Deflationism About Truth

First published Thu Aug 28, 1997; substantive revision Tue Dec 14, 2021

Deflationism about truth, what is often simply called “deflationism”, is really not so much a theory of truth in the traditional sense, as it is a different, newer sort of approach to the topic. Traditional theories of truth are part of a philosophical debate about the nature of a supposed property of truth. Philosophers offering such theories often make suggestions like the following: truth consists in correspondence to the facts; truth consists in coherence with a set of beliefs or propositions; truth is what is acceptable in the ideal limit of inquiry. According to deflationists, such suggestions are mistaken, and, moreover, they all share a common mistake. The common mistake is to assume that truth has a nature of the kind that philosophers might find out about and develop theories of. The main idea of the deflationary approach is (a) that all that can be significantly said about truth is exhausted by an account of the role of the expression ‘true’ or of the concept of truth in our talk and thought, and (b) that, by contrast with what traditional views assume, this role is neither metaphysically substantive nor explanatory. For example, according to deflationary accounts, to say that ‘snow is white’ is true, or that it is true that snow is white, is in some sense strongly equivalent to saying simply that snow is white, and this, according to the deflationary approach, is all that can be said significantly about the truth of ‘snow is white’. Philosophers looking for some underlying nature of some truth property that is attributed with the use of the expression ‘true’ are bound to be frustrated, the deflationist says, because they are looking for something that isn’t there.

Deflationism comprises a variety of different versions, each of which have gone by different names, including at least the following: disquotationalism, minimalism, prosententialism, the redundancy theory, the disappearance theory, the no-truth theory. There has not always been terminological consensus in the literature about how to use these labels: sometimes they have been used interchangeably; sometimes they have been used to mark distinctions between different developments of the same general approach. The actual variety of deflationary views has not always been clear in discussions of this approach, especially in the earlier literature, where important differences are occasionally missed. To help clear this up, we will use ‘deflationism’ to denote the general approach we want to discuss and reserve other names for specific versions of that approach.

1. Central Themes in Deflationism

1.1 The Equivalence Schema

While deflationism can be developed in different ways, it is possible to isolate some central themes emphasized by most philosophers who think of themselves as deflationists. These shared themes pertain to endorsing a kind of metaphysical parsimony and positing a “deflated” role for what we can call the alethic locutions (most centrally, the expressions ‘true’ and ‘false’) in the instances of what is often called truth-talk. In this section, we will isolate three of these themes. The first, and perhaps most overarching, one has already been mentioned: According to deflationists, there is some strong equivalence between a statement like ‘snow is white’ and a statement like “‘snow is white’ is true,” and this is all that can significantly be said about that application of the notion of truth.

We may capture this idea more generally with the help of a schema, what is sometimes called the equivalence schema:

\(\langle p\rangle\) is true if, and only if, \(p\).

In this schema, the angle brackets indicate an appropriate name-forming or nominalizing device, e.g., quotation marks or ‘the proposition that …’, and the occurrences of ‘\(p\)’ are replaced with matching declarative sentences to yield instances of the schema.

The equivalence schema is often associated with the formal work of Alfred Tarski (1935 [1956], 1944), which introduced the schema,

\(X\) is true if, and only if, \(p\).

In the instances of schema (T) (sometimes called “Convention (T)”), the ‘\(X\)’ gets filled in with a name of the sentence that goes in for the ‘\(p\)’, making (T) a version of (ES). Tarski considered (T) to provide a criterion of adequacy for any theory of truth, thereby allowing that there could be more to say about truth than what the instances of the schema cover. Given that, together with the fact that he took the instances of (T) to be contingent, his theory does not qualify as deflationary.

By contrast with the Tarskian perspective on (T)/(ES), we can formulate the central theme of deflationism under consideration as the view, roughly, that the instances of (some version of) this schema do capture everything significant that can be said about applications of the notion of truth; in a slogan, the instances of the schema exhaust the notion of truth. Approaches which depart from deflationism don’t disagree that (ES) tells us something about truth; what they (with Tarski) deny is that it is exhaustive, that it tells us the whole truth about truth. Since such approaches add substantive explanations of why the instances of the equivalence schema hold, they are now often called inflationary approaches to truth. Inflationism is the general approach shared by such traditional views as the correspondence theory of truth, coherence theory of truth, pragmatic theory of truth, identity theory of truth, and primitivist theory of truth, These theories all share a collection of connected assumptions about the alethic locutions, the concept of truth, and the property of truth. Inflationary theories all assume that the expression ‘is true’ is a descriptive predicate, expressing an explanatory concept of truth, which determines a substantive property of truth. From that shared set of presuppositions, the various traditional inflationary theories then diverge from one another by providing different accounts of the assumed truth property. On inflationary views, the nature of the truth property explains why the instances of (ES) hold. Deflationary views, by contrast, reject some if not all of the standard assumptions that lead to inflationary theories, resisting at least their move to positing any substantive truth property. Instead, deflationists offer a different understanding of both the concept of truth and the functioning of the alethic locutions. A deflationist will take the instances of (ES) to be “conceptually basic and explanatorily fundamental” (Horwich 1998a, 21, n. 4; 50), or to be direct consequences of how the expression ‘true’ operates (cf. Quine 1970 [1986], Brandom 1988, and Field 1994a).

It is important to notice that even among deflationists the equivalence schema may be interpreted in different ways, and this is one way to distinguish different versions of deflationism from one another. One question about (ES) concerns the issue of what instances of the schema are assumed to be about (equivalently: to what the names in instances of (ES) are assumed to refer). According to one view, the instances of this schema are about sentences, where a name for a sentence can be formulated simply by putting quotation marks around it. In other words, for those who hold what might be called a sententialist version of deflationism, the equivalence schema has instances like (1):

‘Brutus killed Caesar’ is true if, and only if, Brutus killed Caesar.

To make this explicit, we might say that, according to sententialist deflationism, the equivalence schema is:

The sentence ‘\(p\)’ is true if, and only if, \(p\).

Notice that in this schema, the angle-brackets of (ES) have been replaced by quotation marks.

According to those who hold what might be called a propositionalist version of deflationism, by contrast, instances of the equivalence schema are about propositions, where names of propositions are, or can be taken to be, expressions of the form ‘the proposition that \(p\)’, where ‘\(p\)’ is filled in with a declarative sentence. For the propositionalist, in other words, instances of the equivalence schema are properly interpreted not as being about sentences but instead as being about propositions, i.e., as biconditionals like (2) rather than (1):

The proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true if, and only if, Brutus killed Caesar.

To make this explicit, we might say that, according to propositionalist deflationism, the equivalence schema is:

The proposition that \(p\) is true if, and only if, \(p\).

Interpreting the equivalence schema as (ES-sent) rather than as (ES-prop), or vice versa, thus yields different versions of deflationism, sententialist and propositionalist versions, respectively.

Another aspect that different readings of (ES) can vary across concerns the nature of the equivalence that its instances assert. On one view, the right-hand side and the left-hand side of such instances are synonymous or analytically equivalent. Thus, for sententialists who endorse this level of equivalence, (1) asserts that, “‘Brutus killed Caesar’ is true” means just what ‘Brutus killed Caesar’ means; while for propositionalists who endorse analytic equivalence, (2) asserts that ‘the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true’ means the same as ‘Brutus killed Caesar’. A second view is that the right-hand and left-hand sides of claims such as (1) and (2) are not synonymous but are nonetheless necessarily equivalent; this view maintains that the two sides of each equivalence stand or fall together in every possible world, despite having different meanings. And a third possible view is that claims such as (1) and (2) assert only a material equivalence; this view interprets the ‘if and only if’ in both (1) and (2) as simply the biconditional of classical logic.

This tripartite distinction between analytic, necessary, and material equivalence, when combined with the distinction between sententialism and propositionalism, yields six different possible (although not exhaustive) readings of the instances of (ES):

  Sentential Propositional
Analytic \(\mathbf{A}\) \(\mathbf{B}\)
Necessary \(\mathbf{C}\) \(\mathbf{D}\)
Material \(\mathbf{E}\) \(\mathbf{F}\)

While different versions of deflationism can be correlated to some extent with different positions in this chart, some chart positions have also been occupied by more than one version of deflationism. The labels ‘redundancy theory’, ‘disappearance theory’ and ‘no-truth theory’ have been used to apply to analytic versions of deflationism: positions \(\mathbf{A}\) or \(\mathbf{B}\). But there is a sense in which position \(\mathbf{A}\) is also occupied by versions of what is called “disquotationalism” (although the most prominent disquotationalists tend to be leary of the notions of analyticity or synonymy), and what is called “prosententialism” also posits an equivalence of what is said with the left- and right-hand sides of the instances of (ES). The latter version of deflationism, however, does this without making the left-hand sides about sentences named via quotation or about propositions understood as abstract entities. No deflationist has offered an account occupying position \(\mathbf{C}\), \(\mathbf{E}\), or \(\mathbf{F}\) (although the explicit inspiration some disquotationalists have found in Tarski’s work and his deployment of material equivalence might misleadingly suggest position \(\mathbf{E})\). Paul Horwich (1998a) uses the label ‘minimalism’ for a version of propositionalist deflationism that takes the instances of (ES-prop) to involve a necessary equivalence, thereby occupying position \(\mathbf{D}\). To a large extent, philosophers prefer one or another (or none) of the positions in the chart on the basis of their views from other parts of philosophy, typically their views about the philosophy of language and metaphysics.

1.2 The Property of Truth

The second theme we will discuss focuses on the fact that when we say, for example, that the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true, we seem to be attributing a property to that proposition, namely, the property of being true. Deflationists are typically wary of that claim, insisting either that there is no property of being true at all, or, if there is one, it is of a certain kind, often called “thin” or “insubstantial”.

The suggestion that there is no truth property at all is advanced by some philosophers in the deflationary camp; we will look at some examples below. What makes this position difficult to sustain is that ‘is true’ is grammatically speaking a predicate much like ‘is metal’. If one assumes that grammatical predicates such as ‘is metal’ express properties, then, prima facie, the same would seem to go for ‘is true.’ This point is not decisive, however. For one thing, it might be possible to distinguish the grammatical form of claims containing ‘is true’ from their logical form; at the level of logical form, it might be, as prosententialists maintain, that ‘is true’ is not a predicate. For another, nominalists about properties have developed ways of thinking about grammatical predicates according to which these expressions don’t express properties at all. A deflationist might appeal, perhaps selectively, to such proposals, in order to say that ‘is true’, while a predicate, does not express a property.

Whatever the ultimate fate of these attempts to say that there is no property of truth may be, a suggestion among certain deflationists has been to concede that there is a truth property but to deny it is a property of a certain kind; in particular to deny that it is (as we will say) a substantive property.

To illustrate the general idea, consider (3) and (4):

Caracas is the capital of Venezuela.
The earth revolves around the sun.

Do the propositions that these sentences express share a property of being true? Well, in one intuitive sense they do: Since they both are true, we might infer that they both have the property of being true. From this point of view, there is a truth property: It is simply the property that all true propositions have.

