Ancient Atomism

First published Tue Aug 23, 2005; substantive revision Tue Oct 18, 2022

A number of philosophical schools in different parts of the ancient world held that the universe is composed of some kind of ‘atoms’ or minimal parts, albeit for different reasons. Although the modern term ‘atom’ derives from the ancient Greek adjective atomos, which literally means ‘uncuttable’, it is possible that the first theories we can describe as atomist were developed in classical Indian philosophy. While the ancient Greeks from whom we derive the modern term were theorizing about the fundamental constituents of the natural world, philosophical discussions have embraced various forms of minima, indivisible units or building blocks. Scholarly uses of the term ‘atomism’ range over mereological theories in widely different contexts (Zilioli 2021); not all possible senses of the term are discussed here. Several ancient atomist theories are treated in more depth in other articles in this encyclopedia: the reader is referred to individual entries for detailed discussions by the relevant experts (see the list of related entries at the end of this article).

The term ‘atomism’ is sometimes understood to refer to theories explaining changes in the material world by the rearrangements of minute particles of matter, or to the idea that any kind of magnitude—geometrical extension, time and space—is composed of indivisible parts. Theories of mathematical minima were formulated in response to paradoxes like those of Zeno of Elea (early 5th c. BCE) about infinite divisibility of magnitudes. However, theories of smallest parts could be introduced for reasons quite distinct from mathematical problems about divisibility: atomism in classical Indian philosophy seems to have been motivated by the desire to reflect the categories used in analysis of the metaphysical structure of reality shown in language (Carpenter 2021). While in the Greek tradition, atoms were held to be eternal and indestructible particles that persist through changes in the visible world of experience, that is not always a feature of ancient atomist theories. Some Indian philosophical systems held that atoms are created and subject to transformation or destruction, or that they are only momentary features of experience. Atomists from monotheistic schools—including medieval Islamic kalām philosophers and seventeenth century figures like Pierre Gassendi—adapted atomist theories to allow for the creation and destruction of atoms by God. Some scholars (Pyle 1997) treat a particular strand of atomist thought as an ideal type, yet the diversity of atomist thought seems to belie this stricture (Lüthy, Murdoch and Newman 2001).

The interactions of particles too small to observe is a compelling way to account for perceptible changes in the natural world. Even Aristotle—often cast as the arch-enemy of atomism—allowed that there might be a lower limit to the quantity of matter that could instantiate certain properties. But not all atomist theories were based on an appearance/reality distinction: Buddhist philosophers posited phenomenal instants with minimum extension in time as well as space, to mirror the ephemerality of moments of human experience. Void spaces between atoms sometimes, but not always, feature in atomist theories.

1. Atomism in Classical Indian Philosophy

The beginnings of atomism in classical Indian philosophy are difficult to ascertain, but it likely has origins several centuries before the common era. Two distinct systems that regard Vedic texts as authoritative, Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika, favoured atomist accounts of the material world. Quite different atomist theories are found in Buddhist and Jaina systems. Other Indian philosophical systems were critical of atomism, arguing instead for an idealist account of experience. The Buddhist philosopher Vasubandhu (5th c. CE), whose earlier Treasury of Metaphysics is often considered an atomist account, critiqued atomism in his Twenty Verses.

The terms translated ‘atom’ in Indian philosophy (aṇu, paramāṇu) refer primarily to the smallness of parts (Gangopadhyaya 1980): this notion of smallness, found in the Upanishads, was developed into atomist theories in the commentary tradition. A classic argument for atomism reasons by analogy from the fact that perceptible objects seem to be composed of parts (Chatterjee 2017). Yet, the argument ran, bodies cannot be infinitely divisible because this would lead to the paradoxical result that a mountain and a mustard seed would be equal in size. This rebuttal—closely echoed in Islamic debates—is based on the kind of paradox about summation of infinite series also found in the ancient Greek tradition (Bhaduri 1947, 55). The comparison of mountain and mustard seed was also deployed to argue that the concepts of small and large would be indistinguishable unless smallness had a defined magnitude (Gangopadhyaya 1980, 29).

Not all Indian atomist theories regard minima as substantial entities. Carpenter (2021) describes the trope theory of Vasubandhu as ‘absolute atomism’: this characterization challenges the notion that atomism canonically centres on the positing of enduring particles. Instead, the focus is on minimal units in time as well as space, which are simultaneously minimal components of ontological units and not substance-attribute composites.

A tradition that the Greek atomist Democritus was acquainted with the ideas of the ‘gymnosophists’ or ‘naked wise men’ of India is difficult to authenticate. Claims that Indian atomism was shaped by Greek influences (Keith 1921, 17) are uncommon in recent scholarship. The possibility that Islamic atomism was impacted by debates in classical Indian philosophy has been more extensively considered, particularly given parallel arguments and the shared view that atoms never exist in isolation (Pines 1997; Wolfson 1976). Another feature common to both traditions is a willingness to ascribe sensible qualities to atoms, in contrast to Greek atomist theories. Indian Buddhist scholars introduced atomist theories to China from the second century CE onward, but they seem not to have been adopted into ancient Chinese natural philosophy (Needham 1969, 22).

1.1 Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomism

The Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika systems developed separately, the former focusing on epistemological issues and the latter on ontology. Nonetheless, there were enough overlap and later reconciliations between them that scholars often consider their picture of the natural world together. Both schools developed as traditions of commentary on the Upanishads, dating back to 800 BCE (Phillips 1995). In contrast to the Buddhist tradition, atoms in these systems of thought were regarded as external material substances that persist through change, although—in line with the teachings of the Vedic scriptures—the atoms were thought to be created. Important figures in the textual tradition include Kaṇāda, regarded as founder of the Vaiśeṣika school; Prásastapāda, author of the first surviving commentary; Gautama (ca. 150 CE); Vātsyāyana (ca. 400 CE). The work of Udayana (11th c. CE) and Gañgeśa (c. 1325 CE) gave rise to a new school, Navya- Nyāya, that largely merged the two traditions (Matilal 1977; Phillips 1995; Ganeri 2019).

Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomism developed in constant dialogue with other Indian philosophical schools: in a context where Buddhism offered a compelling narrative of personal salvation through detachment from the unrealities of the experienced world, some Hindu philosophers responded by bolstering their case for the realism of the experienced world, and real atomic substances were invoked to explain both mental and physical events (Ganeri 2011, 167–8). The idea that experienced properties inhere in real external substances was used to account for intersubjective agreement about the external world.

The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika theory posited different kinds of atoms for each of the elements earth, water, air and fire, in contrast to the Jaina theory that there is a single homogenous matter out of which everything is composed (Gangopadhyaya 1980). Atoms were regarded as substances and bearers of different attributes. Different clusters of properties were ascribed to atoms of different kinds (Dasgupta 1987; Chatterjee 2017). In contrast to the Greek atomists, who denied that sensible properties really inhere in atoms at all, atoms of different elements are thought to have perceptible properties, such as cold for water atoms. Some theorists allow for the possibility of altering the fundamental properties of atoms by heating (Thakar 2003). For atomists in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika systems, who held that the atoms are made of fundamentally different matter, there is a problem of explaining how properties of one kind of atom can affect an atom of a different kind, i.e. how the viscosity of water atoms is able to combine with earth atoms and to change their consistency (Gangopadhyaya 1980, 34).

Atoms combine into dyads and triads before they aggregate into bodies of a kind that can be perceived. The theory however faced a question how atoms can combine, if they are indeed partless: unless we can distinguish different parts to an atom, it is difficult to see how they can be said to be next to one another—side by side—any more than mathematical points can be said to join together rather than collapsing into a single point. The response is to deny the analogy to points, since atoms are tangible entities and two of them cannot occupy the same place (Bhaduri 1947, 63), thus atoms do not lose their identity when they aggregate. Another approach to the problem is due to Vasubandhu in the Buddhist tradition (see Carpenter 2021).

Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomism also faced the challenge that their theory was only based on logical inference and could not be confirmed by experience (Bhaduri 1947, 58). In the atomism of Gautama, recognizing the reality of composites is important to secure the basis for knowledge, since atoms themselves are too small to be seen. Vātsyāyana supports this conclusion empirically, pointing out that a forest may be visible from a distance where the individual trees are not (Sarkar 2021). In an ongoing controversy with Buddhist philosophers over the reality of composite entities, Nyāya atomists denied that we are aware of composites only indirectly or by means of awareness of individual parts (Matilal 1986, 268).

Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika atomists held that the world was created when order was imposed on pre-existing matter: the motion of atoms was ascribed to a divine source. Their analysis of motion and its causes employs concepts that have been compared to modern notions of force (Kumar 2019). Although the systems had naturalistic leanings, unusual motions such as the action of a magnet might be ascribed—as it was in the European middle ages—to the moral condition of human agents (Matilal 1977, 58). The organization of atoms was cited as a proof for the existence of God by the 11th century CE atomist Udayana (Gangopadhyaya 1980, 36). The mind and self or soul—like time and space—was regarded as a distinct category from material elements, a distinction traced back to the classical scriptures.

