John Duns Scotus

First published Thu May 31, 2001; substantive revision Fri Oct 11, 2019

John Duns Scotus (1265/66–1308) was one of the most important and influential philosopher-theologians of the High Middle Ages. His brilliantly complex and nuanced thought, which earned him the nickname “the Subtle Doctor,” left a mark on discussions of such disparate topics as the semantics of religious language, the problem of universals, divine illumination, and the nature of human freedom. This essay first lays out what is known about Scotus’s life and the dating of his works. It then offers an overview of some of his key positions in four main areas of philosophy: natural theology, metaphysics, the theory of knowledge, and ethics and moral psychology.

1. Life and Works

1.1 The life of John Duns the Scot

‘Scotus’ identifies Scotus as a Scot. His family name was Duns, which was also the name of the Scottish village in which he was born, just a few miles from the English border. We do not know the precise date of his birth, but we do know that Scotus was ordained to the priesthood in the Order of Friars Minor—the Franciscans—at Saint Andrew’s Priory in Northampton, England, on 17 March 1291. The minimum age for ordination was twenty-five, so we can conclude that Scotus was born before 17 March 1266. But how much before? The conjecture, plausible but by no means certain, is that Scotus would have been ordained as early as canonically permitted. Since the Bishop of Lincoln (the diocese that included Oxford, where Scotus was studying, as well as St Andrew’s Priory) had ordained priests in Wycombe on 23 December 1290, we can place Scotus’s birth between 23 December 1265 and 17 March 1266.

Scotus studied philosophy and then theology at Oxford beginning some time in the 1280s. In the academic year 1298–99 he commented on the first two books of the Sentences of Peter Lombard. Scotus left Oxford for Paris, probably in 1302, and began lecturing on the Sentences again (we think in the order Book I, Book IV, Book II, Book III). In June 1303 Scotus was expelled from France along with eighty other friars for taking Pope Boniface VIII’s side in a dispute with King Philip IV of France. After Boniface died in October 1303 the king allowed the exiled students and masters to return, so Scotus could have returned in the late fall of 1303 to resume his lectures on the Sentences. Scotus became Doctor of Theology in 1305 and was Franciscan regent master at Paris in 1306–07. He was transferred to the Franciscan studium at Cologne, probably beginning his duties as lector in October 1307. He died there in 1308; the date of his death is traditionally given as 8 November.

1.2 Scotus’s works

It is generally agreed that Scotus’s earliest works were his commentaries on the Old Logic: questions on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories, two sets of questions on Peri hermeneias, and De sophisticis elenchis. These probably date to around 1295; the Quaestiones super De anima is also very likely an early work (the editors date it to the late 1280s or early 1290s). Scotus’s other Aristotelian commentary, the Quaestiones super libros Metaphysicorum Aristotelis, seems to have been started early; but Books VI through IX are all late or were at least revised later in Scotus’s career. Scotus also wrote an Expositio on Aristotle’s Metaphysics. It had been unidentified for centuries but was recently identified and edited by Giorgio Pini.

Things really get complicated when we come to Scotus’s commentaries on the four books of Sentences of Peter Lombard, since he commented on the Sentences more than once and revised his lectures over a long period; the relations among the various versions that have come down to us are not always clear. Certainly the Lectura presents us with Scotus’s Oxford lectures on Books I and II of the Sentences in 1298–99. There is an Ordinatio (i.e., a version prepared for publication by the author himself) of lectures at Oxford, based in part on the Lectura and on material from his lectures in Paris. The Ordinatio, which Scotus seems to have been revising up to his death, is generally taken to be Scotus’s premier work; the critical edition was at last completed in 2013. Finally, Scotus lectured on the Sentences at Paris, and there are various Reportationes of these lectures. A critical edition is in progress; at present we have a transcription of a reasonably reliable manuscript of Book I. Although the Paris lectures themselves were later than the Oxford lectures, it seems probable that parts of the Ordinatio—Book IV and perhaps also Book III—are later than the corresponding parts of the Reportatio.

In addition to these works, we have 46 short disputations called Collationes dating from 1300–1305, a late work in natural theology called De primo principio, and Quaestiones Quodlibetales from Scotus’s days as regent master (either Advent 1306 or Lent 1307). Finally, there is a work called Theoremata. Though doubts have been raised about its authenticity, the recent critical edition accepts it as a genuine work of Scotus.

2. Natural Theology

2.1 Some methodological preliminaries

Natural theology is, roughly, the effort to establish the existence and nature of God by arguments that in no way depend on the contents of a purported revelation. But is it even possible for human beings to come to know God apart from revelation? Scotus certainly thinks so. Like any good Aristotelian, he thinks all our knowledge begins in some way with our experience of sensible things. But he is confident that even from such humble beginnings we can come to grasp God.

Scotus agrees with Thomas Aquinas that all our knowledge of God starts from creatures, and that as a result we can only prove the existence and nature of God by what the medievals call an argument quia (reasoning from effect to cause), not by an argument propter quid (reasoning from essence to characteristic). Aquinas and Scotus further agree that, for that same reason, we cannot know the essence of God in this life. The main difference between the two authors is that Scotus believes we can apply certain predicates univocally—with exactly the same meaning—to God and creatures, whereas Aquinas insists that this is impossible, and that we can only use analogical predication, in which a word as applied to God has a meaning different from, although related to, the meaning of that same word as applied to creatures. (See medieval theories of analogy for details.)

Scotus has a number of arguments for univocal predication and against the doctrine of analogy (Ordinatio 1, d. 3, pars 1, q. 1–2, nn. 26–55). One of the most compelling uses Aquinas’s own view against him. Aquinas had said that all our concepts come from creatures. Scotus says, very well, where will that analogous concept come from? It can’t come from anywhere. If all our concepts come from creatures (and Scotus doesn’t deny this), then the concepts we apply to God will also come from creatures. They won’t just be like the concepts that come from creatures, as in analogous predication; they will have to be the very same concepts that come from creatures, as in univocal predication. Those are the only concepts we can have—the only concepts we can possibly get. So if we can’t use the concepts we get from creatures, we can’t use any concepts at all, and so we can’t talk about God—which is false.