On the other hand, when we say that two things share a property of Fness, we often mean more than simply that they are both \(F\). We often mean that two things that are \(F\) have some underlying nature in common, for example, that there is a common explanation as to why they are both \(F\). It is in this second claim that deflationists have in mind when they say that truth is not a substantive property. Thus, in the case of our example, what, if anything, explains the truth of (3) is that Caracas is the capital of Venezuela, and what explains this is the political history of Venezuela. On the other hand, what, if anything, explains the truth of (4) is that the earth revolves around the sun, and what explains this is the physical nature of the solar system. The physical nature of the solar system, however, has nothing to do with the political history of Venezuela (or if it does, the connections are completely accidental!) and to that extent there is no shared explanation as to why (3) and (4) are both true. Therefore, in this substantive sense, they have no property in common.

It will help to bring out the contrast being invoked here if we consider two properties distinct from a supposed property of being true: the property of being a game and the property of being a mammal. Consider the games of chess and catch. Do both of these have the property of being a game? Well, in one sense, they do: they are both games that people can play. On the other hand, however, there is no common explanation as to why each counts as a game (cf. Wittgenstein 1953, §66). We might then say that being a game is not a substantive property and mean just this. But now compare the property of being a mammal. If two things are mammals, they have the property of being a mammal, but in addition there is some common explanation as to why they are both mammals – both are descended from the same family of creatures, say. According to one development of deflationism, the property of being true is more like the property of being a game than it is like the property of being a mammal.

The comparisons between being true, being a game, and being a mammal are suggestive, but they still do not nail down exactly what it means to say that truth is not a substantive property. The contemporary literature on deflationism contains several different approaches to the idea. One such approach, which we will consider in detail in Section 4.1, involves denying that truth plays an explanatory role. Another approach, pursuing an analogy between being true and existing, describes truth as a “logical property” (for example, Field 1992, 322; Horwich 1998a, 37; Künne 2003, 91). A further approach appeals to David Lewis’s (1983, 1986) view that, while every set of entities underwrites a property, there is a distinction between sparse, or natural, properties and more motley or disjointed abundant properties. On this approach, a deflationist might say that there is an abundant property of being true rather than a sparse one (cf. Edwards 2013, Asay 2014, Kukla and Winsberg 2015, and Armour-Garb forthcoming). A different metaphysical idea may be to appeal to the contemporary discussion of grounding and the distinction between groundable and ungroundable properties. In this context, a groundable property is one that is capable of being grounded in some other property, whether or not it is in fact grounded; an ungroundable property is a property that is not groundable (see Dasgupta 2015, 2016 and Rabin 2020). From this point of view, a deflationist might say that being true is an ungroundable property. Hence it is unlike ordinary, sparse/natural properties, such as being iron, which are both capable of being grounded and are grounded, and it is also unlike fundamental physical properties, such as being a lepton, which are capable of being grounded (in some other possible world) but are not (actually) grounded. We will not try to decide here which of these different views of properties is correct but simply note that deflationists who want to claim that there is a truth property, just not a substantive one, have options for explaining what this means.

1.3 The Utility of the Concept of Truth

In light of the two central ideas discussed so far – the idea that the equivalence schema is exhaustive of the notion of truth and the idea that there is no substantive truth property – you might wonder why we have a concept of truth in the first place. After all, contrast this question with the explanation of why we have the concept of mammals. A natural suggestion is that it allows us to think and talk about mammals and to develop theories of them. For deflationism, however, as we have just seen, being true is completely different from being a mammal; why then do we have a concept of truth? (An analogous question might be asked about the word ‘true’, i.e., why we have the word ‘true’ and related words in our language at all. In the following discussion we will not discriminate between questions about the concept of truth and questions about the word ‘true’ and will move back and forth between them.)

The question of why we have the concept of truth allows us to introduce a third central theme in deflationism, which is an emphasis not merely on the property of truth but on the concept of truth, or, equivalently for present purposes, on the word ‘true’ (cf. Leeds 1978). Far from supposing that there is no point having the concept of truth, deflationists are usually at pains to point out that anyone who has the concept of truth is in possession of a very useful concept indeed; in particular, anyone who has this concept is in a position to express generalizations that would otherwise require non-standard logical devices, such as sentential variables and quantifiers for them.

Suppose, for example, that Jones for whatever reason decides that Smith is an infallible guide to the nature of reality. We might then say that Jones believes everything that Smith says. To say this much, however, is not to capture the content of Jones’s belief. In order to do that we need some way of generalizing on the embedded sentence positions in a claim like:

If Smith says that birds are dinosaurs, then birds are dinosaurs.

To generalize on the relationship indicated in (5), beyond just what Smith says about birds to anything she might say, what we want to do is generalize on the embedded occurrences of ‘birds are dinosaurs’. So, we need a (declarative) sentential variable, ‘\(p\)’, and a universal quantifier governing it. What we want is a way of capturing something along the lines of

For all \(p\), if Smith says that \(p\), then \(p.\)

The problem is that we cannot formulate this in English with our most familiar way of generalizing because the ‘\(p\)’ in the consequent is in a sentence-in-use position, rather than mentioned or nominalized context (as it is in the antecedent), meaning that this formal variable cannot be replaced with a familiar English object-variable expression, e.g., ‘it’.

This is where the concept of truth comes in. What we do in order to generalize in the way under consideration is employ the truth predicate with an object variable to produce the sentence,

For all \(x\), if what Smith said \(= x\), then \(x\) is true.

Re-rendering the quasi-formal (7) into natural language yields,

Everything is such that, if it is what Smith said, then it is true.

Or, to put the same thing more colloquially:

Everything Smith says is true.

The equivalence schema (ES-prop) allows us to use (7) (and therefore (9)) to express what it would otherwise require the unstatable (6) to express. For, on the basis of the schema, there is always an equivalence between whatever goes in for a sentence-in-use occurrence of the variable ‘\(p\)’ and a context in which that filling of the sentential variable is nominalized. This reveals how the truth predicate can be used to provide a surrogate for sentential variables, simulating this non-standard logical device while still deploying the standard object variables already available in ordinary language (‘it’) and the usual object quantifiers (‘everything’) that govern them.

This is how the use of the truth predicate in (9) gives us the content of Jones’s belief. And the important point for deflationists is that we could not have stated the content of this belief unless we had the concept of truth (the expression ‘true’). In fact, for most deflationists, it is this feature of the concept of truth – its role in the formation of these sorts of generalizations – that explains why we have a concept of truth at all. This is, as it is often put, the raison d’être of the concept of truth (cf. Field 1994a and Horwich 1998a).

2. History of Deflationism

According to Michael Dummett (1959 [1978]), deflationism originates with Gottlob Frege, as expressed in this famous quote by the latter:

It is … worthy of notice that the sentence ‘I smell the scent of violets’ has just the same content as the sentence ‘It is true that I smell the scent of violets’. So it seems, then, that nothing is added to the thought by my ascribing to it the property of truth. (Frege 1918, 6)

This passage suggests that Frege embraces a deflationary view in position \(\mathbf{B}\) (in the chart above), namely, an analytic propositionalist version of deflationism. But this interpretation of his view is not so clear. As Scott Soames (1999, 21ff) points out, Frege (ibid.) distinguishes what we will call “opaque” truth ascriptions, like ‘My conjecture is true’, from transparent truth-ascriptions, like the one mentioned in the quote from Frege. Unlike with transparent cases, in opaque instances, one cannot simply strip ‘is true’ away and obtain an equivalent sentence, since the result is not even a sentence at all.

Frank Ramsey is the first philosopher to have suggested a position like \(\mathbf{B}\) (although he does not really accept propositions as abstract entities (see Ramsey 1927 (34–5) and 1929 (7)), despite sometimes talking in terms of propositions):

Truth and falsity are ascribed primarily to propositions. The proposition to which they are ascribed may be either explicitly given or described. Suppose first that it is explicitly given; then it is evident that ‘It is true that Caesar was murdered’ means no more than that Caesar was murdered, and ‘It is false that Caesar was murdered’ means no more than Caesar was not murdered. …. In the second case in which the proposition is described and not given explicitly we have perhaps more of a problem, for we get statements from which we cannot in ordinary language eliminate the words ‘true’ or ‘false’. Thus if I say ‘He is always right’, I mean that the propositions he asserts are always true, and there does not seem to be any way of expressing this without using the word ‘true’. But suppose we put it thus ‘For all \(p\), if he asserts \(p\), \(p\) is true’, then we see that the propositional function \(p\) is true is simply the same as \(p\), as e.g. its value ‘Caesar was murdered is true’ is the same as ‘Caesar was murdered’. (Ramsey 1927, 38–9)

On Ramsey’s redundancy theory (as it is often called), the truth operator, ‘it is true that’ adds no content when prefixed to a sentence, meaning that in the instances of what we can think of as the truth-operator version of (ES),

It is true that \(p\) iff \(p\),

the left- and right-hand sides are meaning-equivalent. But Ramsey extends his redundancy theory beyond just the transparent instances of truth-talk, maintaining that the truth predicate is, in principle, eliminable even in opaque ascriptions of the form ‘\(B\) is true’ (which he (1929, 15, n. 7) explains in terms of sentential variables via a formula along the lines of ‘\(\exists p\) (\(p \amp B\) is a belief that \(p\))’) and in explicitly quantificational instances, like ‘Everything Einstein said is true’ (explained as above). As the above quote illustrates, Ramsey recognizes that in truth ascriptions like these the truth predicate fills a grammatical need, which keeps us from eliminating it altogether, but he held that even in these cases it contributes no content to anything said using it.

A.J. Ayer endorses a view similar to Ramsey’s. The following quote shows that he embraces a meaning equivalence between the two sides of the instances of both the sentential (position \(\mathbf{A})\) and something like (since, despite his use of the expression ‘proposition’ to mean sentence, he also considers instances of truth-talk involving the prefix ‘it is true that’, which could be read as employing ‘that’-clauses) the propositional (position \(\mathbf{B})\) version of (ES).

[I]t is evident that a sentence of the form “\(p\) is true” or “it is true that \(p\)” the reference to truth never adds anything to the sense. If I say that it is true that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet, or that the proposition “Shakespeare wrote Hamlet” is true, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet. Similarly, if I say that it is false that Shakespeare wrote the Iliad, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare did not write the Iliad. And this shows that the words ‘true’ and ‘false’ are not used to stand for anything, but function in the sentence merely as assertion and negation signs. That is to say, truth and falsehood are not genuine concepts. Consequently, there can be no logical problem concerning the nature of truth. (Ayer 1935, 28. Cf. Ayer 1936 [1952, 89])

Ludwig Wittgenstein, under Ramsey’s influence, makes claims with strong affinities to deflationism in his later work. We can see a suggestion of an endorsement of deflationary positions \(\mathbf{A}\) or \(\mathbf{B}\) in his (1953, §136) statement that “\(p\) is true \(= p\)” and “\(p\) is false = not-\(p\)”, indicating that ascribing truth (or falsity) to a statement just amounts to asserting that very proposition (or its negation). Wittgenstein also expresses this kind of view in manuscripts from the 1930s, where he claims, “What he says is true = Things are as he says” and “[t]he word ‘true’ is used in contexts such as ‘What he says is true’, but that says the same thing as ‘He says \(\ldquo p\rdquo,\) and \(p\) is the case’”. (Wittgenstein 1934 [1974, 123]) and 1937 [2005, 61]), respectively)

Peter Strawson’s views on truth emerge most fully in his 1950 debate with J.L. Austin. In keeping with deflationary position \(\mathbf{B}\), Strawson (1950, 145–7) maintains that an utterance of ‘It is true that \(p\)’ just makes the same statement as an utterance of ‘\(p\)’. However, in Strawson 1949 and 1950, he further endorses a performative view, according to which an utterance of a sentence like ‘That is true’ mainly functions to do something beyond mere re-assertion. This represents a shift to an account of what the expression ‘true’ does, from traditional accounts of what truth is, or even accounts of what ‘true’ means.

