First published Tue Sep 25, 2018

No aspect of our mental life is more important to the quality and meaning of our existence than the emotions. They are what make life worth living and sometimes worth ending. So it is not surprising that most of the great classical philosophers had recognizable theories of emotions. These theories typically conceived of emotions as a subject’s phenomenologically salient responses to significant events and as capable of triggering distinctive bodily changes and behaviors. But it is surprising that throughout much of the twentieth-century, scientists and philosophers of mind tended to neglect the emotions—in part because of behaviorism’s allergy to inner mental states and in part because the variety of phenomena covered by the word “emotion” discourages tidy theorizing. In recent decades, however, emotions have once again become the focus of vigorous interest in philosophy and affective science. Our objective in this entry is to account for these developments, focusing primarily on the descriptive question of what the emotions are, but tackling also the normative question of whether emotions are rational. In view of the proliferation of exchanges between researchers of different stripes, it is no longer useful to speak of the philosophy of emotion in isolation from the approaches of other disciplines, particularly psychology, neuroscience, and evolutionary biology. This is why we have made an effort to pay significant attention to scientific developments, as we are convinced that cross-disciplinary fertilization is our best chance for making progress in emotion theory.

After some brief methodological remarks intended to clarify what differentiates a philosophical approach from a more general cognitive science perspective on the emotions, we begin by outlining some of the ways researchers have conceived of the place of emotions in the topography of the mind. We will note that emotions have historically been conceptualized in one of three main ways: as experiences, as evaluations, and as motivations. Each of these research traditions captures something true and significant about the emotions, but no theory within any tradition appears immune from counterexamples and problem cases. Concerning the rationality of emotions, we will distinguish two main varieties of it—cognitive rationality and strategic rationality—and explore a number of ways in which the emotions can succeed or fail with respect to different standards of rationality.

1. Defining the Emotions: What are the Desiderata?

Two broad desiderata have governed the project of defining emotions in both philosophy and affective science: (a) Achieving compatibility with ordinary linguistic usage, and (b) Achieving theoretical fruitfulness. A definition that aims exclusively at (a) is a descriptive definition. A definition that aims at (b) at the cost of possibly violating some ordinary intuitions is prescriptive. To secure ordinary language compatibility, traditional philosophers have relied on introspection, thought experiments, casual observation, gleaning of insights from literary texts and other artistic sources, and more recently, experimental tests of ordinary intuitions and of the psychological processes underlying them performed within “experimental philosophy”.

Scientists have also been interested in the study of folk emotion concepts, and they have applied to them experimental techniques common in the psychology of concepts. These techniques have revealed that emotion concepts, like most ordinary concepts, are prototypically organized (Fehr & Russell 1984). There are better and worse examples of emotions as ordinarily understood (e.g., fear is a better example of emotion than awe) and there are borderline cases, such as boredom: on those, ordinary language users are split as to whether they qualify as emotions. A variety of psychological structures have been proposed by concept theorists to account for membership in folk emotion categories, including similarity to prototypes, exemplars, perceptual symbols and others (Fehr & Russell 1984; Wilson-Mendenhall et al. 2011).

What philosophers and affective scientists aim to offer are prescriptive definitions of emotions that preserve as much ordinary language compatibility as it is compatible with serving interest-dependent theoretical objectives. One reason why theoreticians are not merely interested in outlining the contours of folk emotion concepts through descriptive definitions is that they suspect that such concepts may include widely diverse items that are not amenable to any robust theoretical generalizations.

At first blush, the things we ordinarily call emotions differ from one another along several dimensions. For example, some emotions are occurrences (e.g., panic), and others are dispositions (e.g., hostility); some are short-lived (e.g., anger) and others are long-lived (e.g., grief); some involve primitive cognitive processing (e.g., fear of a suddenly looming object), and others involve sophisticated cognitive processing (e.g., fear of losing a chess match); some are conscious (e.g., disgust about an insect in the mouth) and others are unconscious (e.g., unconscious fear of failing in life); some have prototypical facial expressions (e.g., surprise) and others lack them (e.g., regret). Some involve strong motivations to act (e.g., rage) and others do not (e.g., sadness). Some are present across species (e.g., fear) and others are exclusively human (e.g., schadenfreude). And so on.

This multi-dimensional heterogeneity has led some to conclude that folk emotion categories do not designate natural kinds, either with respect to the generic category of emotion (Rorty 1980b, 2003; Griffiths 1997; Russell 2003; Zachar 2006; Kagan 2007, 2010) or with respect to specific emotion categories such as anger, fear, happiness, disgust, and so on (Scarantino 2012; Barrett 2006, 2017). Others have argued that there is, nevertheless, enough homogeneity among instances of folk emotion categories to allow them to qualify as natural kinds (e.g., Charland 2002; Prinz 2004; Zinck & Newen 2008).

The concept of a natural kind is itself contentious and probably more suitable for discussing the categories affective scientists are interested in, so we will speak of theoretical kinds instead, understood as groupings of entities that participate in a body of philosophically or scientifically interesting generalizations due to some set of properties they have in common.

Whether folk emotion categories are homogeneous enough to qualify as theoretical kinds has important methodological implications. To the extent that they are, the prescriptive definitions of emotions the theorist offers can achieve both theoretical fruitfulness and maximal compatibility with ordinary linguistic usage (in such case, prescriptive definitions will also be descriptively adequate). To the extent that they are not homogeneous enough, prescriptive definitions will have to explicate folk emotion categories, transforming them so as to increase theoretical fruitfulness while giving up on some degree of ordinary language compatibility (Carnap 1950).

Theoretical fruitfulness, however, is conceived differently by philosophers and affective scientists. The former often have as their primary target making sense of the human experience of emotions and sometimes to contribute to other projects in philosophy, such as explaining the origins of rational action or moral judgment, or shedding light on what makes life worth living, or investigating the nature of self-knowledge. Affective scientists, by contrast, are more likely to favor a third-person approach that may be highly revisionary with respect to our first-person self-understanding. And their prescriptive definitions are often designed to promote measurement and experimentation for the purposes of prediction and explanation in a specific scientific discipline.

In this entry, we will assess philosophical and scientific definitions of emotions in terms of both ordinary language compatibility and theoretical fruitfulness, but acknowledge that the field currently lacks clear guidelines for how to strike a proper balance between these two desiderata.

2. Three Traditions in the Study of Emotions: Emotions as Feelings, Evaluations, and Motivations

“Emotion” is a term that came into use in the English language in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries as a translation of the French term “émotion” but did not designate “a category of mental states that might be systematically studied” until the mid-nineteenth century (Dixon 2012: 338; see also Dixon 2003; Solomon 2008). At the same time, many of the things we call emotions today have been the object of theoretical analysis since Ancient Greece, under a variety of language-specific labels such as passion, sentiment, affection, affect, disturbance, movement, perturbation, upheaval, or appetite. This makes for a long and complicated history, which has progressively led to the development of a variety of shared insights about the nature and function of emotions, but no consensual definition of what emotions are, either in philosophy or in affective science.

A widely shared insight is that emotions have components, and that such components are jointly instantiated in prototypical episodes of emotions. Consider an episode of intense fear due to the sudden appearance of a grizzly bear on your path while hiking. At first blush, we can distinguish in the complex event that is fear an evaluative component (e.g., appraising the bear as dangerous), a physiological component (e.g., increased heart rate and blood pressure), a phenomenological component (e.g., an unpleasant feeling), an expressive component (e.g., upper eyelids raised, jaw dropped open, lips stretched horizontally), a behavioral component (e.g., a tendency to flee), and a mental component (e.g., focusing attention).

One question that has divided emotion theorists is: Which subset of the evaluative, physiological, phenomenological, expressive, behavioral, and mental components is essential to emotion? The answer to this “problem of parts” (Prinz 2004) has changed at various times in the history of the subject, leading to a vast collection of theories of emotions both in philosophy and in affective science. Although such theories differ on multiple dimensions, they can be usefully sorted into three broad traditions, which we call the Feeling Tradition, the Evaluative Tradition and the Motivational Tradition (Scarantino 2016).

The Feeling Tradition takes the way emotions feel to be their most essential characteristic, and defines emotions as distinctive conscious experiences. The Evaluative Tradition regards the way emotions construe the world as primary, and defines emotions as being (or involving) distinctive evaluations of the eliciting circumstances. The Motivational Tradition defines emotions as distinctive motivational states.

Each tradition faces the task of articulating a prescriptive definition of emotions that is theoretically fruitful and compatible at least to some degree with ordinary linguistic usage. And although there are discipline-specific theoretical objectives, there also is a core set of explanatory challenges that tends to be shared across disciplines:

  • Differentiation: How are emotions different from one another, and from things that are not emotions?
  • Motivation: Do emotions motivate behavior, and if so how?
  • Intentionality: Do emotions have object-directedness, and if so can they be appropriate or inappropriate to their objects?
  • Phenomenology: Do emotions always involve subjective experiences, and if so of what kind?

For example, a viable account of anger should tell us how anger differs from fear and from non-emotional states (differentiation), whether and how anger motivates aggressive behaviors (motivation), whether and how anger can be about a given state of affairs and be considered appropriate with respect to such state of affairs (intentionality), and whether and how anger involves a distinctive subjective experience (phenomenology).

We now consider some of the most prominent theories within each tradition, and assess how they fare with respect to these four theoretical challenges and others. As we shall see, each tradition seems to capture something important about what the emotions are, but none is immune from counterexamples and problem cases. As a result, the most recent trend in emotion theory is represented by theories that straddle traditions, in an attempt to combine their distinctive insights. Although we begin our investigation with William James and will occasionally mention earlier accounts, our primary focus will be on theories developed in the last 50 years.

3. The Early Feeling Tradition: Emotions as Feelings

The simplest theory of emotions, and perhaps the theory most representative of common sense, is that emotions are simply a class of feelings, differentiated by their experienced quality from other sensory experiences like tasting chocolate or proprioceptions like sensing a pain in one’s lower back. The idea that emotions are a specific kind of subjective experiences has dominated emotion theory roughly from Ancient Greece to the beginning of the twentieth century.

This idea can be interpreted in either of two ways. The great classical philosophers—Plato, Aristotle, Spinoza, Descartes, Hobbes, Hume, Locke—all understood emotions to involve feelings understood as primitives without component parts. An alternative idea was first introduced by William James, who argued that scientific psychology should stop treating feelings as “eternal and sacred psychic entities, like the old immutable species in natural history” (James 1890: 449).