1.2 Buddhist atomist theories

Developed in the centuries after the Buddha (6th c. BCE), Buddhist philosophies, especially the Abhidhamma school, systematized the underlying philosophy of a body of texts that focused on human lived experience. The entities in Buddhist theory that are considered atomistic are not substances but momentary events, dharmas or dhammas: ‘the constituents of sentient experience, the irreducible “building blocks” that make up one’s world’ (Ronkin 2005, 41). These atomic particulars can be mental or physical, and have been compared to trope theories or process metaphysics in contemporary scholarship. Unlike theories of atomic substances, Buddhist atoms are not composed of multiple properties. In contrast to Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomists, Buddhists deny that there is an underlying substance uniting different properties like the colour and the weight of a jar (Bhaduri 1947). Atomic property-instances do not occur in isolation, any more than nouns and verbs made sense alone.

Despite the phenomenological character that atoms sometimes bear in Buddhist thought, questions about compositionality occur which parallel issues in other ancient atomist theories (Goodman 2004, Carpenter 2021). Vaiśeṣika thought—which accepted categories like substance and soul—impacted the articulation of Abhidhamma ontology, an articulation that sometimes led to charges of ‘ontologization,’ i.e. of moving away from the experiential focus of Buddhist thought towards a more systematic metaphysics (Ronkin 2005). Material atoms are first found in Buddhist thought in the work of Dharmasri (2nd c. CE), and feature in the work of Vasubandhu and Sanghabhadra (both 5th c. CE) (Ronkin 2005, 56).

Buddhist versions of atomism differ from Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika versions on the status of the wholes composed of atoms, with the former treating composites as mere aggregates, the latter regarding them as distinct entities in their own right (Sarkar 2021). The Buddhist emphasis on the transitory nature of material reality was part of the motivation for their interest in atomist explanations (Gangopadhyaya 1980, 52; Ronkin 2005, 59). In the enumeration of different kinds of mental states, notions that correspond to materiality are included, although earth, water, wind and fire are typically considered to be merely mental constructs in Buddhist thought.

Atoms were nonetheless used in materialist explanations, which account for physical phenomena such as the combination of different elements to form macroscopic materials. Because we appear to see visible particles of dust, or rays of light shining on glass or mirrors, it seemed reasonable to suppose that interactions too small to perceive produce observed changes in the macroscopic world (Dasgupta 1987). Heat and light were thought to be produced by minute corpuscles entering other bodies. Buddhist atomism regarded atomic properties such as solidity, heat and motion as producing perceptible changes at the macroscopic level (Gangopadhyaya 1980, 13–14). Even with non-material atoms, the question of their occupation of space was considered: Matilal suggests that tangibility may have been regarded as a latent property of the atoms, which emerges like visibility when they cluster (Matilal 1986, 361). Different Buddhist schools disagreed on the answer to these questions.

Problems about the possibility of motion, developed especially by the Buddhist Nāgārjuna (2nd c. CE), prompted responses in other schools of thought (Matilal 1977, 79; Dasgupta 1987). Although the persistence of macroscopic bodies might be illusory, there were discussions about the momentum or persisting tendencies of moving bodies, the different directions exhibited by these tendencies in a rotating wheel, and the cohesion of particles within moving bodies.

1.3 Jaina atomism

Jaina atomist theory treats matter, space and time as composed of indivisible smallest parts (Pines 1987). Although natural philosophy may not have occupied a large role in Jaina thought, the reason for positing atoms is as the ultimate cause of perceived physical qualities (Nyayavijayaji 1998). They posited a homogenous matter out of which every material body is composed, in contrast to the atomism of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Buddhist systems, which posited atoms of different kinds for each of the elements earth, water, fire and air (Gangopadhyaya 1980). Atoms thus bring different properties to aggregates, as, for example, the addition of water atoms causes earth atoms to stick together (Dasgupta 1987). The tendency of atoms to cohere into aggregates was thought to come from their own nature and not from external pressures (Nyayavijayaji 1998).

Jaina atomists also regarded soul as a distinct kind of entity, although they held that material atoms can percolate into soul and affect it. Space was also treated as a distinct kind of substance (Mehta 1954). Jaina tradition claims to have been the oldest atomist system and to have inspired Vaiśeṣika atomism, although recent scholarship suggests that the reverse is true (Matilal 1977, 60; Thakar 2003, 7–8, 450).

2. Ancient Greek Atomism

Ancient Greek atomists developed a systematic and comprehensive natural philosophy accounting for the origins of everything from the interaction of indivisible bodies, as these atoms—which have only a few intrinsic properties like size and shape—strike against one another, rebound and interlock in an infinite void. In both its Democritean and its Epicurean versions, Greek atomism eschewed teleological explanation and denied divine intervention or design, regarding every composite of atoms as produced purely by material interactions of bodies, and accounting for the perceived properties of macroscopic bodies as produced by these same atomic interactions. Ancient Greek atomists formulated views on ethics, theology, political philosophy and epistemology consistent with this physical system. This powerful and consistent materialism was regarded by Aristotle as a chief competitor to teleological natural philosophy; following his criticisms, the theory was reformulated by Epicurus and had a second life as the philosophy of a school devoted to the pursuit of tranquillity and a communal life of simple pleasures.

2.1 Leucippus and Democritus

Leucippus (5th c. BCE) is usually credited with inventing atomism in the Greek tradition. According to a passing remark by the geographer Strabo, Posidonius (1st c. BCE Stoic philosopher) reported that ancient Greek atomism can be traced back to a figure known as Moschus or Mochus of Sidon, who lived at the time of the Trojan wars. This report was given credence in the seventeenth century: the Cambridge Platonist Henry More traced the origins of ancient atomism back, via Pythagoras and Moschus, to Moses. This theologically motivated view appealed to those who saw revelation as the source of all truth and wanted to trace ancient Greek ideas to Biblical sources. An ancient Greek source commenting on the travels of Democritus credits his mathematical interests to time spent among Egyptian geometers and suggests that he may have learned from the philosophers of India.

In 1877, Tannéry argued that Zeno of Elea’s arguments about divisibility would make most sense if formulated in response to an atomist theory supposedly held by some early Pythagoreans. Tannéry’s thesis has been thoroughly challenged since then: most scholars instead consider atomism to be one of a number of positions formulated in response to the arguments of Parmenides and Zeno (first half of the fifth century).

Little is known about Leucippus, while the ideas of his student Democritus—who is said to have taken over and systematized his teacher’s theory—are known from a large number of reports and fragments quoted by others. These early atomists theorized that the two fundamental and oppositely characterized constituents of the natural world are indivisible bodies—atoms—and void. The latter is described simply as nothing, or as the negation of being. Atoms were said to be intrinsically unchangeable; they can move about in the void and combine into different clusters, which give rise to the macroscopic bodies of the perceived world. Because all macroscopic objects are in fact combinations of atoms, everything in the world of our experience is transitory and subject to dissolution while the atoms themselves persist through all time.

According to Aristotle’s presentation (On Generation and Corruption I 8), the motivation for the first postulation of indivisible bodies is to answer a metaphysical puzzle about the possibility of change and multiplicity. Parmenides had argued that any differentiation or change in Being implies that ‘what is not’ either is or comes to be. Although there are problems in interpreting Parmenides’ precise meaning, he was understood to have raised a problem about how change can be possible without something coming from nothing. Several Presocratics formulated, in response, philosophical systems in which change is not considered to require something coming into being from complete nonexistence, but rather the arrangement of pre-existing elements into new combinations. The atomists held that, the atoms are unchangeable and contain no internal differentiation of a sort that would allow for division.

By positing indivisible bodies, the atomists were also thought to be answering Zeno’s paradoxes about the impossibility of motion. Zeno had argued that, if magnitudes can be divided to infinity, it would be impossible for motion to occur. The problem seems to be that a body moving would have to traverse an infinite number of spaces in a finite time. By supposing that the atoms form the lowest limit to division, the atomists escape from this dilemma: a total space traversed has only a finite number of parts. As it is unclear whether the earliest atomists understood the atoms to be physically or theoretically indivisible, they may not have made the distinction. Makin’s argument that atomic indivisibility is based on the homogeneity of substance and not smallness explains why Democritus allowed for the possibility of even very large atoms (Makin 1993, 55).

Atoms can differ in size, shape, order and position; they move about in the void, and—depending on their shape—some can temporarily bond with one another by means of tiny hooks and barbs on their surfaces. Thus the shape of individual atoms affects the macroscopic texture of clusters of atoms, which may be fluid and yielding or firm and resistant, depending on the amount of void space between and the coalescence of the atomic shapes. The texture of surfaces and the relative density and fragility of different materials are also accounted for by the same means. Atoms cannot fuse, but rather repel one another when they collide. Observations about the tendencies of bodies bumping one another were frequently exploited to explain the apparently patterned motions of macroscopic bodies in the visible world.

