Zeno’s Paradoxes

First published Tue Apr 30, 2002; substantive revision Wed Mar 6, 2024

Almost everything that we know about Zeno of Elea is to be found in the opening pages of Plato’s Parmenides. There we learn that Zeno was nearly 40 years old when Socrates was a young man, say 20. Since Socrates was born in 469 BC we can estimate a birth date for Zeno around 490 BC. Beyond this, really all we know is that he was close to Parmenides (Plato reports the gossip that they had a sexual relationship when Zeno was young), and that he wrote a book of paradoxes defending Parmenides’ philosophy. Sadly this book has not survived, and what we know of his arguments is second-hand, principally through Aristotle and his commentators (here we draw particularly on Simplicius, who, though writing a thousand years after Zeno, apparently possessed at least some of his book). There were apparently 40 ‘paradoxes of plurality’, attempting to show that ontological pluralism—a belief in the existence of many things rather than only one—leads to absurd conclusions; of these paradoxes only two definitely survive, though a third argument can probably be attributed to Zeno. Aristotle speaks of a further four arguments against motion (and by extension change generally), all of which he gives and attempts to refute. In addition, Aristotle attributes two other paradoxes to Zeno. Sadly again, almost none of these paradoxes are quoted in Zeno’s original words by their various commentators, but in paraphrase.

1. Background

1.1 Ancient Background

Before we look at the paradoxes themselves it will be useful to sketch some of their historical and logical significance. First, Zeno sought to defend Parmenides by attacking his critics. Parmenides rejected pluralism and the reality of any kind of change: for him all was one indivisible, unchanging reality, and any appearances to the contrary were illusions, to be dispelled by reason and revelation. Not surprisingly, this philosophy found many critics, who ridiculed the suggestion; after all it flies in the face of some of our most basic beliefs about the world. In response to this criticism Zeno did something that may sound obvious, but which had a profound impact on Greek philosophy that is felt to this day: he attempted to show that equal absurdities followed logically from the denial of Parmenides’ views. You think that there are many things? Then you must conclude that everything is both infinitely small and infinitely big! You think that motion is infinitely divisible? Then it follows that nothing moves! (This is what a ‘paradox’ is: a demonstration that a contradiction or absurd consequence follows from apparently reasonable assumptions.)

As we read the arguments it is crucial to keep this method in mind. They are always directed towards a more-or-less specific target: the views of some person or school. We must bear in mind that the arguments are ‘ad hominem’ in the literal Latin sense of being directed ‘at (the views of) persons’, but not ‘ad hominem’ in the traditional technical sense of attacking the (character of the) people who put forward the views rather than attacking the views themselves. They work by temporarily supposing ‘for argument’s sake’ that those assertions are true, and then arguing that if they are then absurd consequences follow—that nothing moves for example: they are ‘reductio ad absurdum’ arguments (or ‘dialectic’ in the sense of the period). Then, if the argument is logically valid, and the conclusion genuinely unacceptable, the assertions must be false after all. Thus when we look at Zeno’s arguments we must ask two related questions: whom or what position is Zeno attacking, and what exactly is assumed for argument’s sake? If we find that Zeno makes hidden assumptions beyond what the position under attack commits one to, then the absurd conclusion can be avoided by denying one of the hidden assumptions, while maintaining the position. Indeed commentators at least since Aristotle have responded to Zeno in this way.

So whose views do Zeno’s arguments attack? There is a huge literature debating Zeno’s exact historical target. As we shall discuss briefly below, some say that the target was a technical doctrine of the Pythagoreans, but most today see Zeno as opposing common-sense notions of plurality and motion. We shall approach the paradoxes in this spirit, and refer the reader to the literature concerning the interpretive debate.

1.2 Modern Background

Following a lead given by Russell (1929, 182–198), a number of philosophers—notably Grünbaum (1967), but also see Salmon (2001)—took up the task of showing how modern mathematics could solve all of Zeno’s paradoxes (see §5 for an important elaboration of this project). This work remains the ‘received’ view, and thoroughly influences the following discussion, in approach and in specific analyses. This approach holds that—with certain qualifications—Zeno’s paradoxes reveal problems that cannot be resolved without the full resources of mathematics as worked out in the Nineteenth century (and perhaps beyond). This is not (necessarily) to say that modern mathematics is required to answer any of the problems that Zeno intended to raise; arguably Aristotle and other ancients had some replies that would—or should—have satisfied Zeno. (Nor shall we make any particular claims about Zeno’s influence on the history of mathematics.) However, as mathematics developed, and more thought was given to the paradoxes, new difficulties arose from them; these difficulties require modern mathematics for their resolution. These new difficulties arise partly in response to the evolution in our understanding of what mathematical rigor demands: solutions that would satisfy Zeno’s standards of rigor would not satisfy ours. Thus we shall push several of the paradoxes from their common sense formulations to their resolution in modern mathematics. (A qualification: we shall offer resolutions in terms of ‘standard’ mathematics, but other modern formulations are also capable of dealing with Zeno, and arguably in ways that better represent his mathematical concepts.)

While many have continued to find Russell and Grünbaum’s general approach fruitful, more recently a number of commentators have challenged the specific interpretations of the received view. If correct, this work enriches our understanding of both ancient and Nineteenth century mathematics, as we shall see.

2. The Paradoxes of Plurality

2.1 The Argument from Denseness

If there are many, they must be as many as they are and neither more nor less than that. But if they are as many as they are, they would be limited. If there are many, things that are are unlimited. For there are always others between the things that are, and again others between those, and so the things that are are unlimited. (Simplicius On Aristotle’s Physics, 140.29)

This first argument, given in Zeno’s words according to Simplicius, attempts to show that there could not be more than one thing, on pain of contradiction: if there are many things, then they are both ‘limited’ and ‘unlimited’, a contradiction. On the one hand, he says that any collection must contain some definite number of things, or in his words ‘neither more nor less’. But if you have a definite number of things, he concludes, you must have a finite—‘limited’—number of them; in drawing this inference he assumes that to have infinitely many things is to have an indefinite number of them. On the other hand, imagine any collection of ‘many’ things arranged in space—picture them lined up in one dimension for definiteness. Between any two of them, he claims, is a third; and in between these three elements another two; and another four between these five; and so on without end. Therefore the collection is also ‘unlimited’. So our original assumption of a plurality leads to a contradiction, and hence is false: there are not many things after all. At least, so Zeno’s reasoning runs.

Let us consider the two subarguments, in reverse order. First are there ‘always others between the things that are’? (In modern terminology, why must objects always be ‘densely’ ordered?) Suppose that we had imagined a collection of ten apples lined up; then there is indeed another apple between the sixth and eighth, but there is none between the seventh and eighth! On the assumption that Zeno is not simply confused, what does he have in mind? The texts do not say, but here are two possibilities: first, one might hold that for any pair of physical objects (two apples say) to be two distinct objects and not just one (a ‘double-apple’) there must be a third between them, physically separating them, even if it is just air. And one might think that for these three to be distinct, there must be two more objects separating them, and so on (this view presupposes that their being made of different substances is not sufficient to render them distinct). So perhaps Zeno is arguing against plurality given a certain conception of physical distinctness. But second, one might also hold that any body has parts that can be densely ordered. Of course 1/2s, 1/4s, 1/8s and so on of apples are not dense—such parts may be adjacent—but there may be sufficiently small parts—call them ‘point-parts’—that are. Indeed, if between any two point-parts there lies a finite distance, and if point-parts can be arbitrarily close, then they are dense; a third lies at the half-way point of any two. In particular, familiar geometric points are like this, and hence are dense. So perhaps Zeno is offering an argument regarding the divisibility of bodies. Either way, Zeno’s assumption of denseness requires some further assumption about the plurality in question, and correspondingly focusses the target of his paradox.

