Alfred Jules Ayer

First published Sat May 7, 2005; substantive revision Tue Sep 4, 2018

A.J. Ayer (1910–1989) was only 24 when he wrote the book that made his philosophical name, Language, Truth, and Logic (hereafter LTL), published in 1936. In it he put forward what were understood to be the major theses of logical positivism, and so established himself as the leading English representative of the movement, Viennese in origin. In endorsing these views Ayer saw himself as continuing in the line of British empiricism established by John Locke and David Hume, an empiricism whose most recent representative was Bertrand Russell. Throughout his subsequent career he remained true to this tradition’s rejection of the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge, and so he saw the method of philosophy to be the analysis of the meaning of key terms, such as ‘causality’, ‘truth’, ‘knowledge’, ‘freedom’, and so on. The major portion of his work was devoted to exploring different facets of our claims to knowledge, particularly perceptual knowledge and knowledge that depended on inductive inference for its credence. Along the way he defended a ‘justified true belief’ account of knowledge, a Humean account of causation, and compatibilism with respect to freedom. In LTL he put forward an emotivist theory of ethics, one that he never abandoned.

Ayer always wrote with stylish crispness and clarity; he could lay bare the bones of a philosophical difficulty in a few paragraphs of strikingly simple prose. On many a philosophical problem Ayer cannot be bettered for providing a lucid, informative, and revealing description of its contours. Above all, on reading an essay of his, whether it be on basic propositions, sense data, induction, or freedom, one comes away recognizing that the aim of the author has been to reach the truth, no matter what that turned out to be. Unfortunately, he sometimes rushed to reach it, which, together with the directness of his style, gave him a reputation for mere cleverness that he never lived down. Nevertheless, amongst British philosophers of the 20th Century he has been ranked as second only to Russell (Foster 1985); P.F. Strawson, at his memorial service, stated that his contribution to the theory of knowledge and general metaphysics was “in no way inferior to Russell’s” (see Rogers 1999, 358).

1. Biographical Sketch

Alfred Jules Ayer was born in London on October 29, 1910. His mother, Reine, was descended from Dutch Jews, whilst his father, Jules Louis Cypress Ayer, came from a Swiss Calvinist background. As recounted in Rogers 1999, Ayer was a precocious but mischievous child, and so was sent to boarding school (outside Eastbourne) at the age of seven, from which he won a scholarship to Eton in 1923. There he impressed his peers with his intelligence and competitiveness, the latter trait manifesting itself in the way he played games. Ayer nevertheless felt an ‘outsider’, and it is clear that his fellow-students did not warm to him, perhaps due to the excessive zeal with which he attempted to convert them to atheism. Feeling ‘an outsider’ was something that remained with him all his life. At the age of sixteen he specialized in classics and at the same time started reading some philosophy. Bertrand Russell’s Sceptical Essays made an impression, particularly Russell’s argument for the claim that it is undesirable to believe a proposition when there is no ground for believing its truth. Ayer said that this remained a motto for him throughout his philosophical career (see Rogers 1999, 45). At the same time a reading of G.E. Moore’s Principia Ethica also had a lasting effect, particularly Moore’s articulation of the Naturalistic Fallacy.

The Easter before leaving Eton, Ayer spent some time in Paris, where he met Renee Lees, whom he subsequently married (in 1933). The following year (1929) he won a classics scholarship to Christ Church, Oxford, where he studied both Greek and philosophy, one of his tutors being Gilbert Ryle. It was Ryle who suggested that Ayer read Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, a work that immediately impressed him. Ryle was also instrumental in getting Ayer to go to Vienna in 1933 to study with Moritz Schlick, then leader of the influential Vienna Circle of philosophers, scientists and other intellectuals, joining W. V. O. Quine in being one of only two visitors to be members of the Vienna Circle. His philosophical experience in Vienna was somewhat limited by his uncertain knowledge of German, but he knew enough to pick up the basic tenets of logical positivism.

After leaving Vienna, Ayer lectured for a short time at Christ Church, where in 1935 he was elected to a five-year research fellowship. In the same year he finished LTL, which caused a great deal of controversy and debate, partly for its sweeping dismissal of metaphysics, but especially for the metaethical emotivism Ayer championed in one of its most notorious chapters. During the next few years, Ayer worked at defending and refining some of the positions adopted in LTL, not least at meetings in Oxford with Isaiah Berlin, Stuart Hampshire, and J.L. Austin; the confrontations with Austin were to prove long-lasting. The product of this refining process was the book Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. During this time he also enjoyed life to the full; he was a good dancer, once confessing that he would have preferred to be a tap-dancer rather than a professional philosopher, but had given up on the idea when he recognized that he would never be as good as Fred Astaire. His marriage to Renee started to disintegrate; Ayer had numerous affairs, and Renee formed an enduring relationship with Stuart Hampshire.

In the immediate pre-war years, Ayer had become passionate about politics. He supported the Republican side in Spain, flirted with joining the Communist Party, but instead became an active member of the Labour Party. When war was declared he joined the Welsh Guards (and was helped to do so by Gilbert Ryle). He worked for a while in Cambridge interrogating prisoners, then was sent to America to join a secret service mission, one which seemed to involve gathering information about Fascist sympathizers in America. Whilst in New York he reviewed films for the Nation, fathered a daughter (Sheila Graham was the mother), and made a record with Lauren Bacall. On being repatriated to England, Ayer found himself given the job of helping with the organization of the French resistance movements in London. Shortly after the war he was posted to Paris, where he took the opportunity to study French existentialism, writing articles on Sartre and Camus in Horizon.

