Samuel Clarke

First published Sat Apr 5, 2003; substantive revision Wed Aug 22, 2018

Samuel Clarke (1675–1729) was the most influential British metaphysician and theologian in the generation between Locke and Berkeley, and only Shaftesbury rivals him in ethics. In all three areas he was very critical of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Toland. Deeply influenced by Newton, Clarke was critical of Descartes’ metaphysics of space and body because of the experimental evidence for Newtonianian doctrines of space, the vacuum, atoms, and attraction and because he believed Descartes’ identifying body with extension and removing final causes from nature had furthered irreligion and had naturally developed into Spinozism.

Clarke sided with Locke and Newton against Descartes in denying that we have knowledge of the essence of substances, even though we can be sure that there are at least two kinds of substances (mental and material) because their properties (thinking and divisibility) are incompatible. He defended natural religion against the naturalist view that nature constitutes a self-sufficient system and defended revealed religion against deism. Clarke adopted Newton’s natural philosophy early on. Through his association with Newton, Clarke was the de facto spokesperson for Newtonianism in the first half the eighteenth century, not only explaining the natural science but also providing a metaphysical support and theological interpretation for it.

In what follows, we use “W” as an abbreviation to cite passages from the four-volume The Works, edited posthumously by Benjamin Hoadly. Two recent editions of Clarke’s major works are more widely available and thus cited here as well: “D” for passages in A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Other Writings in Vailati (1998), and “CC” for passages in The Correspondence of Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins (Uzgalis (ed.) 2011). References to the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence (available in many print and online editions) include the letter and section number preceded by an “L” for Leibniz and “C” for Clarke (e.g., L 1.4 refers to Leibniz’s first letter, section four).

1. Life and Works

Samuel Clarke was born on October 11, 1675, in Norwich, England to Edward Clarke (a cloth merchant, alderman, and representative in Parliament) and Hannah, daughter of Samuel Parmenter, a merchant (Hoadly 1730, i). He took his B.A. degree at Cambridge in 1695 by defending Newton’s views, which were not yet widely accepted. His oral defense “suprized the Whole Audience, both for the Accuracy of Knowledge, and Clearness of Expression, that appeared through the Whole” (Hoadly 1730, iii-iv).

His tutor, Sir John Ellis, a Cartesian, apparently encouraged Clarke to provide a new annotated Latin translation of Rohault’s Treatise of Physics. The 1697 translation included Clarke’s Newtonian notes that criticized Rohault’s Cartesian text. The edition’s success rapidly expanded the understanding of Newtonian physics, and later editions became the standard physics textbook in England. In that same year, Clarke befriended William Whiston, who probably introduced Clarke into the Newtonian circle. These early years show Clarke’s interest in theology as well; he published Three practical essays on baptism, confirmation, and repentance (1699), A Paraphrase on the Four Evangelists (1701–1702), and Some Reflections on that Part of a Book called Amyntor (1699), a response to John Toland’s critique of the New Testament canon. These all demonstrate Clarke’s early interest in “primitive Christianity” (Christianity as practiced and believed in its first two hundred years), which would be central to his theological vision and would lead to the confrontations over the doctrine of the trinity in the 1710s.

The middle years of his career mark his greatest philosophical contributions, beginning with the Boyle lectures (delivered 1704 and 1705). The first, an attempt to prove the existence of God, along with all divine attributes, was published as A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God (1705) and the second, a continuation intended to establish all fundamental moral truths and most religious doctrine, as A discourse concerning the unchangeable obligations of natural religion, and the truth and certainty of the Christian revelation (1706). They both went through many editions and were often published together. These lectures, established by Robert Boyle to promote natural religion based on the latest scientific developments, were closely watched, and Clarke instantly became one of the most well known philosophers in England. Also in 1706, his association with Newton became official when he translated the Opticks into Latin. In the meantime, he had been introduced to Queen Anne, who made him one of her chaplains in 1706, and three years later he was elevated to the rectory of St. James’s, Westminster. After the Hanoverian accession, Clarke developed a close relationship with Caroline of Ansbach, the Princess of Wales and future queen. His prominence as a philosopher drew him into a series of very public exchanges of letters. The most notable of these were the letters to Anthony Collins (1707–1708) and the letters to Leibniz (1715–1716) (see below).