The atomists accounted for perception by means of films of atoms sloughed off from their surfaces by external objects, and entering and impacting the sense organs. They tried to account for all sensible effects by means of contact, and regarded all sense perceptions as caused by the properties of the atoms making up the films acting on the atoms of animals’ sense organs. Perceptions of color are caused by the ‘turning’ or position of the atoms; tastes are caused by the shape of the atoms contacting the tongue, e.g., bitter tastes by the tearing caused by sharp atoms; feelings of heat are ascribed to friction. Heat itself is said to be caused by the admixture of tiny fire atoms. Democritus considered thought to be a material process involving the local rearrangement of bodies, just as much as is perception.

A famous quotation from Democritus distinguishes between perceived properties like colors and tastes, which exist only ‘by convention,’ in contrast to the reality, which is atoms and void. However, he apparently recognized an epistemological problem for an empiricist philosophy that nonetheless regards the objects of sense as unreal. In another famous quotation, the senses accuse the mind of overthrowing them, although mind is dependent on the senses. The accusation is that, by developing an atomist theory that undermines the basis for confidence in sense perception, thought has in effect undercut its own foundation on knowledge gained through the senses. Democritus sometimes seems to doubt or deny the possibility of knowledge.

The early Greek atomists try to account for the formation of the natural world by means of their simple ontology of atoms and void alone. Leucippus held that there are an infinite number of atoms moving for all time in an infinite void, and that these can form into cosmic systems or kosmoi by means of a whirling motion which randomly establishes itself in a large enough cluster of atoms. It is controversial whether atoms are thought to have weight as an intrinsic property, causing them all to fall in some given direction, or whether weight is simply a tendency for atoms (which otherwise move in any and every direction, except when struck) to move towards the centre of a system, created by the whirling of the cosmic vortices. When a vortex is formed, it creates a membrane of atoms at its outer edge, and the outer band of atoms catches fire, forming a sun and stars. These kosmoi are impermanent, and are not accounted for by purpose or design. The earth is described as a flat cylindrical drum at the center of our cosmos.

Species are not regarded as permanent abstract forms, but as chance combinations of atoms. Living things are regarded as having a psychê or principle of life; this is identified with fiery atoms. Organisms are thought to reproduce by means of seed: Democritus seems to have held that both parents produce seeds composed of fragments from each organ of their body. Whichever of the parts drawn from the relevant organ of the parents predominates in the new mixture determines which characteristics are inherited by the offspring. Democritus is reported to have given an account of the origin of human beings from the earth. He is also said to be the founder of a kind of cultural anthropology (Cole 1967), since his account of the origin of the cosmos includes an account of the origin of human institutions, including language and social and political organization.

A large group of reports about Democritus’ views concern ethical maxims: some scholars have tried to regard these as systematic or dependent on atomist physics, while others doubt the closeness of the connection. Because several maxims stress the value of ‘cheerfulness,’ Democritus is sometimes portrayed as ‘the laughing philosopher.’ The frequent association between hedonism and atomism may stem from the denial of any source of good other than immediate experience; the tendency to reduce experience to the rubbing together of atoms may have contributed to the impression that atomists are preoccupied with physical pleasure.

2.2 Plato, Platonists and Pythagoreans

Although the Greek term atomos is most commony associated with the solid and impenetrable bodies posited by Leucippus and Democritus, Plato’s Timaeus presents a different kind of physical theory based on indivisibles and was also regarded as a kind of atomism. Plato’s discussion of the composition of solids from plane surfaces is sometimes thought to be based on fourth-century Pythagorean theories. A fourth-century Pythagorean, Ecphantus, interpreted the Pythagorean monads as indivisible bodies: he is reported to have been sympathetic to atomism of a kind similar to Democritus’.

Plato’s Timaeus elaborates an account of the world wherein the four different basic kinds of body—earth, air, fire, and water—are regular solids composed from plane figures: isosceles and scalene right-angled triangles. Because the same triangles can form into different regular solids, the theory thus explains how some of the elements can transform into one another, as was widely believed. In this theory, it is the elemental triangles composing the solids that are regarded as indivisible, not the solids themselves. When Aristotle discusses the hypothesis that the natural world is composed of indivisibles, the two views he considers are those of Plato and Democritus. Aristotle criticizes both Plato and fourth-century Pythagoreans for constructing natural bodies possessing weight from indivisible mathematical abstractions, whether plane surfaces or numbers. It has been suggested that Plato accepted time atoms, i.e., indivisible minima in time, but this is controversial.

A treatise in the Aristotelian corpus probably not by Aristotle himself (On Indivisible Lines) addresses and refutes a number of arguments offered for the existence of indivisible lines, without naming their author. Plato’s student Xenocrates (396–314 BCE), third head of the Academy, is reported to believe in indivisible lines, and he may well be the target of the Aristotelian treatise. One of the arguments attacked addresses a Zenonian problem about traversing or touching in succession an infinite series of parts. The idea that there are indivisible lines offers an alternative to the view that any extended magnitude must be divisible to infinity. A distinct argument claims that, if the physical elements composing a body are regarded as the ultimate parts, they cannot be further divisible. Although this does not argue for indivisible lines per se, it is used to suggest that the objects of sense as well as those of thought must include things without parts.

A further argument depends on thinking that opposite properties must have opposite characteristics: if ‘many’ or ‘large’ things have infinite parts, it is argued, then ‘few’ or ‘small’ things must have only a finite number of parts. It is then concluded that there must be a magnitude without parts, apparently so that it is not further divisible and thus composed of an infinite number of parts. The last argument depends on the idea that mathematicians talk of commensurable lines, and posit a single unit of measurement: this would not be possible if the unit were divisible, because the parts of the unit, if measured, would be measured by the unit measure and it would then turn out to contain multiple units within itself.

In late antiquity, the Neoplatonist Proclus defended Plato’s account against Aristotle’s objections; these arguments are preserved in Simplicius’ commentary on Aristotle’s On the Heavens. Simplicius credits the Pythagoreans as well as Plato with a theory composing bodies from plane surfaces. Simplicius also compares Pythagorean views to Democritean atomism, inasmuch as both theories posit a cause for hot and cold rather than taking these to be fundamental principles, as the Aristotelians do.

2.3 Minima Naturalia in Aristotelian Thought

An argument in Aristotle (Physics 1.4, 187b14–21) is sometimes taken by later writers as evidence that Aristotle allowed for the existence of minima in natural things. Aristotle writes that there is a smallest size of material substrate on which it is possible for the form of a given natural tissue to occur. Blood and bone, say, are all materially composed of given proportions of earth, air, fire, and water: there needs to be a certain minimal amount of these material components present before the form of blood or bone can occur. This doctrine—while surely compatible with Aristotle’s view that the material components are nonetheless continuous and divisible at any point—is sometimes read by Neoplatonist commentators and later sources interested in rapprochement with atomism as evidence that Aristotle endorsed the existence of minimal physical parts.

In late antiquity, this debate seems to have moved away from the radical solution of positing minimal physical parts or atoms—a view that seems to have had few advocates—into a puzzle about the possibilities of ‘bottom up’ explanation versus the need to regard emergent properties as ‘supervening’ and not mere products of the necessary material base. The term traditionally translated ‘supervene’ here—epigignomai—refers to the idea that forms are thought to come from a distinct source and inhere in suitable material, rather than to be produced by the material substrate: it does not exactly correspond to the technical notion of supervenience formulated in late-20th century philosophy of mind. The reasons for positing minimal thresholds for the supervenience of form in John Philoponus concern the inadequacy of material explanation because changes in the matter do not correlate numerically to—and hence cannot fully explain—changes in qualities, and not because of concerns about minimal parts (Berryman 2002).

Scholars have highlighted the importance of Islamic philosophers in developing what came to be known in medieval Latin philosophy as the doctrine of minima naturalia (Dijksterhuis 1961, 205; Glasner 2001; McGinnis 2015). Giles of Rome particularly developed the notion of a natural minima in Thomistic thought: the notion of a minimum size for a given substance was linked in these discussions to the problem that a given quantity of one element could only be rarefied so far before it becomes a different element (Duhem 1985, 35–45).

Book 4 of Aristotle’s Meteorology was sometimes regarded as inauthentic in the past because of its use of explanations of the microstructure of matter, explanations that some scholars argued were too much of a concession in the direction of atomism to be Aristotle’s own. These arguments are no longer widely accepted.

2.4 Diodorus Cronus

Diodorus Cronus (late 4th c. BCE), a member of the supposed Dialectical School, is reported to have offered new arguments that there must be partless bodies or magnitudes. Most reports suggest that his focus was on logical arguments rather than on physical theory: he used arguments that depend on positing mutually exhaustive alternatives.

Perhaps drawing on an argument of Aristotle’s (Sens. 7, 449a20–31]), Diodorus apparently used the idea that there is a smallest size at which an object at a given distance is visible as the basis for an argument that there are indivisible magnitudes. His argument begins from the idea that there is a difference in size between the smallest size at which a given object is visible—presumably from a given distance—and the largest size at which it is invisible. Unless we concede that, at some magnitude, a body is both invisible and visible (or neither), there cannot be any other magnitude intermediate between these two magnitudes. Magnitudes must increase by discrete units.