Another argument for univocal predication is based on an argument from Anselm. Consider all predicates, Anselm says. Now get rid of the ones that are merely relatives, since no relative expresses the nature of a thing as it is in itself. (So we’re not talking about such predicates as “supreme being” or “Creator,” since even though those properly apply to God, they don’t tell us anything about what God is in himself, only about how he is related to other things.) Now take the predicates that are left. Here’s the test. Let F be our predicate-variable. For any F, either

(a) It is in every respect better to be F than not to be F.
(b) It is in some respect better to be not-F than F.

A predicate will fall into the second category if and only if it implies some sort of limitation or deficiency. Anselm’s argument is that we can (indeed must) predicate of God every predicate that falls into the first category, and that we cannot predicate of God any predicate that falls into the second (except metaphorically, perhaps). Scotus agrees with Anselm on this point (as did Aquinas: see SCG I.30). Scotus has his own terminology for whatever it is in every respect better to be than not to be. He calls such things “pure perfections” (perfectiones simpliciter). A pure perfection is any predicate that does not imply limitation.

So Scotus claims that pure perfections can be predicated of God. But he takes this a step further than Anselm. He says that they have to be predicated univocally of God; otherwise the whole business of pure perfections won’t make any sense. Here’s the argument. If we are going to use Anselm’s test, we must first come up with our concept—say, of good. Then we check out the concept to see whether it is in every respect better to be good than not-good. We realize that it is, and so we predicate ‘good’ of God. That test obviously won’t work unless it’s the same concept that we’re applying in both cases.

One can see this more clearly by considering the two possible ways in which one might deny that the same concept is applied to both God and creatures. One might say that the concept of the pure perfection applies only to creatures, and the concept we apply to God has to be something different; or one might try it the other way around and say that the concept of the pure perfection applies only to God, and the concept we apply to creatures has to be something different. Take the first possibility. If we come up with the idea of a pure perfection from creatures and don’t apply the same concept to God, we’re saying that we can come up with something that is in every respect better to be than not to be, but it doesn’t apply to God. Such a view would destroy the idea that God is the greatest and most perfect being. So then one might try the second possibility: the concept of the pure perfection really applies only to God. Scotus points out that that can’t be right either. For then the perfection we apply to creatures won’t be the pure perfection any more, and so the creature wouldn’t be better off for having this pseudo-perfection. But the whole way in which we came up with the idea of the pure perfection in the first place was by considering perfections in creatures—in other words, by considering what features made creatures better in every respect. So this possibility gets the test backwards: it says that we have to start with knowing what features God has and thereby determining what is a pure perfection, but in fact we first figure out what the pure perfections are and thereby know what features God has.

Not only can we come up with concepts that apply univocally to God and creatures, we can even come up with a proper (distinctive) concept of God. Now in one sense we can’t have a proper concept of God in this life, since we can’t know his essence as a particular thing. We know God in the way that we know, say, a person we have heard about but have never met. That is, we know him through general concepts that can apply both to him and to other things. In another sense, though, we can have a proper concept of God, that is, one that applies only to God. If we take any of the pure perfections to the highest degree, they will be predicable of God alone. Better yet, we can describe God more completely by taking all the pure perfections in the highest degree and attributing them all to him.

But these are all composite concepts; they all involve putting two quite different notions together: ‘highest’ with ‘good’, ‘first’ with ‘cause’, and so on. Scotus says that we can come up with a relatively simple concept that is proper to God alone, the concept of “infinite being.” Now that concept might seem to be every bit as composite as “highest good” or “first cause,” but it’s really not. For “infinite being” is a concept of something essentially one: a being that has infinity (unlimitedness) as its intrinsic way of existing. I will return to the crucial role of the concept of infinite being in Scotus’s natural theology after I examine his proof of the existence of God.

2.2 Proof of the existence of God

Scotus’s argument for the existence of God is rightly regarded as one of the most outstanding contributions ever made to natural theology. The argument is enormously complex, with several sub-arguments for almost every important conclusion, and I can only sketch it here. (Different versions of the proof are given at Lectura 1, d. 2, q. 1, nn. 38–135; Ordinatio 1, d. 2, q. 1, nn. 39–190; Reportatio 1, d. 2, q. 1; and De primo principio.)

Scotus begins by arguing that there is a first agent (a being that is first in efficient causality). Consider first the distinction between essentially ordered causes and accidentally ordered causes. In an accidentally ordered series, the fact that a given member of that series is itself caused is accidental to that member’s own causal activity. For example, Grandpa A generates a son, Dad B, who in turn generates a son of his own, Grandson C. B’s generating C in no way depends on A—A could be long dead by the time B starts having children. The fact that B was caused by A is irrelevant to B’s own causal activity. That’s how an accidentally ordered series of causes works.

In an essentially ordered series, by contrast, the causal activity of later members of the series depends essentially on the causal activity of earlier members. For example, my shoulders move my arms, which in turn move my golf club. My arms are capable of moving the golf club only because they are being moved by my shoulders.

With that distinction in mind, we can examine Scotus’s argument for the existence of a first efficient cause:

