First published Wed Nov 23, 2005; substantive revision Fri Jun 17, 2016

Pleasure, in the inclusive usages important in thought about well-being, experience, and mind, includes the affective positivity of all joy, gladness, liking, and enjoyment – all our feeling good or happy. It is often contrasted with the similarly inclusive pain, or suffering, of all our feeling bad.[1] Nowadays “happiness” is often used similarly, which leads to confusion with older uses signifying overall good fortune or success in life that figure in self-reports of happiness and in ‘happiness studies’ of the diverse sources of these.

Pleasure presents as good and attractive – itself, when it comes to our notice, and all else that appears aglow in its light. This suggests simple explanations both of why people pursue pleasure and why there are reasons to do so. That we may prefer and choose something for its pleasure suggests that there are facts about pleasure that make some such choices better than others. Philosophers, taking this suggestion further, have sometimes taken pleasure to be a single simple (feature of) experience that makes experiences good and attractive to the extent it is present. This simple picture has often been associated with more sweeping normative and psychological claims, all ambiguously called “hedonism”. These take pleasure’s goodness and attractiveness (and pain’s badness and aversiveness) to (between them) explain all of human value, normative practical reasons, and motivation. Pleasure and pain would, if views of all three kinds were true, be the only ultimately good- and bad-making features of human (and relevantly similar animal) life and also both the only actual ultimate ends and the only justified ultimate ends of all our voluntary pursuit and avoidance. The simple picture and related hedonistic claims and explanations were especially prominent in the psychology, economics, and philosophy of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries but were widely rejected in the twentieth.

Contemporary science partly restores pleasure’s importance but also suggests that pleasure’s relations to awareness and motivational attraction are more variable than many hedonists and much ordinary thinking supposed. Contemporary philosophers continue to debate what pleasure is but are only beginning to address scientific advances that are slowly filling out what age-old use of psychoactive substances to enhance mood and newer drug therapies for depression already presupposed – pleasure is a biological phenomenon.

Guide to the Contents: Notes should be omitted by the typical reader; see the advice that precedes these. §1 discusses the simple picture (boldface, two paragraphs above). §1.3 suggests how the objections earlier considered may be mitigated sufficiently to save the simple picture’s experiential core as a live theoretical possibility. The difficulty and fallibility of introspection and perhaps especially of introspecting affective states is appealed to. §2.3.2 discusses the recent attitudinal approach in the form developed by Fred Feldman. Its difficulties are discussed at length and both neoAristotelian and more simple-picture-like alternatives (§2.3.3) suggested. More complex medieval accounts of pleasure’s intentional relations are also noted (§2.3.1) and likewise contrasted with more nondual views. §3, especially, aims to integrate philosophical and scientific, historical and contemporary contributions.

1. A Feature of Momentary Experience

Pleasure seems obvious and even intimate in a friend’s smile, posture, or manner and when we notice we are having a good time and enjoying ourselves. To some in the grip of the simple picture (¶2 above) it has seemed introspectively obvious that pleasure is a simple feeling we know directly in momentary conscious experience and almost as obvious that it is something we often do, and should, pursue. But Gilbert Ryle, writing when behaviorism ruled psychology, maintained that pleasure is never any episode of conscious experience at all (1949, IV, 6) and Fred Feldman (2004, discussed in §2.3.2 below) maintains that it is a pure propositional attitude of which feeling is no essential part. Other opponents of the simple picture maintained that pleasure requires a much larger cognitive context than, on the simple picture, it does. Elizabeth Anscombe thereby helped refocus philosophers’ attention on the foundational question that uncritical acceptance of the simple picture had led many modern philosophers to neglect, What is pleasure?

1.1 Pleasure as a Simple but Powerful Feeling

Pleasure most commonly backgrounds the experience of someone cheerful by temperament or in a good mood. Such baseline affect and small deviations from it cumulatively matter most to the affective quality of life (Watson 2000; Diener, Sandvik, and Pavot  1991; cf. Coan and Allen 2003, Rachels 2004). That pleasure includes these has been prominently noted (e.g.: Duncker, 1941, 404; Alston, 1967, 341; Gosling, 1969, 135 ff.) but often slips from mind. Exclusive focus on salient episodes with acute onset caused by typically pleasant stimulation, as from sweets and caresses, may mislead one to think such episodes or sensations are the main topic of hedonic discussion or to misread others as making this mistake.

Pleasure neither easily fits, nor has been widely thought by theorists to fit, the standard paradigms of sensation, whether of qualities of outward things or of those of either localized or diffuse bodily sensation, since it seems any typically pleasant sensory state or quality may be enjoyed less or even not at all on occasions, while its sensory quality and intensity remain much the same (Ryle 1949, p. 109; 1954a, p. 58; 1954b, p. 136). The pleasantness of tastes is modulated by nutritional state and experience (Young 1959, Cabanac 1971, Bolles 1991). And differences in mood, temperament, personal history, and how one feels toward a particular person in a specific social context may make all the difference between feeling great pleasure or great distress from what seems the same sensation of touch (cf. Helm 2000 pp. 93–94; 2002, pp. 23–24). Both science and reflection on everyday experience thus distinguish mere sensation proper from hedonic reaction (cf. Aydede 2000). Allowing that there may be ‘sensations of pleasure’, its occasionally accompanying somatic symptoms, is consistent with this distinction between sensation, narrowly conceived, and affective response. John Locke’s (1700/1979, II, xx, 1) picture of pleasure and pain as “simple ideas” learned and understood “only by experience” of “what we feel in ourselves”, distinguishable from any “sensation barely in itself” they may accompany, seems consistent with this distinction between affective feeling and sensation proper made more prominently later.[2]

Locke and many of his time and tradition seem to have held views close to the simple picture of pleasure (of this entry’s second introductory paragraph), joined to an empiricist picture of our concepts of pleasure and good as similarly simple because acquired from the simple experience of pleasure. Their view that pleasure is an (at least cognitively) isolable conscious event or feature has counterparts among those ancient hedonist materialist philosophers who thought of pleasure as some smooth or gentle stimulation, motion, or physiological change (see Gosling and Taylor 1982, pp. 41, 394) and also among those nowadays who regard it as some short-term activity of the brain. Hedonist views that explain human value, motivation, and concepts of good and evil in terms of such supposedly simple affective feelings of pleasure and pain (e.g., Locke 1700/1979, Essay II, xx and xxi, 31 ff.) were also widespread, especially among writers in English, in the following two centuries. Pleasure was widely taken for granted as foundational in this way by the nascent behavioral and social sciences, until more demanding standards, first for stricter introspection and later for more objective (in this use: not based in experimental subjects’ judgments on the topic) methods, were adopted.[3]

1.2 Rejections of the Simple Picture

The last great nineteenth century utilitarian moral philosopher, Henry Sidgwick, failed to find any constant felt feature in his experience of pleasure. He therefore proposed that “pleasure” picks out momentary experiences not by any specific introspected quality but rather by their intrinsic desirability, as may be cognitively apprehended at the time of experiencing (Sidgwick 1907, pp. 125–31, 111–5). He thus took the concept of pleasure to be irreducibly evaluative and normative, but still to apply to experience; experience is pleasant to the extent it wholly grounds reasons to desire, seek, or actualize it merely in how it feels. Mid-twentieth-century British and American philosophers departed still farther from the simple picture and associated empiricist traditions, influenced in part by behaviorism in psychology.

Gilbert Ryle (1949, 1954a, 1954b) accordingly argued that “pleasure” designates no occurrent experiences at all, but (in a central use) heedfully performed activities fulfilling unopposed dispositional inclinations and (in others) equally dispositional disturbances of, or else liabilities to, such dispositions.[4] The preferred first of these was a near transposition of Aristotle’s account of pleasure (in NE VII) as the unimpeded conduct of activities into the language of dispositions to behavior or action (since heed, or attention, was also taken dispositionally). Ryle’s logical dispositionalism was soon rejected (Nowell-Smith 1954, Penelhum 1957, Armstrong 1968, Lyons 1980). His constructive suggestion that pleasure be understood as a form of heed, attention, or interest builds on Aristotle’s observation that pleasure strengthens specific activities in competition with others and his arguing from this that pleasure varies in kind with the different activities on which it depends, each being strengthened by its own pleasures but weakened by others and also weakened by its own pains (NE X, 5:1175b1–24). On Ryle’s view, this is because to do something with pleasure just is to do it wholeheartedly and with one’s absorption in it undistracted by other activities or by feelings of any kind.

Justin Gosling, insightfully appraising the Ryle-inspired literature toward the end of its run, argued that it had largely missed the ethical and psychological importance of pleasure by neglecting the conceptually central cases of positive emotion and mood. (For a forthright denial of pleasant occurrent mood, see Taylor 1963.) He concluded that our being pleased in these ways shows pleasure to be, in a relaxed way of speaking, a feeling, after all, and that the concept is extended from these cases to include enjoyments that may please one at the time or else cause or dispose one to be pleased later. Wanting things for their own sake, which hedonists often seek to explain in terms of their being pleasant, is actually connected to the central cases through its often being caused by being pleased at some prospect. While Gosling used such distinctions to block some arguments for hedonist theses, he also defended the importance of pleasure in both moral psychology and ethics (1969, chapters 9 and 10).

Elizabeth Anscombe, like Ryle and his followers, rejected any account on which pleasure is a context-independent ‘internal impression’, whether affective or sensory. But while Ryle substituted a neoAristotelian account of enjoyments to fit his ‘anti-Cartesian’ philosophy of mind, her main reason was that any such feeling or sensation would be quite beside what she took to be the concept’s explanatory and reason-implying use. She influentially judged the concept so obscure and problematic that theories placing weight upon it, such as hedonistic utilitarianism, should be rejected out of hand. John Rawls, quoting her even more influentially, did just that, abandoning utilitarianism for a more constructivist and less realist approach to ethics.[5]

Anscombe (interpreting and expanding on her very brief remarks on pleasure, guided by the larger context of her 1963/1957 and also by her later 1981d/1978) reasoned that since ascribing pleasure gives a reason for action, and reasons for action are intelligible only given a context of intelligible evaluation and motivation that no feeling of the moment could supply, pleasure cannot be anything picked out only by how it feels in the moment and regardless of its larger context. Attributing pleasure to a subject, rather, involves understanding what it is for a subject to regard and behave toward something as good (however nonconceptually represented) and this in turn involves background knowledge of the ways something may intelligibly be considered good and an object of voluntary pursuit. Thus the possession of the concept of pleasure presupposes the presence of a rich and contextually embedded concept of the good that no mere momentary qualitative experience could supply. Therefore no such experience could serve as the origin of our concept of pleasure or of our concept of good, as empiricists aiming to account for these concepts as acquired from a feeling of pleasure had supposed.

Bennett Helm, beginning in the 1990s, developed a positive view much in the spirit of Anscombe’s sparse critical remarks, although perhaps different in detail.[6] For Helm (2002), pleasures and pains alike are ‘felt evaluations’ that impress themselves on our feeling (in contrast to our activity in evaluative judgment) by virtue of larger patterns of evaluation, emotion, and motivation they partially constitute. Our feeling pleasure or pain is just our having our attention and motivation directed in this way (1994, 2001a, 2001b, 2009).

While Helm’s view of pleasure and pain accommodates Anscombe’s constraint that pleasure provide holistically intelligible reasons for action and also fits his larger agenda, it implausibly makes a kitten’s or an infant’s hurting from a bruised limb or deriving pleasure from nursing depend on their having appropriate large patterns of background concerns including, as he tells us, in cases of bodily pain, background concerns for the integrity of their bodies (2002, pp. 24–27). If such a larger pattern of concern for one’s body is necessary for the affective component of pain, both should together fade away in, for example, a terminally ill patient who now wants mainly a speedy natural death, rather than the continuance of whatever bodily integrity remains. To the extent that someone has predominantly such a pattern of desire and emotion, it would seem, on this view, that sensory pain (or, as Helm has it, the stimulation that would otherwise have been painful) must, as signaling the approach of the desired end, be if not purely then at least on balance pleasant. And in the unconflicted limiting case, we need not offer palliative analgesia for relief of pain, since experiencing pain is supposedly unintelligible lacking an appropriate larger pattern of desires and emotions. Lacking this, as Helm claims in renewing the ancient Stoic claim about the sage under torture, one’s writhing and screaming fail to signify that one is suffering pain (2002, p. 24). No need for morphine to palliate any such seeming pain of our patient, it seems. And Richard Moran would add that morphine should be equally useless for providing the solace of pleasure, as this similarly always depends on appropriately connecting with a patient’s cognitively complex normative space of skills and reasons (Moran 2002, pp. 209–14). Such views may have testable consequences. They may predict that broad attitude changes accompany effective antidepresssant therapy and, less plausibly, all transient enjoyments and lightening of mood.

But as Helm perhaps halfway acknowledges by deferring in passing to biological constraints, we may not be as unitary and governed by a coherent pattern of feelings, desires, and evaluative judgments as he seems officially to propose. Pleasure and pain sometimes seem to impose themselves on us absent any connection with any large pattern of evaluations we can identify with, but rather from below, out of proportion to any plausible role in larger patterns of preexisting concerns and standing desires, as when we spontaneously take pleasure in a fragrance, sunset, or landscape –or just find ourselves, unaccountably, in a good mood. In such cases, at least, it seems plausible that our relevant concerns and practical reasons are small and local, centered on the pleasure and perhaps a perception (Sidgwick 1907, 127-31, 110-113; Goldstein 1980, 1989, 2002) or appearance (Plato and Aristotle, according to Jessica Moss 2012) of its goodness, rather than necessarily embedded in a much larger package deal. Even if pleasure is or involves a functional role of some kind, this may be a relatively small and local one of a kind shared with simpler animals, constituted by intrinsic functions of brain and mind.[7]

Hedonists in the grip of the simple picture regard pleasure-seeking as uniquely intelligible and demand that all motivated action and all reasons for action be fitted to this mold. Opponents who privilege a holistic model of evaluation and deliberation may demand, instead, that all feeling be made intelligible in its terms. We should be equally skeptical of both demands and also of the claims for special and exclusive intelligibility on which they trade. It appears that affective experience is present in infants who have as yet no large pattern of desires and concerns and also in dying people who have lost any relevant ones or even the capacity for them. The default presumption seems to be that in many cases such as these and of ordinary ‘simple pleasures’ and of elevated mood as well no relevant large integrated pattern of evaluative attitudes or of aesthetic aptitudes need obtain. We thus have some reason to return to something closer to the simple picture that retains its momentary experiential core.

1.3 More Modest Roles for Experience

The child acquiring the ability to refer to pleasure has more to go on than the concept empiricist’s untutored inward recognition when learning to sort together sweets, hugs, and play and to name something common these typically cause or sustain. The great medieval lyric poet Walther von der Vogelweide paraphrases joy as “dancing, laughing, singing”.[8] And Darwin writes, “I heard a child a little under four years old, when asked what was meant by being in good spirits, answer, ‘It is laughing, talking, and kissing.’ It would be difficult to give a truer and more practical definition.”[9] As Darwin also observes, “[W]ith all races of man, the expression of good spirits appears to be the same, and is easily recognized.”[10] The contrast with the negative affects develops very early in the expressive behavior of the child and is also early and easily perceived. While a mature conception will distinguish behavioral expression from its inward cause (as Walther does, in lines 28–29, quoted in note 8), the very young child may possess a less differentiated conception in which the salient contrasts between smiling or laughing and crying (Walther, line 29), and generally between the external expressions of the positive and negative affects, are prominent. Labeling and reporting one’s own hedonic states presumably develop alongside attribution to others, from innately prepared capacities for affective feeling, expression, and perception that must work together early to facilitate early emotional communication and bonding between infant and parent and, later, mutual understanding with others.[11] To a slightly older child, pleasure may signify at once feeling that is good and behavior expressing it and goodness of life no more than these. From such a liberalized Lockean basis, not based solely or mainly in phenomenal similarity but not arrived at without experience, a child may progress to a more mature conception of good and thence to the common adult conception of pleasure as feeling that is good (Sidgwick, discussed in §1.2, ¶1; §2.3.1, ¶1; n. 5, ¶4; and n. 18) or at least naturally presents as such (Aristotle according to Moss, n. 7 above), with hedonic experience having had some place among these concepts’ sources.

Saving the core of the simple picture, pleasure as a relatively unmediated momentary experience, in some such way, however, may abandon the obviousness of pleasure’s nature, goodness, and role in motivation that complete introspective transparency and intelligibility was supposed to provide. Experience of pleasure may thus play a role in allowing direct reference to pleasure and also in forming our concept of the good without its giving us any deep knowledge or justified confidence about either. Even whether there actually is such a kind as pleasure, as there appears to be, is open to refutation by new science. But if introspection is thus fallible, then Sidgwick’s failing to find a single feeling of pleasure, Ryle’s finding it a behavioral disposition, and Feldman a pure propositional attitude like belief (§2.3.2) separable from having any feeling at all, are not decisive objections to pleasure feeling like something or at least some things (Labukt 2012). The immediacy of phenomenal experience may not make for obviousness to cognition §2.3.4, ¶2), as on the full-blooded empiricist construal of the simple picture. (For recent defenses of aspects of such an experiential approach to pleasure, see, e.g., Crisp 2006, Labukt 2012, and Bramble 2013).

There may be reason, moreover, to believe introspection of affective, as opposed to, for example, sensory, experience, to be especially prone to errors of omission. Focal awareness of specific information content and the experience of affect have long been thought to compete with each other – and not merely as different sensory or cognitive contents do. Competitive alternation between the two modes of experience was a commonplace of past psychology and is receiving increasing confirmation.[12] Ongoing research initiated by Marcus Raichle and his collaborators indicates default, resting state, or monitoring modes of brain activity, perhaps including representations of one’s current hedonic state, that are typically turned down by attention-demanding tasks (Gusnard et al 2001, Gusnard and Raichle 2004, Fox et al 2005), perhaps even by some ways of attempting to introspect one’s current affective state. If so, the very focusing of introspective scrutiny on pleasure provoked by the demand to accurately report it, may, thus, sometimes turn down the gain on systems involved in representing it. If this is so, it may explain some of the inconsistency of views mentioned in the previous paragraph and those of the 1930s introspectionist psychological laboratories (n. 3) as well. However that may be, pleasure seems generally to attach attention and motivation to salient stimuli and especially toward ends it is pleasant to envision, rather than to itself (e.g., Schlick 1930/1939, Ch. II, §§4–10, pp. 36–55). Such a perspective may answer the objection to experiential views of pleasure that if pleasure were felt, it would divert our attention from what we are enjoying, such as music, to itself (Ryle 1954a, Madell (2002, pp. 90–93). Pleasure may typically be easier to notice sideways than straight on. And as task demands increase, these may degrade our ability to even cognitively notice our affective state, so that the pleasure we phenomenally experience is out of (the limited-capacity cognitive awareness of our) mind (cf. §2.3.4, ¶2).

From a contemporary fallibilist perspective on introspection, we should not then be surprised at its failures or take them to be decisive against pleasure’s being a single experiential kind, as Sidgwick did. And even if it is not, the possibility of its containing a limited heterogeneity remains (Labukt 2012, §3.3 below). Neither should it be surprising that introspectionist psychologists (n. 3, ¶ 3) and philosophers failed to agree on whether pleasure has one phenomenal feel, a diversity, or none at all and that bodily sensations (which are not similarly resistant to inspection) may show up instead. If diligent introspection of some kinds tends to make momentary feeling cognitively inaccessible, then such introspection will often be a worse guide than untutored experience about it. Rather than relying exclusively on introspection (and unknowingly on the naive or trained intuitions and prejudices that may shape reports of it) we should bring the totality of our evidence to bear, drawing on psychology and biology as well as direct experience, as the best philosophers before the heyday of modern empiricism and introspectionism did.