Sextus Empiricus (AM 10.48ff) reports an argument of Diodorus’ also concluding that magnitudes have discrete intervals. It also denies the existence of moving bodies, insisting that bodies move neither when they are in the place where they are, nor when they are in the place where they are not. Since these alternatives are presented as exhaustive, the conclusion must be that bodies are never moving. However, rather than assert that everything is static, Diodorus took the view that bodies must have moved without ever being in motion: they are simply at one place at one moment, and at another place at another moment.

As well as postulating the existence of indivisible smallest bodies and magnitudes, Diodorus seems to have supposed that there are indivisible smallest units of time. The argument about motion does not quite make it explicit that this is what he is committed to, but it is a reasonable inference: given his insistence that bodies are always at one place or another at any given time, he might well suppose that infinite divisibility of time would open up the threatening possibility of indeterminacy as to whether the change of place has taken place.

For those who posit indivisibles as a way to escape paradoxes about infinite divisibility, parallel arguments might equally well have been applied to the problem of completing tasks in an infinitely divisible time. Sextus Empiricus reports that the Aristotelian Strato of Lampsacus (d. 268/70 BCE) argued for time atoms, although this is contradicted by other sources. Sorabji (1983) suggests that Strato merely countenanced the possibility that time could be discrete while space and motion are continuous, without endorsing this position.

2.5 Epicurean Atomism

Democritus’ atomism was revived in the early Hellenistic period: Epicurus (341–270 BCE) founded an atomist school in Athens about 306 BCE. The Epicureans formed more of a closed community than other schools, and promoted a philosophy of a simple, pleasant life lived with friends. The community included women, and some of its members raised children. The works of the founder were revered and some of them were memorized, a practice that was thought to have discouraged philosophical innovation by later members of the school, although this view has been challenged (Fish and Sanders 2011).

Epicurus seems to have learned of atomist doctrine through Democritus’ follower Nausiphanes. Because Epicurus made some significant changes in atomist theory, it is often thought that his reformulation of the physical theory is an attempt to respond to Aristotle’s criticisms of Democritus. Even more significant, however, is the increasing centrality of ethical concerns to Epicurus’ atomism, and the importance of the view that belief in an atomist physical theory helps us live better lives.

Epicurus takes to heart a problem Democritus himself recognized, which is that atomist theory threatens to undermine itself if it removes any trust we can place in the evidence of the senses, by claiming that colors, etc. are unreal. He notoriously said that ‘all perception is true,’ apparently distinguishing between the causal processes which impact our senses, all of which originate with the films of atoms sloughed off by objects, and the judgments we make on the basis of them, which may be false. Reasoning to truths about things that are not apparent—like the existence of atoms—depends on the evidence of the senses, which is always true in that it consists of impacts from actually existing films. For particular phenomena, like meteorological events, Epicurus endorses the existence of multiple valid explanations, acknowledging that we may have no evidence for preferring one explanation over another.

It may be that Epicurus was less troubled by any such epistemological uncertainties because of his emphasis on the value of atomist theory for teaching us how to live the untroubled and tranquil life. Denying any divine sanction for morality, and holding that the experience of pleasure and pain are the source of all value, Epicurus thought we can learn from atomist philosophy that pursuing natural and necessary pleasures—rather than the misleading desires inculcated by society—will make pleasure readily attainable. At the same time, we will avoid the pains brought on by pursuing unnatural and unnecessary pleasures. Understanding, on the basis of the atomist theory, that our fears of the gods and of death are groundless will free us from our chief mental pains.

Epicurus made significant changes to atomist physical theory. It seems that Democritus did not distinguish clearly between the physical uncuttability of atoms and their conceptual indivisibility: this raises a problem about how atoms can have parts, as evidenced by their variations in shape or their ability to compose a magnitude, touching one another in a series on different sides. Epicurus distinguished the two, holding that uncuttable atoms did have conceptually distinct parts, but that there was a lowest limit to these. Different solutions to this problem are found in ancient Indian atomism.

Epicurus’ view of the motion of atoms also differs from Democritus’. Rather than talking of a motion towards the center of a given cosmos, possibly created by the cosmic vortex, Epicurus grants to atoms an innate tendency to downward motion through the infinite cosmos. The downward direction is simply the original direction of atomic fall. This may be in response to Aristotelian criticisms that Democritus does not show why atomic motion exists, merely saying that it is eternal and that it is perpetuated by collisions. Moreover, although this is not attested in the surviving writings of Epicurus, authoritative later sources attribute to him the idea that it belongs to the nature of atoms occasionally to exhibit a slight, otherwise uncaused swerve from their downward path. This is thought to explain why atoms have from infinite time entered into collisions instead of falling in parallel paths: it is also said, by Lucretius, to enter into the account of action and responsibility. Scholars have proposed a number of alternative interpretations as to how this is thought to work.

The epistemological concerns discussed above required a different view on the nature of composites and macroscopic, perceptible properties. Epicurus rejected Democritus’ eliminativist position that perceived properties only exist ‘by convention’ (Sedley 1988; O’Keefe 2005). Epicurus’ successor Polystratus further defended and elaborated a claim about the reality of properties, including relational properties. Moreover, with the recovery of new papyrological evidence, controversy has arisen about the extent to which Epicurus rejected Democritus’ attempt to account for all causal processes by the properties of the atoms and void alone. Although Epicurus’ ideas have long been known from three surviving letters preserved in the biography by Diogenes Laertius, no copy of his longer work On Nature had been available. However, following excavation of the Epicurean library at Herculaneum that was buried by a volcanic eruption, some parts of this work are being recovered. Many of the scrolls found are badly damaged, however, and interpretation of this newly recovered material is ongoing.

The Herculaneum library contains much work of the Epicurean Philodemus (1st c. BCE). Philodemus wrote extensively, including on the history of philosophy, ethics, music, poetry, rhetoric and the emotions. He wrote a treatise on the theory of signs: because they are empiricists, believing that all knowledge comes from our sense experience, later Epicureans were concerned about the basis for our knowledge of imperceptibles like the atoms, and engaged in an extensive debate with the Stoics about the grounds for inferences to imperceptible entities.

Although Epicurus’ doctrines teach the value of a quiet life in a specially constructed Epicurean community and decry the search for fame, atomist theory is also regarded as a cure for the troubles afflicting others outside the community, and there are certainly Epicurean texts written for a wider audience. Besides the letters by Epicurus himself summarizing his doctrines, the Epicurean philosopher Lucretius (d. c. 50 BCE) wrote a long Latin poem advocating Epicurus’ ideas to Roman audiences (Sedley 1998). Lucretius makes clear his close allegiance to Epicurus’ own views, and provides more detail on some topics than has survived from Epicurus’ own work, such as an extended account of the origins of human society and institutions. A less sympathetic contemporary of Lucretius, Cicero, also wrote a number of Latin works in which an Epicurean spokesman presents the doctrines of the school.

Diogenes of Oenoanda propagated Epicurean doctrines in Asia Minor, inscribing them on the wall of a Stoa in his home town so as to convert passersby to Epicurean theory. Excavation of these since the nineteenth century has also produced new texts. Smith (1993), in his latest edition of the text of the inscriptions, dates them to the early second century CE.

2.6 Atomism and Particle Theories in Ancient Greek Sciences

Some figures concerned with the natural sciences, especially medicine, are thought to have regarded organic bodies as composed of particles. Galen (2nd c. CE), in On the Natural Faculties, divides medical theorists into two groups, following the division of natural philosophers. On the one side are continuum theorists, who hold that all matter is infinitely divisible but that all the matter in things subject to generation and corruption is susceptible to qualitative alteration. On the other are those who suppose that matter is composed of tiny, unchangeable particles separated by void spaces, and explain qualitative change as produced only in compound bodies, by rearrangement of the particles alone. In Galen’s view, qualitative alteration is needed to produce the powers whereby beneficent Nature directs change: Galen credits the first group with asserting the priority of Nature and its beneficent order, and the latter with denying this.

Although ancient Greek natural philosophers tend to fall on either side of Galen’s divide (Furley 1987)—continuum theory plus beneficent teleology, vs. atomism plus blind necessity— there is a danger in taking this dichotomy to be exhaustive or exclusive of possible natural philosophies. Inasmuch as the view Plato develops in Timaeus is atomistic and also endorses teleological explanation, for example, his position complicates the picture, and other theories of natural philosophy in the Hellenistic period do not divide so neatly onto one side or the other. Comparison to other traditions makes clear that atomism has no necessary affinity to the absence of divine organization. Galen has polemical interests in discrediting those who deny the need for qualitatively irreducible faculties or powers employed by Nature to produce beneficial results.

