –––, 2013, Perception, Sensibility, and Moral Motivation in Augustine: A Stoic-Platonic Synthesis, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139086110
  • Cary, Phillip, 2000, Augustine’s Invention of the Inner Self. The Legacy of a Christian Platonist, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2008a, Inner Grace: Augustine in the Traditions of Plato and Paul, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195336481.001.0001
  • –––, 2008b, Outward Signs: The Powerlessness of External Things in Augustine’s Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195336498.001.0001
  • Cary, Phillip, John Doody, and Kim Paffenroth (eds.), 2010, Augustine and Philosophy, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Castagnoli, Luca, 2010, Ancient Self-Refutation: The Logic and History of the Self-Refutation Argument from Democritus to Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Catapano, Giovanni, 2010, “Augustine”, in The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Lloyd Gerson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1:552–581. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521764407.038
  • –––, 2013, “The Epistemological Background of Augustine’s Dialogues”, in Sabine Föllinger and Gernot M. Müller (eds.), Der Dialog in der Antike. Formen und Funktionen einer literarischen Gattung zwischen Philosophie, Wissensvermittlung und dramatischer Inszenierung, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 107–122.
  • –––, 2012–2018a, “Philosophia”, Augustinus-Lexikon, 4: 719–742.
  • –––, 2012–2018b, “Ratio”, Augustinus-Lexikon, 4: 1069–1084.
  • –––, 2018, “Augustine”, in Anna Marmodoro and Sophie Cartwright (eds.), A History of Mind and Body in Late Antiquity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 343–464.
  • –––, 2021b, “Signum—res”, Augustinus-Lexikon, 5: 432–450.
  • –––, 2022, “Augustine’s Doctrine of Eternal Reasons. A Textual Dossier”, in Tommaso Manzon and Irene Zavattero (eds.), Theories of Divine Ideas: From the Church Fathers to the Early Franciscan Masters, Roma: Aracne, pp. 1–30. doi:10.53136/97912218046692
  • –––, 2023, “Entre le corps et Dieu. Le statu médian de l’âme dans la pensée de saint Augustin”, in Pascal Marin et Laurence Mellerin (eds.), Penser l’âme au temps de son éclipse. Les ressources de l’anthropologie chrétienne, Paris: Les éditions du Cerf, pp. 55–72.
  • Catapano, Giovanni and Beatrice Cillerai (eds.), 2012, Il De trinitate di Agostino e la sua fortuna nella filosofia medievale/Augustine’s De trinitate and Its Fortune in Medieval Philosophy (= Medioevo. Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale 27), Padova: Il Poligrafo.
  • Chappell, Timothy D.J., 1995, Aristotle and Augustine on Freedom. Two Theories of Freedom, Voluntary Action and Akrasia, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • Cillerai, Beatrice, 2008, La memoria come ‘capacitas Dei’ secondo Agostino. Unità e complessità, Pisa: Edizioni ETS.
  • –––, 2012, “La mens-imago et la « mémoire métaphysique » dans la réflexion trinitaire de saint Augustin”, in Bermon and O’Daly 2012: 291–312.
  • Clark, Elizabeth A., 1996, St. Augustine on Marriage and Sexuality, Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • –––, 2000, “Vitiated Seeds and Holy Vessels. Augustine’s Manichean Past”, in Karen L. King (ed.), Images of the Feminine in Gnosticism, Harrisburg, PA: Trinity Press International, pp. 367–401.
  • Clark, Gillian, 2009, “Can We Talk? Augustine and the Possibility of Dialogue”, in The End of Dialogue in Antiquity, Simon Goldhill (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 117–134. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511575464.007
  • –––, 2015, Monica. An Ordinary Saint, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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