Political Obligation

First published Tue Apr 17, 2007; substantive revision Mon Mar 15, 2021

This entry follows the traditional practice of equating political obligation with a moral duty to obey the law of one’s country or state. How does one acquire such an obligation, and how many people have really done what is necessary to acquire it? Or is a political obligation more a matter of being than of doing – that is, of simply being a member of the country or state in question? To those questions many answers have been given, and none now commands widespread assent. Indeed, a number of contemporary political philosophers deny that a satisfactory theory of political obligation either has been or can be devised. Others, however, continue to believe that there is a solution to what is commonly called “the problem of political obligation,” and they are presently engaged in a lively debate not only with the skeptics but also with one another on the question of which theory, if any, provides the solution to the problem.

The history of political thought is replete with attempts to provide a satisfactory account of political obligation, from the time of Socrates to the present. These attempts have become increasingly sophisticated in recent years, but they have brought us no closer to agreement on a solution to the problem of political obligation than the efforts of, say, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke in the seventeenth century. Nor have these sophisticated attempts made it unnecessary to look back to earlier efforts to resolve the problem. On the contrary, an appreciation of the troublesome nature of political obligation requires some attention to its place in the history of political thought.

This essay begins, therefore, with a brief history of the problem of political obligation. It then turns, in Part 2, to the conceptual questions raised by political obligation, such as what it means for an obligation to be political. In Part 3 the focus is on the skeptics, with particular attention to the self-proclaimed philosophical anarchists, who deny that political obligations exist yet do not maintain that the state is necessarily unjustifiable. Part 4 surveys the leading contenders among the various theories of political obligation now on offer, and Part 5 concludes the essay with a consideration of recent proposals for pluralistic or “multiple principle” approaches.

1. Political Obligation in Historical Perspective

The phrase “political obligation” is apparently no older than T. H. Green’s Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation, delivered at Oxford University in 1879–80 (D’Entrèves, p. 3). The two words from which Green formed the phrase are much older, of course, and he apparently thought that combining them required no elaborate explanation or defense. In any case, there was nothing novel about the problem Green addressed in his lectures: “to discover the true ground or justification for obedience to law” (Green 1986, p. 13). Sophocles raised this problem in his play Antigone, first performed around 440 BCE, and Plato’s Crito recounts Socrates’ philosophical response to the problem, in the face of his own death, some forty years later.

1.1 Socrates on Obeying the Law

In 399 BCE an Athenian jury found Socrates guilty of impiety and corrupting the morals of the youth, for which crimes the jury condemned him to death. According to Plato’s account, Socrates’ friends arranged his escape, but he chose to stay and drink the fatal hemlock, arguing that to defy the judgment against him would be to break his “agreements and commitments” and to “mistreat” his friends, his country, and the laws of Athens (Crito, 54c; Trial and Death, p. 54). Socrates’ arguments are sketchy, and Crito, his interlocutor, does little to challenge them, but they are nevertheless suggestive of the theories of political obligation that have emerged in the two and a half millennia since his death.

These arguments fall into at least four categories. First, Socrates maintains that his long residence in Athens shows that he has entered into an agreement with its laws and committed himself to obey them – an argument that anticipates the social contract or consent theory of political obligation. Second, he acknowledges that he owes his birth, nurture, and education, among other goods, to the laws of Athens. Together with the explicit analogy he draws between a father’s rightful claim to his children’s obedience and Athens’ rightful claim to her citizens’ obedience, these observations point toward a membership or associative account of political obligation. Third, Socrates appeals to what is now known as the argument from fairness or fair play when he suggests that to disregard his legal sentence would be to free-ride on his fellow citizens, enjoying the benefits provided by their complying with the law while refusing to bear the cost of doing so himself. As he asks Crito, “if we leave here without the city’s permission, are we mistreating people whom we should least mistreat?” (50a) Finally, there is a trace of utilitarian reasoning when Socrates imagines “the laws and the state” confronting him with this challenge: “do you think it possible for a city not to be destroyed if the verdicts of its courts have no force but are nullified and set at naught by private individuals?” (50b) None of these arguments is fully developed, but their presence in the Crito testifies to the staying power of intuitions and concepts – commitment and agreement, gratitude, fair play, and utility – that continue to figure in discussions of obligation and obedience.

Plato’s Crito is noteworthy not only as the first philosophical exploration of political obligation but also as the last to appear for centuries. To be sure, the Cynics and others did question the value of political life, and indirectly the existence of an obligation to obey the law, but they left no record of a discussion of the subject as sustained as even the five or six pages in the Crito. When the morality of obedience and disobedience next became a much discussed issue, it was a religious as much as a philosophical discussion.

1.2 Divine Command

Throughout history, the belief that political society and its rules are divinely ordained has been so strong as to keep many people, and probably most, from considering the possibility that disobeying those rules might ever be justified. With the advent of Christianity, however, that possibility had to be taken seriously. For the Christian, the distinction Jesus draws (Matthew 22:15–22) between the tribute owed to Caesar and that owed to God makes it clear that what the rulers command may be at odds with what God wants done. That point became even clearer when the rulers tried to suppress Christianity. Nevertheless, Christian doctrine held that there is an obligation to obey the law grounded in divine command, with the most important text being Paul’s Epistle to the Romans (13:1–2): “For there is no authority except from God, and those that exist have been instituted by God. Therefore he who resists the authorities resists what God has appointed, and those who resist will incur judgment.”

As a theory of political obligation, divine command faces two general problems. First, it presupposes the existence of divinity of some sort; and second, the commands of the divine being(s) are not always clear. It is one thing to know that we should give to Caesar what is Caesar’s and to God what is God’s, for example, and quite another to know what exactly is Caesar’s due. For Christians, however, the main challenge was to reconcile Paul’s text with the uncomfortable fact that rulers were often hostile to Christianity – or, with the rise of Protestantism in the sixteenth century, hostile to what one took to be true Christianity. To this challenge, one response was simply to hold that hostile or vicious rulers must be endured, for God must have given them power as a sign of His displeasure with a wicked people. Other responses, though, made room for disobedience.

One such response was to distinguish the divinely ordained office from the officer who occupied it. That is, God ordains that political authority must exist, because the condition of human life since the fall from grace requires such authority; but God does not ordain that this or that particular person hold a position of authority, and He certainly does not want rulers to abuse their authority by ruling tyrannically. This distinction, employed as early as the fourth century by St. John Chrysostom, was invoked throughout the middle ages (McIlwain, pp. 152–53). A second response to the problem Romans 13 posed was to distinguish disobedience from resistance. According to Martin Luther and others who drew this distinction, Christians may not actively resist their rulers, but they must disobey them when the rulers’ commands are contrary to God’s. Yet a third response was to note the possibility of conflict between two or more of one’s rulers. In other words, if more than one person holds political authority over you, and if they issue conflicting commands, then you may satisfy Paul’s injunction by obeying the authority whose commands are more congenial to your understanding of true Christianity, even when such obedience entails resisting the commands of others in authority.

These last two responses played an especially important part in the political disputes that accompanied the Protestant Reformation. Under the pressure of those disputes, however, another theory of political obligation became increasingly prominent, as Protestants came to rely on the belief that political authority derives from the consent of the governed (Skinner, vol. 2, chaps. 7–9).

1.3 The Social Contract

Although the idea of the social contract long antedates the modern era (Gough 1967), its full development occurred in the seventeenth century, when Thomas Hobbes and John Locke used the theory to rather different ends. Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Immanuel Kant, and other philosophers have also relied on social contract theory – in Kant’s case, in ways we will examine below (§1.5) – but the classic expressions of the contract theory of political obligation remain Hobbes’s Leviathan (1651) and Locke’s Second Treatise of Government (1690).

For Hobbes, social contract theory established the authority of anyone who was able to wield and hold power. If we imagine ourselves in a state of nature, he argued, with no government and no law to guide us but the law of nature, we will recognize that everyone is naturally equal and independent. But we should also recognize that this state of nature will also be a state of war, for the “restless desire for Power after power” that drives all of us will lead to “a warre of every man against every man” (Hobbes, chaps. 11, 13). To escape so dreadful a condition, people surrender their independence by entering into a covenant to obey a sovereign power that will have the authority to make, enforce, and interpret laws. This form of the social contract Hobbes called “sovereignty by institution.” But he also insisted that conquerors acquire authority over those they subject to their rule – “sovereignty by acquisition” – when they allow those subjects to go about their business. In either case, Hobbes said, the subjects consent to obey those who have effective power over them, whether the subject has a choice in who holds power or not. Because they consent, they therefore have an obligation to obey the sovereign, whether sovereignty be instituted or acquired.