(1) No effect can produce itself.
(2) No effect can be produced by just nothing at all.
(3) A circle of causes is impossible.
(4) Therefore, an effect must be produced by something else. (from 1, 2, and 3)
(5) There is no infinite regress in an essentially ordered series of causes.
(5a) It is not necessarily the case that a being possessing a causal power C possesses C in an imperfect way.
(5b) Therefore, it is possible that C is possessed without imperfection by some item.
(5c) If it is not possible for any item to possess C without dependence on some prior item, then it is not possible that there is any item that possesses C without imperfection (since dependence is a kind of imperfection).
(5d) Therefore, it is possible that some item possesses C without dependence on some prior item. (from 5b and 5c by modus tollens)
(5e) Any item possessing C without dependence on some prior item is a first agent (i.e., an agent that is not subsequent to any prior causes in an essentially ordered series).
(5f) Therefore, it is possible that something is a first agent. (from 5d and 5e)
(5g) If it is possible that something is a first agent, something is a first agent. (For, by definition, if there were no first agent, there would be no cause that could bring it about, so it would not in fact be possible for there to be a first agent.)
(5h) Therefore, something is a first agent (i.e., an agent that is not subsequent to any prior causes in an essentially ordered series—Scotus still has to prove that there is an agent that is not subsequent to any prior causes in an accidentally ordered series either. That’s what he does in step (6) below). (from 5f and 5g)
(6) It is not possible for there to be an accidentally ordered series of causes unless there is an essentially ordered series.
(6a) In an accidentally ordered series, each member of the series (except the first, if there is a first) comes into existence as a result of the causal activity of a prior member of the series.
(6b) That causal activity is exercised in virtue of a certain form.
(6c) Therefore, each member of the series depends on that form for its causal activity.
(6d) The form is not itself a member of the series.
(6e) Therefore, the accidentally ordered series is essentially dependent on a higher-order cause.
(7) Therefore, there is a first agent. (from 4, 5, and 6)

Scotus then goes on to argue that there is an ultimate goal of activity (a being that is first in final causality), and a maximally excellent being (a being that is first in what Scotus calls “pre-eminence”).

Thus he has proved what he calls the “triple primacy”: there is a being that is first in efficient causality, in final causality, and in pre-eminence. Scotus next proves that the three primacies are coextensive: that is, any being that is first in one of these three ways will also be first in the other two ways. Scotus then argues that a being enjoying the triple primacy is endowed with intellect and will, and that any such being is infinite. Finally, he argues that there can be only one such being.

2.3 Divine infinity and the doctrine of univocity

In laying out Scotus’s proof of the existence of God, I passed rather quickly over the claim that God is infinite. But the divine infinity deserves more detailed treatment. As we have already seen, the concept of “infinite being” has a privileged role in Scotus’s natural theology. As a first approximation, we can say that divine infinity is for Scotus what divine simplicity is for Aquinas. It’s the central divine-attribute generator. But there are some important differences between the role of simplicity in Aquinas and the role of infinity in Scotus. The most important, I think, is that in Aquinas simplicity acts as an ontological spoilsport for theological semantics. Simplicity is in some sense the key thing about God, metaphysically speaking, but it seriously complicates our language about God. God is supposed to be a subsistent simple, but because our language is all derived from creatures, which are all either subsistent but complex or simple but non-subsistent, we don’t have any way to apply our language straightforwardly to God. The divine nature systematically resists being captured in language.

For Scotus, though, infinity is not only what’s ontologically central about God; it’s the key component of our best available concept of God and a guarantor of the success of theological language. That is, our best ontology, far from fighting with our theological semantics, both supports and is supported by our theological semantics. The doctrine of univocity rests in part on the claim that “[t]he difference between God and creatures, at least with regard to God’s possession of the pure perfections, is ultimately one of degree” (Cross [1999], 39). Remember one of Scotus’s arguments for univocity. If we are to follow Anselm in ascribing to God every pure perfection, we have to affirm that we are ascribing to God the very same thing that we ascribe to creatures: God has it infinitely, creatures in a limited way. One could hardly ask for a more harmonious cooperation between ontology (what God is) and semantics (how we can think and talk about him).

Scotus ascribes to Aquinas the following argument for the divine infinity: If a form is limited by matter, it is finite. God, being simple, is not limited by matter. Therefore, God is not finite. This, as Scotus points out, is a fallacious argument. (It’s an instance of denying the antecedent.) But even apart from the fallacy, simplicity is not going to get us infinity. As Scotus puts it: “if an entity is finite or infinite, it is so not by reason of something accidental to itself, but because it has its own intrinsic degree of finite or infinite perfection” (Ordinatio 1, d. 1, pars 1, q. 1–2, n. 142). So simplicity does not entail infinity, because finitude is not the result of composition. To look at it another way, Aquinas’s conception of infinity is negative and relational. The infinite is that which is not bounded by something else. But Scotus thinks we can have a positive conception of infinity, according to which infinity is not a negative, relational property, but instead a positive, intrinsic property. It is an “intrinsic degree of perfection.”

How do we acquire that conception of positive, intrinsic infinity? The story goes like this. We begin with “the potentially infinite in quantity.” According to Aristotle, you can never have an actual quantitative infinity, since no matter how great a quantity you have, you can always have more. What you can have (and in fact do have, Aristotle thinks) is a quantitative infinity by successive parts. The next step is to imagine that all the parts of that quantitative infinity remained in existence simultaneously. That is, we imagine an actual quantitative infinity. Scotus then asks us to shift from thinking about an actual quantitative infinity to thinking about an actual qualitative infinity. Think of some quality (say, goodness) as existing infinitely: so that there is, as it were, no more goodness that you could add to that goodness to make it any greater. That’s infinite goodness. But notice that you can’t think of infinite goodness as in some way composed of little goodness-bits (just an infinite number of them). If I say that an angel is better than a human being, I can’t mean that a human being has a certain number of goodness-bits while the angel has that many plus some extras. Rather, the specific degree of goodness of a thing is just an intrinsic, non-quantitative feature of that thing. Infinite being is just like that. Scotus describes it as “a measure of intrinsic excellence that is not finite.” This is why the concept of “infinite being” is the simplest concept available to us for understanding God. Infinity is not some sort of accidental addition to being, but an intrinsic mode of being. Of course, if this is right, then the concepts of ‘infinite goodness’, ‘infinite power’, and so forth, are every bit as simple as the concept of ‘infinite being’. So why does Scotus make such a big deal about ‘infinite being’? Because ‘infinite being’ “virtually contains” all the other infinite perfections of God. That is, we can deduce the other infinite perfections from infinite being. So besides being the next best thing to a simple concept, it’s the most theoretically fruitful concept we can have of God in this life.