James’ proposal, often labeled as the James-Lange theory because it is rather similar to the one offered around the same time by Lange (1885), stated that emotions are feelings constituted by perceptions of changes in physiological conditions relating to the autonomic and motor functions. When we perceive that we are in danger, for example, this perception directly sets off a collection of bodily responses, and our awareness of these responses is what constitutes fear. James thus maintained that “our feeling of [bodily] changes as they occur IS the emotion” (James 1884: 189–190, emphasis in original).

The James-Lange theory fared well with respect to the problem of phenomenology, in the sense that it replaced the brute phenomenology favored by earlier accounts with a constructivist account of the “processes that generate and construct…conscious experiences” (Mandler 1990: 180). This approach has acquired new prominence in recent times with the affirmation of the psychological constructionist movement in affective science (section 8.2).

But the James-Lange theory seemed less successful with respect to the challenges of motivation, differentiation and intentionality. First, James stated that common sense is wrong about the direction of causation concerning emotions and bodily changes: a more appropriate statement is that

we feel sorry because we cry, angry because we strike, afraid because we tremble, and not that we cry, strike, or tremble, because we are sorry, angry, or fearful. (James 1884: 190)

The counterintuitive implication that emotions do not cause their manifestations but rather emerge from them struck many as problematic, because it seemed to undermine the idea that emotions are important to us. How could they be so important, critics like Dewey (1894, 1895) asked, if they have no causal import with respect to actions? And why, one might add, does science not first seek to explain the cause and function of those original “bodily changes”, namely why the emotion is elicited in the first place? (Arnold 1960).

Furthermore, the theory lacked an adequate account of the differences between emotions. This objection was influentially voiced by Walter Cannon (1929). According to a common interpretation of the James-Lange theory, what distinguishes emotions from one another is the fact that each involves the perception of a distinctive set of bodily changes. Cannon countered that the visceral reactions characteristic of distinct emotions such as fear and anger are indistinguishable, and so these reactions cannot be what allows us to tell emotions apart.

Subsequent research has not fully settled whether emotions do, in fact, have significantly different bodily profiles, either at the autonomic, expressive or neural level (for the latest on bodily signatures, see Clark-Polner et al. 2016; Duran et al. 2017; Kragel & LaBar 2016; Nummenmaa & Saarimäki forthcoming; Keltner et al. 2016). Independently of how the empirical debate on bodily signatures is settled, brain or bodily changes and the feelings accompanying these changes can get us only part way towards an adequate taxonomy.

Another major stumbling block for the James-Lange theory is that it does not yield any insight into emotions’ role in our life as rational agents and thinkers. Emotions, however, are capable of being not only explained, but also justified. If someone angers me, I can cite my antagonist’s deprecatory tone; if someone makes me jealous, I can point to his poaching on my emotional property (Taylor 1975). If emotions were merely feelings, as James suggested, it would be difficult to explain why they can be justified in light of reasons, just as we would be hard pressed to justify the sensory experience of tasting chocolate or feeling pain in one’s lower back.

4. Emotions and Intentional Objects

To shed light on the sense in which emotions can be justified requires a brief detour on the topic of their “object-directedness” or “aboutness” or “intentionality”. The first distinction we need to draw is the one between particular objects and formal objects of emotions. As Kenny (1963) first emphasized, any X that I can have emotion E about is a particular object of E, whereas the formal object of E is the property which I implicitly ascribe to X by virtue of having E about X.

For example, the particular object of fear is anything a person can be afraid of, whereas the formal object of fear is “that which constitutes danger”, on the assumption that only what is evaluated as dangerous can intelligibly be feared. Particular and formal objects constitute the two principal aspects of emotional intentionality: emotions are object-directed insofar as they have particular objects, and they are fitting insofar as their particular objects instantiate the formal objects represented by the emotion (see section 10.1).

The second distinction we wish to draw is that between two types of particular objects of emotions: target objects and propositional objects (de Sousa 1987). The target object of an emotion is the specific entity the emotion is about. For example, love can be about Mary, or about Bangkok, or about Homer Simpson and so on. These are all possible targets of love, and they may be real or imaginary.

Not every emotion has a target. I may be angry that my life has turned out a certain way, without there being any particular entity—myself or anyone else—at which my anger is directed. Propositional objects capture facts or states of affairs, real or imagined, towards which my emotion is directed. Conversely, not all emotions have a propositional object. For example, if Mary is the target of my love, there may be no proposition, however complex, that captures what it is that I love about Mary (Kraut 1986; Rorty 1987 [1988]).

Finally, there also appear to be affective states that lack both types of particular objects: they are neither directed at a particular entity nor are they about a state of affairs captured by a proposition. For example, I can be depressed or elated but not depressed or elated about any specific target or fact. These seemingly objectless affective states share many properties with object-directed emotions, especially with respect to their physiological and motivational aspects, so we may consider them to be emotions without objects.

On the other hand, some have suggested that such objectless states are better regarded as moods (Frijda 1994; Stephan 2017a). Whether we think of seemingly objectless affective states as emotions or moods, we must decide what kinds of objects they lack. Here two main options are available. The first is to assert that some affective states have neither particular objects nor formal objects. If we think of moods and objectless emotions that way, it becomes hard to explain how such affective states may have conditions of correctness—formal objects being among other things descriptions of what the world must be like for the affective state to be fitting (Teroni 2007).

If instead we think of such affective states as having formal objects and conditions of correctness, then their objectlessness is only apparent, because they need to have targets or propositional objects of some kind to which they implicitly ascribe the property defined by the formal object. This is the view of moods defended among others by Goldie (2000), who thinks moods take the whole world as their object, and by Price (2006), who thinks that moods have generic objects but “watch out” for particular ones.

What are the formal objects of specific emotions? This is a controversial topic, because the ascription of formal objects commits one to the claim that each emotion, on conceptual grounds, ascribes a specific property to its particular object. This is often identified with one of a number of “core relational themes” originally offered by Richard Lazarus (1991a,b) to explain what sorts of evaluations cause emotions, one of the primary concerns of appraisal theories in psychology (section 6).

Within that framework, anger represents slights, fear represents dangers, shame represents failures to live up to an ego ideal, sadness represents losses, happiness represents progress towards goal achievement, pride represents enhancement of one’s ego identity (Prinz 2004; Lazarus 1991b). Once the formal object of an emotion has been clarified, we can use it to justify emotions by citing their conditions of elicitation. For example, if anger represents slights, then my antagonist’s deprecatory tone can be cited as a justification of my anger, because a deprecatory tone instantiates the very property that anger represents.

5. The Early Evaluative Tradition in Philosophy: Emotions as Judgments

Evaluative theories of emotions, a.k.a. cognitive theories of emotions, became popular in both philosophy and affective science roughly in the 1960s and come in many flavors. A key distinction is that between constitutive and causal evaluative theories. Constitutive theories state that emotions are cognitions or evaluations of particular kinds, whereas causal theories state that emotions are caused by cognitions or evaluations of particular kinds. The constitutive approach tends to be dominant in philosophy, while the causal approach enjoys significant support in psychology. Let us consider these two strands of cognitivism in turn.

The emergence of the constitutive approach in philosophy in the middle of the twentieth century can be traced to a pair of articles by C.D. Broad (1954) and Errol Bedford (1957), and a book by Anthony Kenny (1963) (see also Pitcher 1965; Thalberg 1964). These authors were not the first to emphasize that emotions are object-directed or endowed with intentionality—Brentano (1874 [1995]) had already done so with inspiration from various medieval authors (King 2010). But these mid-twentieth century philosophers were the first to articulate an influential argument to the effect that, in order to account for their intentionality, emotions must be cognitive evaluations of some kind rather than feelings (see also Meinong 1894).

The argument goes roughly like this. If emotions have intentionality, it follows that there are internal standards of appropriateness according to which an emotion is appropriate just in case its formal object is instantiated (Kenny 1963). But feelings are not the kinds of things that can enter into conceptual relations with formal objects. So, to be properly embedded in conceptual relations of this sort, emotions need to be or involve “cognitive evaluations” of some kind.

What kinds of cognitive evaluations? The most parsimonious type of cognitivist theory follows the Stoics in identifying emotions with judgments. Robert Solomon (1980), Jerome Neu (2000) and Martha Nussbaum (2001) take this approach. On a common interpretation of their view, my anger at someone is the judgment that I have been wronged by that person. To generalize, the proposal is that an emotion E is a judgment that the formal object of E is instantiated (by some particular object X).

This theory is often referred to as judgmentalism, but the label is potentially misleading, because it suggests that for the theory’s proponents an emotion is nothing but a judgment, understood as an assent to a proposition. This interpretation is indeed presupposed by some of the standard critiques of judgmentalism.

First, it is argued that judgmentalism does not explain how emotions can motivate, because one can hold a judgment—say the judgment that I have been wronged—without being motivated to act on it. Second, it does not explain the phenomenology of emotions, because holding a judgment lacks the bodily, valence and arousal dimensions that typically characterize the experience of emotion. Third, it fails to account for the emotions of animals and infants, who arguably lack the capacity of assenting to propositions (Deigh 1994). Fourth, it does not explain the “recalcitrance to reason” some emotions display when they are not extinguished by judgments that contradict them, as when someone judges that flying is not dangerous but continues to be afraid of it (D’Arms & Jacobson 2003).

Judgmentalists have tried to address these critiques by clarifying what sorts of judgments emotions are (and some, like Nussbaum and Neu, have explicitly rejected the label of judgmentalism). It has been argued for instance that we should think of judgments as “enclosing a core desire” (Solomon 2003: 105–106), which makes them motivational (e.g., fear encloses the core desire to flee). Such judgments are also “dynamic” and able to “house…the disorderly motions of emotion” (Nussbaum 2001: 45), and thus phenomenologically salient; since they involve pre-linguistic and non-linguistic acceptance of how the world seems, they are available to infants and animals; finally, as they are capable of being held jointly with contradictory judgments, they can explain recalcitrance to reason (Nussbaum 2001).

Several objections have been launched against this strategy. Just to pick a prominent example among many, it has been argued is that explaining recalcitrance to reason in terms of contradictory judgments—judging that p and that not-p—ascribes to agents the wrong kind of irrationality (Helm 2001, 2015; see also Döring 2008; Benbaji 2012; Brady 2009; Tappolet 2000, Faucher & Tappolet 2008a, b). There may be a broader problem at work here, namely that judgmentalists stretch the meaning of the concept of “judgment” in an unprincipled way to account for all counterexamples, instead of distinguishing between importantly different types of cognitive states all subsumed under the same heading.

