Contemporary Approaches to the Social Contract

First published Sun Mar 3, 1996; substantive revision Mon Sep 27, 2021

The idea of the social contract goes back at least to Protagoras and Epicurus. In its recognizably modern form, however, the idea is revived by Thomas Hobbes and was later developed, in different ways, by John Locke, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Immanuel Kant. After Kant, the idea fell out of favor with political philosophers until it was resurrected by John Rawls. It is now at the heart of the work of a number of moral and political philosophers.

The basic idea seems simple: in some way, the agreement of all individuals subject to collectively enforced social arrangements shows that those arrangements have some normative property (they are legitimate, just, obligating, etc.). Even this basic idea, though, is anything but simple, and even this abstract rendering is objectionable in many ways.

To explicate the idea of the social contract we analyze contractual approaches into five elements: (1) the role of the social contract (2) the parties (3) agreement (4) the object of agreement (5) what the agreement is supposed to show.

1. The Role of the Social Contract

1.1 Distinctiveness of the Social Contract Approach

The aim of a social contract theory is to show that members of some society have reason to endorse and comply with the fundamental social rules, laws, institutions, and/or principles of that society. Put simply, it is concerned with public justification, i.e., “of determining whether or not a given regime is legitimate and therefore worthy of loyalty” (D’Agostino 1996, 23). The ultimate goal of state-focused social contract theories is to show that some political system can meet the challenge Alexander Hamilton raised in Federalist no. 1 of whether “men are really capable or not of establishing good government from reflection and choice, or whether they are forever destined to depend for their political constitutions on accident and force” (Hamilton 1788). Going further, David Gauthier argues that any system of moral constraints must be justified to those to whom it is meant to apply. “What theory of morals,” Gauthier asks, “can ever serve any useful purpose unless it can show that all the duties it recommends are truly endorsed in each individual’s reason?” (1986, 1).

The ultimate goal, then, of social contract theories is to show, in the most general sense, that social (moral, political, legal, etc.) rules can be rationally justified. This alone does not, however, distinguish the social contract from other approaches in moral and political philosophy, all of which attempt to show that moral and political rules are rationally justifiable in some sense. The true distinctiveness of the social contract approach is that justification does not rely, for its foundation, on some exogenous reason or truth. Justification is generated endogenously by rational agreement (or lack of rejection in T. M. Scanlon’s version). That is, the fact that everyone in a society, given their individual reasoning, would agree to a certain rule or principle is the critical justification for that rule or principle.

Although contract theorists differ in their account of the reasons of individuals, with some being attracted to more objectivist accounts (Scanlon 2013), most follow Hobbes in modeling individual reasons as subjective, motivationally internal, or at least agent-relative. This may be because of skepticism about moral reasons generally (Harman 1975, Gauthier 1986, Binmore 1998), a conviction about the overwhelming importance of self-interest to the social order (Hobbes 1651, Buchanan 2000 [1975], Brennan and Buchanan 1985), a concern to take seriously the disagreement of individual view in modern society (Gaus 2011a, 2016; Muldoon 2017; Moehler 2014, 2015, 2018) or because this approach is consistent with the most well-developed theories of rational choice in the social sciences (Binmore 2005, Buchanan 2000 [1975]). In any case, the reasons individuals have for agreeing to some rules or principles are importantly their own reasons, not “good reasons” from the impartial perspective. Of course, those same individuals may care about what they perceive to be the impartial good or some other non-individualistic notion—they need not be egoists—but what they care about, and so their reasons will differ from one another. This point, as Rawls highlights in his later work, is crucial to understanding political justification in a diverse society where members of a society cannot reasonably be expected to have similar conceptions of the good (Rawls 1996). Recent contractarian accounts put even greater weight on heterogeneity (Southwood 2010, Gaus 2016, Muldoon 2017, Moehler 2018, Sugden 2018).

1.2 The Social Contract as a Model

The social contract is a model of rational justification that transforms the problem of justification (what reasons individuals have) into a problem of deliberation (what rules they will agree to). As Rawls argues:

[T]he question of justification is settled by working out a problem of deliberation: we have to ascertain which principles it would be rational to adopt given the contractual situation. This connects the theory of justice with the theory of rational choice (Rawls 1999, 16).

Justification is not a “mere proof” (Rawls 1999a 508), nor is it reasoning from given or generally accepted premises to conclusions about political legitimacy or morality (Rawls 1980, p. 518). Rather, the contractual model makes explicit the reasoning that connects our standpoint as persons with determinate interests and goals to our standpoint as citizens.

At the simplest level, models take something complex and make it simpler. Along these lines, both the economist Ariel Rubinstein (2012) and the philosopher Nancy Cartwright (1991) compare models to fables. Fables are stories that communicate some important lesson in a simple, easy-to-understand fashion. Fables, like models, communicate important general rules through particular, though fictional, cases.

Models involve abstraction and idealization, but they do more than that: they help us see what our key assumptions are, identify the factors that we see as relevant (Gaus 2016, xv-xvii). Models, as techniques of idealization, do more than abstract (Weisberg 2007a, 2013). Consider the periodic table of the elements. It is an abstraction, but not a model according to Michael Weisberg. He calls abstractions like the periodic table abstract direct representations to distinguish them from models (2007b). Modeling seeks to isolate the important features of the target phenomena, allowing the modeler to understand and manipulate important elements of the phenomena in simulations. John Rawls’s representatives to the original position, for instance, are not only abstractions of real persons. They are idealizations that isolate particular aspects of persons that are relevant to justification as a choice, specifically their thin theory of rationality, and their values (in the form of primary goods). Isolating these features is important for modeling the agreement procedure in Rawls’s theory.

Given this, we can think of social contract theories as having a general schematic form. Social contract theories are models of justification with several general parameters that are set differently in different theories. What distinguishes contractarian theories is how they specify these general parameters (Thrasher 2019). The goal of the model is to represent our reasons for endorsing and complying with some set of social rules, principles, or norms. This is done by showing that our representatives in the model would agree to a given set of these rules, principles, or norms in a suitably constructed choice situation. What “suitably constructed” means here will depend on the other parameters in the model.