Another figure briefly mentioned above who looms large in the development of deflationism is Alfred Tarski, with his (1935 [1956] and 1944) identification of a precise criterion of adequacy for any formal definition of truth: its implying all of the instances of what is sometimes called “Convention (T)” or “the (T)-schema”,

\(X\) is true if, and only if, \(p\).

To explain this schema a bit more precisely, in its instances the ‘\(X\)’ gets replaced by a name of a sentence from the object-language for which the truth predicate is being defined, and the ‘\(p\)’ gets replaced by a sentence that is a translation of that sentence into the meta-language in which the truth predicate is being defined. For Tarski, the ‘if and only if’ deployed in any instance of (T) expresses just a material equivalence, putting his view at position \(\mathbf{E}\) in the chart from Section 1.1. Although this means that Tarski is not a deflationist himself (cf. Field 1994a, Ketland 1999, and Patterson 2012), there is no denying the influence that his work and its promotion of the (T)-schema have had on deflationism. Indeed, some early deflationists, such as W.V.O. Quine and Stephen Leeds, are quite explicit about taking inspiration from Tarski’s work in developing their “disquotational” views, as is Horwich in his initial discussion of deflationism. Even critics of deflationism have linked it with Tarski: Hilary Putnam (1983b, 1985) identifies deflationists as theorists who “refer to the work of Alfred Tarski and to the semantical conception of truth” and who take Tarski’s work “as a solution to the philosophical problem of truth”.

The first fully developed deflationary view is the one that Quine (1970 [1986, 10–2]) presents. Given his skepticism about the existence of propositions, Quine takes sentences to be the primary entities to which ‘is true’ may be applied, making the instances of (ES-sent) the equivalences that he accepts. He defines a category of sentence that he dubs “eternal”, viz., sentence types that have all their indexical/contextual factors specified, the tokens of which always have the same truth-values. It is for these sentences that Quine offers his disquotational view. As he (ibid., 12) puts it,

This cancellatory force of the truth predicate is explicit in Tarski’s paradigm:

‘Snow is white’ is true if and only if snow is white.

Quotation marks make all the difference between talking about words and talking about snow. The quotation is a name of a sentence that contains the name, namely ‘snow’, of snow. By calling the sentence true, we call snow white. The truth predicate is a device of disquotation.

As this quote suggests, Quine sees Tarski’s formal work on defining truth predicates for formalized languages and his criterion of adequacy for doing so as underwriting a disquotational analysis of the truth predicate. This makes Quine’s view a different kind of position-\(\mathbf{A}\) account, since he takes the left-hand side of each instance of (ES-sent) to be, as we will put it (since Quine rejects the whole idea of meaning and meaning equivalence), something like a mere syntactic variant of the right-hand side. This also means that Quine’s version of deflationism departs from inflationism by rejecting the latter’s presupposition that truth predicates function to describe the entities they get applied to, the way that other predicates, such as ‘is metal’, do.

Quine also emphasizes the importance of the truth predicate’s role as a means for expressing the kinds of otherwise inexpressible generalizations discussed in Section 1.3. As he (1992, 80–1) explains it,

The truth predicate proves invaluable when we want to generalize along a dimension that cannot be swept out by a general term … The harder sort of generalization is illustrated by generalization on the clause ‘time flies’ in ‘If time flies then time flies’…. We could not generalize as in ‘All men are mortal’ because ‘time flies’ is not, like ‘Socrates’, a name of one of a range of objects (men) over which to generalize. We cleared this obstacle by semantic ascent: by ascending to a level where there were indeed objects over which to generalize, namely linguistic objects, sentences.

So, if we want to generalize on embedded sentence-positions within some sentences, “we ascend to talk of truth and sentences” (Quine 1970 [1986, 11]). This maneuver allows us to “affirm some infinite lot of sentences that we can demarcate only by talking about the sentences” (ibid., 12).

Leeds (1978) (following Quine) makes it clear how the truth predicate is crucial for extending the expressive power of a language, despite the triviality that disquotationalism suggests for the transparent instances of truth-talk. He (ibid., 121) emphasizes the logical role of the truth predicate in the expression of certain kinds of generalizations that would otherwise be inexpressible in natural language. Leeds, like Quine, notes that a central utility of the truth predicate, in virtue of its yielding every instance of (ES-sent), is the simulation of quantification into sentence-positions. But, unlike Quine, Leeds glosses this logical role in terms of expressing potentially infinite conjunctions (for universal generalization) or potentially infinite disjunctions (for existential generalization). The truth predicate allows us to use the ordinary devices of first-order logic in ways that provide surrogates for the non-standard logical devices this would otherwise require. Leeds is also clear about accepting the consequences of deflationism, that is, of taking the logically expressive role of the truth predicate to exhaust its function. In particular, he points out that there is no need to think that truth plays any sort of explanatory role. We will return to this point in Section 4.1.

Dorothy Grover, Joseph Camp, and Nuel Belnap (1975) develop a different variety of deflationism that they call a “prosentential theory”. This theory descends principally from Ramsey’s views. In fact, Ramsey (1929, 10) made what is probably the earliest use of the term ‘pro-sentence’ in his account of the purpose of truth-talk. Prosentences are explained as the sentence-level analog of pronouns. As in the case of pronouns, prosentences inherit their content anaphorically from other linguistic items, in this case from some sentence typically called the prosentence’s “anaphoric antecedent” (although it need not actually occur before the prosentence). As Grover, et al. develop this idea, this content inheritance can happen in two ways. The most basic one is called “lazy” anaphora. Here the prosentence could simply be replaced with a repetition of its antecedent, as in the sort of case that Strawson emphasized, where one says “That is true” after someone else has made an assertion. According to Grover, et al., this instance of truth-talk is a prosentence that inherits its content anaphorically from the other speaker’s utterance, so that the two speakers assert the same thing. As a result, Grover, et al. would take the instances of (ES) to express meaning equivalences, but since they (ibid., 113–5) do not take the instances of truth-talk on the left-hand sides of these equivalences to say anything about any named entities, they would not read (ES) as either (ES-sent) or (ES-prop) on their standard interpretations. So, while their prosententialism is similar to views in position \(\mathbf{A}\) or in position \(\mathbf{B}\) in the chart above, it is also somewhat different from both.

Grover, et al.’s project is to develop the theory “that ‘true’ can be thought of always as part of a prosentence” (ibid., 83). They explain that ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ are generally available prosentences that can go into any sentence-position. They consider these expressions to be “atomic” in the sense of not being susceptible to a subject-predicate analysis giving the ‘that’ or ‘it’ separate references (ibid., 91). Both of these prosentences can function in the “lazy” way, and Grover, et al. claim (ibid., 91–2, 114) that ‘it is true’ can also operate as a quantificational prosentence (i.e., a sentential variable), for example, in a re-rendering of a sentence like,

Everything Smith says is true.

in terms of a “long-form” equivalent claim, such as

Everything is such that, if Smith says that it is true, then it is true.

One immediate concern that this version of prosententialism faces pertains to what one might call the “paraphrastic gymnastics” that it requires. For example, a sentence like ‘It is true that humans are causing climate change’ is said to have for its underlying logical form the same form as ‘Humans are causing climate change. That is true’ (ibid., 94). As a result, when one utters an instance of truth-talk of the form ‘It is true that \(p\)’, one states the content of the sentence that goes in for ‘\(p\)’ twice. In cases of quotation, like “‘Birds are dinosaurs’ is true”, Grover, et al. offer the following rendering, ‘Consider: Birds are dinosaurs. That is true’ (ibid., 103). But taking this as the underlying form of quotational instance of truth-talk requires rejecting the standard view that putting quotation marks around linguistic items forms names of those items. These issues raise concerns regarding the adequacy of this version of prosententialism.

3. The Varieties of Contemporary Deflationism

In this section, we explain the details of three prominent, contemporary accounts and indicate some concerns peculiar to each.

3.1 Minimalism

Minimalism is the version of deflationism that diverges the least from inflationism because it accepts many of the standard inflationary presuppositions, including that ‘is true’ is a predicate used to describe entities as having (or lacking) a truth property. What makes minimalism a version of deflationism is its denial of inflationism’s final assumption, namely, that the property expressed by the truth predicate has a substantive nature. Drawing inspiration from Leeds (1978), Horwich (1982, 182) actually coins the term ‘deflationism’ while describing “the deflationary redundancy theory which denies the existence of surplus meaning and contends that Tarski’s schema [”\(p\)“ is true iff \(p\)] is quite sufficient to capture the concept.” Minimalism, Horwich’s mature deflationary position (1998a [First Edition, 1990]), adds to this earlier view. In particular, Horwich (ibid., 37, 125, 142) comes to embrace the idea that ‘is true’ does express a property, but it is merely a “logical property” (cf. Field 1992), rather than any substantive or naturalistic property of truth with an analyzable underlying nature (Horwich 1998a, 2, 38, 120–1).

On the basis of natural language considerations, Horwich (ibid., 2–3, 39–40) holds that propositions are what the alethic locutions describe directly. Any other entities that we can properly call true are so only derivatively, on the basis of having some relation to true propositions (ibid., 100–1 and Horwich 1998b, 82–5). This seems to position Horwich well with respect to explaining the instances of truth-talk that cause problems for Quine and Leeds, e.g., those about beliefs and theories. Regarding truth applied directly to propositions, however, Horwich (1998a, 2–3) still explicitly endorses the thesis that Leeds emphasizes about the utility of the truth predicate (and, Horwich adds, the concept it expresses), namely, that it “exists solely for the sake of a certain logical need”. While Horwich (ibid., 138–9) goes so far as to claim that the concept of truth has a “non-descriptive” function, he does not follow Quine and Leeds all the way to their rejection of the assumption that the alethic predicates function to describe truth-bearers. Rather, his (ibid., 31–3, 37) point of agreement with them is that the main function of the truth predicate is its role in providing a means for generalizing on embedded sentence positions, rather than some role in the indication of specifically truth-involving states of affairs. Even so, Horwich (ibid., 38–40) still contends that the instances of truth-talk do describe propositions, in the sense that they make statements about them, and they do so by attributing a property to those propositions.

The version of (ES) that Horwich (1998a, 6) makes the basis of his theory is what he also calls “the equivalence schema”,

It is true that \(p\) if and only if \(p\).

Since he takes truth-talk to involve describing propositions with a predicate, Horwich considers ‘it is true that \(p\)’ to be just a trivial variant of ‘The proposition that \(p\) is true’, meaning that his (E) is a version of (ES-prop) rather than of Ramsey’s (ES-op). He also employs the notation ‘\(\langle p\rangle\)’ as shorthand specifically for ‘the proposition that \(p\)’, generating a further rendering of his equivalence schema (ibid., 10) that we can clearly recognize as a version of (ES-prop), namely

\(\langle p\rangle\) is true iff \(p\).

