Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism

First published Fri Jan 23, 2004; substantive revision Mon Dec 18, 2023

Non-cognitivism is a variety of irrealism about ethics with a number of influential variants. Non-cognitivists agree with error theorists that there are no moral properties or moral facts. But rather than thinking that this makes moral statements false, non-cognitivists claim that moral statements are not in the business of predicating properties or making statements which could be true or false in any substantial sense. Roughly put, non-cognitivists think that moral statements have no substantial truth conditions. Furthermore, according to non-cognitivists, when people utter moral sentences they are not typically expressing states of mind which are beliefs or which are cognitive in the way that beliefs are. Rather they are expressing non-cognitive attitudes more similar to desires, approval or disapproval.

Cognitivism is the denial of non-cognitivism. Thus it holds that moral statements do express beliefs and that they are apt for truth and falsity. But cognitivism need not be a species of realism since a cognitivist can be an error theorist and think all moral statements false. Still, moral realists are cognitivists insofar as they think moral statements are apt for robust truth and falsity and that many of them are in fact true.

1. A More Detailed General Description

1.1 Two Negative Constitutive Non-cognitivist Claims

Two negative theses comprise the central common non-cognitivist claims, although current theories often endorse them only in qualified form. One thesis might be called semantic nonfactualism. Simply put this thesis denies that predicative moral sentences express propositions or have substantial truth conditions. Thus semantic nonfactualism suggests that their contents are not apt for robust truth or falsity. (The terms ‘substantial’ and ‘robust’ are inserted here to make room for minimalist theories which offer deflationary accounts of truth, truth-aptness and propositions. Such theories will be discussed in more detail in section 4.1 below.) Moral predicates do not denote or express properties and predicative moral sentences do not therefore predicate properties of their subjects. The second negative thesis can be called psychological non-cognitivism. This thesis denies that the states of mind conventionally expressed by moral utterances are beliefs or mental states which fall on the cognitive side of the cognitive/non-cognitive divide. Typically non-cognitivists accept both negative theses, though there are views which accept one and not the other.

Some non-cognitivists have accepted these theses in their strongest form – moral sentences in no way predicate properties, are apt for truth or falsity, or express beliefs. But most current non-cognitivists accept these negative claims only in a somewhat weakened form. For example many non-cognitivists hold that moral judgments’ primary function is not to express beliefs, though they may express them in a secondary way. Others deny that their contents are true or false in any robust sense but not that they can be true or false in a deflationary sense according to which there is no substantial property separating true and false sentences.

Non-cognitivists deny neither that moral sentences are meaningful nor that they are generally used by speakers in meaningful ways. Thus different sorts of non-cognitivist couple their negative theses with various positive claims about the meanings of moral sentences and about the states of mind that they express. It is the diversity of positive proposals that generates the different varieties of non-cognitivism. Emotivists suggest that moral sentences express or evoke non-cognitive attitudes towards various objects without asserting that the speaker has those attitudes. Norm-expressivists suggest (roughly) that the states of mind expressed by moral sentences are attitudes of acceptance of various norms or rules governing conduct and emotion, perhaps coupled with a judgment that the objects or action under discussion comports with those norms. Prescriptivists suggest that these sentences are a species of prescription or command, and may or may not offer an account of the state of mind such judgments express.

While non-cognitivism was first developed as a theory about moral judgments (Ogden & Richards 1923, 125. Barnes 1933) many of the arguments for the position apply equally well to other sorts of evaluative language. Thus most non-cognitivists today extend the treatment to normative or evaluative judgments generally, and the discussion below will often speak of normative or evaluative judgments and terms – a category which includes as paradigms moral judgments, judgments of rationality, and judgments of value.

1.2 Cognitivism

Cognitivism is perhaps best defined as the denial of non-cognitivism. Cognitivists think that moral sentences are apt for truth or falsity, and that the state of mind of accepting a moral judgment is typically one of belief. They think that typical utterances of indicative sentences containing moral predicates express beliefs in the same way that other sentences with ordinary descriptive predicates typically do. (There is some reason to be careful here since cognitivists may not need to employ the sense of ‘express’ that expressivists need to get their theory off the ground. See Schroeder 2008a.) Different species of cognitivist disagree about the contents of moral sentences and beliefs, about their truth conditions, and about their truth. To discuss all the varieties would require a complete taxonomy of possible metaethical positions. What they have in common, however, is that they all deny that an adequate account of moral judgments can be given consistent with the two negative non-cognitivist theses.

1.3 Contrast with Cognitivist Subjectivism

It is useful to contrast non-cognitivism with one particular variety of cognitivism in order to more clearly present what the non-cognitivist is claiming. Various versions of cognitivist subjectivism equate moral properties such as rightness with the property of being approved of by some person or group. To be right is to be approved of by the speaker, or the speaker and her friends, or the members of the speaker’s society, or everybody. On many such views, when a speaker says something is right she is in fact saying that she approves, or that she and those like her approve. In one very good sense she would then have expressed her approval – she said that she approved or that she and her friends did. And, if approval is a conative rather than a cognitive attitude, we might say that she expressed a non-cognitive attitude. But this by itself is not sufficient to make the position non-cognitivist. This variety of subjectivism agrees with one of the positive non-cognitivist theses (that moral utterances conventionally express non-cognitive attitudes), but it does not agree with either of the essential negative non-cognitivist claims (that the judgments don’t express beliefs and/or that they are not truth-apt). According to this subjectivist theory, the moral utterance expresses the speaker’s belief that she approves of the action and this has truth conditions which are also the truth conditions of the sentence uttered. When a non-cognitivist says that a sentence conventionally expresses an attitude, she means to contrast the mode of expression with saying that one has the attitude. A simple example gets the idea across. One can express dislike of something by saying that one dislikes it. This is the way that a cognitivist subjectivist thinks we express moral attitudes. But one can also express dislike of something by booing or hissing. This is much like the way some non-cognitivists think we express moral attitudes. The latter way of expressing an attitude is different from the way cognitivist subjectivists think we express moral attitudes because it expresses the attitude without saying that we have the attitude (Barnes 1933; Carnap 1937, 28–29.) There is further discussion of this point in section 4.3 below.

2. Principal Varieties in More Detail

The principal varieties of non-cognitivism can be distinguished by focusing on the positive claims they make in explicating the semantic function of moral expressions and the nature of the mental states typically expressed by those who utter them in simple predicative statements.

2.1 Emotivism

Emotivists think moral terms in grammatically assertive utterances function primarily to express emotion and perhaps also to elicit similar emotions in others (Barnes 1933; Stevenson 1946; Ayer 1952, Chapter 6). They can be read as suggesting that the right way to explain the meanings of such terms is to point out that they are conventional devices for performing a certain sort of speech act, one which if sincere requires that the speaker have a certain attitude. Sentences employing general predicates of positive moral evaluation such as ‘right’, ‘good’, ‘virtuous’, and so on signal a non-cognitive pro-attitude such as approval or preference. Sentences employing general predicates of negative evaluation such as ‘wrong’, ‘bad’, and ‘vicious’ signal negative non-cognitive attitudes. Thus to call a person virtuous is to express an attitude of approval and the speech act of doing so is analogous to the speech act performed when we cheer for that person. The account can be extended beyond general moral terms. Simple predicative utterances employing the so-called thick moral terms such as ‘brave’ and ‘honest’ can then be thought of as performing this same speech act while at the same time predicating the natural property (say fearlessness in the case of bravery) which common usage of the term seems to track. Thus thick moral terms can be thought of as having both descriptive and emotive meaning.

Some theorists who view themselves as emotivists suggest that even the most general terms of moral evaluation have a descriptive meaning rather than just an emotive or non-cognitive meaning (Stevenson 1944, 22; Hare 1952, suggests the same sort of idea within a prescriptivist theory at 118). One such approach analyzes judgments applying a moral predicate to a particular object or action as expressing approval or disapproval of some property while at the same time predicating that property of the object or item in question. This idea has been taken over by contemporary hybrid expressivists (Jackson 1999; Barker 2000; Ridge 2006, Ridge 2014). According to these theorists, a sentence such as ‘Lying is wrong’ both predicates a property of the act type lying and expresses the speaker’s disapproval of that property. Theories of this sort will be discussed in more detail in the section on hybrid theories below. They are mentioned here only to note two points: (1) The hybrid idea was already present in the writings of early noncognitivists. And (2) these more complicated views are often adopted by theorists who begin from simpler theories which are paradigm cases of non-cognitivism.

2.2 Prescriptivism and Universal Prescriptivism

Prescriptivists suggest that moral judgments are a species of prescriptive judgement and that moral sentences in the indicative mood are semantically more akin to imperatives than indicatives. One way to think of the idea is that moral terms function as force indicators on analogy with mood. Early prescriptivists thought that this had radical implications for moral reasoning and argument. Carnap suggested that moral judgments are equivalent to relatively simple imperatives. The statement ‘Killing is evil’ means the same thing as ‘Do not kill.’ On that basis he claimed that there could be no moral knowledge or error (Carnap 1937; 23–24 & 29).

By contrast current versions of prescriptivism, most developed in the works of R. M. Hare, have attempted to vindicate moral thinking as a rational enterprise. The main idea here is that while moral sentences do in fact express a species of prescription much as ordinary imperatives do, they express prescriptions of a special universal sort. And it is largely because they are prescriptions of this sort that they are subject to various consistency constraints, so that accepting one moral judgment carries with it a requirement that one accept other judgments in some respects like it. While Hare denies that moral judgments are exactly equivalent to prescriptions expressible in any other form of words, he does tell us a lot about what they mean. Moral imperatives are universal in a number of ways. They are to apply not just to the agent about whom they are made (if they are made with respect to a particular agent) but also to any agent who is similarly situated. And they apply to any action or object which is relevantly similar to the actions or objects about which the judgment is made. They apply to all relevantly similar cases at any time and any place. Thus, very roughly, when one calls an action right one is not only prescribing the action in question, but also any relevantly similar action wherever and whenever it occurs. And the prescription is addressed not only to the agent whose action is up for assessment but also to every other person, including the speaker and listeners. In this way, Hare believes, calling an action wrong commits the speaker to judging wrong any relevantly similar action done at any time and any place by any person.

With ordinary prescriptions, it isn’t obvious that there is a state of mind that someone must be in if they utter or obey a command and which we ought to characterize as accepting an imperative. Hare, himself at one point argues that there is no substantive way of characterizing the attitude a person must have if she expresses or accepts a prescription or moral judgment (Hare 1952, 9–11). Even so, prescriptivists have some reason for wanting to offer an account of accepting a moral judgment if they want to explain moral practice. Ordinarily we attribute moral judgments to people, even people who are silent. So the prescriptivist will want to say something about our basis for these attributions. An account of the attitude that constitutes accepting a moral judgment will allow them to ground such attributions. One suggestion is that the attitude of accepting a moral judgment involves an intention to do what the judgments recommend. Sincerely accepting a command directed at oneself involves doing it if one is in circumstances where it applies and one is able and otherwise intending to do it should one find oneself in those circumstances (Hare 1952, 20). Since moral commands are universal according to the theory, they will be directed at everyone. Thus anyone who sincerely accepts a moral judgment will be disposed to do what they believe right in circumstances where they can. Less sincere judgments may lack this connection (Hare 1952, 169). The issue of which attitude, if any, are involved in accepting a prescription is relevant to some of the arguments over internalism that we will consider below.