A prevailing tendency in modern scholarship to identify particle theories with ‘mechanistic’ thinking is not representative of ancient atomism: the identification of Greek atomism as a precursor to the New Science was due to the work of 17th century figures like Pierre Gassendi, Henry More and Robert Boyle. Galen elsewhere explicitly contrasts atomist thought with the schools who appeal to explanations from mechanics (Berryman 2002). Galen’s presentation of Greek natural philosophy was important in the later reception of ideas into Islamic philosophy (Langermann 2009) and the Renaissance (Copenhaver 1998).

The theories of Heracleides of Pontus (4th c. BCE) and Asclepiades of Bythnia (2nd c. BCE) are sometimes likened to atomism (Gottschalk 1980; Vallance 1990). Both—a pupil of Plato, and a medical theorist—are said to have posited the existence of corpuscles they call anarmoi onkoi, likely some kind of partless masses: the precise meaning is uncertain. Although the theories of Asclepiades in particular are often assimilated to atomism, it may be that Galen’s characterization of this view is polemical, and that Asclepiades’ particles are capable of division. Galen is the source for a distinctive argument against the idea that atoms were alike in substance, based on the Hippocratic idea that organisms composed of a single substance would not be able to experience sensations like pain (Leith 2014). Ironically, Galen’s theory of the four elements was sometimes interpreted as an atomist theory by medieval sources (Langermann 2009).

One of the most prominent writers on mechanics in antiquity, Hero of Alexandria (1st c. CE), is sometimes regarded, following Hermann Diels, as an atomist in the Democritean tradition. In the introduction to his Pneumatica, Hero describes matter as made up of particles with spaces between them. However, Hero’s account of pneumatic effects involving compression of air seems to depend on the deformation of elastic particles which can be compressed artificially but will spring back to their original shape quite vehemently. If so, his account denies a fundamental tenet of classical atomism, that atoms do not change in their intrinsic properties like shape (Berryman 2011). Pneumatics, because its effects were thought to depend on forces acting against a void, provided stimulus to discussions of the possibility of void and why its supposed impossibility would cause water to move against its natural direction. In late antiquity, John Philoponus theorized that void must be at least theoretically possible for these effects to occur (Sedley 1987).

3. The Legacy of Ancient Atomism

The conventional division into ‘ancient and modern’ was developed in a European context that does not necessarily reflect the history of other cultures. Without intending to overstate the value or generality of this division, we might regard three major bodies of thought as inheriting ideas from the ‘ancient’ traditions discussed above: atomism in Islamic kalām thought; the revival of atomism in the European Renaissance and after; and the continued interest in atomist theories in Indian philosophy through the early modern period.

3.1 Atomism in the Islamic World

Beginning in the late 8th century CE/2nd century AH), different versions of atomism were adopted and developed by many adherents of the Islamic schools of kalām or theology. The most important of these early atomist schools were located in Basra and Baghdad. The philosopher-physician Abū Bakr al-Rāzī (d. 313/925) also developed an atomist theory (Pines 1997; Baffioni 1982; Adamson 2014; Koetschet 2019), although adherents of the philosophical schools known as falsafa more commonly adhered to a philosophical picture based on Neoplatonic continuum metaphysics. Some medieval Jewish philosophers of the Karaite school, writing in Arabic and influenced by kalām thought, adopted atomist views (Ben-Shammai, 1985). Critics of kalām atomism include Ibn Sīnā, the 11th/5th century philosopher known as Avicenna in the West, and Maimonides (12th/6th C) in his Guide for the Perplexed. Fakhr al-dīn al-Rāzī responded to Ibn Sīnā’s criticisms in the 12th/6th century (Dhanani 2015), and atomist ideas were publicized by the work of al-Ijī (d. 1355 CE) and his student al-Taftazani, which present arguments from earlier kalam and falsafa natural philosophy and were used for teaching purposes (Dhanani 2017).

Although the loss of texts makes it difficult to trace the origins of atomism in Islamic thought, scholars argue that ancient Greek theories may have reached the Mutakallimun by oral transmission if not by translation of texts; the indirect transmission may explain some divergences (Wolfson 1976; Dhanani 1994). Epicurean rather than Democritean ideas may have been transmitted through doxographies (van Ess 2018) or from Galen’s critiques (Langermann 2009); other possible routes of transmission that have been explored include the Greek sceptical tradition and the supposed atomism of the Pythagorean Ecphantus (Baffioni 1982). Attempts have also been made to link kalām atomism to the Indian tradition (Pines 1997; Wolfson 1976): echoes include a similar argument that a mountain and a mustard seed would be equal if bodies were infinitely divisible, and the fact that perceptible properties are ascribed to atoms, in contrast to the Greek tradition. Whatever its antecedents, the development of atomism in an Islamic context—where different philosophical questions prevailed—led to creative innovations and a distinctive critical tradition of atomist thought (Rashed 2005).

Unlike Greek atomists, Abu al-Hudhayl—regarded as the founder of kalām atomism—posited that atoms were indiscernible from one another even in size or shape. Rashed (2005) argues for the distinctness of al-Hudhayl’s atoms from both ancient Greek or Indian antecedents, since atoms were conceived as Euclidean points and not as extended material bodies. Rashed stresses the importance of the conception of atoms as in motion at an instant, connecting it to the development of a notion that bodies occupying infinitesimal locations could possess motion as a dynamic property, and to a treatment of mathematical properties that were not merely regarded as abstracted from bodies, as in the Aristotelian tradition (Rashed 2005). Al-Nazzān, a prominent early critic of atomism, tried to solve paradoxes about motion over infinitely divisible continua with the alternative thesis that motion consisted in an imperceptible ‘leap’ from one location to another.

Because any Islamic metaphysical system was committed to a Creator God, the ancient Greek use of atomism to solve the problem of change without something coming from nothing could not be the motivation for kalām atomism. Some scholars believe the created nature of atoms could have been used as an argument for the existence of God, since creation implies a Creator (Adamson 2016, 16). Atoms could not continue existing on their own but were continually recreated by God at every instant. Al-Rāzī’s atomism, by contrast, denied that creation from nothing was possible and supposed that atoms were eternal (Pines 1997, 48). Baffioni (1982) contrasts al-Rāzī’s physical motivations for adopting atomism with the ‘teleological’ atomism of the kalām schools.

Central debates about the viability of atomism in the Islamic world centred on infinite divisibility, applying paradoxes similar to those of Zeno to the problem of an ant crawling over a sandal. A problem about the fact that different particles in a rolling millstone or wheel must be moving at different speeds, despite the apparent cohesiveness of the millstone, is found in Islamic discussions. The insistence within kalām atomism on recognizing accidents that adhere in the whole of composite bodies, and that cannot be traced back to the properties of individual atoms, may share the motivation of Epicurus’ attempt to avoid the eliminativism of Democritus’ theory. Likewise, epistemological arguments for preserving confidence in sense perception, even given the possibility of illusion, may have been formulated to avoid the sceptical potential inherent in a Democritean approach to perception and empirical knowledge.

Atoms in Islamic philosophy were typically defined by the occupation of space and the exclusion of other bodies; by their ability to receive accidents; and by their ability to be perceived by the senses of sight and touch, presumably in sufficiently large aggregates. The assertion of an entailment between materiality and occupying space was apparently directed against the Peripatetic notion of matter and the Aristotelian notion of natural place (Dhanani 1994, 88–89). The spatial extendedness of atoms was also linked to the notion that atoms served as a unit for measuring extension. Because spherical atoms packed together would leave a space that is smaller than the atom—which would be impossible if atoms represented the smallest possible magnitude—atoms were said to be cubic (Dhanani 1994, 115). Atoms were thought to adhere to one another without the physical ‘hooks’ proposed by Democritus; even so, it proved difficult to avoid ascribing subatomic parts to atoms.

As in the Greek tradition, the positing of atoms in Islamic thought was paired with assertions about the existence of void space, in opposition to the continuum physics characteristic of most falsafa thought (cf. Pines 1979). Debate over the existence of void was enriched by the need to explain the operation of so-called pneumatic devices like the siphon, medical cupping glasses or syringe (Lugal and Sayili 1951; Koetschet 2019). The supposed impossibility of void space forming was used to account for observed fluid movements in pneumatic devices, raising questions about how a metaphysical impossibility might produce physical motions. Ingenious thought experiments were developed to test the assumptions at work, asking what would happen if a single film of atoms were trapped between two cupping glasses, or comparing the effect of cupping glasses on stone to their effect on flesh (Dhanani 1994, 77). The fascination with pneumatic technology in the medieval Islamic world is attested in surviving texts which detail increasingly complex marvels: trick fountains, surprise vessels, water clocks with elaborate mechanical side-shows (Hill 1974, 1979), although the explanation of these effects did not necessarily involve atomist or particle theories of matter.