On his release from Army service Ayer accepted the offer of a tutorial fellowship at Wadham College, Oxford, but was there only a short while before becoming the Grote Professor of Philosophy at University College, London, at the age of 36. He quickly appointed Hampshire to a lectureship (making up for having cited Hampshire as co-respondent in his divorce from Renee), then Richard Wollheim. The department grew and became a thriving philosophical center. Ayer also ventured into the world of radio, being involved in many BBC Third Programme broadcasts, including panel discussions with the scientists Zuckerman, Huxley and Medawar, and a famous debate with the Jesuit priest Frederick Copleston on the existence of God. Later he became a regular performer on BBC television’s “The Brains Trust”. In 1948 he lectured at Bard College in New York, but it proved to be an unhappy experience. Back in London C.E.M. Joad had published an article in the New Statesman arguing that LTL was responsible for creating an environment in which Fascism flourished, and Time magazine published an unflattering short article claiming that Ayer taught his students that “That man is good to support his mother” was a meaningless statement (Rogers 1999, p. 232). On his return to Europe he started a hectic schedule of lecture tours, visiting France, Belgium, Italy, Sweden, Denmark, Peru, Chile, Uruguay, and Brazil, all in the early 1950s.

In 1958 Ayer took the opportunity to return to Oxford as Wykeham Professor of Logic. He later said that this decision was made in order to combat the growing influence of Austin, who had made a point of attacking Ayer’s views on perception. Austin was, however, soon to die, making Ayer’s ‘sacrifice’ of his life in London somewhat pointless. Not that it was completely sacrificed; he bi-located, spending long weekends in London with his second wife, Dee Wells, and at most three nights in New College during the week. He continued to travel widely: China, Russia, India, and Pakistan were added to the itinerary. He also continued his political activity, continuing to support the Labour Party, campaigning against British involvement in Vietnam, and being at one time Vice-President of the Society for the Reform of the Abortion Law, Chairman of the Campaign Against Racial Discrimination in Sport, and President of the Homosexual Law Reform Society. His support for the decriminalization of homosexual behavior, he once quipped, could not be thought by anyone acquainted with him to involve a vested interest. Ayer’s support for the Labour Party came to an end with the formation of the Social Democratic Party in 1981. His support for the SDP was a protest at the leftward trend of the Labour Party, and particularly its anti-Europeanism.

The arrangement of spending long weekends in London and some of the working week in Oxford added to Ayer’s turbulent domestic life. In 1963 he and Dee Wells had a son, Nicholas, of whom Ayer said, “My love for this child has been a dominating factor in the remainder of my life” (Rogers 1999, 278.) He formed a relationship with Vanessa Lawson, whom he would see whilst in Oxford. During this time, Ayer continued to be philosophically productive, doing some of his most original work. The Origins of Pragmatism was published in 1968, following this Russell and Moore: the Analytical Heritage (the product of the William James lectures he delivered at Harvard in 1970), and Probability and Evidence (the Dewey lectures delivered at Columbia University in 1970). Shortly thereafter came Russell, a small paperback, and The Central Questions of Philosophy (1973, originally given as the Gifford Lectures at the University of St. Andrews), in which he elaborated on the sophisticated realism first put forward in The Origins of Pragmatism. He visited Canada on a couple of occasions, giving the Gilbert Ryle lectures at Trent University (1979) resulting in his book on Hume, and the Whidden lectures at McMaster (1983) giving rise to Freedom and Morality.

Shortly after being divorced from Dee Wells, Ayer married Vanessa Lawson in 1982. Shortly before that Renee, his first wife, had died (1980), followed by Valerie, their daughter, who died suddenly of Hodgkin’s disease in 1981. Tragically Vanessa was to die of liver cancer in 1985, leaving Ayer grief-stricken. He himself had a close encounter with death, being ‘technically’ dead for a few minutes after choking on a piece of smoked salmon. On reviving he reported his experience whilst ‘dead’ in such a way as to provide fodder for those who thought the famous atheist had recanted and found God. He moved quickly to dispel these rumours. By this time he had become something of a philosophical Grand Old Man, with volumes published in his honour, and a full-length critical study by John Foster in the prestigious Routledge “arguments of the philosophers” series. He spent most of the remaining couple of years responding to articles that were to appear in the Ayer volume in the Library of Living Philosophers series, edited by L.E. Hahn. He remarried Dee Wells, but not long afterwards Ayer was admitted to hospital with a collapsed lung in the early summer of 1989 and died on the 27th, June.

Ayer wrote two autobiographies, Part of My Life, and More of My Life. His circle of friends included many famous and influential people; the following (in no particular order) is only a brief list. Cyril Connolly, Graham Greene, George Orwell, ee cummings and his wife Marianne, Meyer Schapiro, Arthur Koestler, Bertrand Russell, Stephen Spender, W.H. Auden, Philip Toynbee, Isaiah Berlin, Hugh Gaitskell, Roy Jenkins, Michael Foot, Richard Crossman, Jonathan Miller, Angus Wilson, Alan Bennett, Alice Thomas Ellis, Joan Fontaine, Iris Murdoch, V.S. Pritchett, and Christopher Hitchens. He believed, maybe truly, that the character of George Moore in Tom Stoppard’s play Jumpers was modeled on him. Ayer was a vain man whose vanity was part of his considerable charm. He made a distinction between vanity and egotism; an egotist, he said, thought he should have more medals, whilst a vain person just enjoyed showing off the medals he had. Among the many ‘medals’ given to Ayer were his knighthood, Fellow of the British Academy, honorary member of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, Member of the Bulgarian Order of Cyril and Methodius, 1st class, and Chevalier of the Légion d’honneur.