2.3 Quasi-realism

Since non-cognitivism is a species of irrealism about ethics, it should be unsurprising that many of its main motivations overlap with those for other versions of ethical irrealism, especially with those for error theories. Early non-cognitivists seem most concerned to defend metaphysical and epistemic commitments incompatible with a realist interpretation of moral claims. For example, moral judgments seem to be empirically under-determined (Ayer 1952, 106; Mackie 1977, 39). Hence they fail tests for meaningful discourse proposed by logical positivists. If moral language is meaningful, it would be a counter-example to the view. Thus early versions of non-cognitivism were proposed by these theorists, not so much because they were interested in moral philosophy but rather to render innocuous a seeming counter-example to their own theories (Carnap 1937, 24–27; Ayer 1952, 107–109).

More contemporary non-cognitivists have also been motivated by similar underlying metaphysical and epistemic commitments. But they have been as concerned with vindicating the legitimacy of moral practice and argument as with anything else. As a result, they have put more time and energy into explaining, and in a certain sense justifying, the realist-seeming features of moral discourse in the absence of a commitment to realism (Hare 1952; Blackburn 1984, 1998; Gibbard 1990).

‘Quasi-Realism’ is Simon Blackburn’s name for this sort of non-cognitivism, and especially his own version of expressivism. Yet other sophisticated non-cognitivists, notably Allan Gibbard, have been happy to work under the quasi-realist banner (Gibbard 2003, 18–19). What especially distinguishes the quasi-realist project is an emphasis on explaining why we are entitled to act as if moral judgments are genuinely truth-apt even while strictly speaking they are neither true nor false in any robust sense. Thus it is a commitment of a quasi-realist that normative judgments are in an important way different from most (other) paradigm descriptive judgments – enough so to render problematic their status as either true or false – and yet that a justification is nonetheless available for our practices of treating them as if they were in fact so. What exactly this comes to is hard to say without discussing some of the special problems for non-cognitivism in general, since it is precisely in offering solutions to those problems that the quasi-realist carries out his program. Thus we will revisit the position later on in the context of these problems.

2.4 Expressivism

Expressivists of all sorts think that moral sentences are conventional devices for expressing pro and/or con attitudes towards their objects. In this broad sense emotivists are expressivists; they agree that moral language functions to express non-cognitive attitudes of various sorts. The claim that moral terms function much like ‘boo’ and ‘hurrah’ qualifies as expressivist in a broad sense. In recent years, however, the term ‘expressivist’ has come to be used in a narrower way, to refer to views which attempt to construct a systematic semantics for moral sentences by pairing them with the states of mind that the sentences are said to express. Such expressivists hold that the meanings of all sentences containing moral terms are determined by the mental states that they serve to express.

For this to work, the sense in which moral sentences express the attitudes which determine their semantic values must be fairly strict and particular. For in one sense perfectly ordinary indicative sentences can express non-cognitive attitudes as when, ‘It is ten o’clock already,’ can express impatience. And, ‘Lying sucks!’ and ‘I disapprove of lying,’ can each express disapproval of lying. Even so, we should not want to assimilate the semantics of these sentences to one another. Thus expressivists of the narrower sort must identify a kind of expression which allows them to distinguish the way in which “Lying is wrong,” expresses the attitude that generates its semantic value, from the way in which “I disapprove of lying,” or even “I think that lying is wrong” might express the very same attitude (Schroeder 2008a, 2008c).

Those who have taken up this expressivist program have provided a number of candidates for the attitudes expressed by sentences containing normative terminology. Simon Blackburn, whose quasi-realist project was briefly described above, has contributed various ideas not only for the states expressed by indicative sentences but also for complex embeddings of moral claims. Hybrid theories that put the expressive function of normative language into the semantics (discussed below) also involve work of this sort. But the proponent who has developed the program in the most systematic way is Allan Gibbard. In two influential books Gibbard has proposed two structurally similar accounts each of which employs a different base noncognitive attitude. In Gibbard (1990) the attitude was norm-acceptance, whereas in Gibbard (2003) it was a planning attitude akin to intending. In each case he develops a strategy for combining the relevant noncognitive attitude with belief to generate complex attitudes that can serve as the semantic values of more complex sentences. For more recent developments see Mark Schroeder’s (2008c) bifurcated attitude semantics and Silk (2015) developing Dreier’s (2006) use of preference to impose structure.

2.5 Norm-expressivism and Plan-expressivism

Gibbard’s Wise Choices, Apt Feelings (1990) proposes an analysis of judgments regarding rationality according to which they express a non-cognitive attitude of acceptance towards rules or norms. From there he proceeds to reduce other normative judgments into various more particular kinds of judgments of rationality, so that all moral judgments are covered by the proposed analysis. Gibbard suggests that normative judgments express the acceptance of systems of norms – rules dividing actions under naturalistic descriptions into those which are forbidden, permitted and required. To call an action rational is, to a first approximation, to express one’s acceptance of a system of norms which allows it. To call an action irrational is to express one’s acceptance of a system of norms which forbids it. And so on (Gibbard 1990, 46). This is only Gibbard’s idea to a first approximation, since a speaker may not have a determinate system of norms in mind when he or she makes such a judgment. So Gibbard suggests we would do better to think of judgments to the effect that an action would be irrational as expressing rejection of any set of norms which does not forbid it. More precisely, a normative judgment predicating a normative term of a particular action rules out combinations of descriptive judgments concerning the action with norms that either permit, forbid, or require (as appropriate) actions falling under those descriptions. More complex judgments are captured using the sets of norm-world pairs which those judgments “rule out” to represent the states of mind inconsistent with the judgments in question. The basic idea can be illustrated with an example. A judgment that action A is permissible is incompatible with a pair the first member of which represents A as a lie, and the second member of which is a norm that rules out lying. And it is inconsistent with many more such combinations besides. Given this, we can capture the content of the judgment that action A is permissible by specifying the set of world-norm pairs with which it is incompatible. (A more detailed exposition of Gibbard’s technical apparatus can be found within the discussion of the Embedding Problem below and in the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies.)

Gibbard develops his analysis to cover moral judgments by analyzing such judgments in terms of judgments of rationality. An action is wrong if and only if it fails to meet standards of action the intentional or negligent violation of which in a normal state of mind would be sufficient for finding the agent prima facie blameworthy. And an action is blameworthy if it would be rational for the agent to feel guilty and for others to resent the agent for doing the action (Gibbard 1990, 45). Since the rationality of guilt or resentment receives a non-cognitive analysis, the approach generates a non-cognitive analysis of moral judgments themselves.

Gibbard’s more recent work (Gibbard 2003) retains many of the main features of his norm-expressivist theory but it revises to some extent the account of the non-cognitive attitudes involved in accepting a normative judgment. On the current view, such judgments express the acceptance of plans, or perhaps better they express a state of mind that we might think of as planning to act in this way or that depending on the naturalistic circumstances one finds oneself in. More complex judgments embedding normative terms express combinations of such attitudes with further attitudes, including ordinary beliefs. Whereas in the earlier work Gibbard used sets of world-norm pairs to formally capture the contents of judgments, in the later work he relies on what he calls “fact-prac worlds”. Formally they function in much the same way as the world-norm pairs did in the earlier theory. But with the fact-prac worlds apparatus contingency plans take the place of norms as members of the pairs. Once again, judgements will rule out other judgements represented by a set of pairs. The judgment that action A is permissible will be inconsistent with various combinations of factual beliefs with plans. Each of these combinations can be captured by a world representing a way the world might be together with a second component consisting of a plan, representing a commitment to act that the thinker might have. For example the judgment that action A is permissible will be incompatible with any pair the fact-representing member of which represents action A as a lie, paired with a plan that rules out lying. And just as a similar idea allowed Gibbard to use sets of norm-world pairs to capture the content of normative judgments, he now can capture the content of a normative judgment by specifying the set of fact-prac worlds with which it is incompatible. When the apparatus is fully developed, the fact representing members of the pairs can once again be thought of as possible worlds insofar as they specify every detail of the world, and the plans are hyper-plans insofar as they have an answer for what to do in every circumstance. Gibbard often calls these fully determinate fact-prac worlds “fact-plan worlds”, just as you might expect given what they are composed of. The resulting theory might now be called ‘plan-expressivism’ rather than ‘norm-expressivism’ though most of its important structural features are very similar to those of his earlier norm expressivist view.

Further developments come in the form of Gibbard’s arguments for the resulting theory: Gibbard suggests that people need to plan and need ways to think about and represent their plans. He argues that they would also need to think about what to do from the perspectives of various other people and to formulate plans for arbitrary situations they might find themselves in. If these claims are right, a language might naturally develop in order to make such thinking easier. A planning language modeled by the sets of world-plan pairs would serve very well. And in actual use it would operate much as our actual normative language does. It is therefore reasonable to conclude that our actual normative language is of this sort. Furthermore conceiving of these attitudes as involving contingency plans for descriptively specifiable circumstances would allow us to explain the supervenience of the moral on the descriptive. The thoughts represented by the fact-prac world apparatus represent such contingency plans. So the supervenience of the normative on the descriptive falls naturally out of the resulting story (Gibbard 2003).

Some theorists are unsatisfied with Gibbard’s treatment of third personal judgements, partly because they find the psychology of forming a contingency plan for being in another person’s shoes implausible. Ayers (2022) suggests that this aspect of Gibbard’s view can be replaced with a third-personal decision that the agent who should act in a particular way act in precisely that way. The view takes on board a commitment to the view that one can decide for others in the relevant way. Ayers argues that idea makes sense if one takes up certain ideas from the literature on group agency.

2.6 Borderline Cases and Hybrid Theories

Often philosophical positions are introduced in rather pure and stark versions, only to be modified in light of arguments and objections so as to become more like competing theories over time. It should not be too surprising that this is the case in metaethics and that present day non-cognitivist theories are less distinguishable from cognitivist alternatives than earlier versions. It can even be a controversial matter whether theories developed within the non-cognitivist tradition but modified to handle objections still deserve the label. The varieties of emotivism which postulate both descriptive meaning and emotive meaning have sometimes aroused such suspicions and the more developed hybrids discussed at the end of this section are in that tradition. Furthermore, while paradigm non-cognitivists accept each of the two negative theses outlined above, there are views which accept only one of the two without the other. These positions constitute two metaethical theories which we might think of as borderline cases lying just outside the non-cognitivist region of logical space.