3.2 Ancient Greek Atomism in Later European Philosophy

Aristotelian natural philosophy came to predominate in the medieval Latin West during the 13th century, and prevailed in the universities into the seventeenth century. Nonetheless, scholars recognize pockets of interest in atomist thought in the middle ages, including a 12th century ‘renaissance’ of atomism (Pabst 1991, 1994; Grant 1996; Dijksterhuis 1961), and the work of the 14th century ‘indivisibilists,’ who focused on the mathematics of motion (Duhem 1985; Murdoch 1982, 1984). Reasons for the renewed interest in atomist thought have been linked to the vision of a relatively autonomous nature found in Timaeus (Pabst 1994), and to the need to account for motion of immaterial bodies like angels (Murdoch 1984). Medical authors and Latin sources were important in the transmission of ideas from antiquity to the 12th century, for whom the atomist theories in the Arabic tradition were largely inaccessible (Pabst 1994, 86). Later medieval Latin philosophers would have access to ideas from the Islamic atomist tradition through Maimonides’ reports and Ibn Sīnā’s refutations: modern scholarly opinions differ as to the extent to which Latin theorists were aware of Islamic atomism, however: recent scholarship has uncovered more evidence of borrowings from the Islamic world into the 14th century Latin texts (Murdoch 1974; Sorabji 1982; Freudenthal 2003; Grellard 2009; Robert 2009).

Although 12th century atomists were inspired by Plato, Calcidius’ widely circulated commentary did not include the passages detailing Plato’s geometrical atomism: instead, they developed particle theories and attempted to reconcile these with the doctrine of the four elements. An original attempt by Thierry of Chartes to solve the problem of the different motions of the four elements—fire and air tending upward, earth and water tending downward to different degrees—relied on the relative cohesiveness of different elements to explain the different degrees of mobility (Pabst 1991). Elemental intertransformation shows that elements must be composed of atoms of similar substance, but fire atoms, say, are less entangled with one another and thus more mobile than other kinds of atoms. Other classic problems, including puzzles about the different speeds of particles of a rotating wheel, continued to occupy theorists into the early modern period; this problem was called rota Aristotelis or ‘Aristotle’s wheel’ because of its appearance in the pseudo-Aristotelian Mechanica (Palmerino 2001).

Renaissance alchemy, as much as the reworking of ancient Greek atomist theories by adherents of the ‘New Science’ of the seventeenth century, proved important sources of inspiration for corpuscularian theories in the early modern world (Newman 2006). The Aristotelian notion of minima naturalia, and the appeal to microstructures of matter in explanation of chemical changes in Aristotle’s Meteorology IV, meant that consideration of corpuscularian explanations need not automatically be framed as a rejection of Aristotle. A useful corrective here to the tendency to regard early modern atomism as merely reviving ancient Greek theories is Newman’s argument that an ‘operational’ notion of minima—the smallest unit that seems to be manifest in the best explanation of the observed phenomena—emerged from the alchemical tradition and provided an alternative to the metaphysical arguments of the ancient Greek atomists (Newman 2006, 2009).

Hero of Alexandria’s matter theory has long been considered an important source for Robert Boyle and other New Scientists of the seventeenth century (Boas 1949). However, Hero’s theory differed from classical atomism, and drew heavily on the need to explain pneumatic effects (see section 2.6 above). The evidence of Sennert’s influence on Boyle casts further doubts on the centrality of ancient Greek atomism to his matter theory. Newman (2006, 2009) argues that the relevant sense of ‘atom’ depended on the incapacity for chemical decomposition, not spatial or physical indivisibility, a notion grounded in empirical evidence rather than logical or mathematical reasoning.

Milton (2002) offers a helpful perspective on why ancient Greek atomism, despite its naturalist worldview, was not especially conducive to scientific investigation. Features of seventeenth century New Science that do not fit well with classical atomist theory include the application of mathematical analysis to motion and the appeal to a machine model to conceptualize the possibility that complex causal sequencing could produce regular and determinate results without ongoing intelligent direction (Berryman 2009). A modern scholarly tendency to describe Democritean atomism as ‘mechanistic’ contributes to a prevailing overestimate of the scientific credentials of ancient Greek atomism.

Epicurean philosophy played a very different role in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, providing a classical ‘cover’ for hedonistic and anti-religious sentiment among intellectuals attracted by the vision of a tranquil life free of fear of the gods (Kargon 1966; Wilson 2008). Women philosophers and intellectuals were unusually prominent amongst the seventeenth century advocates and translators of Epicurus (Wilson 2008). The Cambridge Platonists may have fueled the identification of atomism with atheism, because of the presentation of ancient Greek natural philosophy in Cudworth’s True Intellectual System of the Universe. A tendency to mischaracterize Epicurean philosophy as licentious persisted.

The young Karl Marx wrote his doctoral dissertation on Democritus, a fact that may have contributed to his sensitivity to materialist explanations. Given the association with Marx, Soviet-era scholarship produced important work on Democritus, especially S.I. Luria’s magisterial edition of the fragments.

3.3 Early Modern Indian Atomism

The philosophical traditions discussed above continued for over a millenium in the Indian schools, without the historical discontinuity caused in Europe and West Asia by the collapse of the Roman Empire and the rise of Islam. The debate between ‘idealist’ and ‘realist’ metaphysics continued, the latter represented by the Navya-Nyāya school which developed about the fourteenth century, building on the work of Udayana and Gángeṣa (Phillips 1995). Stephen Phillips argues that the ‘New Logic’ thought of Navya-Nyāya school proliferated in Indian culture and law as well as impacting other philosophical schools, especially after 1500 CE. Although it incorporated Vaiśeṣika realism, the focus was on epistemology and on cognitive experience rather than on the atomist metaphysics.

Jonardon Ganeri (2011) has argued for regarding the early modern period in India as a period of innovation comparable to that in Europe, although the Indian intellectual world was less concerned to present itself as a radical break from the past than was true of the European ‘New Science.’ François Bernier, protege of the French atomist Pierre Gassendi, travelled to India in 1656 and found a receptive audience in the Sanskrit scholars trained in the atomism of the classical period of Indian philosophy (Ganeri 2011). Jayarāma, an early modern Indian atomist working in the Vaiśeṣika tradition, produced an atomist theory that Ganeri argues is closer to that of Daniel Sennert than to that of Gassendi (Ganeri 2011, p. 218). Substantial concessions are made within this atomist metaphysics towards acknowledging the reality of emergent properties.


For works on atomism in the Indian philosophical traditions, on Leucippus, Democritus, Epicurus, Lucretius, al-Rāzī, Islamic and Renaissance atomism, see primarily the relevant articles in this encyclopedia. This bibliography focuses on sources for alternative varieties of atomism, as well as sources that connect and compare different periods and traditions.


  • Dijksterhuis, E.J., 1961. The Mechanization of the World Picture, trans. C. Dikshoorn. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Furley, David J., 1987. The Greek Cosmologists vol 1: The Formation of the Atomic Theory and its Earliest Critics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Konstan, David, 1982. ‘Atomism and its Heritage: Minimal Parts,’ Ancient Philosophy, 2: 60–75.
  • Lasswitz, Kurd, 1890. Geschichte der Atomistik vom Mittelalter bis Newton, Hamburg: Verlag von Leopold Voss.
  • Lüthy, Christoph, John E. Murdoch and William R. Newman, 2001. ‘Introduction: Corpuscles, Atoms, Particles and Minima,’ in Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories, Leiden: Brill, 1–38.
  • Pines, Shlomo, 1997. Studies in Islamic Atomism, trans. Tzvi Langermann. Jerusalem: The Hebrew University, Magnes Press.
  • Pyle, Andrew, 1997. Atomism and Its Critics: From Democritus to Newton, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • Rashed, Marwan, 2005. ‘Natural philosophy,’ in Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 287–307.
  • Sorabji, Richard, 1982. ‘Atoms and Time Atoms,’ in N. Kretzmann (ed.), Infinity and Continuity in Ancient and Medieval Thought, Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 37–86.
  • –––, 1983. Time, Creation and the Continuum: Theories in Antiquity and the Early Middle Ages, London and Ithaca, NY: Duckworth and Cornell University Press.
  • Zilioli, Ugo (ed.), 2021. Atomism in Philosophy: A History from Antiquity to the Present, London: Bloomsbury Publishing.