2. Meaning and Truth

2.1 Meaning

The empiricist basis of Ayer’s attitude to meaning was laid first in his reading of Hume. The thought that no idea had any empirical significance unless it was suitably related to an impression stayed with him, and was reinforced both by his reading of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus and by the time spent in Vienna with the Logical Positivists. His first formulation of a criterion of meaning, the principle of verification, was in the first edition of LTL (1936), where he claimed that all propositions were analytic (true in virtue of their meaning) or else either strongly verifiable or weakly verifiable. Strong verification required that the truth of a proposition be conclusively ascertainable; weak verification required only that an observation statement be deducible from the proposition together with other, auxiliary, propositions, provided that the observation statement was not deducible from these auxiliaries alone. This rapidly proved defective: any proposition P conjoined with ‘if P then O’, where ‘O’ is an observation statement, will yield O, without this being deducible from ‘if P then O’ alone. So in the second edition Ayer amended the principle to read: a statement is directly verifiable if it is either an observation statement or is such that an observation statement is derivable from it in conjunction with another observation statement (or observation statements), such derivability not being possible from the conjoined observation statement(s) alone. And a statement is indirectly verifiable if, first, in conjunction with certain other premises it entails one or more directly verifiable statements that are not derivable from these other premises alone, and, second, that these other premises “do not include any statement that is not either analytic, or directly verifiable, or capable of being independently established as indirectly verifiable.” (LTL 2nd ed. P. 17).

This principle generated further criticism, most significantly from Alonzo Church (1949), who claimed to show that, again, it allowed any statement to be meaningful. Take O1, O2, and O3 as logically independent observation statements, and S any statement whatsoever. Then

(1) (¬O1&O2) v (O3S)

is directly verifiable, as (1) in conjunction with O1 entails O3. S becomes indirectly verifiable, as O2 follows from S and (1), and (1) is directly verifiable. Should O2 follow from (1) alone, then O2 follows from O3S, which means that ¬S is directly verifiable (O2 and O3S being logically independent).

Despite the failure of these attempts to provide a rigorous empiricist criterion of meaning, Ayer continued to hold that there was a close connection between evidence and meaning, maintaining that a satisfactory account of confirmation was needed before a fool-proof criterion of empirical meaning could be supplied. Given later doubts about whether any theory of confirmation could provide a foundation for a theory of meaning (Quinean doubts relating to the impossibility of ruling out any facts as possibly bearing on the truth of any sentence), it remains unclear as to how the evidence-meaning connection can be circumscribed. (For a review of other attacks on, and adjustments to, the verification principle, see Wright 1986, 1989.)

In addition to the technical difficulties surrounding the proper formulation of the meaning-criterion, Ayer later acknowledged that he had been vague as to whether the criterion was intended in a ‘weak’ or ‘strong’ sense: if weak, verifiability merely demarcated sense from nonsense, whilst the strong version meant that the method of verification provided the meaning of the sentence. It was the strong version that was used in his discussion of the meaning of sentences about the past and other minds, but in his discussion of the latter another difficulty emerged. It had not been made clear whether the ‘method of verification’ was intended to be neutral between people employing the sentences in question, and so provide a standard meaning for these sentences, or whether such a method could provide an idiosyncratic meaning for one individual’s use of the sentence, the method of verification being peculiar to that person. In his discussion of mental experiences, Ayer had implicitly taken the second route, and so sentences attributing such experiences to himself were given a ‘mentalistic’ analysis, and those attributing experiences to others were given a behaviorist analysis (see the introduction to the second edition of LTL. At the same time, however, he construed another’s self-attribution of experience mentalistically, whereas, as he later acknowledged, to be consistent these should also have been given a behaviorist analysis (see the discussion between Bernard Williams and Ayer in Macdonald 1979).

The strong interpretation of the criterion required there to be some decision made as to what evidence contributed to the meaning of verifiable sentences. For Ayer it was clear that not all evidence for a statement was to be included in the meaning of the statement: a statement about the blood on Jack’s jacket was not included in the meaning of the assertion that Jack was the murderer. Further, although only present evidence is available to anybody making a statement about the past, the meaning of such a statement is not restricted to such present evidence; one is entitled to include in the meaning evidence that would be available if one were able to transport oneself to that past time. Moral statements were, in Ayer’s view, not verifiable, and so could not be construed as assertions of fact, being interpreted instead as expressions of emotion. This is examined again in Section 7.

The only class of statements that Ayer allowed to be meaningful without such a connection to evidence was that comprised of tautologies, which included all analytic propositions. These were the only propositions knowable a priori, their meaning being dependent on how language was used, and on the conventions governing that use. Ayer insisted that the necessity attaching to these propositions was only available once the conventions governing language-use were in play.