Critically, there are two sets of relevant individuals (N and N*). The first set is the representative choosers (N) constructed in the “device of representation” such as the original position (Rawls 1996, 27). The second set (N*) is composed of real individuals whose terms of interaction are to be guided by the contract/agreement. If the deliberations of the contractors (N) are to be relevant to the actual participants (N*), the reasoning of the former must, in some way, be shared by the latter. There is, however, considerable debate about what it means for reasons to be shared in this sense (see Public Reason and Public Justification). The other main parameter in the model is the deliberative setting (M), in which the model choosers (N) endorse some rules, principles, or norms (R).

Given all of this, we can identify a general model of social contract theories:

General Model of the Social Contract: N chooses R in M and this gives N* reason to endorse and comply with R in the real world insofar as the reasons N has for choosing R in M can be shared by N*.

Each of these parameters (N,M,R,N*) can be specified in any number of ways. The shape of a particular contractual theory depends on the precise way these parameters are set in the theory.

2. Modeling the Parties

2.1 Reductionist vs. Non-Reductionist

How contract theorists model the representative choosers (N) is determined by our (actual) justificatory problem and what is relevant to solving it. A major divide among contemporary social contract theories thus involves defining the justificatory problem. A distinction is often drawn between the Hobbesian/Lockean (“contractarian”) and Rousseavian/Kantian (“contractualist”) interpretations of the justificatory problem. These categories are imprecise, and there is often as much difference within these two approaches as between them, yet, nevertheless, the distinction can be useful for isolating some key disputes in contemporary social contract theory.

Among those “contractarians” who—very roughly—can be called followers of Hobbes and/or Locke, the crucial justificatory task is, as Gauthier (1991, 16) puts it, to resolve the “foundational crisis” of morality:

From the standpoint of the agent, moral considerations present themselves as constraining his choices and action, in ways independent of his desires, aims, and interests…. And so we ask, what reason can a person have for recognizing and accepting a constraint that is independent of his desires and interests? … [W]hat justifies paying attention to morality, rather than dismissing it as an appendage of outworn beliefs?

If our justificatory problem is not simply to understand what morality requires, but whether morality ought to be paid attention to, or instead dismissed as a superstition based on outmoded metaphysical theories, then obviously the parties to the agreement must not employ moral judgments in their reasoning. Another version of this concern is Gregory Kavka’s (1984) description of the project to reconcile morality with prudence. On both these accounts, the aim of the contract is to show that commitment to morality is an effective way to further one’s non-moral aims and interests, answering the question “why be moral?” The political version of this project, is similar, though the target of justification is a set of political rules or constitution rather than morality generally (Buchanan 2000[1975], Coleman 1985, Kavka 1986, Sugden 2018). This “contractarian” project is reductionist in a pretty straightforward sense: it derives moral or political reasons from non-moral ones. Or, to use Rawls’s terminology, it attempts to generate the reasonable out of the rational (1996, 53).

The reductionist approach is appealing for several reasons. First, insofar as we doubt the normative basis of moral reasons, such a reductionist strategy promises to ground morality—or at least a very basic version of it—on the prosaic normativity of the basic requirements of instrumentalist practical rationality (Moehler 2018). The justificatory question “why be moral?” is transformed into the less troubling question “why be rational?” Second, even if we recognize that moral reasons are, in some sense, genuine, contractarians like Kavka also want to show that prudent individuals, not independently motivated by morality would have reason to reflectively endorse morality. Furthermore, if we have reason to suspect that some segment of the population is, in fact, knavish then we have good defensive reasons based on stability to build our social institutions and morality so as to restrain those who are only motivated by prudence, even if we suspect that most persons are not so motivated. Geoffrey Brennan and James Buchanan argue that a version of Gresham’s law holds in political and social institutions that “bad behavior drives out good and that all persons will be led themselves by even the presence of a few self-seekers to adopt self-interested behavior” (2008 [1985], 68). We need not think people are mostly self-seeking to think that social institutions and morality should be justified to and restrain those who are.

On the other hand, “contractualists,” such as Rawls, John Harsanyi (1977), Thomas Scanlon (1998), Stephen Darwall (2006), Nicholas Southwood (2010) and Gerald Gaus (2011) attribute ethical or political values to the deliberative parties, as well as a much more substantive, non-instrumentalist form of practical reasoning. The kinds of surrogates that model the justificatory problem are already so situated that their deliberations will be framed by ethico-political considerations. The agents’ deliberations are not, as with the Hobbesian theorists, carried out in purely prudential or instrumentalist terms, but they are subject to the ‘veil of ignorance’ or other substantive conditions. Here the core justificatory problem is not whether the very idea of moral and political constraints makes sense, but what sorts of moral or political principles meet certain basic moral demands, such as treating all as free and equal moral persons, or not subjecting any person to the will or judgment of another (Reiman 1990, chap. 1). This approach, then, is non-reductionist in the sense that justification is not derived from the non-moral.

A benefit of the non-reductive approach is that the choosers in the contractual procedure (N) share many of the normative concerns of their actual counterparts (N*). This should ensure a closer normative link between the two parties and allow for the contract to generate a thicker, more substantive morality, presumably closer to that already held by N*. Whether this is so, however, depends on how closely the non-reductionist model of rationality is to the reasoning of actual individuals.

At this point, the debate seems to be centered on two positions, which we might call the robustness and sensitivity positions. According to the proponents of robustness, whatever else moral agents may disagree about, we can safely assume that they would all be committed to basic standards of rationality (Moehler 2013, 2017, 2018). We should thus suppose this same basic, shared conception of rationality and agency: when people fall short of more moralistic ideals and virtue, the contract will still function. It will be robust. According to this view, we are better off following Hume (1741) in assuming every person to be a knave, even though that maxim is false in fact.

The sensitivity position rejects this, holding that, if, in fact, individuals in N* are not resolutely self-interested, the problems of N, resolutely self-interested individuals, and their contractual solutions, will be inappropriate to N*. Perhaps whereas N* can count on social trust, the self-interested contractors will find it elusive and arrive at second-best alternatives that trusting folks would find silly and inefficient. Indeed, the sensitivity theorist may insist that even if the self-interested agents can talk themselves into acting as moral agents they do so for the wrong sort of reasons (Gaus 2011, 185ff).

