Supplement to Argument and Argumentation

Historical Supplement: Argumentation in the history of philosophy

Arguments and argumentation figure prominently in most (if not all) influential philosophical traditions. This Supplement presents argumentation as discussed in five prominent traditions from the past: ancient Greek, classical Indian, classical Chinese, medieval Latin, and medieval Islamicate philosophy. The goal is not to present an exhaustive historical account of these developments, but rather to offer a sample of reflections on argumentation in five noteworthy philosophical traditions.

1. Ancient Traditions

1.1 Greece

Argumentative practices in ancient Greece constitute one of the main historical examples of a well-developed argumentative tradition (Dutilh Novaes 2020: ch. 5). The relevant sociopolitical background is that of Athenian democracy (508 to 322 BCE), where citizens could participate in decisions pertaining to governance of the city (M. Hansen 1977–81 [1991]). The three main political bodies were the assembly, the boule, and the courts of law; in all three, decisions were reached on the basis of extensive debates. Thus, being a persuasive orator was of paramount importance for a citizen, both to obtain votes in the assembly and to argue for a legal case in court.

In this setting, those who could train citizens to become skilled orators had something immensely valuable to offer. Many of the well-known thinkers of this period were exactly that: itinerant professional teachers who became collectively known as the Sophists (Notomi 2014; see entry on the Sophists). But with the end of the so-called golden age of Athenian democracy and the disastrous results of the Peloponnesian Wars (431–404 BCE) for Athens, this mode of discursive engagement came to be criticized as a sign of the failure of democracy as a political system. Plato famously (and somewhat unfairly) offers harsh criticism of the Sophists in his dialogues (e.g., the Gorgias, the Republic; see entry on Plato): according to Plato, they only aim at shallow persuasion rather than at the truth (Irani 2017).

Plato promotes a different style of argumentative discourse: instead of the long speeches of the rhetoricians, and following his teacher Socrates (see entry on Socrates), he favors dialogical interactions where speakers take turns in quick succession, in what became known as dialectical encounters. Dialectic seems to have predated Socrates and Plato, as the Eleatic philosophers (Parmenides, Zeno) were apparently already practitioners of this kind of discourse (Castelnérac & Marion 2009; see entry on Zeno of Elea). But Plato was arguably the first to reflect and theorize on these different styles of argumentation.

What does a dialectical encounter look like, concretely? There are a number of detailed reconstructions of the basic features of this practice in the literature (Castelnérac & Marion 2009; Fink 2012). Aristotle’s Topics and its “ninth chapter”, the Sophistical Refutations, may be read as the (presumably) first regimentation/systematization of these practices, thus providing support for a general description thereof:

First of all there are the agents: the questioner and the answerer. There may also have been an audience (Sophistical Refutations 16 175a20–30). The questioner has two main jobs: first, to extract a thesis, the “starting point” for the debate from the answerer; second, to try to force the answerer to admit the contradictory of that starting point, by getting the answerer to agree to certain premises. Alternatively, the questioner can try to reduce the thesis to absurdity. In either case, the questioner aims to refute the answerer. Crucially, the starting point should be something that can be affirmed or denied (Topics 8.2. 158a14–22). For example, “what is knowledge?” would not be allowed as a starting point, as the answerer cannot reply “yes” or “no”. The answerer, on the other hand, has only one task, which is to remain un-refuted within a fixed time (Topics 8.10. 161a1–15). If the answerer is refuted, then the answer should make clear that it is not their fault, but is due solely to the starting point (Topics 8.4. 159a18–22) (Duncombe & Dutilh Novaes 2016: 3).

A key component of dialectic is the concept of refutation, or elenchus in Greek: questioner aims at refutation, answerer tries to avoid being refuted. Readers of Plato will recall the numerous instances where Socrates, by means of questions, elicits various discursive commitments from his interlocutors, only to show that, taken together, these commitments are incoherent. The interlocutor is thus refuted, and must revise their previous discursive commitments so as to restore coherence. But beyond these basic details, there is much discussion in the literature on how best to understand the concept of elenchus (Wolfsdorf 2013).