Horwich considers the instances of (E) to constitute the axioms of both an account of the property of truth and an account of the concept of truth, i.e., what is meant by the word ‘true’ (ibid., 136). According to minimalism, the instances of (E) are explanatorily fundamental, which Horwich suggests is a reason for taking them to be necessary (ibid., 21, n. 4). This, combined with his view that the equivalence schema applies to propositions, places his minimalism in position \(\mathbf{D}\) in the chart given in Section 1.1. The instances of (ES-prop) are thus explanatory of the functioning of the truth predicate (of its role as a de-nominalizer of ‘that’-clauses (ibid., 5)), rather than being explained by that functioning (as the analogous equivalences are for both disquotationalism and prosententialism). Moreover, Horwich (ibid., 50, 138) claims that they are also conceptually basic and a priori. He (ibid., 27–30, 33, 112) denies that truth admits of any sort of explicit definition or reductive analysis in terms of other concepts, such as reference or predicate-satisfaction. In fact, Horwich (ibid., 10–1, 111–2, 115–6) holds that these other semantic notions should both be given their own, infinitely axiomatized, minimalist accounts, which would then clarify the non-reductive nature of the intuitive connections between them and the notion of truth.

Horwich (ibid., 27–30) maintains that the infinite axiomatic nature of minimalism is unavoidable. He (ibid., 25) rejects the possibility of a finite formulation of minimalism via the use of substitutional quantification. On the usual understanding of this non-standard type of quantification, the quantifiers govern variables that serve to mark places in linguistic strings, indicating that either all or some of the elements of an associated substitution class of linguistic items of a particular category can be substituted in for the variables. Since it is possible for the variables so governed to take sentences as their substitution items, this allows for a type of quantification governing sentence positions in complex sentences. Using this sort of sentential substitutional quantification, the thought is, one can formulate a finite general principle that expresses Horwich’s account of truth as follows:

\(\forall x\, (x\) is true iff \(\Sigma p (x = \langle p\rangle \amp p)),\)

where ‘\(\Sigma\)’ is the existential substitutional quantifier. (GT) is formally equivalent to the formulation that Marian David (1994, 100) presents as disquotationalism’s definition of ‘true sentence’, here formulated for propositions instead. Horwich’s main reason for rejecting the proposed finite formulation of minimalism, (GT), is that an account of substitutional quantifiers seems (contra David 1994, 98–9) to require an appeal to truth (since the quantifiers are explained as expressing that at least one or that every item in the associated substitution class yields a true sentence when substituted in for the governed variables), generating circularity concerns (Horwich 1998a, 25–6).

Moreover, on Horwich’s (ibid., 4, n. 1; Cf. 25, 32–3) understanding, the point of the truth predicate is to provide a surrogate for substitutional quantification and sentence-variables in natural language, so as “to achieve the effect of generalizing substitutionally over sentences … but by means of ordinary [quantifiers and] variables (i.e., pronouns), which range over objects” (italics original). Horwich maintains that the infinite “list-like” nature of minimalism poses no problem for the view’s adequacy with respect to explaining all of our uses of the truth predicate, and the bulk of Horwich 1998a attempts to establish just that. However, Anil Gupta (1993a, 365) has pointed out that minimalism’s infinite axiomatization in terms of the instances of (E) for every (non-paradox-inducing) proposition makes it maximally ideologically complex, in virtue of involving every other concept. (Moreover, the overtly “fragmented” nature of the theory also makes it particularly vulnerable to the Generalization Problem that Gupta has raised, which we discuss in Section 4.5, below.)

Christopher Hill (2002) attempts to deal with some of the problems that Horwich’s view faces, by presenting a view that he takes to be a newer version of minimalism, replacing Horwich’s equivalence schema with a universally quantified formula, employing a kind of substitutional quantification to provide a finite definition of ‘true thought (proposition)’. Hill’s (ibid., 22) formulation of his account,

For any object \(x\), \(x\) is true if and only if \((\Sigma p)((x =\) the thought that \(p)\) and \(p)\),

is formally similar to the formulation of minimalism in terms of (GT) that Horwich rejects, but to avoid the circularity concerns driving that rejection, Hill’s (ibid., 18–22) idea is to offer introduction and elimination rules in the style of Gerhard Gentzen (1935 [1969]) as a means for defining the substitutional quantifiers. Horwich (1998a, 26) rejects even this inference-rule sort of approach, but he directs his critique against defining linguistic substitutional quantification this way. Hill takes his substitutional quantifiers to apply to thoughts (propositions) instead of sentences. But serious concerns have been raised regarding the coherence of this non-linguistic notion of substitutional quantification (cf. David 2006, Gupta 2006b, Simmons 2006). As a result, it is unclear that Hill’s account is an improvement on Horwich’s version of minimalism.

3.2 Disquotationalism

Like minimalism, disquotationalism agrees with inflationary accounts of truth that the alethic locutions function as predicates, at least logically speaking. However, as we explained in discussing Quine’s view in Section 2, disquotationalism diverges from inflationary views (and minimalism) at their shared assumption that these (alethic) predicates serve to describe the entities picked out by the expressions with which they are combined, specifically as having or lacking a certain property.

Although Quine’s disquotationalism is inspired by Tarski’s recursive method for defining a truth predicate, that method is not what Quine’s view emphasizes. Field’s contemporary disquotationism further departs from that aspect of Tarski’s work by looking directly to the instances of the (T)-schema that the recursive method must generate in order to satisfy Tarski’s criterion of material adequacy. Tarski himself (1944, 344–5) suggests at one point that each instance of (T) could be considered a “partial definition” of truth and considers (but ultimately rejects; see Section 4.5) the thesis that a logical conjunction of all of these partial definitions amounts to a general definition of truth (for the language that the sentences belonged to). Generalizing slightly from Tarski, we can call this alternative approach “(T)-schema disquotationalism”, in contrast with the Tarski-inspired approach that David (1994, 110–1) calls “recursive disquotationalism”. Field (1987, 1994a) develops a version of (T)-schema disquotationalism that he calls “pure disquotational truth”, focusing specifically on the instances of his preferred version of (ES), the “disquotational schema” (Field 1994a, 258),

“\(p\)” is true if and only if \(p\).

Similar to the “single principle” formulation, (GT), rejected by Horwich (but endorsed by Hill), Field (ibid., 267) allows that one could take a “generalized” version of (T/ES-sent), prefixed with a universal substitutional quantifier, ‘\(\Pi\)’, as having axiomatic status, or one could incorporate schematic sentence variables directly into one’s theorizing language and reason directly with (T/ES-sent) as a schema (cf. ibid., 259). Either way, in setting out his version of deflationism, Field (ibid., 250), in contrast with Horwich, does not take the instances of his version of (ES) as fundamental but instead as following from the functioning of the truth predicate. On Field’s reading of (T/ES-sent), the use of the truth predicate on the left-hand side of an instance does not add any cognitive content beyond that which the mentioned utterance has (for the speaker) on its own when used (as on the right-hand-side of (T/ES-sent)). As a result, each instance of (T/ES-sent) “holds of conceptual necessity, that is, by virtue of the cognitive equivalence of the left and right hand sides” (ibid., 258). This places Field’s deflationism also in position \(\mathbf{A}\) in the chart from Section 1.1.

Following Leeds and Quine, Field (1999, 533–4) sees the central utility of a purely disquotational truth predicate to be providing for the expression of certain “fertile generalizations” that cannot be made without using the truth predicate but which do not really involve the notion of truth. Field (1994a, 264) notes that the truth predicate plays “an important logical role: it allows us to formulate certain infinite conjunctions and disjunctions that can’t be formulated otherwise [n. 17: at least in a language that does not contain substitutional quantifiers]”.

Field’s disquotationalism addresses some of the worries that arose for earlier versions of this variety of deflationism, due to their connections with Tarski’s method of defining truth predicates. It also explains how to apply a disquotational truth predicate to ambiguous and indexical utterances, thereby going beyond Quine’s (1970 [1986]) insistence on taking eternal sentences as the subjects of the instances of (ES-sent) (cf. Field 1994a, 278–81). So, Field’s view addresses some of the concerns that David (1994, 130–66) raises for disquotationalism. However, an abiding concern about this variety of deflationism is that it is an account of truth as applied specifically to sentences. This opens the door to a version of the complaint that Strawson (1950) makes against Austin’s account of truth, that it is not one’s act of stating [here: the sentence one utters] but what thereby gets stated that is the target of a truth ascription. William Alston (1996, 14) makes a similar point. While disquotationalists do not worry much about this, this scope restriction might strike others as problematic because it raises questions about how we are to understand truth applied to beliefs or judgments, something that Hill (2002) worries about. Field (1978) treats beliefs as mental states relating thinkers to sentences (of a language of thought). But David (1994, 172–7) raises worries for applying disquotationalism to beliefs, even in the context of an account like Field’s. The view that we believe sentences remains highly controversial, but it is one that, it seems, a Field-style disquotationalist must endorse. Similarly, such disquotationalists must take scientific theories to consist of sets of sentences, in order for truth to be applicable to them. This too runs up against Strawson’s complaint because it suggests that one could not state the same theory in a different language. These sorts of concerns continue to press for disquotationalists.

3.3 Prosententialism

As emerges from the discussion of Grover, et al. (1975) in Section 2, prosententialism is the form of deflationism that contrasts the most with inflationism, rejecting even the latter’s initial assumption that the alethic locutions function as predicates. Partly in response to the difficulties confronting Grover, et al.’s prosentential account, Robert Brandom (1988 and 1994) has developed a variation on their view with an important modification. In place of taking the underlying logic of ‘true’ as having this expression occur only as a non-separable component of the semantically atomic prosentential expressions, ‘that is true’ and ‘it is true’, Brandom treats ‘is true’ as a separable prosentence-forming operator. “It applies to a term that is a sentence nominalization or that refers to or picks out a sentence tokening. It yields a prosentence that has that tokening as its anaphoric antecedent” (Brandom 1994, 305). In this way, Brandom’s account avoids most of the paraphrase concerns that Grover, et al.’s prosententialism faces, while still maintaining prosententialism’s rejection of the contention that the alethic locutions function predicatively. As a consequence of his operator approach, Brandom gives quantificational uses of prosentences a slightly different analysis. He (re)expands instances of truth-talk like the following,

Everything Smith says is true.
Something Jones said is true.

“back” into longer forms, such as

For anything one can say, if Smith says it, then it is true.
For something one can say, Jones said it, and it is true.

and explains only the second ‘it’ as involved in a prosentence. The first ‘it’ in (8*) and (11) still functions as a pronoun, anaphorically linked to a set of noun phrases (sentence nominalizations) supplying objects (sentence tokenings) as a domain being quantified over with standard (as opposed to sentential or “propositional”) quantifiers (ibid., 302).

Brandom presents a highly flexible view that takes ‘is true’ as a general “denominalizing” device that applies to singular terms formed from the nominalization of sentences broadly, not just to pronouns that indicate them. A sentence like ‘It is true that humans are causing climate change’, considered via a re-rendering as ‘That humans are causing climate change is true’, is already a prosentence on his view, as is a quote-name case like “‘Birds are dinosaurs’ is true”, and an opaque instance of truth-talk like ‘Goldbach’s Conjecture is true’. In this way, Brandom offers a univocal and broader prosentential account, according to which, “[i]n each use, a prosentence will have an anaphoric antecedent that determines a class of admissible substituends for the prosentence (in the lazy case, a singleton). This class of substituends determines the significance of the prosentence associated with it” (ibid.). As a result, Brandom can accept both (ES-sent) and (ES-prop) – the latter understood as involving no commitment to propositions as entities – on readings closer to their standard interpretations, taking the instances of both to express meaning equivalences. Brandom’s account thus seems to be located in both position \(\mathbf{A}\) and position \(\mathbf{B}\) in the chart from Section 1.1, although, as with any prosententialist view, it still denies that the instances of (ES) say anything about either sentences or propositions.