Hermeneutic moral fictionalists are not semantic non-factualists. Moral sentences are regarded as genuinely truth-apt. Such sentences do have truth conditions and an assertive sentence using a moral predicate does predicate a property. Yet, in normal use these sentences are not strictly speaking true. Thus far the hermeneutic fictionalist agrees with error theorists. But while error theorists think that the falsity of moral sentences implies that ordinary moral talk is massively in error, fictionalists disagree. According to the hermeneutic fictionalist a speaker uttering a false moral sentence is typically not expressing a belief in the content expressed by the sentence. Rather such speakers are using it fictively, and this use involves no error. Thus, fictionalists are psychological non-cognitivists. Use of a moral sentence does not communicate that the speaker believes the proposition expressed by that sentence. Rather speakers use such sentences to express other, non-cognitive states of mind. Just as with standard versions of non-cognitivism, fictionalists will generally offer a story about the nature of the non-cognitive attitude expressed. For example, they may suggest that the state of mind is an intention to act as if the moral judgment expressing the intention is true (Kalderon 2005b). At the same time, because they are not pursuing the expressivist semantic program the expression relation need not be exactly what ordinary expressivists take it to be. Since they need not require a one–to–one mapping of moral sentences onto states of mind that express them to support their semantic theory, fictionalists can allow for more variation in the states of mind such sentences (loosely) express. Hermeneutic fictionalism is often contrasted with revolutionary fictionalism. Revolutionary moral fictionalists think we should reform our current cognitively committed use of normative language to work roughly as the hermeneutic fictionalist thinks we already do (Joyce 2001, 2005). They are thus not committed to non-cognitivism about actual current use of moral terms in the way that hermeneutic fictionalists seem to be. Revolutionary fictionalists could be read as proposing that we convert to using moral language to express something other than belief with our indicative moral sentences, but revolutionary fictionalists have not usually presented their reforms in that way. That should not be too surprising. Fictionalist rejection of semantic nonfactualism leads most taxonomists to omit fictionalism from the non-cognitivist genus. Still at least one prominent hermeneutic fictionalist has presented his view as a version of non-cognitivism (Kalderon 2005b) drawing on some comments in MacIntyre (1981, 15–18). (See also Beddor, 2023)

For more detail on fictionalism see the entry on fictionalism.

In contrast, Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons have propounded a view which they call Nondescriptivist Cognitivism. As the label suggests, they do not regard their view as a species of non-cognitivism, but like fictionalism the view does accept one of non-cognitivism’s two constitutive negative theses while rejecting the other. However, with respect to each thesis Horgan and Timmons’s choices contrast with those made by fictionalism. Nondescriptivist cognitivism spurns psychological non-cognitivism, but embraces semantic nonfactualism, at least insofar as it rejects the claim that moral sentences describe the world or predicate genuine properties (Horgan & Timmons 2000; Timmons 1999). The precise content of the view can be difficult to pin down. Horgan and Timmons challenge a standard Humean division of the mind into a domain of cognitive states which represent the world as being some way and a separate domain of noncognitive states that do not represent the world. Rather they think there is an important division within the cognitive domain between beliefs that represent the world and beliefs that do not do this but which have non-descriptive but cognitive content. Nondescriptive Cognitivism then holds that moral judgments express such nondescriptive but cognitive states. Indicative sentences apt for expressing these mental states (in one sense of ‘express’) also semantically express the contents of these nondescriptive states just as on a more standard picture indicative sentences semantically express the propositions that are the contents of sentences that (in a different sense of ‘express’) express beliefs. Whether this is in fact a distinctive cognitivist position will depend on the best way of dividing up different sorts of mental states. Some will think that Horgan and Timmons have stipulated a new use for old terms, but they respond by defending phenomenological criteria for dividing cognitive from non-cognitive mental states that justify counting nonrepresentational states among the cognitive.

However that debate comes out, it is nevertheless worth noting the view as one which makes trouble for the standard division between cognitivist and non-cognitivist views. Together with fictionalism it illustrates a position which accepts only one of the two negative theses constitutive of standard non-cognitivism. If such views are coherent this would suggest the two negative theses are logically independent.

Hybrid-expressivist theories can be thought of as another sort of borderline case but for a different reason. These theorists combine the positive claims of expressivism – that moral sentences are conventional devices for the expression of pro-attitudes and that moral attitudes are (partly) non-cognitive with features of cognitivism – that moral sentences predicate properties and that moral attitudes are (partly) cognitive. There are a variety of ways of combining these ideas and various extant theories adopt many of the options.

We’ve already noted a tendency for emotivists and prescriptivists to allow a kind of secondary descriptive meaning for moral terms over and above their expressive meaning in order to capture the way that moral statements can be used to convey descriptive information. If I know that you are a utilitarian you might convey the information that an action maximizes utility by telling me that it is right. In such cases, what the speaker successfully conveys depends on the audience’s knowledge of the speaker’s moral views. One sort of hybrid theorist incorporates this idea into the semantics of moral expressions. Such theorists suggest that moral utterances as a matter of their semantics predicate a property, one which is determined by the speaker’s moral attitudes, while at the same time expressing a non-cognitive attitude towards that property. Proponents hope that the view will have advantage in explaining the communication of factual information with moral terms and with handling the embedding problem (explained below), while also explaining the motivational efficacy of moral judgements. One implementation of this view equates the main semantic content of a moral predicate with the property it picks out (via a function from the speaker’s attitudes to the relevant properties), while use of the predicate conventionally implicates the presence of a pro or con attitude (Barker 2000). A different implementation of the strategy incorporates both components into the semantic values of moral terms, even while the descriptive content is a function of the non-cognitive attitude expressed. More specifically on this way of developing the idea, moral sentences to the effect that something is right semantically express both a proposition – that the action has a particular property – and a particular positive attitude toward that particular property. The particular property picked out itself depends on the non-cognitive attitudes of the speaker, insofar as the property predicated is the most general property towards which the speaker holds the non-cognitive attitudes expressed by the very same judgement(Ridge, 2006a, 2006b, 2014). One upshot is that the descriptive content of a speaker’s judgements can vary over time as the object of her attitudes change. John Eriksson(2009) suggests that R. M. Hare was an early adopter of this kind of hybrid theory.

A contrasting sort of hybrid theory holds the descriptive content of moral predicates constant. Such views are often modeled on slurs or epithets, as explicated in a certain way. It is plausible and perhaps even standard to think of slurs as semantically expressing a certain descriptive property (being a member of such and such a group, say) while also conventionally expressing a negative attitude towards those with the property. Copp (2001, 2009) and Boisvert (2008) suggest that moral terms could function in the same way. Here again there are various ways to work out the details. Advocates of the approach can note that it has advantages over the previous kind of hybrid theory in explaining communication insofar as the descriptive content remains fixed from speaker to speaker (Schroeder 2009). And they claim that the view does so without undermining the standard hybrid explanation of the motivational efficacy of moral judgements. Other theorists suggest that pejoratives like ‘idiot’ present a better model than slurs (Hay 2013).

As the literature develops hybrid views get more complicated and subtle. Close relatives of these theories claim to elude objections directed at each of the above variants and yet the resulting theories are probably best understood as developments of these simpler variants (Schroeder 2013;Toppinen 2013).

Perhaps hardest to characterize as a species of non-cognitivism are the claims of several recent theorists who suggest that non-cognitivism is best understood as a metasemantic theory. The claim seems to be that non-cognitivism is a theory not about the meaning of moral sentences or about the contents of moral thoughts, but rather a story at a different level about how sentences and thoughts come to have these meanings or contents (Charlow 2015; Chrisman 2012, 2016; Pérez Carballo 2014; Ridge 2014; Silk 2014 at 217). One motivation for the view seems to be that it allows noncognitivists to take advantage of ordinary semantic theories and hence avoid the embedding problem. There isn’t yet a lot of literature disputing the idea, but Alwood (2016) expresses some skepticism about the advantages of the approach. It is at least worth thinking about which of the standard motivations for non-cognitivism in ethics support the view when it is construed as a metasemantic theory. It is also worth thinking about exactly how the view contrasts with cognitivist views on which attitudes can play a role in determining the content of certain expressions, either generally or in particular occurrences. Chances are the literature will take up such questions in the near future and subsequent versions of this entry will say more about the developments to come.

3. Motivations for Non-cognitivism

Non-cognitivism is motivated by a number of considerations, most rooted in metaphysics, the philosophy of mind or epistemology.

3.1 The Open Question Argument

At the beginning of the 20th Century, G. E. Moore’s open question argument convinced many philosophers that moral statements were not equivalent to statements made using non-moral or descriptive terms. For any non-moral description of an action or object it seemed that competent speakers could without confusion doubt that the action or object was appropriately characterized using a moral term such as ‘good’ or ‘right’. The question of whether the action or object so described was good or right was always open, even to competent speakers. Furthermore, in the absence of any systematic theory to explain the possibility of synthetic as opposed to analytic identity claims, many were convinced that this showed that moral properties could not be identified with any natural (or supernatural) properties. Thus Moore and others concluded that moral properties such as goodness were irreducible sui generis properties, not identical to natural properties (Moore 1903, 15).

The non-naturalists, however, had neglected another option consistent with the thought underlying the open question argument. Perhaps moral predicates did not refer to properties at all, and perhaps their meaning was not analyzable in non-moral descriptive terms not because they referred to irreducibly moral properties but because, despite appearances, they were not referring expressions at all. In other words, semantic nonfactualism about moral terms entails that questions of the sort highlighted by Moore could not be closed by any amount of competence with the expressions used to ask them because the expressions in question are not in fact equivalent. Thus non-cognitivists could argue that moral expressions used in such open questions did not function to represent anything or to predicate any property and as such were not equivalent to any descriptive or referring expressions. Rather they merely served to convey emotion (Ogden and Richards 1923, 125). Speakers to whom such questions seemed open were tacitly aware of this difference in function and hence not in a position to equate moral expressions with descriptive expressions.

Contemporary philosophers recognize the possibility that sentences that express identities might be synthetic as opposed to analytic or true by definition. We can discover that water is the same stuff as H2O without being able to infer it from the meanings of the terms involved (Kripke 1972; Putnam 1975a). And descriptive naturalists about morality have pointed out that the openness of Moore’s question to competent speakers does not rule out the possibility of securing the identity of a moral property with a naturalistic property through empirical discoveries that do not rely on the expressions in question having the same meaning (Boyd 1988). Yet many contemporary defenders of non-cognitivism suggest that the open question argument still provides ammunition for their claims. Even if we cannot infer from the openness of a question that the referents of two terms used to ask that question are distinct, we might still have reason to think that the two expressions do not mean the same thing. Thus non-cognitivists have used the open question argument to suggest that moral terms contain a normative element completely lacking in descriptive terms and which should be cashed out along the lines that the non-cognitivists favor.

The open question argument can be seen as providing independent support for what is sometimes called Hume’s Law – the claim that one can never validly deduce an ‘ought’ from an ‘is’ (Hume 1888, 469). According to Hume’s Law, no set of premises consisting entirely of non-moral descriptive statements is sufficient to entail a moral or normative conclusion. The non-cognitivist is in a position to explain this, insofar as her positive proposal for the functioning of moral terms will suggest they do more than merely describe the world. She will say that moral terms essentially express a positive attitude, or function to commend. Purely descriptive terms do not. Nothing can be the conclusion of a valid argument which is not already implicit in the premises. Thus descriptive claims cannot entail the extra expressive or imperatival component that according to the non-cognitivist is part of the meaning of moral terms (Hare 1952, 32–49).