2. Finding Unity in Heterogeneity

There are four chief pleasures, a saying among Afghan men goes: of the hot bath, of a youth with his friends, of a man with a woman, and of seeing one’s son grown to manhood. What might these share, not only with each other, but also with otherwise gendered social and sexual pleasures and with the horror movie goer’s joyous thrill in frights and those of hot spice, as well?

2.1 Seeking a Universal Account

On the simple picture, pleasure itself is always the same; when it is bound up with the different pleasures of sweets or philosophy it is only caused (however cognitively, reciprocally, or recurrently) in different ways. Philosophers have often aimed to respect, more equally with pleasure’s obscurely felt unity, also the diversity manifest in its occasions. Thus Plato speculated that pleasure is a sensing, perceiving, or awareness of improvement, in varying respects, in one’s condition; Aristotle, that it arises in the unimpeded functional fulfillment of varying life capacities in their characteristically different activities (e.g.; perceiving particular things, theoretically contemplating their natures); and contemporary writers that it is a welcoming attitude (had toward different contents) or some underlying stance of openness to experience generally that may waver between different objects and having none at all. Such questions have been explicitly contested at least since Plato had his Socrates suggest that pleasure is so extremely heterogeneous that no simple generalizations about it will hold, such as the hedonist’s claim that all pleasure is good, especially given the very large differences between the things that very different sorts of people enjoy (Philebus 12C–13B).

2.2 Classical Accounts: Functional Unity with Difference

Plato and Aristotle aimed to understand pleasure’s value, biology, and place in psychology and experience in an integrated way, in the context of the science of their day.

2.2.1 Plato: Noticing Different Restorations to Life’s Natural State

Plato built on the ancient common sense that connected pleasure with the satisfaction of felt longing, or appetitive desire (epithumia), and also on early scientific speculation equating pleasure with the fulfillment of bodily needs. He observed that simple personal-report level motivational accounts fail because we may experience pleasure without any previously felt distress, desire, or noticed need, as sometimes when looking, listening, smelling, or learning, and also that one may fulfill physiological needs without experiencing pleasure in the process of so doing (Philebus 51A–52C). He therefore refined and generalized the current physiologically-influenced account of pleasure as restoration of bodily imbalance or deficiency, on the model of hunger and thirst, to make it instead the sensation, perception, or consciousness (all aisthēsis in Greek) of return from a (possibly unnoticed) state of deficiency to a naturally healthy state.[13] The ‘pure’ (‘unmixed with pain’) pleasures of knowing and perceiving were apparently construed as signaling the satisfaction of needs we are unaware of, and so not pained by, acquiring or having. A unified account of all pleasure was thus achieved, as awareness of processes of fulfilling very diverse needs, systematically accounting for both pleasure’s unity and diversity. Pleasure could be accorded a place in the best life attainable for beings like ourselves, imperfect enough to have recurrent needs but sometimes aware of their however partial and temporary satisfaction. But the absolutely best life would be a divine one of permanent perfect knowing without the possibility of further learning or any other improvement, and in which there would therefore be no pleasure at all – and presumably we would do well, insofar as we are able, to approximate to this (Philebus 33B). Descartes’ views of the function or content of pleasure and Spinoza’s official definitions of pleasure as an affect of transition to greater perfection are close to Plato’s, as also are one of Kant’s characterizations,[14] one of Elijah Millgram’s (2000, pp. 122–26), and Timothy Schroeder’s (2001, 2004, discussed in §3.1). Such Improvement Indicator Views may account for diversity within pleasure by the different species of improvements indicated. But they need not attribute explicit awareness of needs or of their fulfillments as such to the experiencing subject. A modern version might attribute only biological functions, without requiring any explicit representation of departures from or restorations to one’s natural state at either personal or subpersonal levels.

2.2.2 Aristotle: Perfecting Different Activities

Aristotle rejected Plato’s assimilation of enjoying sights, sounds, smells, and intellectual activity to the satisfaction of homeostasis-serving appetites and also his view of the best, divine, changeless life we should aspire to approximate to as one of pleasureless cognition. Yet he adopted as his own the project of finding a unitary account of pleasure that would fit the teleological metaphysics and intellectualist value theory he inherited from Plato – and also Plato’s strategy of giving a generic formal account that allows for specific variation. He thus rejected Plato’s restoration process account totally to substitute his own equally general account of pleasure as arising rather from the activities of animals, or of their parts or faculties, when these are already, at least in part, in good condition.

Aristotle’s account of life as a teleologically and hierarchically unified system of biological capacities allowed him to give a unified account of pleasure while discriminating systematically among different kinds and instances according to their ranks in his value-laden hierarchy of life capacities and their functionings. Each activity, when unimpeded and perfected, on his view, gives rise to its own specific ‘supervenient’ (arising from a preexisting ground) pleasure, differentiated in kind from those belonging to other kinds of activity (NE X, 5). The different pleasures thus have a generic unity, as belonging to perfected activities of developed life capacities – a unity ultimately deriving from the generic unity of life itself. The differing causal powers of different kinds of pleasure, each supporting engagement in its own specific activity, but interfering with others, could thus be accounted for, and their higher-level functional and felt similarity as well, by regarding instances of pleasure as experiences of the success of one’s life’s, or soul’s, fulfillment in particular activities of its constitutive perfected activity – but in different activities that, according to the differing teleological ranks of their life capacities and objects, have correspondingly differing degrees of pleasure and value. Pleasure is thus no accidental addition to life; it naturally reflects and tracks success in living and its value. This value is teleologically explanatory of our biological development and of the lower animal desires in which we share, but also gives to human life and rational human action their own characteristic higher ultimate goal and point. Living a life that brings its biologically highest constitutive capacities to their complete development and then exercises them without impediment upon their naturally best and most suitable objects is success in life and brings the most pleasant pleasure with it. Trivial or ignoble pleasures are sought instead by those who are stunted in their capacities for higher activities, having failed to develop the intellectual and moral virtues needed to use these well, and consequently fall short of the highest natural human fulfillment and goal. That is the fully human happiness which consists in using reason well, which at its best approximates to the best and pleasantest life form of all, the changeless purely intellectual activity of God. Our pleasure tracks the perfection of our current activities and thus our proximity to this, life at its cognitively clearest, most awake, and best (Protrepticus B87–B91, 1984, p. 2414; Nicomachean Ethics VII, 11–14 and X, 1–6).

Aristotle’s theory, which we may call a Perfection in Functioning View, accommodates both pleasure’s generic unity and specific diversity by making pleasure and its value vary together, with the varying nature and value of animals’ various life activities, and these, in turn, with those of their objects or ends. It has had a deservedly great influence on later accounts, from later antiquity to recent philosophy and welfare economics.[15] Recently the prolific social psychologist Mihaly Csikszentmihalyi’s studies mainly of self-reports of the ‘flow experience’ of engaged absorption in activities have provided some empirical support for flow’s connection with enjoyment, but also, perhaps, for its not, despite its advertising, being the very same thing – as he, like Aristotle, in his improving exhortation, sometimes seems to want it to be.[16]

John Stuart Mill followed Aristotle in endorsing a rational preference for ‘higher’ pleasures over those we share with ‘lower’ animals, but objected to Aristotle’s tying pleasure to objective functional standards. He and more recent writers have posed simple counterexamples to these being even sufficient or necessary conditions for pleasure, using perceptual examples such as Aristotle used in expounding his theory. Mill’s objection may be interpreted and expanded upon as follows. Aristotle’s theory implies that, other things equal, the more precise and informative of two perceptions or cognitions must be the more pleasant. But this, it seems, may be the worse of two bad smells. The excellent acuity of the olfactory system and even its unimpeded operation and the mutual suitability of faculty and object (NE X, 4:1174b14–1175a3) seem not to exclude this. So Aristotle’s conditions seems insufficient for pleasure, if excellence of object is filled out in cognitive or functional rather than in hedonic terms. (Neither is any such condition necessary for pleasure, as in a relaxed and lazy mood.) Of course, we might downgrade or upgrade sensory interactions ad hoc, counting those we enjoy as excellent, but then we move in a small circle and offer no independent characterization of pleasure.[17] Perhaps a quasi-neoAristotelian might acknowledge all this and abandon the claims that led to the falsified predictions, while still believing pleasure is some way activities are performed (to be filled out empirically). But whether any plausible way can be found remains to be shown. The same holds all the more for Aristotle’s ambition of explaining pleasure’s value by some more basic independently defined value in biological functioning.

2.2.3 Epicurus: Savoring the Activity of Life’s Natural State

Epicurus took a less elitist and less intellectualist view of pleasure according to which it is available to its greatest extent to any animal free from bodily and emotional pain (Cooper 1999a), with no highly developed distinctively human capacity or functioning in principle required. Epicureans cultivated philosophy, however, to free people from groundless fears of afterlife suffering and death, and inculcated habits of living enabling one to live simply and thus securely because not needing, and thus not fearing loss of, luxuries. Varying pleasant activities was also recommended, perhaps because this is needed to maintain requisite awareness of our stable natural state’s unimpeded life activity by varying its expression (cp. Gosling and Taylor, 1982, 374 and Erler and Schofield, 1999, 653 and further references cited there; for further references supporting a variety of interpretations see n. 30 below). While emphasizing his differences with Epicurus, as he interpreted him (1790/1976, 294–300, 307), Adam Smith rather similarly believed that someone “who is in health, who is out of debt, and has a clear conscience” is in “the natural and ordinary state of mankind” to the widespread happiness typical of which nothing important can be added (45).

2.3 A Kind of Directedness toward Objects or Contents?

Many ordinary mental states recognized by common sense, such as particular beliefs and desires, are essentially directed upon their object or content. Could pleasure’s unity be that of such a kind, and its diversity derive from from that of its intentional contents or objects? If not always of Aristotelian activities we enjoy. or real people or things, perhaps prospects or propositions or impossibilities that are abstracta or have their being as objects of thought alone? According to a Christian philosophical tradition, pleasure constitutively depends on a mental act of willing or loving that may be directed toward different cognitively presented things. And according to the contemporary analytic philosopher Fred Feldman, pleasure itself is a single propositional attitude, like belief, that, similarly, may be directed toward diverse propositional contents. The tenability of such accounts concerns not only philosophers primarily interested in pleasure but also those more generally concerned with the nature of mind. Brentano claimed that all mentality is intentional and some recent analytic philosophers that the phenomenal character of experience is constituted by its representational content (e.g., Lycan 2005). If there are representationally contentless but phenomenally conscious pleasant moods, such claims and theories cannot be correct.

2.3.1 Liking, Loving, Savoring

The lack of a precise account of pleasure’s nature presented no scandal so long as pleasure was thought of as an experience, however variable and generic, typical causes of which might be roughly characterized but for which no verbally explicit real definition was to be expected (Locke and Kant, cited in n. 2; Mill 1872/1979, p. 430). Perhaps this is all an account short on biological or computational detail, and on the deep functional insight these might offer, can provide. However, taking introspection to be a source of scientific knowledge led to disquiet when introspectors failed to agree about what, if any, distinctive introspectible item they had found in experiencing pleasure. Even before this method had run its course in psychology (see n. 3 above), the philosopher Henry Sidgwick had failed to find any distinctive uniform quality in his own experience of pleasure. His normative account of pleasure, as “feeling, apprehended as desirable by the sentient individual at the time of feeling it” (1907, p. 129; see n. 5, ¶4 above), led C.D. Broad to suggest, in passing, that the pleasant experiences might be just those we like.[18] Ambiguity in academic use of this colloquial language of “liking” has led to equivocation in the literature. Some authors use it for an intrinsically hedonic state distinguished from wanting or desiring but not from pleasure. Others use it instead for an attitude (such as desire) they suppose either to constitute from within, or else to pick out and thus unify from outside, experiences of pleasure as such and sometimes to insist wrongly that their opponents, by using the same language, have conceded their view. (Problems with such language were flagged by Zink 1962, 90–2; Trigg 1970, 52–3, 116–19; Katz 2008, 414–17; Tanyi 2010; and Labukt 2012, 158 but still afflict the ethics literature. This issue is also often run together with that of whether the related reasons are value- or desire-based, but distinguished from it by Heathwood 2011.)

Franz Brentano, Sidgwick’s close contemporary, brought explicit concern with such intentional (act/object or attitude/content) structure to the attention of Western philosophers outside the continuing Catholic intellectual tradition. The involvement of pleasure and emotions with beliefs and desires had been a starting point for discussions in Plato (Philebus 36ff.) and Aristotle (Rhetoric II, 2–11). In the following tradition pleasure was often regarded as, in part, a bodily phenomenon not belonging to our true, nonbodily, self or true good.[19] Scholastic philosophers of the Western Christian high middle ages accordingly regarded bodily pleasure as occurring in a sensory soul or power, caused directly by sensory awareness. They debated competing views concerning the causation and intentionality of thought-mediated pleasure, regarded as occurring in the intellectual soul or power. On William of Ockham’s account, such pleasure causally depends directly on the will’s loving acceptance, as good in itself, of an object intellectually presented. For Ockham, this pleasure is distinct from the loving acceptance on which it depends, as is shown by the example (used similarly earlier by John Duns Scotus) of a cognitively pleased scholar in a depressed mood, in which the normally resulting pleasure fails to occur. Others denied these two were distinct. Some of them allowed, however, a distinct second-order loving taking the original loving as its object and thus as that of its pleasure; another thought this higher-order loving and pleasure might be included in the original act of loving.[20] Descartes rejected this dualism, regarding all pleasure (as all else mental) as essentially thought (and, specifically, as at least often involving thinking that some good pertains to oneself) and sensory, or bodily, pleasure as pleasing the immaterial thinking mind by informing it of its body’s sufficiency to withstand the mild challenge to its integrity that the sensory stimulation presents (see n. 2, ¶2, for references). For Brentano, sensory pleasure takes as its intentional content, rather, the sensuous experiencing of sensory qualities. It is a loving directed toward a sensory act. In intellectually-caused pleasure, our purely spiritual (nonbodily) loving (as it seems: nonaffective liking, approving of, or being pleased by) the content of a thought causes us to affectively love a sensory experiencing – i.e., to experience bodily sensory pleasure.[21] Brentano seems in these views to have followed his medieval Scholastic models, without taking on board the standard modern notion of affective consciousness that is neither conative nor sensory nor coldly intellectual (Kant 1790/2000 and its Bibliography note).

Caution is required when appropriating the medieval language of intentionality in contemporary non-Scholastic use. In the older deployments considered above, in the context of an Aristotelian teleological metaphysics of mind and nature in which minds and natural forms were made for each other and their moving toward perfected acts of knowing did explanatory work, naive realism about content ascriptions had a fundamental place. In contemporary cognitive sciences and analytic philosophy, they are sometimes understood more instrumentally than as expressing precise ground-level truths.[22] It’s often not clear what ascribing a content or object to, say, pleasure involves. There’s also no standard single use of attitude language in academic Philosophy. Uses predominant in the analytic philosophy of language and thereby in the philosophy of mind usually involve relations to propositions, about which there is much literature but no standard account of what they are or what ascribing relations to them involves. Belief is standard example. A different or narrower use more influenced by psychology and common in ethics involves being motivationally, affectively, or evaluatively (rather than cognitively) for or against (e.g., Nowell-Smith 1954, 111–115, the source of the term “pro-attitude” and of classifying pleasure as one of these).

2.3.2 A Content-Involving Attitude, Like Belief?

Fred Feldman identifies pleasure (in the relevant inclusive use) with an occurrent propositional attitude comparable to Brentano’s loving.[23] If an act/object analysis applies uniformly to all pleasure, and if we must then choose between the objects and how we take them, then opting thus, for how we take them, would seem the correct choice. Accordingly, on Feldman’s view, the act or attitude type, rather than its diverse objects or contents, would be what all episodes of pleasure have in common and makes them such, while its objects, including instances of ‘sensory pleasure’ (in use 2 of n. 1, ¶8), are brought together and unified only by way of their relation to it, so that this attitude is, in the important sense, what pleasure is (cf. Feldman 1997a, 2004).

Unlike Brentano, for whom even human intellectual pleasure turns out, in the end, to be sensory, bodily, and affective, Feldman, in attempting a similarly unifying account, moves in the opposite direction; his attitudinal pleasure is not supposed ever to essentially involve as such any feeling at all. (For this reason, his saying it is an attitude like belief communicates his intention more clearly than his going on sometimes to add hope and fear, without making explicit that he intends these latter, also, to be pure propositional attitudes not essentially or centrally involving feeling, as he perhaps, like the Stoics, does.) Friends of the simple picture’s experiential core, of pleasure conceived as involving felt momentary affective experience, will want to resist this denial of the centrality of feeling in pleasure. But there are also other grounds for skepticism about the uniform attitude approach, since an act/object or attitude/content account, again, seems not to fit the phenomenology of someone enjoying a pleasant nap, daydream, or diffuse good mood, as it must if it is to be an account of inclusive pleasure – as must be intended given Feldman’s larger aim of formulating hedonism as a view of ‘the good life’ in ethical theory. Taking all pleasure to be a single special kind of propositional or de se (directly attributing a property to oneself) attitude, as in Feldman 1997c/1988, in all human and animal pleasure alike, also strains intuitive plausibility by requiring cognitive powers of propositional representation or self-reference even in young children and animals (as in Feldman 2002, p. 607), if these are not to be denied pleasure. And the belief we must choose between pleasure feeling like something and its having intentionality also seems questionable. Bennett Helm, as we have seen (§1.2), and also other contemporary philosophers, including Geoffrey Madell (2002, chs. 5 and 6) and Timothy Schroeder (§3.1), reject this exclusive disjunction of the two in proposing accounts on which both belong to pleasure, as did many medievals and, following them, Brentano.

The single uniform attitude approach also faces a problematic tension between its intuitive motivation and its technical adequacy. The natural and intuitive assignment of contents that makes plausible construing pleasure sometimes as an attitude with propositional content runs into problems when it is extended to a uniform propositional attitude theory of all pleasure, as Anscombe (1981c/1967) first observed. To use and develop further her line of reasoning using her original example: her enjoying riding with someone is different and separable from her enjoying reflecting then on the fact that she is (and, if the latter is distinct from that, also from her being pleased then that this is the case). But on a single uniform attitude analysis, applied in what seems the natural and intuitive way, it seems these should consist in her directing the same attitude on the same proposition (or, alternatively, on her self-attributing the same property). But this doesn’t seem to allow that she might enjoy one but not the other, as she surely may. A technical problem may have a technical fix. Perhaps one may thus regard the activity of reflecting as a different mode of presentation (or the like) of the same propositional content that Anscombe more directly enjoys to the same attitude, while retaining something of the approach’s intuitive motivation. However, it seems more natural and intuitive to say the attitude is directed, instead, primarily toward these different activities, including some naturally described as themselves taking propositional or de se (property-self-attributing) contents, such as Anscombe‘s reflecting that she is riding with someone, but also to others that don’t, such as her just riding.

Anscombe’s earlier work, apparently provoked by proposals similar to Feldman’s, suggests such a way out. As she noted, cases described as enjoying a proposition or fact seem to involve our thinking about it or being in some state or the like (1981c/1967). These seem to be activities or experiencings that we may (following Aristotle) regard as activities, at least for present purposes. We may, then, let the different activities make the needed distinctions, by saying that enjoying riding is one thing and enjoying reflecting that one is riding is another. Such an approach also handles the pleasure of prancing puppies and of suckling babies without seeming to ascribe to them the general and logically combinatorial representational capacities that may be involved in having attitudes toward propositions, attributing properties to oneself, or the like – capacities that puppies and babies may lack and that even human adults may not always exercise when enjoying a nap or a warm bath. The most natural and uniform attitudinal view of pleasure would thus seem to be not Feldman’s propositional view but rather one on which to enjoy a sensation is just to enjoy sensing it and that similarly to enjoy any cognitive content or object of thought as such is just to enjoy thinking about it or the like – and that these are all actual activities. But this seems at least very close to an ‘adverbial’ (activity-dependent) neoAristotelian view on which particular instances of pleasure are modes of their activities (without the need for any special single kind of attitude).