Despite its greater flexibility, however, Brandom’s account still faces the central worry confronting prosentential views, namely that truth-talk really does seem predicative, and not just in its surface grammatical form but in our inferential practices with it as well. In arguing for the superiority of his view over that of Grover, et al., Brandom states that “[t]he account of truth talk should bear the weight of … divergence of logical from grammatical form only if no similarly adequate account can be constructed that lacks this feature” (ibid., 304). One might find it plausible to extend this principle beyond grammatical form, to behavior in inferences as well. This is an abiding concern for attempts to resist inflationism by rejecting its initial assumption, namely, that the alethic locutions function as predicates.

4. Objections to Deflationism

In the remainder of this article, we consider a number of objections to deflationism. These are by no means the only objections that have been advanced against the approach, but they seem to be particularly obvious and important ones.

4.1 The Explanatory Role of Truth

The first objection starts from the observation that (a) in certain contexts an appeal to the notion of truth appears to have an explanatory role and (b) deflationism seems to be inconsistent with that appearance. Some of the contexts in which truth seems to have an explanatory role involve philosophical projects, such as the theory of meaning (which we will consider below) or explaining the nature of knowledge. In these cases, the notion of explanation at issue is not so much causal as it is conceptual (see Armour-Garb and Woodbridge forthcoming, for more on this). But the notion of truth seems also sometimes to play a causal explanatory role, especially with regard to explaining various kinds of success – mainly the success of scientific theories/method (cf. Putnam 1978 and Boyd 1983) and of people’s behavior (cf. Putnam 1978 and Field 1987), but also the kind of success involved in learning from others (Field 1972). The causal-explanatory role that the notion of truth appears to play in accounts of these various kinds of success has seemed to many philosophers to constitute a major problem for deflationism. For example, Putnam (1978, 20–1, 38) claims, “the notions of ‘truth’ and ‘reference’ have a causal-explanatory role in … an explanation of the behavior of scientists and the success of science”, and “the notion of truth can be used in causal explanations – the success of a man’s behavior may, after all, depend on the fact that certain of his beliefs are true – and the formal logic of ‘true’ [the feature emphasized by deflationism] is not all there is to the notion of truth”.

While a few early arguments against deflationism focus on the role of truth in explanations of the success of science (see Williams 1986 and Fine 1984a, 1984b for deflationary responses to Putnam and Boyd on this), according to Field (1994a, 271), “the most serious worry about deflationism is that it can’t make sense of the explanatory role of truth conditions: e.g., their role in explaining behavior, or their role in explaining the extent to which behavior is successful”. While few theorists endorse the thesis that explanations of behavior in general need to appeal to the notion of truth (even a pre-deflationary Field (1987, 84–5) rejects this, but see Devitt 1997, 325–330, for an opposing position), explanations of the latter, i.e., of behavioral success, still typically proceed in terms of an appeal to truth. This poses a prima facie challenge to deflationary views. To illustrate the problem, consider the role of the truth-value of an individual’s belief in whether that person succeeds in satisfying her desires. Let us suppose that Mary wants to get to a party, and she believes that it is being held at 1001 Northside Avenue. If her belief is true, then, other things being equal, she is likely to get to the party and get what she wants. But suppose that her belief is false, and the party is in fact being held at 1001 Southside Avenue. Then it would be more likely, other things being equal, that she won’t get what she wants. In an example of this sort, the truth of her belief seems to be playing a particular role in explaining why she gets what she wants.

Assuming that Mary’s belief is true, and she gets to the party, it might seem natural to say that the latter success occurs because her belief is true, which might seem to pose a problem for deflationists. However, truth-involving explanations of particular instances of success like this don’t really pose a genuine problem. This is because if we are told the specific content of the relevant belief, it is possible to replace the apparently explanatory claim that the belief is true with an equivalent claim that does not appeal to truth. In Mary’s particular case, we could replace i) the claim that she believes that the party is being held at 1001 Northside Avenue, and her belief is true, with ii) the claim that she believes that the party is being held at 1001 Northside Avenue, and the party \(is\) being held at 1001 Northside Avenue. A deflationist can claim that the appeal to truth in the explanation of Mary’s success just provides an expressive convenience (including, perhaps, the convenience of expressing what would otherwise require an infinite disjunction (of conjunctions like ii)), by saying just that what Mary believed was true, if one did not know exactly which belief Mary acted on) (cf. Horwich 1998a, 22–3, 44–6).

While deflationists seem to be able to account for appeals to truth in explanations of particular instances of success, the explanatory-role challenge to deflationism also cites the explanatory role that an appeal to truth appears to play in explaining the phenomenon of behavioral success more generally. An explanation of this sort might take the following form:

People act (in general) in such a way that their goals will be obtained (as well as possible in the given situation), or in such a way that their expectations will not be frustrated, … if their beliefs are true.
Many beliefs [people have about how to attain their goals] are true.
So, as a consequence of [1] and [2], people have a tendency to attain certain kinds of goals. (Putnam 1978, 101)

The generality of [1] in this explanation seems to cover more cases than any definite list of actual beliefs that someone has could include. Moreover, the fact that [1] supports counterfactuals by applying to whatever one might possibly believe (about attaining goals) suggests that it is a law-like generalization. If the truth predicate played a fundamental role in the expression of an explanatory law, then deflationism would seem to be unsustainable.

A standard deflationary response to this line of reasoning involves rejecting the thesis that [1] is a law, seeing it (and truth-involving claims like it) instead as functioning similarly to how the claim ‘What Mary believes is true’ functions in an explanation of her particular instance of behavioral success, just expressing an even more indefinite, and thus potentially infinite claim. The latter is what makes a claim like [1] seem like an explanatory law, but even considering this indefiniteness, the standard deflationary account of [1] claims that the function of the appeal to the notion of truth there is still just to express a kind of generalization. One way to bring out this response is to note that, similar to the deflationary “infinite disjunction” account of the claim ‘What Mary believes is true’, generalizations of the kind offered in [1] entail infinite conjunctions of their instances, which are claims that can be formulated without appeal to truth. For example, in the case of explaining someone, \(A\), accomplishing their goal of getting to a party, deflationsts typically claim that the role of citing possession of a true belief is really just to express an infinite conjunction with something like the following form:

If \(A\) believes that the party is 1001 Northside Avenue, and the party is at 1001 Northside Avenue, then \(A\) will get what they want; and if \(A\) believes that the party is at 1001 Southside Avenue, and the party is at 1001 Southside Ave, then \(A\) will get what they want; and if \(A\) believes that party is at 17 Elm St, and the party is at 17 Elm St, then \(A\) will get what they want; … and so on.

The equivalence schema (ES) allows one to capture this infinite conjunction (of conditionals) in a finite way. For, on the basis of the schema, one can reformulate the infinite conjunction as:

If \(A\) believes that the party is 1001 Northside Avenue, and that the party is 1001 Northside Avenue is true, then \(A\) will get what they want; and if \(A\) believes that the party is at 1001 Southside Avenue, and that the party is at 1001 Southside Avenue is true, then \(A\) will get what they want, and if \(A\) believes that the party is at 17 Elm Street, and that the party is at 17 Elm Street is true, then \(A\) will get what they want; … and so on.

In turn, this (ES)-reformulated infinite conjunction can be expressed as a finite statement with a universal quantifier ranging over propositions:

For every proposition \(x\), if what \(A\) believes \(= x\), and \(x\) is true, then \(A\) will get what they want, other things being equal.

The important point for a deflationist is that one could not express the infinite conjunction regarding the agent’s beliefs and behavioral success unless one had the concept of truth. But deflationists also claim that this is all that the notion of truth is doing here and in similar explanations (cf. Leeds 1978, 1995; Williams 1986, Horwich 1998a).

How successful is this standard deflationary response? There are several critiques in the literature. Some (e.g., Damnjanovic 2005) argue that there is no distinction in the first place between appearing in a causal-explanatory generalization and being a causal-explanatory property. After all, suppose it is a true generalization that metal objects conduct electricity. That would normally be taken as sufficient to show that being metal is a causal-explanatory property that one can cite in explaining why something conducts electricity. But isn’t this a counter, then, to deflationism’s thesis that, assuming there is a property of truth at all, it is at most an insubstantial one? If a property is a causal or explanatory property, after all, it is hard to view it as insubstantial.

The reasoning at issue here may be presented conveniently by expanding on the general argument considered above and proceeding from an apparently true causal generalization to the falsity of deflationism (ibid.):

If a person \(A\) has true beliefs, they will get what they want, other things being equal.
Therefore, if \(A\) has beliefs with the property of being true, \(A\) will get what they want other things being equal.
Therefore, the property of being true appears in a causal-explanatory generalization.
Therefore, the property of being true is a causal-explanatory property.
Therefore, deflationism is false.

Can a deflationist apply the standard deflationary response to this argument? Doing so would seem to involve rejecting the inference from C2 to C3. After all, the standard reply would say that the role that the appeal to truth plays in P1, the apparent causal generalization, is simply its generalizing role of expressing a potentially infinite, disjointed conjunction of unrelated causal connections (cf. Leeds 1995). So, applying this deflationary response basically hinges on the plausibility of rejecting the initial assumption that there is no distinction between appearing in a causal-explanatory generalization and being a causal-explanatory property.

It is worth noting two other responses beyond the standard one that a deflationist might make to the reasoning just set out. The first option is to deny the step from P1 to C1. This inference involves the explicit introduction of the property of being true, and, as we have seen, some deflationists deny that there is a truth property at all (cf. Quine 1970 [1986], Grover, et al. 1975, Leeds 1978, Brandom 1994). But, as we noted above, the idea that there is no truth property may be difficult to sustain given the apparent fact that ‘is true’ functions grammatically as a predicate.

The second option is to deny the final step from C3 to C4 and concede that there is a sense in which truth is a causal-explanatory property and yet say that it is still not a substantive property (cf. Damnjanovic 2005). For example, some philosophers (e.g., Friedman 1974, van Fraassen 1980, Kitcher 1989, Jackson and Pettit 1990) have offered different understandings of scientific explanation and causal explanation, according to which being a causal and explanatory property might not conflict with being insubstantial (perhaps by being an abundant or ungroundable property). This might be enough to sustain a deflationary position.

The standard deflationary response to the explanatory-role challenge has also met with criticisms focused on providing explanations of certain “higher-level” phenomena. Philip Kitcher (2002, 355–60) concludes that Horwich’s (1998a, 22–3) application of the standard response, in his account of how the notion of truth functions in explanations of behavioral success, misses the more systematic role that truth plays in explaining patterns of successful behavior, such as when mean-ends beliefs flow from a representational device, like a map. Chase Wrenn (2011) agrees with Kitcher that deflationists need to explain systematic as opposed to just singular success, but against Kitcher he argues that deflationists are actually better off than inflationists on this front. Will Gamester (2018, 1252–5) raises a different “higher-level factor” challenge, one based on the putative inability of the standard deflationary account of the role of truth in explanations of behavioral success to distinguish between coincidental and non-coincidental success. Gamester (ibid., 1256–7) claims that an inflationist could mark and account for the difference between the two kinds of success with an explanation that appeals to the notion of truth. But it is not clear that a deflationist cannot also avail herself of a version of this truth-involving explanation, taking it just as the way of expressing in natural language what one might formally express with sentential variables and quantifiers (cf. Ramsey 1927, 1929; Prior 1971, Wrenn 2021, and Armour-Garb and Woodbridge forthcoming).