2.2 Truth

In LTL Ayer, following Ramsey (as he thought, but see Field 1986 for a dissenting view), put forward a redundancy (deflationary) view of truth: “…in all sentences of the form ‘p is true’, the phrase ‘is true’ is logically superfluous” (LTL p. 117). The function of such a phrase is simply to mark an assertion (or denial, in the case of ‘is false’), so there is no ‘real’ relation of truth, and so no problem of truth for philosophers to worry about. Similarly, when we say a proposition is probable, or probably true, we are not assigning any intrinsic property to the proposition, nor saying that there is any relation it bears to any other proposition. We are simply expressing our confidence in that proposition, or, more accurately, it expresses the degree of confidence it is rational to possess in the proposition.

This deflationary attitude to truth was supported by his verificationism about meaning; Ayer did not have to provide truth-conditions for the meaning of sentences. Assertions had meaning in virtue of their verification conditions, and propositions were defined just as an equivalence class of sentences with the same verification conditions.

Deflationism about truth replaces a concern for a substantial theory of truth with a concern about which sentences, or utterances, are deemed to be truth-apt. Ayer denied that moral utterances were truth-apt. Given that he thought that asserting that p was equivalent to saying that p was true, he had to deny that moral utterances could be assertions (see section 7).

See the entry on the deflationary theory of truth for further discussion.

3. Perception

In his early work on perception Ayer espoused a strict form of phenomenalism, defending the view that statements about material objects are translatable into statements about actual and possible ‘sense-contents’. These latter statements were the ultimate verifiers, forming the basis upon which our empirical world was constructed. Although he later abandoned the reductionism inherent in the translatability requirement (beginning with “Phenomenalism” in 1947), believing that he had been wrong to think that any statement about a physical object could be entailed by a set of statements about sensory experience (sense-data), Ayer continued to hold that our claims about physical objects were justified by reference to such sensory experience. He consistently opposed the view, espoused by Rudolf Carnap, Otto Neurath, and Karl Popper, that the only justifiers were sentences, whether Neurath’s ‘protocols’ or Popper’s ‘basic statements’. His criticism of such views was that the favoured class of statements could not be picked out in the right way without an appeal to relevant experience. So a criterion for membership of the favored class of statements that required only those statements accepted by the scientists of the time to be members of the class was not going to be successful without knowing which sentences were thus accepted, and this, Ayer claimed, could only be known by experience. The alternative of using yet another sentence, one stating that these (p,q,r, …) were the sentences in the relevant class (those accepted by the scientists), would make the foundations of science entirely arbitrary.

Even on Ayer’s later view, called ‘sophisticated realism’(in Ayer 1973), where our perception of physical objects was indirect, the ultimate bases for perceptual judgments were sense-data, which were now called ‘qualia’ (or, if particularized, ‘percepts’). It was this continuing commitment to sense-data as the objects of perception that drew J.L. Austin’s (often sarcastic) criticism in Sense and Sensibilia (1962). On Ayer’s view, qualia formed the patterns constituting a primary system, and it was on the basis of this system that we posited the existence of physical objects, this being the ‘theoretical’ secondary system. Once we have this theory, we are able reinterpret the quale as mental states and claim that they are caused by the physical objects. This causal claim is only merited once the theoretical system is in place, and so cannot be a primitive element in any account of perception. The physical objects are required to be there before any causal hypothesis involving them makes sense.

Part, but only a part, of Ayer’s reason for embracing such indirect realism was what has been called the argument from illusion, the central idea of which is that, for any perceptual state of ours, we could be in a state indiscriminable from it but which did not involve perception of any material object or scene, it being an illusion that there was any such object or scene to be perceived. That is, non-veridical perceptions could share their intrinsic properties with veridical perceptions, this possibility leading Ayer to claim that it was plausible that the object of perception in both cases was (non-material) experience, and not, as naïve realism would have it, the physical objects themselves. As a consequence, ordinary perceptual judgments, those making claims about such objects, go beyond what is ‘strictly available’ in our perceptual experience, and so they form a theory about that which is available to perception.

There are many ways of querying Ayer’s conclusion. Austin attacked the way he saw the argument from illusion being deployed. He questioned just about everything in it: the distinction between veridical and non-veridical perception, the supposed generalization from ‘some (real) perceptual experience is indiscriminable from a (mere) perceptual appearance’ to ‘all such perceptions are indiscriminable from their counterpart appearances’, and the assumption that when we have defective perceptions there are non-material objects of those perceptions, sense-data.

Strawson (1979) argued that the primary system, that purporting to describe no more than what was ‘strictly available’ to perception, could only be described using concepts available to those already acquainted with the secondary system. A consequence of this, he claimed, was that the secondary system embodied in ordinary perceptual judgments could not be a theory with respect to which the primary system was the data – the data have to be describable in terms that do not presuppose the very theory for which they are the data. Although, he argued, it may be possible, though difficult, for us to strip our vocabulary describing our experience of such secondary-system concepts, such an effort on our part would be unusual, and not at all like what is involved in our common-sense perceptual judgments, those that Ayer supposes to be the result of some theorizing on our part. For Strawson, our commitment to a conceptual scheme of a realist character is ‘something given with the given’ (Strawson 1979, p. 47).