Feldman, in an encyclopedia treatment that perhaps presents the attitudinal approach to pleasure more broadly than the works cited above presenting his own propositional version, allows attitudinal pleasure to take among its objects or contents activities and sensations as well as facts (2001, p. 667). Elsewhere he allows nonactual states of affairs among the objects of attitudinal propositional pleasure (2002, p. 608). Presumably he will need distinct impossible propositions, so that Hobbes’ pleasure in contemplating the (supposed) geometrical fact (actually, a mathematical impossibility) that the circle can be squared may be distinguished from his pleasure in his having (equally impossibly) discovered this. (Surely the magnitude of his taking pleasure in these two may change in opposite directions, as his focus shifts, as he first loses all thought of himself in the mathematics, but later swells with self-regarding pride.) Whether there are such distinct impossible states of affairs or propositions (between which Feldman may not distinguish) seems especially controversial. Feldman tells us that pleasure is an attitude like belief, so it may seem we may rest content to have pleasure no worse off than belief and leave it to theorists of belief to solve such shared problems generally. But pleasure must be even more general than belief if, as in Feldman 2001, it takes as its objects not only the contents of belief (often thought of as abstract entities, which as we have seen need to at least represent, if not include, nonactual and even impossible objects) but also sensations and activities that, for us to enjoy them, must be not only actual and concrete but also present and our own. The supposedly single attitude of pleasure thus seems to come apart along this line, in part corresponding to one between sensory and intellectual pleasure that many medievals and Brentano respected, by complicating their theories at this point, as Feldman does not. The move from Locke’s distinctive feeling of pleasure to Feldman’s stipulated distinctive attitude does not obviously help with the unity problem for pleasure that he supposes it to solve; similar doubts arise about pleasure’s unity and, it seems, more besides.

Further, pleasure differs from belief and similar nonaffective propositional attitudes in seeming to be more locally biological and less broadly functional. It often seems to spill over promiscuously from one object to another as belief logically cannot; it is generally suppressed by depressed mood, as belief in general is not; a diminished capacity for pleasure may be restored by antidepressant drugs and other therapies, while there are neither specific deficits affecting all and only beliefs (but not other attitudes taking a similar range of contents) nor specific remedies for them. Belief and the like are thus plausibly thought of, at least in large part, as broadly functional states neither simply localized in any single discrete neural system nor susceptible to being capable of being similarly caused directly by similar chemical interventions in all physiologically similar individuals. If psychological realism and parsimony are to constrain our theory, the evidence would seem to favor an account more like Ockham’s on which objects presented by thought may be loved consequently, with pleasure often resulting. We may thus more plausibly theorize that sophisticated intentionality belongs primarily to the cognitively representational powers of mind, also to the loving that uses these in referring to and acting toward its objects, but is ascribed to pleasure only derivatively through functionally appropriate causal connections by way of these and the like. Then we can distinguish Hobbes’ two pleasures in thinking of different impossibilities and also Anscombe’s in riding and reflecting on it derivatively, by way of the differences in the relevant activities, whatever view we take about thinking and its contents.

2.3.3 Welcoming-Whatever-Comes that May Float Free?

On the other hand, if something in the spirit of Feldman’s welcoming attitude were freed from the requirement of always taking a content or object, and might obtain on its own, then it could capture not only all of the above but also cases in which we seem to have pleasure when doing nothing at all and attitudinizing toward nothing at all. Perhaps, then, pleasure is a stance (for lack of a better place-holding term) of affective openness, welcoming, or immediate liking with which we may wholeheartedly engage in the activities and experiences we enjoy, from thinking to swimming to just lying about and ‘doing nothing’, but that may also (unlike ordinary propositional attitudes or de se [reflexively-centered] attitudes) obtain without having any object or content at all. Like many experiential features and mental processes, it might be sometimes integrated and bound with others, but sometimes not, and the same episodic instance might survive as the variable binding and integration develops, decays, and shifts over time (perhaps varying without increasing the pleasure, as the Epicureans said) while the underlying mood or stance of readiness for pleasant engagement remains, rather than being individuated in term of its contents or objects as particular intentional mental acts are. Rather than being an attitude of taking pleasure in some specific or particular content or other, pleasure itself could be a central state independent of such attitudes from which they arise and perhaps include as their common inner ground.

Empirical evidence that affect can exist separated from what under normal conditions would have been its object supports thinking of it in such less object-bound ways. In experiments the nonconscious mechanisms that bind pleasure to objects can be fooled about the pleasure’s source (which presumably they evolved to track), resulting in personal-level ignorance or error about this and even the unconscious formation of arbitrary new preferences through experimental manipulations. For example, experimental subjects may be caused to like a beverage better by initial exposure to it after a photograph of a smiling face under conditions in which there is no awareness of the face being seen or of the affective response it caused. This presumably works by pleasantness being ‘misattributed’ by unconscious cognitive mechanisms that, ignorant of any more appropriate cause for the positive affect, attribute pleasantness to the next salient stimulus they find, with an enduring liking for the beverage resulting from this. Similar spillover of affect from unattended sources, for example, of unattended physical discomfort leading to anger at a salient target, seems common in everyday life. Such phenomenona are all presumably explained by affective processes being detachable from what would have been their objects under more cognitively optimal conditions.[24]

On the basis of this and other science (e.g., Shizgal 1997, 1999) it seems that affect, may, like color and many other features, be processed separately in the brain from representations of any objects to which the feature in question (e.g., color or pleasantness) really belongs or is later assigned. Such assignment presumably requires active binding to object representations, however fused with these in our experience of liking or hope our affect may often seem. Cases of objectless ‘diffuse’ mood in which, rather than the binding of affect being displaced to an object that did not cause it, the affect rather remains objectless and unbound (if only for lack of a suitable cognitively accessible object), seem clear and common enough not only in unusual experiences but also in everyday dreamy life to establish object-independence at the personal level, even if the experimental evidence for misplaced affect is rejected. That positive affect is often diffuse (objectless) seems uncontroversial in the psychology of mood (Watson 2000; Thayer 1989, 1996). That pleasure is in itself objectless is sometimes supposed in theorizing in behavioral neuroscience, as well (e.g., Robinson and Berridge, 1993, pp. 261ff.). The same assumption is the basis for the psychologist and emotion specialist James Russell’s notion of core affect, which places an in-itself objectless feeling good at the ground level of the construction of more complex positive emotion (Russell 2003).

We may call all views sharing the general approach on which pleasure is either a welcoming attitude (with instances individuated, in part, by their contents or objects) or a potentially freestanding welcoming stance, Welcoming Views – and only those latter, on which it is such a stance that can float free, Welcoming-Whatever-Comes Views.[25] The latter capture something of the connections biologists and psychologists have made with approach behavior, and past philosophers and common sense with desire, while still allowing pleasure to be sometimes a freestanding welcoming mood and nonintentional, but with the potential for becoming bound to representational states and presenting objects as good then. Such a stance could be unified and recognized in part by way of an experiential core.

2.3.4 Intentionality, Subjectivity, and Consciousness

Brentano influentially claimed that all mental phenomena exhibit intentionality as their distinctive mark (Jacob 2014). (The ancient roots of the philosophical concepts of mind and consciousness on which Brentano drew were cognitive.) Contemporary philosophers seeking a unified account of all phenomena covered by the inclusive modern Western notion of mind often follow Brentano in hoping to do this in representational terms and to account in this way for consciousness. In this they may turn for support and guidance to neuroscientific accounts of the remapping of information from peripheral receptors to the brain and from one brain region to another. Thus Michael Tye, in discussing mood, appeals to Antonio Damasio’s account of feelings as representing conditions of the body (Damasio 1994, 1999, 2003; Tye 1995, pp. 128–30; Craig 2002, 2009, 2015).

Intentional structure has also been motivated by a subject/object duality that may seem metaphysically necessary or even given in subjective awareness itself. Pleasure has often been thought of as immediately, essentially, and even wholly conscious in itself. However, some philosophers have distinguished pleasure from consciousness of pleasure. And this may introduce a layer of intentional structure otherwise not found in pleasure itself. Seventh century India saw Nyāya and Vaiśesika criticisms of the views of some self-denying Buddhists that all awareness, and therefore all pleasure, is self-disclosing, without any need for a higher-order cognitive act of an ulterior self. And G. E. Moore, following Plato, argued that we must decide whether pleasure or cognitive awareness (or, as Moore put it, “consciousness of pleasure”) is the locus of hedonic value and that this is properly located in the consciousness of pleasure rather than in bare pleasure itself.[26] Perhaps our concept of consciousness comes apart at this juncture and pleasure may be immediately or ‘phenomenally’ experienced while unnoticed and without its being generally cognitively accessible. Someone sympathetic to the simple picture who applies this distinction of Block’s (Block 1995, 1997, 2002; Katz 2005b; cp. Haybron 2007) might locate hedonic value in bare pleasure, rather than in any cognitive awareness of it. Then we might mediate between the Buddhists and their opponents by allowing nondual phenomenal experience without insisting that it need be cognitively self-disclosing and respond to Moore by saying that hedonic experience, even when unmonitored, may be phenomenally conscious and valuable nonetheless. And indeed scientists increasingly regard pleasure, like many cognitive states and processes, as separable from awareness.[27]

3. Pleasure, Motivation, and the Brain

The simple picture of pleasure as valuable and attractive due to its own experiential nature may survive the objections considered so far, at least as theoretical possibility. However, looking more closely at our experience of pleasure, its long-noted but variable connections to motivation, and at the sciences studying these raises further questions. Pleasure itself, or at least pleasure and forms of motivation with which it is typically integrated and easily confused, may come apart, on closer analysis. The search for true pleasure that is really as good as it seems, beyond taint of compulsive craving or biological illusion, now continues in the studies of the brain. These give us reason to think that, if there is some single experience of true pleasure, its relations to motivation may be more heterogeneous, complex, and contingent than naive versions of the simple picture, hedonism, and common sense supposed. But perhaps the deeper philosophers and yogis knew this all along.

3.1 Motivation-Based Analyses and Their Problems

Pleasure has traditionally been connected with motivation, although traditions differ on how. Plato (Charmides 167e1–3), Aristotle (Rhetoric I, 11:1370a16–18; DA II, 3:414b2–6 and II, 9:4332b3–7; EE II, 7:1223a34–35), and the common sense for which they speak are pluralist about human motivation. For all these, while one salient kind of motive involves longing for pleasure or pleasant things, people also have other ultimate goals. They compete for honors and other purely competitive goods, seek revenge, and pursue and avoid other things as well. And sometimes they do so because of evaluative judgments based in ultimately nonhedonic grounds. Hedonists argued that spontaneous pleasure-seeking is evidence of pleasure’s unique status as our ultimate goal and good, as evidenced by the unenculturated and therefore uncorrupted appetites and values of infants. The ancient Stoics interpreted these phenomena so as to block this hedonist appeal to nature’s authority: pleasure is rather a by-product of the achievement of other ends, starting right from the infant’s innate impulses, not toward pleasure, but rather toward biological goods such as food, guided by a natural instinct directed toward its preservation, which rational motivation may later supersede (Long and Sedley, 1987, 65A3–4; Brunschwig 1986). Augustine influentially built on the Stoics in attributing pleasure to the will (CD XIV,6); later Western Christian thought mainly followed him.

Modern Western philosophers, following Aristotle’s account of the unity of motivation (DA 433a30–b13) and Augustine’s counting all motives as loves of the will (but often ignoring the pluralism about kinds of motive on which they and their traditions equally insisted), have often treated ‘desire’ as including all motivation and as of a single kind to be explained on the same pattern. Between 1600 and 1900 they often regarded desire as uniformly directed toward one’s own pleasure, along lines suggested by the simple picture. Joseph Butler (1726) responded to this view of human nature as hedonistically selfish by renewing the Stoic insistence on the priority of motivation to pleasure and also the related medieval view that pleasure always consists in the satisfaction of some appetite. He thereby could argue that pleasure-seeking without prior motivation would be impossible since pleasure always consists in the satisfaction of some motive (in his language, ‘passion’) and that altruistic motives are thus in principle as capable of leading to a high level of fulfilled desire, and thus of pleasure, as any others.

There are, however, prima facie counterexamples to taking desire satisfaction to be a necessary condition for pleasure, as Plato long ago pointed out (Philebus 51A–52C): we often enjoy things such as sights, sounds, and fragrances that may surprise us without our having wanted them before, clinging to them when they are with us, or craving them after they are gone. But Butler presumably followed Plato and his medieval successors in implicitly understanding unconscious internally represented needs as of a kind with desires. Timothy Schroeder does similarly today (2001, 2004), but in an account on which pleasure does not require the actual existence of desires or their satisfaction, but is rather a defeasible sensing of an increase in their net satisfaction. However, the basis for such an informational interpretation in the neuroscience appealed to seems very slim (Katz 2005c). Older desire satisfaction accounts of pleasure were susceptible to counterexamples based in desires that expire before their satisfaction (Brandt 1982). Recent writers avoid these by proposing instead the satisfaction of current desires, such as affective desire for the continuation of one’s present experiences (Madell 2002, pp. 97–98). Other contemporary writers on pleasure, with analytic reductionist projects in folk psychology (Davis, 1981a, 1981b, 1982) and metaethics (Heathwood 2006, 2007), have claimed that pleasure is definable as believed satisfaction of current desire. However, we often don’t enjoy things that we continue to desire, at least for a time. And addiction offers salient cases of such cravings that hang around for a very long time without leading to pleasure when indulged. And distinguishing believing or sensing that we are now getting what we want from now actually getting it doesn’t generally solve this class of problem. So it appears that it won’t do to make either desire or its satisfaction or sensings or beliefs in that satisfaction sufficient for pleasure, let alone identical to it, as these philosophers have variously proposed.

One cannot help suspecting that the attraction of such desire satisfaction related views of pleasure owes something to unconscious equivocation between someone’s feeling satisfied and desires’ being satisfied (i.e., fulfilled) merely by their satisfaction conditions coming to pass, as they might long after the desirer is dead and gone. (This latter use is analogous to the way logicians speak of satisfaction, without any felt contentment or happiness of the linguistic objects considered being in question.) One may view someone’s success in a way that makes mere project fulfillment count toward it, but it is hard to see why anything like that, or sensing (Schroeder 2001, 2004) or believing (Davis and Heathwood) it, should figure directly in an account of someone’s pleasure even while alive. To adapt the example of Plato’s Socrates that scandalized his Callicles (Gorgias 494A–495A) to apply to Madell, one may intensely and affectively desire to continue one’s experience of scratching one’s itch or rubbing oneself, which desire is simultaneously fulfilled, without oneself experiencing pleasure in so doing. Fulfilling compulsive or addictive cravings in their time need not be pleasant. And appropriately limiting the kind of desires, to avoid all such counterexamples, would seem to require building a relation to pleasure or the like into the desires, thus giving up the reductive project. Consonantly with the foregoing, decades of social psychological research using self-ratings of happiness (e.g., Strack, Argyle, and Schwarz 1991) indicates a hedonic component (or two, one for positive and one for negative affect) underlying such self-reports that tracks how good people feel but that is independent of the component tracking their beliefs about their achievement of desired or valued goals. People care about both, but for different reasons.

Problems also face analyzing pleasure in motivational terms other than “desire” more closely tied to behavior. Henry Sidgwick rejected simple relational accounts of pleasure as “a feeling we seek to bring into consciousness and retain there” or the “motive power” toward this as incapable of giving the correct ‘quantitative’ answers about degree of pleasure demanded of any serious definition. He argued that, while “pleasures of repose, a warm bath, etc.” might be handled by moving to an account in terms of motivational dispositions, excitement often adds motivation disproportionate to pleasure – an objection that applies to similar behavioral and motivational accounts current today.[28]

3.2 Is Pleasure’s Goodness Independent of Motivation?

On the other hand, if there is no close connection between pleasure and motivation, why pleasure should be more likely to become an object of pursuit rather than of avoidance or indifference seems mysterious. Natural selection may explain why animals that already pursue pleasure and avoid pain should come to enjoy foods that are nutritious and to feel pain when they begin to be injured. But it’s not clear how it could explain why animals pursue pleasure and avoid pain rather than the other way around. Philosophers are well acquainted with the problem of evil in a world created by an all-knowing, all-powerful and all-good God or in any similarly good-directed teleological order. It’s hard to explain why there should be any evil in such a world. But on a completely nonteleological view of nature it seems as hard to see why animals especially pursue their own or any good (cf. Plato, Phaedo 97B8–99C6). Both problems depend on our having an independent grasp of the relevant normative notions. If evil were just whatever God won’t will, and an animal’s good or pleasure were just whatever it tends toward or has been naturally selected to pursue, both puzzles would dissolve.

This Problem of Good was, in the past century, raised specifically against views akin to the simple picture of pleasure, on which pleasure is valuable by virtue of its intrinsic nature, perhaps just because of the way it feels in its moment, and independently of our or other animals’ actually desiring or pursuing it. It was argued that such a picture of pleasure leaves our pursuit of pleasure an apparently miraculous conicidence crying out for explanation. This was urged not in favor of theology or teleology, but rather in arguing that pleasure must be connected to animal impulse or desire by its very nature (Alston 1967, pp. 345–46; Findlay 1961, pp. 175–78; McDougall, 1911, pp. 324–25.) It may help to see this puzzle as a human counterpart of Socrates’ question to Euthyphro, about which comes logically first, the righteousness of pious acts or Divine love of them (Plato, Euthyphro, 6E11–11B1). Which comes logically first, hedonic value or motivation? Perhaps science, by revealing the constitution of pleasure and of its enmeshment with motivation, will tell us which of these answers to give to this human Euthyphro question or else will suggest some third way out. Some value hedonists are inclined to answer that we and other animals simply respond to pleasure’s value by rationally apprehending, and accordingly pursuing, it (Goldstein 1980, 1989, 2002). While ancients and medievals inhabiting a teleological worldview (on which attraction toward the good required no further explanation) could answer thus, to that extent, it seems, they faced no Problem of Good, which arises to the extent one abandons unexplained teleology. In principle, however, nondebunking explanations seem possible. For example, perhaps brute identity or natural relations of pleasure and pain with good and bad nutritional or metabolic states provided a basis for natural selection, starting from feelings of energy and fatigue representing only themselves, to enable these to progressively connect with and represent more, and then entangled these representations with motivational reward systems, resulting in the biology discussed in the next section.

3.3 Dividing Pleasure or Finding True Pleasure?

Plato and later Greek thinkers, as also many of ancient India, distinguished kinds of pleasure connected with craving kinds of desire from kinds of pleasure that involve no desire or need and hence none of the suffering, tension, or stress connected with these. Similar questions arise in interpreting the neuroscience of affect, motivation, and addiction today.

According to Adam Smith (1790/1976), “[h]appiness consists in tranquillity and enjoyment. Without tranquillity there can be no enjoyment; and where there is perfect tranquillity there is scarce any thing which is not capable of amusing.” (III, 3, 30, p. 149) And in Utilitarianism John Stuart Mill distinguishes between excitement and tranquillity as two sources of contentment, the first allowing us to tolerate pain and the second the absence of pleasure (1971, Ch. II, ¶13).[29] They thus draw on distinctions prominent in Hellenistic traditions, such as those of Epicurean and Stoic thought,[30] which (unlike Mill) advised against the more activated and desire-driven forms of pleasure and took the happiest life to be one of calm and tranquillity. (Cf. Haybron, 2008 on attunement and tranquillity, passim.) Such advice had antecedents in Plato’s hostility to pleasure connected with strong desires and in Aristotle’s ranking the calm pleasure of reviewing already possessed knowledge over those of attaining and producing new knowledge, of competitive achievement, and of satisfying worldly desires.[31] Making such distinctions is consonant with Ivar Labukt’s recent suggestion (2012) that experiential views of pleasure may err not in being experiential but in neglecting the possibility that pleasure may be more than one kind of experience.