Exactly how much Locke differs from Hobbes in his conclusions is a matter of scholarly dispute, but there is no doubt that he puts the same concepts to work for what seem to be more limited ends. According to Locke, the free and equal individuals in the state of nature establish government as a way of overcoming the “inconveniencies” of that state. Moreover, Locke’s social contract appears to have two stages. In the first stage the naturally free and equal individuals agree to form themselves into a political society, under law, and in the second they establish the government. This move allows Locke to argue, contrary to Hobbes, for a right of revolution on the ground that overthrowing the government will not immediately return the people to the state of nature. Nor does he hold, with Hobbes, that mere submission to a conqueror constitutes a form of consent to the conqueror’s rule.

Locke does agree with Hobbes, of course, in deriving obligations to obey the law from the consent of the governed. In developing his argument, however, he reveals several problems that have bedeviled social contract theory. One has to do with the nature of the contract: is it historical or hypothetical? If the former, then the problem is to show that most people truly have entered into such a contract (at least if one’s aim is to show that most people have a duty to obey the law). If the contract is meant to be a device that illustrates how people would have given their consent, on the other hand, then the difficulty is that a hypothetical contract “is no contract at all” (Dworkin, 1977, p. 151). Two more problems concern how to characterize acts that count as consent. Though Hobbes maintains that submission to a conqueror qualifies as such an act, few are now likely to accept that agreement at the point of a sword gives rise to a moral obligation to obey (as opposed to a prudential reason to do so). Indeed, it is not clear that consent is really the key to political obligation in Hobbes’s theory; rather, we have an obligation to obey anyone who can maintain order. As for Locke, he seems to stretch the notion of tacit consent too far when he states, in §119 of the Second Treatise, that the “very being of anyone within the territories” expresses a person’s willing submission to the rule of its government.

One of the first to find fault with the argument from consent or contract was David Hume. In “Of the Original Contract,” published in 1752, Hume takes particular exception to the appeal to tacit consent. To say that most people have given their consent to obey the laws simply by remaining in their country of birth is tantamount to saying that someone tacitly consents to obey a ship’s captain “though he was carried on board while asleep and must leap into the ocean and perish the moment he leaves her” (1953, p. 51). For Hume, the obligation to obey the law derives not from consent or contract but from the straightforward utility of a system of laws that enables people to pursue their interests peacefully and conveniently.

1.4 Utility and Obligation

For all its influence in other areas of legal, moral, and political philosophy, utilitarianism has found few adherents among those who believe that there is a general obligation to obey the laws of one’s country. Part of the reason for this situation may be the fact that Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and others who followed Hume’s path had little to say about political obligation. A more powerful reason, though, is that utilitarians have trouble accounting for obligations of any kind. If one’s guiding principle is always to act to maximize expected utility, or promote the greatest happiness of the greatest number, then obligations seem to have little or no binding force. After all, if I can do more good by giving the money in my possession to charity than by paying my debts, then that is what I should do, notwithstanding my obligations to my creditors. By the same reasoning, whether I should obey or disobey the law is a matter to be settled by considering which will do more good, not by determining whether I have an obligation to obey.

Some utilitarian philosophers have struggled to overcome this problem, either by pointing to reasons to believe that respecting obligations serves to promote utility or by restricting calculations of utility to rules or norms rather than to individual acts (see the entry on “consequentialism” for details). Whether their efforts have been successful remains a matter of debate. There seems to be a consensus, however, that the most sophisticated attempts to provide a utilitarian grounding for political obligation, such as those of Rolf Sartorius (1975, chaps. 5 and 6) and R. M. Hare (1976), have proved unsuccessful (e.g., Simmons 1979, pp. 45–54; Horton 2010, pp. 60–69). As a result, utilitarianism seldom figures in the debates of those contemporary political philosophers who continue to believe that there is, in some political societies, a general obligation to obey the law.

1.5 Kant on Legitimacy and Obligation

In contrast to utilitarianism, the practical philosophy of the eighteenth-century German philosopher Immanuel Kant plays a major part in contemporary debates about political obligation. The proper direction of his influence, however, is not altogether settled. On the one hand, a leading “philosophical anarchist,” Robert Paul Wolff, claims Kantian inspiration for his a priori rejection of the possibility of political obligation (see §3.1, below); on the other hand, important exponents of the “natural duty” approach to the obligation to obey the law also claim to derive their arguments from Kant (see §4.4, below). Kant may bear some responsibility for fostering these divergent responses, but it is safe to say that he himself was no anarchist, not even of the “philosophical” sort. Indeed, he seems to insist on an unqualified obligation to obey the law that goes well beyond what any political philosopher nowadays will countenance.

Kant’s theory employs the same basic concepts as Hobbes’s and Locke’s – natural (or innate) rights, the state of nature, and the social contract – but he puts them to different use. In contrast to Hobbes, Kant looks upon the coercive force of the law not as a limitation on freedom but as the means of securing and extending it. In the state of nature, as he conceives of it, individuals may enjoy “wild, lawless freedom,” but the threats and constraints imposed by others prevent them from freely acting on their choices (1991 [1797], p. 127). Justified coercion under law provides a remedy by impeding those who would interfere with one’s actions, thereby hindering the hindrances to freedom (Ripstein 2009, pp. 54–55 et passim). Moreover, unlike Locke’s justification of the social contract as the way to secure one’s property and escape the “inconveniencies” of the state of nature, Kant takes the “civil condition” produced by the social contract to be the foundation that property rights and justice in general presuppose. The social contract is thus not a matter of collective consent but a moral imperative: “When you cannot avoid living side by side with all others, you ought to leave the state of nature and proceed with them into a rightful condition, that is, a condition of distributive justice” (1991, pp. 121–22). “Properly speaking,” Kant declares, the original contract is not an expression of consent to be governed; it is “the Idea of this act, in terms of which alone we can think of the legitimacy of a state” (1991, p. 127).

The upshot, as noted above, is that everyone seems to have an absolute obligation to obey the laws of whoever is in authority; for even if the ruler “proceeds contrary to law … subjects may indeed oppose this injustice by complaints … but not by resistance” (1991, p. 130, emphasis in original; also pp. 176–77). Kant’s comments on this point are not unqualified, though. Among other things, he states that “the spirit of the original contract … involves an obligation on the part of the constituting authority to make the kind of government suited to the Idea of the original contract”; and he immediately adds that “the only constitution that accords with right” is “that of a pure republic” – that is, “the constitution in which law itself rules and depends on no particular person” (1991, p. 148, emphasis in original; for further discussion, see Ripstein 2009, chap. 11). In any case, it is not so much Kant’s conclusions as the foundations of his theory that have proved so important to contemporary discussions of political obligation.

2. Conceptual Matters

In the twentieth century political philosophers devoted themselves at least as much to the analysis of the problem of political obligation, and to the concepts it involves, as to full-scale attempts to devise theories of the obligation to obey the law. Some even argued that the existence of political obligations could be established by conceptual analysis alone – a point we return to in section 3. More often philosophers working in this vein sought to clarify what was at issue in the assertion or denial of political obligations, or duties to obey the law.

2.1 Obligation and Duty

As the previous sentence suggests, obligations are also duties. That is true, at any rate, when the obligation in question is political obligation. To be sure, some philosophers claim to have uncovered differences between obligations and duties, the most important of which is that obligations must be voluntarily undertaken or incurred, but duties need not be (e.g., Brandt 1964; Hart 1958). The obligation to keep a promise or fulfill a contract, for example, arises only when one has done something that generates the obligation – made a promise or signed a contract – but the duties of charity and truth telling supposedly fall on us regardless of what, if anything, we voluntarily commit to do. John Rawls relies on this distinction when he argues that most citizens of a reasonably just political society have no general obligation to obey its laws, even though they do have a “natural duty” to support just institutions – a duty he thinks has the general effect of requiring them to obey (Rawls 1999, p. 97). For the most part, however, the alleged distinction between obligation and duty has played no significant role in the debates over the supposed moral responsibility to obey the law. To invoke the distinction here would run counter to the tendency in both ordinary language and contemporary philosophical discussion to use the terms interchangeably, as when we speak of the “duty” to keep a promise or an “obligation” to tell the truth. This essay will proceed, then, like almost everything written on either side of the question, on the understanding that a political obligation, if it exists, is a moral duty to obey the law (but note the elaboration of this point in §2.3).