Ayer was unmoved by the objections. He replied to Austin’s attack in “Has Austin Refuted Sense-data Theory” (Ayer 1967), with Ayer defending the viability of the distinction between veridical and non-veridical perception, and maintaining that the argument from illusion was only one source of the case for sense-data. (For an in-depth discussion of the dispute between Austin and Ayer, see Mike Thau, “What is Disjunctivism” 2004). Against Strawson (“Replies” 1979) he noted that there was considerable agreement between them: in particular, they both agreed that perceptual judgments contain implications going beyond those carried by a ‘strict’ account of our sensible experience. The disagreement was primarily about whether the perceptual judgments were based on, or were inferred from, awareness of sense-data. Ayer conceded that such an inference would be only implicit. The point about language he conceded as well, maintaining only that the assumptions often built into concepts descriptive of physical objects – the accessibility of such objects to other observers, that they continued to exist unperceived, and so on, would not be in play when these concepts were used to provide the ‘strict’ account of perceptual experience.

4. Induction and Probability

Hume was an influential figure in the formation of Ayer’s philosophical views, so it is no surprise to find Ayer’s approach to inductive inference modeled on Hume’s. Ayer defined inductive inference in negative terms, as involving all factual inference in which the premises did not entail the conclusion. All such inferences, Ayer claimed, presumed the uniformity of nature, an assumption he put in terms of assuming that the future will, in relevant respects, resemble the past (1956, p. 72). To unambiguously cover cases of retrodiction, the assumption is better put in terms of the unobserved resembling, in relevant respects, the observed. Ayer agreed with Hume that relying on any ‘principle’ of the uniformity of nature was not going to help justify inductive inference, given that such a principle was itself not demonstrable. A similar argument applied to any other principles that may have been thought to supply the missing ingredient, such as an appeal to universal causality, or to laws of nature. These were also not demonstrably true, so would require justification themselves, and any appeal to these principles in such a justification would be viciously circular.

The fundamental problem here is that the inductive gap can be closed only if the premises can somehow be made to entail their conclusion, and Ayer denied that this could be done. Naïve realism tried to do it by making the evidence ‘move up’ to the conclusion – by making it the case that in perception our evidence was directly of physical objects, rather than of sense-data from which physical objects were inferred. This could work, if it did, only for perception, and not for other inductive inferences. Reductive attempts to close the gap tried to make the conclusion ‘move down’ to the premises, as in phenomenalism. Ayer by now thought phenomenalism was unsuccessful in this attempt, and again reductionism would not work for the future cases. In his 1956 he thought that the best we could do was to admit the gap and be content to describe the ways in which we actually went about justifying such inferences.

Ayer went on in later work to examine the problem of induction in greater detail, in particular in relation to attempts to make the problem tractable by appeal to notions of probability. In 1957 he wrote an important article attacking the idea that the logical conception of probability could be a useful guide to the future. Given a proposition, a, that a horse is going to win the race, and various sources of evidence, h1, h2, h3hn, one can estimate the probability of a given h1 to be p1, given h2 to be p2, and so on. One can also estimate the probability of a given all of h1hn. Call this probability pn, it being the probability of a given all of the evidence available to the person wishing to place a bet on the horse. Which of these probabilities, asks Ayer, would it be rational for this person to base their bets on? Common sense dictates that pn is the best estimate, but Ayer argues that on the logical conception of probability, all of the estimates p1pn are logically true, and so it is impossible to single out one as being ‘better’ than any of the others.

Ayer notes that common sense (and Carnap) say that a probability based on ‘total’ evidence is what is needed. But why do we have to take into account total evidence? Given that all of the different estimates are logically true, there can be nothing wrong in relying on one rather than another. Saying that if one takes into account all the available evidence one is more likely to be right is equivalent to saying that the hypothesis that ‘those with total evidence’ are more often right has a certain probability, and that gets us no further forward. Ayer took this result as a reason to reject the logical interpretation of probability statements, a rejection repeated in his more extended treatment of probability in Probability and Evidence 1972, and again in his reply to J.L. Mackie’s attempt to rebut his objections (see Mackie 1979, Ayer 1979).

In Probability and Evidence Ayer also criticised the frequency interpretation of probability, noting that under this interpretation the probability of an event will change with any change in the reference class to which that event is assigned. The frequency interpretation itself cannot determine whether the choice of one reference class over another is better for the determination of the relevant probability, and so suffers from a critical defect if it is to be of any use in solving problems associated with inductive inference. (For further discussion of Ayer’s views on probability and induction see Bela Juhos 1969, and Foster 1985, pp.198–227.)

5. Knowledge

In The Problem of Knowledge (1956), Ayer defended a context-based account of knowledge that had as its essential ingredients that some claim, p, counted as knowledge for a person, A, iff p was true, A was sure that p, and A had, in the relevant context, ‘the right to be sure’ about the truth of p. The contextual element is apparent in the discussion after Ayer outlines what is required to have the ‘right to be sure’ in the mathematical case. One avenue to knowledge in this case lies in the ability of the agent to provide a proof of the relevant proposition. In the case of perception, or memory, it is clear that it is impossible to possess such a proof, so a more relaxed standard is required. To state in general how strong the backing needs to be for a believer to have the right to be sure that their belief is true is not possible; doing so would require drawing up a list of conditions “under which perception, or memory, or testimony, or other forms of evidence are reliable.” (1956, p. 32.) Ayer thought this would be too complicated a task, if at all possible. The ‘correct’ standard to set for claims to knowledge is to be decided pragmatically, on grounds of practical convenience. The skeptic’s ploy of setting an impossible standard, one requiring the impossibility of error, should be resisted, as one has the right to be sure even where error is possible.