Atomism in Classical Indian Philosophy

  • Bhaduri, Sadananda, 1947. Studies in Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika Metaphysics, Poona: Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute
  • Carpenter, Amber, 2014. Indian Buddhist Philosophy, Durham: Routledge.
  • Carpenter, Amber with Ngaserin, Sherice, 2021. ‘Atoms and Orientation: Vasubandhu’s solution to the problem of contact,’ in Ugo Zilioli (ed.), Atomism in Philosophy, London: Bloomsbury Academic Publishing, 159–81.
  • Chatterjee, Amita, 2017. ‘Naturalism in Classical Indian Philosophy’, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath, 1987. Natural Science of the Ancient Hindus, edited by Debiprasad Chattopadhyaya. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research
  • Ganeri, Jonardon, 2001. Philosophy in Classical India, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2019. ‘Analytic Philosophy in Early Modern India’, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2019 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), <>.
  • Gangopadhyaya, M., 1980. Indian Atomism: History and Sources, Calcutta: K.P. Bagchi.
  • Goodman, Charles, 2004. ‘The Treasury of Metaphysics and the Physical World,’ Philosophical Quarterly, 54(216): 389–401.
  • Keith, Arthur Berriedale, 1921. Indian Logic and Atomism: An Exposition of the Nyāya and Vaiceṣika Nyâya Systems, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kumar, Shashi Prabha, 2019. Categories, Creation and Cognition in Vaiśeṣika Philosophy, Springer.
  • Matilal, Bimal Krishna, 1977. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika: A History of Indian Literature, 6.2. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • –––, 1986. Perception: An Essay on Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mehta, Mohan Lal, 1954. Outlines of Jaina Philosophy: The Essentials of Jaina Ontology, Epistemology and Ethics, Bangalore: The Jain Mission Society.
  • Mishra, A.K., 2006. ‘Atomism of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Jainism’, Indian Journal of the History of Science, 41: 247–61.
  • Needham, Joseph, 1969. The Grand Titration: Science and Society in East and West, London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Nyayavijayaji, Muni Shri, 1998. Jaina Philosophy and Religion, translated by Nagin J. Shah. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers.
  • Phillips, Stephen H., 1995. Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of ‘New Logic’, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Ronkin, Noa, 2005. Early Buddhist Metaphysics, London: Routledge.
  • Sarkar, Sahotra, 2021. ‘Aggregates versus Wholes: An unresolved debate between the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Buddhist schools in ancient Indian atomism,’ in Ugo Zilioli (ed.), Atomism in Philosophy, London: Bloomsbury Academic Publishing, 182–97.
  • Thakar, Anantalal, 2003. Origin and Development of the Vaiśeṣika System (PHISPC, Volume II, Part 4), New Delhi: Center for Studies in Civilizations.

Leucippus and Democritus

  • Guthrie, W.K.C., 1967. A History of Greek Philosophy vol. 1: The Earlier Presocratics and the Pythagoreans, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Heidel, W.A., 1940. ‘The Pythagoreans and Greek Mathematics,’ American Journal of Philology, 61: 1–33.
  • Makin, Stephen, 1993. Indifference Arguments, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mihai, Adrian, 2021. ‘Atomism and the Cambridge Platonists,’ in Ugo Zilioli (ed.), Atomism in Philosophy: A History from Antiquity to the Present, London: Bloomsbury Publishing, 206–71.
  • More, Henry, 1653. Conjectura Cabbalistica, London: J. Flesher.
  • Owen, G.E.L., 1957–8. ‘Zeno and the mathematicians,’ Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 58: 199–222.
  • Sedley, David, 2008. ‘Atomism’s Eleatic Roots,’ in Patricia Curd and Daniel W. Graham (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Presocratic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 305–332.
  • Tannéry, Paul, 1887. L’Histoire de la science héllène, Paris: Georg Olms.

Plato, Platonists and Pythagoreans

  • Dillon, John, 2003. The Heirs of Plato: A Study of the Old Academy (347–274 BC), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Konstan, David, 1988. ‘Points, Lines, and Infinity: Aristotle’s Physics Zeta and Hellenistic Philosophy,’ in John J. Cleary (ed.), Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, 3: 1–32.
  • Mueller, Ian, 2000. ‘Plato’s Geometrical Chemistry and Its Exegesis in Antiquity,’, in P. Suppes, J. Moravcsik and H. Mendell (eds.), Ancient and Medieval Traditions in the Exact Sciences: Essays in Memory of Wilbur Knorr, Stanford: CSLI Publications, 159–76.
  • Opsomer, J., 2012. ‘In Defence of Geometric Atomism: Explaining Elemental Properties,’ in J. Wilberding and C. Horn (ed), Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 147–73.
  • Pines, Shlomo, 1986. ‘A New Fragment of Xenocrates and its Implications,’ in Studies in Arabic Versions of Greek Texts and in Medieval Science, Jerusalem: The Magnes Press, 3–95.
  • Sambursky, S., 1962. The Physical World of Late Antiquity, London: Routledge.
  • Sattler, Barbara, 2021. ‘Platonic Reception – Atomism and the Atomists in Plato’s Timaeus,’ in Chelsea C. Harry and Justin Habash (eds.), Brill’s Companion to the Reception of Presocratic Natural Philosophy in Later Classical Thought, Leiden: Brill, 429–52 .
  • Sedley, David, 2004. ‘On Generation and Corruption 1.2,’ in Frans de Haas and Jaap Mansfeld (eds.), Aristotle: On Generation and Corruption, Book 1: Symposium Aristotelicum, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 65–89.
  • Siorvanes, Lucas, 1996. Proclus: Neo-Platonic Philosophy and Science, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.

Minima Naturalia in Aristotelian Thought

  • Berryman, Sylvia, 2002. ‘The Sweetness of Honey: Philoponus against the Doctors on Supervenient Qualities,’ in Cees Leijenhorst, Christoph Lüthy and Johannes M.M.H. Thijssen (eds.), The Dynamics of Aristotelian Natural Philosophy from Antiquity to the Seventeenth Century, Leiden: Brill, 65–79.
  • Dijksterhuis, E.J., 1961. The Mechanization of the World Picture, trans. C. Dikshoorn. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Duhem, Pierre, 1985. Medieval Cosmology: Theories of Infinity, Place, Time, Void, and the Plurality of Worlds, ed. and trans. Roger Ariew. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Glasner, Ruth, 2001. ‘Ibn Rushd’s Theory of Minima Naturalia,’ Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 11: 9–26
  • McGinnis, Jon, 2015. ‘A Small Discovery: Avicenna’s Theory of Minima Naturalia,‘ Journal of the History of Philosophy, 53(1): 1–24.
  • Murdoch, John E., 2001. ‘The Medieval and Renaissance Tradition of Minima Naturalia,’ in Christoph Lüthy, John E. Murdoch and William R. Newman (eds.), Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories, Leiden: Brill, 91–132.
  • Rashed, Marwan, 2005. ‘Natural philosophy,’ in Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 287–307.

Diodorus Cronus

  • Denyer, Nicholas, 1981. ‘The Atomism of Diodorus Cronus,’ Prudentia, 13: 33–45.
  • Sedley, David, 1977. ‘Diodorus Cronus and Hellenistic Philosophy,’ Proceedings of the Cambridge Philological Society (New Series), 23: 74–120.

Epicurean Atomism

  • Clay, Diskin, 1998. Paradosis and Survival: Three Chapters in the History of Epicurean Philosophy, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Fish, Jeffrey and Kirk R. Sanders, 2011. Epicurus and the Epicurean Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Frischer, B., 1982. The Sculpted Word: Epicureanism and Philosophical Recruitment in Ancient Greece, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Gigante, Marcello, 1995. Philodemus in Italy: The Books from Herculaneum, translated by Dirk Obbink, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Konstan, David, 1979. ‘Problems in Epicurean Physics,’ Isis, 70(3): 394–418
  • Netz, Reviel, 2015. ‘Were There Epicurean Mathematicians?’ Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, XLIX: 283–320.
  • O’Keefe, Tim, 2005. Epicurus on Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sedley, David, 1988. ‘Epicurean Anti-Reductionism,’ in Jonathan Barnes and Mario Mignucci (eds.), Matter and Metaphysics, Naples: Bibliopolis, 297–327 .
  • –––, 1998. Lucretius and the Transformation of Greek Wisdom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smith, Martin Ferguson, 1993. Diogenes of Oinoanda: The Epicurean Inscription, Edited with Introduction, Translation and Notes, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Warren, James, 2002. Epicurus and Democritean Ethics: An Archaeology of Ataraxia, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Warren, James (ed.), 2009. Cambridge Companion to Epicureanism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Atomism and Particle Theories in Ancient Greek Sciences

  • Berryman, Sylvia, 2002. ‘Galen and the Mechanical Philosophy,’ Apeiron: a journal for ancient philosophy and science, 235–53.
  • –––, 2011. ‘The Evidence for Strato of Lampsacus in Hero of Alexandria,’ in Marie-Laurence Desclos and W.W. Fortenbaugh (eds.), Strato of Lampsacus, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers.
  • Copenhaver, Brian, 1998. ‘The Occultist Tradition and Its Critics,’ in Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers, The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (Volume 1), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 454–512.
  • Damiani, Vincenzo, 2021. ‘The Reception of Atomism in Ancient Medical Literature: From Hippocrates to Galen,’ in Ugo Zilioli (ed.), Atomism in Philosophy, London: Bloomsbury Academic Publishing, 39–60.
  • Drachmann, A. G., 1948. Ktesibios, Philon and Heron: A Study in Ancient Pneumatics, Copenhagen: Munksgaard.
  • Gottschalk, Hans, 1980. Heracleides of Pontus, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Langermann, Tzvi, 2009. ‘Islamic Atomism and the Galenic Tradition,’ History of Science, 47: 1–20.
  • Leith, David, 2014. ‘Galen’s Refutation of Atomism,’ in Peter Adamson, Rotraud Hansberger and James Wilberding (eds.), Philosophical Themes in Galen (Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies: Supplementary Volume 114), London: Institute of Classical Studies, 213–234 .
  • Sedley, David, 1987. ‘Philoponus’ Conception of Space,’ 140–153 in Richard Sorabji (ed.), Philoponus and the Rejection of Aristotelian Science, London: Gerald Duckworth.
  • Vallance, J.T., 1990. The Lost Theory of Asclepiades of Bithynia, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Atomism in the Islamic World