2.2 Idealization and Identification

The core idea of social contract theories, we have been stressing, is that the deliberation of the parties is supposed to model the justificatory problem of ordinary moral agents and citizens. Now this pulls social contract theories in two opposing directions. On the one hand, if the deliberations of the hypothetical parties are to model our problem and their conclusions are to be of relevance to us, the parties must be similar to us. The closer the parties are to “you and me” the better their deliberations will model you and me, and be of relevance to us. On the other hand, the point of contract theories is to make headway on our justificatory problem by constructing parties that are models of you and me, suggesting that some idealization is necessary and salutary in constructing a model of justification. To recognize that some forms of idealization are problematic does not imply that we should embrace what Gaus has called “justificatory populism” that every person in society must actually assent to the social and moral institutions in question (Gaus 1996, 130–131). Such a standard would take us back to the older social contract tradition based on direct consent and as we argue in §3, modern contract theories are concerned with appeals to our reason, not our self-binding power of consent.

Despite possible problems, there are two important motivations behind idealization in the modeling of the deliberative parties. First, you and I, as we now are, may be confused about what considerations are relevant to our justificatory problem. We have biases and false beliefs; to make progress on solving our problem of justification we wish, as far as possible, to see what the result would be if we only reasoned correctly from sound and relevant premises. So in constructing the hypothetical parties we wish to idealize them in this way. Ideal deliberation theorists like Jürgen Habermas (1985) and Southwood (2010), in their different ways, are deeply concerned with this reason for idealization. On the face of it, such idealization does not seem especially troublesome, since our ultimate concern is with what is justified, and so we want the deliberations of the parties to track good reasons. But if we idealize too far from individuals and citizens as they presently are (e.g., suppose we posit that they are fully rational in the sense that they know all the implications of all their beliefs and have perfect information) their deliberations may not help much in solving our justificatory problems. We will not be able to identify with their solutions (Suikkanen 2014, Southwood 2019). For example, suppose that hyper-rational and perfectly informed parties would have no religious beliefs, so they would not be concerned with freedom of religion or the role of religion of political decision making. But our problem is that among tolerably reasonable but far from perfectly rational citizens, pluralism of religious belief is inescapable. Consequently, to gain insight into the justificatory problem among citizens of limited rationality, the parties must model our imperfect rationality.

2.3 Homogeneity vs. Heterogeneity

Social contract theories model representative choosers (N) so as to render the choice situation determinate. This goal of determinacy, however, can have the effect of eliminating the pluralism of the parties that was the original impetus for contracting in the first place. In his Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy Rawls tells us that “a normalization of interests attributed to the parties” is “common to social contract doctrines” and it is necessary to unify the perspectives of the different parties so as to construct a “shared point of view” (2007, 226). Here Rawls seems to be suggesting that to achieve determinacy in the contract procedure it is necessary to “normalize” the perspectives of the parties.

The problem is this. Suppose that the parties to the contract closely model real agents, and so they have diverse bases for their deliberations—religious, secular, perfectionist, and so on. In this case, it is hard to see how the contract theorist can get a determinate result. Just as you and I disagree, so will the parties. Rawls (1999, 121) acknowledges that his restrictions on particular information in the original position are necessary to achieve a determinate result. If we exclude “knowledge of those contingencies which set men at odds …. ” then since “everyone is equally rational and similarly situated, each is convinced by the same arguments”(Rawls 1999, 17, 120). Gaus (2011a, 36–47) has argued that a determinative result can only be generated by an implausibly high degree of abstraction, in which the basic pluralism of evaluative standards—the core of our justificatory problem—is abstracted away. Thus, on Gaus’s view, modelings of the parties that make them anything approaching representations of real people will only be able to generate a non-singleton set of eligible social contracts. The parties might agree that some social contracts are better than none, but they will disagree on their ordering of possible social contracts. This conclusion, refined and developed in (Gaus 2011a, Part Two) connects the traditional problem of indeterminacy in the contract procedure (see also Hardin 2003) with the contemporary, technical problem of equilibrium selection in games (see Vanderschraaf 2005). A topic we will explore more in §3 below.

It is possible, however, that determinacy may actually require diversity in the perspective of the deliberative parties in a way that Rawls and others like Harsanyi didn’t expect. The reason for this is simple, though the proof is somewhat complex. Normalizing the perspectives of the parties assumes that there is one stable point of view that has all of the relevant information necessary for generating a stable and determinate set of social rules. There is no reason, antecedently, to think that such a perspective can be found, however. Instead, if we recognize that there are epistemic gains to be had from a “division of cognitive labor” there is good reason to prefer a diverse rather than normalized idealization of the parties to the contract (see: Weisberg and Muldoon 2009, Gaus 2016, Muldoon 2017, Muldoon 2017a, Muldoon 2018). There is reason to conclude that if we wish to discover social contracts that best achieve a set of interrelated normative desiderata (e.g., liberty, equality, welfare, etc.), a deliberative process that draws on a diversity of perspectives will outperform one based on a strict normalization of perspectives (Gaus 2011b, 2016; Thrasher 2020).

2.4 Doxastic vs. Evaluative

Any representation of the reasoning of the parties will have two elements that need to be specified: 1) doxastic and 2) evaluative. These elements, when combined, create a complete model that will specify how and why representatives in the contractual model choose or agree to some set of social rules. The first (doxastic) is the specification of everything the representatives in the original position know or at least believe. Choice in the contractual model in the broadest sense, is an attempt by the parties to choose a set of rules that they expect will be better than in some baseline condition, such as “generalized egoism” (Rawls, 1999: 127) a “state of nature” (Hobbes 1651) or the rules that they currently have (Binmore, 2005; Buchanan 2000 [1975]). To do this, they need representations of the baseline and of state of the world under candidate set of rules). Without either of these doxastic representations, the choice problem would be indeterminate. Rawls famously imposes severe doxastic constraints on his parties to the social contract by imposing a thick veil of ignorance that eliminates information about the specific details of each individual and the world they live in. James Buchanan imposes a similar, but less restrictive “veil of uncertainty” on his representative choosers (Buchanan and Tullock 1965 [1962]; Buchanan 1975; see also Rawls, 1958).