4.2 Propositions Versus Sentences

We noted earlier that deflationism can be presented in either a sententialist version or a propositionalist version. Some philosophers have suggested, however, that the choice between these two versions constitutes a dilemma for deflationism (Jackson, Oppy, and Smith 1994). The objection is that if deflationism is construed in accordance with propositionalism, then it is trivial, but if it is construed in accordance with sententialism, it is false. To illustrate the dilemma, consider the following claim:

Snow is white is true if and only if snow is white.

Now, does ‘snow is white’ in (12) refer to a sentence or a proposition? If, on the one hand, we take (12) to be about a sentence, then, assuming (12) can be interpreted as making a necessary claim, it is false. On the face of it, after all, it takes a lot more than snow’s being white for it to be the case that ‘snow is white’ is true. In order for ‘snow is white’ to be true, it must be the case not only that snow is white, it must, in addition, be the case that ‘snow is white’ means that snow is white. But this is a fact about language that (12) ignores. On the other hand, suppose we take ‘snow is white’ in (12) to denote the proposition that snow is white. Then the approach looks to be trivial, since the proposition that snow is white is defined as being the one that is true just in case snow is white. Thus, deflationism faces the dilemma of being false or trivial.

One response for the deflationist is to remain with the propositionalist version of their doctrine and accept its triviality. A trivial doctrine, after all, at least has the advantage of being true.

A second response is to resist the suggestion that propositionist deflationism is trivial. For one thing, the triviality here does not have its source in the concept of truth, but rather in the concept of a proposition. Moreover, even if we agree that the proposition that snow is white is defined as the one that is true if and only if snow is white, this still leaves open whether truth is a substantive property of that proposition; as such it leaves open whether deflationism or inflationism is correct.

A third response to this dilemma is to accept that deflationism applies inter alia to sentences, but to argue (following Field 1994a) that the sentences to which it applies must be interpreted sentences, i.e., sentences which already have meaning attached to them. While it takes more than snow being white to make the sentence ‘snow is white’ true, when we think of it as divorced from its meaning, that is not so clear when we treat it as having the meaning it in fact has.

4.3 Correspondence

It is often said to be a platitude that true statements correspond to the facts. The so-called “correspondence theory of truth” is built around this intuition and tries to explain the notion of truth by appealing to the notions of correspondence and fact. But even if one does not build one’s approach to truth around this intuition, many philosophers regard it as a condition of adequacy on any approach that it accommodate this correspondence intuition.

It is often claimed, however, that deflationism has trouble meeting this adequacy condition. One way to bring out the problem here is by focusing on a particular articulation of the correspondence intuition, one favored by deflationists themselves (e.g., Horwich 1998a). According to this way of spelling it out, the intuition that a certain sentence or proposition “corresponds to the facts” is the intuition that the sentence or proposition is true because of how the world is; that is, the truth of the proposition is explained by some fact, which is usually external to the proposition itself. We might express this by saying that someone who endorses the correspondence intuition so understood would endorse:

The proposition that snow is white is true because snow is white.

The problem with (6) is that, when we combine it with deflationism – or at least with a necessary version of that approach – we can derive something that is plainly false. Anyone who assumes that the instances of the equivalence schema are necessary would clearly be committed to the necessary truth of:

The proposition that snow is white is true iff snow is white.

And, since (7) is a necessary truth, under that assumption, it is very plausible to suppose that (6) and (7) together entail:

Snow is white because snow is white.

But (8) is clearly false. The reason is that the ‘because’ in (6) and (8) is a causal or explanatory relation, and plausibly such relations must obtain between distinct relata. But the relata in (8) are (obviously) not distinct. Hence, (8) is false, and this means that the conjunction of (6) and (7) must be false, and that deflationism is inconsistent with the correspondence intuition. To borrow a phrase of Mark Johnston’s (1989) – who mounts a similar argument in a different context – we might say that if deflationism is true, then what seems to be a perfectly good explanation in (6) goes missing; if deflationism is true, after all, then (6) is equivalent to (8), and (8) is not an explanation of anything.

One way a deflationist might attempt to respond to this objection is by providing a different articulation of the correspondence intuition. For example, one might point out that the connection between the proposition that snow is white being true and snow’s being white is not a contingent connection and suggest that this rules out (6) as a successful articulation of the correspondence intuition. That intuition (one might continue) is more plausibly given voice by

‘Snow is white’ is true because snow is white.

However, when (6*) is conjoined with (7), one cannot derive the problematic (8), and thus, one might think, the objection from correspondence might be avoided. Now, certainly this is a possible suggestion; the problem with it, however, is that a deflationist who thinks that (6*) is true is most plausibly construed as holding a sententialist, rather than a propositionalist, version of deflationism. A sententialist version of deflationism will supply a version of (7), viz.:

‘Snow is white’ is true iff snow is white.

which, at least if it is interpreted as a necessary (or analytic) truth, will conspire with (6*) to yield (8). And we are back where we started.

Another response would be to object that ‘because’ creates an opaque context – that is, the kind of context within which one cannot substitute co-referring expressions and preserve truth. However, for this to work, ‘because’ must create an opaque context of the right kind. In general, we can distinguish two kinds of opaque context: intensional contexts, which allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions but not contingently co-referring expressions; and hyperintensional contexts, which do not even allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions. If the inference from (6) and (7) to (8) is to be successfully blocked, it is necessary that ‘because’ creates a hyperintensional context. A proponent of the correspondence objection might try to argue that while ‘because’ creates an intensional context, it does not create a hyperintensional context. But since a hyperintensional reading of ‘because’ has become standard fare, this approach remains open to a deflationist and is not an ad hoc fix.

A final, and most radical, response would be to reject the correspondence intuition outright. This response is not as drastic as it sounds. In particular, deflationists do not have to say that someone who says ‘the proposition that snow is white corresponds to the facts’ is speaking falsely. Deflationists might do better by saying that such a person is simply using a picturesque or ornate way of saying that the proposition is true, where truth is understood in accordance with deflationism. Indeed, a deflationist can even agree that, for certain rhetorical or conversational purposes, it might be more effective to use talk of “correspondence to the facts”. Nevertheless, it is important to see that this response does involve a burden, since it involves rejecting a condition of adequacy that many regard as binding.

4.4 Truth-Value Gaps

According to some metaethicists (moral non-cognitivists or expressivists), moral claims – such as the injunction that one ought to return people’s phone calls – are neither true nor false. The same situation holds, according to some philosophers of language, for claims that presuppose the existence of something which does not in fact exist, such as the claim that the present King of France is bald; for sentences that are vague, such as ‘These grains of sand constitute a heap’; and for sentences that are paradoxical, such as those that arise in connection with the Liar Paradox. Let us call this thesis the gap, since it finds a gap in the class of sentences between those that are true and those that are false.

The deflationary approach to truth has seemed to be inconsistent with the gap, and this has been thought by some (e.g., Dummett 1959 [1978, 4] and Holton 2000) to be an objection. The reason for the apparent inconsistency flows from a natural way to extend the deflationary approach from truth to falsity. The most natural thing for a deflationist to do is to introduce a falsity schema like:

‘\(p\)’ is false iff \({\sim}p.\)

Following Holton (1993, 2000), we consider (F-sent) to be the relevant schema for falsity, rather than some propositional schema, since the standard understanding of a gappy sentence is as one that does not express a proposition (cf. Jackson, et al. 1994).

With a schema like (F-sent) in hand, deflationists could say things about falsity similar to what they say about truth: (F-sent) exhausts the notion of falsity, there is no substantive property of falsity, the utility of the concept of falsity is just a matter of facilitating the expression of certain generalizations, etc.

However, there is a seeming incompatibility between (F-sent) and the gap. Suppose, for reductio, that ‘S’ is a sentence that is neither true nor false. In that case, it is not the case that ‘S’ is true, and it is not the case that ‘S’ is false. But then, by (ES-sent) and (F-sent), we can infer that it is not the case that S, and it is not the case that not-S; in short: \({\sim}\)S and \({\sim}{\sim}\)S, which is a classical contradiction. Clearly, then, we must give up one of these things. But which one can we give up consistently with deflationism?

In the context of ethical non-cognitivism, one possible response to the apparent dilemma is to distinguish between a deflationary account of truth and a deflationary account of truth-aptitude (cf. Jackson, et al. 1994). By accepting an inflationary account of the latter, one can claim that ethical statements fail the robust criteria of “truth-aptitude” (reidentified in terms of expression of belief), even if a deflationary view of truth still allows the application of the truth predicate to them, via instances of (ES). In the case of vagueness, one might adopt epistemicism about it and claim that vague sentences actually have truth-values, we just can’t know them (cf. Williamson 1994. For an alternative, see Field 1994b).

With respect to the Liar Paradox, the apparent conflict between deflationism and the gap has led some (e.g., Simmons 1999) to conclude that deflationism is hobbled with respect to dealing with the problem, since most prominent approaches to doing so, stemming from the work of Saul Kripke (1975), involve an appeal to truth-value gaps. One alternative strategy a deflationist might pursue in attempting to resolve the Liar is to offer a non-classical logic. Field 2008 adopts this approach and restricts the law of the excluded middle. JC Beall (2002) combines truth-value gaps with Kleene logic (see the entry on many-valued Logic) and makes use of both weak and strong negation. Armour-Garb and Beall (2001, 2003) argue that deflationists can and should be dialetheists and accept that some truthbearers are both true and not true (see also, Woodbridge 2005, 152–3, on adopting a paraconsistent logic that remains “quasi-classical”). By contrast, Armour-Garb and Woodbridge (2013, 2015) develop a version of the “meaningless strategy” with respect to the Liar (based on Grover 1977), which they claim a deflationist can use to dissolve that paradox and semantic pathology more generally, without accepting genuine truth-value gaps or giving up classical logic.

4.5 The Generalization Problem

Since deflationists place such heavy emphasis on the role of the concept of truth in expressing generalizations, it seems somewhat ironic that certain versions of deflationism have been criticized for being incapable of accounting for generalizations involving truth (Gupta 1993a, 1993b; Field 1994a, 2008; Horwich 1998a (137–8), 2001; Halbach 1999 and 2011 (57–9); Soames 1999, Armour-Garb 2004, 2010, 2011). The “Generalization Problem” (henceforth, \(GP)\) captures the worry that a deflationary account of truth is inadequate for explaining our commitments to general facts we express with certain uses of ‘true’. This raises the question of whether and, if so, how, deflationary accounts earn the right to endorse such generalizations.

Although Tarski (1935 [1956]) places great importance on the instances of his (T)-schema, he comes to recognize that those instances do not provide a fully adequate way of characterizing truth. Moreover, even when the instances of (T) are taken as theorems, Tarski (ibid.) points out that taken all together they are insufficient for proving a ‘true’-involving generalization like

All sentences of the form ‘If \(p\), then \(p\)’ are true.

since the collection of the instances of (T) is \(\omega\)-incomplete (where a theory, \(\theta\), is \(\omega\)-incomplete if \(\theta\) can prove every instance of an open formula ‘\(Fx\)’ but cannot prove the universal generalization, ‘\(\forall xFx\)’).