There are of course many ways to resist these arguments. Perhaps moral expressions are analytically equivalent to naturalistic expressions, but these analyticities are themselves not obvious even to competent speakers (Lewis 1989, 129). This may be because no analyticities are obvious, or it may be because moral analyses in particular are especially complex. One moral that could be drawn from the history of Twentieth Century analytic philosophy is that if there are any analyticities, competent speakers can question them. This is the paradox of analysis. If any definition can be questioned by a competent speaker, and we think there are at least some definitions sufficient to underwrite analytic truths, then the mere fact that a speaker can doubt a candidate analysis may not tell against that analysis. An equivalence could be analytic because competent speakers tacitly respect it, for the most part acting as if the equivalence is true (Lewis 1989, 130). It has been suggested that moral concepts are role concepts analogous to the concepts of various mental states as conceived by functionalists. The idea is that commonsense morality embodies a theory of morality which specifies the ways in which various moral properties (rightness, wrongness, goodness, badness, fairness, etc.) are related to each other and to other properties. When we put all of the claims of the commonsense theory together it specifies a role that each property must play in terms of the other properties it relates to. The role concept so-specified for each term might then be the concept of the referent of that term (Jackson and Pettit 1995). If so we should expect such concepts to be quite complex. And their complexity might make it hard to recognize the adequacy of any analysis, even for speakers who tacitly respect the equivalence so defined.

Relatedly, some theorists have wanted to resist Hume’s Law, arguing that one can in fact validly draw normative or moral conclusions from purely descriptive premises (Foot 1958–9; Searle 1964). It is actually quite difficult to find an adequate formulation that is immune to counter-example, although many theorists suspect there is nonetheless something right about Hume’s claim (Humberstone 1996).

There may be a problem for those more sophisticated forms of non-cognitivism according to which moral terms have both descriptive and prescriptive or expressive meaning when these are coupled with reliance on the Open Question Argument. Suppose that the postulated extra expressive or prescriptive component in moral terms explains why competent speakers would not equate moral terms with descriptive analyses of them and that it also explains why we cannot validly infer a moral conclusion from non-moral premises. If moral terms have descriptive meaning in addition to their non-cognitive element one should be able to validly argue in the other direction. The problem is that competent speakers are just as likely to wonder about the validity of such inferences as they are to wonder about those going from descriptive premises to normative conclusions. If the openness of such questions to competent speakers is sufficient to refute claims of meaning equivalence, it should here refute theories which include descriptive meanings in an otherwise non-cognitive analysis. If the arguments that lead non-cognitivists to postulate descriptive meaning are sufficiently compelling it seems they should not rely on the open question argument to support their views. Woods (2015) presses a related worry against even non-hybrid non-cognitivist theories. If the conventional function of moral terms is to express attitudes, it should seem Moore-paradoxical (that is pragmatically incoherent) to deny that one approves of the things one believes good or right. But many such claims don’t seem pragmatically incoherent.

3.2 Naturalism

Naturalism in metaphysics has been on the ascendancy for some time, though it is often somewhat difficult to ascertain exactly what the position amounts to. Metaphysical naturalists claim that there are only natural properties, in some good sense of the term ‘natural’. Usually naturalism is taken to rule out at least the existence of supernatural entities or properties. And one standard way that naturalists have defended their position has been to reduce seemingly mysterious properties or objects which might appear to be non-natural to more familiar purportedly natural properties. That is, they have tried to show that these objects or entities are nothing over and above some set of natural properties or objects appropriately arranged. One strategy is to identify seemingly suspect properties with natural properties, either via connecting definitions or through synthetic identities. In this way the seemingly suspect properties can be allowed into the naturalist’s ontology without undermining the commitment to naturalism. Many naturalists have taken this approach to moral properties (Firth 1952; Railton 1986; Boyd 1988).

Non-cognitivism is not a form of reductive naturalism about the contents of moral judgments, beliefs and sentences. It does not equate the property seemingly predicated in such judgments with any natural property, precisely because it denies that the (primary) function of such expressions is to predicate properties. But in another good sense non-cognitivists are naturalists. They offer a reduction of the attitude of accepting a moral judgment to a perfectly naturalistic sort of attitude such as the attitude of approval or disapproval. And they do not postulate any properties which cannot be reduced to natural properties. Thus another motivation for accepting non-cognitivism has been naturalism. If someone doubts the prospects for reducing moral properties to natural properties (perhaps under the influence of the open question argument), they need not concede that there are any extra-natural or supernatural properties. One can simply reinterpret even the moral judgments one accepts as predicating no properties at all. Or, as with the more sophisticated versions of non-cognitivism, one can allow them to predicate natural properties and argue that the appearance that they do something other than this is due to the additional expressive component in their meaning. One’s naturalism will then not commit one to giving up moral judgments or reducing moral properties to natural properties (Ayer 1952, 106–7).

3.3 Motivational Internalism and the Action-guiding Character of Moral Judgments

Many non-cognitivists have argued for their theories based on motivational internalist premises. Motivational internalists believe that there is some sort of conceptual or necessary connection between moral judgments on the one hand and motivations to act on the other. The nature of the connection is a matter of some dispute and theorists have suggested and refuted a variety of candidates (Hare 1952, 20; Brink 1989, 37ff.; Smith 1994, 60ff; Darwall 1997). Non-cognitivists have often supported their theory by arguing from versions of judgment internalism, which postulate a necessary connection between accepting a moral judgment on the one hand and being motivated to act on it on the other (Stevenson 1937; Hare 1952; Blackburn 1998; Gibbard 1990). This sort of internalism is controversial, so that leading non-cognitivists have had both to defend judgment internalism and to argue that their favored theory should be accepted as the best explanation of the sort of internalism they attempt to vindicate.

You can find defenses of various versions of judgment internalism which support somewhat different but still necessary connections between accepting or uttering a moral judgment on the one hand and being motivated on the other. One version makes the connection very tight – if one accepts a judgment one is motivated to do what it says we ought to do. Others are looser, requiring motivation only in rational persons (Korsgaard 1986; Smith 1994, 61) or perhaps in normal members of a community (Dreier 1990; Horgan & Timmons 1992; 164–5). Depending on which version a theorist defends, different versions of non-cognitivism can explain the necessity of the connection, although not all versions can be easily explained using non-cognitivist resources. The tightest connection which requires motivation in anyone who accepts the judgment that some action is right is rather well explained by a very simple version of emotivism on which a judgment that some action is right conventionally expresses one’s approval of that action. One can only sincerely use that expression when one has the attitude just as one can only sincerely cheer for some team or person if one has a positive attitude towards them. Sincere utterance requires motivation, that’s part and parcel of this sort of emotivist theory.

On the other hand, this easy explanation of the strong internalist thesis has liabilities. Such strong internalism may be too strong to be credible insofar as it rules out amoralists – those who accept moral judgments without being at all motivated to do what they recommend. Such people may be possible and even actual (Brink 1989, 46; Svavarsdóttir 1999). If so, simple emotivism of the sort described is refuted because the sincerity conditions for making the judgment require the motivation not present in the amoralist. Examples such as the amoralist have led internalists to posit more moderate, defeasible, but still necessary connections between moral judgments and motivation (Korsgaard 1986; Dreier 1990; Smith 1994). More complex versions of non-cognitivism can make the connection with actual motivation looser and thereby withstand the amoralist challenge. But not every more moderate internalist principle will be easily explained by a corresponding non-cognitivist theory. Some versions of moderate internalism require that rational people will be motivated in accordance with their own moral judgments (Smith 1994, 61). It isn’t clear what version of non-cognitivism can take advantage of this sort of defeasible connection. On any theory where the acceptance of a moral judgment is constituted by the acceptance of a non-cognitive attitude, it should be the case that those who genuinely hold the judgment have the attitude. This should apply to the irrational as well as the rational.

Other responses to the amoralist are available consistent with non-cognitivism. One such response is not to accept a defeasible version of internalism, but rather to claim that amoralists do not have genuine moral beliefs. What an amoralist expresses when she makes a moral claim that she is disinclined to honor involves using the moral predicate in an “inverted commas sense” – a sense which alludes to the value judgments of others without itself expressing such a judgment (Hare 1952, 145–6). Many cognitivists have not found this a persuasive characterization of all amoralists (Brink 1989, 46–7). Alternatively, non-cognitivists can point out that a sentence can conventionally express an attitude even when uttered by people who don’t have the requisite attitude. For example, one can apologize without feeling sorry or actually caring about what is at issue (Joyce 2002). But it is not so easy to see how to carry this over to the treatment of accepting a moral judgment in the absence of uttering a moral sentence. We would like there to be grounds to attribute the belief or acceptance of a moral judgment to those who are silent on some grounds, and it isn’t clear exactly what resources are available to a non-cognitivist if it doesn’t involve being in some attitudinal state. Even if one can sincerely apologize without having any special feeling or attitude as one does so, it seems we would not say of a person that they were sorry unless they had such an attitude. Thus the analogy with apology only takes us so far.

Hare’s most famous argument for the action-guiding character of moral judgments is the Missionaries and the Cannibals Argument. He suggests an example in which our translation practices seem to indicate that when we use moral words from our home language to translate words and concepts from another language, what is most important to us is that native users of the language or concepts generally use them to guide choice and action (Hare 1952, 148–9). If this is right, it establishes a connection of the following form: Necessarily the acceptance of a moral judgment will normally incline society members to do what is recommended by that judgment. This version will require an intention to act or something similar in most people much of the time, but it will not require such an intention from everybody all of the time. The argument thus supports a version of moderate internalism. And, according to Hare, people who utter general commands that are directed at themselves will normally but not invariably act in accordance with those commands (Hare 1952, 169). So this much of prescriptivism fits with the sort of internalism that Hare’s arguments support. But, insofar as Hare also suggests that accepting a command directed at oneself requires an intention to act accordingly (Hare 1952, 20), he seems committed to a closer connection between moral judgment and motivating states than the Missionaries and Cannibals Argument vindicates.

Thus far we have been considering internalism as a reason to accept non-cognitivism based on a sort of inference to the best explanation. Insofar as non-cognitivism can explain the connection between normative or moral judgments and motivation we have some reason to accept it. But the explanations so far have relied on the positive part of non-cognitivism – the part that connects the meanings of moral terms to commendation or the expression of attitudes. The denial of cognitivism so far has played no role. Since the expressivist or prescriptivist component of non-cognitivist theories does not by itself entail the denial of cognitivism, a cognitivist could take them on board and explain a species of internalism just as non-cognitivists do (Copp 2001).