In addition to specifying what the representatives believe to be the case about the world and the results of their agreement, there must also be some standard by which the representative parties can evaluate different contractual possibilities. They must be able to rank the options on the basis of their values, whatever those may be. Rawls models parties to the contractual situation as, at least initially, having only one metric of value: primary goods. They choose the conception of justice they do insofar as they believe it will likely generate the most primary goods for them and their descendants. This specification of the evaluative parameter is uniform across choosers and therefore, choice in the original position can be modeled as the choice of one individual. Insofar as there is evaluative diversity between the representatives, more complex models of agreement will be needed (see §3). If we think in terms of decision theory, the doxastic specification individuates the initial state of affairs and the outcomes of the contractual model, while the specification of the evaluative elements gives each representative party a ranking of the outcomes expected to result from the choice of any given set of rules. Once these elements are specified, we have a model of the parties to the contract.

3. Modeling Agreement

Social contract theories fundamentally differ in whether the parties reason differently or the same. As we have seen (§2.3) in Rawls’s Original Position, everyone reasons the same: the collective choice problem is reduced to the choice of one individual. Any one person’s decision is a proxy for everyone else. In social contracts of this sort, the description of the parties (their motivation, the conditions under which they choose) does all the work: once we have fully specified the reasoning of one party, the contract has been identified.

The alternative view is that, even after we have specified the parties (including their rationality, values and information), they continue to disagree in their rankings of possible social contracts. On this view, the contract only has a determinate result if there is some way to commensurate the different rankings of each individual to yield an agreement (D’Agostino 2003). We can distinguish four basic agreement mechanisms of doing this.

3.1 Consent

The traditional social contract views of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau crucially relied on the idea of consent. For Locke only “consent of Free-men” could make them members of the government (Locke 1689, §117). In the hands of these theorists—and in much ordinary discourse—the idea of “consent” implies a normative power to bind oneself. When one reaches “the age of consent” one is empowered to make certain sorts of binding agreements—contracts. By putting consent at the center of their contracts these early modern contract theorists (1) were clearly supposing that individuals had basic normative powers over themselves (e.g. self-ownership) before they entered into the social contract (a point that Hume (1748) stressed), and (2) brought the question of political obligation to the fore. If the parties have the power to bind themselves by exercising this normative power, then the upshot of the social contract was obligation. As Hobbes (1651, 81 [chap xiv,¶7) insisted, covenants bind; that is why they are “artificial chains” (1651, 138 [chap. xxi, ¶5).

Both of these considerations have come under attack in contemporary social contract theories, especially the second. According to Buchanan, the key development of recent social contract theory has been to distinguish the question of what generates political obligation (the key concern of the consent tradition in social contract thought) from the question of what constitutional orders or social institutions are mutually beneficial and stable over time (1965). The nature of a person’s duty to abide by the law or social rules is a matter of morality as it pertains to individuals (Rawls 1999, 293ff), while the design and justification of political and social institutions is a question of public or social morality. Thus, in Buchanan’s view, a crucial feature of more recent contractual thought has been to refocus political philosophy on public or social morality rather than individual obligation. In most modern social contract theories, including Rawls’s, consent and obligation play almost no role whatsoever.

Although contemporary social contract theorists still sometimes employ the language of consent, the core idea of contemporary social contract theory is agreement. “Social contract views work from the intuitive idea of agreement” (Freeman 2007a, 17). One can endorse or agree to a principle without that act of endorsement in any way binding one to obey. Social contract theorists as diverse as Samuel Freeman and Jan Narveson (1988, 148) see the act of agreement as indicating what reasons we have; agreement is a “test” or a heuristic (see §5). The “role of unanimous collective agreement” is in showing “what we have reasons to do in our social and political relations” (Freeman 2007, 19). Thus understood, the agreement is not itself a binding act—it is not a performative that somehow creates obligation—but is reason-revealing (Lessnoff 1986). If individuals are rational, what they agree to reflects the reasons they have. In contemporary contract theories such as Rawls’s, the problem of justification takes center stage. Rawls’s revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice thus did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted. Recall that for Rawls (1999, 16) the aim is to settle “the question of justification … by working out a problem of deliberation.”

Given that the problem of justification has taken center stage, the second aspect of contemporary social contract thinking appears to fall into place: its reliance on models of counterfactual agreement. The aim is to model the reasons of citizens, and so we ask what they would agree to under conditions in which their agreements would be expected to track their reasons. Contemporary contract theory is, characteristically, doubly counterfactual. Certainly, no prominent theorist thinks that questions of justification are settled by an actual survey of attitudes towards existing social arrangements, and are not settled until such a survey has been carried out. The question, then, is not “Are these arrangements presently the object of an actual agreement among citizens?” (If this were the question, the answer would typically be “No”.) The question, rather, is “Would these arrangements be the object of an agreement if citizens were surveyed?” Although both of the questions are, in some sense, susceptible to an empirical reading, only the latter is in play in present-day theorizing. The contract nowadays is always counterfactual in at least this first sense.

There is a reading of the (first-order) counterfactual question, “Would R be the object of agreement if___” which, as indicated, is still resolutely empirical in some sense. This is the reading where what is required of the theorist is that she try to determine what an actual survey of actual citizens would reveal about their actual attitudes towards their system of social arrangements. (This is seldom done, of course; the theorist does it in her imagination. See, though, Klosko 2000). But there is another interpretation that is more widely accepted in the contemporary context. On this reading, the question is no longer a counterfactual question about actual reactions; it is, rather, a counterfactual question about counterfactual reactions—it is, as we have said, doubly counterfactual. Framing the question is the first counterfactual element: “Would R be the object of agreement if they were surveyed?” Framed by this question is the second counterfactual element, one which involves the citizens, who are no longer treated empirically, i.e. taken as given, but are, instead, themselves considered from a counterfactual point of view—as they would be if (typically) they were better informed or more impartial, etc. The question for most contemporary contract theorists, then, is, roughly: “If we surveyed the idealized surrogates of the actual citizens in this polity, what social arrangements would be the object of an agreement among them?”

Famously, Ronald Dworkin (1975) has objected that a (doubly) hypothetical agreement cannot bind any actual person. For the hypothetical analysis to make sense, it must be shown that hypothetical persons in the contract can agree to endorse and comply with some principle regulating social arrangements. Suppose that it could be shown that your surrogate (a better informed, more impartial version of you) would agree to a principle. What has that to do with you? Where this second-stage hypothetical analysis is employed, it seems to be proposed that you can be bound by agreements that others, different from you, would have made. While it might (though it needn’t) be reasonable to suppose that you can be bound by agreements that you would yourself have entered into if, given the opportunity, it seems crazy to think that you can be bound by agreements that, demonstrably, you wouldn’t have made even if you had been asked.