Practices of dialectic provided the background for the emergence of the first fully-fledged logical system in history, Aristotle’s syllogistic, as described in the Prior Analytics (Dutilh Novaes 2020: ch. 6; see entry on Aristotle’s logic). Syllogistic differs from dialectic more generally in that it views as valid only arguments having the property of necessary truth-preservation (i.e., deductive arguments), whereas dialectic also allows for inductive and analogical arguments (as attested by the wide range of arguments used in Plato’s dialogues). But Aristotle remained equally interested in dialectic more generally, as attested by his manuals on how to argue well in dialectical encounters, the Topics and the Sophistical Refutations, and by the extensive discussions on dialectic even in the Prior Analytics. A key concept introduced by Aristotle in the Sophistical Refutations is that of fallacies, i.e., arguments that appear correct but are ultimately incorrect, thus leading to faulty conclusions (see entry on fallacies). For millennia (and to this day), the identification and study of fallacies remained one of the main instruments to study argumentation.

Plato and Aristotle were not the only Greek thinkers interested in dialectic (see entry on the dialectical school). Later authors continued to discuss the concept of dialectic, even if it acquired different meanings for different authors and traditions (see entry on ancient logic). The Stoics are particularly worth mentioning, as they are credited with developing the first fully-fledged propositional logic, where the validity of arguments is analyzed by means of schemata where numbers take the place of propositions (whereas in Aristotle’s syllogistic, letters take the place of terms). Modus Ponens, for example, was formulated by the Stoics as:

If the 1st, then the 2nd. But the 1st, therefore the 2nd

(See entry on ancient logic.) In sum, a concern with rational discourse and argumentation was a constant element in ancient Greek philosophy, from the early stages with pre-Socratic thinkers all the way until late antiquity.

1.2 India

The classical Indian tradition shares with the ancient Greek tradition the pervasiveness of debating practices. In fact, it might seem that Indian thinkers relished engaging in lively debates even more than their Greek peers, as attested by their sophisticated reflections on argumentation (both for instruction and practice, and as theoretical investigations; Matilal 1998: chs 2 and 3; Solomon 1976). As is well known, classical Indian philosophy is extremely diverse, branching into a plethora of schools. These essentially fall within two groups: Brahmanical schools, which accepted the validity of the Vedic sacred texts (such as Nyāya and Yoga), and schools that rejected the authority of the Vedas (such as Buddhism and Jainism). There was much disagreement among these different schools, thus generating ample opportunity for lively discussions.

While the emergence of sustained debating practices in ancient Greece was greatly influenced by the political background, in India debating practices emerged as a response to different circumstances, in particular to address metaphysical, epistemological and religious issues (see entry on epistemology in classical Indian philosophy). The historical record suggests that kings and rulers encouraged and patronized such debates between sages, thus providing an institutional, social embedding quite different from the background for intellectual endeavors in ancient Greece. On the whole, while the Greeks were primarily interested in moral and political issues, Indian thinkers mainly focused on ontological, epistemological, medical, and religious questions such as the distinction of the soul from the body, the purpose of life, the different sources of knowledge, and the existence of the after-life (Matilal 1998; though these discussions also had moral implications).

The popularity of debates dates back to the early stages in the history of Indian thought (as early as 1700 BCE), but the first theories of argumentation only appeared around the time of the Buddha and other religious reformers (6th century BCE). By the third and second centuries BCE, monks and Brahmans were required to have training in the art of debating. Debating manuals were written within the different sectarian schools (Matilal 1998), containing accounts of highly regimented debating practices displaying the same level of sophistication (if not beyond) as Greek dialectic (see entry on logic in classical Indian philosophy). The Indian authors distinguished between friendly, honest debates, where presumably the common goal was the search for truth, from competitive ones where the goal was mere victory. In the influential Nyāya-sūtra manual, attributed to Akṣapāda Gautama and widely available by 150 CE (exact dates of composition are uncertain), the former were called vāda, while the latter were called jalpa and vitaṇḍā (Nicholson 2010). These manuals contained instructions on how to perform at honest debates as well as discussions of clever argumentative tricks that may be used by disputatious opponents in competitive debates, so as to help the novice to identify and rebut these tricks (Prets 2001). In particular, Indian philosophers also developed sophisticated theories of fallacies (Phillips 2017) that served purposes similar to Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations (Ganeri 2001).

Indian philosophical discussions also tend to have a strong epistemological focus, with a concern for the nature of evidence and discussions on the means of knowledge, pramāṇas (see entry on epistemology in classical Indian philosophy). The Nyāya-sūtra, for example, can be read as offering a formulation of acceptable and sound methods for philosophical discourse and inquiry. Inference (anumāna) was viewed by the Nyāya philosophers (as well as by other schools of thought) as one of the pramāṇas, one of the means of knowledge. But Indian thinkers saw no contradiction between dialectical and epistemological approaches; as is clear in particular in the works of the influential fifth–sixth century CE Buddhist thinker Dignāga, inference—the cognitive process taking one from the known to the unknown—and argument—a device of persuasion—are but two sides of a single coin (see entry on logic in classical Indian philosophy, section 4).