The trouble with this elastic strategy is not only that it is ad hoc, but also that it creates cross-purpose talk and ultimately amounts to a pyrrhic victory for the evaluative theory, because, on a sufficiently expanded notion of judgment, the identification of emotions with judgments becomes at best trivially true and fails to shed light on what emotions are (Scarantino 2010).

Two more promising strategies have been put in place to defend cognitivism from counterexamples. The first, which we call the judgmentalist add-on strategy (Goldie 2000), consists of explicitly adding on to judgments other components of emotions, rather than embedding them into judgments through the elastic strategy. For instance, the motivational dimension of emotions has been accounted for by suggesting that emotions are not just judgments, but rather combinations of judgments (or beliefs) and desires (Marks 1982; Green 1992; Gordon 1987). Other authors have added further elements, proposing that emotions are combinations of judgments, desires and feelings, a move intended to account for both motivational and phenomenological dimensions of emotions (Lyons 1980).

Another strategy, which may be called the alternate cognitions strategy, consists of replacing the broad notion of judgment with a variety of other types of cognitive evaluations that can account for the intentionality of emotions while avoiding some of the critiques that have been raised against judgmentalism. Since most of the action in contemporary philosophy of emotions focuses on which alternate cognitions are to be preferred, we will devote a whole section to the topic. First, we discuss how the Evaluative Tradition has been developed in affective science.

6. The Evaluative Tradition in Affective Science: Appraisal Theories

Roughly around the time when the Evaluative Tradition became popular in philosophy, a parallel tradition emerged in affective science through the pioneering work of Magda Arnold and Richard Lazarus. What powered this development was in part the cognitivist revolution, the intellectual movement that replaced behaviorism in the 1960s and put the cognitive processing of mental representations at the heart of the science of psychology.

Arnold argued that emotion research had neglected to explain how emotions are elicited. To shed light on the matter, she introduced the notion of appraisal, the process through which the significance of a situation for an individual is determined. Appraisal gives rise to attraction or aversion, and emotion is equated for Arnold with this

felt tendency toward anything intuitively appraised as good (beneficial), or away from anything intuitively appraised as bad (harmful). (Arnold 1960: 171)

Several authors prior to Arnold had acknowledged that emotions must be produced by some sort of cognitive evaluation of the eliciting circumstances, either in the form of a judgment, a thought, a perception, or an act of imagination. After all, it is quite clear that the same stimulus can generate different emotions in different people, or in the same person at different times, which suggests that it is not stimuli as such that elicit emotions, but stimuli as appraised.

Arnold (1960) was the first to subject the internal structure of the appraisal process to scientific investigation. Appraisals, she suggested, are made along three primary dimensions: eliciting circumstances can be evaluated as good or bad, present or absent, and easy to attain or avoid. For example, the cognitive evaluation that causes fear can be described as the appraisal of an event as bad, absent but possible in the future, and hard to avoid; whereas the cause of joy can be described as the appraisal of an event as good, present and easy to maintain.

Broadly speaking, appraisal theories of emotions are accounts of the structure of the processes that extract significance from stimuli and differentiate emotions from one another. It is also frequently assumed that appraisal is a dynamic process: appraisals are followed by re-appraisals, which follow changes in the environment and in internal variables, and incrementally shape emotions over time.

It should be noted that appraisal theories do not properly qualify as theories of what emotions are, even though individual appraisal theorists often articulate such theories as a complement to their theories of the structure of appraisal. More specifically, appraisal theories are in principle compatible with theories of emotions that identify them as evaluations, feelings, or motivations, as long as such theories acknowledge that appraisals play an essential role in differentiating emotions from one another. This being said, a great many influential appraisal theorists—including Arnold, Lazarus and Scherer—offer theories of emotions that would best fit into the Motivational Tradition.

Scientific theories have significantly developed our understanding of the nature of appraisal, endowing it with even more structure than Arnold originally envisioned (e.g., C. Smith & Ellsworth 1985; Frijda 1986; Lazarus 1991a,b; Roseman 1996; Scherer 2001; Ellsworth & Scherer 2003; Roseman & Smith 2001; Oatley & Johnson-Laird 1987).

Lazarus (1991b), for instance, introduced six structural dimensions of assessment, including (1) goal-relevance, (2) goal-congruence or incongruence, (3) type of ego-involvement, (4) blame or credit, (5) coping potential, and (6) future expectancy. For example, guilt is assumed to be caused by the appraisal of an event as goal relevant, goal-incongruent, involving a moral transgression, and one for which the self is to blame (coping potential and future expectancy appraisals are left open). Lazarus’ own theory of emotions is labeled as cognitive-relational-motivational, because it holds that

emotion is a complex state, an AB, with [appraisal] A as cause and B as a combination of an action tendency, physiological change, and subjective affect, (Lazarus 1991a: 819)

whereby the appraisal is not just a cause of emotion but also a part of it (see Moors 2013 for a critique of this assumption).

Scherer et al. (2001) distinguished between sixteen dimensions of appraisal, labeled Stimulus Evaluation Checks (SECs), which can be grouped into four classes: appraisals of relevance, appraisals of consequences, appraisals of coping potential, and appraisals of normative significance. On Scherer’s component process model,

[e]motion is defined as an episode of interrelated, synchronized changes in the states of all or most of the five organismic subsystems in response to the evaluation of an external or internal stimulus event as relevant to major concerns of the organism. (Scherer 2005: 697)

The five organismic subsystems underlie five emotion components which, when engaged in coordinated changes, instantiate emotions: an appraisal, autonomic physiological changes, an action tendency, a motor expression, and a subjective feeling. In his more recent collaborative work (Moors & Scherer 2013), Scherer has suggested that the point of each stimulus evaluation check is actually to determine action tendencies, which would give pride of place to the motivational component and make his theory an evaluative-motivational hybrid (see also Scherer & Moors forthcoming).

A variant of appraisal theories has recently attracted some interest in affective computing, an interdisciplinary approach that combines insights from affective science and computer science (see Picard 1997). This is the Belief and Desire Theory of Emotions (BDTE) developed by Reisenzein (2009a,b; see also Miceli & Castelfranchi 2015). The BDTE holds that emotions are caused by a combination of cognitive evaluations (beliefs) and conative motivations (desires), whereas standard appraisal theories postulate cognitive evaluations of motive-congruence, which in effect assesses the degree to which the stimulus is congruent with the goals/desires of the agent.

BDTE’s core thesis is that emotions are elicited by hardwired mechanisms whose evolutionary function is to compare newly acquired beliefs with existing desires and existing beliefs, thereby monitoring and updating the central representational system of humans (the belief–desire system). For example, suppose you have a belief that your favorite candidate will lose the election and a desire that she win the election (Reisenzein 2009a). Once new information that she has in fact won the election is acquired, a belief-belief-comparator system produces a belief disconfirmation signal subjectively experienced as surprise, and a belief-desire-comparator system produces a desire fulfillment signal subjectively experienced as pleasure. This in turn leads to adaptive responses which include a refocusing of attention to the new content that one’s favorite candidate won, the deletion of the belief that one’s favorite candidate was going to lose, and the subjective experience of happiness.

To generalize, emotions are for the BDTE combinations of belief disconfirmation/confirmation signals and desire fulfillment/frustration signals experienced as, respectively, surprise/expectancy confirmation and pleasure/displeasure, which blend into an emergent experience of a specific emotion (e.g., happiness, fear, hope, etc.). These signals are non-conceptual, in the sense that they do not presuppose concept use, and they bring about redirection of attention, updates of the belief and desire store, and, when above threshold, distinctive subjective experiences.

A challenge faced by appraisal theories concerns whether appraisals are causes of emotions, entailments of emotions, parts of emotions, or some combination of the above. These questions raise complex conceptual issues we cannot address here (see Moors 2013), but they are essential for assessing the evidentiary support for appraisal theory. A long-running critique of the research program (Oatley 1992; Parkinson & Manstead 1992; Parkinson 1997; Russell 1987; Frijda 1993) has been that the self-report evidence commonly taken to support a causal interpretation of the relation between appraisals and emotions only supports a relation of conceptual entailment between them because it unveils people’s beliefs about what makes emotions appropriate rather than what causes emotions (see Scherer 2009 for a response).

7. The Hybrid Evaluative-Feeling Tradition in Recent Philosophy

We mentioned earlier that a popular response to the critiques received by philosophical judgmentalism has been the alternate cognitions strategy, intended to better account for their intentionality, differentiation, motivational power, and phenomenology, as well as their potential recalcitrance.

This has led to a gradual convergence of the Evaluative and Feeling Traditions, with the former now identifying emotions as evaluative perceptions with a distinctive phenomenology and the latter identifying emotions as evaluative feelings with a distinctive intentionality. As a result, the distinction between evaluative (or cognitivist) theories and feeling theories is increasingly blurred, with most of the dominant accounts in the philosophy of emotions now qualifying as hybrids.

7.1 Emotions as Evaluative Perceptions

Perceptual theories come in literal/strong and non-literal/weak varieties (Brady 2013; Salmela 2011). Strong versions generally assume that emotions are genuine forms of perception along the lines of sensory perception; weak versions stress key properties emotions share with sensory perception, while also acknowledging important differences.

Prinz’s Neo-Jamesian theory is a good example of a strong perceptual theory. For Prinz (2004), we can speak of a bona fide perceptual system when we are in the presence of a dedicated input system with specialized transducers and mental representations. Sensory perception clearly has input systems dedicated to vision, olfaction, touch, hearing, and taste. Following in the footsteps of Damasio’s (1994, 2003) neuroscientific work, Prinz suggests that emotions can also rely on a dedicated system within the somatosensory system. Thus, emotions literally are perceptions of bodily changes, either at the visceral, hormonal, or musculoskeletal levels, or in the form of changes in the somatosensory brain areas.

Prinz adds that emotions are not just perceptions of bodily changes, from which it follows that two emotions can differ from one another despite involving indistinguishable perceptions of bodily changes. For example, fear is not just the perception of “a racing heart and…other physiological changes” (Prinz 2004: 69): it also has a distinctive function—being elicited by danger—and a specific negative valence marker—less of this!—which motivates avoidant action. Since on a teleosemantic theory of representation mental states represent what they have the function of indicating (Prinz 2004; Dretske 1988), Prinz concludes that perceiving a racing heart can also represents danger insofar as it has the function of indicating it (but see Shargel & Prinz 2018; Robinson 2005). To sum up, subjects literally perceive bodily changes (the nominal content) and indirectly perceive the formal object (the real content) by virtue of the fact that bodily changes represent formal objects.