This criticism is decisive, however, only if the hypothetical social contract is supposed to invoke your normative power to self-bind via consent. That your surrogate employs her power to self-bind would not mean that you had employed your power. Again, though, the power to obligate oneself is not typically invoked in the contemporary social contract: the problem of deliberation is supposed to help us make headway on the problem of justification. So the question for contemporary hypothetical contract theories is whether the hypothetical agreement of your surrogate tracks your reasons to accept social arrangements, a very different issue (Stark 2000).

This argument has been revived by Jussi Suikkanen (2014) as the claim that certain forms of contract theory, most notably Southwood’s (2010) “deliberative” contractualism, commit the conditional fallacy. The conditional fallacy is a specific version of the problem we are considering here, namely that a conditional with counterfactual agents, will not necessarily apply if the counterfactual agents are sufficiently different from the real ones it is meant to apply to. In response, Southwood (2019) develops what he calls an “advice model” of contractualism wherein we take the counterfactual contractors to generate reasons that should appeal to us as advice from a more thoughtful, idealized version of ourselves, along lines similar to Michael Smith’s (1994) ideal advisor theory of moral reasons. Thrasher (2019) raises a different but related concern that segmented choice in the model of agreement can create outcomes that are not rationalizable to the parties, since they are the result of path-dependent processes.

As we have argued, contemporary social contract theory rely on hypothetical or counterfactual agreement, rather than actual agreement. In one sense this is certainly the case. However, in many ways the “hypothetical/actual” divide is artificial: the counterfactual agreement is meant to model, and provide the basis for, actual agreement. All models are counterfactual Understanding contemporary social contract theory is best achieved, not through insisting on the distinction between actual and hypothetical contracts, but by grasping the interplay of the counterfactual and the actual in the model of agreement.

Rawls (1995) is especially clear on this point in his explication of his model of agreement in response to Habermas. There he distinguishes between three different perspectives relevant to the assessment of the model (1996, 28):

  1. you and me
  2. the parties to the deliberative model
  3. persons in a well-ordered society

The agreement of the parties in the deliberative model is certainly counterfactual in the two-fold sense we have analyzed: a counterfactual agreement among counterfactual parties. But the point of the deliberative model is to help us (i.e., “you and me”) solve our justificatory problem—what social arrangements we can all accept as “free persons who have no authority over one another” (Rawls 1958, 33). The parties’ deliberations and the conditions under which they deliberate, then, model our actual convictions about justice and justification. As Rawls says (1999, 514), the reasoning of the counterfactual parties matters to us because “the conditions embodied in the description of this situation are ones that we do in fact accept.” Unless the counterfactual models the actual, the upshot of the agreement could not provide us with reasons. Gaus describes this process as a “testing conception” of the social contract (2011a, 425). We use the counterfactual deliberative device of the contract to “test” our social institutions. In this way, the contemporary social contract is meant to be a model of the justificatory situation that all individuals face. The counterfactual and abstracted (see §2) nature of the contract is needed to highlight the relevant features of the parties to show what reasons they have.

Samuel Freeman has recently stressed the way in which focusing on the third perspective—of citizens in a well-ordered society—also shows the importance of counterfactual agreement in Rawls’s contract theory. On Freeman’s interpretation, the social contract must meet the condition of publicity. He (2007b:15) writes:

Rawls distinguishes three levels of publicity: first, the publicity of principles of justice; second, the publicity of the general beliefs in light of which first principles of justice can be accepted (“that is, the theory of human nature and of social institutions generally)”; and, third, the publicity of the complete justification of the public conception of justice as it would be on its own terms. All three levels, Rawls contends, are exemplified in a well-ordered society. This is the “full publicity” condition.

A justified contract must meet the full publicity condition: its complete justification must be capable of being actually accepted by members of a well-ordered society. The counterfactual agreement itself provides only what Rawls (1996, 386) calls a “pro tanto” or “so far as it goes” justification of the principles of justice. “Full justification” is achieved only when actual “people endorse and will liberal justice for the particular (and often conflicting) reasons implicit in the reasonable comprehensive doctrines they hold” (Freeman 2007b, 19). Thus understood, Rawls’s concern with the stability of justice as fairness, which motivated the move to political liberalism, is itself a question of justification (Weithman, 2010). Only if the principles of justice are stable in this way are they fully justified. Rawls’s concern with stability and publicity is not, however, idiosyncratic and is shared by all contemporary contract theorists. It is significant that even theorists such as Buchanan (2000 [1975], 26–27), Gauthier (1986, 348), and Binmore (2005, 5–7)—who are so different from Rawls in other respects—share his concern with stability.

3.2 Bargaining

It is perhaps no surprise that the renaissance in contemporary contact theory occurred at the same time as game-theoretic tools and especially bargaining theory began to be applied to philosophical problems. Bargaining theory, as it was developed by John Nash (1950) and John Harsanyi (1977) is a rigorous approach to modeling how rational individuals would agree to divide some good or surplus. In its most general form, the bargaining model of agreement specifies some set of individuals who have individual utility functions that can be represented in relation to one other without requiring interpersonal comparisons of utility directly. Some surplus is specified and if the individuals involved can agree on how to divide the good in question, they will get that division. If, however, they cannot agree they will instead get their disagreement result. This may be what they brought to the table or it could be some other specified amount. One example is a simple demand game where two people must write down how much of given pot of money they want. If the two “bids” amount to equal or less than the pot, each will get what he or she wrote down, otherwise each will get nothing.