But suppose that one holds that some collection (the points in a line, say) is dense, hence ‘unlimited’, or infinite. The first prong of Zeno’s attack purports to show that because it contains a definite number of elements it is also ‘limited’, or finite. Can this contradiction be escaped? The assumption that any definite number is finite seems intuitive, but we now know, thanks to the work of Cantor in the Nineteenth century, how to understand infinite numbers in a way that makes them just as definite as finite numbers. The central element of this theory of the ‘transfinite numbers’ is a precise definition of when two infinite collections are the same size, and when one is bigger than the other. With such a definition in hand it is then possible to order the infinite numbers just as the finite numbers are ordered: for example, there are different, definite infinite numbers of fractions and geometric points in a line, even though both are dense. (See Further Reading below for references to introductions to these mathematical ideas, and their history.) So contrary to Zeno’s assumption, it is meaningful to compare infinite collections with respect to the number of their elements, to say whether two have more than, or fewer than, or ‘as many as’ each other: there are, for instance, more decimal numbers than whole numbers, but as many even numbers as whole numbers. So mathematically, Zeno’s reasoning is unsound when he says that because a collection has a definite number, it must be finite, and the first subargument is fallacious. (Though of course that only shows that infinite collections are mathematically consistent, not that any physically exist.)

2.2 The Argument from Finite Size

… if it should be added to something else that exists, it would not make it any bigger. For if it were of no size and was added, it cannot increase in size. And so it follows immediately that what is added is nothing. But if when it is subtracted, the other thing is no smaller, nor is it increased when it is added, clearly the thing being added or subtracted is nothing. (Simplicius On Aristotle’s Physics, 139.9)

But if it exists, each thing must have some size and thickness, and part of it must be apart from the rest. And the same reasoning holds concerning the part that is in front. For that too will have size and part of it will be in front. Now it is the same thing to say this once and to keep saying it forever. For no such part of it will be last, nor will there be one part not related to another. Therefore, if there are many things, they must be both small and large; so small as not to have size, but so large as to be unlimited. (Simplicius On Aristotle’s Physics, 141.2)

Once again we have Zeno’s own words. According to his conclusion, there are three parts to this argument, but only two survive. The first—missing—argument purports to show that if many things exist then they must have no size at all. Second, from this Zeno argues that it follows that they do not exist at all; since the result of joining (or removing) a sizeless object to anything is no change at all, he concludes that the thing added (or removed) is literally nothing. The argument to this point is a self-contained refutation of pluralism, but Zeno goes on to generate a further problem for someone who continues to urge the existence of a plurality. This third part of the argument is rather badly put but it seems to run something like this: suppose there is a plurality, so some spatially extended object exists (after all, he’s just argued that inextended things do not exist). Since it is extended, it has two spatially distinct parts (one ‘in front’ of the other). And the parts exist, so they have extension, and so they also each have two spatially distinct parts; and so on without end. And hence, the final line of argument seems to conclude, the object, if it is extended at all, is infinite in extent.

But what could justify this final step? It doesn’t seem that because an object has two parts it must be infinitely big! And neither does it follow from any other of the divisions that Zeno describes here; four, eight, sixteen, or whatever finite parts make a finite whole. Again, surely Zeno is aware of these facts, and so must have something else in mind, presumably the following: he assumes that if the infinite series of divisions he describes were repeated infinitely many times then a definite collection of parts would result. And notice that he doesn’t have to assume that anyone could actually carry out the divisions—there’s not enough time and knives aren’t sharp enough—just that an object can be geometrically decomposed into such parts (neither does he assume that these parts are what we would naturally categorize as distinct physical objects like apples, cells, molecules, electrons or so on, but only that they are geometric parts of these objects). Now, if—as a pluralist might well accept—such parts exist, it follows from the second part of his argument that they are extended, and, he apparently assumes, an infinite sum of finite parts is infinite.

Here we should note that there are two ways he may be envisioning the result of the infinite division.

First, one could read him as first dividing the object into 1/2s, then one of the 1/2s—say the second—into two 1/4s, then one of the 1/4s—say the second again—into two 1/8s and so on. In this case the result of the infinite division results in an endless sequence of pieces of size 1/2 the total length, 1/4 the length, 1/8 the length …. And then so the total length is (1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + … of the length, which Zeno concludes is an infinite distance, so that the pluralist is committed to the absurdity that finite bodies are ‘so large as to be unlimited’.

What is often pointed out in response is that Zeno gives us no reason to think that the sum is infinite rather than finite. He might have had the intuition that any infinite sum of finite quantities, since it grows endlessly with each new term must be infinite, but one might also take this kind of example as showing that some infinite sums are after all finite. Thus, contrary to what he thought, Zeno has not proven that the absurd conclusion follows. However, what is not always appreciated is that the pluralist is not off the hook so easily, for it is not enough just to say that the sum might be finite, she must also show that it is finite—otherwise we remain uncertain about the tenability of her position. As an illustration of the difficulty faced here consider the following: many commentators speak as if it is simply obvious that the infinite sum of the fractions is 1, that there is nothing to infinite summation. But what about the following sum: \(1 - 1 + 1 - 1 + 1 -\ldots\). Obviously, it seems, the sum can be rewritten \((1 - 1) + (1 - 1) + \ldots = 0 + 0 + \ldots = 0\). Surely this answer seems as intuitive as the sum of fractions. But this sum can also be rewritten \(1 - (1 - 1 + 1 - 1 +\ldots) = 1 - 0\)—since we’ve just shown that the term in parentheses vanishes—\(= 1\). Relying on intuitions about how to perform infinite sums leads to the conclusion that \(1 = 0\). Until one can give a theory of infinite sums that can give a satisfactory answer to any problem, one cannot say that Zeno’s infinite sum is obviously finite. Such a theory was not fully worked out until the Nineteenth century by Cauchy. (In Cauchy’s system \(1/2 + 1/4 + \ldots = 1\) but \(1 - 1 + 1 -\ldots\) is undefined.)

Second, it could be that Zeno means that the object is divided in half, then both the 1/2s are both divided in half, then the 1/4s are all divided in half and so on. In this case the pieces at any particular stage are all the same finite size, and so one could conclude that the result of carrying on the procedure infinitely would be pieces the same size, which if they exist—according to Zeno—is greater than zero; but an infinity of equal extended parts is indeed infinitely big.

But this line of thought can be resisted. First, suppose that the procedure just described completely divides the object into non-overlapping parts. (There is a problem with this supposition that we will see just below.) It involves doubling the number of pieces after every division and so after \(N\) divisions there are \(2^N\) pieces. But it turns out that for any natural or infinite number, \(N\), \(2^N \gt N\), and so the number of (supposed) parts obtained by the infinity of divisions described is an even larger infinity. This result poses no immediate difficulty since, as we mentioned above, infinities come in different sizes. The number of times everything is divided in two is said to be ‘countably infinite’: there is a countable infinity of things in a collection if they can be labeled by the numbers 1, 2, 3, … without remainder on either side. But the number of pieces the infinite division produces is ‘uncountably infinite’, which means that there is no way to label them 1, 2, 3, … without missing some of them—in fact infinitely many of them. However, Cauchy’s definition of an infinite sum only applies to countably infinite series of numbers, and so does not apply to the pieces we are considering. However, we could consider just countably many of them, whose lengths according to Zeno—since he claims they are all equal and non-zero—will sum to an infinite length; the length of all of the pieces could not be less than this.