3. Metaphysics

3.1 The subject matter of metaphysics

Metaphysics, according to Scotus, is a “real theoretical science”: it is real in that it treats things rather than concepts, theoretical in that it is pursued for its own sake rather than as a guide for doing or making things, and a science in that it proceeds from self-evident principles to conclusions that follow deductively from them. The various real theoretical sciences are distinguished by their subject matter, and Scotus devotes considerable attention to determining what the distinctive subject matter of metaphysics is. His conclusion is that metaphysics concerns “being qua being” (ens inquantum ens). That is, the metaphysician studies being simply as such, rather than studying, say, material being as material.

The study of being qua being includes, first of all, the study of the transcendentals, so called because they transcend the division of being into finite and infinite, and the further division of finite being into the ten Aristotelian categories. Being itself is a transcendental, and so are the “proper attributes” of being—one, true, and good—which are coextensive with being. Scotus also identifies an indefinite number of disjunctions that are coextensive with being and therefore count as transcendentals, such as infinite-or-finite and necessary-or-contingent. Finally, all the pure perfections (see above) are transcendentals, since they transcend the division of being into finite and infinite. Unlike the proper attributes of being and the disjunctive transcendentals, however, they are not coextensive with being. For God is wise and Socrates is wise, but earthworms—though they are certainly beings—are not wise.

The study of the Aristotelian categories also belongs to metaphysics insofar as the categories, or the things falling under them, are studied as beings. (If they are studied as concepts, they belong instead to the logician.) There are exactly ten categories, Scotus argues. The first and most important is the category of substance. Substances are beings in the most robust sense, since they have an independent existence: that is, they do not exist in something else. Beings in any of the other nine categories, called accidents, exist in substances. The nine categories of accidents are quantity, quality, relation, action, passion, place, time, position, and state (habitus).

3.2 Matter and form, body and soul

Now imagine some particular substance, say, me. Suppose I go from being pale to being tan. Now it is still I who exist both before and after the sun has had its characteristic effect on me. This illustrates an important feature of substances: they can successively have contrary accidents and yet retain their numerical identity. This sort of change is known, appropriately enough, as accidental change. In an accidental change, a substance persists through the change, having first one accident and then another. But clearly not all changes are accidental changes. There was once a time when I did not exist, and then I came into existence. We can’t analyze this change as an accidental change, since there doesn’t seem to be any substance that persists through the change. Instead, a substance is precisely what comes into being; this is not an accidental but a substantial change. And yet there must be something that persists even through substantial change, since otherwise we wouldn’t have change at all; substances would come to exist from nothing and disappear into nothing. Scotus follows Aristotle in identifying matter as what persists through substantial change and substantial form as what makes a given parcel of matter the definite, unique, individual substance that it is. (There are also accidental forms, which are a substance’s accidental qualities.)

Thus far Scotus is simply repeating Aristotelian orthodoxy, and none of his contemporaries or immediate predecessors would have found any of this at all strange. But as Scotus elaborates his views on form and matter, he espouses three important theses that mark him off from some other philosophers of his day: he holds that matter can exist without any form whatsoever, that not all created substances are composites of form and matter, and that one and the same substance can have more than one substantial form. Let us examine each of these theses in turn.

First, Scotus argues that God can create and conserve what was called “prime matter”: that is, matter that has no form whatsoever. (For an analysis of the arguments, see Ward 2014.) Matter and form are distinct things, as the case of substantial change makes clear: matter persists when forms come and go. Now that fact by itself might be taken to show only that matter can exist apart from any given form (and Scotus thinks that too), but Scotus takes the separability of matter and form even further. Divine omnipotence means that God can cause immediately (that is, without a secondary cause) whatever he ordinarily causes through a secondary cause. God ordinarily causes matter through form; but given divine omnipotence, he need not. He can create matter without any form. Moreover, given that matter is a thing distinct from form, God creates matter directly and immediately; and what God creates immediately, he can conserve immediately. So God can conserve matter without conserving any of the forms that characterize that matter.

Second, Scotus denies “universal hylomorphism,” the view that all created substances are composites of form and matter (Lectura 2, d. 12, q. un., n. 55). Universal hylomorphism (from the Greek hyle, meaning ‘matter’, and morphe, meaning ‘form’) had been the predominant view among Franciscans before Scotus. Saint Bonaventure, for example, had argued that even angels could not be altogether immaterial; they must be compounds of form and “spiritual matter.” For matter is potentiality and form is actuality, so if the angels were altogether immaterial, they would be pure actuality without any admixture of potentiality. But only God is pure actuality. But as we have already seen in his affirmation of the existence of prime matter, Scotus simply denies the unqualified equation of matter with potentiality and form with actuality. Prime matter, though entirely without form, could be actual; and a purely immaterial being is not automatically bereft of potentiality.

Third, Scotus holds that some substances have more than one substantial form (Ordinatio 4, d. 11, q. 3, n. 54). This doctrine of the plurality of substantial forms was commonly held among the Franciscans but vigorously disputed by others. We can very easily see the motivation for the view by recalling that a substantial form is supposed to be what makes a given parcel of matter the definite, unique, individual substance that it is. Now suppose, as many medieval thinkers (including Aquinas) did, that the soul is the one and only substantial form of the human being. It would then follow that when a human being dies, and the soul ceases to inform that parcel of matter, what is left is not the same body that existed just before death; there is an entirely new substance, with entirely new accidents (for accidents depend for their being on the substance in which they inhere). For what made it that very body was its substantial form, which (ex hypothesi) is no longer there.

To Scotus and many of his fellow Franciscans it therefore seemed obvious that we need to posit a plurality of substantial forms to avoid these metaphysical incongruities. One standard form of such pluralism postulated a “form of the body” (forma corporeitatis) that makes a given parcel of matter to be a definite, unique, individual organism, and the “animating form” or soul, which makes that body alive. At death, the animating soul ceases to vivify the body, but numerically the same body remains, and the form of the body keeps the matter organized, at least for a while. Since the form of the body is too weak on its own to keep the body in existence indefinitely, however, it gradually decomposes.