Weak perceptual theories take emotions to be relevantly analogous to sensory perception or proprioception. In addition, most take emotions to be direct perceptions of formal objects rather than perceptions of bodily changes with the function of tracking formal objects.

An influential proposal in this vein is offered by Roberts (2003), who holds that “emotions are a kind of perception” (2003: 87) in the form of concern-based construals. Roberts clarifies that construals are “impressions, ways things appear to the subject” (2003: 75) and that they are concern-based by virtue of being based on the subject’s desires and aversions. For example, a father’s fear that a fire will hurt his daughter is a construal of the fire as dangerous based on the father’s desire that nothing bad happen to his daughter.

Along similar lines, Tappolet (2016) suggests that emotions are perceptual experiences of evaluative properties (a.k.a. values) like dangerousness (fear) or slights (anger). Some authors add that such evaluative properties are not available through any others means, just like color properties are not available except by courtesy of visual perception (see, e.g., Johnston 2001).

Tappolet emphasizes that evaluative perception, just like sensory perception, is non-conceptual in nature and cognitively impenetrable (see also Döring 2007; Döring & Lutz 2015; Goldie 2000; Tappolet 2000; Goldie 2002; Wollheim 1999; Charland 1995; Zajonc 2000). This would explain why creatures who do not possess concepts, like animals and pre-linguistic infants, can have emotions, and it would account for emotional recalcitrance, which can be understood along the lines of a visual illusion. As we visually perceive a pencil as bent while judging it to be straight, so we emotionally perceive a transparent platform over the Grand Canyon as dangerous while judging it to be non-dangerous.

Tappolet (2016) lists additional features that help explain why so many authors have come to think of emotions as perceptions: (a) both emotions and perceptions have salient phenomenal properties, (b) both are elicited automatically by real or imagined objects, (c) both have correctness conditions because they represent the world as being a certain way, and (d) both play the epistemic role of providing defeasible reasons for belief (e.g., visual perception for the belief that something is blue, and fear for the belief that something is dangerous).

These analogies notwithstanding, several critics have rejected perceptual theories of emotions (e.g., Salmela 2011; Dokic & Lemaire 2013). A prominent critique concerns their inability to account for emotional recalcitrance. For example, Helm (2001) has argued that perceptualists have ended up removing the irrationality that is distinctive of recalcitrance. If perceiving a transparent platform over the Grand Canyon as dangerous while judging it to be non-dangerous were just like a visual illusion, then there would be nothing irrational about it, as there is nothing irrational in seeing a pencil as bent while judging it to be straight. But there clearly is some measure of irrationality involved in recalcitrant emotions: unlike perceptual illusions, they motivate us to act. In other words, they involve a passive assent which contradicts the active assent captured by the contradicting judgment.

7.2 Emotions as Evaluative Feelings

Several authors have proposed theories that endow feelings with intentionality. A notable example is that of Goldie (2000), who identifies the intentionality of emotions with that of feelings towards, which are not just bodily feelings that borrow their intentionality from somewhere else, as in Prinz’s account, but are instead supposed to have their own, intrinsic intentionality (see also Döring 2007; Pugmire 1998). For example, when I feel fear about slipping on ice, my feeling is towards the ice as being dangerous. This sort of feeling is a matter of thinking of the ice with feeling, and cannot be reduced to a combination of a non-intentional bodily feeling and a non-emotional evaluative thought. As Goldie puts it,

emotional feelings are inextricably intertwined with the world-directed aspect of emotion, so that an adequate account of an emotion’s intentionality…will at the same time capture an important aspect of its phenomenology. (Goldie 2002: 242; see also Ratcliffe 2005, 2017)

In a similar vein, Helm (2009: 8) proposes that “emotions are intentional feelings of import” which are either pleasurable or unpleasant. On Helm’s view,

[f]or something to have import to you—for you to care about it—is (roughly) for it to be worthy of attention and action. (Helm 2009: 252)

This explains why emotions motivate action: feeling that something is worthy of attention and action is being motivated. It also explains what makes a recalcitrant emotion irrational. By judging a transparent platform over the Grand Canyon as not dangerous and yet fearing it, the subject is judging that what he or she feels is worthy of attention and action actually isn’t, thereby undertaking evaluative commitments at odds with one another (Helm 2015: 430–431).

Some of the views that ascribe intentionality to feelings are inspired by the broader research program of representationalism in the philosophy of mind, which is the view that phenomenal properties are identifiable with, or at least reducible to, intentional properties (Dretske 1995; Horgan & Tienson 2002). In some variants of representationalism, the emotional phenomenology that gets to be reduced is merely somatic, in the sense that the feeling is directed at bodily events (e.g., Tye 1995). In other variants, the phenomenology is much richer, as it comprises somatic, cognitive, conative and irreducibly affective components directed at particular and formal objects in the world (e.g., Kriegel 2012).

An alternative embraced by some contemporary feeling theorists is to argue that emotions are feelings devoid of any intentional objects. The contrary impression is an illusion, deriving from the fact that the feelings we call emotions are typically caused by thoughts with an intentional structure with which they are associated in a “composite” experience (Whiting 2011; Goldstein 2002). On this view, fear of the ice is a composite mental state consisting of an emotion—the objectless feeling of fear—plus a thought with the ice as its intentional object. In themselves, emotions are merely hedonic feelings without intentionality. The grounds claimed for this view are explicitly phenomenological, however, and since most researchers’ introspection appears to deliver the contrary verdict that emotions are themselves object-directed, the composite view fails to persuade (for a different argument for objectlessness based on social psychology data, see Shargel 2015).

7.3 Emotions as Patterns of Salience

Another influential approach in recent philosophy of emotions takes them to be

mechanisms that control the crucial factor of salience among what would otherwise be an unmanageable plethora of objects of attention, interpretations, and strategies of inference and conduct. (de Sousa 1987: xv; see also Elgin 2006; Evans 2001; Ben-Ze’ev 2000)

For example, there are innumerable things I could in principle be focusing on as I find myself face to face with a grizzly bear on a hike, but my fear focuses my attention squarely on the bear, on how to interpret its movements, and on how to infer and execute an escape strategy. This approach may be taken to have a “perceptual flavor” (Prinz 2004: 223) because it describes emotions as mechanisms for changing salience, and perceptions can certainly affect salience. But de Sousa aims to draw attention to the broader role emotions play in providing the framework for cognitions of both perceptual varieties (e.g., what we see and hear) and non-perceptual varieties (e.g., what we believe and remember).

Some philosophers suggest that the directive power that emotions exert over cognitions is partly a function of their essentially dramatic or narrative structure (Rorty 1987 [1988]). Goldie (2012) offers a particularly subtle examination of the role of narrative in constituting our emotions over the long term. It seems conceptually incoherent to suppose that one could have an emotion—say, an intense jealousy or a consuming rage—for only a fraction of a second (Wollheim 1999). One explanation of this feature of emotions is that a story plays itself out during the course of each emotional episode, and stories take place over stretches of time. Interestingly, Goldie argues that the narrative structure of emotions is the same whether emotions are experienced towards real or fictional objects, which explains why we can respond to fictional characters with full-fledged, although motivationally muted, emotional responses (for a review of other solutions to the so-called paradox of fiction, see Cova & Friend forthcoming).

De Sousa (1987) has suggested that the stories characteristic of different emotions are learned by association with “paradigm scenarios”. Paradigm scenarios involve two aspects: first, a situation type providing the characteristic objects of the specific emotion-type (where objects can be particular and formal), and second, a set of characteristic or “normal” responses to the situation, where normality is determined by a complex and controversial mix of biological and cultural factors. These scenarios are drawn first from our daily life as small children and later reinforced by the stories, art, and culture to which we are exposed. Later still, they are supplemented and refined by literature and other art forms capable of expanding the range of one’s imagination of ways to live (de Sousa 1990; Faucher and Tappolet 2008b).

Once our emotional repertoire is established, we interpret new situations through the lens of different paradigm scenarios. When a particular scenario suggests itself as an interpretation, it arranges or rearranges our perceptual, cognitive, and inferential dispositions. When a paradigm scenario is evoked by a novel situation, the resulting emotion may or may not be appropriate to the situation that triggers it. Thus, a childhood fear of clowns may be reappraised and overcome in adult life as a result of a more realistic appraisal. In that sense at least, emotions can be assessed for rationality (see section 10 for further discussion).

8. The Motivational Tradition in Affective Science and Its Opponents

The third tradition in the study of emotions identifies them essentially with special kinds of motivational states, where a motivational state broadly understood is an internal cause of behaviors aimed at satisfying a goal. Members of this research tradition think that the central problem a theory of emotions needs to solve is explaining how emotions and actions are related, because it is ultimately what we do when we emote that produces significant personal and social consequences.

The Motivational Tradition was anticipated by many theorists of emotions in Ancient Greece and throughout the Middle Ages who emphasized the constitutive relation between emotions and behavioral impulses (King 2010), but it finds its first modern precursor in Dewey (1894, 1895). Dewey was unhappy with the reversal of common sense entailed by the Jamesian idea that emotions are feelings that emerge in response to proprioceptions. If we truly were angry because we strike, Dewey countered, anger could not cause the striking, and this would deprive anger, as well as other emotions, of their explanatory importance.

Dewey’s main suggestion was that there is a difference between the feeling of anger and anger itself: an emotion “in its entirety” is “a mode of behavior which is purposive” and “which also reflects itself into feeling” (Dewey 1895: 15). When we say that someone is angry, Dewey concluded, “we do not simply, or even chiefly, mean that [such person] has a certain ‘feel’ occupying his consciousness”. Rather, “[w]e mean He…has assumed a readiness to act in certain ways” (Dewey 1895: 16–17). The view that emotions are essentially either mechanisms that change one’s readiness to act or states of action readiness themselves has since been developed in a variety of ways in affective science and in the philosophy of emotions. Let us begin from an influential evolutionary variant of the Motivational Tradition in affective science.

8.1 Basic Emotion Theory: Emotions as Evolved Affect Programs

Basic emotion theory emerged in the 1970s from the pioneering work of Silvan Tomkins, whose orienting insight was that “the primary motivational system is the affective system” (Tomkins 2008: 4). Tomkins proposed that there are nine basic or innate affects controlled by inherited programs: interest, enjoyment, surprise, fear, anger, distress, shame, contempt and disgust. Their motivational power comes from their feeling pleasurable or painful, with such hedonic feelings emerging from the perception of facial changes providing “motivating feed-back” (Tomkins 2008: 623).