In the later years of his life, Clarke published popular works of theology, notable translations of Caesar, and a royally appointed translation of the Iliad. Each of his major publications went through multiple editions, often with substantial revision. He died in 1729 after a very short illness, consistent with a stroke (Sykes 1729, 10). He was survived by his wife Katherine and five of his seven children. Clarke was a polite and courtly man, vivacious with his friends, and reportedly fond of playing cards.

1.1 Authorship in the Correspondence with Leibniz

Before Caroline of Ansbach became the Princess of Wales, she was tutored by Leibniz. Leibniz did not join her in England, and they corresponded across the channel. In one of these letters he attacked prominent views in England that Leibniz considered dangerous to natural religion. After mentioning materialism and Lockean doubts about the soul, Leibniz chastises Newton twice. (Newton and Leibniz had sparred earlier over the priority of discovery of the calculus.) Clarke, who with Newton was attending Caroline’s court, came to Newton’s defense. A series of five letters passed through Caroline between Leibniz and Clarke over a wide range of issues. Caroline is significant not only for her contributions to framing the debate for each correspondent but also as an important context for understanding the letters (Meli 1999). Leibniz is trying to maintain Caroline’s commitment to his system, while Newton and especially the more sociable Clarke are working to convert her with arguments and experimental demonstrations in person. She continued to challenge Clarke and pledge loyalty to Leibniz until his death, but starting around the time of the third letter, it seems that Clarke had won her over at least to the existence of the vacuum, which would be difficult to maintain without going for the rest of the Clarkean-Newtonian picture (Brown 2004, 93–98).

Today the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence is easily Clarke’s most often read work, which is unfortunately usually published without the cover letters to and from Caroline. However, there has long been a dispute over Newton’s role in the authorship of the letters. Leibniz suspected and Caroline confirmed that Newton at least read Clarke’s letters before sending them and provided “advice” (Alexander 1956, 189 and 193; Brewster 1855, 287–288). Since then, scholarly opinion has ranged from Newton’s ghostwriting all the letters himself (Koyré and Cohen 1961, 560ff) to Clarke writing the letters and merely showing them to Newton to make sure there was no disagreement over the scientific information (Vailati 1997, 4–5). This point is not easily decidable, in part because Newton and Clarke were neighbors and thus almost no correspondence survives between them, presumably since they would meet in person. Current opinion has shifted toward attributing most of the philosophical arguments to Clarke, with the blessing of Newton, a move sparked in part by a reappraisal in recent years of Clarke’s status as an original philosopher.

In reading the letters to Leibniz, it is helpful to remember that the views being defended might not belong only to Clarke or only to Newton, so attribution to a single figure might be misguided. What we have might be the intersection of their views, or they might be views that Newton held privately but did not yet want to avow publicly, or they might be a mixture of some of Clarke’s views and some of Newton’s views. In some cases, we can see links to other publications by Newton and Clarke. For instance, space as a sensorium (organ of sensation) of God, which Leibniz ridiculed in his first letter to Caroline, appeared first in Newton’s Principia and Opticks and not in Clarke’s other works. (Clarke tries to argue that Newton does not believe that space is the sensorium of God, but Koyré and Cohen [1961, 563–566] argue that Newton did believe it and tried to disguise or soften the view in publication.) Also, there are arguments based on the principle of sufficient reason, which Clarke employed in his Boyle lectures twelve years earlier, but do not play a role in Newton’s publications. Other cases are more difficult to connect to Newton’s and Clarke’s other works, such as the famous passage in which space is called “an immediate and necessary consequence of the existence of God,” since “consequence” is not a term usually used by either Clarke or Newton on this issue.

2. Major Themes in Clarke

Three major themes run through all of Clarke’s philosophical works: Newtonianism, anti-naturalism, and rationalism.