The account offered was intended as an analysis of knowledge, but revealingly Ayer did not require that believers be aware of how they have the right to be sure. It was allowed that somebody who invariably correctly predicted the outcome of a lottery could be said to know that their prediction was true, even though they, nor anyone else, had any idea of how the predictions came to be reliable. Ayer admitted that this case, and others like it, may cause some dispute: it was not clearly covered by the meaning of the term ‘knowledge’, and so left room for some stipulation.

Ayer’s particular analysis, or one closely resembling it, came under attack in a famous paper by Gettier (1963), in which satisfaction of the three clauses (the truth of p, the belief in p, and the right to be sure that p) was held to be insufficient for knowledge. Gettier’s argument requires that someone, A, could be justified in believing a false proposition, and that if A was justified in believing p and q is deducible from p, and A accepted q by deducing it from p, then A would be justified in believing q. An example used by Gettier has the following structure: (i) Jones owns a Ford. (ii) Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Boston. Smith believes, and has ample evidence for, (i). He deduces (ii) from (i), and so is justified in believing (ii), even though, in fact, he has no idea of where Brown is. It turns out that (i) is false, but (ii) is true – unbeknownst to Smith, Brown is indeed in Boston. Gettier concluded that in this case all three clauses of the analysis of knowledge are satisfied, but that we should judge in this case that Smith did not know (ii). The suggestion was that additional clauses might be needed.

The literature spawned by the Gettier counter-examples is huge, nearly all of it attempting to pin down the elusive additional clause(s). Ayer himself did not think that any such additional clauses were needed. The counter-examples, he thought, showed that what was needed was a more careful account of what ‘being justified’ consisted in. He disputed Gettier’s claim that any deduction from a justified, but false, proposition preserves justification. We already knew, he claimed, that the notion of having evidence for a claim is very difficult to elucidate; Carl Hempel’s paradoxes succeeded in showing that. Once we had managed to throw more light on the justification relation, we would see that his proposed analysis was sufficient for knowledge.

6. Necessity, Causality, and Freedom

We have seen that in LTL Ayer maintained that all necessary truths were true in virtue of the meanings of the terms used in expressing them, this in turn depending on the conventions governing the use of those terms. One can see in the expression of this early view unease about the source of logical necessity. He describes the necessity of logical truths as dependent on the rules governing the use of logical constants. Although such rules are neither true nor false, they elucidate the “proper” use of such constants, a formulation suggesting that the source of the necessity is deeper than mere linguistic usage.

Later, cleaving (or perhaps clinging) to his “all necessity is de dicto” starting point, he consistently refused to countenance any de re necessities. He strenuously resisted the essentialism that became fashionable following the work of Putnam and Kripke in the 1970s, but his reasons for doing so were not always to the point. In his argument against essence-based de re necessities Ayer would say that “Caesar is necessarily human” is not true, since he could have called his dog “Caesar”. Here he lost sight of his own insistence (in the Introduction to the 2nd. Edition of LTL) that necessary truths were expressed in a language whose terms had already been assigned meaning and reference, so changing the reference of “Caesar” is irrelevant to the necessary truth of a sentence employing the term with its ‘normal’ reference.

Of greater relevance was his suspicion of the move from conceivability to possibility, and inconceivability to impossibility, thinking that answers to questions about conceivability were dependent upon the state of knowledge and imaginative powers of the person entertaining them. Was it inconceivable that Caesar (the Julius of old) be non-human? Ayer thought it consistent with everything he knew of Caesar (apart from his being human) that Caesar was a robot, so he could “easily conceive of it as a possibility” (“Replies” p. 308). On the other hand, if asked whether Caesar was a tortoise, he would suspect that the word “Caesar” was here used with a different reference in mind. Ayer buttressed this thought by suggesting that the descriptions securing the referent of the term “Caesar” would normally make it logically inconsistent that the satisfier of the descriptions be a tortoise, but that this did not establish de re necessities; it does not follow that the Caesar in question necessarily satisfies the descriptions associated with the use of the name. To the suggestion that something other than descriptions might secure the proper reference, such as the causal origin of the use of the term, Ayer was dismissive: “…the idea …that one can explain the nature of reference by saying that what makes A’s use of a sign s a reference to an object O is its causal derivation from someone’s original use of s to refer to O is a manifest absurdity. If one does not understand what it is for s to refer to O, one is none the wiser; and if one does, the causal flummery is otiose.” (“Replies” 1979 p. 309.)

Ayer’s rejection of these kind of de re necessities was, at root, a consequence of his epistemological approach to their evaluation. The senses of terms, he thought, were dependent on their associated descriptions, these being dependent on what we knew of their reference, and these senses accounted for the presence or absence of necessity. So it is identity of sense in “Hesperus is Hesperus” that makes that sentence necessarily true, whilst absence of sense-identity renders “Hesperus is Phosphorous” contingently true. He rejected the thought that natural kind terms have their sense fixed by their internal constitution on the grounds that many, if not most, users of natural kind terms are ignorant of the nature of the relevant internal constitutions. In this he is in agreement with those who recognize the kind of necessity arising from primary intensions (Chalmers 2004) or ‘A intensions’ (Jackson 1998), such intensions being determined by (some) phenomenal properties of the kinds referred to.