Indic traditions are rich not only in recommendations of nonattachment as a path to tranquillity but also in their long history of analysis of experiential states associated with traditional meditation practices. The Pali Canon of the Theravadin Buddhists, in passages that have parallels in other Buddhist traditions, describes progressively deeper stages of meditative concentration (jhana), passing through which one first stops initiating and sustaining thought, then ceases also activating joyful interest (pīti), and finally loses even the underlying feeling of (perhaps nonintentional) pleasure, bliss, or ease (sukha, in a narrow sense), so that one then abides in a state of equanimous, all-accepting upekkha (etymologically, ‘looking on’), sometimes traditionally described as without pleasure (sukha) or pain (dukkha) but occasionally as pleasant (sukha). The difference between joyful interest and (mere) pleasure (traditionally classified as a feeling rather than with the predominantly intentional states such as joyful interest) is explained in the commentary tradition by the contrast between the state of a hot and weary desert traveler when first hearing of, and then seeing, a pool of water in a shady wood and the state of one actually enjoying, or resting after, using it.[32] The latter is said to be preferred by the meditator as less coarse, presumably because it is a purer and more restful pleasure in that it is less mixed with eager interest and motivation, which seem tainted with stress, strain, or pain. Similar distinctions, between appetitive states that prepare animals for anticipatory, preparatory, or instrumental action and functionally later consummatory states that end these and initiate consummatory behaviors and end in repose, have been used for at least the past century in the scientific studies of behavior and mind (Sherrington 1906/1947, pp. 329 ff.; W. Craig 1918; Davidson 1994).

In contemporary affective neuroscience, similar interpretative questions arise. Here also we find a condition of activated interest and motivation that many have been tempted to identify with pleasure. Activation of the brain’s mesolimbic dopamine system organizes many especially of the instrumental pursuits that bring our lives not only ulterior rewards but also meaning. However it seems also to drive our compulsions and the craving desire unrelieved by euphoria typical at times of withdrawn cocaine addicts. The apparent paradoxes facing a general pleasure interpretation of such dopaminergic activity have led many scientists studying these systems, including former advocates, to back off from that and similar interpretations (e.g., Wise 1994). The distinction between pleasure and pain may be made elsewhere in the brain.

The theoretically inclined affective neuroscientist Kent Berridge has for decades influentially argued that mesolimbic dopamine itself gives no true pleasure, but that a core neural basis for a state of ‘liking’ involved in conscious pleasure is mediated by other brain activity, including some involving opioid receptors and sometimes cannabinoid receptors as well. These seem to be involved in organizing the circuit and network activity that makes possible the savoring more prominent in the consummatory, satisfying, and relaxing phases of meals, sexual activity, and personal relations and, so far as we know, all other pleasure and enjoyment as well, even as mesolimbic dopamine ’wanting’ seems typically more prominent in the earlier and more exploratory, appetitive, instrumental, and approach phases of these. Berridge and his collaborators persuasively argue that without the participation of localized hedonic ’hotspot’ activity there is no true pleasure, with specific transmitter activity in these small areas always required. While so far as is known such results may apply with generality, the preponderance of evidence as of yet comes from invasive experiments on rodents, and therefore relies on expressive and voluntary behavior to indicate pleasure. (See Berridge references and his website linked below for new review articles, Kringelbach references, papers in their jointly edited 2010. For a complementary perspective on relevant opioid systems, see Depue and Morrone-Strupinksy 2005, especially §6.1.2, pp. 323–25). The emerging picture seems not one of ’pleasure centers’ or ’pleasure transmitters’ but of diverse neurons capable of behaving flexibly, in different modes, and thus able to collectively self-organize into different circuits and different networks with changing input and neuromodulation, some of which differences make the differences between feeling happy, so-so, or sad. But we must remember that this science is still very much a work in progress and that the picture is growing more, not less, complex at this time.

Perhaps the two normally functionally integrated modes of activity, Berridge’s ‘liking’ and ‘wanting’, organize fundamentally different affective, motivational, and experiential states that, however often they occur mixed or temporally intermeshed, should be considered distinct successors to our naive and undiscriminating common conception of pleasure. However, to the extent that the relevant concept of pleasure is a normative one, so too will this question of succession be. It is tempting to regard Berridge’s ‘liking’, when unmixed with ‘wanting’and pain, as the undriven, pure and true pleasure that contemplatives and philosophers have long been seeking, and to follow Berridge in regarding this ‘liking’ detachable from any object (cf. the stance of 3.3 above), as (true) pleasure – and dopaminergic ‘wanting’ as the fool’s pleasure dross from which it and we ideally should be freed to live like Epicurean gods. However, we may still, in practice, need to alternate between the preponderance of the two (cf. Mill, 1871, Ch. II,¶13). Pleasure may thus commonly arise as a relatively fragile and transient outgrowth of a larger biological syndrome of pursuit and temporary attainment, much as in Aristotle’s analogy of pleasure’s perfecting an activity with the bloom of youth ‘coming on top of’ biological maturation, using a term, epigignomenon, earlier applied in medicine to an aggravating symptom arising from a grounding and underlying diseased state (NE X, 4:1174b31–33, Liddell and Scott, 1940, ad loc. epigignomai).

Based on the scientific evidence, if pleasure comes apart, it will be along such lines, and not along those suggested by concern with intentional structure (between attitude and object) or between sensory pleasure, enjoyment of activities, and so-called propositional pleasure that armchair philosophical and linguistic analysis suggests. But this should come as no surprise. Mood disorders and their therapies do not discriminate along such a priori lines either (Millgram 1997, 124 citing Katz 1986, 119).

4. Conclusion: Looking Inward, Looking Forward

Perhaps there is only one true pleasure of blissful freedom from stress, present in all apparently diverse pleasures, including those of the hot bath, sexual consummation, youthful friendship, and freedom from responsibility for children which figured in the short Afghan list of §2.1 – and its impure mixtures with frights and with the burning pains of hot spice are only due to ways it can be caused due to our biology and past conditioning. Or perhaps there will be much more intrinsic, and not merely causally relational, diversity. How we and our hedonic experience are situated or constituted in our brains and organisms remains to be seen. And bringing normative wisdom to bear on emerging physiology will presumably be called for, at least to the extent that the concept of pleasure, at least in its primary use by naive experiencers (who seem to fix the reference of the term in part through pleasure presenting as good to them), is an evaluative and normative one, however legitimately this may bracketed by scientists and philosophers when theorizing about it. (Cf. Sidgwick 1907, 129, on the Stoics taking this appearance to be an always deceptive one, and not only, perhaps like Plato [Moss 2006] and Aristotle [Moss 2012], as an occasionally corrigible one.)

In doing so we may aim to capture much in earlier views while keeping in mind that pleasure is something biological, psychological, and experiential which remains in large part unknown, the nature or category of which it is inappropriate to stipulate a priori. Perhaps pleasure expresses the unimpeded functioning (Aristotle) of our Natural anxiety-free and pain-free State (Epicurus) by which we are able to reach outward from our hedonic core to engage with more representational brain processes – and through these, with love, to all the world (citations in n. 25). But perhaps pleasure has a more complex reflexive intentional structure, as suggested in some of the medieval literature mentioned in §2.3.1 and n. 20  ad loc., and understanding the self-organization of recurrent neural activity will someday help us to introspect this better. Elements at least of these suggestions and others are compatible. Or perhaps pleasure divides in two, perhaps along the lines between the ‘wanting’ and ‘liking’ discussed in the preceding section, no one natural kind responding to all we intuitively seek, with dopaminergic reward needed to organize our exploratory pleasures of pursuit until we are ready for opioid bliss and repose. But we should also not forget more humble and basic biological facts: that mood varies with energy and thus with circadian rhythms affecting body temperature and also with the current availability of nutrients in the blood (Thayer 1989, 1996); that how much pleasure we experience also depends on getting enough, and good enough, sleep; that pleasure increases immune response (Rosenkranz et al, 2003), and that how we feel may grow in part out of monitoring bodily homeostasis (Craig 2002, 2009, 2015). These facts are telling about what may, perhaps, turn out to be more a syndrome of typically causally connected features than a simple or unified psychobiological phenomenon, such as would better fit philosophers’ penchant for simple kinds and simple explanations.

The prospects seem good for new and deep scientific understanding of pleasure and of how it is organized in the brain. We may have much to gain from the practical results of this new understanding – especially if, as Voznesensky says,

The main thing in living is human feeling: Are you happy? just fine? or sad?[33]

But pleasure should also be of special interest even to philosophers of mind not especially interested in value or affect, in part for the strong challenge that apparently contentless moods pose to representational accounts of mind. Deeply subjective or phenomenal aspects of our experience, that may more easily be ignored elsewhere in the philosophy of mind, seem to stare us in the face here, where what is at issue centrally seems no informational content or broad functional role but simply “whether you’re happy or sad”. However, appearances of bare intrinsic fact and simple pictures taken for firm foundations have often proved misleading in the studies of mind. As the sciences of mind and brain mature, they will offer new evidence about pleasure and its roles in our and kindred minds and about whether and how these roles may pull apart, perhaps making pleasure more than one natural kind. Real answers to major questions about the unity, diversity, and nature of pleasure and its relations to pain, motivation, awareness, and value must likely await further results of this new science and their scientifically informed and philosophically sensitive interpretation.


This will gradually be supplemented by linked lists of suggested readings divided by subject.

Canonical Religious Texts, by Tradition

  • Buddhist Canon (Theravadin, Pali in original), 1974 translation, (1st ed. this trans., 1900), A Buddhist Manual of Psychological Ethics, Being a Translation, now made for the First Time, from the Original Pali, of the First Book of the Abhidhamma Pitaka entitled Dhamma-sangani, Caroline A.F. Rhys Davids (ed.) and Introductory Essay and Notes, 3rd ed., London and Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul for the Pali Text Society.
  • Buddhist Canon (Theravadin, Pali in original), 1995 translation, The Middle Length Discourses of the Buddha: A New Translation of the Majjhima Nikāya, trans. Bhikkhu Ñānamoli and Bhikkhu Bodhi, Boston: Wisdom Publications.
  • Christian Bible.
  • Hebrew Bible.
  • Upanishads.