There is, however, a popular non-cognitivist strategy for arguing that they are uniquely placed to explain judgment internalism. This strategy proceeds from the Humean idea that belief alone is incapable of motivating action. The Humean Theory of Motivation, as it has come to be known, postulates that motives must always be composed of desires for some end, possibly along with some relevant means-ends belief (Hume 1888, 413; Smith 1987). The theory is supposed to rule out any state of mind which both qualifies as a cognitive state and which would be sufficient to motivate action by itself without supplementation from some independent desire. If moral judgments necessarily motivate, even in the absence of further desires, the theory seems to entail that they cannot be genuine beliefs. They must be conative rather than cognitive states, or at the very least be composites to which the non-cognitive component is essential. Even if beliefs are also constituents of the judgment, those beliefs will not be identical to it, since they can persist in the absence of motivation while the moral judgments necessitate motives (Blackburn 1998, 97–100).

This argument too can be resisted by cognitivists. It presupposes a particularly strong version of internalism. If the nature of the necessary connection between moral judgments and motives is of a defeasible kind, it will be possible for someone to accept the judgment while remaining unmotivated (Korsgaard 1986; Dreier 1990; Smith 1994). And even a stronger version of judgment internalism might be consistent with various subjectivist cognitivist theories, especially those which relativize the truth of moral judgments to individual agents. Such theories can make the truth conditions for the judgments include the presence of certain attitudes in the speaker and claim that speakers are highly accurate in tracking that part of their truth conditions (Harman 1978; Dreier 1990.). Furthermore, despite its lofty pedigree, the Humean Theory of Motivation is itself subject to dispute (Bromwich 2010; Dancy 1996; Darwall 1983; Nagel 1970; McDowell 1981; Swartzer 2013, 2018; van Roojen 1995, 2002).

3.4 Supervenience

It is relatively common ground among moral theorists that moral properties supervene on non-moral properties. Two items cannot differ in their moral properties without differing in some non-moral property as well. Or to put the point in terms more suited to the non-cognitivist, virtually all agree that it is inappropriate to treat two items as morally distinguishable without believing that they are also distinguishable in some other way. If two actions are otherwise indistinguishable, labeling one as good thereby commits one to labeling the other as good. Often this thesis is put as the claim that moral properties supervene on natural properties, and this has the advantage of leaving open the possibility of the moral properties turning out to be among the natural properties.

Some non-cognitivists have argued that this seemingly uncontroversial datum supports their theories against rival alternatives. Hare seems to have introduced the term ‘supervenience’ to the philosophical literature (Hare 1952, 145) and he suggested that his own theory, universal prescriptivism, was uniquely placed to explain it. Insofar as moral prescriptions were by their nature universal they would prescribe or proscribe any action which was sufficiently similar to the action up for evaluation. Thus Hare included supervenience as one of the phenomena that any adequate metaethical theory should explain and he counted it as a point in favor of his theory that it did so. But the feature of his theory that did the explanatory work was not its non-cognitivism – rather it was that it required the judgments to be universal in the ways he specified. In fact, Hare himself suggested that the supervenience of moral judgments on descriptive features was part and parcel of these judgments having a secondary descriptive meaning (Hare 1963, 7–22).

Other contemporary expressivist theories can use a similar approach to explaining supervenience. Take a version of expressivism which says that a moral judgment that such and such an action is wrong predicates a nonmoral property of that action and at the same time expresses disapproval of that property. This too will explain supervenience, insofar as the speaker will be committed by that moral judgment to disapproving of anything else with that property. Gibbard’s (1990) world-norm pair apparatus in which the judgments express attitudes towards norms that pick out actions by their natural features will generate the same sort of result. (His 2003 update inherits this feature as will be explained below.) Thus each of these theorists is able to explain supervenience. Many cognitivist theories can also explain supervenience. Reductive naturalists get the supervenience of the moral on the natural for free. If moral properties just are natural properties, there should be no surprise if two items cannot differ in their moral properties without also differing in their natural properties (Dreier 1993). And while nonreductive naturalists and even nonnaturalists may have to offer explanations, it isn’t obvious that these explanations must fail. (McPherson ; van Roojen 2023) We might thus conclude that supervenience does not favor either cognitivism or non-cognitivism.

Simon Blackburn, however, argues that the phenomenon of supervenience especially favors non-cognitivism. According to Blackburn, it is not just the simple fact that moral properties supervene on nonmoral properties that needs to be explained. Nor is it just that appropriate moral predication must supervene on nonmoral predication, to put the point in a way that does not beg the question against non-cognitivism. It is rather to explain how honoring the supervenience constraint can be a requirement of linguistic competence, even while there is no analytic entailment from nonmoral claims to moral claims. In other words, what needs explaining is how supervenience can be a conceptual requirement even while there is no analytic equivalence between moral properties and any non-moral property. Blackburn thinks that we require such an explanation even if there are metaphysically or nomically necessary connections between moral and nonmoral terms or properties. For, he thinks, it is hard to see how such nomic or metaphysical connections could justify the analytic status of the supervenience thesis. People can be ignorant of nomic necessities for it is an empirical matter what natural laws govern our world. And they might be ignorant of certain metaphysical necessities while knowing all the truths about the meanings of their terms. So these necessities cannot justify the apriori and analytic status that the supervenience requirement has. Or to put the same point differently, a requirement to recognize some constraint that one should recognize merely in virtue of having competence with the appropriate terms cannot be explained by citing a fact which mere linguistic competence does not put one in a position to recognize.

Blackburn’s favored explanation of the difference in status between the two claims is roughly as follows: Moral judgments must supervene on judgments regarding natural properties because it is the point of moral judgments “to guide desires and choices among the natural features of the world” (Blackburn 1993, 137). Since this sort of explanation makes reference to our purposes in using moral terms rather than to an independent realm of moral fact, Blackburn thinks it supports a quasi-realist account rather than a straightforward realist theory. He goes on to suggest that because the explanation relies on facts about what beliefs can coexist with linguistic competence, there is “no further inference to a metaphysical conclusion” (Blackburn 1993, 143).

It should be obvious that Blackburn’s argument is not entirely independent of the arguments for non-cognitivism that we have already surveyed. The claim that there is no analytic entailment from any natural property to any moral property is simply Hume’s Law – a datum often supported through use of the open question argument. Thus any reductive naturalist about moral properties will deny that premise of the argument along with the validity of the open question argument. (Dreier 1993) The thought that an explanation which involves the practical purposes to which moral judgments are put must favor non-cognitivism over cognitivism might well depend on accepting a Humean division between inert beliefs and motivating desires. Anti-Humeans just think that action-guiding purposes can be served by beliefs concerning genuine properties (McDowell 1981; Bromwich 2010; Swartzer 2013, 2018; van Roojen 1995). And cognitivists who agree that the analytic status of supervenience needs explanation will not need to deny that such explanations require claims about what the competent can believe; on many understandings of analyticity, analytic claims just are claims the linguistically competent must accept (Dreier 1993).

Allan Gibbard (2003) has recently proposed a new argument for the supervenience of normative judgements grounded in his fact-prac world apparatus as a representational device for capturing normative judgments. Given that account of the content of normative judgments it will turn out to be necessary that those with moral attitudes are committed to normative judgments which treat descriptively identical items the same for purposes of planning. This is because the plans themselves must be formulated so as to individuate circumstances of action using “recognitional” concepts. Thus any two recognitionally identical circumstances will yield the same plan of action. If Gibbard’s reasons for thinking that plans must be formulated in recognitional terms are cogent, this result would allow the theory to explain the relevant phenomenon of supervenience. It does not, however, show that a cognitivist theory might not do just as well on its own terms.

3.5 The Distinctiveness of Moral Disagreement?

Theorists sometimes present the motivations for noncognitivism as rooted in the distinctive nature of moral disagreement. For example, Gibbard (1990) begins with a puzzle about how (for instance) two people who both fully understand the prisoner’s dilemma scenario can still disagree over what it is rational for someone in such a situation to do. It doesn’t seem that they are asking after the meaning of the word ‘rational’ yet there also doesn’t seem to be any descriptive fact over which they disagree. And Stevenson (1944) begins his book by distinguishing the kind of disagreement in play when two people disagree in their ordinary beliefs from “disagreements in attitude” which involve conative clash. Having made the distinction he suggests that moral disagreements involve both, and then uses that diagnosis to motivate his own noncognitivism as developed in the rest of the book.

While each of these theorists highlights disagreement, it seems that disagreement is only part of what generates the argument for noncognitivism. On one reading, Gibbard’s argument seems to tacitly involve one of the assumptions that makes the Open Question Argument seem compelling – that property identities are fully transparent to competent thinkers. Our confidence that the dispute over what is rational in the prisoner’s dilemma dispute is not over a descriptive fact seems rooted in the stipulation that all the descriptive facts are clear to both thinkers. But that stipulation only settles the matter if we further assume that the identity of rationality and the property picked out the relevant description (if indeed there is such and identity) will be transparent to the parties to the dispute. So this reading of Gibbard’s argument will have it stand or fall with the Open Question Argument.

On a second reading of Gibbard’s argument it emphasizes the distinctive practical or action-guiding nature of moral concepts. What any purely descriptive account of the dispute leaves out is that the parties disagree about what to do when in a prisoner’s dilemma. This version of Gibbard’s point aligns with Stevenson’s – there is a kind of practical disagreement that purely cognitive analyses of moral arguments leave out. If that is the point of adverting to disagreement we are back with the motivating concerns discussed in section 3.3. So it may be best to just think of disagreement as highlighting these prior ideas.

4. Problems, Objections and Response Strategies

One strategy of objection to non-cognitivism is to find fault with the main motivating ideas. We have already surveyed many of these in the course of discussing the arguments for non-cognitivism. We now turn to objections resting on the content of the theory rather than its motivations.

4.1 The Embedding Problem

Non-cognitivism as it is often presented is incomplete. It gives us an account of the meanings of moral expressions in free standing predicative uses, and of the states of mind expressed when they are so used. But the identical expressions can be used in more complex sentences, sentences which embed such predications. Thus far we have not considered what the expressions might mean when so used. We say things such as the following:

It is true that lying is wrong.
Lying is not wrong.
I wonder whether lying is wrong.
I believe that lying is wrong.
Fred believes that lying is wrong.
Is lying wrong?
If lying is wrong, he will be sure to do it.
If lying is wrong, then so is misleading truth-telling.

So, in addition to their analyses of unembedded predication, non-cognitivists owe us an account of the meanings of more complex sentences or judgments such as these. Of course there are some desiderata we would like an adequate account to fulfill. (1) One is compositionality; the meaning of a complex sentence embedding a moral claim should be a function of the meaning of its parts so as to explain the ease with which speakers can understand novel normative sentences. (2) Another is that it should preserve and explain the logical relations between moral judgements and other judgements which embed them, at least for central cases. And (3), we want the account not to require implausible verdicts in attributing attitudes to people who use the sentences. For example, if a non-cognitivist says the meaning of ‘Lying is wrong’ is to express disfavor towards lying, that does not yet provide a good explanation of the attitude expressed by the very same words used in many embedded contexts. When those words occur in the antecedent of a conditional, or when a person says, ‘I wonder if lying is wrong’ they they are typically not being used to express such disapproval. The point here is not that these desiderata cannot be satisfied. Leading contemporary non-cognitivists have all tried to provide accounts. As it turns out, the task is difficult and generates much controversy.