2.2 Obligation: Political, Legal, and Civil

One question that immediately arises from this conception of political obligation is whether “political” is the appropriate modifier. If the obligation in question is a duty to obey the law, then why not call it a legal obligation? The answer is that “legal obligation” has a different kind of work to do. For many legal philosophers, the claim that a person has a legal obligation to do X is merely a descriptive claim, a statement of social fact [see the entry on Legal Positivism]. The fact that a person has a legal obligation to do X provides him with a moral reason to do X only if he has a moral duty obey the law; that is, a political obligation. The value of this distinction is that it allows one to hold that a person may be subject to a legal obligation even though she has no political obligation to obey the laws of the regime in power. Suppose that the regime is tyrannical, inept, or simply so unjust that only a Hobbesian would maintain that those subject to its commands have a moral obligation to obey. Nevertheless, most theorists will agree that people in this unhappy country have legal obligations to pay taxes, refrain from certain types of conduct when driving, and do whatever the legal system that enjoys de facto jurisdiction over them requires; that is, claims to this effect are true descriptions of the world. But such descriptions are compatible with the belief that the people of unhappy countries have no moral duty to act as the law directs simply because the law so directs.

Bhikhu Parekh (1993, p. 240) employs the phrase “civil obligation” to refer to “the obligation to respect and uphold the legitimately constituted civil authority,” from which follows a moral obligation “to obey the laws enacted by the civil authority.” “Political” is a broader term, according to Parekh, and someone who has a truly political obligation will owe her polity more than mere obedience to its laws, such as a positive duty to take steps to secure the safety and advance the interests of her country. (see also Raz 2006, p. 1004). Yet we already have a term, “civic duty,” that does the work Parekh wants to assign to “political obligation.” Exhortations to do our civic duty typically urge us to do more than merely obey the law. These exhortations would have us vote in elections and be well-informed voters; buy government bonds; limit our use of water and other scarce resources; donate blood, service, or money (beyond what we owe in taxes) in times of crisis; and generally contribute in an active way to the common good. Whether we really have a civic duty to do any or all of these things may be a matter of dispute, but appeals to civic duty are certainly quite common, and it is hardly clear that there is something to be gained by reclassifying them as appeals to political obligation.

We now turn to the question of whether we should distinguish the concept of political obligation from that of a duty to obey the law. The answer may depend on whether we understand the term “political” to refer to the status in virtue of which a person has the obligation or to the entity or agent to whom she owes it. In the former case, political obligation refers to those obligations a person has as a member or citizen of a particular polity. So understood, a theory of political obligation will tell us nothing about the authority a state enjoys over non-members; for example, whether and why short-term visitors residing on its territory have a duty to obey its laws. That need not render it defective as an account of political obligation, but it does entail that we should not take the phrase “political obligation” to be synonymous with the phrase “a duty to obey the law simpliciter,” but only with the phrase “a citizen’s (or member’s) duty to obey the law.” In contrast, if “political” refers to the agent or entity to whom a person owes the obligation, then a theory of political obligation will be synonymous with a theory of the duty to obey the law, since it will aspire to explain why those who are subject to a particular state’s jurisdiction, be they citizens or foreigners, have a moral duty to act as it directs them to act. Arguably, certain solutions to the problem of political obligation fare better when “political” refers to the status in virtue of which a person has the obligation than when it refers to the entity to which she owes it, or vice versa. For example, membership or associative approaches to political obligation may have a leg up in justifying citizens’ duties to obey the law but face a significant challenge in accounting for the obligation of foreigners to do so (see §4.3). Conversely, natural duty theories may be able to explain why anyone, citizen or not, has a duty to obey the law (i.e., the laws of one or another legal system) but struggle to explain why anyone has a duty to obey the laws of the particular state of which she is a member (see the discussion of particularity at the end of § 2.3; see also §4.4). Attention to the ambiguity in the referent of the term “political” may also support a pluralistic or multi-principle solution to the problem of political obligation; e.g., a membership justification for the duty of citizens to obey the law, and a consent justification for the duty of foreigners to do so (see §5).

2.3 Obligation, Morality, and Practical Reason

As in the five historically significant theories surveyed in the previous section, the presumption has continued to be that the answer to the problem of political obligation must be stated in moral terms. When T. H. Green set out in 1879 “to discover the true ground or justification for obedience to law,” for example, he was looking for more than prudence alone can provide. “You ought to obey the law because you will suffer if you do not” may be a powerful reason for obedience, but it is not a reason that speaks to Green’s concern with “the moral function or object served by law…” (1986, p. 13). For Green, and for almost everyone else who has pondered it, the problem of political obligation is a moral problem, and the obligation in question is a kind of moral obligation. To have a political obligation, then, is to have a moral duty to obey the law.

Margaret Gilbert has recently challenged this moralized characterization of political obligation (Gilbert 2006; Gilbert 2013). She maintains that a political obligation is a genuine obligation, by which she means that it provides a person subject to it with a sufficient, though not necessarily conclusive, reason for action that trumps considerations of inclination or self-interest. However, Gilbert distinguishes between two kinds of genuine obligations, or two senses of the term “obligation,” the first synonymous with being the subject of a moral requirement and the second with “owing” something to another (2013, pp. 391–2). Obligation in this second sense describes a normative relationship between two or more parties, one that can be created via a suitable act of will; for example, by what Gilbert calls an exercise of joint commitment. It is the second sense of obligation that Gilbert maintains we ought to employ in our analysis of the problem of political obligation, understood here as the challenge of accounting for the obligations people owe one another as co-members of a given polity. That does not preclude the development of a theory concerning when moral requirements outweigh or defeat people’s political obligations, of course. The theory of political obligation itself, however, ought to be de-moralized.

One upshot of Gilbert’s account is that it entirely separates the existence of political obligations from the justice or injustice of the political community’s institutions and laws. On her account, individuals can acquire genuine obligations in the sense of owing something to another even when their suitable act of willing is coerced or the content of what they agree to owe another is immoral. With respect to political obligation, then, neither state coercion (i.e., the absence of voluntary consent) nor the injustice of a state’s laws or institutions precludes its citizens’ acquisition of a genuine obligation to obey its laws. But why think that a promise extracted at gun point generates any reason to do that which one promised, or that a voluntary agreement to torture babies generates a genuine (albeit not conclusive) obligation to do so? Or, if coerced or immoral owing-obligations are genuine but always defeated or trumped by moral-requirement-obligations, one might wonder why we should posit their separate existence at all? One possibility is that doing so is necessary to render intelligible the response of the promisee when the coerced promisor reneges on her promise; we can understand why the promisee feels betrayed even if we do not think he is justified in feeling that way. This response, however, treats Gilbert’s account of political obligation as an explanatory theory, not a justificatory one (Lefkowitz 2007; for a response, see Gilbert 2013, pp. 406–7).

Gilbert aside, theorists of political obligation characterize it as a moral duty to obey the law. As such, it provides a person with a categorical reason for action, one that does not depend on her inclinations or self-interest. Political obligation is also typically understood to be content-independent; that is, to be a duty to obey the law as such, or simply because it is the law [Hart 1982, pp. 254–55]. Where a person has a duty to obey the law, the fact that the law requires her to X suffices to provide her with a reason to X, independent of any judgment she may make regarding the merits of performing X. The problem of political obligation, then, is not simply the question of whether a person has a reason to do that which the law would have her do. Often a person will have prudential reasons to do so, and she may have moral obligations to perform or not perform specific acts independent of their being legally required or proscribed, as in the case of forbearing from murder. Rather, the question concerns the conditions, if any, in which the fact that the law requires a person to act thus-and-so imposes a moral obligation on her to act as the law directs. The content-independence of political obligation reflects the fact that what stands in need of justification is the polity’s right to its subjects’ obedience; to their acting as it directs because it so directs them.

How best to understand the content-independence of political obligation, and indeed, whether we ought to conceive of a duty to obey the law in this way, remain live questions. For example, Stefan Sciaraffa argues that in introducing the idea of content-independence, H.L.A. Hart relies on Paul Grice’s distinction between natural and non-natural meaning. Statements with a non-natural meaning provide those to whom they are addressed with a particular kind of reason to form some belief or perform some act A, namely the intention of the agent who uttered the statement that they form that belief or perform that act. The phrase ‘content-independent reason’ is a (misleading) label for this particular kind of reason. Or as Sciaraffa puts the point, “an agent has a content-independent reason to phi if and only if someone’s intent that she phi is a reason for her to phi” (2009, p. 234). N.P. Adams counters that a reason is content-independent if and only if “it has a container as a constituent part and changing the content of that container does not determine whether the agent has that reason and does not determine the weight of that reason” (2017, p. 149). Speech-acts such as commands and promises are paradigmatic examples of containers. It is the status of an agent as morally entitled to direct another to perform some act, apart from any other considerations that count in favor of performing it, that provide the person so directed with a reason to perform that act. Sciaraffa and Adams draw on their respective accounts of content-independence to offer rejoinders to Peter Markwick’s criticisms of (a common interpretation of) content-independence (Markwick 2000). Laura Valentini maintains that “if property P, invoked to justify the authority of law, is not displayed by legal commands robustly across variations in their content, then P cannot justify an obligation to obey the law because it is the law” (2018, p. 141). She then argues that while certain common approaches to justifying political obligation, such as consent, can satisfy this understanding of content-independence, others, such as fair play, cannot. Finally, George Klosko contends that we ought to reject altogether the claim that political obligation is content-independent (Klosko 2011; see Adams, Valentini, for responses).