At this point the pluralist who believes that Zeno’s division completely divides objects into non-overlapping parts (see the next paragraph) could respond that the parts in fact have no extension, even though they exist. That would block the conclusion that finite objects are infinite, but it seems to push her back to the other horn of Zeno’s argument, for how can all these zero length pieces make up a non-zero sized whole? (Note that according to Cauchy \(0 + 0 + 0 + \ldots = 0\) but this result shows nothing here, for as we saw there are uncountably many pieces to add up—more than are added in this sum.) We shall postpone this question for the discussion of the next paradox, where it comes up explicitly.

The second problem with interpreting the infinite division as a repeated division of all parts is that it does not divide an object into distinct parts, if objects are composed in the natural way. To see this, let’s ask the question of what parts are obtained by this division into 1/2s, 1/4s, 1/8s, …. Since the division is repeated without end there is no last piece we can give as an answer, and so we need to think about the question in a different way. If we suppose that an object can be represented by a line segment of unit length, then the division produces collections of segments, where the first is either the first or second half of the whole segment, the second is the first or second quarter, or third or fourth quarter, and in general the segment produced by \(N\) divisions is either the first or second half of the previous segment. For instance, writing the segment with endpoints \(a\) and \(b\) as \([a,b]\), some of these collections (technically known as ‘chains’ since the elements of the collection are ordered by size) would start \(\{[0,1], [0,1/2], [1/4,1/2], [1/4,3/8], \ldots \}\). (When we argued before that Zeno’s division produced uncountably many pieces of the object, what we should have said more carefully is that it produces uncountably many chains like this.)

The question of which parts the division picks out is then the question of which part any given chain picks out; it’s natural to say that a chain picks out the part of the line which is contained in every one of its elements. Consider for instance the chain \(\{[0,1/2], [1/4,1/2], [3/8,1/2], \ldots \}\), in other words the chain that starts with the left half of the line and for which every other element is the right half of the previous one. The half-way point is in every one of the segments in this chain; it’s the right-hand endpoint of each one. But no other point is in all its elements: clearly no point beyond half-way is; and pick any point \(p\) before half-way, if you take right halves of [0,1/2] enough times, the left-hand end of the segment will be to the right of \(p\). Thus the only part of the line that is in all the elements of this chain is the half-way point, and so that is the part of the line picked out by the chain. (In fact, it follows from a postulate of number theory that there is exactly one point that all the members of any such a chain have in common.) The problem is that by parallel reasoning, the half-way point is also picked out by the distinct chain \(\{[1/2,1], [1/2,3/4], [1/2,5/8], \ldots \}\), where each segment after the first is the left half of the preceding one. And so both chains pick out the same piece of the line: the half-way point. And so on for many other pairs of chains. Thus Zeno’s argument, interpreted in terms of a repeated division of all parts into half, doesn’t divide the line into distinct parts. Hence, if we think that objects are composed in the same way as the line, it follows that despite appearances, this version of the argument does not cut objects into parts whose total size we can properly discuss.

(You might think that this problem could be fixed by taking the elements of the chains to be segments with no endpoint to the right. Then the first of the two chains we considered no longer has the half-way point in any of its segments, and so does not pick out that point. The problem now is that it fails to pick out any part of the line: the previous reasoning showed that it doesn’t pick out any point greater than or less than the half-way point, and now it doesn’t pick out that point either!)

2.3 The Argument from Complete Divisibility

… whenever a body is by nature divisible through and through, whether by bisection, or generally by any method whatever, nothing impossible will have resulted if it has actually been divided … though perhaps nobody in fact could so divide it.

What then will remain? A magnitude? No: that is impossible, since then there will be something not divided, whereas ex hypothesi the body was divisible through and through. But if it be admitted that neither a body nor a magnitude will remain … the body will either consist of points (and its constituents will be without magnitude) or it will be absolutely nothing. If the latter, then it might both come-to-be out of nothing and exist as a composite of nothing; and thus presumably the whole body will be nothing but an appearance. But if it consists of points, it will not possess any magnitude. (Aristotle On Generation and Corruption, 316a19)

These words are Aristotle’s not Zeno’s, and indeed the argument is not even attributed to Zeno by Aristotle. However we have Simplicius’ opinion (On Aristotle’s Physics, 139.24) that it originates with Zeno, which is why it is included here. Aristotle begins by hypothesizing that some body is completely divisible, ‘through and through’; the second step of the argument makes clear that he means by this that it is divisible into parts that themselves have no size—parts with any magnitude remain incompletely divided. (Once again what matters is that the body is genuinely composed of such parts, not that anyone has the time and tools to make the division; and remembering from the previous section that one does not obtain such parts by repeatedly dividing all parts in half.) So suppose the body is divided into its dimensionless parts. These parts could either be nothing at all—as Zeno argued above—or ‘point-parts’. If the parts are nothing then so is the body: it’s just an illusion.

Now what of the final step? Why should something composed entirely of points have no size? Aristotle doesn’t say. A natural—standard—understanding is that Aristotle thinks that the problem is one of summing up the lengths of zero length parts. Surely any sum—even an infinite one—of zeroes is zero; that certainly is the case (as noted above) for Cauchy’s definition of infinite sums. However Grünbaum (1967) pointed out that that definition only applies to countable sums, and Cantor gave a beautiful, astounding and extremely influential ‘diagonal’ proof that the number of points in the segment is uncountably infinite. There is no way to label all the points in the line with the infinity of numbers 1, 2, 3, … , and so there are more points in a line segment than summands in a Cauchy sum. In short, the analysis employed for countably infinite division does not apply here.

So suppose that you are just given the number of points in a line and that their lengths are all zero; how would you determine the length? Do we need a new definition, one that extends Cauchy’s to uncountably infinite sums? It turns out that that would not help, because Cauchy further showed that any segment, of any length whatsoever (and indeed an entire infinite line) have exactly the same number of points as our unit segment. So knowing the number of points won’t determine the length of the line, and so nothing like familiar addition—in which the whole is determined by the parts—is possible. Instead we must think of the distance properties of a line as logically posterior to its point composition: first we have a set of points (ordered in a certain way, so that there is some fact, for example, about which of any three is between the others) then we define a function of pairs of points which specifies how far apart they are (satisfying such conditions as that the distance between \(A\) and \(B\) plus the distance between \(B\) and \(C\) equals the distance between \(A\) and \(C\)—if \(B\) is between \(A\) and \(C)\). Thus we answer Zeno as follows: the argument assumed that the size of the body was a sum of the sizes of point parts, but that is not the case; according to modern mathematics, a geometric line segment is an uncountable infinity of points plus a distance function. (Note that Grünbaum used the fact that the point composition fails to determine a length to support his ‘conventionalist’ view that a line has no determinate length at all, independent of a standard of measurement.)

As Ehrlich (2014) emphasizes, we could even stipulate that an ‘uncountable sum’ of zeroes is zero, because the length of a line is not equal to the sum of the lengths of the points it contains (addressing Sherry’s (1988) concern that refusing to extend the definition would be ad hoc). Hence, if one stipulates that the length of a line is the sum of any complete collection of proper parts, then it follows that points are not properly speaking parts of a line (unlike halves, quarters, and so on of a line). In a strict sense in modern measure theory (which generalizes Grünbaum’s framework), the points in a line are incommensurable with it, and the very set-up given by Aristotle in which the length of the whole is analyzed in terms of its points is illegitimate.