As Rawls recognized in his 1958 essay “Justice as Fairness” one way for parties to resolve their disagreements is to employ bargaining solutions, such as that proposed by R.B. Braithwaite (1955). Rawls himself rejected bargaining solutions to the social contract since, in his opinion, such solutions rely on “threat advantage” (i.e., disagreement result) and “to each according to his threat advantage is hardly a principle of fairness” (Rawls 1958, 58n). In addition to Rawls’s concern about threat advantage, a drawback of all such approaches is the multiplicity of bargaining solutions, which can significantly differ. Although the Nash solution is most favored today, it can have counter-intuitive implications. Furthermore, there are many who argue that bargaining solutions are inherently indeterminate and so the only way to achieve determinacy is to introduce unrealistic or controversial assumptions (Sugden, 1990, 1991; Thrasher 2014). Similar problems also exist for equilibrium selection in games (see Vanderschraaf 2005 and Harsanyi and Selten 1988).

Gauthier famously pursued the bargaining approach, building his Morals by Agreement on his bargaining solution, minimax relative concession, which is equivalent to the Kalai-Smorodinsky bargaining solution in the two-person case (see also Gaus 1990, Ch. IX). Binmore (2005) has recently advanced a version of social contract theory that relies on the Nash bargaining solution, as does Ryan Muldoon (2017) while Moehler (2018) relies on a “stabilized” Nash bargaining solution. In later work, Gauthier (1993) shifted from minimax relative concession to the Nash solution. Gauthier has since adopted a less formal approach to bargaining that is, nevertheless, closer to his original solution than to the Nash Solution (2013).

Many of the recent developments in bargaining theory and the social contract have adopted dynamic (Muldoon 2017, Vanderschraaf 2018) or even evolutionary approaches to modeling bargaining (Alexander and Skyrms 1999, Skyrms 2014). This highlights a general divide in bargaining models between what we can call axiomatic and process models. The traditional, axiomatic, approach to the bargaining problem going back to John Nash, codified by John Harsanyi, and popularized by R. Duncan Luce and Howard Raiffa (1957). Out of this tradition has come several core bargaining solutions. Each uses a slightly different set of axioms to generate a unique and generally applicable way to divide a surplus. These include, most notably, the egalitarian (Raiffa 1953), the Nash (1950), the stabilized Nash (Moehler 2010), the Kalai-Smorodinsky (1975), and Gauthier’s minimax relative concession (1986). The main point of contention among these theories is whether to employ Nash’s independence axiom or to use a monotonicity axiom (as the egalitarian, Kalai-Smorodinsky, and minimax relative concession do), although, to one degree or another all of the axioms have been contested.

The other approach is what we can call a process model. Instead of using various axioms to generate a uniquely rational solution, these theorists rely on some procedure that will generate a determinate, though not always unique result. Process approaches use some mechanism to generate agreement. An example is an auction. There are many types of auctions (e.g., English, Dutch, Vickrey, etc.), each has a way of generating bids on some good and then deciding on a price. Posted price selling, like one often sees in consumer markets, are also a kind of bargain, though an extremely asymmetric one where the seller has offered a “take or leave it” ask. Double-auctions are more symmetrical and have a clearer link to the initial bargaining model. Although auctions are not typically used to solve pure division problems, there are some examples of auction mechanisms being used to solve public goods problems in interesting ways that guarantee unanimity (Smith 1977). Dworkin also uses a kind of auction mechanism in his work on equality, though he doesn’t develop his approach for more general application (Dworkin 1981, Heath 2004). Despite its promise, however, auction theory and its potential application to social contract theory have largely gone unexploited.

The main process approach to bargaining derives from the influential work of Rubinstein (1982) and his proof that it is possible to show that an alternating offer bargaining process will generate the same result as Nash’s axiomatic solution in certain cases. This result added life to Nash’s (1950) early observation that bargaining and the rules of bargaining must be the result of some non-cooperative game, with the idea being that it might be possible to unify bargaining theory and game theory. This approach, called the Nash Program, is most notably championed by Binmore (1998), whose evolutionary approach to the social contract relies on biological evolution (the game of life) to generate the background conditions of bargaining (the game of morals). Both can be modeled as non-cooperative games and the later can be modeled as a bargaining problem. By using this approach, Binmore (1998, 2005) claims to be able to show, in a robust and non-question-begging way, that something very much like Rawls’s “justice as fairness” will be the result of this evolutionary bargaining process.

A more empirically minded approach follows Schelling’s (1960) early work on bargaining and game theory by looking at the way actual people bargain and reach agreement. The pioneers of experimental economics used laboratory experiments to look at how subjects behaved in division problems (Hoffman et. al. 2000, Smith 2003). Some of the most interesting results came, perhaps surprisingly, from asymmetric bargaining games like the ultimatum game (Smith 1982). Since these early experiments, considerable experimental work has been done on bargaining problems and cooperative agreement in economics. Much of the most philosophically relevant work involves the importance of social norms and conventions in determining the result (Bicchieri 2016, Vanderschraaf 2018).

Although appealing to a bargaining solution can give determinacy to a social contract, it does so at the cost of appealing to a controversial commensuration mechanism in the case of axiomatic bargaining or of moving to process approaches that must ultimately rely on the empirically contingent outcome of social and biological evolution. Although the importance of bargaining in the social contract has been moribund for some time, recent work is changing that (see Alexander 2007, Thrasher 2014, Thoma 2015, Muldoon 2017, Moehler 2018, Vanderschraaf 2018, Bruner 2020).

3.3 Aggregation

We can distinguish bargaining from aggregation models of agreement. Rather than seeking an outcome that (as, roughly, the Kalai-Smorodinsky solution does) splits the difference between various claims, we might seek to aggregate the individual rankings into an overall social choice. Arrow’s theorem and related problems with social choice rules casts doubt on any claim that one specific way of aggregating is uniquely rational: all have their shortcomings (Gaus and Thrasher 2021, chap. 8). Harsanyi (1977, chaps. 1 and 2; 1982) develops a contractual theory much like Rawls’s using this approach. In Harsanyi’s approach, reasoning behind a veil of ignorance in which people do not know their post-contract identities, he supposes that rational contractors will assume it is equally probable that they will be any specific person. Moreover, he argues that contractors can agree on interpersonal utility comparisons, and so they will opt for a contract that aggregates utility at the highest average (see also Mueller 2003, chap. 26). This, of course, depends on the supposition that there is a non-controversial metric that allows us to aggregate the parties’ utility functions. Binmore (2005) follows Harsanyi and Amartya Sen (2009, Chap. 13) in arguing that interpersonal comparisons can be made for the purposes of aggregation, at least some of the time. John Broome (1995) develops something like Harsanyi’s approach that relies on making interpersonal comparisons.