How can the state’s mere willing that a person perform a certain act create a moral obligation to do so? One response is to construe the successful exercise of practical authority not as the creation of moral obligations ex nihilo but as a justified claim to deference to the state’s judgment regarding what its subjects have independent reason to do. The characterization of this deference within a person’s deliberation is a matter of some dispute. H. L. A. Hart and Joseph Raz, for example, argue that law is preemptive; law does not merely offer a consideration for or against a potential course of action, to be weighed against any and all other relevant considerations. Rather, law aims to exclude from an agent’s deliberation at least some of the considerations favoring or opposing the conduct at issue, considerations that in the absence of the law it would be permissible to take into account (Raz 1979, chaps. 1 and 2). Rival views of the manner in which political obligation functions in a person’s deliberation reject the exclusionary element of Raz’s account of the duty to obey the law, arguing that political obligations are simply weighty moral reasons that are balanced against all of the other reasons a person has to perform or not perform a given act (Perry 1989). On neither account, though, is a person’s political obligation taken to provide her with an absolute duty to obey the law. Raz, for example, notes that law need not exclude all of the first-order reasons a person might have for performing a given act (1986, p. 46). Nor does he claim that the first-order reason the law provides for not performing a given act will always outweigh or defeat non-excluded first-order reasons a person has to perform that act. In other words, the duty to obey the law is a prima facie or pro tanto reason for action, from which it follows that the bearer of a political obligation may not always have a conclusive or all-things-considered reason to act as the law demands.

Theorists of political obligation typically ascribe two further features to the moral duty they seek to defend. First, the duty to obey the law is general both in the sense that it is a duty to obey the entire body of law in a given jurisdiction and in the sense that the duty is borne by all those living within that jurisdiction. Note that a general moral duty to obey the law is consistent with variation in the legal obligations different subjects bear. For example, a given state may impose on all and only its male citizens a duty to register for a military draft, in which case the full set of legal obligations borne by men in this state will differ from the full set borne by women. Nevertheless, citizens of both sexes may be subject to a general political obligation, meaning that they have a moral duty to fulfill all of their legal obligations. Raz, however, denies that the subjects of any existing state or indeed anything remotely like it have a general duty to obey the law; rather, law’s authority is piecemeal, both with respect to who has a moral duty to obey a particular law and with respect to the number of laws within a given legal system that enjoy authority over anyone.

The second feature commonly ascribed to political obligations is that they are typically conceived of as being owed only to the particular political/legal society that claims primary or exclusive jurisdiction over a person. Following John Simmons’s influential analysis, this has come to be known as “the particularity requirement.” Political obligation, Simmons maintains, carries an implicit connection to citizenship, which means that those who are engaged in the political obligation debate “are only interested in those moral requirements [including obligations and duties] which bind an individual to one particular political community, set of institutions, etc.” (1979, p. 31; but cf. Edmundson 2004, p. 232, and Walton, 2013). As indicated below, in §4.4, the main objection to natural duty theories of political obligation is that they cannot account for this particularity.

3. Anarchist Challenges to Political Obligation

Until recently, most political philosophers have assumed that subjects of a (moderately just) state have political obligations, while disputing why that is so. Indeed, in the middle years of the twentieth century some philosophers even asserted, on conceptual grounds, that political obligation needs no justification. As one of them put the point, “to ask why I should obey any laws is to ask whether there might be a political society without political obligations, which is absurd. For we mean by political society, groups of people organized according to rules enforced by some of their number” (Macdonald 1951, p. 192; also McPherson 1967, p. 64, and, more subtly, Pitkin 1966; but cf. Pateman 1973, and Horton 2010, pp. 138–46). This view did not long prevail, but it testifies to the strength of the tendency to believe that citizens surely have an obligation to obey the laws of their country, at least if it is reasonably just.

Beginning in the 1960s, however, skeptics have come to occupy a prominent place in debates over political obligation. As they see it, there is no general obligation to obey the law, not even on the part of the citizens of a reasonably just polity. The most thorough-going of these dissenters have been anarchists proper – that is, those who insist that states and governments are necessarily immoral institutions that ought to be abolished. Other skeptics or dissenters have concluded, though, that the anarchist proper is wrong about the need for the state but right about the lack of an obligation to obey the law. Like the anarchist proper, these “philosophical anarchists” hold that the state is illegitimate, but they deny that its illegitimacy entails “a strong moral imperative to oppose or eliminate states; rather they typically take state illegitimacy simply to remove any strong moral presumption in favor of obedience to, compliance with, or support for our own or other existing states” (Simmons 2001, p. 104; but note Huemer 2013, who regards philosophical anarchism as a second-best alternative that could prepare the way for anarchism proper).

3.1 Philosophical Anarchism

The arguments of these philosophical anarchists take either an “a priori” or an “a posteriori” form (Simmons 2001, pp. 104–106). Arguments of the first kind maintain that it is impossible to provide a satisfactory account of a general obligation to obey the law. According to Robert Paul Wolff, the principal advocate of this view, there can be no general obligation to obey the law because any such obligation would violate the “primary obligation” of autonomy, which is “the refusal to be ruled” (1998 [1970], p. 18). As Wolff defines it, autonomy combines freedom with responsibility. To be autonomous, someone must have the capacity for choice, and therefore for freedom; but the person who has this capacity also has the responsibility to exercise it – to act autonomously. Failing to do so is to fail to fulfill this “primary obligation” of autonomy.

This primary obligation dooms any attempt to develop a theory of political obligation, Wolff argues, except in the highly unlikely case of a direct democracy in which every law has the unanimous approval of the citizenry. Under any other form of government, autonomy and authority are simply incompatible. Authority is “the right to command, and correlatively, the right to be obeyed” (p. 4), which entails that anyone subject to authority has an obligation to obey those who have the right to be obeyed. But if we acknowledge such an authority, we allow someone else to rule us, thereby violating our fundamental obligation to act autonomously. We must therefore reject the claim that we have an obligation to obey the orders of those who purport to hold authority over us and conclude that there can be no general obligation to obey the laws of any polity that falls short of a unanimous direct democracy.

Arguments of the second, a posteriori form are more modest in their aims but no less devastating in their conclusions. In this case the aim is not to show that a satisfactory defense of political obligation is impossible but that no defense has proven satisfactory, despite the efforts of some of the best minds in the history of philosophy. All such attempts have failed, according to those who take this line, so we must conclude that only those relatively few people who have explicitly committed themselves to obey the law, perhaps by swearing allegiance as part of an oath of citizenship, have anything like a general obligation to obey the laws under which they live (e.g., Smith 1973; Raz 1979, chap. 12; Simmons 1979, 2001, chap. 6, and 2005; Green 1988, pp. 220–47, and 1996).

3.2 Against Philosophical Anarchism

Whether a priori or a posteriori, the arguments of the philosophical anarchists pose a serious challenge to those who believe in a general obligation to obey the law. This challenge is made especially difficult by the powerful objections that Simmons and other a posteriori anarchists have brought against the existing theories of political obligation. The most effective response, of course, would be to demonstrate that one’s favored theory does not succumb to these objections, and we shall briefly consider attempts to respond in this fashion in §4, below. Some general attempts to refute philosophical anarchism ought to be noted first, however.

Some of these attempts apply specifically to Wolff’s a priori attack on political authority and obligation, and others apply to philosophical anarchism in general. The arguments against Wolff usually concentrate on his conception of autonomy and its relation to authority. In brief, Wolff’s critics argue that he is wrong to insist that moral autonomy is our “primary” or “fundamental obligation,” for it “is, in fact, highly implausible to think that autonomy should invariably override all other values” (Horton, p. 127). Moreover, there is no reason to accept Wolff’s claim that autonomy and authority are necessarily incompatible. Insofar as autonomy is a capacity, as Wolff says, it will need to be developed before it can be exercised, and various kinds of authority – including political authority – will foster its development and make its continued exercise possible (Dagger 1997, pp. 66–68). Nor is it clear how Wolff can reject political authority without also rejecting promises and contracts as illegitimate constraints on one’s autonomy – a problem that leads even Simmons to declare Wolff’s a priori anarchism a “failed attempt” (2001, p. 111).