Ayer also repudiated causal necessity. Following Hume, he thought causation could be reduced to regularity: “c causes e” is equivalent to “whenever c then e”. This latter proposition is then a law of nature, which is just a generalization to which we have a certain attitude. So contingent generalizations and laws of nature are much the same; they differ only in that we rely on the latter more than the former, and are prepared to treat the law as though it possessed some stronger modality, though in fact it does not.

The lack of necessity attaching to causes made Ayer’s acceptance of human freedom undemanding. Having denied the existence of any causal necessity it was open to Ayer to be a compatibilist: determinism could be true (all action could be caused), but one could still accept that this left it open as to whether the agent could have done otherwise, given that the existence of the cause did not necessitate the action. Ayer argued that the relevant contrast to freedom was not causality, but constraint, or compulsion, which are a ‘special’ sort of cause. So if our actions could be caused whilst not being ‘constrained’ in any way, then determinism could be true and we could still be free. It was just as well that this position was available, claimed Ayer, because being held morally responsible for our actions required that these be not the result of sheer chance.

This leaves, as Ayer recognized, a problem: if freedom is possible because causes don’t necessitate, then am I ever unfree? Ayer’s reply was straightforward. It is only some causes that deprive us of freedom; if a robber puts a pistol to my head and demands my money, he has left me without a reasonable alternative, so I am not morally responsible for the action I am made to do. So to say that I could have done otherwise is just to say that I would have done otherwise had I so chosen, that my action was voluntary in the way in which the kleptomaniac’s isn’t, and that nobody compelled me to act in the way that I did. (See “Freedom and Necessity”, 1954). This ‘resolution’ of the problem remains unsatisfactory; Ayer’s type of compatibilist does not have an acceptable account of why it is that some causes are sufficient to make my action not free, whilst others contain no such threat. As he says, all causes are equally necessitating – none of them necessitate, not even the ‘special’ sort of causes that, he alleges, threaten our freedom.

7. Ethics

The emotivism espoused by Ayer in LTL was supported by his belief in the distinction between fact and value. Given, he thought, that there were no moral facts to be known, there could be no verification of such facts, and so moral utterances could have no cognitive significance. And given the connection between moral ‘judgment’ and motivation, and the connection between motivation and feeling, it was natural to see moral utterances as having the function of expressing our feelings, or ‘emoting’. This view, Ayer was careful to point out, was not that associated with subjectivism, that in making moral claims we are describing our feelings. This latter view would make moral claims truth-evaluable, and Ayer’s moral emotivism denied that they were so evaluable. So when we say: “Cruelty towards children is wrong” we are really expressing a negative attitude towards killing children, and when we say “Being kind to old people is good” we are expressing positive feelings towards such acts of kindness. The expression of such positive or negative feelings, he later thought, also contained a prescriptive element, so in such expressions we are also encouraging others to share those feelings, and to act accordingly. As this makes clear, the attitudes expressed were towards classes of acts, and not particular acts.

Emotivism was thought by some to be the reductio ad absurdum of the verificationist theory of meaning, and indeed it was not the preferred metaethical position of other positivists, some of whom preferred a consequentialist approach, and so emotivism could be seen as separable from verificationism. In fact, in the “Introduction” to the second edition of LTL Ayer stated that his commitment to emotivism would survive any demise of his positivism, and it later became clear that it was because Ayer thought moral judgments to be not fact-stating that he concluded they were unverifiable (see “The Analysis of Moral Judgments” in Ayer 1954). Emotivism was given additional support by C.L.Stevenson, who had developed his ideas independently of Ayer, in his book Ethics and Language (1944). In subsequent decades, it spawned a family of what came to be called “expressivist” views in metaethics, which sought to state the view with a sensitivity to the logical problems Ayer’s formulation raised.

It has been suggested (Dreier 2004) that Ayer faced a particular difficulty in defending this brand of non-cognitivism; the combination of affirming a redundancy theory of truth with the denial that moral claims can be true looks suspicious. Although the two views are not incompatible (Ayer denied that moral claims were assertions, and the redundancy of the truth-predicate held only for assertions), the tension between the two is symptomatic of the worry that moral claims have so many of the features of truth-evaluable assertions that one has to be unjustifiably revisionist in construing them as non-meaningful. They are, after all, typically expressed in indicative sentences, and people appear to dispute moral claims. This latter point Ayer did respond to: moral disagreements were, he (and Stevenson) claimed, either genuine disputes about non-moral facts, or simply not genuine disagreements. (For an examination of the trouble that moral disagreement makes for emotivism, see Smith 1986.) There was, however, a further, more troubling, point about the role of moral terms in arguments: moral terms can be used in arguments in which the moral term appears in a conditional, and so is not there contributing to the expressive force of the utterance, so not expressing any emotion of the speaker. This latter point has been developed into a line of reasoning (called the “Frege-Geach” problem) against expressivism in general. The problem for the expressivist is to make sense of simple arguments such as the following: (1) If John killed Jane, he did something wrong. (2) John killed Jane. So (3) John did something wrong. The argument appears to be valid, and so not to involve any ambiguity, but the moral term can be construed as having expressive force only in (3), not in (1). Expressivism, and so emotivism, seems to introduce an unwarranted equivocation into the argument.