Tomkins’ theory of basic affects was followed by two related developments. The first was the birth of modern-day basic emotion theory, with its consuming attention for the universality of facial expressions, present especially in the work of Paul Ekman (Ekman et al. 1972; Ekman 1980, 1999a, 2003; Ekman & Friesen 1969) and Carrol Izard (1971, 1977, 1992, 2007). The second was the emergence of the evolutionary psychology approach to emotions understood as solutions to recurrent evolutionary problems, with prominent contributions by Plutchick (1980) and Tooby and Cosmides (2008) (see also Shand 1920 and McDougall 1908 [2001] for earlier examples of evolutionary theories of emotions).

Starting in the 1990s, the two approaches have progressively merged, although evolutionary psychologists are more inclined than basic emotion theorists to conclude that a given emotion solves an evolutionary problem merely on the basis of plausibility arguments. According to Ekman (1999a: 46), “emotions evolved for their adaptive value in dealing with fundamental life tasks” such as

[f]ighting, falling in love, escaping predators, confronting sexual infidelity, experiencing a failure-driven loss in status, responding to the death of a family member. (Tooby & Cosmides 2008: 117; see also Keltner & Haidt 2001)

They have adaptive value because they quickly mobilize and coordinate resources needed to successfully deal with life tasks, and because they communicate socially relevant information via bodily expressions. As soon as a basic emotion program is activated, a

cascade of changes (without our choice or immediate awareness) occurs in split seconds in: the emotional signals in the face and voice; preset actions; learned actions; the autonomic nervous system activity that regulates our body; the regulatory patterns that continuously modify our behavior; the retrieval of relevant memories and expectations; and how we interpret what is happening within us and in the world. (Ekman & Cordaro 2011: 366)

From this follows the central empirical hypothesis of traditional BET: there should be bodily signatures for each basic emotion consisting of highly correlated and emotion-specific changes at the level of facial expressions, autonomic changes and preset and learned actions. More specifically, Ekman defined basic emotions in terms of (a) distinctive universal signals, (b) distinctive physiology, (c) distinctive thoughts, memories and images, (d) distinctive subjective experiences, (e) predictable developmental appearance, (f) homologous presence in other primates, (g) automatic appraisals tuned to distinctive universals in antecedent events, (h) quick onset, brief duration, and unbidden occurrence (Ekman 1999a: 5). Some basic emotion theorists have also suggested that basic emotions are associated with distinctive hardwired neural circuits (e.g., Izard 2011; Levenson 2011; Panksepp 1998, 2000).

Armed with this definition, Ekman proceeded to argue that we have empirical evidence for six basic affect programs (happiness, sadness, anger, fear, disgust, and surprise), later on expanding the list to include states whose basic status is likely to be proven in the future such as amusement, contempt, embarrassment, excitement, guilt, pride in achievement, relief, satisfaction, wonder, ecstasy, sensory pleasure, and shame (Ekman & Cordaro 2011). Scientifically-minded philosophers often restrict their discussions of emotions to the basic affect programs, since these are argued to be the only natural kinds so far discovered in the affective domain (Griffiths 1997; DeLancey 2002).

The main source of evidence for basic affect programs arguably comes from cross-cultural studies on facial expressions that use a recognition technique first described by Darwin (1872). It consists of showing pictures of emotional expressions and asking observers what emotions they express from a list of six to ten emotion terms in the observer’s language. As reported by Ekman (1999b), experiments of this sort have so far been performed with observers from dozens of countries, revealing significant agreement on which emotion is portrayed (the recognition rates are strongest for happiness, sadness and disgust). This being said, membership to a given culture increases recognition of expressions from that culture, which has led some to argue that emotional expressions are a universal language with different dialects (Elfenbein et al. 2007).

In combination with complementary data on the production of facial expressions (Matsumoto et al. 2008), the recognitional data have been taken to speak in favor of the hypothesis that affect programs are evolutionary adaptations producing the same mandatory facial changes in all cultures, although culturally specific display rules can partially mask such cross-cultural universality.

The evidence for universality has been criticized on methodological and conceptual grounds. Methodologically, it has been argued that the experiments are defective because they rely on a forced choice paradigm which inflates consensus and because they rely on ecologically unrealistic stimuli such as actors’ posed faces (Russell 1994). Conceptually, it has been argued that the evolutionary hypothesis that selection would favor the production of mandatory facial expressions is implausible, because in conflict situations it may not be in the evolutionary interest of the emoter to let observers know about what emotions they are experiencing (e.g., communicating fear during a confrontation). And even if there were universality of recognition and production of emotional expressions, alternative explanations like species constant learning would be able to account for the data (Fridlund 1994).

8.2 The Behavioral Ecology View, Psychological Constructionism and Social Constructionism: Emotions as Constructions

An influential alternative to the Basic Emotions view of facial expressions is the Behavioral Ecology view (Fridlund 1994), which replaces the notion of expressions of emotion with that of displays produced in an audience-dependent fashion when signalers expect benefits from them. Audience-dependence entails that signalers tailor their context-sensitive facial displays to their audience and do not produce them mandatorily upon experiencing a given emotion. Displays are rather

declarations that signify our trajectory in a given social interaction, that is, what we will do in the current situation, or what we would like the other to do. (Fridlund 1994: 130)

For example, what Ekman would describe as an anger face, a sad face or a happy face is described by behavioral ecologists as, respectively, a display of readiness to attack, a display of intent to affiliate and a display of recruitment of succor (Fridlund 1994). A number of theorists have argued that Ekman’s and Fridlund’s approaches can be reconciled: emotions can at the same time express emotions and make declarations that are credible precisely because they are associated with emotions (M. Green 2007; Scarantino 2017; Hess, Banse, & Kappas 1995; see also Bar-On 2013).

The broader problem with traditional BET is that the distinctive response profiles allegedly produced in cascade-like fashion have not been convincingly demonstrated either at the level of expressive responses or at the level of autonomic changes, neural changes, preset actions or learned actions (Ortony & Turner 1990; Mauss et al. 2005; Barrett 2006; Lindquist et al. 2012). This lack of clear and distinctive bodily signatures has led to a variety of attempts to save BET from empirical refutation. Some basic emotion theorists have suggested, for instance, that basic emotions can be regulated, which would mask their mandatory effects, or that they cannot be elicited at the right level of intensity by laboratory stimuli, or that they often mix with other affective and cognitive states in ways that blur their distinctive responses (Ekman & Cordaro 2011).

Others have offered new meta-analyses that are more favorable to the existence of emotion-specific biological signatures, especially at the level of autonomic and neural changes (Kreibig 2010; Stephens et al. 2010; Nummenmaa & Saarimäki forthcoming). A third option is to transition to a New Basic Emotion Theory which replaces the assumption of cascade-like responses with that of action tendencies with control precedence, which would account for some of the variability of responses while preserving the core idea that basic emotions are geared towards solving evolutionary problems (Levenson 2011; Scarantino & Griffiths 2011; Scarantino 2015).

A more radical proposal has been offered by psychological constructionists, who have suggested that we should abandon entirely the “latent variable” model distinctive of basic emotion theory, replacing it with an “emergent variable” model according to which emotions do not cause facial expressions, autonomic changes and preset and learned actions but rather emerge from them (Barrett & Russell 2015). Specifically, psychological constructionists have argued that there is no one-to-one correspondence between anger, fear, happiness, sadness, etc. and any neurobiological, physiological, expressive, behavioral, or phenomenological responses, and that the different responses allegedly diagnostic of basic emotions are not even strongly correlated with one another.

Psychological constructionists have concluded that this variability calls into question the very idea that

emotions have ontological status as causal entities [and that they] exist in the brain or body and cause changes in sensory, perceptual, motor, and physiological outputs. (Barrett 2005: 257)

This view is at the polar opposite of the Motivational Tradition, which takes emotions to be motives—causal determinants of the changes in outputs we observe.

It has also been suggested that the folk psychological categories commonly invoked by basic emotion theorists—e.g., anger, fear, disgust, etc.—are not suitable objects of scientific investigation, and should be replaced by categories that describe emotion components rather than discrete emotions themselves (Russell 2003; Barrett 2006, 2017).

Constructionists are convinced that emotions are put together on the fly and in flexible ways using building blocks that are not specific to emotions, roughly in the way cooked foods are constructed from ingredients that are not specific to them and could be used according to alternative recipes. One of the ingredients out of which emotions are built is said to be core affect, which is a

neurophysiological state that is consciously accessible as a simple, nonreflective feeling that is an integral blend of hedonic (pleasure–displeasure) and arousal (sleepy–activated) values. (Russell 2003: 147)

Psychological constructionists emphasize that we are always in some state of core affect, which is a sort of barometer that informs us of our “relationship” to the flow of events. The readings of the barometer are feelings, understood as blends of pleasure-displeasure and activation-deactivation. These readings can be represented as points along a “circumplex structure”, with the vertical axis representing the degree of activation-deactivation and the horizontal axis representing the degree of pleasure-displeasure (Russell 1980):

two concentric rings of words. The inner ring has, starting at the east, 'PLEASANT', 'happy', 'elated', 'excited', 'alert', 'DEACTIVATION' [south], 'contented', 'serene', 'relaxed', 'calm', 'UNPLEASANT' [west], 'fatigued', 'lethargic', 'depressed', 'sad', 'ACTIVATION' ]north], 'tense', 'nervous', 'stressed', 'upset'. Lines connect 'ACTIVATION' and 'DEACTIVATION' and also 'PLEASANT' and 'UNPLEASANT'. The outer ring has 'Sadness' (between 'depressed' and 'sad' of the inner ring), 'Disgust' (between 'upset' and 'stressed'), 'Anger' (between 'stressed' and 'nervous'), 'Fear' (between 'nervous' and 'tense'), 'Surprise' (above 'ACTIVATION'), 'Happiness' (between 'elated' and 'happy'). A black circle links the outer ring words.

Different constructionists describe the way in which emotions are built out of core affect and other ingredients in different ways. For example, in Barrett’s influential Conceptual Act View, conceptualization plays a key role (Barrett 2006, 2013, 2017; Barrett & Satpute 2013). Being afraid amounts to categorizing a core affective state of high arousal and high displeasure under the “fear” concept. Being happy amounts to categorizing a core affective state of high arousal and high pleasure under the “happiness” concept. More generally, Barrett (2017) takes emotions to be experiences that emerge from the categorization of sensations from one’s own body and the world. This view, which resembles Schachter and Singer’s (1962) cognition-arousal theory and merges themes from the Feeling Tradition and the Evaluative Tradition, has been criticized for conflating emotions with verbal labeling, for making it impossible for adult humans to mislabel their own emotions, and for preventing infants and animals from having emotions in the first place (e.g., Scherer 2009, see Barrett 2015 for a reply).