2.1 Newtonianism and Anti-Naturalism

There is a widespread agreement that Newton influenced Clarke. Newton was thirty years Clarke’s senior, and their relationship (post-1704) might best be thought of as a mentorship. Newton and Clarke likely held similar views about God’s role in the world, but Newton was hesitant to state these positions publicly, and he may have used the Boyle lectures to promote these views (Force 1984; 522–526). Many have thought he supported Clarke’s interpretations and defenses on matters scientific and also theological (Jacob 1976; 242). In private correspondence, such as the letters to Bentley of December 10, 1692, and January 17, 1693, he entertains views similar to those that Clarke would later proclaim. Whiston (1728) reports that when asked why he did not publicly announce them, Newton said, “He saw those Consequences; but thought it better to let his Readers draw them first of themselves,” at least until the “General Scholium” was published in later editions of the Principia. However, it is also possible that Clarke influenced Newton. Newton, at least, endorsed publicly views that had been previously published by Clarke, especially in the “General Scholium” of 1713, which was seen to endorse Clarkean arguments about the nature of God (Stewart 1996; Snobelen 2001, 14–18).

On scientific, philosophical, and especially theological grounds, Clarke believed Newtonian natural philosophy to be superior to all alternatives. Clarke saw in Newtonianism a world that could only exist by a free act of God. Matter is dispersed sparingly throughout empty space, gravity is universal to matter but not inherent in it, and the universe is ordered according to rules that are neither absolutely necessary nor chaotic. Clarke concluded that the laws of nature do not describe the powers of matter, which is just dead mass constantly pushed around, but modalities of operation of the divine power. Clarke’s position is similar to that of the occasionalists, who also denied that matter had the power to move itself and that the only thing with such power is God. Matter has no power of self-motion, so to explain motion, one must appeal to immaterial souls (divine and human). Thus, nature is not a self-sufficient system; without direct and constant divine physical intervention planets would fly away from their orbits and atoms would break into their components. Thus, the naturalist attempt to describe the world solely by the arrangement and matter in motion is doomed to failure on scientific and metaphysical grounds and must give way to a world with an active God. This is why “the foundations of natural religion had never been so deeply and firmly laid, as in the mathematical and experimental philosophy of that great man” (W4.582). Newton’s natural philosophy could thus be the argumentative basis for Clarke’s preferred religious and social views (Stewart 1981).

For three decades, Clarke was the leading voice on the metaphysical and theological implications of Newtonianism, confirmed when Newton himself seemed to endorsed publicly the fundamentals of Clarke’s interpretation in the revisions to the Principia.

2.2 Rationalism

Clarke adopted some form of rationalism in metaphysics, ethics, and theology, as exhibited in his methodology, his account of ethical truths, and in his acceptance of a fundamental rationalist principle, the principle of sufficient reason. The principle of sufficient reason was used both in Clarke’s positive metaphysical arguments and was assumed in his arguments against other philosophers, especially Spinoza, whom he chastises for failing to explain the diversity of things that exist (Yenter 2014).

Clarke is also an ethical rationalist. Ethical truths are discoverable through reason and correspond to necessary and eternal relations among things in the world. He also calls ethical truths “truths of reason.” His theology is also rationalist, in that through reason one can discover the many truths contained in natural religion. Furthermore, true Christian doctrines are neither mysterious nor self-contradictory, and nearly all can be comprehended by human beings.

Most importantly, the Demonstration makes great use of the principle of sufficient reason, which motivates the cosmological argument, and he explicitly and repeatedly avows it in the correspondence with Leibniz (C 3.2, W 4.606). It is not mentioned in the correspondence with Collins, but he there adopts principles that can be derived from it. Clarke’s understanding of the principle of sufficient reason differs notably from Leibniz’s formulation, with whom it is more frequently associated. This was a major source of contention in their correspondence. Clarke asserts that the sufficient reason why something exists as it does may be due to the “mere Will” of God and nothing more (C 3.2, W 4.606–607; C 5.124–130, W 4.700). This involves two claims. First, in cases of complete indifference (such as God choosing where to place the world in the infinite expanse of absolute space), God is capable of acting even if there is no reason to prefer one option over another. Second, a free will is able to refrain from acting on what reason presents to it as best to do. As a consequence of these, Clarke denies the identity of indiscernibles. This is significant for Clarke’s Newtonianism, because if space is real and absolute, then the identity of indiscernibles must be false because regions of space are indiscernible with respect to their intrinsic and (prior to the creation of the world) their extrinsic properties. Clarke may also have felt the need to accommodate indiscernible atoms, which Newton seemed to allow. (Clarke defends atomism in the letters to Leibniz, but in his other works he claims that all matter is infinitely divisible.) Because Clarke denies the identity of indiscernibles and affirms libertarianism, Leibniz claims that Clarke grants the principle of sufficient reason “only in Words, and in reality denies it. Which shews that he does not fully perceive the Strength of it” (L 3.2, W 4.601). In response, Clarke argues that if Leibniz is right then a free agent would be merely passive because determined to do what reason presents, but a “passive agent” is a contradiction since the concept of agency includes the concept of activity. Leibniz was never satisfied with Clarke’s position and by the fifth letter he was more explicit than previously that the principle of sufficient reason and the principle of the identity of indiscernibles are not independent but the latter is derived from the former (L 5.21), and in the fifth letter’s cover letter, sent to Princess Caroline, Leibniz asserts, “If [Clarke] does not entirely accept the received great principle that nothing happens without there being a sufficient reason why it happens thus rather than otherwise, I could not help doubting his sincerity, and if he grants it then farewell to the philosophy of Monsieur Newton” (quoted in Khamara 2006, 4).