References, by Author

  • Adolphs, Ralph and Damasio, Antonio, 2001, “The Interaction of Affect and Cognition: A Neurobiological Perspective”, in Forgas 2001, pp. 27–49.
  • Algra, Keimpe; Barnes, Jonathan; Mansfield, Jaap; and Schofield, Malcolm, 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Alston, William, 1967, “Pleasure”, in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Paul Edwards (ed.), London and New York: Macmillan, Vol. 6, pp. 341–347. A clear and concise account of some reasons driving changes in philosophers’ and introspectionist psychologists’ views of pleasure through the preceding century and also of some main competing views and objections to them, as seen at the time of writing.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1963/1957, Intention, 2nd ed. (1st ed., 1957), Oxford: Blackwell. Seminal work in philosophy of action by a leading disciple of Wittgenstein. A very short but deep and influential discussion of pleasure leads up to a dismissal of ethical hedonism in particular, and perhaps of any appeal to pleasure in theory quite generally, on p. 77.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1981a, The Collected Papers of G.E.M. Anscombe, 3 vols., Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1981b/1958 “Modern Moral Philosophy”, in Anscombe, 1981a, Vol. III, pp. 26–42. A summary version of the relevant 1963/1957 passage is in this paper’s seventh paragraph at p. 27. Original publication: Philosophy, 33(124) (1958): 1–16.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1981c/1967, “On the Grammar of Enjoy”, in 1981a, Vol. II, pp. 94–100. Original publication: Journal of Philosophy, 64(19): 607–614.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1981d/1978, “Will and Emotion”, in 1981a, Vol. I, pp. 100–107. Original publication: Grazer Philosophische Studien, 5 (1978): 139–148.
  • Aquinas, Thomas, 1975 (written 1268–71), Summa Theologiæ (‘ST’) 1a 2æ (first division of second part), questions 31–39. The Blackfriars edition, vol. 20, “Pleasure”, has the Latin text and an English translation of these by Eric D’Arcy. New York: McGraw-Hill and London: Eyre and Spottiswoode. Also relevant is question 11 in vol. 17, on fruitio, enjoyment in possession of something prized as ultimately valuable (correctly, only of God, as by the saints in Heaven, in their beatific vision of God), following Augustine (see n. 20, para. 4).
  • Argyle, Michael, 2001 (1st ed., 1987), The Psychology of Happiness, 2d ed., New York: Taylor and Francis; Hove, East Sussex: Routledge. Chs. 2 and 3 are cited as especially relevant; its subject is broader than ours.
  • Aristotle, 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle, Jonathan Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Aristotle, De Anima (‘DA’).
  • Aristotle, Eudemian Ethics (‘EE’).
  • Aristotle, Magna Moralia (‘MM’). II, 7.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics. (‘NE’) VII, 11–14; X, 1–6.
  • Aristotle, Politics.
  • Aristotle, Protrepticus. Fragment B87 in its context, a reconstruction from quotations of this presumably relatively early popular work of Aristotle’s. B87 may be found in the 1984 Complete Works at p. 2414.
  • Aristotle, Rhetoric I: 11 gives a version of the standard Platonic-Academic definition of pleasure rather than that of the ethical works listed just above. Book II: 1–11 discusses specific emotions, characterizing most as forms of pleasure and pain.
  • Aristotle, Topica.
  • Armstrong, D.M., 1968, A Materialist Theory of the Mind, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul and New York: The Humanities Press. Pp. 175–79 on pleasure and pp. 85–89 identifying dispositions with their categorical basis.
  • Ashby, F. Gregory; Isen, Alice M; and Turken, And U., “A Neuropsychological Account of Positive Affect and Its Influence on Cognition”, Psychological Review, 106(3): 529–50. A dopamine-pleaure interpretation lies, in part, behind the title.
  • Augustine, De Civitate Dei contra Paganos (The City of God, ‘CD’). XIV,vi on pleasure as belonging to the Will and XIV,vii elaborating this ethically and theologically as a form of love (into which is packed not only all motivation but all natural motion and a tie to the Holy Spirit of Trinitarian theology as well). Augustine’s sparse remarks here and elsewhere were taken as authoritative in the ensuing Western medieval Christian tradition. There are many editions and translations.
  • Augustine, De Doctrina Christiana (On Christian Instruction/Doctrine/Teaching).
  • Augustine, 1963, De Trinitate, trans. Stephen McKenna, The Trinity, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press. This translation is now available in a paperback edition from Cambridge University Press, 2002, with an editor’s note by Gareth Matthews on the merits and demerits of this and other English translations, p. xxxii.
  • Aydede, Murat, 2000, “An Analysis of Pleasure Vis-à-Vis Pain”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, LXI(3): 537–70. Distinguishes affective reactions from sensory states in this discussion only of physical (bodily) pleasure, with reference especially to the 1949–1973 Anglo-American philosophical literature.
  • Aydede, Murat, 2013, “Pain”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>. §§5 and 6.1 contain discussion of the distinction between pain sensation and pain affect discussed in n. 1; comprehensive pain bibliographies are linked to at that entry’s end.
  • Bain, Alexander, 1876, The Emotions and the Will, 3rd ed., New York: D. Appleton and Co.
  • Bargh, John A. and Deborah K. Apsley, 2002, Unraveling the Complexities of Social Life: A Festschrift in Honor of Robert B. Zajonc, Washington: American Psychological Association.
  • Barrett, Lisa Feldman; Niedenthal, Paula M; and Winkielman, Piotr (eds.), 2005; Emotion and Consciousness, New York and London: The Guilford Press.
  • Bartolic, E.I.; Basso, M. R.; Schefft, B.K.; Glauser, T.; Titanic-Schefft, M., 1999, “Effects of experimentally-induced emotional states on frontal lobe cognitive task performance”, Neuropsychologia, 37(6): 677–83.
  • Beebe-Center, J.G., 1932 , The Psychology of Pleasantness and Unpleasantness, New York: Russell and Russell. Summarizes and discusses results and controversies in the introspectionist academic experimental psychology of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries.
  • Beebe-Center, J.G., 1951, “Feeling and Emotion,” in Harry Helson (ed.), Theoretical Foundations of Psychology, New York: D Van Nostrand & Co., pp. 254–317.
  • Berridge, Craig W.; España, Rodrigo A.; and Stalnaker, Thomas A., 2003, “Stress and Coping: Asymmetry of Dopamine Efferents within the Prefrontal Cortex”, in Hugdahl and Davidson 2003, pp. 69–103.
  • Berridge, Kent C., 1996, “Food Reward: Brain Substrates of Wanting and Liking”, Neuroscience and Biobehavioral Reviews, 20(1): 1–25.
  • Berridge, Kent C., 1999, “Pleasure, Pain, Desire and Dread”, in Kahneman, Diener and Schwarz, 1999, pp. 525–557. Excellent and accessible review emphasizing the distinction between consciously reportable affect and underlying ‘core processes’ that are supposedly in themselves unconscious. One wonders, however, whether Block’s (1995, 2002) phenomenal consciousness might be present in the activity of some of these.
  • Berridge, Kent C., 2003a, “Comparing the Emotional Brains of Humans and other Animals,” in Davidson, Scherer, and Goldsmith 2003 (Handbook), pp. 25–51,
  • Berridge, Kent C., 2003b, “Pleasures of the brain”, Brain and Cognition, 52: 106–128. Sophisticated review of the case for a distinction between ‘liking’ and ‘wanting’ within the supposedly unconscious ‘core processes’ of the brain.
  • Berridge, Kent C., 2004, “Pleasure, Unfelt Affect, and Irrational Desire”, in Manstead, Frijda, and Fischer 2004, pp. 243–62.
  • Berridge, Kent C. and Morten L. Kringelbach, 2015, “Pleasure Systems in the Brain”, Neuron 86:646–664.
  • Berridge, Kent C. and Robinson, Terry E., 1998, “What is the role of dopamine in reward: hedonic impact, reward learning, or incentive salience?” Brain Research Reviews 28,3:309–69. After Robinson and Berridge 1993, perhaps still the best place for a rigorous statement of the theoretical approach behind the developing research program discussed in §3.3, last three paragraphs.
  • Berridge, Kent C. and Robinson, Terry E., 2003, “Parsing Reward,” Trends in Neurosciences, 26(9): 507–13.
  • Berridge, Kent C. and Winkielman, Piotr, 2003, “‘What is an unconscious emotion?’ (The case for unconscious ‘liking’)”, Cognition and Emotion, 17(2): 181–211.
  • Block, Ned, 1995, “On a Confusion about a Function of Consciousness”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 18: 227–47. This is here followed by many peer commentaries and the author’s reply. Block’s paper is updated in Ned Block, Owen Flanagan, and Güven Güzeldere (eds.), The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates, Cambridge. Mass.: MIT Press, 1997.
  • Block, Ned, 1997, “Biology versus computation in the study of consciousness”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 20: 159–65. Contains responses to additional commentaries.
  • Block, Ned, 2002, “Concepts of Consciousness”, in David Chalmers (ed.), Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 206–18. Abridged and revised from Block 1995.
  • Bolles, Robert C. (ed.), 1991, The Hedonics of Taste, Hillsdale, N.J.: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Bourdon, 1893, “La Sensation de Plaisir”, Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Étranger, 36: 225–37.
  • Bramble, Ben, 2013, “The distinctive feeling of pleasure”, Philosophical Studies, 162: 201–17.
  • Brandt, Richard B., 1979, A Theory of the Good and the Right, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brandt, Richard B., 1982, “Two Concepts of Utility,” in Richard B. Brandt, 1992, Morality, Utilitarianism, and Rights, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 196–212. Original publication: Harlan B. Miller and William H. Williams, eds., Utilitarianism and Its Limits, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982, pp. 169–85. An objection to desire-fulfillment views of pleasure is based in desires’ changing over time.
  • Brandt, Richard B., 1993, “Comments on Sumner” in Brad Hooker (ed.), Rationality, Rules, and Utility: New Esssays on the Moral Philosophy of Richard B. Brandt, Boulder: Westview Press, pp. 229–32. A reply to objections in a volume with a useful bibliography and critical papers, among which that by L.W. Sumner, “The Evolution of Utility: A Philosophical Journey”, pp. 97–114, traces changes in, and appraises, Brandt’s views bearing on our subject.
  • Brentano, Franz, 1907/1979, Untersuchungen zur Sinnespsychologie, 2nd ed., with additions, Roderick Chisholm and Reinhard Fabian (eds.), Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag (1st. ed.: Leipzig: von Duncker & Humblot, 1907). Note 39 on pp. 235–40 (pp. 119–25 of 1st ed.), referenced here, is key for a precise interpretation of Brentano’s views on pleasure and their divergence with those of his former protegé Karl Stumpf. The Brentano-Stumpf controversy obviously bears a close analogy and historical relation to medieval debates on pleasure such as those, mentioned in §2.3.1, ¶2 and in n. 20 ad loc., discussed in McGrade 1987. Many of the same questions explicitly or implicitly arise: Is pleasure a distinct act? If not, what is its relation to the acts to which it belongs? What are its relations to sensation and thought? Does a conscious act always or sometimes take itself as an object (in a different way from any others it has) or is another act always required to reflect on or take pleasure in it?
  • Brentano, Franz, 1921/1969, “Loving and Hating”, Appendix IX, in his The Origin of Our Knowledge of Right and Wrong, (Oskar Kraus, ed., 3rd German edition, 1934), Roderick Chisholm (ed.), Roderick Chisholm and Elizabeth H. Schneewind (trans.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul and New York: Humanities Press, pp. 137–60. Original German publication: “Vom Lieben und Hassen”, Anhang, IX, in Vom Ursprung sittlicher Erkenntnis, 2nd ed., Oskar Kraus, (ed.), Leipzig: Felix Meiner, 1921; this was dictated by Brentano in 1907. A source especially for Brentano’s view of bodily pleasure being involved even in cognitive pleasure, by being caused by one’s judgment or loving, exposited with further references in Chisholm 1987.
  • Brentano, Franz, 1929/1981, Sensory and Noetic Consciousness: Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint III, Oskar Kraus (ed.), Margarete Schättle and Linda L. McAlister (trans. ed.), Linda L. McAlister (trans.), London and Henley: Routledge and Kegan Paul and New York: Humanities Press. Original German publication: Vom sinnlichen und noetischen Bewußtein, Leipzig: Felix Meiner, 1929. Pp. 14, 16, 59 in Part I, iii, 5 & 7 and Part II, i, 28 are a source for Brentano’s complex intentional theory of pleasure as loving one’s loving of one’s experiencing and also that experiencing itself, exposited with further references in Chisholm 1986 and 1987.
  • Brink, David O., 1989, Moral realism and the foundations of ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Contains critical discussion of Moore’s naturalistic fallacy charge against value hedonism, at pp. 151–54.
  • Broad, C.D., 1930, Five Types of Ethical Theory, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Bruder, Gerard E., 2003, “Frontal and Parietal Asymmetries in Depressive Disorders: Behavioral, Electrophysiologic, and Neuroimaging Findings”, in Hugdahl and Davidson, 2003, pp. 719–42.
  • Brunschwig, Jacques, 1986, “The Cradle Argument in Epicureanism and Stoicism,” in Malcolm Schofield and Gisela Striker (eds.), The Norms of Nature: Studies in Hellenistic Ethics, Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press; Paris: Editions de la Maison des Sciences de l’Homme, pp. 113–44.
  • Buddhaghosa (c. 400 CE Buddhist), 1920–21, The Expositor (Atthasālīni: Buddhaghosa’s Commentary on the Dhammasangani, the First Book of the Abhidhamma Pitaka), 2 vols., Maung Tin (trans.), Mrs. Rhys Davids (ed. and rev.), London: Oxford University Press, for the Pali Text Society.
  • Buddhaghosa (c. 400 CE Buddhist), 1979, The Path of Purification (Visuddhimagga), tr., Ñâṇamoli, 4th ed., Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Butler, Joseph, 1726, Fifteen Sermons Preached in the Rolls Chapel. There have been full and partial reprintings of these sermons. Using the Augustinian language of love, he argues that self-interest (the object of self-love) is dependent on there being specific passions (i.e., desires, but perhaps in a richer than functionalist sense) to satisfy. Classic refutation of drawing selfish consequences from hedonistic egoism: satisfying altruistic desires may advance one’s happiness as much as any self-regarding project does.
  • Cabanac, Michel, 1971, “Physiological role of pleasure”, Science, 173(2): 1103–1107.
  • Cabib, Simona and Puglisi-Allegra, Stefano, 2004, “Opposite Responses of Mesolimbic Dopamine Neurons to Controllable and Uncontrollable Aversive Experiences”, The Journal of Neuroscience, 14(5): 3333–40.
  • Cacioppo, John T., 1999, “Emotion”, Annual Review of Psychology, 50: 191–214.
  • Campos, Belinda and Keltner, Dacher, 2014, “Shared and Differentiating Features of the Positive Emotion Domain”, in Gruber and Moskowitz 2014, 52-71.
  • Caston, Victor, 2003, “Intentionality in Ancient Philosophy”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M., 1986, Brentano on Intrinsic Value, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Ch. 3, pp. 17–32, is mainly a shorter, earlier version of his 1987; the rest provides context.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M., 1987, “Brentano’s Theory of Pleasure and Pain”, Topoi, 6: 59–64. Accessible exposition of Brentano’s theory.
  • Christiano, Thomas, 1992, “Sidgwick on desire, pleasure, and the good”, in Essays on Henry Sidgwick, Bart Schultz (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 261–78.
  • Churchland, Paul M., 1979, Scientific Realism and the Plasticity of Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cicero, de finibus bonorum et malorum (On Ultimate Goods and Ills). A recent translation is entitled On Moral Ends, Julia Annas (ed.), Raphael Woolf (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Clore, Gerald L. and Colcombe, Stanley, 2003, “The Parallel Worlds of Affective Concepts and Feelings”, in Musch and Klauer, 2003, pp. 335–69.
  • Clore, Gerald L.; Gasper, Karen; and Garvin, Erika, “Affect as Information”, in Forgas 2001, pp. 121–44.
  • Coan, James A. and Allen, John J.B., 2003, “The State and Trait Nature of Frontal EEG Asymmetry in Emotion”, in Hugdahl and Davidson, 2003, pp. 681–715.
  • Cooper, John M., 1996a/1999, “An Aristotelian Theory of the Emotions”, in Essays in Aristotle’s Rhetoric, Amélie Oksenberg Rorty (ed.), Berkeley and London: University of California Press, pp. 238–57, repr. in Cooper 1999b, pp. 406–23.
  • Cooper, John M., 1996b/1999, “Reason, Moral Virtue and Moral Value”, in Rationality in Greek Thought, Michael Frede and Gisela Striker, eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 81–114, repr. in Cooper 1999b, pp. 253–80. See pp. 101–2/269–70 for citations on pleasure as an apparent good.
  • Cooper, John M., 1998/1999, “Posidonius and the Emotions”, in The Emotions in Hellenistic Philosophy, Juha Sihvola and Troels Engberg-Pedersen, (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 71–111; repr. in Cooper 1999b, pp. 449–84.
  • Cooper, John M., 1999a, “Pleasure and Desire in Epicurus”, in 1999b, pp. 485–414.
  • Cooper, John M., 1999b, Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Craig, A.D., 2002,“How do you feel? Interoception: the sense of the physiological condition of the body”, Nature Reviews Neuroscience, 3: 655–666.
  • Craig, A.D., 2009, “How do you feel – now? The anterior insula and human awareness“, Nature Reviews Neuroscience, 10(1): 1059–70.
  • Craig, A.D., 2015 , How Do You Feel? An Interoceptive Moment with Your Neurobiological Self, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Craig, Wallace, 1918, “Appetites as Constitutents of Instincts”, Biological Bulletin, 34: 91–107.
  • Crisp, Roger, 2006, Reasons and the Good, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mihaly, 1990, Flow: The Psychology of Optimal Experience, New York: Harper and Row.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mihaly, 1996, Flow and the Psychology of Discovery and Invention, New York: Harper Collins. A list of nine characteristics of ‘flow’, his longest I know of, is at pp. 123–24.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mihaly, 1997, Finding Flow: The Psychology of Engagement with Everyday Life, New York: Harper Collins. Also published as: Living Well: The Psychology of Everyday Life, London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1997.
  • Dalgleish, Tim and Mick J. Power (eds.), 1999, Handbook of Cognition and Emotion, Chichester, England and New York: Wiley.
  • Damasio, Antonio R., 1994, Descartes’ Error: Emotion, Reason, and the Human Brain, New York: G.P. Putnam.
  • Damasio, Antonio R., 1999, The feeling of what happens: body and emotion in the making of consciousness, New York: Harcourt Brace.
  • Damasio, Antonio R., 2003, Looking for Spinoza: joy, sorrow, and the feeling brain, Orlando, Fla.: Harcourt.
  • Darwall, Stephen; Gibbard, Allan; Railton, Peter, 1992, “Toward Fin de siècle Ethics: Some Trends”, Philosophical Review, 101(1): 115–189. Reprinted in: their (as editors) Moral Discourse and Practice: Some Philosophical Approaches, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997, pp. 3–47.
  • Darwin, Charles, 1998, The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals, 3rd ed., with Introduction, Afterword and Commentaries by Paul Ekman, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press. Now widely thought correct in its main direction, although of course dated in evidence and detail. But a great Darwin read! And Ekman brings the science almost up to date in his notes.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 1994, “Asymmetric brain funtion, affective style and psychopathology: the role of early experience and plasticity”, Development and Psychopathology, 6: 741–758.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 2000a, “Affective Style, Mood and Anxiety Disorders“, in Davidson 2000b, pp. 88–108.
  • Davidson, Richard J. (ed.), 2000b, Anxiety, Depression and Emotion, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 2000c, “The Functional Neuroanatomy of Affective Style,” in Lane and Nadel, 2000, pp. 371–88.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 2001, “Toward a Biology of Personality and Emotion”, Annals of the New York Academy of Sciences, 935: 191–207.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 2002, “Toward a Biology of Positive Affect and Compassion”, in Visions of Compassion: Western Scientists and Tibetan Buddhists Examine Human Nature, Richard J. Davidson and Anne Harrington, eds., New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 107–130.
  • Davidson, Richard J., 2003, “Seven sins in the study of emotion: Correctives from affective neuroscience”, Brain and Cognition, 52(1): 129–32.
  • Davidson, Richard J. and Irwin, William, 1999, “The functional neuroanatomy of emotion and affective style”, Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 3: 11–21.
  • Davidson, Richard J.; Jackson, Daren C.; and Kalin, Ned H., 2000, “Emotion, Plasticity, Context, and Regulation: Perspectives From Affective Neuroscience,” Psychological Bulletin, 126(6): 890–909.
  • Davidson, Richard J.; Pizzagalli, Diego; and Nitschke, Jack B., 2002, “Depression: Perspectives from Affective Neuroscience,” Annual Review of Psychology, 53: 545–74
  • Davidson, Richard J.; Scherer, Klaus R. and Goldsmith, H. Hill, 2003, Handbook of Affective Sciences, New York: Oxford University Press. (‘Handbook’)
  • Davidson, Richard J. and Sutton, Steven K., 1995, “Affective neuroscience: The emergence of a discipline”, Current Opinion in Neurobiology, 5: 217–24.
  • Davis, Wayne, 1981a, “A Theory of Happiness,”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 18(2): 111–20. An analysis in terms of beliefs about the satisfaction of desires. However, while the self-report literature on subjective judgments of happiness often shows one component depending on beliefs about how well one’s life is objectively going, there are also other components reflecting how one feels that this analysis does not account for, and these others seem to be pain and pleasure (or feeling happy, where this is the same as experiencing pleasure). See Bibliography annotation to Strack, Argyle, and Schwarz 1991.
  • Davis, Wayne, 1981b, “Pleasure and Happiness,” Philosophical Studies, 39: 305–17. (Identifies the two, so the analyses of the other papers, too, apply to our subject.)
  • Davis, Wayne, 1982, “A Causal Theory of Enjoyment,” Mind, XCI: 240–56. Extends his 1981 to analyze enjoyment as experiences causing beliefs about the satisfaction of one’s desires.
  • Depue, Richard and Paul F. Collins, 1999, with commentaries by others, “Neurobiology of the structure of personality: dopamine, foundations of incentive motivation and extraversion”, with extensive peer commentary, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 22: 491–569. Defends a dopaminergic view of all these and, in part, of positive affect as well.
  • Depue, Richard A. and Jeannine Morrone-Strupinsky, 2005, “A neurobehavioral model of affiliative bonding: implications for conceptualizing a human trait of affiliation”, with extensive peer commentary by many others, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 28(3): 313–95. Defends a μ-opioid-system theory of the trait of affiliation, while suggesting, more tentatively, such a view of similar consummatory-phase pleasure more generally. (Typesetting errors resulted in “u-opiates” and the like here for “μ-opiates” and the like in most places.)