It is perhaps these ‘surface’ features of moral discourse, those that make it look like moral claims are assertions, and hence expressions of belief, and so truth-evaluable, and that moral disagreement appears to be genuine moral disagreement, that later tempted Ayer to consider Mackie’s ‘error’ theory of moral language (Mackie 1977) as closer to the truth (in Ayer 1984). The details of emotivism tended to disappear from the metaethical scene in the latter half of the twentieth century, but its guiding thoughts have remained very much alive in the expressivism of Blackburn 1984, 1998, and Gibbard 1990. (See Altham, 1979, for a sympathetic defense of these guiding thoughts, and Schroeder, 2010, for a thorough treatment of the development of expressivism, with particular attention paid to subsequent attempts to tackle the Frege-Geach problem.)


A more complete bibliography of Ayer’s work up to 1979 can be found in Macdonald 1979, in the Secondary Literature section below.

Primary Literature: Works by Ayer

  • 1936, Language, Truth, and Logic, London: Gollancz, 2nd Edition, 1946.
  • 1940, The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge, London: Macmillan.
  • 1954, Philosophical Essays, London: Macmillan. (Essays on freedom, phenomenalism, basic propositions, utilitarianism, other minds, the past, ontology.)
  • 1957, “The conception of probability as a logical relation”, in S. Korner, ed., Observation and Interpretation in the Philosophy of Physics, New York, NY: Dover Publications.
  • 1956, The Problem of Knowledge, London: Macmillan.
  • 1963, The Concept of a Person and other Essays, London: Macmillan. (Essays on truth, privacy and private languages, laws of nature, the concept of a person, probability.)
  • 1967, “Has Austin Refuted the Sense-Datum Theory?” Synthese, 18: 117–40. (Reprinted in Ayer 1969).
  • 1968, The Origins of Pragmatism, London: Macmillan.
  • 1969, Metaphysics and Common Sense, London: Macmillan. (Essays on knowledge, man as a subject for science, chance, philosophy and politics, existentialism, metaphysics, and a reply to Austin on sense-data theory.)
  • 1971, Russell and Moore: The Analytical Heritage, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972a, Probability and Evidence, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972b, Bertrand Russell, London: Fontana.
  • 1973, The Central Questions of Philosophy, London: Weidenfeld.
  • 1979, “Replies”, in G. Macdonald, ed., Perception and Identity, London: Macmillan.
  • 1980, Hume, Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • 1982, Philosophy in the Twentieth Century, London: Weidenfeld.
  • 1984, Freedom and Morality and Other Essays, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1986, Ludwig Wittgenstein, London: Penguin.
  • 1977, Part of My Life, London: Collins.
  • 1984, More of My Life, London: Collins.

Secondary Literature

  • Altham, J., 1986, “The Legacy of Emotivism”, in Macdonald and Wright, 1986.
  • Austin, J.L., 1962, Sense and Sensibilia, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, S., 1984, Spreading the Word, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1998, Ruling Passions, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Chalmers, D., 2004, “Epistemic Two-Dimensional Semantics” in Philosophical Studies, 118 (1–2): 153–226.
  • Church, A., 1949, “Review of Language, Truth, and Logic”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 14: 52–3.
  • Dreier, James, 2004, “Meta-ethics and the problem of Creeping Minimalism”, in Hawthorne 2004.
  • Foster J., 1985, A.J. Ayer, London: Routledge.
  • Gettier, E.L., 1963, “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” in Analysis, 23 (6): 121-123.
  • Gibbard, A., 1990, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Griffiths, A.P., 1991, A.J. Ayer Memorial Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hahn, L.E., 1992, The Philosophy of A.J. Ayer, Open Court.
  • Hanfling, O., 1999, Ayer, London: Routledge.
  • Hawthorne, John, ed., 2004, Ethics, Volume 18, Philosophical Perspectives series, Oxford, Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Honderich, T., 1991, Essays on A.J. Ayer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jackson, F., 1998, From Metaphysics to Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Juhos, B., 1969, “Logical and Empirical Probabllity”, Logique et Analyse, XII (47): 277–282.
  • Lewis, D.K., 1988, “Statements Partly About Observation”, Philosophical Papers 17: 1–31.
  • Macdonald, G.F., 1979, Perception and Identity, London: Macmillan.
  • Macdonald, Graham. and Wright, C., 1986, Fact, Science, and Morality, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Mackie, J.L., 1977, Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Martin, R., 2000, On Ayer Wadsworth Publishing Co.
  • Rogers, Ben, 1999, A.J. Ayer: A Life, London: Chatto & Windus.
  • Schroeder, M., 2010, Noncognitivism in Ethics, London: Routledge.
  • Smith, M., 1986, “Should We Believe in Emotivism”, in Macdonald and Wright, 1986.
  • Stevenson, C.L., 1944, Ethics and Language, New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press.
  • Thau, M., 2004, “What is Disjunctivism?” in Philosophical Studies, 120: 193–253.
  • Wilks, C., 2002, Emotion, Truth and Meaning, Kluwer Academic Publishers: Dordrecht.
  • Williams, B., 1979, “Another Time, Another Place, Another Person”, in Macdonald (ed.) 1979, pp. 252–261.
  • Wright, C., 1986, “Scientific Realism, Observation, and the Verification Principle”, in Macdonald and Wright, 1986.
  • –––, 1989, “The Verification Principle: Another Puncture – Another Patch”, Mind, 98: 611–22.

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