Grünbaum’s response, while addressing a paradox, has recently been significantly challenged for accuracy regarding both ancient and Nineteenth century mathematics. Reese et al. (2022) construe the paradox—specifically Aristotle’s reasoning in the final sentence— in a way that does not turn on summing zeroes at all, but instead assumes only that the size of a point is bounded by the size of the lines of which it is a part. The resulting paradox, they show, would have troubled the principles of ancient mathematics; moreover, it troubled mathematics in the 1880s, and was ultimately resolved by Borel. While that solution turns on the number of points in a line being uncountable, it neither relied on Cauchy’s proof, nor ideas concerning infinite sums. Serious future research on this paradox will need to consider this work.

3. The Paradoxes of Motion

3.1 The Dichotomy

The first asserts the non-existence of motion on the ground that that which is in locomotion must arrive at the half-way stage before it arrives at the goal. (Aristotle Physics, 239b11)

This paradox is known as the ‘dichotomy’ because it involves repeated division into two (like the second paradox of plurality). Like the other paradoxes of motion we have it from Aristotle, who sought to refute it.

Suppose a very fast runner—such as mythical Atalanta—needs to run for the bus. Clearly before she reaches the bus stop she must run half-way, as Aristotle says. There’s no problem there; supposing a constant motion it will take her 1/2 the time to run half-way there and 1/2 the time to run the rest of the way. Now she must also run half-way to the half-way point—i.e., a 1/4 of the total distance—before she reaches the half-way point, but again she is left with a finite number of finite lengths to run, and plenty of time to do it. And before she reaches 1/4 of the way she must reach \(1/2\) of \(1/4 = 1/8\) of the way; and before that a 1/16; and so on. There is no problem at any finite point in this series, but what if the halving is carried out infinitely many times? The resulting series contains no first distance to run, for any possible first distance could be divided in half, and hence would not be first after all. However it does contain a final distance, namely 1/2 of the way; and a penultimate distance, 1/4 of the way; and a third to last distance, 1/8 of the way; and so on. Thus the series of distances that Atalanta is required to run is: …, then 1/16 of the way, then 1/8 of the way, then 1/4 of the way, and finally 1/2 of the way (for now we are not suggesting that she stops at the end of each segment and then starts running at the beginning of the next—we are thinking of her continuous run being composed of such parts). And now there is a problem, for this description of her run has her travelling an infinite number of finite distances, which, Zeno would have us conclude, must take an infinite time, which is to say it is never completed. And since the argument does not depend on the distance or who or what the mover is, it follows that no finite distance can ever be traveled, which is to say that all motion is impossible. (Note that the paradox could easily be generated in the other direction so that Atalanta must first run half way, then half the remaining way, then half of that and so on, so that she must run the following endless sequence of fractions of the total distance: 1/2, then 1/4, then 1/8, then ….)

A couple of common responses are not adequate. One might—as Simplicius (On Aristotle’s Physics, 1012.22) tells us Diogenes the Cynic did by silently standing and walking—point out that it is a matter of the most common experience that things in fact do move, and that we know very well that Atalanta would have no trouble reaching her bus stop. But this would not impress Zeno, who, as a paid up Parmenidean, held that many things are not as they appear: it may appear that Diogenes is walking or that Atalanta is running, but appearances can be deceptive and surely we have a logical proof that they are in fact not moving at all. Alternatively if one doesn’t accept that Zeno has given a proof that motion is illusory—as we hopefully do not—one then owes an account of what is wrong with his argument: he has given reasons why motion is impossible, and so an adequate response must show why those reasons are not sufficient. And it won’t do simply to point out that there are some ways of cutting up Atalanta’s run—into just two halves, say—in which there is no problem. For if you accept all of the steps in Zeno’s argument then you must accept his conclusion (assuming that he has reasoned in a logically deductive way): it’s not enough to show an unproblematic division, you must also show why the given division is unproblematic.

Another response—given by Aristotle himself—is to point out that as we divide the distances run, we should also divide the total time taken: there is 1/2 the time for the final 1/2, a 1/4 of the time for the previous 1/4, an 1/8 of the time for the 1/8 of the run and so on. Thus each fractional distance has just the right fraction of the finite total time for Atalanta to complete it, and thus the distance can be completed in a finite time. This reply may seem trivial by modern lights, but in an important monograph Sattler (2020) argues that understanding motion via such a mathematical correspondence between distance and duration was a crucial advance made by Aristotle, in response to his predecessors. Certainly, Aristotle felt that his reply should satisfy Zeno. However, he also realized (Physics, 263a15) that it could not be the end of the matter. For now we are saying that the time Atalanta takes to reach the bus stop is composed of an infinite number of finite pieces—…, 1/8, 1/4, and 1/2 of the total time—and isn’t that an infinite time?

Of course, one could again claim that some infinite sums have finite totals, and in particular that the sum of these pieces is \(1 \times\) the total time, which is of course finite (and again a complete solution would demand a rigorous account of infinite summation, like Cauchy’s). However, Aristotle did not make such a move. Instead he drew a sharp distinction between what he termed a ‘continuous’ line and a line divided into parts. Consider a simple division of a line into two: on the one hand there is the undivided line, and on the other the line with a mid-point selected as the boundary of the two halves. Aristotle claims that these are two distinct things: and that the latter is only ‘potentially’ derivable from the former. Next, Aristotle takes the common-sense view that time is like a geometric line, and considers the time it takes to complete the run. We can again distinguish the two cases: there is the continuous interval from start to finish, and there is the interval divided into Zeno’s infinity of half-runs. The former is ‘potentially infinite’ in the sense that it could be divided into the latter ‘actual infinity’. Here’s the crucial step: Aristotle thinks that since these intervals are geometrically distinct they must be physically distinct. But how could that be? He claims that the runner must do something at the end of each half-run to make it distinct from the next: she must stop, making the run itself discontinuous. (It’s not clear why some other action wouldn’t suffice to divide the interval.) Then Aristotle’s full answer to the paradox is that the question of whether the infinite series of runs is possible or not is ambiguous: the potentially infinite series of halves in a continuous run is possible, while an actual infinity of discontinuous half runs is not—Zeno does identify an impossibility, but it does not describe the usual way of running down tracks!

It is hard—from our modern perspective perhaps—to see how this answer could be completely satisfactory. In the first place it assumes that a clear distinction can be drawn between potential and actual infinities, something that was never fully achieved. Second, suppose that Zeno’s problem turns on the claim that infinite sums of finite quantities are invariably infinite. Then Aristotle’s distinction will only help if he can explain why potentially infinite sums are in fact finite (couldn’t we potentially add \(1 + 1 + 1 +\ldots\), which does not have a finite total); or if he can give a reason why potentially infinite sums just don’t exist. Or perhaps Aristotle did not see infinite sums as the problem, but rather whether completing an infinity of finite actions is metaphysically and conceptually and physically possible. We will briefly discuss this issue—of ‘Supertasks’—below, but note that there is a well-defined run in which the stages of Atalanta’s run are punctuated by finite rests, arguably showing the possibility of completing an infinite series of finite tasks in a finite time (Huggett 2010, 21–2). Finally, the distinction between potential and actual infinities has played no role in mathematics since Cantor tamed the transfinite numbers—certainly the potential infinite has played no role in the modern mathematical solutions discussed here.