We arrive at a related problem when we combine a reliance on the instances of some version of (ES) with Quine’s view about the functioning and utility of the truth predicate. He (1992, 81) considers the purpose of (A) to be to express a generalization over sentences like the following:

If it is raining, then it is raining.
If snow is white, then snow is white.

Quine points out that we want to be able to generalize on the embedded sentences in those conditionals, by semantically ascending, abstracting logical form, and deriving (A). But, as Tarski (ibid.) notes, this feat cannot be achieved, given only a commitment to (the instances of) (T). From (T) and (A), we can prove (B) and (C) but, given the finitude of deduction, when equipped only with the instances of (T), we cannot prove (A). As a consequence of the Compactness Theorem of first-order logic, anything provable from the totality of the instances of (T) is provable from just finitely many of them, so any theory that takes the totality of the instances of (T) to characterize truth will be unable to prove any generalization like (A).

To address the question of why we need to be able to prove these truth-involving generalizations, suppose that we accept a proposition like \(\langle\)Every proposition of the form \(\langle\)if \(p\), then \(p\rangle\) is true\(\rangle\). Call this proposition “\(\beta\)”. Now take ‘\(\Gamma\)’ to stand for the collection of propositions that are the instances of \(\beta\). Horwich (2001) maintains that an account of the meaning of ‘true’ will be adequate only if it aids in explaining why we accept the members of \(\Gamma\), where such explanations amount to proofs of those propositions by, among other things, employing an explanatory premise that does not explicitly concern the truth predicate. So, one reason it is important to be able to prove a ‘true’-involving generalization is because this is a condition of adequacy for an account of the meaning of that term. One might argue that anyone who grasps the concept of truth, and that of the relevant conditional, should be said to know \(\beta\). But if a given account of truth, together with an account of the conditional (along, perhaps, with an account of other logical notions), does not entail \(\beta\), then it does not provide an acceptable account of truth.

Here is another reason for thinking that generalizations like \(\beta\) must be proved. A theory of the meaning of ‘true’ should explain our acceptance of propositions like \(\beta\), which, as Gupta (1993a) and Hill (2002) emphasize, should be knowable a priori by anyone who possesses the concept of truth (and who grasps the relevant logical concepts). But if such a proposition can be known a priori on the basis of a grasp of the concept of truth (and of the relevant logical concepts), then a theory that purports to specify the meaning of ‘true’ should be able to explain our acceptance of that proposition. But if an account of the meaning of ‘true’ is going to do this, it must be possible to derive the proposition from one or more of the clauses that constitute our grasp of the concept of truth.

This creates a problem for a Horwichian minimalist. Let us suppose that \(\beta\) is one of the general propositions that must be provable. Restricted to the resources available through Horwich’s minimalism, we can show that \(\beta\) cannot be derived.

If a Horwichian minimalist could derive \(\beta\), it would have to be derived from the instances of

\(\langle p\rangle\) is true iff \(p.\)

But there cannot be a valid derivation of a universal generalization from a set of particular propositions unless that set is inconsistent. Since, according to Horwich (1998a), every instance of (E) that is part of his theory of truth is consistent, it follows that there cannot be a derivation of \(\beta\) from the instances of (E). This is a purely logical point. As such, considerations of pure logic dictate that our acceptance of \(\beta\) cannot be explained by Horwich’s account of truth. Since Horwich takes all instances of the propositional version of (T) (i.e., (ES-prop)) as axioms, he can prove each of those instances. But, as we have seen, restricted to the instances of the equivalence schema, he cannot prove the generalization, \(\beta\), i.e., \(\langle\)Every proposition of the form \(\langle\)if \(p\) then \(p\rangle\) is true\(\rangle\).

Some deflationists respond to the GP by using a version of (GT) to formulate their approach:

\(\forall x\) \((x\) is true iff \(\Sigma p(x = \langle p\rangle \amp p)).\)

In this context, there are two things to notice about (GT). First, it is not a schema but a universally quantified formula. For this reason, it is possible to derive a generalization like \(\beta\) from it. Second, the existential quantifier, ‘\(\Sigma\)’, in (GT) must be a higher-order quantifier (see the entry on second-order and higher-order logic) that quantifies into sentential positions. We mentioned above an approach that takes this quantifier as a substitutional one, where the substitution class consists of sentences. We also mentioned Hill’s (2002) alternative version that takes the substitution class to be the set of all propositions. Künne (2003) suggests a different approach that takes ‘\(\Sigma\)’ to be an objectual (domain and values) quantifier ranging over propositions. However, parallel to Horwich’s rejection of (GT) discussed in Section 3.1, all of these approaches have drawn criticism on the grounds that the use of higher-order quantifiers to define truth is circular (cf. Platts 1980, McGrath 2000), and may get the extension of the concept of truth wrong (cf. Sosa 1993).

An alternative deflationist approach to the GP attempts to show that, despite appearances, certain deflationary theories do have the resources to derive the relevant generalizations. Field (1994a, 2001a), for example, suggests that we allow reasoning with schemas directly and proposes rules that would allow the derivation of generalizations. Horwich (1998a, 2001) suggests a more informal approach according to which we are justified in deriving \(\beta\) since an informal inspection of a derivation of some instance of \(\beta\) shows us that we could derive any instance of it. For replies to Horwich, see Armour-Garb 2004, 2010, 2011; Gupta 1993a, 1993b; and Soames 1999. For responses to Armour-Garb’s attack on Horwich 2001, see Oms 2019 and Cieśliński 2018.

4.6 Conservativeness

An ideal theory of truth will be both consistent (e.g., avoid the Liar Paradox) and adequate (e.g., allow us to derive all the essential laws of truth, such as those at issue in the Generalization Problem). Yet it has recently been argued that even if deflationists can provide a consistent theory of truth and avoid the GP, they still cannot provide an adequate theory.

This argument turns on the notion of a conservative extension of a theory. Informally, a conservative extension of a theory is one that does not allow us to prove anything that could not be proved from the original, unextended theory. More formally, and applied to theories of truth, a truth theory, \(Tr\) is conservative over some theory \(T\) formulated in language \(L\) if and only if for every sentence \(\phi\) of \(L\) in which the truth predicate does not occur, if \(Tr \cup L \vdash \phi\), then \(L \vdash \phi\) (where ‘\(\vdash\)’ represents provability). Certain truth theories are conservative over arithmetic – e.g., theories that implicitly define truth using only the instances of some version of (ES) – and certain truth theories are not – e.g., Tarski’s (1935 [1956], 1944) compositional theory. Specifically, the addition of certain truth theories allows us to prove that arithmetic is consistent, something that we cannot do if we are confined to arithmetic itself.

It has been argued (a) that conservative truth theories are inadequate and (b) that deflationists are committed to conservative truth theories. (See Shapiro 1998 and Ketland 1999; Horsten 1995 provides an earlier version of this argument.) We will explain the arguments for (a) below but to get a flavor of the arguments for (b), consider Shapiro’s rhetorical question: “How thin can the notion of arithmetic truth be, if by invoking it we can learn more about the natural numbers?” Shapiro is surely right to press deflationists on their frequent claims that truth is “thin” or “insubstantial”. It might also be a worry for deflationists if any adequate truth theory allowed us to derive non-logical truths, if they endorse the thesis that truth is merely a “logical property”. On the other hand, deflationists themselves insist that truth is an expressively useful device, and so they cannot be faulted for promoting a theory of truth that allows us to say more about matters not involving truth.

To see an argument for (a), consider a Gödel sentence, \(G\), formulated within the language of Peano Arithmetic (henceforth, \(PA)\). \(G\) is not a theorem of PA if PA is consistent (cf. the entry on Gödel’s incompleteness theorems). But \(G\) becomes a theorem when PA is expanded by adding certain plausible principles that appear to govern a truth predicate. Thus, the resultant theory of arithmetical truth is strong enough to prove G and appears therefore to be non-conservative over arithmetic. If, as has been argued by a number of theorists, any adequate account of truth will be non-conservative over a base theory, then deflationists appear to be in trouble.

Understood in this way, the “Conservativeness Argument” (henceforth, \(CA)\) is a variant of the objection considered in Section 4.1, claiming that truth plays an explanatory role that deflationism cannot accommodate. There are several deflationary responses to the CA. Field (1999) argues that the worries that arise from the claim that deflationists are in violation of explanatory conservativeness is unfounded. He (ibid., 537) appeals to the expressive role of the truth predicate and maintains that deflationists are committed to a form of “explanatory conservativeness” only insofar as there are no explanations in which the truth predicate is not playing its generalizing role. As a result, he (ibid.) notes that “any use of ‘true’ in explanations which derives solely from its role as a device of generalization should be perfectly acceptable”. For responses to Field, see Horsten 2011 (61) and Halbach 2011 (315–6).

Responding to the CA, Daniel Waxman (2017) identifies two readings of ‘conservativeness’, one semantic and the other syntactic, which correspond to two conceptions of arithmetic. On the first conception, arithmetic is understood categorically as given by the standard model. On the second conception, arithmetic is understood axiomatically and is captured by the acceptance of some first-order theory, such as PA. Waxman argues that deflationism can be conservative given either conception, so that the CA does not go through.

Julien Murzi and Lorenzo Rossi (2018) argue that Waxman’s attempt at marrying deflationism with conservativeness – his “conservative deflationism” – is unsuccessful. They (ibid.) reject the adoption of this view on the assumption that one’s conception of arithmetic is axiomatic, claiming, in effect, that a deflationist’s commitment to a conservative conception of truth is misguided (cf. Halbach 2011, Horsten 2011, Cieśliński 2015, and Galinon 2015).

Jody Azzouni (1999) defends the “first-order deflationist”, viz., a deflationist who endorses what Waxman (ibid.) calls “the axiomatic conception of arithmetic” and whose subsequent understanding cannot rule out the eligibility of non-standard models. Azzouni accepts the need to prove certain ‘true’-involving generalizations, but he maintains that there are some generalizations that are about truths that a first-order deflationist need not prove. He further contends that if one does extend her theory of truth in a way that allows her to establish these generalizations, she should not expect her theory to be conservative, nor should she continue describing it as a deflationary view of truth. For a response to Azzouni (ibid.), see Waxman (2017, 453).

In line with Field’s response to the CA, Lavinia Picollo and Thomas Schindler (2020) argue that the conservativeness constraint imposed by Horsten 1995, Shapiro 1998, Ketland 1999, and others is not a reasonable requirement to impose on deflationary accounts. They contend that the insistence on conservativeness arises from making too much of the metaphor of “insubstantiality” and that it fails to see what the function of the truth predicate really amounts to. Their leading idea is that, from a deflationist’s perspective, the logico-linguistic function of the truth predicate is to simulate sentential and predicate quantification in a first-order setting (cf. Horwich 1998a, 4, n. 1). They maintain that, for a deflationist, in conjunction with first-order quantifiers, the truth predicate has the same function as sentential and predicate quantifiers. So, we should not expect the deflationist’s truth theory to conservatively extend its base theory.

4.7 Normativity

It is commonly said that our beliefs and assertions aim at truth, or present things as being true, and that truth is therefore a norm of assertion and belief. This putative fact about truth and assertion in particular has been seen to suggest that deflationism must be false (cf. Wright 1992 and Bar-On and Simmons 2007). However, the felt incompatibility between normativity and deflationism is difficult to make precise.