There is much discussion among scholars on whether earlier Indian thinkers did or did not draw a sharp distinction between (what we now call) deductive and inductive reasoning (Siderits 2003), and between monotonic and non-monotonic reasoning (Taber 2004). Inferential knowledge was typically viewed as the product of repeated observations of individual cases, and many authors from the earlier period seemed to view these inferences as sufficiently reliable; an exception were some skeptical thinkers, who emphasized precisely the fact that these inferences were not necessarily truth-preserving (Matilal 1998; Siderits 2003). By contrast, later authors, in particular Dignāga, explicitly recognized arguments having the property of necessary truth-preservation as comprising a special class of arguments. Indeed, over the centuries theories and practices of argumentation in the Indian tradition continued to evolve, thus offering much valuable material for those interested in the history of theories of argumentation.

1.3 China

Chinese intellectuals were also deeply interested in argumentation (C. Hansen 1983), a practice described as biàn or biàn shuō in classical Chinese texts. In particular, the thinkers associated with the “School of Names” were especially keen on disputations, including idle contests of wits (at least according to their critics). Indeed, some of these thinkers have been described as the “Chinese sophists”, given the (at least superficial) similarities with the Greek sophists (see entry on the School of Names). Moreover, Chinese thinkers also dealt with contexts of “mass persuasion”, that is persuasion of large groups of people (even if they were not fellow citizens like in Greece), such as groups of followers of different masters.

Biàn is in fact a more general concept, its core meaning pertaining to drawing distinctions,

as a verb referring to the act of distinguishing or discriminating things from each other and as a noun referring to distinctions. (Fraser 2013: 4)

But for these classical Chinese thinkers, a debate or argument is in fact an activity primarily aimed at drawing distinctions, hence the secondary meaning the term acquired as referring to disputation and argument. Essentially, the question in a disputation is usually whether a given name is suitably applied to a given object (or event), as revealed by a passage from the Mohist Dialectics (A74, as cited in the entry on Mohist canons (note 25)):

Canon: Biàn is contending over converses. Winning in biàn is fitting the thing.

Explanation: One calls it “ox”, the other calls it “non-ox”. This is contending over converses. These do not jointly fit the object. If they do not jointly fit, it must be that one does not fit.

While this may seem like an idle discussion, Chinese thinkers took the rectification of names to be of paramount importance. If speakers do not use names and terms uniformly, chaos and anarchy will ensue. In particular, they will not be able to follow commands as intended by their superiors, as these thinkers emphasized the action-guiding over the descriptive functions of language (see entry on the School of Names, supplement “Disputation in context”).

While intellectuals of all main traditions in the classical period discussed (and presumably engaged in) biàn, there are three main (interrelated) accounts of argumentation in classical Chinese thought: that of the early Mohists in their rebuttal of fatalism, that of the later Mohist dialectic, and that of Xúnzǐ (a prominent thinker in the Confucian tradition; Fraser 2013). And yet, while they contain sophisticated analyses of proper and improper uses of language in disputations, they remain fundamentally different from the theories of argumentation found in Aristotle’s texts, for example, in particular in that there is no explicit articulation of inferential rules and principles—even if implicitly they seem to endorse certain principles, such as the principle of non-contradiction when stating that something cannot both be called “ox” and “non-ox” (see passage quoted above). The key concept in the Chinese context is that of analogy:

inference is thus understood as the act of distinguishing something as a certain kind of thing on the basis of having distinguished it as similar to a relevant “model” or “standard”. (Fraser 2013: 4)

As noted above, analogical reasoning is also widely present in the Greek tradition, but in the latter it coexists with other modes of reasoning, including deductive reasoning. In this respect, we may say that the property of necessary truth-preservation did not stand out for the Chinese thinkers, who were primarily concerned with language-world relations rather than with relations between sentences (as part of a more general pragmatic intellectual orientation). So here again we have an argumentative tradition tailored to the needs of its practitioners in their own sociocultural circumstances.