In the face of these problems, Matthew Noah Smith has recently tried to rescue the a priori skepticism of Wolff’s theory by substituting the overriding importance of “the moral status of the subject’s self” (2011, p. 2) for Wolff’s reliance on the fundamental duty of autonomy. According to Smith, preserving the status of the self is incompatible with the law’s claim to authority, because “the obligation to obey the law would morally require otherwise morally upstanding subjects to undergo a radical form of self-effacement in favor of recreating themselves in the image of foreign values” (p. 2; see p. 9 for an admittedly “florid” way of making this point). Whether the law is properly understood as an “alien force” that threatens “to fix who one is” (p. 14), however, is a point that critics of a priori anarchism are not likely to concede. Indeed, the radically individualistic conception of the self that underpins Smith’s argument is one that proponents of the membership or associative theory of political obligation (see §4.3, below) will dismiss from the outset. It seems unlikely, then, that Smith’s adaptation will develop the “traction” that, on his account, Wolff’s has failed to gain.

With regard to philosophical anarchism in general, critics have responded in various ways, including the disparate complaints that it is a kind of false or hypocritical radicalism (Gans) and that it is all too genuine a threat to political order (Senor). The latter complaint has both an ontological and a conceptual aspect. That is, the critics argue that philosophical anarchists fail to appreciate the social or embedded nature of human beings, which leads the anarchists to conceive of obligation in excessively individualistic or voluntaristic terms – and that leads, in turn, to their denial of a general obligation to obey the law. The problem, however, is that it is a mistake to think “that political life can be left more or less unchanged by dispensing with some conception of political obligation and adopting the perspective of philosophical anarchism. Unless it can be shown that we can continue to talk intelligibly and credibly of our government or our state, then a root and branch reimagining of our political relations would appear to be a necessary consequence” (Horton 2010, p. 133; emphasis in original). Whether the philosophical anarchists should welcome that consequence, or whether they can find a way to stop short of it, thus becomes a major point of contention.

In the end, of course, the best response to philosophical anarchists, especially those of the a posteriori kind, will be to produce or defend a theory of political obligation that proves immune to their objections. At present, though, no single theory has the support of all of those who continue to believe in political obligation, let alone the clear prospect of converting philosophical anarchists. Several theories remain in contention, however, as the following section indicates.

4. Contemporary Theories of Political Obligation

Although the lines that separate one theory from another are not always distinct, philosophical justifications of political obligation nowadays usually take the form of arguments from consent, fair play, membership, or natural duty. Some philosophers advance a hybrid of two or more of these approaches, and others hold, as the concluding section shows, that a pluralistic theory is necessary. For the most part, though, attempts to justify a general obligation to obey the law follow one of these four lines of argument.

4.1 Consent

Most people who believe that they have an obligation to obey the law probably think that this putative obligation is grounded in their consent. Political philosophers are less inclined to think this way, however, in light of the withering criticism to which Hume and more recent writers – notably Simmons (1979, chaps. 3 and 4) – have subjected consent theory. The critics’ claim is not that consent cannot be a source of obligations, for they typically believe that it can. Their claim, instead, is that too few people have either expressly or tacitly given the kind of actual consent that can ground a general obligation to obey the law, and hypothetical consent cannot supply the defect, for reasons already noted.

Nevertheless, consent theory still has its adherents among political philosophers. Their versions of consent theory vary considerably, though, with two main branches emerging in response to the criticisms. One response, advanced by Harry Beran (1987), accepts the claim that only express consent can generate a political obligation, but then calls for political societies to establish formal procedures for evoking such consent. That is, states should require their members openly to undertake an obligation to obey the law or to refuse to do so. Those who decline the obligation will then have the options of leaving the state, seceding to form a new state with like-minded people, or taking residence in a territory within the state reserved for dissenters. In the absence of such procedures, it seems that Beran’s position is roughly the same as that of the a posteriori philosophical anarchist. Were the procedures he recommends in place, though, it is far from clear that the options available to the members will make their “consent” truly voluntary (Klosko 2005, pp. 123–29; Horton, pp. 34–36).

The second line of response to the criticisms of consent theory is to argue in one way or another that the critics construe “consent” too narrowly. Thus John Plamenatz (1968, “Postscript”) and Peter Steinberger (2004, p. 218) have maintained that voting or otherwise participating in elections should count as consent; and Steinberger produces a lengthy list of fairly ordinary activities – calling the police or fire department for help, sending children to a public school, using a public library, and more – that constitute “active participation in the institutions of the state” (pp. 219–20). Mark Murphy and Margaret Gilbert have sounded variations on this theme by arguing, in Murphy’s case, that “surrender of judgment is a kind of consent” (in Edmundson 1999, p. 320), or, in Gilbert’s, that “joint commitment” is an important source of obligations, including political obligations (1993, 2006, 2013). For Murphy, surrender of judgment is consent in the usual sense of voluntary agreement or acceptance. As he says, “One consents to another in a certain sphere of conduct in the acceptance sense of consent when one allows the other’s practical judgments to take the place of his or her own with regard to that sphere of conduct. (This consent may be either to a person or to a set of rules: both of these can be authoritative)” (p. 330). As the earlier discussion of her ideas indicates (§2.3), Gilbert differs from Murphy, and others, in taking a joint commitment to be something that need not arise voluntarily. According to her theory, “an understanding of joint commitment and a readiness to be jointly committed are necessary if one is to accrue political obligations, as is common knowledge of these in the population in question. One can, however, fulfill these conditions without prior deliberation or decision, and if one has deliberated, one may have had little choice but to incur them” (2006, p. 290). Indeed, membership in a “plural subject” formed through non-voluntary joint commitments plays such a large part in Gilbert’s theory that it may be better to place her with those who advocate an “associative” or “membership” theory of political obligation than with adherents of consent theory.

David Estlund (2008, pp. 117–58) has recently offered a new twist on consent theory. Most theorists maintain that putative acts of consent are void if it would be wrong to consent to another’s authority. For example, consent to be another’s slave generates no obligation even if it genuinely expresses a person’s will. Estlund argues on grounds of symmetry that we ought to draw the same conclusion in cases where it would be wrong not to consent to another’s authority. Such failures are void, and so a person who morally ought to have consented to another’s authority has a duty to obey her. If subjects of a given state ought to consent to obey its laws, say because the state performs morally necessary tasks, then their failure to do so is void and no barrier to concluding that they are under a political obligation to that state. Estlund’s defense of what he labels normative consent is subtle and sophisticated. Still, one might wonder whether in cases where non-consent is void the duty to submit to another’s authority follows directly from the considerations in virtue of which it is wrong for someone not to consent (see Sreenivasan 2009). It is also unclear whether there is enough of a connection between the agent’s will and her coming to be subject to another’s authority to warrant classifying Estlund’s account as an example of consent theory (for responses to both concerns, see Estlund 2008, pp. 127–131; 2009).

4.2 Fair Play

Although earlier philosophers, including Socrates, appealed to something resembling the principle of fairness (or fair play), the classic formulation of the principle is set out in H. L. A. Hart’s “Are There Any Natural Rights?” As Hart there says, “when a number of persons conduct any joint enterprise according to rules and thus restrict their liberty, those who have submitted to these restrictions when required have a right to a similar submission from those who have benefited by their submission” (1955, p. 185). John Rawls subsequently adopted this principle in an influential essay of his own, referring to the duty derived from the principle as the “duty of fair play” (1964). What the principle of fair play holds, then, is that everyone who participates in a reasonably just, mutually beneficial cooperative practice – Hart’s “joint enterprise according to rules” – has an obligation to bear a fair share of the burdens of the practice. This obligation is owed to the others who cooperate in the enterprise, for cooperation is what makes it possible for any individual to enjoy the benefits of the practice. Anyone who acts as a free rider is acting wrongly, then, even if his or her shirking does not directly threaten the existence or success of the endeavor. Those who participate in the practice thus have rights against as well as obligations to one another: a right to require others to bear their share of the burdens and an obligation to bear one’s share in turn.

The principle of fair play applies to a political society only if its members can reasonably regard it as a cooperative enterprise that works to their mutual benefit. If it can, the members have an obligation of fair play to do their part in maintaining the enterprise. Because the rule of law is necessary to the maintenance of such a polity – and perhaps even constitutive of it – the principal form of cooperation is abiding by the law. In the absence of overriding circumstances, then, the members of the polity qua cooperative practice must honor their obligation to one another to obey the laws. In this way the principle of fair play provides the grounding for a general obligation to obey the law, at least on the part of those whose polity they can reasonably regard as a cooperative enterprise.