Geach thought that the second and third desiderata would be especially hard to accomplish simultaneously. Normally we believe that the status of an argument as valid depends, at least in part, on the words not shifting in meaning as we move from premise to premise. But the simplest story of the meaning of moral terms, that they are devices for expressing pro and con attitudes, seems then to require that they mean something else when embedded in the antecedents of conditionals. Consider the following example from Geach (1965, 463):

(P1) If tormenting the cat is bad, getting your little brother to do it is bad
(P2) Tormenting the cat is bad.
Ergo, getting your little brother to torment the cat is bad.

The argument is valid. But if the entire meaning of ‘tormenting the cat is bad’ in the second premise is well explained by saying that it is suited for use in expressing disapproval of tormenting the cat, then that meaning cannot be the same as the meaning it has in the first premise (which one might accept even if one approves of tormenting cats). This doesn’t show that the expression is not being used emotively in the second premise; a descriptivist can agree to that. But it does indicate that more will need to be said to explain what is going on. For straightforwardly descriptive arguments of the same form, the explanation of why the argument is valid relies on the idea that the phrase in the antecedent has a constant meaning that it represents both unembedded and embedded. This is what Geach has called The Frege Point: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, 449). As Geach saw it, if content did not remain constant across embedded and unembedded occurrences of predicative moral sentences, we would routinely commit a fallacy of equivocation in arguments. (It is due to Geach’s invocation of Frege in this context that the embedding problem is often called the Frege-Geach problem. Searle 1962 independently raises a version of the same objection and some credit W. D. Ross (1939, 34–38) with an earlier yet statement of the objection.)

Semantic nonfactualism, the non-cognitivist commitment to the view that moral judgments do not express propositions or predicate properties, rules out one simple way of explaining matters. (But see the discussion of hybrid theories below and in the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies.) If there is no proposition expressed in normal predicative uses of moral expressions we eliminate one candidate for a constant element that generates relations of implication with other expressions embedding the same form of words. Arguably we need some other candidate to provide the commonality. As Geach noted, it isn’t plausibly the attitude expressed by the a free-standing sentence since this feature doesn’t always survive embedding as we saw. Perhaps it might be some predictable function of this attitude. That would serve the goal of providing a compositional semantics for the terms in question.

It isn’t just that semantic nonfactualism eliminates a candidate for the constant element uniting embedded and unembedded uses of the same normative expression. Such nonfactualism also serves to complicate the semantics, because it eliminates a straightforward and easy way of explaining how different beliefs can be inconsistent and how one belief can commit one to another. On a standard model for belief in general, belief content is propositional and two beliefs are inconsistent when their contents – the propositions they are directed at – are inconsistent. And one belief logically commits one to another when the content of the first entails the second. Those two ideas, plus an account of what it is for contents – that is propositions – to be inconsistent is all you need to explain the logical relations among beliefs. It isn’t even really important to this general point that the contents be propositions. The point is that if you treat all beliefs as inheriting their logical properties from the logical properties of their contents in this way, you get a relatively simple story about attitudinal inconsistency and commitment.

Once you say that ordinary beliefs and moral beliefs represent different types of attitude towards their contents (if they have contents at all) you can’t any longer tell the simple story. This remains so even if the theory can allow moral attitudes to have contents in some sense and even if these contents are the same kind of thing as the contents of ordinary beliefs. That’s because the different relations to those contents (taking different attitudes towards them) will need to be taken into account. The resulting theory will need more complicated inconsistency and inference-licensing rules. I’ll use R. M. Hare’s (1952) logic of phrastics and neustics to illustrate. Because it furthers my purpose in providing this example I’m going to assume that sincere speech acts using moral terms express attitudes and that these attitudes are what we attribute when say they believe something about morality. This may be more than Hare was committed to himself.

Hare thought we could model the logic of speech acts by employing one element that represented a possible way things might be (the phrastic) and a second element that in effect gave instruction for how to interpret the point of the representation (the neustic). For our purposes here we can think of the first element as the contents of the attitude expressed by the speech act and it would not distort the theory too much to say they are propositions. On this way of presenting things, several different speech acts expressing a number of different attitudes will all involve the same phrastic. The differences between them will be represented by differences in the neustic. The belief that P will be expressed by a speech act which is represented by a neustic that reflects the status of assertion and a phrastic that represents P. A question about whether P is the case will be represented by the same phrastic, but a different neustic – the one that represents the speech act as a question rather than an assertion. The sentence which expresses the thought that P is good (say) will also employ this same phrastic. What distinguishes it from the first two is once again the neustic which will reflect that this judgement is a universal prescription to bring about P. This means that we cannot compute the logical compatibility or incompatibility of two judgements by noting the compatibility or incompatibility of their phrastics which we are treating as their contents. The assertion of P and the attitude it expresses is different from the assertion that P is good and the attitude it expresses. Standard semantic theory captures this by assigning these judgements different contents. Within the theory which treats the phrastic as the content, the difference must be captured by assigning them different neustics as a reflection that they’re supposed to be different kinds of speech acts and to express different kinds of attitudes. There isn’t yet a problem with that. But insofar as the judgements clearly have different consistency conditions and involve different logical commitments the resulting logic must now include principles that allow differences in attitude type to matter to consistency and inconsistency.

Hare was aware of the point. And if we were dealing with only a few different types of attitude and corresponding expressive speech act it should be no difficulty at all. But once we introduce new sentences joining the terms we have so far with logical connectives we are likely to need to postulate yet further attitude types and to need further principles to capture their logical properties. Such complex sentences express attitudes that don’t reduce to the attitudes which would be expressed by either conjunct (Schroeder 2008c, 49). It would thus be wrong to equate the attitude expressed with either accepting the one attitude or accepting the other. Relatedly, a speech act “asserting” a disjunction with one normative disjunct and one non-normative disjunct should be a new kind of speech act. It doesn’t universally prescribe anything, nor (on the theory we’re working with) does it assert anything. And similarly for the attitude expressed by that speech act. It will be a new type of state of mind. So we’ll need a new sort of neustic to capture the kind of speech act this is. And we’ll need additional rules to tell us about the logic of speech act types represented by those neustics.

Schroeder (2008b, 2008c) dubs the distinction between inconsistencies that involve one attitude-type directed towards inconsistent contents, A-type inconsistencies and contrasts them with B-type inconsistencies which postulate inconsistencies that stem from incoherences between the attitude types in conjuction with their contents. For example approving of a proposition and disapproving of the same proposition is inconsistent (if it is) not in virtue of directing one and the same attitude at inconsistent propositions, but rather because two allegedly incompatible attitude-types are directed at the same proposition. And he notes that the clearest examples of genuine inconsistency – beliefs in contradictories and intentions to pursue inconsistent courses of action – seem to be A-type. He further suggests that this would be a reason to prefer an A-type model if non-cognitivists could construct one.

Non-cognitivists have developed various ingenious strategies for constructing a theory that preserves the intuitive logical relations between normative attitudes, non-normative attitudes and various mixed attitudes, along with the sentences that express them. We will briefly survey some main variants below. For a more thorough survey see the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies, which can be read in place of the remainder of section 4.1.

Much of the recent innovation in developing non-cognitivist theories is motivated by a desire to address the embedding problem. In what remains of this section we will briefly survey three differing approaches to the task, which may also be combined. These are (1) developing a logic of the sentences by explaining how that logic falls out of logical relations among the attitudes they express, (2) exploiting minimalism with regard to truth and related notions to provide an account of certain locutions, and (3) allowing the descriptive semantic component postulated by hybrid expressivist theories to explain the logical relations among normative sentences and attitudes.

4.1.1 A logic of attitudes

The idea behind a logic of attitudes is to change the normal order of explanation to explain why normative sentences and attitudes bear the logical relations that they do to other sentences and attitudes. As noted above, standard cognitivist accounts of a domain of discourse will explain the consistency or inconsistency of states of mind by citing the consistency or inconsistency of that state’s content, that is what it represents. The belief that dogs howl is inconsistent with the belief that dogs don’t howl because their contents (that dogs do or don’t howl) are inconsistent with one another. And similarly for the sentences expressing those beliefs. Since noncognitivists don’t postulate such representational contents they can’t deploy that explanation. But they might still be able to do justice to the fact that normative judgments and sentences stand in logical relations to one another if they can explain how the judgments themselves stand in certain logical relations to to one another and then go on to explain that the sentences are inconsistent just because they express judgments that are inconsistent.

One such approach has been to suggest that the complex moral or normative judgments are higher order attitudes aimed at the judgements that would be expressed by the sentences which they embed. These higher order attitudes might either be complex beliefs (Blackburn 1971) or further non-cognitive judgments (Blackburn 1984) expressed by the corresponding complex sentences. The hope is that these judgments will have rational connections to the other judgments that are likely to play a role in valid arguments. If all goes well, a kind of pragmatic incoherence or irrationality will be involved when someone accepts the judgments of a valid argument so analyzed while at the same time rejecting the conclusion. Such a speaker would be in a state similar to those uttering sentences of the sort that feature in Moore’s paradox, such as ‘It is raining but I don’t believe that it is.’

A simple example of this sort of approach comes from Blackburn. Conditionals express higher order attitudes towards accepting certain conjunctions of attitudes. “If lying is wrong, telling your little brother to lie is wrong,” (when sincerely uttered) expresses approval of making disapproval of getting one’s brother to lie “follow upon” disapproval of lying.

…Anyone holding this pair [the above attitude, plus the attitude expressed by ‘lying is wrong’] must hold the consequential disapproval: he is committed to disapproving of getting little brother to lie, for if he does not his attitudes clash. He has a fractured sensibility which cannot itself be an object of approval. (Blackburn 1984, 195)

Logical entailments involving moral judgments are explained as follows: A constellation of attitudes which includes the attitudes expressed by the conditional and by the seemingly assertive premises but not those expressed by the conclusion is irrational, because it goes against the purposes of moral discourse. Somewhat more sophisticated ways of developing this strategy can be worked out but the basic idea is well exemplified in this proposal. The logic of attitudes strategy has met with much resistance on the part of cognitivists. One line of thought is that these proposals conflate genuine inconsistency with mere pragmatic incoherence (Hale 1986; Schueler 1988; Brighouse 1990; Zangwill 1992; van Roojen 1996). And non-cognitivists have responded with increasingly more sophisticated proposals about the logic of attitudes, including several proposals that do not employ higher order attitudes (Baker & Woods 2015; Blackburn 1988b; Gibbard 1990, 2003; Horgan and Timmons 2006b; Schroeder 2008a, 2008b, 2008c, Silk 2015). These are discussed in more detail in the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies.