One of the problems with this approach, however, is that if the interpersonal comparisons are incomplete they will not be able to produce a complete social ordering. As Sen points out, this will lead to a maximal set of alternatives where no alternative is dominated by any other within the set but also where no particular alternative is optimal (Sen, 1997). Instead of solving the aggregation problem, then, interpersonal comparisons may only be able to reduce the set of alternatives without being able to complete the ordering of alternatives.

Because of the problems with indeterminacy, many theorists have rejected the aggregation approach as being either unworkable or as being incomplete in some way. Gaus (2011), for instance, uses an evolutionary mechanism to generate determinacy in his aggregation model. Brian Kogelmann (2017) argues, however, that under reasonable assumptions about the preferences of the representative agents, aggregation alone is sufficient to generate determinacy.

3.4 Equilibrium

There is a long tradition of thinking of the social contract as a kind of equilibrium. Within this tradition, however, the tendency is to see the social contract as some kind of equilibrium solution to a prisoner’s dilemma type situation (see Gauthier, 1986 and Buchanan, 2000 [1975]). Brian Skyrms (1996, 2004) suggests a different approach. Suppose that we have a contractual negotiation in which there are two parties, ordering four possible “social contracts”:

  1. both Alf and Betty hunt stag
  2. both hunt hare;
  3. Alf hunts stag, Betty hunts hare;
  4. Alf hunts hare, Betty hunts stag.

Let 3 be the best outcome, and let 1 be the worst in each person’s ranking (Alf’s ranking is first in each pair). We thus get Figure 1

Hunt Stag Hunt Hare
BETTY Hunt Stag 3,3 2,1
Hunt Hare 1,2 2,2

Figure 1: A Stag Hunt

The Stag Hunt, Skyrms argues, “should be a focal point for social contract theory” (2004, 4). The issue in the Stag Hunt is not whether we fight or not, but whether we cooperate and gain, or each go our separate ways. There are two Nash equilibria in this game: both hunting stag and both hunting hare. Alf and Betty, should they find themselves at one of these equilibria, will stick to it if each consults only his or her own ranking of options. In a Nash equilibrium, no individual has a reason to defect. Of course, the contract in which they both hunt stag is a better contract: it is Pareto superior to that in which they both hunt hare. The Hare equilibrium is, however, risk superior in that it is a safer bet. Skyrms argues that the theory of iterated games can show not simply that our parties will arrive at a social contract, but how they can come to arrive at the cooperative, mutually beneficial contract. If we have a chance to play repeated games, Skyrms holds, we can learn from Hume about the “shadow of the future”: “I learn to do a service to another, without bearing him any real kindness; because I foresee, that he will return my service, in expectation of another of the same kind, and in order to maintain the same correspondence of good offices with me and with others” (Skyrms 2004, 5). Sugden, along different lines, also suggests that repeated interactions, what he calls “experience” is essential to the determination of which norms of social interaction actually hold over time (1986).

The problem with equilibrium solutions is that, as in the stag hunt game, many games have multiple equilibria. The problem then becomes how to select one unique equilibrium from a set of possible ones. The problem is compounded by the controversies over equilibrium refinement concepts (see Harsanyi and Selten 1988). Many refinements have been suggested but, as in bargaining theory, all are controversial to one degree or another. One of the interesting developments in social contract theory spurred by game theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore is the appeal to evolutionary game theory as a way to solve the commensuration and equilibrium selection problem (Vanderschraaf 2005). What cannot be solved by appeal to reason (because there simply is no determinate solution) may be solved by repeated interactions among rational parties. The work of theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore also blurs the line between justification and explanation. Their analyses shed light both on the justificatory problem—what are the characteristics of a cooperative social order that people freely follow?—while also explaining how such orders may come about.

The use of evolutionary game theory and evolutionary techniques is a burgeoning and exciting area of contract theory. One of the many questions that arise, however, is that of why, and if so under what circumstances, we should endorse the output of evolutionary procedures. Should one equilibrium be preferred to another merely because it was the output of an evolutionary procedure? Surely we would want reasons independent of history for reflectively endorsing some equilibrium. This problem highlights the concern that social contracts that are the product of evolutionary procedures will not meet the publicity condition in the right kind of way. If the publicity condition seems harder to meet, the evolutionary approach provides a powerful and dynamic way to understand stability. Following Maynard Smith (1982), we can see stability as being an evolutionarily stable strategy equilibrium or an ESS. Basically, this is the idea that an equilibrium in an evolutionary game where successful strategies replicate at higher rates is stable if the equilibrium composition of the population in terms of strategies is not susceptible to invasion by a mutant strategy. An ESS is an application of the Nash equilibrium concept to populations. A population is evolutionarily stable when a mutant strategy is not a better response to the population than the current mix of strategies in the population. This gives a formal interpretation of Rawls’s conception of “inherent stability” and to Buchanan’s notion that social contracts should be able to withstand subversion by a sub-population of knaves. This new conception of stability combined with the dynamic nature of evolutionary games provides interesting new ways for the social contract theorist to model the output of the contract.

4. The Object of Agreement

Social contract theories differ about the object of the contract. In the traditional contract theories of Hobbes and Locke, the contract was about the terms of political association. In particular, the problem was the grounds and limits of citizen’s obligation to obey the state. In his early formulation, Rawls’s parties deliberated about “common practices” (1958). In his later statement of his view, Rawls took the object of agreement to be principles of justice to regulate “the basic structure:”

The basic structure is understood as the way in which the major social institutions fit together into one system, and how they assign fundamental rights and duties and shape the division of advantages that arises through social cooperation. Thus the political constitution, the legally enforced forms of property, and the organization of the economy, and the nature of the family, all belong to the basic structure. (Rawls 1996, 258)

For Rawls, as for most contemporary contract theorists, the object of agreement is not, at least directly, the grounds of political obligation, but the principles of justice that regulate the basic institutions of society. Freeman (2007a: 23), focuses on “the social role of norms in public life.” Buchanan is concerned with justifying constitutional orders of social and political institutions (2000 [1975]). Gauthier (1986), Scanlon (1998), Darwall (2006), Southwood (2010), and Gaus (2011a) employ the contract device to justify social moral norms or rules.