3.2 Achilles and the Tortoise

The [second] argument was called “Achilles,” accordingly, from the fact that Achilles was taken [as a character] in it, and the argument says that it is impossible for him to overtake the tortoise when pursuing it. For in fact it is necessary that what is to overtake [something], before overtaking [it], first reach the limit from which what is fleeing set forth. In [the time in] which what is pursuing arrives at this, what is fleeing will advance a certain interval, even if it is less than that which what is pursuing advanced …. And in the time again in which what is pursuing will traverse this [interval] which what is fleeing advanced, in this time again what is fleeing will traverse some amount …. And thus in every time in which what is pursuing will traverse the [interval] which what is fleeing, being slower, has already advanced, what is fleeing will also advance some amount. (Simplicius On Aristotle’s Physics 6, 1014.10)

This paradox turns on much the same considerations as the last. Imagine Achilles chasing a tortoise, and suppose that Achilles is running at 1 m/s, that the tortoise is crawling at 0.1 m/s and that the tortoise starts out 0.9m ahead of Achilles. On the face of it Achilles should catch the tortoise after 1s, at a distance of 1m from where he starts (and so 0.1m from where the Tortoise starts). We could break Achilles’ motion up as we did Atalanta’s, into halves, or we could do it as follows: before Achilles can catch the tortoise he must reach the point where the tortoise started. But in the time he takes to do this the tortoise crawls a little further forward. So next Achilles must reach this new point. But in the time it takes Achilles to achieve this the tortoise crawls forward a tiny bit further. And so on to infinity: every time that Achilles reaches the place where the tortoise was, the tortoise has had enough time to get a little bit further, and so Achilles has another run to make, and so Achilles has an infinite number of finite catch-ups to do before he can catch the tortoise, and so, Zeno concludes, he never catches the tortoise.

One aspect of the paradox is thus that Achilles must traverse the following infinite series of distances before he catches the tortoise: first 0.9m, then an additional 0.09m, then 0.009m, …. These are the series of distances ahead that the tortoise reaches at the start of each of Achilles’ catch-ups. Looked at this way the puzzle is identical to the Dichotomy, for it is just to say that ‘that which is in locomotion must arrive [nine tenths of the way] before it arrives at the goal’. And so everything we said above applies here too.

But what the paradox in this form brings out most vividly is the problem of completing a series of actions that has no final member—in this case the infinite series of catch-ups before Achilles reaches the tortoise. But just what is the problem? Perhaps the following: Achilles’ run to the point at which he should reach the tortoise can, it seems, be completely decomposed into the series of catch-ups, none of which take him to the tortoise. Therefore, nowhere in his run does he reach the tortoise after all. But if this is what Zeno had in mind it won’t do. Of course Achilles doesn’t reach the tortoise at any point of the sequence, for every run in the sequence occurs before we expect Achilles to reach it! Thinking in terms of the points that Achilles must reach in his run, 1m does not occur in the sequence 0.9m, 0.99m, 0.999m, …, so of course he never catches the tortoise during that sequence of runs! (And the same situation arises in the Dichotomy: no first distance in the series, so it does not contain Atalanta’s start!) Thus the series of catch-ups does not after all completely decompose the run: the final point—at which Achilles does catch the tortoise—must be added to it. So is there any puzzle? Arguably yes.

Achilles’ run passes through the sequence of points 0.9m, 0.99m, 0.999m, …, 1m. But does such a strange sequence—comprised of an infinity of members followed by one more—make sense mathematically? If not then our mathematical description of the run cannot be correct, but then what is? Fortunately the theory of transfinites pioneered by Cantor assures us that such a series is perfectly respectable. It was realized that the order properties of infinite series are much more elaborate than those of finite series. Any way of arranging the numbers 1, 2 and 3 gives a series in the same pattern, for instance, but there are many distinct ways to order the natural numbers: 1, 2, 3, … for instance. Or …, 3, 2, 1. Or …, 4, 2, 1, 3, 5, …. Or 2, 3, 4, …, 1, which is just the same kind of series as the positions Achilles must run through. Thus the theory of the transfinites treats not just ‘cardinal’ numbers—which depend only on how many things there are—but also ‘ordinal’ numbers which depend further on how the things are arranged. Since the ordinals are standardly taken to be mathematically legitimate numbers, and since the series of points Achilles must pass has an ordinal number, we shall take it that the series is mathematically legitimate. (Again, see ‘Supertasks’ below for another kind of problem that might arise for Achilles’.)

3.3 The Arrow

The third is … that the flying arrow is at rest, which result follows from the assumption that time is composed of moments …. he says that if everything when it occupies an equal space is at rest, and if that which is in locomotion is always in a now, the flying arrow is therefore motionless. (Aristotle Physics, 239b30)

Zeno abolishes motion, saying “What is in motion moves neither in the place it is nor in one in which it is not”. (Diogenes Laertius Lives of Famous Philosophers, ix.72)

This argument against motion explicitly turns on a particular kind of assumption of plurality: that time is composed of moments (or ‘nows’) and nothing else. (According to Pemberton, 2022, Aristotle rejects the claim that time is composed of instants at all.) Consider an arrow, apparently in motion, at any instant. First, Zeno assumes that it travels no distance during that moment—‘it occupies an equal space’ for the whole instant. But the entire period of its motion contains only instants, all of which contain an arrow at rest, and so, Zeno concludes, the arrow cannot be moving.

An immediate concern is why Zeno is justified in assuming that the arrow is at rest during any instant. It follows immediately if one assumes that an instant lasts 0s: whatever speed the arrow has, it will get nowhere if it has no time at all. But what if one held that the smallest parts of time are finite—if tiny—so that a moving arrow might actually move some distance during an instant? One way of supporting the assumption—which requires reading quite a lot into the text—starts by assuming that instants are indivisible. Then suppose that an arrow actually moved during an instant. It would be at different locations at the start and end of the instant, which implies that the instant has a ‘start’ and an ‘end’, which in turn implies that it has at least two parts, and so is divisible, contrary to our assumption. (Note that this argument only establishes that nothing can move during an instant, not that instants cannot be finite.)

So then, nothing moves during any instant, but time is entirely composed of instants, so nothing ever moves. A first response is to point out that determining the velocity of the arrow means dividing the distance traveled in some time by the length of that time. But—assuming from now on that instants have zero duration—this formula makes no sense in the case of an instant: the arrow travels 0m in the 0s the instant lasts, but 0/0 m/s is not any number at all. Thus it is fallacious to conclude from the fact that the arrow doesn’t travel any distance in an instant that it is at rest; whether it is in motion at an instant or not depends on whether it travels any distance in a finite interval that includes the instant in question.

The answer is correct, but it carries the counter-intuitive implication that motion is not something that happens at any instant, but rather only over finite periods of time. Think about it this way: time, as we said, is composed only of instants. No distance is traveled during any instant. So when does the arrow actually move? How does it get from one place to another at a later moment? There’s only one answer: the arrow gets from point \(X\) at time 1 to point \(Y\) at time 2 simply in virtue of being at successive intermediate points at successive intermediate times—the arrow never changes its position during an instant but only over intervals composed of instants, by the occupation of different positions at different times. In Bergson’s memorable words—which he thought expressed an absurdity—‘movement is composed of immobilities’ (1911, 308): getting from \(X\) to \(Y\) is a matter of occupying exactly one place in between at each instant (in the right order of course). For further discussion of this ‘at-at’ conception of time see Arntzenius (2000) and Salmon (2001, 23-4).

3.4 The Stadium

The fourth argument is that concerning equal bodies which move alongside equal bodies in the stadium from opposite directions—the ones from the end of the stadium, the others from the middle—at equal speeds, in which he thinks it follows that half the time is equal to its double…. (Aristotle Physics, 239b33)

Aristotle goes on to elaborate and refute an argument for Zeno’s final paradox of motion. The text is rather cryptic, but is usually interpreted along the following lines: picture three sets of touching cubes—all exactly the same—in relative motion. One set—the \(A\)s—are at rest, and the others—the \(B\)s and \(C\)s—move to the right and left respectively, at a constant equal speed. And suppose that at some moment the rightmost \(B\) and the leftmost \(C\) are aligned with the middle \(A\), as shown (three of each are pictured for simplicity).