4.1.2 Minimalism

Some have suggested that minimalism or deflationism about truth or truth aptness can allow non-cognitivists to bypass some of the above debates. (Stoljar 1993) A very rough characterization of minimalism about truth will hopefully suffice to explain. Minimalist theories are often presented by contrast with theories of truth according to which truth is some sort of “substantial” relation or property. For example correspondence theories which claim that truth involves a real relation between truth-bearers and reality are often cited as paradigm cases of a substantial theory of truth. Most minimalists about truth suggest that truth is not such a substantial property. Different minimalists formulate their positive claims in somewhat different ways. One version suggests that all you need to know to understand the ‘is true’ locution is that it is appropriate to use it in conjunction with any indicative sentence which is itself appropriate in the context of use. To call a sentence true is just to assert or affirm the sentence (Ramsey 1927). There are other variants besides this one. What we need to note is just that the suggestion helps explain the meaning of normative sentences in only one embedded context, namely the one in which it is embedded along in an ‘is true’ construction. Extensions of this minimalist strategy have attempted to deploy minimal conceptions of other notions such as truth-aptness, proposition (Horwich 1990, 18–22) and more besides to extend the account to normative sentences seeming to employ these notions. The explanations allow noncognitivists to explain our use of terms that seem to express realist commitments. Still it is a further step to conclude that this will enable noncognitivists to use them to do the same explanatory work as realists do when they use those terms. But in fact some minimalists have even claimed that they do. Discussion of those proposals is found in the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies. Some of the points about order of explanation in section 5.2 below are also relevant to the issue of how much work minimalism can really do.

4.1.3 Piggybacking on the Descriptive Content in a Hybrid Theory

We noted earlier that non-cognitivists have long granted to evaluative utterances and thoughts some secondary “descriptive meaning” and that hybrid theorists have gone on to give that descriptive content nearly co-equal status. One motivation for such views is rooted in a strategy for solving the embedding problem: Hybrid theorists hope to explain logical relations among moral judgements by using the descriptive component of meaning to do much of the work. Hybrid theorists have differed over whether the non-cognitive component is expressed semantically by some component of the sentence or pragmatically. Still hybrid theorists tend to agree that the belief contents are part of the semantic values of the sentences that express them (Jackson 1999, Barker 2000; Copp 2001; Ridge 2006a, 2006b, 2014; Boisvert 2008; Copp 2009). This would seem to entail that these sentences are inconsistent with any judgement that a sentence expressing only the belief component would be inconsistent with. Hybrid theorists can thus use the alleged descriptive component of the meanings of moral judgments to generate most of the required logical relations that moral judgements bear to other judgements, supplementing the basic account just enough to account for complications introduced by the non-cognitive component of relevant judgements.

Cognitivists have raised doubts about the adequacy of several of these proposals due to the manner in which the descriptive meaning is determined by many of these theories (van Roojen 2005; Schroeder 2009) and how they can be used to communicate the content they allegedly have (Schroeder 2009). Hybrid theorists have, of course, resisted these complaints (Alm 2007, Ridge 2007; Eriksson 2010). and hybrid theories that take epithets and slurs as their model aren’t subject to the same objections (Copp 2001, 2009; Boisvert 2008). A more thorough discussion of these issues can be found in the supplementary document Embedding Problem Response Strategies.

4.2 The Wishful Thinking Objection, Moral Reasoning, and Moral Uncertainty

A well-known objection to non-cognitivism pays close attention to the distinction between explaining logical relations on the one hand, and explaining the use of moral judgments in reasoning on the other. Even if the embedding problem is solved, so that we know what moral utterances mean and what complex sentences embedding them also mean, we might still think it irrational to reason in accordance with ordinary logical principles applied to such judgments. The basic idea here is that conditionals with moral antecedents and nonmoral consequents should, together with the moral judgment in the antecedent, license acceptance of the consequent. Thus someone who accepts such conditionals would be rational to infer the consequent upon coming to accept the antecedent. But if expressivism is correct, accepting the antecedent just is holding a non-cognitive attitude. Thus the licensed inference is really a form of wishful thinking, for a non-cognitive change of attitude has licensed a change of belief. For example, suppose someone accepts a judgment expressible by saying, “If doing an action is wrong, George will do it.” Normally we think that it would be rational for that person to infer the belief that George will hit Sam upon coming to accept that hitting Sam is wrong. But according to non-cognitivism, coming to accept that hitting Sam is wrong is just a change of non-cognitive attitude, and it can seem wrong to think that a change in such attitudes can rationalize a change in belief. It looks like the non-cognitivist is committed to approving of something analogous to wishful thinking. That is they believe something, not because of a change in their evidence but because of a change in attitude alone (Dorr 2002). Enoch (2003) presents an early response which is criticized in (Schroeder 2011, chapter 9). See also (Budolfson 2011; Lenman 2003; Mabrito 2013;) who generally support the idea that solving the Frege-Geach problem will be sufficient for handling Dorr’s wishful thinking objection. But van Roojen (2019) argues that Dorr is right to want something beyond a solution to Frege-Geach. Logic can rule out certain combinations of belief, but does not on its own tell us which member of a bad combination to get rid of. But the difference between good and bad reasoning may depend on which is retained, and this in turn depends on one’s evidence. Dorr’s argument might then suggest that noncognitivists need to explain how the relevant noncognitive attitudes can relate badly or well to such evidence. And this may contravene Humean arguments for noncognitivism.

Another issue to do with moral reasoning has to do with uncertainty, insofar as we can be uncertain of our moral judgements and this will affect how we reason with them. Michael Smith (2002) argues that non-cognitivists have insufficient resources to distinguish variations in moral certainty from differences in both the perceived importance of what is being judged right or wrong and in the stability of such judgements under the influence of new information. The gradable dimensions of desire seem to be strength and stability. If strength is used to represent importance and stability to capture stability of judgements in the face of new information, desires will lack a dimension to represent the certainty with which the moral judgement is held. Cognitivists, by contrast, can allow perceived importance to be captured by a further belief – the belief that the matter is of a certain importance. So they can let certainty just be a matter of credence and robustness in the face of new evidence be just what it seems. Non-cognitivists, as usual, won’t just concede the point. Rather they will explain how their theories have the resources to make the needed distinctions. Lenman (2003c), Sepielli (2012), Eriksson and Francén Olinder (2016), and Ridge (2020) are responses in this vein. A series of papers and a book by Krister Bykvist and co-authors (Björkholm, Bykvist, & Olson, 2021; Bykvist & Olson 2009, 2012, 2017; MacAskill, Bykvist & Ord 2020) criticizes each of the afformentioned noncognitivist proposals. Finally, Staffel (2019) offers an original account of credence for non-cognitivists and responds to Smith’s argument along the way.

4.3 Non-cognitivism and Relativism

It has seemed obvious to many that non-cognitivism has much in common with various relativist metaethical views. Though non-cognitivists may deny that the truth values of moral judgments are relative to speakers or agents and their attitudes, non-cognitivists do accept a constitutive connection between a speaker’s attitudes and their moral judgements. Specifically, non-cognitivists hold that it is semantically appropriate for a person to utter a moral judgment whenever she wishes to express the relevant non-cognitive attitude. This has led some to suggest that noncognitivists must agree with old fashioned subjectivists about the truth conditions for moral utterances. (Jackson and Pettit 1998; Suikkanen 2009; Peacocke 2004) Many noncognitivists in fact believe that there are few rational constraints on holding the relevant attitudes. And then it is hard to see how consistent moral judgments can be mistaken (Carnap 1937, 30; Hare 1963, 110). Thus if relativism is problematic, it may seem that non-cognitivism inherits the problems. Still, it is worth noting that arguments to this effect import extra premises that noncognitivists do not and need not accept. Semantic appropriateness need not (and should not if expressivists are right) be construed as truth. Expressivists think that it is semantically appropriate to use a moral sentence when one has the attitude that it expresses. This commitment is parallel to the claim that it is semantically appropriate to use “Grass is green” when one believes that grass is green. (Schroeder 2014, see also Barker 2000 and Dreier 2004a) That a cognitivist should agree that this use is appropriate does not commit cognitivists to the claim that the truth of “Grass is green” turns on one’s beliefs.

Non-cognitivists claim that whether or not a moral judgment is mistaken is itself a matter for moral theorizing. A speaker should only call a moral judgment true if he or she accepts that judgment. A speaker who expresses his or her acceptance of relativism in the normal way might say something such as “They’re both saying something true”. This might seem to be expressing commitment to a very deferential moral theory – one according to which each agent should just do what she believes is right. The non-cognitivists who adopt this response argue that this natural interpretation of such claims is correct. What may seem to be a higher level metaethical claim – that no consistent set of moral judgments is mistaken – , is really just another moral judgment and hence one which would be rejected by any moral judge with substantive moral commitments (Blackburn 1998, 296 & 304; Timmons 1999; Horgan and Timmons 2006c). If this line of argument works it will allow non-cognitivism to gain the allegiance of those who wish to deny relativism while giving the motivations that lead to both it and non-cognitivism their due.

4.4 Capturing The Varieties of Normative Thought Within A Non-cognitivist Metaethic

Many think it a desideratum in metaethical theorizing that a candidate theory be consistent with all or most normative theories actually defended by serious normative ethical proponents. This idea has played some role in the debate over the embedding problem insofar as some of the proposals have been inconsistent with substantive positions taken in the debate about the possibility of moral dilemmas (Gibbard 1990, 88; Shea 2024; van Roojen 1996, 324). But even aside from that particular issue, the desideratum can make a good deal of work for the non-cognitivist because of the variety of kinds of moral theory and the variety of differing but allegedly consistent judgments proposed by theorists.

As a simple example, non-cognitivists need to be able to distinguish is that judgements of rightness from judgments of goodness. According to standard non-consequentialist theories, rightness and goodness can come apart. In other words, a right action can be such as not to produce the most goodness. Of course consequentialists deny this, and non-consequentialists who use agent-relative values to specify the rightness of actions can also deny that rightness and goodness come apart in this way (Broome 1991, chapter 1). But even if they are incorrect as a matter of substantive moral philosophy, it would seem that competent moral judges can hold views of the sort described without contradiction. Non-cognitivists would like to be able to give an explanation of this consistent with their analyses. Hence they need a way of distinguishing the psychological states involved in making the two sorts of judgment.

A salient strategy for distinguishing rightness and goodness judgements might be to claim that they attach to different things – rightness to actions and goodness to states of affairs. Still it seems that competent speakers can and do consistently judge certain actions right but not good. A different strategy would be to distinguish varieties of positive attitudes such that one sort involves a kind of approval distinctive of rightness, whereas another involves a kind distinctive of goodness. Yet another method would be to use something like the two step approach Gibbard uses when he analyzes judgments of rightness in terms of judging it rationally appropriate to feel guilt and anger at certain actions. The approval could be all of the same sort, but the objects of approval might be feelings of guilt in one case and feelings of sorrow in the other, even when these feelings are directed at one and the same object such as an action. No doubt there are other available strategies so the problem does not by itself constitute an objection. It can however complicate the task of constructing an adequate non-cognitivist theory, especially since it can impact the force of other objections as with the embedding problem and moral dilemmas noted above.