2. Medieval Traditions

2.1 Latin

The Latin medieval intellectual tradition is commonly thought to span from Boethius in the sixth century up to the fifteenth century and beyond. The common denominators were the use of Latin as lingua franca and its (institutional as well as intellectual) proximity with Christianity. A focus on debating and argumentation is a crucial feature of this tradition, in particular as crystalized in what is known as scholastic disputation. Scholastic disputation is a formalized, rigorous procedure for debate, based on fairly strict rules, which became one of the main approaches for intellectual inquiry in medieval Europe (Novikoff 2013). Inspired by ancient Greek argumentation methods, it was then further developed in the monasteries of the early Middle Ages. It reached its pinnacle from the twelfth century onwards, especially with the birth and growth of universities, where it became one of the main teaching methods (see entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy). The influence of disputations went well beyond universities, expanding towards multiple spheres of cultural life.

Schematically, such disputations may be described thus:

[A disputation] is a regular form of teaching, apprenticeship and research, presided over by a master, characterized by a dialectical method which consists of bringing forward and examining arguments based on reason and authority which oppose one another on a given theoretical or practical problem and which are furnished by participants, and where the master must come to a doctrinal solution by an act of determination which confirms him in his function as master. (Bazán, Wippel, Fransen, & Jacquart 1985: 40; as quoted in the entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy)

In other words, a disputation starts with a statement, and then goes on to examine arguments in favor and against the statement. A disputation is essentially a dialogical practice in that it features two (possibly fictive) parties disagreeing on a given statement and producing arguments to defend their respective positions, even if both roles can be played by one and the same person. The goal may simply be that of convincing an interlocutor and/or the audience, but the implication is typically that something deeper is achieved, namely coming closer to the truth by examining the question from many different angles (Angelelli 1970).

Medieval intellectuals engaged in “live” disputations, both privately, between a master and a pupil, and as grand public events attended by the university community at large (Novikoff 2013). Moreover, the general structure is used extensively in some of the most prominent writings by these authors (some of them are in fact written-up versions of disputations actually having taken place, known as reportatio). For example, Aquinas’ Summa Theologica—possibly the most influential work from the scholastic tradition—follows the structure of a disputation, with arguments for and against specific claims being examined (see entry on Thomas Aquinas). Indeed, disputation became one of the chief methods for intellectual inquiry in general, and medieval treatises on philosophical topics typically contain a fair amount of disputational vocabulary. The widespread presence of disputation and related genres has been described as “the institutionalization of conflict” in scholasticism (see entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy).

Logical textbooks were expected to provide the required training to excel in the art of disputation, with chapters on fallacies, consequence, the logical structure and meaning of propositions, obligationes (a special kind of disputation) etc., all of which are directly relevant for the art of disputation (see entries on medieval theories of consequence, properties of terms, and obligationes). In fact, to a great extent Latin medieval authors did not differentiate between “logica” and “dialectica”, as attested by the fact that a number of influential logical textbooks—Abelard’s De Dialectica, Buridan’s Summulae de dialectica—bore the term “dialectica” in their titles. As late as in the sixteenth century, the Spanish scholastic author Domingo de Soto still defined dialectic/logic as “the art or science of disputing” (Ashworth 2011).

But elsewhere, Renaissance authors such as Lorenzo Valla (Nauta 2009; see entry on Lorenzo Valla) were harsh critics of the genre of scholastic disputation. These authors deplored the lack of applicability of scholastic logic; Valla for example saw syllogisms as an artificial type of reasoning, useless for orators on account of being too far removed from natural ways of speaking and arguing. They condemned the cumbersome, artificial and overly technical Latin of scholastic authors, and defended a return to the classical Latin of Cicero and Vergil. Many Renaissance authors did not belong to the university system, where scholasticism was still the norm in the fifteenth century; instead, many were civil servants, and were thus involved in politics, administration, and civic life in general. As such, they were much more interested in rhetoric and persuasion than in logic and demonstration (Dutilh Novaes 2017).

The demise of scholasticism was a gradual process, and for centuries the logic taught at universities was still based on general Aristotelian theories such as syllogistic. But as a whole, logic and argumentation became less prominent topics of discussion for thinkers in the early modern period (Dutilh Novaes 2020: ch. 7). One exception is the so-called Port Royal Logic (1662), which presented itself explicitly as a manual on the art of thinking, but which contains extensive discussions on modes of arguing as well (see entry on Port Royal logic).

2.2 Islamicate

With the advent of Islam in the seventh century, a new cultural and intellectual tradition was initiated; alongside the novelty of Islam, it drew significantly from earlier sources such as ancient Greek philosophy and also Persian and Arabic sources (among others). (The term “Islamicate” is used to refer to what pertains to regions in which Muslims are culturally dominant, but not specifically to the religion of Islam as such.) The primary language of learning in this tradition was Arabic, but significant texts were also written in Persian, Turkish and Hebrew (among other languages).