Scotus’s view is more complicated still, for he treats each organ of a living body as a substance (a composite of matter and substantial form). Whether Scotus also acknowledges a forma corporeitatis over and above the forms of the bodily organs is disputed (see Ward 2014, 90–93). If he does not, he must accept the unpalatable conclusion that a corpse is not the same body as the body of the organism. He can, however, avoid the conclusion that no accidents of that body remain: any accidents that inhere in the organs can remain, because the organs are substances and continue to exist (for a while, anyway) when the body of which they were parts ceases to exist.

Note that the general tendency of Scotus’s theories of form and matter is to allow a high degree of independence to form and matter. In positing the existence of prime matter, Scotus envisions matter as existing without any form; in denying universal hylomorphism, he envisions form as existing without any matter. And the doctrine of the plurality of substantial forms strongly suggests that the human soul is an identifiable individual in its own right. So everything Scotus says in this connection seems to make room for the possibility that the soul survives the death of the body and continues to exist as an immaterial substance in its own right. But Scotus canvases a number of philosophical arguments for the claim that this possibility is in fact realized, and he finds none of them compelling. That the human soul survives the death of the body is something we can know only through faith.

3.3 Universals and individuation

The problem of universals may be thought of as the question of what, if anything, is the metaphysical basis of our using the same predicate for more than one distinct individual. Socrates is human and Plato is human. Does this mean that there must be some one universal reality—humanity—that is somehow repeatable, in which Socrates and Plato both share? Or is there nothing metaphysically common to them at all? Those who think there is some actual universal existing outside the mind are called realists; those who deny extra-mental universals are called nominalists. Scotus was a realist about universals, and like all realists he had to give an account of what exactly those universals are: what their status is, what sort of existence they have outside the mind. So, in the case of Socrates and Plato, the question is “What sort of item is this humanity that both Socrates and Plato exemplify?” A related question that realists have to face is the problem of individuation. Given that there is some extra-mental reality common to Socrates and Plato, we also need to know what it is in each of them that makes them distinct exemplifications of that extra-mental reality.

Scotus calls the extra-mental universal the “common nature” (natura communis) and the principle of individuation the “haecceity” (haecceitas). The common nature is common in that it is “indifferent” to existing in any number of individuals. But it has extra-mental existence only in the particular things in which it exists, and in them it is always “contracted” by the haecceity. So the common nature humanity exists in both Socrates and Plato, although in Socrates it is made individual by Socrates’s haecceitas and in Plato by Plato’s haecceitas. The humanity-of-Socrates is individual and non-repeatable, as is the humanity-of-Plato; yet humanity itself is common and repeatable, and it is ontologically prior to any particular exemplification of it (Ordinatio 2, d. 3, pars 1, qq. 1–6, translated in Spade [1994], 57–113).

4. Theory of Knowledge

4.1 Sensation and abstraction

Scotus adopts the standard medieval Aristotelian view that human beings, alone among the animals, have two different sorts of cognitive powers: senses and intellect. The senses differ from the intellect in that they have physical organs; the intellect is immaterial. In order for the intellect to make use of sensory information, therefore, it must somehow take the raw material provided by the senses in the form of material images and make them into suitable objects for understanding. This process is known as abstraction, from the Latin abstrahere, which is literally “to drag out.” The intellect pulls out the universal, as it were, from the material singular in which it is embedded. This activity is performed by the active or agent intellect, which takes the “phantasms” derived from sense experience and turns them into “intelligible species.” Those species are actualized in the possible or receptive intellect, whose function is to receive and then store the intelligible species provided by the active intellect. Scotus denies that the active and passive intellect are really distinct. Rather, there is one intellect that has these two distinct functions or powers.

Phantasms do not, however, become irrelevant once the intelligible species has been abstracted. Scotus holds (just as Aquinas had held) that the human intellect never understands anything without turning towards phantasms (Lectura 2, d. 3, pars 2, q. 1, n. 255). That is, in order to deploy a concept that has already been acquired, one must make some use of sensory data—although the phantasms employed in using a concept already acquired need not be anything like the phantasms from which that concept was abstracted in the first place. I acquired the intelligible species of dog from phantasms of dogs, but I can make use of that concept now not only by calling up an image of a dog but also by (say) imagining the sound of the Latin word for dog. Scotus’s point is simply that there must be some sensory context for any act of intellectual cognition.

And even that point is not quite as general as my unqualified statement suggests. For one thing, Scotus believes that our intellect’s need for phantasms is a temporary state. It is only in this present life that the intellect must turn to phantasms; in the next life we will be able to do without them. For another thing, Scotus argues in his later works that even in this life we enjoy a kind of intellectual cognition that bypasses phantasms. He called it “intuitive cognition.”

4.2 Intuitive cognition

Scotus understands intuitive cognition by way of contrast with abstractive cognition. The latter, as we have seen, involves the universal; and a universal as such need not be exemplified. That is, my intelligible species of dog only tells me what it is to be a dog; it doesn’t tell me whether any particular dog actually exists. Intuitive cognition, by contrast, “yields information about how things are right now” (Pasnau [2002]). Sensory cognition, as Scotus explicitly acknowledges, counts as intuitive cognition on this account. It is, after all, quite uncontroversial that my seeing or hearing a dog gives me information about some particular dog as it exists when I see or hear it. Scotus’s much bolder claim concerns intellectual intuitive cognition, by which the intellect cognizes a particular thing as existing at that very moment. Intellectual intuitive cognition does not require phantasms; nor does it involve intelligible species (which, like phantasms, are abstractive).

Intellectual intuitive cognition has two different kinds of objects: extramental sensible objects and the soul’s own acts. (Scotus comes around to affirming the possibility of such cognition of extramental objects in his later works, having denied it earlier in his career; he is consistent about the possibility of intuitive cognition of the soul’s acts. See Cross 2014, 43–64, on whom I draw thoughout this section.) We must have intuitive cognition of extramental objects because we can cognize them intellectually as existing; we can form propositions about them and use such propositions in syllogisms. So, for example, if I form the proposition “This flower is red,” the contents of that proposition must be in the intellect, not merely in the sense. This is intellectual cognition because it is conceptual; it is intuitive cognition because it concerns something as existing. The information contained in the sensible species—the shape and color of the flower—is "promoted" by the agent intellect from material existence in an organ to immaterial existence in the non-organic intellect, so that it is available for intellectual cognition. The role of sensible species in intuitive intellectual cognition explains why Scotus denies that we can have such cognition of non-sensible objects, such as angels, in this life.