  \(A\) \(A\) \(A\)    
\(B\) \(B\) \(B\)      
    \(C\) \(C\) \(C\)  

Since the \(B\)s and \(C\)s move at same speeds, they will be aligned with the \(A\)s simultaneously.

  \(A\) \(A\) \(A\)    
  \(B\) \(B\) \(B\)    
  \(C\) \(C\) \(C\)    

At this moment, the rightmost \(B\) has traveled past all the \(C\)s, but only half the \(A\)s; since they are of equal size, it has traveled both some distance and half that distance. The putative contradiction is not drawn here however, presumably because it is clear that these contrary distances are relative to the \(C\)s and \(A\)s respectively; there’s generally no contradiction in standing in different relations to different things. Instead, the distances are converted to times by dividing the distances by the speed of the \(B\)s; half the distance at a given speed takes half the time. Then a contradiction threatens because the time between the states is unequivocal, not relative—the process takes some (non-zero) time and half that time.

The general verdict is that Zeno was hopelessly confused about relative velocities in this paradox. If the \(B\)s are moving with speed S m/s to the right with respect to the \(A\)s, and if the \(C\)s are moving with speed S m/s to the left with respect to the \(A\)s, then the \(C\)s are moving with speed \(S+S = 2\)S m/s to the left with respect to the \(B\)s. And so, of course, while the \(B\)s travel twice as far relative to the \(C\)s as the \(A\)s, they do so at twice the relative speed, and so the times are the same either way. But could Zeno have been this confused? (Sattler, 2015, argues against this and other common readings of the stadium.)

Perhaps (Davey, 2007) he had the following in mind instead (while Zeno is smarter according to this reading, it doesn’t quite fit Aristotle’s words so well): suppose the \(A\)s, \(B\)s and \(C\)s are of the smallest spatial extent, ‘point-sized’, where ‘points’ are of zero size if space is continuous, or finite if space is ‘atomic’. Suppose further that there are no spaces between the \(A\)s, or between the \(B\)s, or between the \(C\)s. During the motion above the leading \(B\) passes all of the \(C\)s, and half of the \(A\)s, so half as many \(A\)s as \(C\)s. Now, as a point moves continuously along a line with no gaps, there is a 1:1 correspondence between the instants of time and the points on the line—to each instant a point, and to each point an instant. Therefore, the number of ‘\(A\)-instants’ of time the leading \(B\) takes to pass the \(A\)s is half the number of ‘\(C\)-instants’ takes to pass the \(C\)s—even though these processes take the same amount of time. If we then, crucially, assume that half the instants means half the time, we conclude that half the time equals the whole time, a contradiction.

We saw above, in our discussion of complete divisibility, the problem with such reasoning applied to continuous lines: any line segment has the same number of points, so nothing can be inferred from the number of points in this way—certainly not that half the points (here, instants) means half the length (or time). The paradox fails as stated. But doesn’t the very claim that the intervals contain the same number of instants conflict with the step of the argument that concludes that there are half as many \(A\)-instants as \(C\)-instants? This issue is subtle for infinite sets: to give a different example, 1, 2, 3, … is in 1:1 correspondence with 2, 4, 6, …, and so there are the same number of each. It is in this sense of 1:1 correspondence—the precise sense of ‘same number’ used in mathematics—that any finite line has the same number of points as any other. However, informally speaking, there are also ‘half as many’ even numbers as whole numbers: the pairs (1, 2), (3, 4), (5, 6), … can also be put into 1:1 correspondence with 2, 4, 6, …. Similarly, there are—informally speaking—half as many \(A\)-instants as \(C\)-instants: \(A\)-instants are in 1:1 correspondence with pairs of \(C\)-instants. So there is no contradiction in the number of points: the informal half equals the strict whole (a different solution is required for an atomic theory, along the lines presented in the final paragraph of this section).

(Let me mention a similar paradox of motion—the ‘millstone’—attributed to Maimonides. Imagine two wheels, one twice the radius and circumference of the other, fixed to a single axle. Let them run down a track, with one rail raised to keep the axle horizontal, for one turn of both wheels [they turn at the same rate because of the axle]: each point of each wheel makes contact with exactly one point of its rail, and every point of each rail with exactly one point of its wheel. Does the assembly travel a distance equal to the circumference of the big wheel? Of the small? Both? Something else? How? This problem too requires understanding of the continuum; but it is not a paradox of Zeno’s so we shall leave it to the ingenuity of the reader.)

A final possible reconstruction of Zeno’s Stadium takes it as an argument against an atomic theory of space and time, which is interesting because contemporary physics explores such a view when it attempts to ‘quantize’ spacetime. Suppose then the sides of each cube equal the ‘quantum’ of length and that the two moments considered are separated by a single quantum of time. Then something strange must happen, for the rightmost \(B\) and the middle \(C\) pass each other during the motion, and yet there is no moment at which they are level: since the two moments are separated by the smallest possible time, there can be no instant between them—it would be a time smaller than the smallest time from the two moments we considered. Conversely, if one insisted that if they pass then there must be a moment when they are level, then it shows that cannot be a shortest finite interval—whatever it is, just run this argument against it. However, why should one insist on this assumption? The problem is that one naturally imagines quantized space as being like a chess board, on which the chess pieces are frozen during each quantum of time. Then one wonders when the red queen, say, gets from one square to the next, or how she gets past the white queen without being level with her. But the analogy is misleading. It is better to think of quantized space as a giant matrix of lights that holds some pattern of illuminated lights for each quantum of time. In this analogy a lit bulb represents the presence of an object: for instance a series of bulbs in a line lighting up in sequence represent a body moving in a straight line. In this case there is no temptation to ask when the light ‘gets’ from one bulb to the next—or in analogy how the body moves from one location to the next. (Here we touch on questions of temporal parts, and whether objects ‘endure’ or ‘perdure’.)

4. Two More Paradoxes

Two more paradoxes are attributed to Zeno by Aristotle, but they are given in the context of other points that he is making, so Zeno’s intent cannot be determined with any certainty: even whether they are intended to argue against plurality and motion. We will discuss them briefly for completeness.

4.1 The Paradox of Place

Zeno’s difficulty demands an explanation; for if everything that exists has a place, place too will have a place, and so on ad infinitum. (Aristotle Physics, 209a23)

When he sets up his theory of place—the crucial spatial notion in his theory of motion—Aristotle lists various theories and problems that his predecessors, including Zeno, have formulated on the subject. The argument again raises issues of the infinite, since the second step of the argument argues for an infinite regress of places. However, Aristotle presents it as an argument against the very idea of place, rather than plurality (thereby likely taking it out of context). It is hard to feel the force of the conclusion, for why should there not be an infinite series of places of places of places of …? Presumably the worry would be greater for someone who (like Aristotle) believed that there could not be an actual infinity of things, for the argument seems to show that there are. But as we have discussed above, today we need have no such qualms; there seems nothing problematic with an actual infinity of places.

The only other way one might find the regress troubling is if one holds that bodies have ‘absolute’ places, in the sense that there is always a unique privileged answer to the question ‘where is it’? The problem then is not that there are infinitely many places, but just that there are many. And Aristotle might have had this concern, for in his theory of motion, the natural motion of a body is determined by the relation of its place to the center of the universe: an account that requires place to be determinate, because natural motion is. (See Sorabji 1988 and Morrison 2002 for general, competing accounts of Aristotle’s views on place; chapter 3 of the latter especially for a discussion of Aristotle’s treatment of the paradox.) But supposing that one holds that place is absolute for whatever reason, then for example, where am I as I write? If the paradox is right then I’m in my place, and I’m also in my place’s place, and my place’s place’s place, and my …. Since I’m in all these places any might seem an appropriate answer to the question. Various responses are conceivable: deny absolute places (especially since our physics does not require them), define a notion of place that is unique in all cases (arguably Aristotle’s solution), or perhaps claim that places are their own places thereby cutting off the regress!