Section 4.1 above explained the embedding problem, which involves coming up with a compositional theory of meaning for sentences that embed indicative moral sentences. And the discussion in that section was largely focussed on embeddings involving operations such as negation, conjunction, disjunction and conditionalization and the logical adequacy of various accounts of these. We also embed moral and normative sentences in attitude reports involving a variety of attitudes. It seems plausible that noncognitivists should interpret belief reports such as “Jasmine believes that lying is wrong,” to attribute to Jasmine the attitude (which according to expressivism) is expressed by ‘lying is wrong’. But we can attribute other attitudes towards what a cognitivist might think to be the same proposition. Jasmine might wonder whether lying is wrong, or wish it was not wrong. Or be glad that it is. The noncognitivist will need an account of what it is to have these attitudes and this account will need to fit coherently with their account of what it is to believe that lying is wrong. This is what Schroeder (2010 at 84) calls the “Many Attitudes problem”. See also Carr (2015), Köhler (2017), Shiller (2017), Beddor (2020a) and Baker (2021)

Relatedly, noncognitivists will want to distinguish moral judgements from aesthetic judgements and from other favorable or unfavorable attitudes, if only to distinguish genuine disagreement from seeming disagreement. Alex Miller (2003 at 43–51) dubs this the “Specification Problem” and it is taken up by Merli (2008) and Björnsson & McPherson (2014). (Blackburn 1998 at 13–14 professes skepticism that such a division can be made.)

5. Can The Cognitivist/Non-cognitivist Distinction Be Sustained?

Non-cognitivist success in handling the embedding problem and related worries about reasoning would put non-cognitivists in a stronger argumentative position. But some commentators have suggested that success at this endeavor might be a mixed blessing. Success may indicate not that non-cognitivism is the right account of moral judgments, but instead that the contrast with cognitivism is not stark enough to make out a real distinction. Perhaps the distinction between cognitivism and non-cognitivism collapses as non-cognitivist theories are modified to capture all of the phenomena that cognitivists challenge them to explain. While both its advocates and those who argued strenuously against it would likely find themselves somewhat disoriented if this were correct, it does seem that non-cognitivists would be most upset by this result. For their position was defined by denying key components of standard realist positions. If the cognitivist/non-cognitivist dichotomy does not hold up, it would seem to show either that the standard positions were not after all committed to those components, or that those commitments could not be avoided by plausible theories.

Early versions of non-cognitivism did not seem subject to this sort of objection, precisely because they did not worry much about vindicating overall moral practice. Carnap (1937, 30–31) was happy to convict ordinary moral thinking of error. But as non-cognitivists have attempted to make sense of and explain most of the seemingly realist features of moral practice, it might seem hard to sustain the claim of a sharp contrast between factual language on the one hand and normative language on the other. Several challenges based on roughly this idea find a home in the recent literature.

5.1 Sophisticated Non-cognitivism vs. Sophisticated Cognitivist Relativism

One way to push the point is to challenge the non-cognitivist to distinguish non-cognitivism from cognitivist relativism. A speaker relativist is in a particularly good position to highlight the suggestion that there is little difference between sophisticated non-cognitivism and cognitivism. Both speaker relativists and non-cognitivists can say that the appropriateness of a moral judgment depends on a speaker’s attitudes. If the non-cognitivist suggests that moral judgments predicate properties in a secondary way (perhaps to handle embedding), the cognitivist relativist can agree. And the theories can agree that the property predicated is determined as a function of the speaker’s moral attitudes. Thus it may be difficult to say precisely what the difference between the views is (Dreier 1999). However, the responses used to explain why noncognitivism doesn’t immediately entail relativism in section 4.3 would also seem to show that the difficulty can be overcome.

5.2 Minimalism as Undermining Non-cognitivism

Another line of argument with a similar upshot proceeds from minimalism of the sort we have already canvassed. Deflationism about truth or truth-aptness can be used to argue that there is no room for non-cognitivism of the sort that succeeds in vindicating much of moral practice. If there is no more robust understanding of truth conditions than can be secured by minimalism about truth conditions, it will be difficult for the quasi-realist non-cognitivist to make the distinctive negative semantic claim – that moral judgements are never true and not the kind of thing that can be true or false. Simple moral sentences may be truth apt if all there is to having truth conditions is to meet minimal requirements of having a meaningful use, being in the right mood, and combining grammatically with other sentences to yield more complex embeddings. Furthermore, if the minimalist strategy extends to beliefs, so that all there is to being a belief is to be a state of mind expressible by such minimally truth–apt sentences, moral judgements will be beliefs. The quasi-realist program to vindicate as much of ordinary moral practice might thus endanger non-cognitivism when carried to this extreme. Success would leave us with no way to distinguish plausible non-cognitivism from cognitivism.

More concretely, some semantic theorists have proposed that all that is needed to have minimal truth conditions is for a set of judgments to satisfy two constraints: (1) Sentences composed of the relevant expressions must exhibit the syntactic surface features of paradigmatic truth-apt sentences such as those used to express ordinary assertions, and they must embed grammatically in more complex sentences such as conditionals, propositional attitude ascriptions, and so on. (2) Use of these expressions must exhibit a certain amount of discipline so that there are clearly appropriate and inappropriate conditions for using them in sentences of the form noted in the first condition (Boghossian 1990, Wright 1993; Divers and Miller 1994). Normative discourse seems to meet both of these constraints relatively straightforwardly, and this may mean that moral sentences are truth-apt and that some of them are true (Divers and Miller 1994).

Early critics of the collapse argument resisted on the basis of an alleged constitutive connection between truth-aptness and genuinely cognitive states. Such theorists regard it as a platitude about indicative sentences that they are conventionally apt for making assertions and that assertions express beliefs. If belief-expression is one of the criteria for truth-aptness, non-cognitivists will be in a position to use psychological non-cognitivism as a reason to deny that moral judgments are genuinely representational even when they meet minimalist requirements (Jackson, Oppy, Smith 1994). So-called minimal truth conditions can remain part of the quasi-realist program only so long as this is compatible with denying that moral judgements express beliefs.

Partly in response to this move, minimalist defenders of the collapse argument have moved to the notion of minimal belief. They can say that a state of mind is a belief and hence cognitive if and only if it is one expressed by a sentence with truth conditions. Since minimalism secures minimal truth conditions, indicative moral sentences have truth conditions and the states they express are beliefs. Yet if the argument works, quasi-realist non-cognitivism would undermine its own right to employ both of the negative constitutive claims distinctive of non-cognitivism.

Minimalist non-cognitivists have regrouped in various ways. One way is to resist the extension of the minimalist strategy to belief (Sinclair 2007). Another is to distinguish minimal and robust notions of belief and representation. Minimal beliefs would need only to be states of mind expressed in assertions by indicative sentences, while robust beliefs would meet some stronger requirement of representationality (Blackburn 2006). Non-cognitivism would then be committed to the view that moral judgements did not express robust belief (Sinclair 2006; McDonald 2012). The hope would be to contrast the entire minimalist package with robust truth, robust truth-conditionality, and robust belief. Such quasi-realist minimalists would be trying to find truth conditions which are (1) sufficient to make sense of using sentences having such truth-conditions in all of the ways that we use paradigmatically truth-apt sentences, and (2) which still fall short of robust representational truth conditions.

One might be a bit worried about the dialectic. If there are minimal and non-minimal readings of all the distinctive claims that can be used to distinguish cognitivism from non-cognitivism, we may lose our grip on the distinction between the positions (Dreier, 2004b). Dreier (2018) suggests that the distinction between genuinely realist theories (of which nonrelativist cognitivism is an instance) and anti-realist theories (of which noncognitivism and relativism are instances) has to do with the order of explanation. According to anti-realist theories, entities or properties such as proposition, property, truth, truth conditions, and representation are explained by our use of terms for them in our thought and talk. Realists on the other hand think that our thought and talk is explained by these entities or properties. If this can be defended, we can distinguish minimalist and nonminimalist uses of the terms and ideas in question. The distinction between cognitivists and noncognitivists can then be made using the non-minimalist reading. But this may undercut the ability of noncognitivists to use minimalism beyond making sense of seemingly realist linguistic constructions. For minimal propositions, properties, and so on will likely not be suited to do much explanatory work of the sort that robust propositions, properties, and so on are suited for. The discussion continues. (Golub 2017, 2021; Simpson 2018, 2020)

It is in any case controversial whether the minimalist proposal is viable, either for truth conditionality or for belief, let alone for further extensions beyond these (Dreier 2006; Dunaway 2010).

5.3 Non-cognitivist Overreaching and Possible Collapse

One final sort of worry about the distinctiveness of non-cognitivism is worthy of mention. This worry is that if too many domains of discourse are such that they require non-cognitive analysis, the contrast between cognitive and non-cognitive domains on which the view depends will be hard to sustain. Blackburn, for example, suggests quasi-realist approaches not just to moral discourse, but also to modality, causation and probability. One may wonder what he means to deny about these domains that is not also applicable to the rest of our seemingly contentful judgments (Rosen 1998). Huw Price, along with various others, has argued for global expressivism. (Price and O’Leary-Hawthorne 1996; Macarthur and Price 2007; Price 2013, 2015) On such views the notion that any language is representational is called into question. This kind of collapse is in danger of assimilating the putatively cognitive and the putatively non-cognitive from the other direction – by making the former look more like the latter, rather than the other way around as with the worries about minimalism. Even Blackburn himself on occasion expresses worries about this problem (Blackburn 1993, 34), but more commonly he and other non-cognitivists resist the worry by pointing to other domains of discourse which are not amenable to non-cognitivist analysis. Simpson (2020) argues that the most promising version of global expressivism should be understood so as not to contradict local expressivism.

6. Conclusion

Non-cognitivism first came on the scene as a rather starkly drawn alternative to prevailing cognitivist and realist construals of moral discourse. As it developed to enable it to explain features of moral discourse relied on by its critics, the view became more subtle and presented a less stark contrast with realist positions. The main negative claims were often somewhat moderated. For example, the claim that moral judgments had no descriptive meaning evolved into a claim that any such meanings were secondary. The claim that moral judgments could not be true or false became the claim that they could be true or false only in a minimal or deflationary sense. Not all of the shifts have been embraced by all non-cognitivists, but it is fair to say that current versions are more complex and subtle than the theories from which they descend. As a result the arguments for and against the views have gotten rather intricate and even technical. That trend is likely to continue for at least a while longer as ideas from other areas of philosophy are employed to further hone the objections and fill out the responses to them.


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The author thanks Kent Bach, David Clemenson, David Copp, Mark Decker, Jamie Dreier, Jennifer Haley, Reina Hayaki, Leo Iacano, Mark Kalderon, Clayton Littlejohn, Joe Mendola, Michael Ridge, and Mark Schroeder as well as the SEP editors and referees for good advice, helpful discussion and other assistance in preparing and revising this entry. The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas for spotting several typographical errors in this entry.

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