We also have intuitive cognition of our mental acts. (As I discuss in the next section, Scotus attaches considerable importance to our intuitive self-knowledge). Abstractive cognition could provide me with an abstract concept of thinking about Scotus, for example, but I need intuitive cognition to know that I am in fact exemplifying that concept right this minute. This kind of intuitive cognition clearly dispenses even with sensible species, since the intellect’s acts, like the intellect itself, are immaterial and therefore not the sorts of things that can be sensed.

4.3 The attack on skepticism and illuminationism

Scotus argues that the human intellect is capable of achieving certainty in its knowledge of the truth simply by the exercise of its own natural powers, with no special divine help. He therefore opposes both skepticism, which denies the possibility of certain knowledge, and illuminationism, which insists that we need special divine illumination in order to attain certainty. He works out his attack on both doctrines in the course of a reply to Henry of Ghent in Ordinatio 1, d. 3, pars 1, q. 4. (For a translation, see van den Bercken [2016], 114–143.)

According to Henry, truth involves a relation to an “exemplar.” (We can think of this relation as akin to the relation of correspondence appealed to by certain theories of truth, and the exemplar itself as the mental item that is one of the relata of the correspondence-relation. The other relatum, of course, is “the way things really are.”) Now there are two exemplars: the created exemplar, which is the species of the universal caused by the thing known, and the uncreated exemplar, which is an idea in the divine mind. Henry argues that the created exemplar cannot provide us with certain and infallible knowledge of a thing. For, first, the object from which the exemplar is abstracted is itself mutable and therefore cannot be the cause of something immutable. And how can there be certain knowledge apart from some immutable basis for that knowledge? Second, the soul itself is mutable and subject to error, and it can be preserved from error only by something less mutable than itself. But the created exemplar is even more mutable than the soul. Third, the created exemplar by itself does not allow us to distinguish between reality and dreaming, since the content of the exemplar is the same in either case. Henry therefore concludes that if we are to have certainty, we must look to the uncreated exemplar. And since we cannot look to the uncreated exemplar by our natural powers, certainty is impossible apart from some special divine illumination.

Scotus argues that if Henry is right about the limitations of our natural powers, even divine illumination is not enough to save us from pervasive uncertainty. To Henry’s first argument he replies that there is no certainty to be had by knowing a mutable object as immutable. To the second he replies that anything in the soul—including the very act of understanding that Henry thinks is achieved through illumination—is mutable. So by Henry’s argument it would be impossible for anything whatever to preserve the soul from error. And to the third argument he replies that if the created exemplar is such as to preclude certainty, adding extra exemplars will not solve the problem: “When something incompatible with certainty concurs, certainty cannot be attained” (Ordinatio 1, d. 3, pars 1, q. 4, n. 221).

So Henry’s arguments, far from showing that certainty is possible through divine illumination, actually lead to a pervasive skepticism. Scotus counters that we can show that skepticism is false. We can in fact attain certainty, and we can do so by the unaided exercise of our natural intellectual powers. There are four types of knowledge in which infallible certainty is possible. First, knowledge of first principles is certain because the intellect has only to form such judgments to see that they are true. (And since the validity of proper syllogistic inference can be known in just this way, it follows that anything that is seen to be properly derived from first principles by syllogistic inference is also known with certainty.) Second, we have certainty with respect to quite a lot of causal judgments derived from experience. Third, Scotus says that many of our own acts are as certain as first principles. It is no objection to point out that our acts are contingent, since some contingent propositions must be known immediately (that is, without needing to be derived from some other proposition). For otherwise, either some contingent proposition would follow from a necessary proposition (which is impossible), or there would be an infinite regress in contingent propositions (in which case no contingent proposition would ever be known). Fourth, certain propositions about present sense experience are also known with certainty if they are properly vetted by the intellect in light of the causal judgments derived from experience.

5. Ethics and Moral Psychology

5.1 The natural law

For Scotus the natural law in the strict sense contains only those moral propositions that are per se notae ex terminis along with whatever propositions can be derived from them deductively (Ordinatio 3, d. 37, q. un.). Per se notae means that they are self-evident; ex terminis adds that they are self-evident in virtue of being analytically true. Now one important fact about propositions that are self-evident and analytically true is that God himself can’t make them false. They are necessary truths. So the natural law in the strict sense does not depend on God’s will. This means that even if (as I believe) Scotus is some sort of divine-command theorist, he is not whole-hog in his divine command theory. Some moral truths are necessary truths, and even God can’t change those. They would be true no matter what God willed.

Which ones are those? Scotus’s basic answer is that they are the commandments of the first tablet of the Decalogue (Ten Commandments). The Decalogue has often been thought of as involving two tablets. The first covers our obligations to God and consists of the first three commandments: You shall have no other gods before me, You shall not take the name of the Lord your God in vain, and Remember the Sabbath day to keep it holy. (Note that many Protestants divide them up differently.) The second tablet spells out our obligations toward others: Honor your father and mother, You shall not kill, You shall not commit adultery, You shall not steal, You shall not bear false witness against your neighbor, and two commandments against coveting. The commandments of the first tablet are part of the natural law in the strict sense because they have to do with God himself, and with the way in which God is to be treated. For Scotus says that the following proposition is per se nota ex terminis: “If God exists, then he is to be loved as God, and nothing else is to be worshiped as God, and no irreverence is to be done to him.” Given the very definition of God, it follows that if there is such a being, he is to be loved and worshiped, and no irreverence should be shown to him. Because these commandments are self-evident and analytic, they are necessary truths. Not even God himself could make them false.