  • Adamson, Peter, 2014. ‘Galen on Void,’ in Peter Adamson, Rotraud Hansberger and James Wilberding (eds.), Philosophical Themes in Galen (Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, Supplementary Volume 114), London: Institute of Classical Studies, 197–212.
  • –––, 2016. Philosophy in the Islamic World, A History of Philosophy Without any Gaps (Volume 3), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Baffioni, Carmela, 1982. Atomismo e Antiatomismo nel Pensiero Islamico, Naples: Istituto Universitario Orientale.
  • –––, 2011. ‘Presocratics in the Arab World’, in Lagerlund H. (eds.) Encyclopedia of Medieval Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer, 1073–6. doi:10.1007/978-1-4020-9729-4_416
  • Ben-Shammai, Hagai, 1985. ‘Studies in Karaite Atomism,’ Jerusalem Studies in Arabic and Islam, 6: 243–93.
  • Dhanani, Alnoor, 1994. The Physical Theory of Kalam, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • –––, 2013. ‘Atoms and Atomism,’ The Oxford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Science and Technology in Islam, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––. 2015. ‘The Impact of Ibn Sīnā’s Critique of Atomism on Subsequent Kalām Discussions of Atomism,’ Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 25: 79–104.
  • Dhanani A. 2016. ‘Atomism in Islamic Thought,’ in H. Selin (ed.), Encyclopaedia of the History of Science, Technology, and Medicine in Non-Western Cultures Dordrecht: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-1-4020-4425-0_8463
  • –––, 2017. ‘Al-Mawaqif fi ‘ilm al-kalam by ‘Adud al-din al-Iji (d. 1355), and its commentaries’, in Khaled al-Rouayheb and Sabine Schmidtke (eds.), An Oxford Companion to Islamic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hill, Donald R., 1974. The Book of Knowledge of Ingenious Mechanical Devices by Ibn al-Razzāz al-Jazarī, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • –––, 1979. The Book of Ingenious Devices by the Banū (sons of) Mūsà bin Shākir, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Langermann, Tzvi, 2009. ‘Islamic Atomism and the Galenic Tradition,’ History of Science, 47: 1–20.
  • Lugal, Necati and Aydin Sayili, 1951. ‘Fārābi’s Article on Vacuum,’ Türk Tarih Kurumu Yayinlarindan, 15(1): 21–36.
  • Koetschet, Pauline, 2019. Abū Bakr al-Rāzī, Doutes sur Galien, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • McGinnis, Jon, 2003. ‘The Topology of Time: An Analysis of Medieval Islamic Accounts of Discrete and Continuous Time,’ The Modern Schoolman, 81: 5–25.
  • Pines, Shlomo, 1979. ‘Etudes sur Awhad al-Zaman Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi’, in The Collected Works of Shlomo Pines Volume 1: Studies in Studies in Abu’l-Barakat al-Baghdadi: Physics and Metaphysics, Jerusalem: The Magnes Press, 1–95.
  • –––, 1986. ‘What was original in Arabic Science?’ in Studies in Arabic Versions of Greek Texts and in Medieval Science, Jerusalem: The Magnes Press, 329–53.
  • –––, 1997. Studies in Islamic Atomism, Tzvi Langermann (trans.), Jerusalem: The Hebrew University Magnes Press.
  • Rashed, Marwan, 2005. ‘Natural philosophy,’ in Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 287–307.
  • Sorabji, Richard R.K., 1983. Time, Creation and the Continuum: Theories in Antiquity and the early Middle Ages, London and Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • van Ess, Josef, 2018. Theology and Society in the Second and Third Centuries of The Hijra: A History of Religious Thought in Early Islam (Volume 4), Gwendolin Goldbloom (trans.), Leiden: Brill, 514–34.
  • Wolfson, Harry Austryn, 1976. The Philosophy of the Kalam, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Zamboni, Francesco Omar, 2021. ‘Atomism and Islamic Thought,’ in Ugo Zilioli (ed.), Atomism in Philosophy, London: Bloomsbury Academic Publishing, 198–215.

Ancient Greek Atomism in Later European Philosophy

  • Boas, Marie, 1949. ‘Hero’s Pneumatica: A Study of Its Transmission and Influence,’ Isis, 40(1): 38–48.
  • Dijksterhuis, E.J., 1961. The Mechanization of the World Picture, trans. C. Dikshoorn. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Duhem, Pierre, 1985. Medieval Cosmology: Theories of Infinity, Place, Time, Void, and the Plurality of Worlds, ed. and trans. Roger Ariew, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Freudenthal, Gad, 2003. ‘Review of Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories,’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, 41(2): 273–4.
  • Grant, Edward, 1996. ‘Review of Bernhard Pabst, Atomtheorien des Lateinischen MittelaltersIsis, 87(2): 346–7.
  • Grellard, Christophe and Aurélien Robert (eds.), 2009. Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden: Brill.
  • Grellard, Christophe, 2009. ‘Nicolas of Autrecourt’s Atomistic Physics,’ in Grellard and Robert (eds.), Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden: Brill, 107–126.
  • Kargon, Robert H., 1966. Atomism in England from Hariot to Newton, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lüthy, Christoph, John E. Murdoch and William R. Newman (eds.), 2001. Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories, Leiden: Brill.
  • Milton, J.R., 2002. ‘The Limitations of Ancient Atomism,’ in C.J. Tuplin and T.E. Rihll, Science and Mathematics in Ancient Greek Culture, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 178–95.
  • Murdoch, John E., 1974. ‘Naissance et Développement de l’Atomisme au Bas Moyen Âge Latin,’ in Cahiers d’Études Médiévales II. La science de la nature: théories et pratiques, Montreal: Bellarmin, 11–32.
  • –––, 1984. ‘Atomism and Motion in the Fourteenth Century,’ in Everett Mendelsohn (ed), Transformation and Tradition in the Sciences, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 45–66.
  • Newman, William R., 2006. Atomism and Alchemy: Chymistry and the Experimental Origins of the Scientific Revolution, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2009. ‘The Significance of “Chymical Atomism”,’ Early Science and Medicine, 14: 248–64.
  • Pabst, Bernhard, 1991. ‘Atomism II: Medieval Theories,’ in Hans Burkhardt and Barry Smith (eds.), Handbook of Metaphysics and Ontology (Volume 1: A-K), Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 63–5.
  • –––, 1994. Atomtheorien des Lateinischen Mittelalters, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Palmerino, Carla Rita, 2001. ‘Galileo’s and Gassendi’s Solutions to the Rota Aristotelis Paradox: A Bridge Between Matter and Motion Theories,’ in Lüthy, Murdoch and Newman (eds.), Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories, Leiden: Brill, 381–422.
  • Robert, Aurélien, 2009. ‘William of Crathorn’s Mereotopological Atomism,’ in Grellard and Robert (eds.), Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden: Brill, 127–62.
  • Wilson, Catherine, 2008. Epicureanism at the Origins of Modernity, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Early Modern Indian Atomism

  • Ganeri, Jonardon, 2011. The Lost Age of Reason: Philosophy in Early Modern India 1450–1700, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Phillips, Stephen H., 1995. Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of ‘New Logic’, Chicago: Open Court.

Other Internet Resources

  • Atomism, maintained by S. Marc Cohen, University of Washington
  • The Final Cut: Democritus and Leucippus, at History of Philosophy Without Gaps, maintained by Peter Adamson, King’s College London
  • Atomism, entry in Wikipedia.
  • Christopher Taylor, site at – this website gives access to CCW Taylor’s English translation of the fragments of Democritus as collected by S. Luria.


This attempt to survey address similarities and differences in atomist thought between different traditions and time periods would not have been possible without generous assistance from a number of scholars. I wish to thank John Cooper, Patrick O’Donnell, Tim O’Keefe and Ednaldo Silva for helpful comments and suggestions on older versions of this article, and Charles Taylor for offering a link to his website translation of Luria’s collection on Democritus.

In expanding the article to a more comprehensive crosscultural treatment, I particularly thank Alnoor Dhanani and Robert Wisnovsky for helpful advice and comments on atomism in Islamic thought; Amber Carpenter, Jonardon Ganeri and Cat Prueitt for invaluable help in writing the sections on Indian atomism; William Newman and Christoph Lüthy for feedback and references on the transmission of Islamic atomism into medieval Europe; and Ted Slingerland for advice on atomism in Chinese philosophy.

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