The argument from fair play has met with serious criticism, however. The most sweeping is that of Robert Nozick, who objects that the principle of fair play would allow others to place us under an obligation to them simply by conferring benefits on us (1974, pp. 90–95). To make his point, Nozick imagines a group of neighbors creating a public entertainment system and assigning every adult in the neighborhood a day on which he or she is responsible for planning and broadcasting a program. As a resident of the neighborhood, you occasionally hear and enjoy the programs, but you never consent to take part in this scheme. When your assigned day arrives, are you obligated to take a turn? The principle of fair play says yes, according to Nozick, but the correct answer to the question is “surely not.”

According to a second objection, fair-play considerations apply only to cooperative schemes that produce benefits one may refuse. If it produces nonexcludable goods, which everyone receives regardless of whether she contributed to their production or even wants them, then there can be no fair-play obligation to bear a share of the burdens of the enterprise. But this is typically the case in political societies, which produce goods such as public order and national defense that one cannot meaningfully refuse to accept. As Simmons puts it (1979, p. 129), there is a difference between receiving and accepting benefits, and receiving them is not enough to place someone under an obligation. If there is a political obligation, therefore, it does not follow directly from the existence of the kind of nonexcludable goods that states provide. To be sure, Simmons does acknowledge that some people may acquire fair-play obligations by enjoying nonexcludable benefits that they take to be “worth the price [they] pay for them” if they do so in full awareness that “the benefits are provided by a cooperative scheme” (1979, p. 132; emphasis in original). But he also maintains that few people will satisfy both of these conditions, with the second proving especially troublesome for advocates of fair-play theory: for “even in democratic political communities, these benefits are commonly regarded as purchased (with taxes) from a central authority, rather than as accepted from the cooperative efforts of our fellow citizens” (1979, p. 139).

As one might expect, advocates of the fair-play account have not remained silent in the face of these criticisms. The leading advocate, George Klosko, has written two books elaborating and defending the principle of fairness as the foundation of political obligation (2004 [1992], 2005), and it sometimes seems that every fresh attack on fair play provokes a swift response (e.g., Carr 2002 and Lefkowitz 2004; Zhu 2014 and Tosi 2017). And the attacks have certainly continued (e.g., Simmons 2001, chap. 2; McDermott 2004), as we shall indicate shortly. First, though, it is necessary to see how fair-play advocates have responded to the criticisms sketched above.

With regard to Nozick’s objection, the response is usually to hold that his example of the neighborhood entertainment system is beside the point (Bell 1978). That is, Nozick is probably right to say that one would have no obligation to operate the system on his or her assigned day, but he is wrong to think that fair play would require one to do so. There is no fair-play obligation in cases such as this, either because the passive receipt of benefits is not enough to show that one is a participant in a cooperative practice (Dagger 1997, pp. 69–70) or because the benefits are “of relatively little value” (Klosko 2004, pp. 38–39:). Responses to Simmons’ objections have taken two directions. One is to say that Simmons has drawn too sharp a distinction between the acceptance and receipt of benefits. Between the person who passively receives the benefits of a cooperative practice and the one who knowingly and willingly accepts them is the person – very many people, in fact – who actively participates in the practice without being fully aware, in the ordinary course of life, that she is undertaking an obligation to do her part in a cooperative practice (Dagger 1997, pp. 73–78; Besson 2005, pp. 487–89). Others respond to Simmons’ criticism by denying that obligations must be incurred voluntarily (Arneson 1982; Klosko 2004, pp. 39–57 ). What matters is not that one accepts the benefits of the practice, according to Klosko’s influential account, but that three conditions are met: “Goods supplied must be (i) worth the recipients’ effort in providing them; (ii) ‘presumptively beneficial’; and (iii) have benefits and burdens that are fairly distributed” ( 2004, p. 39 ). If, in sum, a state qualifies as a cooperative enterprise, and if it provides its members with goods that are presumptively beneficial – or “indispensable for satisfactory lives” (Klosko 2005, p. 6) – then its members have an obligation grounded in fairness to obey its laws.

These responses have not settled the debate in favor of a fair-play account of political obligation. Simmons, for example, continues to hold that modern political societies are too large and impersonal to count as cooperative enterprises (2001, pp. 38–42). He also contends that Klosko’s theory is “not really a fairness theory at all,” but a “disguised Natural Duty theory, resting on an unstated moral duty to help supply essential goods locally …” (2005, p. 190, emphasis in original; also 2007, pp. 22–23). Others complain that fair-play theory is not suitably sensitive to the possible alternatives there may have been to the cooperative practices that have emerged. We may admit, on this view, that people receive benefits from a cooperative practice, and even net benefits, but we should also notice that they might have benefited more from the establishment of a different practice. To say, in these circumstances, that those who are engaged in a cooperative practice have an obligation to do their part is to accept the principle of fairness as “a powerfully conservative principle” (Normore 2010, p. 231). Yet having a fair-play obligation to the members of an ongoing enterprise does not bar anyone from trying to transform that enterprise, perhaps even by means of civil disobedience (see the entry on Civil Disobedience).

In the political context, according to another critic, the proper comparison is between a state of affairs in which benefits follow from other people’s obeying the laws in the sense of mere compliance, on the one hand, and a situation in which benefits follow from others’ obeying “because the law says to do it” (Durning 2003, p. 255). If the benefits are the same in both cases, then there is no reason to think that true cooperation, rather than mere compliance, is producing the benefits, and hence no reason to think that those who receive the benefits have a fair-play obligation to obey the laws. This argument seems likely to do no more than renew controversies about the nature of such societies and the viability of philosophical anarchism. The question is whether we can expect a polity to survive if its “members” regard one another not as cooperators in a common enterprise but exclusively as purchasers of governmental services who comply with the law under the threat of coercion.

4.3 Membership or Association

Recent decades have witnessed a resurgence of arguments in defense of an associative account of political obligation. Associative obligations are ones that agents are alleged to have merely in virtue of their occupying a role in some socially salient relationship, such as being a parent, a friend, or a doctor. These roles are at least partly constituted by the various obligations their occupants owe to the other(s) in the relationship; to be X’s parent or Y’s friend just is to have certain duties to X or Y (as well as certain claims against them). Exactly what those obligations are varies somewhat depending on the relationship in question and the society in which the participants in that relationship are embedded. These variations reflect different conceptions of the relationship’s value or purpose, or of the particular obligations that follow from a specific conception. Whatever their number and content, associative obligations are owed only to particular others, namely those with whom an agent has a certain kind of relationship, rather than being owed universally to all moral agents or sentient beings in virtue of their status as such.

Since associative obligations attach to an agent simply in virtue of her occupying a role in a particular relationship, it makes no difference whether she comes to occupy that role voluntarily, as in the case of professional relationships and most friendships, or non-voluntarily, as in the case of sibling relationships or, in many cases, citizenship. As these examples suggest, occupying roles in various types of relationships often figures centrally in people’s identity. In part, this is a matter of people’s self-conception; many of us strongly identify with our role as parents, children, siblings, friends, teachers, members of specific religious communities, and so on. Some proponents of associative obligations advance a stronger claim, however. Human beings are not essentially unencumbered individuals who can move in and out of various roles while remaining the same person; rather, we are all embedded in a web of normative relationships, some of which we cannot exit without being “reborn” as radically different people.

An associative account of political obligation has many attractive features. It provides a justification for a duty to obey the law that does not depend on an individual’s choice or voluntary exercise of will – surely a virtue when so many people have not consented to be ruled by the state that governs them, or to be a member of the political community on whose behalf it does so. The particularity of political obligation – again, the fact that it is owed to the particular political community to which an agent belongs – follows straightforwardly from its nature as an associative obligation. So, too, does the claim that political obligation requires obedience to law. As Samuel Scheffler observes, “membership-dependent reasons are reasons for doing one’s share, as defined by the norms and ideals of the group itself, to help sustain it and contribute to its purposes” (2018, p. 17). Law specifies, perhaps incompletely, what counts as doing one’s share. John Horton makes the same point when he writes that laws “define the terms of association within a polity, [and] concern for the interests and welfare of the polity is a concern for these terms of association” (1992, p. 165). Finally, many people apparently think of themselves as members of political societies, and in virtue of that fact, believe that they have an obligation to obey its laws. To pay one’s taxes, to vote, to serve on a jury or in the armed forces, to coordinate with other members of one’s polity to ensure a safe environment, and so on, is simply to fulfill the obligations of citizenship. An associative account of political obligation captures this (allegedly) widespread sense that “deep and important obligations flow from identity and relatedness” (Tamir 1993, p. 99).