4.2 The Grain of Millet

… Zeno’s reasoning is false when he argues that there is no part of the millet that does not make a sound; for there is no reason why any part should not in any length of time fail to move the air that the whole bushel moves in falling. (Aristotle Physics, 250a19)

In context, Aristotle is explaining that a fraction of a force many not produce the same fraction of motion. For instance, while 100 stevedores can tow a barge, one might not get it to move at all, let alone 1/100th of the speed; so given as much time as you like he may not move it as far as the 100. (We describe this fact as the effect of friction.) Similarly, just because a falling bushel of millet makes a whooshing sound as it falls, it does not follow that each individual grain would, or does: given as much time as you like it won’t move the same amount of air as the bushel does. However, while refuting this premise Aristotle does not explain what role it played for Zeno, and we can only speculate. It’s not even clear whether it is part of a paradox, or some other dispute: did Zeno also claim to show that a single grain of millet does not make a sound? One speculation is that our senses reveal that it does not, since we cannot hear a single grain falling. Then Aristotle’s response is apt; and so is the similar response that hearing itself requires movement in the air above a certain threshold.

5. Zeno’s Influence on Philosophy

In this final section we should consider briefly the impact that Zeno has had on various philosophers; a search of the literature will reveal that these debates continue.

  • The Pythagoreans: For the first half of the Twentieth century, the majority reading—following Tannery (1885)—of Zeno held that his arguments were directed against a technical doctrine of the Pythagoreans. According to this reading they held that all things were composed of elements that had the properties of a unit number, a geometric point and a physical atom: this kind of position would fit with their doctrine that reality is fundamentally mathematical. However, in the middle of the century a series of commentators (Vlastos, 1967, summarizes the argument and contains references) forcefully argued that Zeno’s target was instead a common sense understanding of plurality and motion—one grounded in familiar geometrical notions—and indeed that the doctrine was not a major part of Pythagorean thought. We have implicitly assumed that these arguments are correct in our readings of the paradoxes. That said, Tannery’s interpretation still has its defenders (see e.g., Matson 2001).

  • The Atomists: Aristotle (On Generation and Corruption 316b34) claims that our third argument—the one concerning complete divisibility—was what convinced the atomists that there must be smallest, indivisible parts of matter. See Abraham (1972) for a further discussion of Zeno’s connection to the atomists.

  • Temporal Becoming: In the early part of the Twentieth century several influential philosophers attempted to put Zeno’s arguments to work in the service of a metaphysics of ‘temporal becoming’, the (supposed) process by which the present comes into being. Such thinkers as Bergson (1911), James (1911, Ch 10–11) and Whitehead (1929) argued that Zeno’s paradoxes show that space and time are not structured as a mathematical continuum: they argued that the way to preserve the reality of motion was to deny that space and time are composed of points and instants. However, we have clearly seen that the tools of standard modern mathematics are up to the job of resolving the paradoxes, so no such conclusion seems warranted: if the present indeed ‘becomes’, there is no reason to think that the process is not captured by the continuum.

  • Applying the Mathematical Continuum to Physical Space and Time: As noted in §1.2, the ‘received view’ of Zeno (developed in the latter part of the Twentieth century by philosophers developing the ideas of Grünbaum 1967) aimed at showing how modern mathematics resolves the paradoxes. However, central to this project was the recognition that a purely mathematical solution is not sufficient: the paradoxes not only question abstract mathematics, but also the nature of physical reality. So what they sought was an argument not only that Zeno posed no threat to the mathematics of infinity but also that that mathematics correctly describes objects, time and space. It would not answer Zeno’s paradoxes if the mathematical framework we invoked was not a good description of actual space, time, and motion! The idea that a mathematical law—say Newton’s law of universal gravity—may or may not correctly describe things is familiar, but some aspects of the mathematics of infinity—the nature of the continuum, definition of infinite sums and so on—seem so basic that it may be hard to see at first that they too apply contingently. But surely they do: nothing guarantees a priori that space has the structure of the continuum, or even that parts of space add up according to Cauchy’s definition. (Salmon offers a nice example to help make the point: since alcohol dissolves in water, if you mix the two you end up with less than the sum of their volumes, showing that even ordinary addition is not applicable to every kind of system.) Our belief that the mathematical theory of infinity describes space and time is justified to the extent that the laws of physics assume that it does, and to the extent that those laws are themselves confirmed by experience. While it is true that almost all physical theories assume that space and time do indeed have the structure of the continuum, it is also the case that quantum theories of gravity likely imply that they do not. While no one really knows where this research will ultimately lead, it is quite possible that space and time will turn out, at the most fundamental level, to be quite unlike the mathematical continuum that we have assumed here.

  • One should also note that Grünbaum took the job of showing that modern mathematics describes space and time to involve something rather different from arguing that it is confirmed by experience. The dominant view at the time (though not at present) was that scientific terms had meaning insofar as they referred directly to objects of experience—such as ‘1m ruler’—or, if they referred to ‘theoretical’ rather than ‘observable’ entities—such as ‘a point of space’ or ‘1/2 of 1/2 of … 1/2 a racetrack’—then they obtained meaning by their logical relations—via definitions and theoretical laws—to such observation terms. Thus Grünbaum undertook an impressive program to give meaning to all terms involved in the modern theory of infinity, interpreted as an account of space and time.

  • Supertasks: A further strand of thought concerns what Black (1950–51) dubbed ‘infinity machines’. Black and his followers wished to show that although Zeno’s paradoxes offered no problem to mathematics, they showed that after all mathematics was not applicable to space, time and motion. Most starkly, our resolution to the Dichotomy and Achilles assumed that the complete run could be broken down into an infinite series of half runs, which could be summed. But is it really possible to complete any infinite series of actions: to complete what is known as a ‘supertask’? If not, and assuming that Atalanta and Achilles can complete their tasks, their complete runs cannot be correctly described as an infinite series of half-runs, although modern mathematics would so describe them. What infinity machines are supposed to establish is that an infinite series of tasks cannot be completed—so any completable task cannot be broken down into an infinity of smaller tasks, whatever mathematics suggests.

  • Infinitesimals: Finally, we have seen how to tackle the paradoxes using the resources of mathematics as developed in the Nineteenth century. For a long time it was considered one of the great virtues of this system that it finally showed that infinitesimal quantities, smaller than any finite number but larger than zero, are unnecessary. (Newton’s calculus for instance effectively made use of such numbers, treating them sometimes as zero and sometimes as finite; the problem with such an approach is that how to treat the numbers is a matter of intuition not rigor.) However, in the Twentieth century Robinson showed how to introduce infinitesimal numbers into mathematics: this is the system of ‘non-standard analysis’ (the familiar system of real numbers, given a rigorous foundation by Dedekind, is by contrast just ‘analysis’). Analogously, Bell (1988) explains how infinitesimal line segments can be introduced into geometry, and comments on their relation to Zeno. Moreover, McLaughlin and Miller (1992) and McLaughlin (1994) show how Zeno’s paradoxes can be resolved in non-standard analysis; they are no more an argument against non-standard analysis than against the standard mathematics we have assumed here. It should be emphasized however that—contrary to McLaughlin and Miller’s suggestions—there is no need for non-standard analysis to solve the paradoxes: either system is equally successful. (Reeder 2015 argues that non-standard analysis is unsatisfactory regarding the arrow, and offers an alternative account using a different conception of infinitesimals.) The construction of non-standard analysis does however raise a further question about the applicability of analysis to physical space and time: it seems plausible that all physical theories can be formulated in either terms, and so as far as our experience extends both seem equally confirmed. But they cannot both be true of space and time: either space has infinitesimal parts or it doesn’t.