But even the first three commandments, once we start looking at them, are not obviously part of the natural law in the strict sense. In particular, the third commandment, the one about the Sabbath day, is a little tricky. Obviously, the proposition “God is to be worshiped on Saturday” is not self-evident or analytic. In fact, Scotus says it’s not even true any more, since Christians are to worship on Sunday, not Saturday. So, Scotus asks, what about the proposition “God is to be worshiped at some time or other”? Even that is not self-evident or analytic. The best one can do is “God is not to be hated.” Now that’s self-evident and analytic, since by definition God is the being most worthy of love and there is nothing in him worthy of hate. But obviously that’s far weaker than any positive commandment about whether and when we should worship God.

So by the time Scotus completes his analysis, we are left with nothing in the natural law in the strict sense except for negative propositions: God is not to be hated, no other gods are to be worshiped, no irreverence is to be done to God. Everything else in the Decalogue belongs to the natural law in a weaker or looser sense. These are propositions that are not per se notae ex terminis and do not follow from such propositions, but are “highly consonant” with such propositions. Now the important point for Scotus is this: since these propositions are contingent, they are completely up to God’s discretion. Any contingent truth whatsoever depends on God’s will.

According to Scotus, God of course is aware of all contingent propositions. Now God gets to assign the truth values to those propositions. For example, “Unicorns exist” is a contingent proposition. Therefore, it is up to God’s will whether that proposition will be true or false. The same goes for contingent moral propositions. Take any such proposition and call it L, and call the opposite of L, not-L. Both L and not-L are contingent propositions. God can make either of them true, but he can’t make both of them true, since they are contradictories. Suppose that God wills L. L is now part of the moral law. How do we explain why God willed L rather than not-L? Scotus says we can’t. God’s will with respect to contingent propositions is unqualifiedly free. So while there might be some reasons why God chose the laws he chose, there is no fully adequate reason, no total explanation. If there were a total explanation other than God’s will itself, those propositions wouldn’t be contingent at all. They would be necessary. So at bottom there is simply the sheer fact that God willed one law rather than another.

Scotus intends this claim to be exactly parallel to the way we think about contingent beings. Why are there elephants but no unicorns? As everyone would agree, it’s because God willed for there to be elephants but no unicorns. And why did he will that? He just did. That’s part of what we mean by saying that God was free in creating. There was nothing constraining him or forcing him to create one thing rather than another. The same is true about the moral law. Why is there an obligation to honor one’s parents but no such obligation toward cousins? Because God willed that there be an obligation to honor one’s parents, and he did not will that there be any such obligation toward one’s cousins. He could have willed both of these obligations, and he could have willed neither. What explains the way that he did in fact will? Nothing whatsoever except the sheer fact that he did will that way.

(For recent criticisms of this strongly voluntaristic reading of Scotus’s account of the moral law, see Borland and Hillman 2017 and Ward 2019.)

5.2 The will, freedom, and morality

Scotus quite self-consciously puts forward his understanding of freedom as an alternative to Aquinas’s. According to Aquinas, freedom comes in simply because the will is intellectual appetite rather than mere sense appetite. Intellectual appetite is aimed at objects as presented by the intellect and sense appetite at objects as presented by the senses. Sense appetite is not free because the senses provide only particulars as objects of appetite. But intellectual appetite is free because the intellect deals with universals, not particulars. Since universals by definition include many particulars, intellectual appetite will have a variety of objects. Consider goodness as an example. The will is not aimed at this good thing or that good thing, but at goodness in general. Since that universal, goodness, contains many different particular things, intellectual appetite has many different options.

But Scotus insists that mere intellectual appetite is not enough to guarantee freedom in the sense needed for morality. The basic difference comes down to this. When Aquinas argues that intellectual appetite has different options, he seems to be thinking of this over a span of time. Right now the intellect presents x as good, so I will x; but later on the intellect presents y as good, so then I will y. But Scotus thinks of freedom as involving multiple options at the very moment of choice. It’s not enough to say that now I will x, but later I can will y. We have to say that at the very moment at which I will x, I also am able to will y. Aquinas’s arguments don’t show that intellectual appetite is free in this stronger sense. So as far as Scotus is concerned, Aquinas hasn’t made room for the right kind of freedom.

This is where Scotus brings in his well-known doctrine of the two affections of the will (see especially Ordinatio 2, d. 6, q. 2; 2, d. 39, q. 2; 3, d. 17, q. un.; and 3, d. 26, q. un.). The two affections are fundamental inclinations in the will: the affectio commodi, or affection for the advantageous, and the affectio iustitiae, or affection for justice. Scotus identifies the affectio commodi with intellectual appetite. Notice how important that is. For Aquinas intellectual appetite is the same thing as will, whereas for Scotus intellectual appetite is only part of what the will is. Intellectual appetite is just one of the two fundamental inclinations in the will. Why does Scotus make this crucial change? For the reason we’ve already discussed. He doesn’t see how intellectual appetite could be genuinely free. Now he can’t deny that the will involves intellectual appetite. Intellectual appetite is aimed at happiness, and surely happiness does have some role to play in our moral psychology. But the will has to include something more than intellectual appetite if it’s going to be free. That something more is the affectio iustitiae. But one can’t fully understand what the affectio iustitiae is until Aquinas and Scotus are compared on a further point.

For Aquinas the norms of morality are defined in terms of their relationship to human happiness. We have a natural inclination toward our good, which is happiness, and it is that good that determines the content of morality. So like Aristotle, Aquinas holds a eudaimonistic theory of ethics: the point of the moral life is happiness. That’s why Aquinas can understand the will as an intellectual appetite for happiness. All of our choosing is aimed at the human good (or at least, it’s aimed at the human good as we conceive it). And choices are good—and, indeed, fully intelligible—only when they are aimed at the ultimate end, which is happiness. So Aquinas just defines the will as the capacity to choose in accordance with a conception of the human good—in other words, as intellectual appetite.