Clarke’s rationalism is tempered by his discussions of faith in reason, especially in his writings against the Deists. Against the Deists, who generally expected all necessary moral and religious truths to be discoverable by reason, Clarke asserted that revealed religion (also called special revelation) provided information necessary for salvation (W 2.666–667). While special revelation involved “supplying the deficiencies” of “right reason,” it could not contradict reason (W 2.669).

3. Metaphysics

3.1 Absolute and Infinite Space and Time

According to Clarke, the ideas of space and time are the two “first and most obvious simple Ideas, that every man has in his mind” (D 114, W 2.752), anticipating the first step in an argument made famous by Kant. Drawing on an argument from Newton (1726, 410), he argued that while matter can be thought of as non-existing, space exists necessarily because “to suppose any part of space removed, is to suppose it removed from and out of itself: and to suppose the whole to be taken away, is supposing it to be taken away from itself, that is, to be taken away while it still remains: which is a contradiction in terms” (D 13, W 2.528). Space is also not an aggregate of its parts but an essential whole preceding all it parts.

Absolute space was allegedly demanded by Newtonian physics. Space is an entity in which things are, and not the mere absence of matter. All finite beings occupy an absolute position in space and time that we may or may not be able to establish because we have no direct access to absolute space and time. Although space is not sensible, Clarke rejected its identification with nothingness, since space has properties: quantity and dimension, and perhaps homogeneity, immutability, continuity, and the ability to contain matter. Law (1758, 10) objects that this makes no more sense than saying that darkness has qualities because it has the property of receiving light.

Clarke believed that space is necessarily infinite because “to set bounds to space, is to suppose it bounded by something which itself takes up space” or else that “it is bounded by nothing, and then the idea of that nothing will still be space,” and both suppositions are contradictory (D 115, W 2.753). Clarke apparently thought that what has a boundary must be bounded by something else. If so, the argument was not well taken because a sphere, for example, has a boundary which stems from its own nature, not by the presence of something external bounding it (Vailati 2006, 111). One possible solution is to appeal to space’s peculiar nature as a property of an infinite God, which would require that it be boundless in virtue of God’s possible activity being boundless (W 1.47), but this might reverse the proper order of explanation or beg the question. (For more on the relationship of God to space, see Section 4.2 below.) He also argues that because existence or being is a perfection, existing in more places is a greater perfection, so God (as the most perfect being) must exist in all places (W 1.46–47). Another possible solution is to appeal to the principle of sufficient reason: any finite limit would be arbitrary, and thus in violation of the principle. Establishing the infinity of space is important to Clarke’s argument that space exists outside of us, because our ideas are always finite (Watts 1733, 4).