Russell (2003) considers conceptualization to affect only the meta-experience of emotion, i.e., the realization that one is afraid, and allows emotion episodes to be constructed without the involvement of categorization. On his view, there are a variety of independent causal mechanisms, rather than any emotion-specific mechanism, that explain why there is some degree of correlation between expressive, autonomic and behavioral changes in emotional episodes, even though it is emphasized that the correlations are much weaker than what Ekman’s (1999a) model would predict (Russell 2012).

In recent times, some proposals have been made to integrate psychological constructionism with other research programs. Some have suggested that progress lies in merging appraisal theory with Russell’s version of psychological constructionism and have offered a general theory of how emotional action tendencies are caused by the weighing of the expected utilities of action options (Moors 2017). Others have proposed that we sharply distinguish between the phenomenological and the motivational side of affective phenomena, handing out the motivational side of (some) basic emotions to a new theory of survival circuits and reserving folk psychological emotion terms to designate feelings exclusively, with the latter understood as cognitively constructed (LeDoux 2015, 2017; note the contrast with LeDoux 1996).

Another option with some elements of overlap with psychological constructionism is social constructionism. The social constructionist approach found its first advocates in the 1920’s when a number of anthropologists and social scientists started questioning Darwin’s (1872) evidence for the universality of emotional expressions (e.g., Allport 1924; Landis 1924; Klineberg 1940).

These researchers initiated what we may call the “cultural variability” strand of social constructionism, related to the thesis that emotions are different in several essential respects in different cultures. These differences have since been shown with respect to both the emotion lexicon (e.g., Russell 1991; Wierzbicka 1999) and the diagnostic characteristics of emotions (e.g., Mesquita & Frijda 1992; Mesquita & Parkinson forthcoming).

The strand of social constructionism that is more germane to the Motivational Tradition is the “social role” strand, related to the thesis that emotions fulfill social functions by virtue of which they should be considered actions or roles rather than passions (see, e.g., Solomon 1976 and Averill 1990 on the “myth of passions”). Jean Paul Sartre (1939 [1948]) can be considered the first to offer a general, although idiosyncratic, theory of emotions as social roles, a view developed in the early 1980s by philosophers (e.g., Harré 1986, Armon-Jones 1986), psychologists (e.g., Averill 1980), and anthropologists (e.g., Lutz 1988). In recent times, Parkinson (1995, 2008, 2009), Parkinson, Fischer, and Manstead (2005), Griffiths (2004), Mesquita and Boiger (2014) and Van Kleef (2016) have articulated sophisticated social constructionist accounts that add to the social constructionist tradition themes from evolutionary accounts.

9. The Motivational Tradition in Recent Philosophy

9.1 Attitudinal and Motivational Theories: Emotions as Attitudes and Motive States

There are two main flavors of the Motivational Tradition in contemporary philosophy of emotions. The phenomenological version, articulated by Deonna and Teroni (2012, 2015), assumes that emotions are feelings of action readiness. The non-phenomenological version, articulated by Scarantino (2014, 2015) identifies emotions as causes of states of action readiness which may or may not be felt. Both versions agree that the fundamental aspect of an emotion is the way it motivates the emoter to act.

Deonna and Teroni argue that both judgmentalist and perceptual theories of emotion make the mistake of identifying emotions in terms of content rather than in terms of attitude or mode. As Searle (1979: 48) points out, “[a]ll intentional states consist of a representative content in a psychological mode”. For example, believing and desiring are different psychological modes or attitudes, and they each have a content—respectively, what is believed or desired as captured by a proposition.

If emotions were special kinds of judgments or perceptions, they would differ from other kinds of judgments or perceptions not in terms of attitude but merely in terms of content—what is judged or perceived when we emote. Furthermore, the emotions themselves would differ from one another only in terms of content rather than attitude, because there would be no attitude specific to, say, anger, shame, guilt and so on, but rather a common attitude—the judging attitude or the perceiving attitude—towards different contents. Deonna and Teroni (2015) think that this approach fails to capture not only what differentiates emotions from one another, but also what makes them special as motivational states.

As an alternative, they propose an attitudinal theory of emotions. On this view, fear of a tiger is neither the judgment nor the perception that there is something dangerous at hand, but rather the attitude of taking-as-dangerous directed towards the content that there is a tiger. What gives emotional attitudes their content, Deonna and Teroni continue, are their cognitive bases, which are the ways in which the content that there is a tiger is cognized—e.g., through perception, imagination, inference and so on (e.g., the perception that there is a tiger).

But what sort of attitude is the one that constitutes an emotion rather than, say, a judgment or a perception? Deonna and Teroni consider emotional attitudes to be essentially experiences of feeling one’s body ready for action. For example, fear of a dog amounts to “an experience of the dog as dangerous” insofar as it is “an experience of one’s body being prepared” for avoidance (Deonna & Teroni 2015: 303). Similarly, anger at a person “is an experience of offensiveness insofar as it consists in an experience of one’s body being prepared to retaliate” (2015: 303). Thus, emotions are felt attitudes of action readiness irreducible to non-emotional attitudes and specific to each emotion (for a critique of the attitudinal theory, see Rossi & Tappolet forthcoming).

The starting point of Scarantino’s (2014) Motivational Theory of Emotions is the conviction that emotions are irreducible not just to judgments and perceptions, but also to feelings, and should be understood instead as special kinds of “central motive states” or “behavioral programs”. Central motive states or behavioral programs are defined by what they do rather than by how they feel. And what they do is to provide a “general direction for behavior by selectively potentiating coherent sets of behavioral options” (Gallistel 1980: 322).

This selective potentiation can result in feelings, but the phenomenal changes are not necessary to the potentiation itself, which consists of changes in the probabilities of behavioral options. To exemplify, fear involves the selective potentiation of options that share the goal of avoiding a certain target appraised as dangerous, anger involves the selective potentiation of options that share the goal of attacking a certain target appraised as offensive, guilt involves the selective potentiation of options that share the goal of repairing a relationship appraised as damaged by actions that fell short of one’s moral standards, and so on.

The Motivational Theory of Emotions is inspired by Frijda’s (1986) theory of emotions as action tendencies, but there are some differences. Scarantino (2014, 2015) draws a distinction between an emotion and an episode of emotion, with the emotion corresponding to what causes a change in action readiness and the episode of emotion corresponding to the actual change of action readiness. But Scarantino borrows a key ingredient from Frijda’s (1986) theory, namely the assumption that action tendencies must have control precedence to become emotional. Control precedence involves interrupting competing processes, preempting access—in memory, inference, perception, etc.—to information not related to the avoidance goal and preparing the body for action.

The idea that emotions are behavioral programs that bring about prioritized impulses to act can be combined with an origin story about how some of such programs evolved to deal with fundamental life tasks, leading to what Scarantino (2015) has labeled the New Basic Emotion Theory. According to it, learning can affect both what activates the evolved program (input) and what responses the program brings about (output) through the interplay of the prioritized action tendency and regulation. This will result in massive variability of the actual responses observed upon the activation of any basic emotion, shielding the New BET from the lack of “bodily signatures” problem.

Finally, Scarantino (2014) endorses a teleosemantic theory of content for emotions to deal with the problem of intentionality, and proposes that different emotions differ from one another and from non-emotional states both in terms of the state of prioritized action tendency they cause (the attitude) and in terms of what they represent (the content). On this view, fear is a prioritizing action control program which represents dangers because it has the function of causing avoidant behaviors in the presence of danger, anger is a prioritizing action control program which represents slights because it has the function of causing aggressive behaviors in the presence of slights, and so on.

A central challenge for motivational theories of emotions of both phenomenological and non-phenomenological varieties is to account for the states of action readiness distinctive of different emotions. First, many emotions do not appear to motivate action at all. Grief and depression, for example, seem to involve a general depotentiation of the readiness to act. Second, it is unclear which action tendencies “backward-looking” emotions like regret could elicit, because they focus on what happened in the past, which cannot be changed. Third, emotions like joy involve the selective potentiation of a fairly open range of behavioral options, so it is unclear what action tendency may be associated with them. Fourth, it seems to be possible for the same action tendency to be associated with different emotions, and for different emotions to be associated with the same action tendency, provided that these tendencies are described at a sufficiently abstract level of analysis (for critiques of motivational approaches, see, e.g., Reisenzein 1996; Prinz 2004; Tappolet 2010, 2016; Eder & Rothermund 2013).

9.2 Enactivist Theories of Emotions: Emotions as Enactions

Enactivism is an interdisciplinary research program which begins with dissatisfaction with the way cognitive processes have long been studied in cognitive science (Di Paolo & Thompson 2014; Gallagher 2017). Two enactivist themes in particular are relevant for emotion theory. The first is the focus on the active role played by the cognizer in his or her relation with the external world, which is for enactivists not given and passively detected but rather enacted and actively shaped by the “sense making” powers of the cognizer. This “sense making” activity is at the heart of cognition as enactivists understand it, and it is available to all living beings, no matter how simple they may be, insofar as they are autonomous and adaptive systems (Thompson 2007).

The second theme is the focus on the embodied, embedded and extended character of cognitive processes (the theme of embodiment looms large in affective science as well; see, e.g., Niedenthal 2007; Wilson-Mendenhall et al. 2011; Carr et al. forthcoming). Whereas traditional cognitive science and neuroscience have focused on the brain in isolation from the rest of the body and from the environment, enactivists argue that we will fail to understand cognition if we neglect the reciprocal causal interactions between brain, body and environment as they dynamically unfold over time.

The idea that complex cognitive abilities can rely on the scaffolding provided by the external environment has proven especially popular among emotion theorists. It has led on the one hand to a renewed attention to the role played by interpersonal communication in social environments (Griffiths & Scarantino 2009), and on the other hand to the suggestion that emotions are ontologically extended beyond the narrow confines of the cranium (Stephan et al. 2014; Krueger 2014; Colombetti & Roberts 2015; Colombetti 2017).

To which tradition of research do enactivist theories of emotions belong? The focus on experience might appear to nudge enactivism towards the Feeling Tradition (see, e.g., Ratcliffe 2008). Enactivism is indeed influenced by the notion, central to the phenomenological philosophical tradition, that the body is an experienced structure (Husserl 1952 [1989]; Merleau-Ponty 1945 [1962]) rather than simply a physical structure. And what we can experience limits the world we inhabit, our “Umwelt” (Uexküll (1934 [2010]).