  • Descartes, René, 1984–91, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and (also, for Vol. III) Anthony Kenny, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 3 vols. (‘CSM’ in citations, where ‘AT’ precedes page numbers of the standard edition of the original French and Latin, often noted in the margins of this and other recent editions: Oeuvres de Descartes, Charles Adam & Paul Tannery, eds., J. Vrin, 1908–1957.)
  • Diener, Ed; Sandvik, Ed and Pavot, William, 1991, “Happiness is the frequency, not the intensity, of positive versus negative affect”, in Strack et al. 1991, pp. 119–139.
  • Diener, Ed (ed.), 1999, Special Section on the Structure of Emotion, Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 76(5): 603–64.
  • Drevets, Wayne C. and Raichle, Marcus E., 1998, “Reciprocal Suppression of Regional Cerebral Blood Flow during Emotional versus Higher Cognitive Processes: Implications for Interactions between Emotion and Cognition”, Cognition and Emotion, 12(3): 353–385.
  • Duncker, Karl, 1941, “On Pleasure, Emotion and Striving,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 1(4): 391–430. Classic paper on the relations of pleasure and motivation, by a psychologist well-versed in the history of thought about this topic generally and especially in the traditions of introspectionist psychology and phenomenology. His many distinctions seldom connect obviously to later neuroscience; any validity may come at higher levels of brain/mind organization than this has yet reached. A source for some early twentieth century psychological literature in German. Through this paper this German literature may have influenced philosophers writing in English in the following decades, and what they found to be obvious in experience or in ordinary English.
  • Edwards, Rem B., 1979, Pleasures and Pains: A Theory of Qualitative Hedonism, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Ekman, Paul, 1999a, “Basic Emotions”, in Dalgleish and Power 1999, Ch. 3, pp. 45–60.
  • Ekman, Paul, 1999b, “Facial Expressions”, in Dalgleish and Power 1999, Ch. 16, pp. 301–20.
  • Ekman, Paul and Davidson, Richard J., eds., 1994, The Nature of Emotion: Fundamental Questions, New York: Oxford University Press. Question 8: “Can Emotion Be Nonconscious?”, pp. 283–318, affords a mix of empirical and conceptual considerations.
  • Ellsworth, Phoebe C. and Klaus R. Scherer, 2003, “Appraisal Processes in Emotion”, in Davidson et al. 2003, Handbook, pp. 572–95.
  • Emilsson, Eyójolfur Kjalar, 1998, “Plotinus on the Emotions”, in Juha Sihvola and Troels Engberg-Pedersen, (eds.), The Emotions in Hellenistic Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 339–63.
  • Empedocles (c. 500 B.C.), Fragments, in Kirk, Raven and Schofield (1983). Fragment 17, cited here, and others may be found also in other collections including selections from the presocratic Greek philosophers‘ surviving writings and in editions of Empedocles.
  • Epicurus (d. 300 B.C.E.), 1994, The Epicurus Reader: Selected Writings and Testimonia, Inwood, Brad and L.P. Gerson, eds. and trans., Indianapolis and Cambridge, Mass.: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Erler, Michael and Malcolm Schofield, , 1999, “Epicurean Ethics”, in Kempe Algra, Jonathan Barnes, Jaap Mansfeld & Malcolm Schofield (eds.), Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge & New York: Cambridge University Press, 1999, 642–674.
  • Feldman, Fred, 1997a, “On the Intrinsic Value of Pleasures”, in Feldman 1997c, pp. 125–47. Original publication: Ethics, 107 (April 1997): 448–466.
  • Feldman, Fred, 1997b, ”Two Questions about Pleasure,“ reprinted in Feldman, 1997c, pp. 79–105. Original publication: Philosophical Analysis: A Defense by Example, David Austin (ed.), Dordrecht: Reidel, 1988, pp. 59–81. Clearly reviews some main kinds of account given by twentieth century philosophers and proposes that the central kind of pleasure is a special attitude and that others are its intentional objects.
  • Feldman, Fred, 1997c, Utilitarianism, Hedonism and Desert: Essays in Moral Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Feldman, Fred, 2001, “Hedonism”, in Lawrence C. Becker and Charlotte B. Becker (eds.), Encyclopedia of Ethics, 2d edition, 3 vols., New York: Routledge, Vol. II, pp. 662–669. Clearly reviews some kinds of twentieth century philosophers’ views of pleasure including his own ‘attitudinal’ view, before going on to expound versions of hedonism based on them.
  • Feldman, Fred, 2002, “The Good Life: A Defense of Attitudinal Hedonism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, LXV(3): 604–28. Part of a 2000 symposium at Brown University.
  • Feldman, Fred, 2004, Pleasure and the Good Life: Concerning the Nature, Varieties, and Plausibility of Hedonism, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Findlay, J.N., 1961, Values and Intentions, New York: Macmillan. Pp. 175–78 argues against the mere feeling view of pleasure as nonexplanatory and running into what is here called ”the problem of good“. The argument is strongly reminiscent of one used by the psychologist William McDougall (e.g., in his 1911), on behalf of his Stoic-influenced hormic psychology, against the simple picture of pleasure.
  • Forgas, Joseph P., ed., 2001, Handbook of Affect and Social Cognition, Mahwah, New Jersey: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Fox, Michael D., Abraham Z. Snyder, Justin L. Vincent, Maurizio Corbetta, David C. Van Essen, and Marcus E. Raichle, 2005, “The human brain is intrinsically organized into dynamic, anticorrelated functional networks”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences of the United States of America, 102: 9673–9678.
  • Fredrickson, Barbara, 1998, “What Good Are Positive Emotions?” Review of Positive Psychology, 2(3): 300–19. Claims there are many positive emotions, although not as well discriminated as negative ones; joy, interest contentment and love (as a complex of these and others) are mentioned. Plausible but vague view that positive emotions serve to broaden attention and cognitive style, which seems to fit a broader range of phenomena than cited. While repeated in later publications, the view seems not yet to have been worked out in greater detail.
  • Frijda, Nico, 1993, “Moods, Emotion Episodes and Emotions”, in Handbook of Emotions, Michael Lewis and Jeannette M. Haviland, eds., New York and London: The Guilford Presss, pp. 381–403. Not in the 2nd ed. of this.
  • Frijda, Nico, 1999, “Emotions and Hedonic Experience”, in Kahneman, Diener and Schwarz, 1999, pp. 190–210.
  • Frijda, Nico, 2001, “The Nature of Pleasure”, in Bargh and Appley, 2001, pp. 71–94.
  • Frijda, Nico and Marcel Zellenberg, 2003, in Appraisal Processes in Emotion: Theories, Methods, Research, Klaus R. Scherer, Angela Schorr and Tom Johnstone, eds., New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 141–55.
  • Fuchs, Alan E., 1976, “The Production of Pleasure by Stimulation of the Brain: An Alleged Conflict between Science and Philosophy”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 36: 494–505.
  • Gardiner, H.M., Ruth Clark Metcalf and John G. Beebe-Center, 1937, Feeling and Emotion: A History of Theories, New York: American Book Company. The most thorough historical account to date in English.
  • Gardner, Eliot L. and James David, 1999a, “The Neuorobiology of Chemical Addiction”, in Getting Hooked: Rationality and Addiction, Jon Elster and Ole-dørgen Skog, eds., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 93–136.
  • Gardner, Eliot L., 1999b, “The Neurobiology and Genetics of Addiction: Implications of the ‘Reward Deficiency Syndrome’ for Therapeutic Strategies in Chemical Dependency”, Addiction: Entries and Exits, Jon Elster (ed.), New York: Russell Sage Foundation, pp. 57–119.
  • Gazzaniga, Michael (ed.), 2004, The Cogntive Neurosciences, 3rd ed., Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press.
  • Gibbard, Allan, 2003, Thinking how to live, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 2003. Ch. 2 has an excellent treatment of Moore’s criticism of value hedonism, distinguishing his well-supported claim for a conceptual distinction between pleasure and good from his further claim that these are distinct properties.
  • Ginsborg, Hannah, 2014, “Kant’s Aesthetics and Teleology”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>. §2.31 discusses aesthetic judgment’s relation to aesthetic pleasure and §2.33 whether, on Kant’s view of this, aesthetic pleasure is intentional. References to recent philosophical literature on these controversial questions are provided.
  • Glare, P.G.W. (ed.), 1968–82, Oxford Latin Dictionary, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Good on etymology, too.
  • Goldstein, Irwin, 1980, “Why People Prefer Pleasure to Pain”, Philosophy, 55: 349–62.
  • Goldstein, Irwin, 1985, “Hedonic Pluralism”, Philosophical Studies, 48: 59–55.
  • Goldstein, Irwin, 1989, “Pleasure and Pain: Unconditional Intrinsic Values”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 50(2): 255–276.
  • Goldstein, Irwin, 2000, “Intersubjective Properties by Which We specify Pain, Pleasure and Other Kinds of Mental States,” Philosophy, 75: 89–104.
  • Goldstein, Irwin, 2002, “The Good’s Magnetism and Ethical Realism”, Philosophical Studies, 108(1–2): 1–14.
  • Gosling, Justin, 1998, “Hedonism”, Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge, ad loc.
  • Gosling, J.C.B., 1969, Pleasure and Desire: The Case for Hedonism Reviewed, Oxford: Oxford University Press. The best introductory book on pleasure, too. Uncluttered and engagingly written, but with only a short select bibliography by way of references. The aim is to distinguish disparate uses and claims run together in the hedonist tradition, without denying the existence or importance of occurrent positive affect in our emotional or active lives. Distinctions made in the course of the twentieth century reaction against hedonism are used to dissect hedonist claims and arguments while excesses of the ordinary language literature (mentioned especially toward the end of n.1 above), then near the end of its run, are largely corrected. A work for undergraduates that wears its wisdom and scholarship lightly while attentive to the intuitive sources and motivations of hedonism in human life.
  • Gosling, J.C.B. and Taylor, C.C.W., 1982, The Greeks on Pleasure, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Thorough and scholarly, but sometimes the interpretations are controversial.
  • Gruber, June and Moskowitz, Judith Tedlie, 2014, Positive Emotion: Integrating the Light Sides and Dark Sides, New York:Oxford University Press.
  • Gusnard, Debra A., Erbil Akbudak, Gordon L, Shulman, and Marcus E. Raichle, 2001, “Medial prefrontal cortex and self-referential mental activity: Relation to a default mode of brain function”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences of the U.S.A., 98: 4259–4264.
  • Gusnard, Debra A., and Marcus E. Raichle, “Functional Imagery, Neurophysiology, and the Resting State of the Brain”, in Gazzaniga 2004, pp. 1267–80.
  • Haber, Suzanne N., Julie L. Fudge, and Nikolaus R. McFarland, “Striatonigrostriatal Pathways in Primates Form an Ascending Spiral from the Shell to the Dorsolateral Striatum”, The Journal of Neuroscience, 20(6): 2369–2382.
  • Haidt, Jonathan, 2003, “The Moral Emotions,” in Davidson, Scherer, and Goldsmith (Handbook), pp. 852–70. Claims there are distinct moral emotions reflected to differing extents in different enculturated moralities.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm, 1997, “Happiness: A Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika Perspective, in Mohanty, J.N. and Bilmoria, P., eds., Relativism, Suffering and Beyond: Essays in Memory of Bimal K. Matilal, Delhi: Oxford University Press, pp. 150–163.
  • Hamlyn, David, 1978, “The Phenomena of Love and Hate”, Philosophy, 53: 5–20.
  • Harkins, Jean and Anna Wierzbicka (eds.), 2001, Emotions in Crosslinguistic Perspective, Berlin and New York: Mouton de Gruyter.
  • Haybron, Daniel, 2001, “Happiness and Pleasure,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, LXII(3): 501–28.
  • Haybron, Daniel, 2007, “Do We Know How Happy We Are? On Some Limits of Affective Introspection and Recall”, Noûs, 41(3): 394–428
  • Haybron, Daniel, 2008, The Pursuit of Unhappiness: The Elusive Psychology of Well-Being, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Heathwood, Chris, 2006, “Desire satisfactionism and hedonism”, Philosophical Studies, 128: 539–63.
  • Heathwood, Chris, 2007, “The reduction of sensory pleasure to desire“, Philosophical Studies, 133: 23–44.
  • Heilman, Kenneth M., 2000, “Emotional Experience: A Neurological Model”, in Lane and Nadel, 2000, pp. 328–44. Well-informed hypotheses on where to look in brain systems’ activity for dimensions of affect, similar to Wundt’s (1896/1897).
  • Hejmadi, Ahalya, Richard J. Davidson and Paul Rozin, 2000, “Exploring Hindu Indian Emotion Expressions: Evidence for Accurate Recognition by Americans and Indians”. Psychological Science, 11(3): 183–187. Suggests there are a plurality of basic positive affects. Requires corroboration by other methods, if additions are to be regarded as affects and as basic, rather than just as social signals; e.g, of submission, which may secondarily feel good to people who have been socialized to regard it as appropriate to their age, sex, class or caste status. The classical Sanskrit treatise on dramaturgy Nāṭyaśāstra, cited as a source, may not support the whole list of principal affects it is credited with here, at least in all versions; its Chapter Seven seems not to mention dhyana, contemplation or meditation, translated as “peace” in this paper. See Nāṭyaśāstra: English translation with Critical Notes, rev. ed., 1996 (1st ed., 1986), trans. and notes, Adya Ragacharya, New Delhi: Munishiram Manoharlal, pp. 66ff..
  • Heller, Wendy; Koven, Nancy S.; and Miller, Gregory; 2003; “Regional Brain Activity in Anxiety and Depression”, in Hugdahl and Davidson, 2003, pp. 533–64.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 1994, “The Significance of Emotions,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 31(4): 319–31.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 2001a, Emotional Reason: Deliberation, Motivation and the Nature of Value, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 2001b, “Emotional and Practical Reason: Rethinking Evaluation and Motivation,” Noûs, 35(2): 190–213.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 2002, “Felt Evaluations: A Theory of Pleasure and Pain,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 39(1): 13–30.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 2009, “Emotions as Evaluative Feelings”, Emotion Review, 1(3): 248–55.
  • Hirvonen, Vesa, 2004, Passions in William Ockham’s Philosophical Psychology, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Hobbes, Thomas 1651/1994, Leviathan: with selected variants from the Latin edition of 1668, Edwin Curley (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1658/1991, Charles T. Wood, T. S. K. Scott-Craig, and Bernard Gert, trans., De Homine (in part), in Man and Citizen: Thomas Hobbes’s De Homine and De Cive, Indianapolis: Hackett. Contains translation of De Homine, chs. x–xv, drafted 1641, published 1658.
  • Hoebel, Bart; Rada, Pedro V.; Mark, Gregory P.; and Pothos, Emmanuel N., 1999, “Neural Systems for Reinforcement and Inhibition of Behavior; Relevance to Eating, Addiction and Depression” in Kahneman, Diener, and Schwarz 1999, pp. 558–77.
  • Houk, James C.; Davis, Joel L., and Beiser, David G., 1995, Models of Information Processing in the Basal Ganglia, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Hugdahl, Kenneth and Davidson, Richard J., eds., 2003, The Asymmetrical Brain, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature.
  • Hundert, E.J., 1994, The Enlightenment’s Fable: Bernard Mandeville and the Discovery of Society, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind, 2002, “Emotional Reason: Deliberation, Motivation and the Nature of Value”, Mind, 111: 418–422. A review of Helm 2001a.
  • Ikemoto, Satoshi and Jaak Panksepp, 1999,“The role of nucleus accumbens dopamine in motivated behavior: a unifying interpretation with special reference to reward-seeking”, Brain Research Reviews, 31: 6–41.
  • Isen, Alice. M., 2002, “A Role for Neuropsychology in Understanding the Facilitating Influence of Positive Affect on Social Behavior and Cognitive Processes”, in Handbook of Positive Psychology, eds., C.R. Snyder and Shane J. Lopez, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 528–40.
  • Ito, Tiffany A. and Cacioppo, John T., 1999, “The Psychophysiology of Utility Appraisals”, in Kahneman, Diener, and Schwarz 1999, pp. 470–88.
  • Ito, Tiffany A. and Cacioppo, John T., 2001, “Affect and Attitudes: A Social Neuroscience Approach”, in Forgas 2001, pp. 51–74.
  • Izard, Carroll E., 1991, The Psychology of Emotions, New York and London, Plenum.
  • Jacob, Pierre, 2014, “Intentionality”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>
  • Johnston, Victor S., 1999, Why We Feel: The Science of Human Emotions, A review of some relevant science by a research psychologist written for a general audience. More daring in its interpretations and evolutionary speculation than the literature written for scientists.
  • Kagan, Shelly, 1992, “The Limits of Well-being”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 9: 169–89. Also published, with identical pagination, in Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred D. Miller, Jr., and Jeffrey Paul (eds.); The Good Life and the Human Good, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992, pp. 169–189. Section II, Hedonism, discusses well some options for relating pleasure and desire.
  • Kahneman, Daniel, 1999, “Objective Happiness”, in Kahneman, Diener and Schwarz, 1999, pp. 3–25. A program for getting from momentary self-reports to somethingmore. Excellent and accessible. See §3.1, last ¶, n. 5 last ¶, and n. 28 on Kahneman’s motivational definition of “instant utility” (p. 4), which seems subject to the objections Sidgwick raised against its Victorian predecessors, 1907, p. 127.
  • Kahneman, Daniel, 2000, “Experienced Utility and Objective Happiness: A Moment-Based Approach”, in Kahneman and Tversky, 2000, pp. 673–92.
  • Kahneman, Daniel; Diener, Ed; and Schwarz, Norbert (eds.), 1999, Well-Being: The Foundations of Hedonic Psychology, New York: Russell Sage Foundation. Contains contributions from psychologists and others representing different subfields and literatures, generally more accessible than papers written for specialists. Probably the best single place to start reading scientfic literature on the subject.
  • Kahneman, Daniel and Amos Tversky (eds.), 2000, Choices, Values, and Frames, New York: Russell Sage Foundation; Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kahneman, Daniel, Wakker, Peter P., and Sarin, Rakesh, 1997, “Back to Bentham? Explorations of experienced utility”, The Quarterly Journal of Economics 112, 2: 375-406.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1790/2000, Kritik der Urteilskraft, trans. as Critique of the power of judgment, Paul Guyer (ed.); Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000. See especially, with pages in the Academy edition, referenced in the entry just below, in parentheses: p. 33 (20: 231) from the First Introduction; pp. 105 (5: 220, 222) and Guyer’s notes at p. 361, n. 24 and p. 366, notes 3 and 4 for citations to other writings of Kant’s. For references to recent secondary literature on the relations of aesthetic judgment and aesthetic pleasure in Kant, and on the latter’s possible intentionality, see Ginsborg 2005. Kant’s First Introduction (which some editions follow Kant in omitting) gives his fullest account of the influential division of mind into Cognition, Conation or Desire, and Feeling (involving pleasure or pain). Adding the last of these formally to the medieval Intellect and Will may be new with him, although eighteenth century predecessors, perhaps especially J.G. Sulzer, came very close (Gardiner, Metcalf, and Beebe Center, 1937, ch. ix, pp. 244–75).
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1800/1974 (first ed., 1798), Anthropologie in pragmatischer Hinsicht, English trans.: Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, trans. Mary Gregor, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974. The relevant passage is on p. 100 there and at vol. VII, pp. 231–2 of the standard complete edition of Kant’s works, Gesammelte Schriften, Prussian/German Academy of Sciences, Berlin: G. Reimer/W. de Gruyter, 1902–    , the pagination of which is often included in the margins of later editions and translations.
  • Kapur, Shitij, 2003, “Psychosis as a State of Aberrant Salience: A Framework Linking Biology, Phenomenology, and Pharmacology in Schizophrenia”, American Journal of Psychiatry, 160(1): 13–23.
  • Katkov, G., 1940, “The Pleasant and the Beautiful”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, XL (1939–40): 177–206. Pp. 179–87 may provide the account in English closest to Brentano’s intentions, based on the relevant passage of Brentano’s untranslated 1907 and other works that may yet be unpublished (Katkov’s note, pp. 178–79). The loving is itself part of the act of sensing at which it is directed. One suspects this may be all the reflexivity intended; Chisholm has a loving of a loving in his analysis, which seems a permissible, but not a mandatory, reading of other Brentano texts.
  • Katz, Leonard D., 1982, “Hedonic arousal, memory and motivation,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 5(1): 60. A commentary on Wise 1982 by a philosopher, showing how to interpret and state Wise’s scientific views in a way friendly to elements of the simple picture of pleasure.
  • Katz, Leonard D., 1986, Hedonism as Metaphysics of Mind and Value. Ph.D. diss., Princeton University, published and distributed through ProQuest/UMI (URL = An attempt to revive and reform pleasure-centered theorizing in both areas, in the spirit of the simple picture of pleasure. Includes discussion of the ancients, utilitarians, and of neuroscience through 1985. The last is updated in §3 below. Some points are used and some improved upon or corrected here.
  • Katz, Leonard D., 2005a, Review of Fred Feldman, Pleasure and the Good Life, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2005.03.02. [Available online]
  • Katz, Leonard D., 2005b, “Opioid bliss as the felt hedonic core of mammalian prosociality – and of consummatory pleasure more generally?”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 28(3): 356. (Short commentary on Depue and Morrone-Strupinsky 2005 by a philosopher).
  • Katz, Leonard D., 2005c, Review of Timothy Schroeder, Three Faces of Desire, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2005.09.09. [Avaialble online]
  • Katz, Leonard D., 2008, “Hedonic Reasons as Ultimately Justifying and the Relevance of Neuroscience”, in Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Vol. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality: Emotion, Brain Disorders and Development, Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press, pp. 409–17.
  • Kenny, Anthony, 1963, Action, Emotion and the Will, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul. Ch. VI, pp. 127–50, is most relevant and includes a pithy statement of Anscombe’s central point.