Like the other theories of political obligation, associative accounts have met with considerable criticism. One line of attack targets the parallels many of its proponents draw between the family and the polity. In Ronald Dworkin’s words, “political association, like family and friendship and other forms of association more local and intimate, is in itself pregnant of obligation” (1986, p. 206). John Horton invokes further analogs between family and polity in his argument for associative political obligation:

My claim is that a polity is, like the family, a relationship into which we are mostly born, and that the obligations which are constitutive of the relationship do not stand in need of moral justification in terms of a set of basic moral principles or some comprehensive moral theory. Furthermore, both the family and the political community figure prominently in our sense of who we are: our self-identity and our understanding of our place in the world (1992, pp. 150–51).

While some critics contest the existence of associative obligations even among family members (Wellman 1997), others acknowledge their existence but maintain that they depend on a degree of intimacy and emotional connection absent from the relationship between citizens of a modern state. As Diane Jeske writes: “[A]ll of the features of intimate relationships that seem morally significant – the mutual emotions and attitudes of the parties to each other as individuals, the personal interaction, the mutual knowledge and understanding of each other’s character – must be ignored in the grounding of associative [political] obligations. [I]f the relationships that ground associative obligations are to include political relations, the notion of a relationship has to be stretched beyond recognition” (2001, p. 38; see also Simmons 1996; Wellman 1997; Dagger 2000). Advocates of associative political obligation offer two (complementary) responses. First, some contend that citizens of modern states can and do care for their fellow citizens and the health of their common political community, even if their relationships with one another do not approximate the intimacy we find in a (healthy) nuclear family. The concern for one’s polity, and its present, past, and future members, reflects the special relationship one bears to them, and therefore differs from the concern a person may have for all moral agents or sentient beings as such. Second, we should not assume that a relationship must be characterized by intimacy or specific types of emotional connection in order to have the sort of value that can justify associative obligations (Horton and Windeknecht 2015, p. 907, Scheffler 2018, p. 10). Even if intimacy is a necessary condition for realizing the good of friendship, and love a necessary condition for realizing the non-instrumental value of the parent-child relationship, it does not follow that they are necessary for achieving the (non-instrumental) value of political association.

Nevertheless, defenders of an associative account of political obligation owe their interlocutors an account of what makes political association valuable. The emphasis these theorists have placed on membership or association as the ground of political obligation, whilst giving relatively little attention to what makes it valuable, has invited the following objection: if membership is sufficient to generate an obligation to obey, then the members of unjust and exploitative groups will have an obligation to obey the rules. In the case of the polity, this leads to the unpalatable and counter-intuitive conclusion that the routinely exploited and oppressed “members” of an unjust polity are under an obligation to obey its laws (Dagger 2000; 2018, p. 89).

The obvious rejoinder is to deny that unjust associations have the sort of value that can ground associative obligations, or at least that this is so for those “members” who are routinely exploited and oppressed. Thus, John Horton develops a two-pronged account of associative political obligation according to which a polity must provide its citizens “the generic good of order and security” and its members must identify with it and acknowledge its political authority (Horton 2010). Similarly, Scheffler maintains that “the value of one’s membership is not independent of the nature of the society or the justice of its institutions,” (2018, p. 14) while Ronald Dworkin holds that associative political obligations arise only among members of a community of principle, one committed to the treatment of all its members with equal concern and respect (1986, pp. 213–215). Whereas these rejoinders all make associative political obligations conditional on the polity adequately satisfying certain substantive moral standards, Massimo Renzo sketches a response that focuses instead on what makes a person a member of a political society. His answer is a “quasi-voluntarist reformulation of the associative model” which holds that we voluntarily occupy our roles even in families and polities as long as “we could have stepped out of them if we had wanted” (2012, p. 109, p. 120). Oppressed “members” of a polity have no associative obligations, at least if stepping out of their role as “members” is not an option available to them at a reasonable cost.

Critics maintain that in offering responses like those just described, associative theorists effectively abandon their attempt to provide a distinctive account of political obligation (Dagger 2018, p. 79–82; Wellman 2000, p. 553; Simmons 2001, pp. 83–84; 2005, pp. 111–115). That is because the moral duty to perform the (conventional) duties that constitute the role of citizen ultimately depends either on an agent’s exercise of will, i.e. consent or accepting the benefits of others’ cooperation, or a natural duty, such as the duty to support just institutions or the duty to maximize aggregate welfare. In all of these cases, citizens’ duty to obey the law ultimately depends on a consideration other than their membership in the polity. The task of morally justifying political obligation bottoms out not in the fact of association but in a moral principle external to it.

Some associative theorists respond that the critics conflate considerations that disable associative obligations with considerations that ground or justify associative obligations (Horton and Windeknecht 2015, p. 914; Scheffler 2018, p. 11). For instance, it may be that the freedom to exit a relationship is a necessary condition for it being one that has the sort of value that justifies obligations on the part of those who participate in it. Awareness of the impossibility of exit may lead a person to feel alienated from their role in the relationship, or otherwise preclude it from being one that is valuable for that person. Yet it is the good realized in the relationship that justifies participants’ claims against one another, and the duties to which they correlate, not any consent implicit in their continued participation in it.

Another rejoinder starts from the observation that actual associations between family, friends, and fellow citizens are typically approximations of moralized ideal types. That is, considerations of fairness, respect, care, and reliance are part and parcel of our concepts of parent, sibling, friend, and citizen. Thus, the invocation of unfairness, disrespect, or neglect to rebut the claim that one has a duty to Ø because one occupies the role of sibling or citizen need not involve an appeal to some moral principle external to the relationship. Instead, it may involve an appeal to a principle internal to the relationship; that is, to a moralized conception of what it is to be a sibling or citizen. This line of argument entails that obligation-generating associations exist only where they realize the relevant ideal-type to a sufficient degree; all genuine associations or relationships are, necessarily, good or valuable associations. Thus, an associative theorist who adopts this line of argument has a ready response to the allegation that she is committed to the conclusion that exploited or oppressed citizens have a duty to obey the law: since they have no genuine political association or common citizenship with their oppressors, they have none of the duties that flow from such a relationship when it exists.

A last response holds that freedom, equality, fairness, and so on are not abstract principles from which we can derive the existence or non-existence of political obligation; rather, they are regulative ideals to which (a sufficient number of) participants in genuine political communities are committed, despite their many differences on points of detail large and small. There is no vantage point outside the specific, historical, political communities in which we are inevitably situated, from which we can identify the true bases of our moral obligations and so determine whether we have a moral duty to obey the law. Thus, there is no abstract, universal, moral principle of fairness, utility, respect for autonomy, etc., that provides a firm foundation for associative obligations, or at least not one to which we have any access. Rather, there are only the concrete practices of fairness, welfare-promotion, and so on realized in actual polities. “Political obligations are practical commitments that come into play through participants’ mutually holding each other to account in political practices,” (Fossen 2014, p. 231) not truths derived from more basic principles comprehended via an act of intellect.

4.4 Natural Duty

The final contenders in the political obligation debates are natural duty accounts. In this context, natural duties are understood to be ones people have simply in virtue of their status as moral agents; they need do nothing to acquire them, nor does their bearing such duties depend on their occupying some role in a socially salient relationship. Natural duties are also universal in scope; they are owed to all members of a class defined in terms of possession of some feature, such as sentience or rationality. John Rawls first broached such an argument for political obligation when he asserted in A Theory of Justice that everyone is subject to a natural duty of justice that “requires us to support and to comply with just institutions that exist and apply to us” (1999, p. 99). More recently, political philosophers and theorists including Jeremy Waldron (1999), Thomas Christiano (2008), Christopher Heath Wellman (2005), Anna Stilz (2009) and, arguably, David Estlund (2008; see section 4.1 above) have refined and expanded upon Rawls’s somewhat vague contention, some of them in ways reminiscent of or even explicitly modeled on Kant’s defense of political obligation (see section 1.5 above).