Colombetti (2014) has made the case that the phenomenological tradition can enrich the affective neuroscience of emotions. Relying on Varela’s (1996) method of neurophenomenology, Colombetti has developed a framework for integrating third-person methods like brain imaging with first-person methods like self-reports. It is also quite clear that enactivists, in opposition to the “disembodied stance” (Colombetti & Thompson 2008) of many cognitivist theories, view emotions as bodily and experiential processes rather than intellectual ones.

Nevertheless, it is more appropriate to slot the enactivist movement into the phenomenological side of the Motivational Tradition. This is because enactivists also greatly emphasize the role of action in cognition. A number of them have recently offered accounts of emotions that emphasize their action-oriented nature (Hufendiek 2016; Slaby & Wüschner 2014; Shargel & Prinz 2018). Cognition is said to be enacted by inherently teleological living systems for the purposes of action. More radically, some cognitive processes like perception are described as constitutively dependent on motoric processes, as in the sensorimotor theory of visual consciousness (Hurley 1998; O’Regan & Noë 2001).

There is no unified understanding of the relation between emotions and action among enactivists, but rather a number of distinct proposals. In Colombetti’s work, for instance, the notion of self-organization plays an orienting role. Her view is that emotional episodes are “self-organizing patterns of the organism, best described with the conceptual tools of dynamical systems theory”, a branch of mathematics designed to account for the temporal evolution of systems that change over time (Colombetti 2014: 53; see also Lewis 2005).

Self-organization is the capacity of a complex system to reach and preserve a state of order through reciprocal causal influences among simpler component parts. When applied to the emotions, the idea is that emotion components self-organize, which helps explain the variability of emotional episodes, because self-organizing systems can end up in multiple end states depending on how their components interact (see A. Clark 2001: 113–114).

Although there are analogies between this view and psychological constructionism, especially with respect to the emphasis on emotions as emergent and flexible phenomena, Colombetti denies that conceptual acts bring about emotions, assuming that “sense making” is a much more primitive phenomenon available from bacteria to humans. Creatures engage in “sense making” when they assess the environment in terms of whether it promotes their self-maintenance, and act so as to improve their viability within the environment, as a bacterium does when swimming away from a noxious substance.

At the same time, Colombetti uses the assumption of self-organization of emotional phenomena to oppose the notion that emotional episodes are caused either by affect programs (contra the basic emotion tradition) or by appraisals (contra the appraisal tradition). Incidentally, Colombetti (2014) thinks that the very notion of basic emotion is arbitrary and not worth keeping because it discourages research on the neural, behavioral, and bodily features of allegedly non-basic emotions. Hufendiek (2016) makes the complementary case that allegedly non-basic emotions manifest a great many of the characteristics distinctive of basic emotions (see also J. Clark 2010).

Another distinctive feature of enactivism is its anti-representational stance (Varela et al., 1991; Hutto & Myin 2013; Gallagher 2017). For example, Hutto (2012) has proposed that “we let go of the idea that emotions represent situations in truth-evaluable ways” (2012: 4), suggesting that emotions do not represent core relational themes. For instance, fear does not represent that there is danger at hand, and anger does not represent that there has been a slight against me or mine. Hutto’s (2012) main concern with respect to ascribing representational powers to emotions is that such powers are posited despite not having explanatory value (see Hufendiek 2018 for discussion). Specifically, Hutto (2012) follows Ramsey (2007) in assuming that a mental state counts as a representation only if it is consumed by other systems in light of what it says or indicates, and concludes that emotions fail to play this larger explanatory role in the cognitive economy of the organism and should therefore not be considered representations.

Prinz (2004) used to think that emotions represent core relational themes because they have the function of correlating with them, but in his recent work he has changed his mind. Schargel and Prinz (2018) have argued that a teleosemantic approach is a threat to the truly embodied character of a theory of emotions in the James-Lange mold, the approach they favor. This is because any non-embodied vehicle—e.g., a disembodied judgment—that has the function of correlating with a core relational theme would just as well represent such theme as an embodied vehicle does (Shargel 2014).

As an alternative, Shargel and Prinz (2018) embrace a non-representational, enactivist theory of content for emotions, according to which emotions create, by virtue of the bodily preparation they involve, action possibilities (see also Griffiths & Scarantino 2009; Hufendiek 2016). These action possibilities, unlike standard affordances in the Gibsonian tradition, which pre-exist emotions and are motivationally inert, are “state-dependent (they typically arise only once the emotion has been initiated), and imperatival (they motivate action)” (Shargel & Prinz 2018: 119). On this view, fear generates possibilities for escape which would not be there in the absence of fear, and which work as dynamic attractors, pulling the agent towards escape. The enactive content of fear, then, is not danger, but the presentation of a certain situation as something to be escaped, jointly with an impulse to move away from it, a content that is essentially embodied since it involves bodily preparation for escape.

A central challenge for enactivist theories of emotions of the non-representational variety is to account for our normative practices with respect to emotions. Once we realize that someone’s fear moved him or her to avoid a certain state of affairs, or that someone’s anger motivated him or her to attack someone, we still ask whether or not what motivated avoidance is a danger and whether or not what motivated retribution is a slight. In other words, we still treat emotions as appropriate and inappropriate with respect to their circumstances of elicitation, and it is an open question if and how these forms of appropriateness can be made sense of if emotions do not represent core relational themes (see Hufendiek 2016, 2017, 2018 for further discussion).

10. Rationality and Emotions

10.1 Cognitive Rationality as Fittingness, Warrant and Coherence

We distinguish between the cognitive rationality of emotions, consisting of their ability to represent the world as it is and properly relate to other evidence-sensitive evaluative processes, and the strategic rationality of emotions, consisting of their ability to lead to actions that promote the agent’s interests and properly relate to other action-influencing processes (De Sousa 1987, 2011; see also Greenspan 2000; Mulligan 1998; Solomon 1980; Thagard 2006; Stephan 2017b).

Emotions have long been thought to score poorly in terms of both cognitive and strategic rationality. The Stoics famously argued that emotions are false judgments. For example, fearing a tiger would involve the false judgment that one’s endangered life is important, whereas the sage should be indifferent to everything except virtue. Failures of the emotions at the strategic level are also deeply ingrained in both theoretical approaches and common sense. Ira brevis furor, said the Romans: anger is a brief bout of madness. In recent times, the pendulum has swung back, and researchers in both philosophy and affective science have started rehabilitating the emotions in terms of both cognitive and strategic rationality. A proper appreciation of the role of emotions with respect to rationality requires a number of distinctions.

Our first distinctions pertain to three varieties of cognitive rationality for emotions: rationality as fittingness, rationality as warrant and rationality as coherence. The dominant view on emotions is that they are representations of core relational themes or formal objects. Therefore, a first dimension of assessment for rationality concerns whether or not such core relational themes/formal objects are instantiated. We may for instance say that fear is rational in terms of fittingness just in case it is directed towards things that are truly dangerous, because this is what fear represents. Being afraid of a shark swimming alongside you is fitting, because the shark is dangerous. As D’Arms and Jacobson (2000) have emphasized, fittingness is importantly different from forms of appropriateness that are moral or strategic. For example, amusement at a funny joke may be fitting even if being amused by it is both morally inappropriate due to the sexist content of the joke, and costly in terms of self-interest, because those who witness the amusement may form a bad opinion of the amused agent.

Suppose now that fear is elicited by something that is not dangerous. Fear could still manifest rationality as warrant if its particular object manifests relevant evidential cues of dangerousness. For example, being afraid of a realistic replica of a shark moving alongside you in the water would be rational in the warrant sense, even though, unbeknownst to you, the shark replica is being remote-controlled by a group of innocuous marine biologists.

A third dimension of cognitive rationality concerns the consistency of emotions with other representations of what the world is like. If someone experiences fear of flying and believes that flying is dangerous, there is rationality as coherence between what they fear and what they believe (even though fear is unfitting given the extremely low likelihood of plane accidents).

As noted in section 7.1, emotions are often recalcitrant to reason: many people do not believe that flying is dangerous, and yet continue to fear it. But emotions manifest rationality as coherence in a great many cases. This is due in part to the fact that emotions have cognitive bases, which consist of cognitions whose function is to provide emotions with their particular objects—I must believe, perceive or imagine being on an airplane prior to fearing it.

When such cognitions are beliefs, their modification tends to be coherently reflected in changes of the emotions. For example, if I am angry at Tom based on my belief that he has bad mouthed me with a colleague, my anger is unlikely to survive the realization that he has not, in fact, bad mouthed me with a colleague. On occasion, however, my anger toward Tom will persist despite my belief that no slight whatsoever has taken place, thereby revealing irrationality as incoherence.

A special case of rationality as coherence regards the coherence of sets of emotions. Helm (2009) has argued that emotions come in rational patterns centered around the things that have import for the agent. For instance, if avoiding death is a concern of mine, then I should not only feel fear when my life is threatened by a deadly disease, but I should also feel, on pain of irrationality, relief once the threat dissipates and sadness or disappointment if the disease progresses instead.

10.2 Instrumental and Substantive Strategic Rationality

The strategic (or prudential) rationality of emotions concerns their ability to lead to actions that promote the agent’s interests and properly relate to other processes that affect actions, notably decision-making. Although emotions that are strategically rational will also generally be cognitively rational in the fittingness and in the warrant sense, exceptions are possible. For example, some instances of anger which are not produced in the presence of either actual slights (fittingness) or evidential cues of slights (warrant) end up promoting the agent’s interests. A case in point may be the anger of a customer whose interests would be best served by returning used merchandise but who has lost the receipt, and angrily dresses down a blameless clerk, which gets him the sought-after concession because the clerk gets intimidated.

We can distinguish two components of strategic rationality: an emotion is strategically rational insofar as it leads an agent (i) to select means conducive to the agent’s ends (instrumental strategic rationality) and (ii) to pursue ends that align with the agent’s interests all things considered (substantive strategic irrationality). An example of instrumental irrationality would be that of an agent who gets into a panic while trying to exit a house on fire, fails to listen to the fireman’s directions, goes for the closest door forgetting that it leads into the only area of the house without an exit, and perishes in the process. There is nothing wrong here with the end towards which panic predisposes the agent—seeking safety—but the means chosen are clearly suboptimal.

Substantive irrationality can be argued for with respect to both emotion types and emotion tokens. For instance, some have proposed that grief is a substantively irrational emotion type, because it always involves the belief that a person dear to the grieving agent is dead and the desire that such person is not dead, which is an unsatisfiable desire given what one believes (Gustafson 1989; see Cholbi 2017 for a response).

More commonly, theorists have argued that specific tokens of certain emotion types can be substantively irrational. For example, it would be contrary to an agent’s interests to get angry at a potential employer during a job interview, since it will likely result in not getting the job offer and thus frustrate self-interest.