In this tradition, the term jadal was generally used to refer to argumentative practices and accompanying theories; it is commonly translated as “dialectic” or “disputation theory” (Young 2017; Miller 2020). Islamicate theories of argumentation come in many kinds, emerging within specific fields of inquiry such as theology and later jurisprudence, but also as domain-independent reflections on how to reason and argue well, in particular but not exclusively in connection with logic and ancient Greek sources such as Aristotle (see entry on Arabic and Islamic philosophy of language and logic).

The advent of the Abbasid Caliphate (750–1258) marked the beginning of systematic efforts to translate a wide range of ancient Greek texts, in particular texts by Aristotle and his commentators, under the protection and sponsorship of these rulers. The translation movement culminated around 830 in the circle of al-Kindî in Baghdad, and inaugurated the intellectual tradition of falsafa (an alliteration for the Greek word “philosophia”), which, at least initially, was viewed as a competitor for the “local” traditions of kalam (rational theology) and fiqh (Islamic jurisprudence) (Miller 2020; see entries on Greek sources in Arabic and Islamic philosophy and on Arabic and Islamic natural philosophy and natural science). The latter also offered accounts of reasoning and argumentation (in their specific domains), but until the eleventh century there was little cross-pollination between them and Greek-inspired logic and philosophy.

The earliest fully-fledged theories of jadal emerged in theological contexts, around the turn of the ninth to the tenth century (Miller 2020: ch. 2). For these theologians, jadal is a method for attaining truth, used by God in disputing with the Jews, and taught by God to his prophet. The focus is thus predominantly epistemological, but jadal is said to explicitly involve at least two people (thus being different from solitary speculation) who exchange questions and answers. The ultimate goal is to defend and prove the truth of Islam in contexts of religious disputes. The authors in this tradition wrote detailed treatises that included discussions of rules of conduct during debates, objections and counter-objections, and signs of defeat. The theological tradition of jadal then provided the substratum for the development of dialectical theories of jurisprudence (Miller 2020: ch. 4).

Within falsafa, argumentation was initially studied from the perspective of the Aristotelian Organon. By the early tenth century, a group of self-declared Peripatetics in Baghdad presented themselves as the defenders of Aristotelian orthodoxy. The most famous member of this group was al-Farabi, who composed a series of commentaries on the books of the Organon, including an influential commentary on Aristotle’s Topics, which was known as the Book of Dialectic (Kitāb al-Jadal; (DiPasquale 2019; see entries on al-Farabi and al-Farabi’s philosophy of logic and language). At this stage, unsurprisingly, these thinkers were predominantly interested in the key topics of Aristotle’s logical canon such as syllogistic, dialectic, and demonstration, and developed detailed theories on argumentation (Miller 2020: ch. 3).

All this was to change thanks to the larger-than-life figure of Ibn Sina (Avicenna; ca. 970–1037; see entry on Ibn Sina). Ibn Sina reoriented the Aristotelian conception of logic as closely connected with dialectic and argumentation towards a more epistemological, mentalistic approach (see entry on Ibn Sina’s logic). Ibn Sina went on to become the most influential thinker in the Islamicate tradition in subsequent centuries, and this meant that the study of logic, referred to as mantiq, became by and large divorced from jadal.

In later periods, the “foreign” theories of the falsafa tradition were finally (partially) incorporated into the original traditions in jurisprudence, law and theology, in particular with the rise of the madrasa system starting in the late eleventh century (El-Rouayheb 2016; madrasas were official institutions of learning, functionally similar to European universities). In the madrasas, the Arabic scholastic method became consolidated and widely disseminated (see entry on Arabic and Islamic philosophy of language and logic). But theories of disputation tended to be studied as an independent discipline, called “the science of disputation” ('ilm al-munazara) or “the rules of discussion” (ādāb al-baḥth), whereas logic (mantiq) remained focused on epistemological concerns. As described by Miller (2020: 103),

ādāb al-baḥth emerged as an independent intellectual discipline and literary genre by adopting concepts from Aristotelian logic and philosophy as well as rules formulated in the context of both juridical and theological dialectics. (The earliest works in the ādāb al-baḥth tradition date to the first half of the 14th century)

Thus, over the centuries, authors and thinkers in the Islamic World produced sophisticated theories of argumentation, and this from different angles, in particular theology, law, and philosophy.

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Catarina Dutilh Novaes <>

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