Contemporary natural duty theorists differ over the natural duty that provides the basis for political obligation. Christiano grounds his account in a fundamental principle of justice requiring the equal advancement of people’s interests, Wellman in a Samaritan duty of easy rescue, and Stilz in a Kantian duty of respect for others’ freedom-as-independence, understood as a secure sphere of self-determination defined by a person’s rights. These theorists agree, however, that moral agents can discharge their natural duty to others only through submission to the authority of a common legal order. This is so for several reasons: the demands of justice are sometimes underdetermined; its achievement requires the resolution of coordination problems; and most importantly, people reasonably disagree over the demands of justice. Christiano traces this disagreement to what he calls the facts of judgment: diversity in people’s natural talents and cultural surroundings, cognitive biases in their interpretation of people’s interests and the value assigned to their own interests relative to the value assigned to the interests of others, and fallibility in both moral and non-moral judgment. In light of these facts, even those who make a good faith effort to discern what justice requires of them in their interaction with others will fail to reach a consensus. Agents who act on their own, private, judgment of justice will be perceived by others to be acting unjustly. If some are able to unilaterally impose their conception of justice on others, the latter will not enjoy freedom-as-independence (Stilz 2009), or will suffer the violation of their fundamental interests in being at home in the world, in correcting for others’ cognitive biases, and in being treated by one’s fellows as a person with equal moral standing (Christiano 2008). Only submission to a common legal order can provide a solution to this problem of domination and conflict, argue natural duty proponents of political obligation. “There is no way other than general compliance with a single authoritative set of rules to secure peace and protect basic moral rights” (Wellman 2005, p. 45); law “settle[s] for practical purposes what justice consists in by promulgating public rules for the guidance of individual behavior” (Christiano, p. 53); or in Stilz’s Kantian terms, law replaces the unilateral imposition of obligations on others with the omnilateral imposition of obligations on all.

Not just any legal order will do, though. Rather, many natural duty theorists of political obligation argue either that the law must be crafted according to democratic procedures or that it must not violate certain individual rights, or both, if those it addresses are to have a duty to obey it. Christiano, for instance, argues that against a background constituted by diversity, cognitive bias, and fallibility, agents can be sure that their fundamental interest in judgment will not be unjustifiably set back only if political power is exercised within institutions that publicly realize equality, i.e. democratic ones. Likewise, Waldron defends the authority of a majority-rule decision procedure on the basis of its “commitment to equality – a determination that when we, who need to settle on a single course of action, disagree about what to do, there is no reasonable basis for us in designing our decision-procedures to accord greater weight to one side than to the other in the disagreement” (Waldron 1999, p. 117; see also Lefkowitz 2004). Even if a person does not believe that the particular scheme of distributive justice realized in the law treats her justly, she can recognize that the process whereby that scheme was created, and can be modified or eliminated, does treat her as an equal. Daniel Viehoff also appeals to the egalitarian character of democratic procedures to justify a moral duty to obey the law, arguing that they best realize an ideal of relational equality in which agents forbear from using any power advantages they may enjoy to determine the terms of their morally necessary coordination (Viehoff 2014; see also Kolodny 2014; Viehoff 2019). Finally, Stilz argues that law omnilaterally imposes obligations on all only if it expresses a general will. It does the latter if and only if it “first, defines rights (protected interests) that apply equally to all; second, it defines these rights via a procedure that considers everyone’s interests equally; and third, everyone who is coerced to obey the law has a voice in the procedure” (Stilz 2009, p. 78). The latter two conditions, she maintains, can only be met by a democratic procedure. Unsurprisingly, some theorists remain unconvinced by the forgoing arguments for democracy’s essential contribution to the justification of political obligation (see, e.g., Huemer 2013; Frye and Klosko 2017).

Whatever its details, many natural duty theorists also argue that the conception of the person that grounds their accounts of political obligation also limits the scope of legitimate law. Reasonable disagreement over freedom-as-independence does not extend to torture, for example, and at some perhaps indeterminate point the denial of freedom of conscience clearly conflicts with a person’s fundamental interests in correcting for cognitive bias and being at home in the world. Most natural duty theorists conclude that subjects of a legal order that recognizes no rights on the part of some or all of its subjects against such treatment lacks legitimate authority, even if it is democratic.

Recall that natural duty accounts of political obligation begin with duties that all moral agents owe to all other moral persons as such. Simmons argues that this commitment renders natural duty accounts unable to justify the particularity of political obligations; that is, the fact that people have political obligations in virtue of their citizenship or residence in particular states, and that they owe those obligations to that particular state (or to their fellow citizens) (1979, pp. 31–5; 2005, pp. 166–79). Even if we have a natural duty “to support and comply with just institutions,” as Rawls maintains, why must we discharge that duty by supporting and complying with the just institutions that comprise the state in which we are citizens or residents? True, those are the institutions that “apply to us,” in the sense that they claim jurisdiction over us. But why think this social fact has any moral import, particularly if we think the political institutions of other states more worthy of our support because they better promote justice, or are in greater need of support?

Some natural duty theorists point to the intensity and frequency of interaction among those who live in close proximity to one another as a justification for the duty to obey the laws of the particular jurisdiction in which one resides (Waldron 1993; 1996). Others emphasize that a person who free-rides on his fellow citizens’ support for and compliance with the law to act on his own judgment of how he can best discharge his natural duty of justice unfairly takes advantage of them. Absent their good-faith sacrifice of the liberty to act on their private judgments regarding what justice requires, the free-rider would likely be unable to act as he does (Wellman 2005, pp. 44–5). Finally, some natural duty theorists argue that Simmons misconstrues the natural duty of justice. Justice is not an outcome or state of affairs that agents have a duty to promote via whatever means they judge to be most effective or efficient, be it the political institutions of their state or those of another. Rather, justice characterizes a particular manner of interacting with others, such as with respect for their freedom-as-independence or their fundamental interests, including but not limited to their interests in judgment. At least for a citizen of a liberal democratic state, the latter construal of justice entails that she can only treat her fellow citizens justly if she guides her conduct according to its law (Stilz 2012).

Simmons has recently offered a rebuttal to this second line of argument (Simmons 2013). It entails, he argues, that citizens of one liberal-democratic state who are forcibly subjected to the rule of another liberal-democratic state immediately acquire political obligations to the second state as long as they are accorded full citizenship rights. Simmons treats this implication as a reductio ad absurdum of the democratic Kantian justification for political obligation, a demonstration that it cannot properly account for the particularity of such obligations. In part, this latest rejoinder by Simmons evidences and gives further impetus to a shift in the debate over political obligation from the question of what gives states a right to rule particular people, to which correlates their duty to obey the law, to the question of what gives states a right to rule over a particular territory [see the entry on territorial rights and territorial justice]. But it also points to the need for natural duty theorists to elaborate upon their so far brief discussions of the contribution that a legitimate international legal order makes to the legitimacy of domestic legal orders.

5. Conclusion: A Plurality of Principles?

The four theories of political obligation sketched above do not exhaust the possibilities – Dorota Mokrosinska, for instance, has recently advanced a “civil justice” theory in her Rethinking Political Obligation – but they seem to represent the main lines of argument. Indeed, even Mokrosinska acknowledges that her “argument from civil justice combines elements of both natural duty accounts and associative theories” (2012, p. 174). In fact, the search for a hybrid theory is something a number of philosophers have undertaken, either implicitly or explicitly, in recent years. Gilbert (2006) and Steinberger (2004), for example, seem to have developed hybrid theories without ever advertising them as such. Gilbert’s theory fuses the consent and associative approaches through her reliance on joint commitments to a plural subject, or group. For his part, Steinberger combines the consent and natural-duty approaches, arguing that any “generalized attempt to divorce obligations from natural duties, to find justifications for the former that are entirely independent of the latter, is … doomed to fail” (2004, p. 211). Wellman explicitly acknowledges the hybrid nature of his theory, which combines an appeal to the natural duty of samaritanism with reliance on the argument from fair play (Wellman 2005, esp. chap 2).

Others, notably Klosko (2005), Jonathan Wolff (1995, 2000), and Dudley Knowles (2010) have explicitly called for a pluralistic or multiple-principle approach to political obligation. There is no single answer to the problem of political obligation, as they see it, because the problem has more than one aspect. Not every “member” of a polity will stand in the same relation to the laws, for instance, which means that it is a mistake to think that everyone must have the same general obligation to obey. Nor is every obligation of equal force. Some are weak, such as the notorious obligation to stop at a traffic signal in an isolated area when no one else is around, and others are quite strong. Klosko thus thinks it necessary to rely on the principle of fairness to supply the core of a justification, but to supplement it with appeals to natural duty and the common good (2006, chap. 5).

As yet there has been little reaction to these attempts to create hybrids and to draw on multiple principles in the attempt to provide a satisfactory theory of political obligation (but see Edmundson 2004, pp. 250–52). Those who doubt that such a theory can be constructed, however, are likely to say that combining principles, whether in hybrid or pluralist fashion, will not help, for combining a set of principles that are unsatisfactory individually will hardly produce a strong and satisfying theory (Simmons 2007, n. 17). Whether a plurality of principles is necessary or even desirable, in sum, remains one of many open questions with regard to the vexing problem of political obligation.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

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Richard Dagger
David Lefkowitz <dlefkowi@richmond.edu>

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