Further Readings

After the relevant entries in this encyclopedia, the place to begin any further investigation is Salmon (2001), which contains some of the most important articles on Zeno up to 1970, and an impressively comprehensive bibliography of works in English in the Twentieth Century. A more recent extended treatment, contextualizing the debate in the development of the concept of motion in antiquity, is Sattler (2020).

One might also take a look at Huggett (1999, Ch. 3) and Huggett (2010, Ch. 2–3) for further source passages and discussion. For introductions to the mathematical ideas behind the modern resolutions, the Appendix to Salmon (2001) or Stewart (2017) are good starts; Russell (1919) and Courant et al. (1996, Chs. 2 and 9) are also both wonderful sources. Finally, three collections of original sources for Zeno’s paradoxes: Lee (1936 [2015]) contains everything known, Kirk et al (1983, Ch. 9) contains a great deal of material (in English and Greek) with useful commentaries, and Cohen et al. (1995) also has the main passages.


  • Abraham, W. E., 1972, ‘The Nature of Zeno’s Argument Against Plurality in DK 29 B I’, Phronesis, 17: 40–52.
  • Aristotle, ‘On Generation and Corruption’, A. A. Joachim (trans), in The Complete Works of Aristotle, J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle, ‘Physics’, W. D. Ross(trans), in The Complete Works of Aristotle, J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Arntzenius, F., 2000, ‘Are There Really Instantaneous Velocities?’, The Monist, 83: 187–208.
  • Bell, J.L., 1988, ‘Infinitesimals’, Synthese, 75(3): 285–315.
  • Belot, G. and Earman, J., 2001, ‘Pre-Socratic Quantum Gravity’, in Physics Meets Philosophy at the Planck Scale: Contemporary Theories in Quantum Gravity, C. Callender and N. Huggett (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bergson, H., 1911, Creative Evolution, A. Mitchell (trans.), New York: Holt, Reinhart and Winston.
  • Black, M., 1950, ‘Achilles and the Tortoise’, Analysis, 11: 91–101.
  • Cohen, S. M., Curd, P. and Reeve, C. D. C. (eds), 1995, Readings in Ancient Greek Philosophy From Thales to Aristotle, Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Co. Inc.
  • Courant, R., Robbins, H., and Stewart, I., 1996, What is Mathematics? An Elementary Approach to Ideas and Methods, 2nd Edition, New York, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Davey, K., 2007, ‘Aristotle, Zeno, and the Stadium Paradox‘, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 24: 127–146.
  • Diogenes Laertius, 1983, ‘Lives of Famous Philosophers’, p.273 of The Presocratic Philosophers: A Critical History with a Selection of Texts, 2nd Edition, G. S. Kirk, J. E. Raven and M. Schofield (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ehrlich, P., 2014, ‘An Essay in Honor of Adolf Grünbaum’s Ninetieth Birthday: A Reexamination of Zeno’s Paradox of Extension’, Philosophy of Science, 81(4): 654–675.
  • Grünbaum, A., 1967, Modern Science and Zeno’s Paradoxes, Middletown: Connecticut Wesleyan University Press.
  • Huggett, N. (ed.), 1999, Space from Zeno to Einstein: Classic Readings with a Contemporary Commentary, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Huggett, N., 2010, Everywhere and Everywhen: Adventures in Physics and Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • James, W., 1911, Some Problems of Philosophy, New York: Longmans, Green & Co.
  • Kirk, G. S., Raven J. E. and Schofield M. (eds), 1983, The Presocratic Philosophers: A critical History with a Selection of Texts, 2nd Edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lee, H. D. P. (ed.), 1936 [2015], Zeno of Elea: A Text, with Translation and Notes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, reprinted 2015.
  • Matson, W. I., 2001, ‘Zeno Moves!’, in Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy VI: Before Plato, A. Preus (ed.), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • McLaughlin, W. I., 1994, ‘Resolving Zeno’s Paradoxes’, Scientific American, 271(5): 84–89.
  • McLaughlin, W. I., and Miller, S. L., 1992, ‘An Epistemological Use of Nonstandard Analysis to Answer Zeno’s Objections against Motion’, Synthese, 92: 371–384.
  • Morison, B, 2002, On Location: Aristotle’s Concept of Place, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Newton, I., The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, I. B. Cohen and A. M. Whitman (trans.), Berkeley: University of California Press, 1999.
  • Pemberton, J.M., 2022, ‘Aristotle’s Solution to Zeno’s Arrow Paradox and its Implications’, Ancient Philosophy Today, 4: 73–95.
  • Plato, 1997, ‘Parmenides’, M. L. Gill and P. Ryan (trans), in Plato: Complete Works, J. M. Cooper (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co. Inc.
  • Reeder, P., 2015, ‘Zeno’s Arrow and the Infinitesimal Calculus’, Synthese, 192: 1315–1335.
  • Reese, B., Vazquez, M., and Weinstein, S., 2022, ‘How Can a Line Segment with Extension be Composed of Extensionless Points? From Aristotle to Borel, and Beyond’, Synthese, 200(2): 1–28.
  • Russell, B., 1919, Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Russell, B., 1929, Our Knowledge of the External World, New York: W. W. Norton & Co. Inc.
  • Salmon, W. C., 2001, Zeno’s Paradoxes, 2nd Edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co. Inc.
  • Sattler, B.M., 2015, ‘Time is Double the Trouble: Zeno’s Moving Rows’, Ancient Philosophy, 35: 1–22.
  • Sattler, B.M., 2020, The Concept of Motion in Ancient Greek Thought: Foundations in Logic, Method, and Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sherry, D. M., 1988, ‘Zeno’s Metrical Paradox Revisited’, Philosophy of Science, 55: 58–73.
  • Simplicius, ‘On Aristotle’s Physics’, in Readings in Ancient Greek Philosophy From Thales to Aristotle, S. M. Cohen, P. Curd and C. D. C. Reeve (eds.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co. Inc. pp. 58–59, 1995.
  • Simplicius, On Aristotle’s Physics 6, D. Konstan (trans.), London: Gerald Duckworth & Co. Ltd, 1989.
  • Sorabji, R., 1988, Matter, Space, and Motion Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Stewart, I., 2017, Infinity a Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tannery, P., 1885, ‘Le Concept Scientifique du continu: Zenon d’Elee et Georg Cantor’, Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Etranger, 20: 385–410.
  • Vlastos, G., 1967, ‘Zeno of Elea’, in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, P. Edwards (ed.), New York: The Macmillan Co. and The Free Press.
  • Whitehead, A. N., 1929, Process and Reality, New York: Macmillan Co.

Other Internet Resources

  • Zeno and Melissus, a short podcast by Peter Adamson (Philosophy, Kings College London).


This entry is dedicated to the late Wesley Salmon, who did so much to educate philosophers about the significance of Zeno’s paradoxes. Those familiar with his work will see that this discussion owes a great deal to him; I hope that he would find it satisfactory. This material is based upon work supported by National Science Foundation Grant SES-0004375. I would also like to thank Eliezer Dorr for bringing to my attention some problems with my original formulation of the argument from finite size, an anonymous referee for some thoughtful comments, and Georgette Sinkler for catching errors in earlier versions. I also revised the discussion of complete divisibility in response to Philip Ehrlich’s (2014) enlightening paper.

Copyright © 2024 by
Nick Huggett <huggett@uic.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free