The first thing to note is that there is certainly a sense in which deflationism is consistent with the idea that truth is a norm of assertion. To illustrate this, notice (as we saw in examining truth’s putative explanatory role) that we can obtain an intuitive understanding of this idea without mentioning truth at all, so long as we focus on a particular case. Suppose that for whatever reason Mary sincerely believes that snow is green, has good evidence for this belief, and on the basis of this belief and evidence asserts that snow is green. We might say that there is a norm of assertion that implies that Mary is still open to criticism in this case. After all, since snow is not green, there must be something incorrect or defective about Mary’s assertion (and similarly for her belief). It is this incorrectness or defectiveness that the idea that truth is a norm of assertion (and belief) is trying to capture.

To arrive at a general statement of the norm that lies behind this particular case, consider that here, what we recognize is

If someone asserts that snow is green when snow is not green, then that assertion is open to criticism.

To generalize on this, what we want to do is generalize on the positions occupied by ‘snow is green’ and express something along the lines of

For all \(p\), if someone asserts that \(p\) when \({\sim}p\), then that assertion is open to criticism.

The problem of providing a general statement like (14) is the same issue first raised in Section 1.3, and the solution by now should be familiar. To state the norm in general we would need to be able to do something we seem unable to do in ordinary language, namely, employ sentential variables and quantifiers for them. But this is where the notion of truth comes in. Because (ES) gives us its contraposition,

\({\sim}p\) iff \(\langle p\rangle\) is not true.

Reading ‘\(\langle p\rangle\)’ as ‘that \(p\)’, we can reformulate (14) as

For all \(p\), if someone asserts that \(p\) when that \(p\) is not true, then that assertion is open to criticism.

But since the variable ‘\(p\)’ occurs only in nominalized contexts in (15), we can replace it with an object variable, ‘\(x\)’, and bind this with an ordinary objectual quantifier, to get

For all \(x\), if someone asserts \(x\), and \(x\) is not true, then that assertion is open to criticism.

Or, to put it as some philosophers might:

Truth is a norm of assertion.

In short, then, deflationists need not deny that we appeal to the notion of truth to express a norm of assertion; on the contrary, the concept of truth seems required to state that very generalization.

If deflationists can account for the fact that we must apply the notion of truth to express a norm of assertion, then does normativity pose any problem for deflationism? Crispin Wright (1992, 15–23) argues that it does, claiming that deflationism is inherently unstable because there is a distinctive norm for assertoric practice that goes beyond the norms for warranted assertibility – that the norms of truth and warranted assertibility are potentially extensionally divergent. This separate norm of truth, he claims, is already implicit just in acceptance of the instances of (ES). He points out that not having warrant to assert some sentence does not yield having warrant to assert its negation. However, because (ES) gives us (ES-con), we have, in each instance, an inference (going from right to left) from the sentence mentioned not being true to the negation of the sentence. But the instance of (ES) for the negation of any sentence,

\(\langle{\sim} p \rangle\) is true iff \({\sim}p,\)

takes us (again, going from right to left) from the negated sentence to an ascription of truth to that negated sentence. Thus, some sentence not being true does yield that the negation of the sentence is true, in contrast with warranted assertibility. This difference, Wright (ibid., 18) claims, reveals that, by deflationism’s own lights, the truth predicate expresses a distinct norm governing assertion, which is incompatible with the deflationary contention “that ‘true’ is only grammatically a predicate whose role is not to attribute a substantial characteristic”.

Rejecting Wright’s argument for the instability of deflationism, Ian Rumfitt (1995, 103) notes that if we add the ideas of denying something and of having warrant for doing so (“anti-warrant”) to Wright’s characterization of deflationism, this would make ‘is not true’ simply a device of rejection governed by the norm that “[t]he predicate ‘is not true’ may be applied to any sentence for which one has an anti-warrant”. But then truth-talk’s behavior with negation would not have to be seen as indicating that it marks a distinct norm beyond justified assertibility and justifiable deniability, which would be perfectly compatible with deflationism.

Field (1994a, 264–5) offers a deflationary response to Wright’s challenge (as well as to a similar objection regarding normativity from Putnam (1983a, 279–80)), pointing again to the generalizing role of the truth predicate in such normative desires as one to utter only true sentences or one to have only true beliefs. Field agrees with Wright that truth-talk expresses a norm beyond warranted assertibility, but he (1994a, 265) also maintains that “there is no difficulty in desiring that all one’s beliefs be disquotationally true; and not only can each of us desire such things, there can be a general practice of badgering other to into having such desires”. Horwich (1996, 879–80) argues that Wright’s rejection of deflationism does not follow from showing that one can use the truth predicate to express a norm beyond warranted assertibility. Like Field, Horwich claims that Wright missed the point that, in the expression of such a norm, the truth predicate is just playing its generalizing role. For other objections to deflationism based on truth’s normative role, see Price 1998, 2003 and McGrath 2003.

4.8 Inflationist Deflationism?

Another objection to deflationism begins by drawing attention to a little-known doctrine about truth that G.E. Moore held at the beginning of the 20th Century. Richard Cartwright (1987, 73) describes the view as follows: “a true proposition is one that has a certain simple unanalyzable property, and a false proposition is one that lacks the property”. This doctrine about truth is to be understood as the analogue for the doctrine that Moore held about goodness, namely that goodness is a simple, unanalyzable quality.

The potential problem that this Moorean view about truth presents for deflationism might best be expressed in the form of a question: What is the difference between the Moorean view and deflationism? One might reply that, according to deflationary theories, the concept of truth has an important logical role, i.e., expressing certain generalizations, whereas the concept of goodness does not. However, this doesn’t really answer our question. For one thing, it isn’t clear that Moore’s notion of truth does not also capture generalizations, since it too will yield all of the instances of (ES). For another, the idea that the concept of truth plays an important logical role doesn’t distinguish the metaphysics of deflationary conceptions from the metaphysics of the Moorean view, and it is the metaphysics of the matter that the present objection really brings into focus. Alternatively, one might suggest that the distinction between truth according to Moore’s view and deflationary conceptions of truth is the distinction between having a simple unanalyzable nature, and not having any underlying nature at all. But what is that distinction? It is certainly not obvious that there is any distinction between having a nature about which nothing can be said and having no nature at all.

How might a deflationist respond to this alleged problem? The key move will be to focus on the property of being true. For the Moorean, this property is a simple unanalyzable one. But deflationists need not be committed to this. As we have seen, some deflationists think that there is no truth property at all. And even among deflationists who accept that there is some insubstantial truth property, it is not clear that this is the sort of property that the Moorean has in mind. To say that a property is unanalyzable suggests that the property is a fundamental property. One might understand this in something like the sense that Lewis proposes, i.e., as a property that is sparse and perfectly natural. Or one might understand a fundamental property as one that is groundable but not grounded in anything. But deflationists need not understand a purported property of being true in either of these ways. As noted in Section 1.2, they may think of it as an abundant property rather than a sparse one, or as one that is ungroundable. In this way, there are options available for deflationists who want to distinguish themselves from the Moorean view of truth.

4.9 Truth and Meaning

The final objection that we will consider concerns the relation between deflationism and theories of meaning, i.e., theories about how sentences get their meanings.

The orthodox approach to this last question appeals to the notion of truth, suggesting, roughly, that a sentence \(S\) means that \(p\) just in case \(S\) is true if and only if \(p\). This approach to meaning, known widely as “truth-conditional semantics”, is historically associated with Donald Davidson’s (1967) thesis that the “(T)-sentences” (i.e., the instances of the (T)-schema) generated by a Tarski-truth-definition for a language give the meanings of the sentences they mention, by specifying their truth conditions. In contemporary linguistics, a prominent approach to sentence meaning explains it in terms of propositions, understood (following Lewis 1970 and Stalnaker 1970) as sets of possible worlds, which amount to encapsulations of truth conditions (Elbourne 2011, 50–51).

This has led a number of philosophers to argue that, on pain of circularity, deflationism cannot be combined with theories of meaning that make use of the notion of truth to explain meaning – in other words, that deflationism is incompatible with truth-conditional theories of meaning. This assessment of deflationism stems from Dummett’s (1959 [1978, 7]) claim that the (T)-sentences (or the instances of any other version of (ES)) cannot both tell us what the sentences they nominalize mean and give us an account of ‘true’. As Horwich (1998a, 68) puts it, “we would be faced with something like a single equation and two unknowns” (cf. Davidson 1990, 1996; Horwich 1998b, Kalderon 1999, Collins 2002).

The first thing to say regarding this objection is that, even if deflationism were inconsistent with truth-conditional theories of meaning, this would not automatically constitute an objection to deflationism. After all, there are alternative theories of meaning available, and most deflationists reject truth-conditional semantics in favor of some “truth-free” alternative. The main alternatives available include Brandom’s (1994) inferentialism, developed following Wilfrid Sellars (1974, 1979); Horwich’s (1998b) use-theory of meaning, inspired by Wittgenstein 1953; and Field’s (1994a, 2001b) computational-role + indication-relations account. There is, however, a lot of work to be done before any of these theories can be regarded as adequate. Devitt 2001 makes this point in rejecting all of these alternative approaches to meaning, claiming that the only viable approach is (referential/)truth-conditional semantics.

While the orthodoxy of truth-conditional accounts of meaning adds weight to this challenge to deflationism, it is still, contra Devitt, an open question whether any non-truth-conditional account of meaning will turn out to be adequate. Moreover, even if there is no viable “truth-free” account, several philosophers (e.g., Bar-on, et al. 2005) have argued that deflationism has no more problem with a truth-conditional theory of meaning than any other approach to truth does. Others have gone further, arguing positively that there is no incompatibility between deflationism and truth-conditional theories. Alexis Burgess (2011, 407–410) argues that at least some versions of deflationism are compatible with mainstream model-theoretic semantics in linguistics (understood as providing explanations of truth conditions) and the recognition of “the manifest power and progress of truth-conditional semantics”. Claire Horisk (2008) argues that “circularity” arguments for incompatibility (or, as she prefers, “immiscibility”) fail. The only circularity involved here, she claims, is a harmless kind, so long as one is (like some proponents of truth-conditional semantics) offering a reciprocal, rather than a reductive, analysis of meaning. Mark Lance (1997, 186–7) claims that any version of deflationism based on an anaphoric reading of ‘is true’ (as in Brandom 1988, 1994) is independent of, and thus compatible with, any underlying account of meaning, including a truth-conditional one. Williams 1999 likewise claims that the role of truth in meaning theories for particular languages is just the expressive role that deflationists claim exhausts the notion of truth’s function. Of course, all of these claims have been contested, but they seem to show that the thesis that deflationism is inconsistent with a truth-conditional theory of meaning is neither a forgone conclusion nor necessarily an objection to deflationism, even if the thesis is correct. (For further discussion of this issue, see Gupta 1993b, Field 2005, Gupta and Martinez-Fernandez 2005, Patterson 2005, and Horisk 2007.) That said, one outstanding question that remains regarding the viability of any deflationary approach to truth is whether that approach can be squared with an adequate account of meaning.


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Bradley Armour-Garb and James Woodbridge joined Daniel Stoljar as co-authors of this (2021) version of this entry. Nicolas Damnjanovic was a co-author with Daniel Stoljar on the previous (2010) version. Daniel Stoljar would like to thank Damnjanovic for his contributions to the 2010 version, as well as Stewart Candlish, James Chase, Jakob Hohwy and Huw Price for help with the original (1997) version of the entry.

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Bradley Armour-Garb <>
Daniel Stoljar
James Woodbridge <>

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