The level at which the object of the contract is described is apt to affect the outcome of the agreement. “A striking feature of Hobbes’ view,” Russell Hardin points out, “is that it is a relative assessment of whole states of affairs. Life under one form of government versus life under anarchy” (2003, 43). Hobbes could plausibly argue that everyone would agree to the social contract because “life under government” is, from the perspective of everyone, better than “life under anarchy” (the baseline condition). However, if a Hobbesian sought to divide the contract up into, say, more fine-grained agreements about the various functions of government, she is apt to find that agreement would not be forthcoming on many functions. As we “zoom in” (Lister, 2010) on more fine-grained functions of government, the contract is apt to become more limited. If the parties are simply considering whether government is better than anarchy, they will opt for just about any government (including, say, one that funds the arts); if they are considering whether to have a government that funds the arts or one that doesn’t, it is easy to see how they may not agree on the former. In a similar way, if the parties are deliberating about entire moral codes, there may be wide agreement that all the moral codes, overall, are in everyone’s interests; if we “zoom in” in specific rights and duties, we are apt to get a very different answer.

In multi-level contract theories such as we find in the work of Buchanan’s (2000 [1975], Moehler’s (2018), or Thrasher (2020), each stage or level has its own unique object. In Buchanan’s theory, the object of the constitutional stage is a system of constraints that will allow individuals to peacefully co-exist, what Buchanan calls the “protective state” (2000 [1975]). On his view, the state of nature is characterized by both predation and defense. One’s ability to engage in productive enterprises is decreased because of the need to defend the fruits of those enterprises against those who would rely on predation rather than production. We all have reason to contract, according to Buchanan, in order to increase the overall ability of everyone to produce by limiting the need for defense by constraining the ability to engage in predation. Once the solution to the predation-production conflict has been solved by the constitutional contract, members of society also realize that if all contributed to the production of various public goods, the productive possibility of society would be similarly increased. This second, post-constitutional stage, involves what Buchanan calls the “productive state.” Each stage is logically distinct though there are causal relationships between changes made at one stage and the efficacy and stability of the solution at the later stage. The distinction between the two stages is analogous to the traditional distinction between commutative and distributive justice. Although these two are often bound up together in contemporary contract theory, one of Buchanan’s novel contributions is to suggest that there are theoretical gains to separating these distinct objects of agreement.

Moehler’s (2017) “multi-level” contract has several aspects. First, drawing on their pluralistic moral commitments individuals seek to agree on social-moral rules that all can endorse as a common morality. This object of this agreement is similar to that of Darwall’s, Gaus’s and Southwood’s models. The second-level agreement is appropriate to circumstances in which pluralism is so deep and wide no common morality can be forged. Rather than moral agents, the parties are reconceived as instrumentally rational prudential agents: the object of this second level is rules of cooperation that advance the interests of all when a deeper moral basis cannot be uncovered.

5. What Does the Contract Show?

Suppose, then, that we have arrived at some social contract. Depending on the initial justificatory problem, it will yield an outcome R (principles, rules, etc. that have some normative property L—such as justice, morality, authority, obligation, legitimacy, mutual benefit, and so on. But, supposing that the contract has generated a principle, rule, etc. with the relevant normative property, precisely what is shown by the fact that this principle or rule was generated through the contractual device?

Throughout we have been distinguishing the justificatory problem from the deliberative model. Now the strongest that could be claimed for a contractual argument is that the outcome of the deliberative model is constitutive of both the correct solution of the justificatory problem and the conclusion that “R has L.” On this “constructivist” reading of the outcome of the deliberative model, there is no independent and determinate external justification that R has L, which the contractual device is intended to approximate, but, rather, that R is the outcome of the deliberative model is the truth-maker for “R has L”.

Rawls, along with Gauthier and Buchanan, was sometimes attracted to such a reading. Rawls (1999, 104) describes the argument from the original position as invoking “pure procedural justice”—the deliberative situation is so set up that whatever principles it generates are, by the fact of their generation, just. But, his considered position is that the outcome of the deliberative model is indicative (not constitutive) of the correct solution to “the question of justification” (1999, 16).

We might say that the deliberative model is evidence of the proper answer to the question of justification. However, this is still consistent with Rawls’s “constructivism” because the answer to the justificatory problem is constitutive of R’s having L. So we might say that Rawls’s two principles are just—simply because they are in reflective equilibrium with the considered judgments of you and me and that they would be chosen in the original position is indicative of this.

The weakest interpretation of the contract is that the contractual result is simply indicative of the correct answer to the justificatory problem, which itself is simply indicative of the fact that R has L. One could be a “realist,” maintaining that whether R has L is a fact that holds whether or not the contract device generates R has L, and independently of whether the correct answer to our justificatory problem (i.e., what we can justify to each other) is that R has L. There is still logical space for a type of contractualism here, but an indicative contractualism of this sort would not be a form of “constructivism.” Some, for example, have argued that Scanlon’s theory is actually based on a sort of natural rights theory, where these rights are prior to the contract (Mack 2007). Even if this is correct, Scanlon can be a sort of social contract theorist. The diversity of possible approaches within social contract theory indicates the variety of different uses to which social contract theory can be applied.

6. Conclusion: The Social Contract and Justification

The social contract theories of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau all stressed that the justification of the state depends on showing that everyone would, in some way, consent to it. By relying on consent, social contract theory seemed to suppose a voluntarist conception of political justice and obligation: what counts as “justice” of “obligation” depends on what people agree to—whatever that might be. Only in Kant (1797) does it become clear that consent is not fundamental to a social contract view: we have a duty to agree to act according to the idea of the “original contract.” Rawls’s revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted as a way to help solve the problem of justification. As the question of public justification takes center stage, it becomes clear that posing the problem of justification in terms of a deliberative or a bargaining problem is a heuristic: the real issue is “the problem of justification”—what principles can be justified to all reasonable citizens or persons.


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In September 2008, Gerald Gaus became a co-author of this entry for the purpose of maintaining it and keeping it current. In December 2011, Gaus was joined by co-author John Thrasher. Changes introduced in these versions reflect joint modifications to the entry which had been solely authored and maintained by Fred D’Agostino. In 2020, Thrasher became solely responsible for updates.

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Gerald Gaus
John Thrasher <>

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