By contrast, anger at someone cutting the line at the airport can be substantively rational, since the end of stopping the offensive behavior is conducive to one’s interests. Nussbaum (2016) has recently argued that this can only be the case if the angry agent’s focus is not at all on payback for the offensive behavior but entirely on preventing the offensive behavior from happening again, because the desire for payback is either straightforwardly irrational or problematic in other ways (Nussbaum refers to the unproblematic forms of anger as transition-anger).

A common reason for doubting the strategic rationality of emotions is that they often appear to lead to impulsive physical and mental actions. Impulsivity involves acting quickly prior to having considered all relevant information (Frijda 2010; Elster 1999, 2010). Some have argued that this is precisely what helps emotions provide an optimal compromise between speed and flexibility, allowing emotions to function as “decoupled reflexes” (Scherer 1984).

Others have noted that emotions often lead to “arational” actions, namely emotional actions not performed “for a reason” (Hursthouse 1991). Paradigmatic examples include actions like jumping up and down out of joy or rolling around in one’s dead wife’s clothes out of grief. In such cases, Hursthouse argued, there is no belief and desire pair that can be posited to provide a Humean reason for such actions, which are to be explained simply by saying that the agent is in the grip of an emotion. The debate on arational actions has taken off in recent philosophy of emotions, and a number of proposals, both in favor and against Humeanism, are available (see M. Smith 1998; Goldie 2000, Döring 2007; Kovach & De Lancey 2005; Scarantino & Nielsen 2015).

Emotions are notoriously apt to make us act in ways we regret. Notably, they can be a source of weakness of the will, the failure to act on one’s best reasons (Davidson 1970 [1980]). But they just as often help agents stick to their long-term goals (Tappolet 2016: 227). For example, a gut feeling of guilt may help an agent resist a cheating temptation and is in this sense a means to the end of successfully exercising self-control. On occasion, emotions can even ground the phenomenon of inverse akrasia (McIntyre 1990; Arpaly & Schroder 2000), which consists in failing to do what you judged best only to discover that you in fact did what was best for you, contrary to your former judgment. For example, one may judge best to become a professional musician, but be crippled by stage fright and end up in law school, only to later realize that this course of action best serves one’s long-term interests.

A further threat to the strategic rationality of emotions comes from their relation to self-deception (Fingarette 1969; Mele 1987; van Leeuwen 2007), which is commonly regarded as irrational. Roughly, self-deception involves forming beliefs that are contrary to what the available evidence supports but conformant to what the self-deceived agent desires. Emotions can cause self-deception because they can lead to powerful desires that something be or not be the case, which causally impact the subject’s ability to process evidence.

This feature is principally related to the fact that emotions determine salience among potential objects of attention. Poets have always known that the main effect of love is to redirect attention: when I love, I notice nothing but my beloved, and nothing of his or her faults. But this carries a risk, because I may fail to notice that there is massive evidence that I am being deceived in some harmful way. My desire that I not be deceived, motivated by my love, is what drives the faulty processing of evidence, resulting in self-deception.

This potential of emotions for “skewing the epistemic landscape” (Goldie 2004: 259) in negative ways is compensated by emotion’s important role in promoting rational epistemic thinking. Epistemic emotions are those that are particularly relevant to our quest for knowledge and understanding. Curiosity motivates inquiry; interest keeps us at it, and, as both Plato and Descartes noted, doubt is crucial to our ability avoid prejudice. These “epistemic” emotions can guide us specifically in the context of our attempts to gain knowledge (Silvia 2006; Brun, Doğuoğlu, & Kuenzle 2008; Morton 2010).

But even garden-variety, non-epistemic emotions can promote understanding of the world and of the self within it (see also the feeling-as-information hypothesis in affective science; Schwarz 2012). According to Brady (2013), the principal way in which emotions can do so is by motivating us to search for information that has a bearing on the fittingness of our emotions, and on the adequacy of their underlying concerns. Once again, the mechanism is that of changing salience among potential objects of attention. Suppose for instance you feel afraid when about to give a toast at a wedding. Your fear promotes understanding because it prompts you to determine whether the situation is truly dangerous, and whether you should care that much about giving a brilliant toast.

More broadly, it has been argued that the ability of emotions to shift attention on some features rather than others provides an essential solution to the so-called frame problem, which is the problem of sorting relevant from irrelevant information in decision-making. De Sousa has made the case in philosophy, suggesting that

emotions spare us the paralysis potentially induced by [the frame problem] by controlling the salience of features of perception and reasoning…[thereby] circumscribing our practical and cognitive options. (de Sousa 1987: 172)

For example, being afraid of a bear focuses attention exclusively on the features of the situation that are relevant to escaping it, without wasting time on deciding what irrelevant factors to ignore.

Damasio (1994, 2003) has given neurobiological foundations to this proposal, suggesting that emotions simplify the decision process by quickly marking deliberative options in the prefrontal cortex as positive or negative in light of their expected emotional consequences. Patients with ventromedial prefrontal damage, Damasio argued, become irrationally Hamlet-like when faced with trivial decisions such as choosing a date for their next doctor’s appointment, irrationally risk-prone when faced with gambling decisions, and irrationally impatient when faced with decisions demanding deferred gratification. The debate on whether the empirical evidence supports Damasio’s “somatic marker hypothesis” is still ongoing (see, e.g., Dunn, Dalgleish, & Lawrence, 2006; Reimann & Bechara, 2010; Beer 2017).

Another influential view on the rationality of emotions is that they help solve the commitment problem (Schelling 1960; Hirshleifer 1987; Frank 1988), which is the problem of convincing potential cooperative partners that one will fulfill promises and threats even when narrowly self-interested considerations would demand otherwise. For example, Frank (1988) has described the expression of sympathy as a mechanism to convince potential cooperators that one will behave honestly in future interactions even in the presence of temptation, and the expression of anger as a mechanism to convince potential cooperators that one will behave aggressively if messed with even when aggression is costly. These emotional signals are said to be credible because hard to fake, and they end up benefitting both partners, because they help secure the parties’ willingness to cooperate honestly in mutually beneficial projects (see also Ross & Dumouchel 2004; O’Connor 2016).

11. Concluding Remarks

One may be tempted to conclude from this overview of emotion theories across disciplines that the field is deeply divided on just about everything. This would be hasty. Despite the great diversity of views on the nature and function of emotions we have documented, a broad consensus has emerged on a number of topics. Here is a tentative list of what a plurality of emotion theorists agree about, with brief mention of where the disagreements begin:

  1. Emotion episodes involve, at least in prototypical cases, a set of evaluative, physiological, phenomenological, expressive, behavioral, and mental components that are diagnostic of emotions and are to some degree correlated with one another.
    • The degree to which these correlations are instantiated continues to be a central topic of theoretical debate: latent variable models assume that emotions cause the changes in components and expect to find strong correlations, whereas emergent variable models assume that emotions emerge from changes in components caused by something other than emotions and expect to find weak correlations.
  2. Token episodes of the same folk emotion type (e.g., anger, fear, shame) manifest a great deal of variability with respect to expressive, behavioral, physiological and phenomenological features, as well as intensity, duration, valence, arousal, type and range of intentional objects.
    • Researchers disagree on whether underlying all this variability there exist measurable bodily patterns of some kind that are still distinctive of different emotions.
  3. Emotions have intentionality or the ability to represent.
    • Researchers disagree on whether emotions represent descriptively or imperatively or both, on what exact contents they represent, and on what grounds the emotion-world representation relation. A small minority of researchers, hailing mostly from the enactivist movement, have argued that emotions lack representational qualities.
  4. The physical seat of emotions is the brain, but there are no neural circuits that correspond one-to-one with any folk emotion type, and brains are embodied and embedded in environments that are essential to their proper functioning.
    • Researchers disagree on how exactly the brain implements tokens of different emotion types, and whether emotional phenomena are best understood in terms of emotion-specific or emotion-unspecific neural mechanisms.
  5. Emotions typically involve conscious experiences, but such experiences are not strictly necessary for an emotion to be instantiated, in part because some emotion terms refer to dispositions and in part because most theorists consider feelings conceptually distinct from non-dispositional emotions.
    • A handful of influential researchers such as LeDoux (2017) and Barrett (2017) continue to identify emotions with conscious experiences.
  6. Evolutionary and socio-cultural considerations must both contribute to our understanding of a great many emotions’ functions. These are both intra-personal functions —e.g., helping organisms coordinate organismic resources to deal with urgent demands—and interpersonal functions —e.g., communicating information useful for the negotiation of social transactions.
    • Researchers continue to debate whether there is sufficient empirical evidence for basic emotions and other special-purpose emotion mechanisms. Some see the role of evolution as limited to the shaping of general-purpose adaptations, such as core affect and the ability to categorize, which jointly lead to the emergence of emotions.
  7. Emotions are no longer considered structurally opposed to reason
    • Researchers continue to debate the circumstances in which emotions manifest various kinds of cognitive and strategic irrationality.
  8. Emotions can be appropriate or inappropriate with respect to their intentional objects
    • Researchers debate the grounds of, and distinctions between, different forms of appropriateness (e.g., fittingness, moral appropriateness).
  9. Emotions typically involve appraisals of the significance of the stimulus situation, ranging between primitive and sophisticated forms of information processing.
    • Researchers debate what the structure of appraisals is, and whether appraisals cause or constitute emotions or both.
  10. Emotions typically correlate with changes in motivation to do things.
    • Some researchers think emotions cause or consist in such changes in motivation, whereas others think that changes in motivation have other causes, or are too unspecific to ground a theory of what emotions are.

The exploration of these insights and the resolution of the disagreements around them is a thriving interdisciplinary project in contemporary emotion theory. Philosophers and affective scientists will continue to engage in it for years to come, putting their distinctive theoretical skills at the service of projects of common interest.


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We want to thank Manula Adhihetty for his valuable work helping us edit the entry and completing the bibliography. We received excellent feedback on a previous draft of this entry from a number of colleagues and friends, including Giovanna Colombetti, Phoebe Ellsworth, Rebekka Hufendiek, Agnes Moors, Jesse Prinz, Jim Russell, Disa Sauter, Dan Shargel, Achim Stephan, Christine Tappolet, Fabrice Teroni and an anonymous referee. Fabrice also gave us very valuable comments on the previous version of this entry, for which we are very grateful.

Copyright © 2018 by
Andrea Scarantino <ascarantino@gsu.edu>
Ronald de Sousa <ronald.de.sousa@utoronto.ca>

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