  • Kirk, G.S.; Raven, J.E.; and Schofield, M., 1983, The Presocratic Philosophers: A Critical History with Selected Texts, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 1st ed., 1957.
  • Knuuttila, Simo, 2004, Emotions in Ancient and Medieval Philosophy, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kraye, Jill (ed.), 1997, Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts, Vol. I, Moral Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Part VI translates extracts from works of Petrarch, Filelfo, Raimondi, and Quevedo partially rehabilitating Epicurean hedonism in a Christian context.
  • Kringelbach, Morten. L., 2009, The Pleasure Center: Trust Your Animal Instincts, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kringelbach, Morten L. and Kent C. Berridge (eds.), 2010, Pleasures of the Brain, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kringelbach, Morten L. and Kent. C. Berridge, 2015, “Motivation and Pleasure in the Brain”, in Wilhelm Hofmann and Loran F. Nordgren (eds.), The Psychology of Desire, New York and London: The Guilford Press, 129–45.
  • Labukt, Ivar, 2012, “Hedonic Tone and the Heterogeneity of Pleasure”, Utilitas, 24(2): 172–99.
  • Lamme, Victor A. F., 2003, “Why Visual Attention and Awareness Are Different”, Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 7(1): 12–18.
  • Lamme, Victor A. F., and P. R. Roelfsema, 2000, “The Distinct Modes of Vision Offered by Feedforward and Recurrent Processing” Trends in Neurosciences, 23(11): 571–579.
  • Landfester, Manfred, 1966, Das griechische Nomen «philos» und seine Ableitungen, Hildesheim: Olms.
  • Lane, Richard D., 2000, “Neural Corelates of Emotional Experience”, in Lane and Nadel, 2000, pp. 345–70.
  • Lane, Richard D, and Nadel, Lynn, eds., 2000, Cognitive Neuroscience of Emotion, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lane, Richard D., Lynn Nadel and Alfred Kaszniak, “Epilogue: The Future of Emotion Research from the Perspective of Cognitive Neuroscience”, in Lane and Nadel, 2000, pp. 407–12.
  • Larue, Gerald A., 1991, “Ancient Ethics”, in A Companion to Ethics, Peter Singer (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 29– 40.
  • LeDoux, Joseph, The Emotional Brain : The Mysterious Underpinnings of Emotional Life New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • LeDoux, Joseph, 2002 The Synaptic Self: How Our Brains Become Who We Are, New York and London: Viking Penguin. Ch. 9, pp. 235–91 has further discussion and references on relevant neuroscience, especially of dopamine ‘reward’, by an affective neuroscientist who takes a fairly dim view of it – an eminent amygdala specialist who thinks that what pays off is studying specific emotion systems, such as that supposed to be specifically for fear conditioning in the amygdala. (Many now take a less specific view of amygdala function.)
  • Liddell, Henry George and Robert Scott, rev. Henry Stuart Jones, 1940, 9th ed. (1st ed., 1843), A Greek-English Lexicon, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lieh-tzu, 1960, The Book of Lieh-tzu: A Classic of the Tao, trans. A.C. Graham, New York: Columbia University Press. Reports of the naive libertine hedonism of Yang Chu, apparently rare in extant ancient Chinese prose, are in chapter 7.
  • Locke, John, 1700/1979, reprinted with corrections from 1975 edition; following mainly 4th ed., 1700; 1st ed. 1689), An Essay concerning Human Understanding, Peter H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. II,xx and xxi are most relevant.
  • Long, A.A. and Sedley, D.N. (eds., trans., commentary and notes), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols., Vol. I containing English translations and Vol. II containing Greek texts. Texts and notes in §21 (Epicurean) and in §§57 and 65 (Stoic), in both volumes, are relevant.
  • Lucretius (Titus Lucretius Carus, 1st c. B.C.E.), De rerum natura. This exposition of Epicureanism in verse is available in many editions and translations.
  • Lycan, William, 2015, “Representational Theories of Consciousness”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2015 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Lyons, William, 1980, Gilbert Ryle: An Introduction to his Philosophy, Brighton: Harvester and Atlantic Highlands, N.J: Humanities. Chapter 11 critically discusses Ryle 1954a and 1954b but overlooks the relevant chapter in his 1949.
  • Madell, Geoffrey, 1996, “What Music Teaches about Emotion,” Philosophy, 71: 63–82.
  • Madell, Geoffrey, 2002, Philosophy, Music and Emotion. 2002, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press
  • Manstead, Antony S. R.; Frijda, Nico and Fischer, Agneta (eds.), 2004, Feelings and Emotions: The Amsterdam Symposium, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Matilal, Bimal Krishna, 1986, Perception: An Essay in Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • McDougall, William, 1911, Body and Mind, New York: Macmillan. There have been several identically paginated reprint editions.
  • McGrade, Arthur Stephen, 1981, “Ockham on Enjoyment: Toward an Understanding of Fourteenth Century Philosophy and Psychology,” Review of Metaphysics 33: 706–28. “Enjoyment” is the traditional but misleading translation of the technical use of “fruitio” and cognates in these medieval texts. In the text I prefer “valuing” for this act of the Will distinguishable from pleasure and arguably antecedent to and dissociable from it, as on Ockham’s own view.
  • McGrade, Arthur Stephen, 1987, “Enjoyment at Oxford after Ockham,” in Anne Hudson and Michael Wilks, eds., From Ockham to Wyclif, Oxford: Blakwell, pp. 63–88. An excellent and clear discussion of the alternatives to Ockham’s view in the fourteenth century debates. But see note on his 1981 above.
  • Merlan, Philip, 1960, “Hēdonē in Epicurus and Aristotle”, in his Studies in Epicurus and Aristotle (Klassich-Philologische Studien, Volume 22), Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz, pp. 1–37.
  • Mill, James, 1829/1869, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, 2nd ed., 1869, John Stuart Mill (ed. and annot.) (1st ed., London: Baldwin and Cradock, 1829), London: Longmans Green Reader & Dyer, 2 vols.
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1872/1979 (1st ed., 1865), An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy and of the Principal Questions Discussed in his Writings, 1872 4th ed. text, J. M. Robson (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press and London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1979. Chapter XXV, pp. 430–436, is the classic rejoinder to Aristotelian views in a principal but now little-read work of Mill’s.
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1871 (1st ed., 1861), Utilitarianism, 4th ed., London: Longmans Green Reader & Dyer. Many recent editions based on this are available.
  • Millgram, Elijah, 1997, Practical Induction Princeton: Princeton University Press. Chapter 6, pp. 105–40, gives an indicator of well-being theory of pleasure.
  • Millgram, Elijah, 2000, “What’s the Use of Utility?”, Philosophy and Public Affairs 29,2:114–36. An indicator of change for the better account of pleasure.
  • Mitsis, Phillip, 1987, Epicurus’ Ethical Theory, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Monier-Williams, Monier, 1899, A Sanskrit-English Dictionary, Etymologically and Philologically Arranged with special reference to Cognate European Languages, new ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press. This standard is available in both British and Indian reprints.
  • Moore, George Edward (G.E.), 1903, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Ch. III, “Hedonism”, pp. 59–109 and especially the distinction between pleasure and consciousness of pleasure at pp. 87–89, influenced by Plato’s discussion in Philebus 21A. Plato’s distinction there between pure pleasure and cognition, however, may differ from Moore’s in leaving what Block calls “phenomenal consciousness” on the pleasure side. Moore uses an undifferentiated concept of consciousness.
  • Moran, Richard, 2002, “Frankfurt on Identification: Ambiguities of Activity in Mental Life”, in Sarah Buss and Lee Overton (eds.), Contours of Agency: Essays on Themes from Harry Frankfurt, pp. 189–217. Pp. 209–14 contain a sensitive discussion of ways pleasure may be regarded as norm-governed and active, much in the spirit of Aristotle and of Anscombe. A controversial inference that pleasure cannot be the sort of thing that could be directly caused by drug action is drawn.
  • Morillo, Carolyn R., 1990, “The Reward Event and Motivation”, Journal of Philosophy, 87(4): 169–186. Material from this is included in her 1995.
  • Morillo, Carolyn R., 1992, “Reward Event Systems: Reconceptualizing the Explanatory Roles of Motivation, Desire and Pleasure,” Philosophical Psychology, 5(1): 7–32. Material from this is included in her 1995.
  • Morillo, Carolyn, 1995, Contingent Creatures: A Reward-Event Theory of Motivation and Value, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield. Includes material from her 1990 and 1992 in Chapter 2. Defends a hedonistic view of motivation and value (but an avowedly nonnormative and naturalist one) in the light of the brain reward and conditioning literature. Clearly develops a view of motivation like the motivation by pleasant thoughts view put forward by Schlick (1930/1939) and discussed by Gosling (1969), while also emphasizing that pleasure is itself intrinsic and nonrelational, as in her 1992.
  • Moss, Jessica, 2006, “Pleasure and Illusion in Plato”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 72: 503-35,
  • Moss, Jessica, 2012, Arisotle on the Apparent Good: Perception, Phantasia, Thought, & Desire, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mulligan, Kevin, 2004, “Brentano on the mind”, in Dale Jaquette (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Brentano, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004, pp. 66–97. Pp. 83–86 summarize and reference Brentano’s views on pleasure and pain – his earlier views as well as the mature ones discussed in §2.3.1, ¶2 and n. 21.
  • Murphy, Sheila T., Jennifer L. Monahan and R.B. Zajonc, 1995, “Additivity of Nonconscious Affect: Combined Effects of Priming and Exposure”, Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 69(4): 589–602.
  • Murphy, Sheila T. and R. B. Zajonc, 1993, “Affect, Cognition, and Awareness: Affective Priming With Optimal and Suboptimal Stimulus Exposures”, Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 64(5): 723–739.
  • Murray, James Augustus Henry; Henry Bradley, William Alexander Craigie and Charles Talbut Onions (eds.), 1884–1928, The Oxford English Dictionary (original title: A New English Dictionary on Historical Principles), Oxford: Oxford University Press. ‘OED’. A uniform corrected edition appeared in 1933, a 2d ed. in 1989.
  • Musch, Jochen and Klauer, Karl Christoph, 2003, The Psychology of Motivation: Affective Processes in Cognition and Emotion, Mahwah, New Jersey: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Nader, Karim; Bechara, Antoine; and van der Kooy, Derek, 1997, “Neurobiological Constraints on Behavioral Models of Motivation”, Annual Review of Psychology, 48: 85–114.
  • Nettle, Daniel, 2005, Happiness: The Science behind Your Smile, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Neumann, Roland; Förster, Jens; Strack, Fritz, 2003, “Motor Compatibility: The Bidirectional Link between Behavior and Evaluation”, in Musch and Klauer, 2003, pp. 371–391.
  • Nichols, Herbert, 1892, “The Origin of Pleasure and Pain, I”, The Philosophical Review, 1(4): 403–432.
  • Nowell-Smith, Patrick Horace, 1954, Ethics, Harmondsworth: Middlesex. Especially pp. 111–115 on ‘pro-attitudes’, including pleasure, as explanatory (i.e., involving conation of various kinds, as it seems) and pp. 127–32 on enjoyment. He seems thus to seek some middle way between Ryle’s dispositional view and older experiential episode views, but to leave any filling out of the details to psychology.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C., 1994, The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C., 2001, Upheavals of Thought: The Intelligence of the Emotions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nyanatiloka, 1980, Buddhist Dictionary: Manual of Buddhist Terms and Doctrines, 4th ed., Nyanaponika, Kandy (ed. and rev.), Sri Lanka: Buddhist Publication Society Valuable for its doctrinal summaries and translation suggestions, such as “joyful interest” for pīti, p. 168, adopted here; the work of Theravadin Buddhist monks of German and German-Jewish origin, respectively, a teacher-student pair; the original version was done by Nyanatiloka during their World War II internment as enemy aliens in British India.
  • Ockham, see William of Ockham.
  • Olds, James, 1958, “Self-Stimulation of the Brain: Its Use to Study Local Effects of Hunger, Sex, and Drugs”, Science, 127: 315–24.
  • Olds, James, 1965, “Pleasure Centers in the Brain”, Scientific American, 195: 105–16.
  • Olds, James, 1977, Drives and Reinforcements: Behavioral Studies of Hypothalamic Functions, New York: Raven Press.
  • Olds, James and Milner, Peter, 1954, “Positive reinforcement produced by electrical stimulation of septal area and other regions of rat brain”, Journal of Comparative and Physiological Psychology, 47: 419–27.
  • Oliver, Alex, “Facts,” Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London and New York: Routledge, Vol. 3, pp. 535–37.
  • Onions, C.T., 1966, The Oxford Dictionary of English Etymology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Owen, G.E.L., 1971–72,“Aristotelian Pleasures,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 72: 135–52. Reprinted in his Logic, Science and Method: Collected Papers in Greek Philosophy, Martha Nussbaum (ed.), Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 1996.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, 1998, Affective Neuroscience: The Foundations of Human and Animal Emotions, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, 2000a, “Emotions as Natural Kinds within the Mammalian Brain”, ch. 9, in Handbook of Emotions, 2nd ed., Michael Lewis and Jeannette M. Haviland-Jones (eds.), New York and London, The Guilford Press, pp. 137–156.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, 2000b, “The Riddle of Laughter: Neural and Psychoevolutionary Wellsprings of Joy”, Current Directions in Psychological Science, 9(6): 183–186.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, 2014, “Understanding the Neurobiology of Core Postive Emotions through Animal Models: Affective and Clinical Implications“, in Gruber and Moskowitz, 116-36.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, Brian Knutson and Jeff Burgdorf, 2002, “The role of brain emotional systems in addictions: a neuro-evolutionary perspective and new ‘self-report’ animal model,” Addiction, 97: 450–469.
  • Panksepp, Jaak, and Biven, Lucy, 2012, The Archaeology of Mind: Neuroevolutionary Origins of Human Emotions, New York: Norton.
  • Parfit, Derek, 1984, Reasons and Persons, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Peciña, Susana and Berridge, Kent C., 2000, “Opioid site in nucleus accumbens shell mediates eating and hedonic ‘liking’ for food: map based on microinjection Fos plumes”, Brain Research, 863: 71–86.
  • Peciña, Susana; Cagniard, Barbara; Berridge, Kent C.; Aldridge, J. Wayne; and Zhuang, Xiaoxi, 2003, ”Hyperdopaminergic Mutant Mice Have Higher “Wanting” But Not “Liking“ for Sweet Rewards,” The Journal of Neuroscience, 23(28): 9395–9402.
  • Penelhum, Terence, 1957, “The Logic of Pleasure”, Philosophy and Phenomenlogical Research, XVII: 488–23. Classic critical discussion of Ryle, accepting his positive account of enjoyment as a form of effortless attention but rejecting his claim that this is always a disposition rather than an episode.
  • Perry, David L., 1967, The Concept of Pleasure, The Hague: Mouton. Uses the method of British ordinary language philosophy but often takes issue with predecessors in it, as well as with the earlier hedonist tradition.
  • Pfaffmann, Carl, 1960, “The pleasures of sensation”, Psychological Review, 67: 753–68.
  • Pizzagalli, Diego; Shackman, Alexander J.; and Davidson, Richard J.; 2003, “The Functional Imaging of Human Emotion: Asymmetric Contributions of Cortical and Subcortical Circuitry”, in Hugdahl and Davidson, 2003, pp. 511–32.
  • Plato, 1997, Complete Works, trans. by many hands, with notes by John M. Cooper (ed.); D. S. Hutchinson (assoc ed.), Indianapolis and Cambridge, Mass.: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Plato, Definitions. Generally regarded as not by Plato himself, but a record of work done by those in his circle. It is included in the 1997 Complete Works in a translation by D.S. Hutchinson.
  • Plato, Gorgias, in Plato 1997.
  • Plato, Philebus, trans. with notes and commentary by J.C.B. Gosling, London: Oxford University Press, 1975. A large and ongoing secondary literature debating the interpretation of the section on false pleasures exists.
  • Plato, Protagoras, 1991/1976, trans. and notes, C.C.W. Taylor, Oxford: Oxford University Press, rev. ed., 1991 (1st ed., 1976). 352B–357E apparently adopts a summative hedonism about individual welfare and prudential rationality in this supposedly relatively early work, but likely only for the purposes of the argument, ironically or to lead protreptically toward views defended later; this hedonism seems to be rejected in the Gorgias and most explicitly at Phaedo 68Ef. and also seems clearly inconsistent with what are thought to be Plato’s later writings. A large and continuing secondary literature exists on the interpretation of this latter section of the dialogue and on whether and how it can be reconciled with view defended inj other dialogues.
  • Plato, Republic, in Plato 1997.
  • Potter, Karl (ed.), 1977, Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, Vol., II, Indian Metaphysics and Epistemology: The Tradition of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika up to Gaṇgeśa, Delhi, Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Preston, Stephanie D. and Frans B.M. de Waal, 2002, “Empathy: Its ultimate and proximate bases”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 25: 1–72. With peer commentaries and the authors’ reply.
  • Preuss, Peter, 1994, Epicurean Ethics: Katastematic Hedonism, Lewiston, New York; Queenston, Ontario; Lampeter, Wales: The Edwin Mellen Press. Ch. Six: Kinetic and Katastematic Pleasure, pp. 121–77, critically reviews earlier interpretations and presents his own at pp. 162–77.
  • Prinz, Jesse, 2004, Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotion, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Provine, Robert J., 2000, Laughter: A Scientific Investigation, New York: Viking.
  • Puccetti, Roland, 1969, “The Sensation of Pleasure”, The British Journal of the Philosophy of Science, 20(3): 239–245.
  • Putnam, Hilary, 1975, Mind, Language and Reality (Philosophical Papers, Volume 2), London: Cambridge University Press.
  • Radhakrishnan, Sarvepalli and Moore, Charles A., eds., 1957, A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Rachels, Stuart, 2004, “Six Theses about Pleasure”, Philosophical Perspectives, 18: 247–67.
  • Rainville, Pierre, 2002, “Brain mechanisms of pain affect and pain modulation,” Current Opinion in Neuorbiology, 12: 195–204.
  • Rawls, John, 1999, A Theory of Justice, 2nd ed. (1st ed., 1971); Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press. §84 is most directly relevant.
  • Rhys Davids, T.W. and Stede, William, Pali-English Dictionary, Oxford: Pali Text Society, 1921–1925, repr. 1998. There are also other reprint edition, British and Indian, of this old standard; a new dictionary in progress has not yet reached the terms of most interest here.
  • Rilling, James K., David A. Gutman, Thorsten R. Zeh, Giuseppe Pagnoni, Gregory S. Berns, and Clinton D. Kilts, 2002, “ A Neural Basis for Social Cooperation”, Neuron, 35(2): 395–405. A study purporting to show how cooperating in a seeming Prisoner’s Dilemma really pays off because it makes cooperators happier than defectors. Based on interpretation of functional brain imaging supported by subjects’ self-reports.
  • Robinson, Terry E. and Kent C. Berridge, 1993, “The neural basis of drug craving: an incentive-sensitization theory of addiction”, Brain Research Reviews, 18(3): 247–91. Probably their most explicit and interesting to philosophers; a useful Glosssary clearly explains both the standard uses of relevant terms in their field and their innovations, pp. 279–81.
  • Robinson, Terry E. and Kent C. Berridge, 2000, “The psychology and neurobiology of addiction: an incentive-sensitization view”, Addiction, 95 (Supplement 2): S91–S117.
  • Robinson, Terry E. and Kent C. Berridge, 2001, “Incentive-sensitization and addiction”, Addiction, 96: 103–114. A shorter version of their 2000.
  • Rolls, Edmund T., 1999, The Brain and Reward, New York: Oxford University Press. This book is not really about emotion, as conceived by philosophers or in ordinary language, but mainly about brain systems for reward (what an animal can be trained to perform an operant task in order to get) and motivation, thoroughly reviewed by a senior experimenter on the brains of nonhuman animals – roughly, in older psychological jargon, the territory of reinforcement and drive. Chapter 9 is on pleasure.
  • Rolls, Edmund T., 2000, ”The Orbitofrontal Cortex and Reward,“ Cerebral Cortex, 40: 284–94.
  • Rosenkranz, Melissa A., Daren C. Jackson, Kim M. Dalton, Isa Dolski, Carol D. Ryff, Burt H. Singer, Daniel Muller, Ned H. Kalin, and Richard J. Davidson, 2003, “Affective style and in vivo immune response: Neurobehavioral mechanisms”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences of the U.S.A., 100: 11148–11152.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1921, The Analysis of Mind, London: Unwin and New York: Macmillan. Pp. 69–72 are relevant; Russell defines pleasure behaviorally and, quoting the neurologist Henry Head, adopts his distinction between pain and ‘discomfort’, based on observations of soldiers wounded in World War I.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1930/1968, The Conquest of Happiness, New York: Liveright, 1930 (New York: Bantam Books reprint, 1980). Ostensibly written as a self-help book free of deep philosophy, it is still worth reading, not only for its wise practical advice, nonetheless.
  • Russell, Daniel, 2005, Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Russell, James A., 1991, “Culture and the Categorization of Emotions”, Psychological Bulletin, 110(3): 426–50. Survey of wide array of evidence supporting positive/negative categorization of affect, by a major and sophisticated proponent. Wierzbicka’s later synthesis of the linguistic data (1999) should be more up-to-date on that.
  • Russell, James A., 2003, “Core Affect and the Psychological Construction of Emotion,” Psychological Review, 110(1): 145–72. Russell’s core affect is supposed to be in itself objectless but always conscious, whereas Berridge’s core affective processes are supposed to be in themselves unconscious as well.