When Scotus rejects the idea that will is merely intellectual appetite, he is saying that there is something fundamentally wrong with eudaimonistic ethics. Morality is not tied to human flourishing at all. For it is Scotus’s fundamental conviction that morality is impossible without libertarian freedom, and since he sees no way for there to be libertarian freedom on Aquinas’s eudaimonistic understanding of ethics, Aquinas’s understanding must be rejected. And just as Aquinas’s conception of the will was tailor-made to suit his eudaimonistic conception of morality, Scotus’s conception of the will is tailor-made to suit his anti-eudaimonistic conception of morality. It’s not merely that he thinks there can be no genuine freedom in mere intellectual appetite. It’s also that he rejects the idea that moral norms are intimately bound up with human nature and human happiness. The fact that God creates human beings with a certain kind of nature does not require God to command or forbid the actions that he in fact commanded or forbade. The actions he commands are not necessary for our happiness, and the actions he forbids are not incompatible with our happiness. Now if the will were merely intellectual appetite—that is, if it were aimed solely at happiness—we would not be able to choose in accordance with the moral law, since the moral law itself is not determined by any considerations about human happiness. So Scotus relegates concerns about happiness to the affectio commodi and assigns whatever is properly moral to the other affection, the affectio iustitiae.


Primary texts in Latin

  • Cuestiones Cuodlibetales. In Obras del Doctor Sutil, Juan Duns Escoto. Ed. Felix Alluntis. Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1963.
  • Opera Omnia. (“The Wadding edition”) Lyon, 1639; reprinted Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlagsbuchhandlung, 1968. This is the best source for material not yet available in the critical editions. It does include some material now known to be inauthentic, and it prints as Book 1 of the Reportatio what is actually the Additiones magnae compiled and edited by Scotus’s student and secretary, William of Alnwick.
  • Opera Omnia. (“The Vatican edition”) Civitas Vaticana: Typis Polyglottis Vaticanis, 1950–2013. The Ordinatio (vol. I–XIV) and Lectura (vol. XVI–21).
  • Opera Philosophica. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute, 1997–2006. The question-commentaries on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories (vol. I), on Peri hermeneias and Sophistical Refutations, along with the Theoremata (vol. II), the Quaestiones super libros Metaphysicorum Aristotelis (vols. III–IV), and the Quaetiones super Secundum et Tertium de Anima (vol. V).
  • Notabilia Scoti super Metaphysicam: una testimonianza ritrovata dell’insegnamento di Duns Scoto sulla Metafisica, Giorgio Pini (ed.), Archivum Franciscanum Historicum, 89 (1996): 137–180.

Primary texts in English translation

  • Buckner, Edward, and Jack Zupko (trans., eds.), 2014. Duns Scotus on Time and Existence: The Questions on ‘De Interpretatione’, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Bychkov, Oleg B., and Trent Pomplun, 2016. John Duns Scotus: The Report of the Paris Lecture: Reportatio IV-A. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute. (An English translation and preliminary edition of the Latin text through distinction 10.)
  • Etzkorn, Girard J., and Allan B. Wolter, OFM, 1997–98. Questions on the Metaphysics of Aristotle by John Duns Scotus. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Jaczn, A. Vos, H. Veldhuis, A. A. Looman-Graaskamp, E. Dekker, and N. W. Den Bok (trans.), 1994. John Duns Scotus, Contingency and Freedom: Lectura I 39 (New Synthese Historical Library, 42), Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Newton, Lloyd (trans.), 2014. Questions on Aristotle’s Categories, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1994. Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • van den Bercken, John, 2016. On Being and Cognition: Ordinatio 1.3. New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Vos, A., H. Veldhuis, E. Dekker, N.W. den Bok and A.J. Beck (eds.), 2003. Duns Scotus on Divine Love: Texts and Commentary on Goodness and Freedom, God and Humans, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Williams, Thomas, 2017. Duns Scotus: Selected Writings on Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan B., OFM, 1987. Duns Scotus: Philosophical Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • –––, 2000. A Treatise on Potency and Act. Questions on the Metaphysics of Aristotle Book IX, St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute Publications.
  • –––, 2001. Political and Economic Philosophy, St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute Publications.
  • Wolter, Allan B., OFM, and Felix Alluntis, 1975. John Duns Scotus, God and Creatures. The Quodlibetal Questions. Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wolter, Allan B., OFM, and Oleg V. Bychkov, 2004. The Examined Report of the Paris Lecture: Reportatio I-A. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute. (An English translation and preliminary Latin edition.)

Secondary literature

  • Borland, Tully, and T. Allan Hillman 2017. “Scotus and God’s Arbitrary Will: A Reassessment,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 91: 399–429.
  • Cross, Richard, 1999. Duns Scotus, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014. Duns Scotus’s Theory of Cognition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016. Duns Scotus on God, New York: Routledge.
  • Frank, William A. and Allan B. Wolter, OFM, 1995. Duns Scotus: Metaphysician, Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1995.
  • Hoffmann, Tobias, 2002. Creatura intellecta: Die Ideen und Possibilien bei Duns Scotus mit Ausblick auf Franz von Mayronis, Poncius, und Mastrius, Münster: Aschendorff.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth, et al. (eds.), 2010–2012. Proceedings of the Quadruple Congress on Duns Scotus, 4 volumes, St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth, and Mechthild Dreyer, 2004. The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus: An Introduction, Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • King, Peter, 2002. “Scotus on Metaphysics,” in Williams 2002.
  • Pasnau, Robert, 2002. “Cognition,” in Williams 2002, 285–311.
  • Pini, Giorgio, 2002. Categories and Logic in Duns Scotus: An Interpretation of Aristotle’s Categories in the Late Thirteenth Century, Köln: Brill.
  • Vos, Antonie, 2018. The Theology of John Duns Scotus, Leiden: Brill.
  • Ward, Thomas M., 2014. John Duns Scotus on Parts, Wholes, and Hylomorphism, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2019. “A Most Mitigated Friar: Scotus on Natural Law and Divine Freedom,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 93: 385–409.
  • Williams, Thomas, 1995. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 69: 425–445. [Preprint available online.]
  • –––, 1998. “The Unmitigated Scotus,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 80: 162–181. [Preprint available online.]
  • –––, 2000. “A Most Methodical Lover: On Scotus’s Arbitrary Creator,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 38: 169–202. [Preprint available online.]
  • –––, 2002. The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan B., OFM, 1990. The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, Marilyn McCord Adams (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

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