  • Russell, James A. and Barrett, Lisa Feldman, 1999, “Core affect, prototypical emotional episodes, and other things called emotion: Dissecting the elephant”, Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 76(5): 805–819. A sophisticated attempt to show how apparently competing approaches to the classification of emotion, the dimensional approach to which Russell is a major contributor and the discrete emotions approach supported, for example, by Ekman and Panksepp, can fit together. This special journal section (Diener 1999), mainly on the dimensional approach, is a good place to see the state of play then on Russell’s ‘bipolar’ (positive vs. negative affect on the same dimension) approach.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1949, The Concept of Mind, London: Hutchinson, 1949. Chapter IV, ”Emotion“, and especially its §6, “Enjoying and Wanting”, started the mid-century Anglo-American literature with its quasi-behaviorist strong denial that there are occurrent episodes of pleasure. Often in an assertive rhetorical tone.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1951, “Feelings”, Philosophical Quarterly 1,3:193–205, repr. in his 1971, pp. 272–86.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1954a, “Pleasure”, Ch. 4 in Dilemmas: The Tarner Lectures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 54–67. His largest collection of considerations against the view that pleasure is an occurrence in experience, mainly at pp. 58–61. Some strong claims taken by followers to be obvious and based on ordinary English usage may, perhaps, be traced to other sources. That pleasure is inseparable from its object (p. 61) may derive (aside from grammatical transitivity) from the supposed results of intropectionist psychology reported in Duncker 1941 (see annotation there). The very strongly hedged claim, that pleasure is not an episode since it cannot be independently clocked and one cannot be pleased quickly (pp. 58–60), seems to draw a conclusion that pleasure is not an occurrent state in part from Aristotelian premises that do not, at least obviously, support it. The relevant Aristotelian view is that pleasure is not a process but an activity that, like seeing, is complete in each of its (experiential?) moments. E.g., at any moment of seeing or enjoying one can truly say that one has already seen or enjoyed oneself, while it is not generally true that when one is building a house that one has already built it (e.g., NE 1174a13–b14). It has not, apparently, been similarly argued on such grounds that there are no experiential episodes of seeing (an example of Aristotle’s which he sees as parallel to pleasure) or of tasting, or that a dispositionalist rather than an occurent state account of these is therefore true, although these would seem equally to follow. But Ryle may be more influenced by the difficulty of attending to describable features of pleasure (on which see §1.3, last two paragraphs) and by its consequences in introspectionist psychology.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1954b, “Pleasure”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 28 (Supplementary Volume): 135–146; repr. in his 1971, pp. 325–35. Ryle’s most tentative yet most constructive treatment, emphasizing more than his other writings on pleasure his positive view that pleasure is a manner or kind of attention or interest. It is strongly reminiscent of Aristotle.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1971, Collected Papers (Volume II: Collected Essays, 1929–1968), London: Hutchinson & Co.
  • Scanlon, T.M., “Replies” Social Theory and Practice, 28(2): 337–58.
  • Scherer, Klaus R., 2003, Introduction to “Cognitive Components of Emotion” section in Davidson, Scherer and Goldsmith 2003, (Handbook), pp. 141–55
  • Schlick, Moritz, 1930/1939, Fragen der Ethik, Vienna: Springer, 1930. Trans. by David Rynin as Problems of Ethics, New York: Prentice-Hall, 1939. The classic statement of the motivation by pleasant thoughts variety of hedonist motivation psychology is in Ch. II.
  • Schroeder, Timothy, 2001, “Pleasure, Displeasure and Representation,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 31(4): 507–30.
  • Schroeder, Timothy, 2004, Three Faces of Desire, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schultz, Wolfram, 2000, “Multiple Reward Signals in the Brain”, Nature Reviews Neuroscience, 1: 201–7.
  • Schultz, Wolfram and Dickinson, Anthony, 2000, “Neuronal Coding of Prediction Errors,” Annual Review of Neuroscience, 23: 473–500. Leading scientists review the literature on how dopamine neurons serve as teachers or critics in learning and also show this function is not unique to dopamine neurons but is widespread.
  • Scitovsky, Tibor, 1992/1976, The Joyless Economy: The Psychology of Human Satisfaction, rev. ed, New York: Oxford University Press. An economist’s case against what he takes to be the counterproductive contemporary pursuit of stable comfort at the expense of pleasure, which he takes to be felt transition toward optimal arousal level. The revised edition contains no updating of the old science. Kahneman 1999, pp. 13ff., provides some discussion and references toward updating the science and reappraising Scitovsky’s claims, discussed briefly in n. 31.
  • Sen, Amartya, 1985, Commodities and Capabilities Amsterdam: North-Holland. An Aristotelian-type view of well-being is deployed to produce a measure of social distributive justice.
  • Seneca, Lucius Annaeus, 1917–25 (1st century B.C.E.), Ad lucilium epistolae morales, with trans. by Richard M. Gummere, 3 vols., Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press and London: Heinemann. The influential Roman Stoic’s mature reflections on ethics in the form of letters to a young friend.
  • Shackman, Alexander J., “Anterior Cerebral Asymmetry, Affect, and Psychopathology: Commentary on the Approach-Withdrawal Model”, in Davidson 2000b, pp. 104–32.
  • Sherrington, Charles, 1906/1947, The Integrative Action of the Nervous System, New Haven, Yale University Press. (Original publication: New York: Scribner, 1906.) Later reprints follow the pagination of the 1947 edition, which prefixes a new author’s Foreword to the reset 1906 text.
  • Shizgal, Peter, 1997, “Neural basis of utility estimation”, Current Opinion in Neurobiology, 7: 198–208.
  • Shizgal, Peter, 1999, “On the Neural Computation of Utility: Implications from Studies of Brain Stimulation Reward”, in Kahneman, Diener and Schwarz, 1999, pp. 500–524.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1907, Methods of Ethics, 7th ed., London: Macmillan; 1st ed. 1874. The culminating work of the British hedonistic utilitarian tradition and one of the all-time greats of moral philosophy. Book I, ch. iv and Book II are especially relevant.
  • Siewert, Charles, 2011, “Consciousness and Intentionality”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Smith, Adam, 1790/1976, The Theory of Moral Sentiments, D.D. Raphael and A.L. Macfie, eds., London, Oxford University Press.
  • Smart, J.J.C. and Williams, Bernard, 1973, Utilitarianism: for and against, London: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smuts, Aaron, 2011, “The feels good theory of pleasure”, Philosophical Studies, 155: 241–65.
  • Sobel, David, 1999, “Pleasure as a Mental State”, Utilitas, 11(2) (July 1999): 230–234. Criticism of Katz 1986 and Kagan 1992 from a desire-based standpoint on both pleasure and reasons.
  • Solomon, Robert C. and Stone, Lori D., 2002, “On ‘Positive’ and ‘Negative’ Emotions”, Journal of the Theory of Social Behavior, 32(2): 417–35. While many of their complaints about failures to distinguish different psychological and evaluative distinctions in the softer psychological literature and about the misleading terminology (seeming to presuppose these are opposite poles or contraries) are well-placed, the seeming rejection of the centrality of a single distinction between positive and negative affect in the affective sciences is at least very premature. The harder evidence supporting it (e.g., opposite immune system effects, cerebral asymmetries in studies of mood, temperament [see Rosenkranz et al. 2003 for recent results and earlier references] and psychopathology [Davidson and Pizzagalli 2002]) is not even considered here.
  • Sorabji, Richard, 2000, Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation: The Gifford Lectures, New York: Oxford University Press. Part I, Emotions as Judgments versus Irrational Forces, pp. 16–155, summarized in the Introduction at pp. 2–7, is a good discussion of whether all affect can be reduced to judgment. While Sorabji emphasizes the important ancient debate provoked by the claim of Chrysippus that emotions (including pleasure and joy) are judgments, there is some discussion of recent philosophical and scientific literature as well.
  • Spinoza, Benedictus de (Baruch), 1677, Ethica Ordine Geometrico Demonstrata in Carl Gebhardt, 4 vols., Spinoza Opera, Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925. Cited passages in Vol. II, pp. 148–49, 191. Of the recent English translators, Richard Shirley (Hackett, 1982) and G.H.R. Parkinson (Oxford, 2000) translate Spinoza’s “laetitia” by “pleasure”, but Edwin Curley by “joy”, following the “joie” of Descartes’ Les Passions de l’Âme (Princeton University Press, in Collected Works, Vol. I, 1985, pp. 500–501, 531; also in his A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works, Princeton, 1994).
  • Stocker, Michael with Hegeman, Elizabeth, 1996, Valuing Emotions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Strack, Fritz; Argyle, Michael; and Schwarz, Norbert, eds., 1991, Subjective well-being: an interdisciplinary perspective, Oxford: Pergamon. Provides an entry into the social psychology self-report literature, some of which deals with pleasure. This literature tends to show subjects’ self-ratings of well-being or happiness are based partly on pleasure, partly on the absence of negative affect, and partly on their views of how well they are achieving the ends they regard as important in life (their ‘life satisfaction’). For new publications in this literature, check the Journal of Happiness Studies, (Kluwer, 2000+).
  • Strick, Peter L., 2004, “Basal Ganglia and Cerebellar Circuits with the Cerebral Cortex”, in Gazzaniga 2004, pp. 453–61.
  • Striker, Gisela, 1993, “Epicurean Hedonism”, in Passions and Perceptions; Studies in Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind; Proceedings of the Fifth Symposium Hellenisticum, Jacques Brunschwig and Martha Nussbaum (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 3–18. Reprinted in her Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996, pp. 196–208.
  • Sumner, L. W., 1996, Welfare, Happiness, and Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Ch. 4, “Hedonism”, pp. 81–112 defends an attitude view (of ‘enjoyment’) and opposes others on the way to theses in ethics.
  • Sutton, Steven K. and Davidson, Richard J., 1997, “Prefrontal brain asymmetry: A biological substrate of the behavioral approach and inhibition systems”, Psychological Science, 8(3): 204–10.
  • Sutton, Steven K. and Davidson, Richard J, 2000, “Prefrontal brain electrical asymmetry predicts the evaluation of affective stimuli”, Neuropsychologia, 38(13): 1723–1733.
  • Tanyi, Attila, 2010, “Sobel on Pleasure, Reason, and Desire”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 14: 101–15.
  • Taylor, C.C.W., 1963, “Pleasure”, Analysis, 23 (Supplement): 3–19. Refines Ryle’s account of enjoyment while admitting other supposedly less central or important kinds of pleasure as well.
  • Thayer, Robert E., 1989, The Biopsychology of Mood and Arousal, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Thayer, Robert E, 1996, The origin of everyday moods: understanding and managing energy and tension, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Titchener, Edward Bradford, 1908, Lectures on the Elementary Psychology of Feeling and Attention, New York: Macmillan. Ch. IV, “The Tridimensional Theory of Feeling and Emotion”, is a long, chatty, account of the evolution of Wundt’s writings and views, with extensive quotations in his original German, by the last major representative of the introspectionist school of early academic experimental psychology.
  • Tomkins, Silvan S., 1962, Affect, Imagery, Consciousness, Vol. I: The Positive Affects, New York: Springer Publishing Company.
  • Tracy, Jessica L. and Robins, Richard W., 2004, “Show Your Pride: Evidence for a Discrete Emotion Expression”, Psychological Science, 15(3): 194–97.
  • Trigg, Roger, 1970, Pain and Emotion, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Ch. VI, “Is Pleasure a Sensation”, pp. 102–24, is most relevant. The most substantial contribution of the ordinary language tradition to the study of affect. An excellent, underread book, perhaps still the best philosophical discussion of the dissociation of emotional reactions from sensory pain, which neurologists and some philosophers became saliently aware of in result of reactions to battlefield injury and evacuation in World War I. What he says about pain seems mainly to be consistent with science to date.
  • Tye, Michael, 1995, Ten Problems of Consciousness: A Representational Theory of the Phenomenal Mind, Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press. Pp. 128–30 are on our topic.
  • Urry, Heather L.; Nichols, Jack B; Dolski, Isa; Jackson, Daren C.; Dalton, Kim M.; Mueller, Corrina J.; Rosenkranz, Melissa A.; Ryff, Carol D., Singer, Burton H.; and Davidson, Richard J., “Making a Life Worth Living: Neural Correlates of Well-Being”, Psychological Science, 15(6): 367–71.
  • Van Riel, Gerd, 1999, “Does a Perfect Activity Necessarily Yield Pleasure? An Evaluation of the Relation between Pleasure and Perfect Activity in Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics VII and X”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 7(2): 211–24.
  • Van Riel, Gerd, 2000a, Pleasure and the Good Life: Plato, Aristotle, and the Neoplatonists, Leiden: Brill, 2000. Especially pp. 7–37 on Plato and 43–78 on Aristotle. Concise account of the Epicureans and Stoics, too.
  • Van Riel, Gerd, 2000b, “Aristotle’s Definition of Pleasure: a Refutation of the Platonic Account”, Ancient Philosophy, 20(1): 119–138.
  • Vasubandhu (c. 400 C.E. Buddhist), 1923–31. L’abhidharmakośa de Vasubandhu, tr. and annotated in French by Louis de la Vallée Poussin, Paris and Louvain: Paul Geuthner, 1923–31, 6 vols., repr. Brussells: Institut Belge des Hautes Études Chinoises, 1971. A less satisfactory translation into English from this French translation, itself based mainly on an ancient Chinese translation from the original Sanskrit which has since been largely recovered, is that of L.M. Pruden, Abhidharmakośabhāṣyam, Berkeley, California: Asian Humanities Press, 1988–90.
  • Vasubandhu (c. 400 C.E. Buddhist), 1984, “A Discourse of the Five Aggregates” (Pañcaskandhaka), in Stefan Anacker (trans. and ed.), Seven Works of Vasubandhu, The Buddhist Psychological Doctor, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, pp. 65–82.
  • Voruganti, Lakshmi; Slomka, Piotr;, Zabel, Pamela; Costa, Giuseppe; So, Aaron; Mattar, Adel; and Awad, George A., 2001, “Subjective Effects of AMPT-induced Dopamine Depletion in Schizophrenia: Correlation between Dysphoric Responses and Striatal D2 Binding Ratios on SPECT Imaging”, Neuropsychopharmacology, 25(5): 642–50. Has relevant recent references. Supports the dopamine pleasure interpretation. Caution: Wise 1996 is reported in terms of pleasure, whereas he had by then abandoned such interpretation and uses there only the behavioral term “reward”. But in this study, with human patients, feeling bad when dopamine-depleted by anti-psychotic medication may be checked more directly than in Wise’s animal studies.
  • Voznesensky, Andrei (1967/1966), “Oza”, in Antiworlds and the Fifth Ace: Poetry by Andrei Voznesensky: A Bilingual Edition, Patricia Blake and Max Hayward (eds.), New York: Basic Books.
  • Wacker, Jan; Heldmann, Marcus; Stemmler, Gerhard, 2003, “Separating Emotion and Motivational Direction in Fear and Anger: Effects on Frontal Asymmetry”, Emotion, 3(2): 167–193.
  • Walther von der Vogelweide, c. 1227, “Elegie”. There are many editions and reprintings in anthologies.
  • Warner, Richard, 1987, Freedom, Enjoyment, and Happiness: An Essay in Moral Psychology, Ithaca and London: Cornell Univeristy Press. A cognitive definition of enjoyment, in terms of belief and desire, is at p. 129. Purports to develop a ‘Kantian’ approach, but this is an analysis in terms of belief and desire quite unlike Kant’s own treatment, which provides rough functional characterizations but no analysis because he took pleasure to be undefinable. See under Kant for citations.
  • Watkins, Calvert rev. and ed., 2000, The American Heritage Dictionary of Indo-European Roots, 2d ed. Boston and New York: Houghton Mifflin, 2000. Much of its content is available as an appendix to the American Heritage Dictionary of the English Language.
  • Watson, David, 2000, Mood and Temperament, New York and London: The Guilford Press. A very accessible summary of some of the easier relevant science.
  • Wierzbicka, Anna, 1999, Emotions Across Languages and Cultures: Diversity and Universals, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press; Paris: Editions de la Maison des Sciences de l’Homme.
  • Wierzbicka, Anna and Jean Harkins, 2001, Introduction to Harkins and Wierzbicka, 2001, pp. 1–34.
  • William of Ockham, 2001, (c. 1317–26), “Using and Enjoying”, trans. Stephen Arthur McGrade, in Arthur Stephen McGrade, John Kilcullen and Matthew Kempshall, eds., The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. Two, Ethics and Political Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 351–417. This translates Questions 1–4 and 6 of Distinction 1 of his Ordinatio, a commentary on the first book of the Sentences of Peter Lombard. Original Latin text: Guillelmi de Ockham (William of Ockham), Scriptum in librum primum Sententiarum Ordinatio, Gedeon Gál (ed. with the assistance of Stephen Brown), 4 vols., St. Bonaventure, New York: Franciscan Institute, 1967, Vol. I, Prologus et Distinctio Prima, pp. 371–447, 486–507. These are Vols. I-IV in their edition of Ockham’s Opera Theologica.
  • Williams, Bernard, 1959, “Pleasure and Belief”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 73 (Supplement): 73–92; reprinted in Philosophy of Mind, Stuart Hampshire (ed.), Philosophy of Mind, New York: Harper and Row, 1966, pp. 225–42.
  • Willner, Paul, 2002, “Dopamine and Depression”, in Gaetano Di Chiara (ed.), Handbook of Experimental Pharmacology, Vol. 154/II: Dopamine in the CNS II, Berlin: Springer, 2002, pp. 387–416.
  • Winkielman, Piotr; Berridge, Kent C. 2004; “Unconscious Emotion”, Current Directions in Psychological Science, 13(3): 120–23.
  • Winkielman, Piotr; Berridge, Kent C; and Wilbarger, Julia L. 2005; “Emotion, Behavior, and Conscious Experience: Once More without Feeling”, in Barrett, Niedenthal, and Winkielman 2005, pp. 335–62.
  • Wise, 1982, “Neuroleptics and operant behavior: the anhedonia hypothesis”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 5(1): 39–87. With peer commentaries. A case for the pleasure interpretation of activity in the midbrain dopamine projections. The bold interpretation is withdrawn in his 1994 and 1999, which give some reasons, but others still hold similar views and there seems to be at least some causal connection.
  • Wise, Roy A., 1994, “A brief history of the anhedonia hypothesis”, in Appetite: Neural and Behavioral Bases, Charles R. Legg and David Booth (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 243–63. A former leading advocate of the pleasure interpretation of the consequences of mesolimbic dopamine, in the 1980s, recants, with reasons, more of which may be found in his 1999.
  • Wise, Roy A., 1999, “Cognitive factors in addiction and nucleus accumbens function: Some hints from rodent models”, Psychobiology, 27(2): 300–10. This journal issue has articles presenting various views on the functions of the mesolimbic dopamine system, none of which support the pleasure interpretation.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1968, Philosophical Investigations, trans. G.E.M. Anscombe, 3rd ed., Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1980, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 1, G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell. From his notebooks. Overlaps with material published as Zettel.
  • Wolfsdorf, David, Pleasure in Ancient Greek Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013.
  • Wundt, Wilhelm, 1896/1897, Grundriß der Psychologie, 1896, Leipzig: Wilhelm Engelmann; Trans. as Outlines of Psychology, Charles Hubbard Judd, trans., Leipzig: Wilhelm Engelmann, 1897. Many libraries have reprint editions. Later editions and other writings of Wundt’s are compared with this first edition’s original presentation of the tridimensional view of affect (in its §7; Judd trans., pp. 74–89, especially pp. 82–85) in Titchener, 1908, ch. IV.
  • Young, Paul Thomas, 1959, “The role of affective processes in learning and motivation”, Psychological Bulletin, 66: 104–25. Distinguishes hedonic from sensory intensity.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 1980, “Feeling and Thinking: Preferences Need No Inferences”, American Psychologist, 35: 151–175.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 1984, “On the primacy of affect”, American Psychologist, 39: 117–124.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 1994, “Evidence for Nonconscious Emotions”, in The Nature of Emotion: Fundamental Questions, Paul Ekman and Richard J. Davidson, eds., New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 293–97. (This and the other short papers and the editors’ Afterword in the same section of this reader, Question 8: “Can Emotion Be Nonconscious?”, pp. 283–318, afford a mix of empirical and conceptual considerations. The term “nonconscious” is sometimes misleading in the work of Zajonc and his collaborators when what is clearly established in the experimental results referred to seems to be rather affect that is not firmly bound to an object when explicit awareness was earlier lacking either of the thing that fails to be the affect’s object or of its causing the affect. Cf. Zajonc 2000, pp. 47–48; Berridge and Winkielman 2003, pp. 185–86; Berridge 2002. Some phenomena Zajonc is concerned with seem to be only nonconscious causation, or conditioning, of future emotional memory or reactions. But Zajonc, whose major 1980s claim was about the independence of affect from (sophisticated) cognition, apparently wants to emphasize that point by calling this fast and automatic processing of stimuli without awareness of these or of their result “emotion”. Beyond this, it may be necessary to distinguish different uses of “nonconscious emotion”, corresponding to distinctions between phenomenal and cognitive concepts of consciousness made, for example, in Block 1995 and 2002. For an empirically-founded attempt to connect a related distinction to the neurobiology of the cingulate cortex, see Lane 2000, pp. 358–60. For perspectives on relevant observations, beyond those cited by Zajonc, see the discussion in Berridge 1999, 2004 and Shizgal 1999.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 1998, “Emotions”, in The Handbook of Social Psychology, 2 vols., 4th ed., eds., Daniel T. Gilbert, Susan T. Fiske and Gardner Lindzey, Boston: McGraw-Hill, Vol. 1, pp. 591–632. Good overall review of the evidence for the relative independence of affect systems from sophisticated cognition by an early advocate of this in an introduction to many aspects of the subject, including cultural influences and the differences these may make for affect.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 2000, “Feeling and Thinking: Closing the Debate Over the Independence of Affect”, in Feeling and Thinking: The Role of Affect in Social Cognition, Joseph P. Forgas (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; Paris: Editions de la Maison des Sciences de l’Homme, pp. 31–58.


I am grateful to Ned Block, David Chalmers, and Daniel Stoljar for their suggestions during an earlier revision and to Arindam Chakrabarti and Arthur Stephen McGrade for the help acknowledged in notes 26 and 20, respectively.

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Leonard D. Katz <>

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