3.2 Free Will

Clarke attached great importance to the issue of free will, and he may have introduced the modern philosophical meaning of the term “agency” (Schneewind 1997, 313). In his philosophical writings, he argues that freedom of the will involves a libertarian power of self-determination. However, in the sermon “Of the Liberty of Moral Agents,” he claims that the “True liberty of a Rational and Moral Agent” is “being able to follow right Reason only, without Hindrance or Restraint” (W 1.219). Similarly, in that sermon Clarke calls acting as one pleases “mere physical or natural liberty” (which humans and non-human animals have), so he seems to accept a definition of liberty that is compatibilist (W 1.218). Elsewhere he argues that human freedom requires a self-determining will that could freely assent or refrain from assenting to the mind’s judgments; this is a freedom of choosing and not a freedom of acting, such that a prisoner in chains “who chooses or endeavors to move out of his place is therein as much a free agent as he that actually moves out of his place” (D 75, W 2.566). Clarke does not explicitly reconcile these incompatibilist and compatibilist approaches. One way to do so is to make the libertarian power of self-determination a necessary condition for the compatibilist understanding of freedom as following reason without restraint. Clarke also entertains a third notion of freedom: freedom is “a principle of acting, or power of beginning motion, which is the idea of liberty” (D 54, W 2.553). The ability to begin motion marks freedom as a power only held by non-material agents, because matter has no power of self-motion. This third definition is libertarian and is probably the most important of the three to Clarke’s project (Harris 2005, 46–61; Greenberg 2013, 249–251).

Clarke’s primary defense of libertarian freedom involves clarifying the relationship between the will and the judgment. In order to will, one must have a judgment about what to do and the power to choose in accordance with that judgment. This power to choose is provided by the will. The will is not to be identified with the last judgment of the understanding nor is it a volition caused by a judgment. Those (like Hobbes) who thought so were guilty of basic philosophical errors. If they maintained that the content of the evaluative proposition is either identical with the volition or causes it, then they were confusing the “moral motive” with the “physical efficient,” the physical efficient being the element of the cause that provides the active power (D 73, W 2.565). Because the moral motive is simply an abstract object (a proposition) and abstract objects are causally inert, the moral motive cannot cause anything. On the other hand, if Clarke’s opponents maintained that, not the evaluative proposition, but one’s perceiving, judging or otherwise believing it is the cause (or a partial cause) of volition, then they were falling foul of a basic causal principle. Against Descartes, Clarke insisted that judging, i.e., assenting to what appears true and dissenting from what appears false, is not an action but a passion. But what is passive cannot cause anything active. So, there is no causal link between evaluation and volition, or, as Clarke put it, between “approbation and action” (D 126, W 4.714). In general, there is no causal link between previous non-volitional mental states, all of which are passive, and any volition (Vailati 1997, 82–84).

Jonathan Edwards (1754, 222–223) argued that Clarke was committed to an infinite regress of volitions. Because each volition is active, it must be caused by something active; but every other purported motivation is passive, so each volition is caused by a previous volition, and so on ad infinitum. However, Clarke did not believe that each volition was caused by a previous volition, but rather each volition is caused by the will itself. This raises a different problem, noticed by Leibniz: because the conditions for the will choosing in accordance with the judgment are exactly the same as when it refrains from choosing, there is no explanation for why it does one rather than the other, in violation of the principle of sufficient reason (L 4.1, W 4.612; L 5.14, W4.634). Clarke never provided a satisfactory response to this charge; his best attempt is his claim that to deny this account would lead to accepting passive agency, which is a contradiction.

Divine freedom raises new problems for Clarke. For one, human and divine freedom are perhaps in tension with God’s knowledge of future events. Against the claim that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free will, Clarke objected that because knowledge does not affect the thing known, our free choices are unaffected by divine omniscience (D 75–78, W 2.566–568). A second problem is that God always does what is best, so God cannot refrain from acting on his judgment of what is best, and thus acts necessarily, which Clarke claims is a contradiction (D 83–86, W 571–573). Clarke could rely, again, on the passivity of judgment (or the difference between physical causes and moral reasons) to block the move that God’s judgment determines God’s choice. Thus, even though we have complete certainty that God always does what is best, it does not follow that God doing the best is necessitated by God’s judgment of what is right to do. This response is nested in Clarke’s official response, which is to distinguish God’s metaphysical attributes from his moral attributes. Because God’s will is not determined by God’s knowing that an action is the best, our certainty that God will do what is best is due to our confidence in “the unalterable Rectitude of his Will” and not a necessity of his nature (D 86–87, W 573). In other words, it is a moral necessity and not a metaphysical necessity. A third and related problem is that when God created the world, he did what was best to do, but had a choice among an infinite number of equally best ways of creating the world because he could place the world anywhere in space and could create it at any time. Thus, it does not follow from God’s perfect judgment combined with his infinite power to create that God should create the world in a particular way. Although this bothered Leibniz because it conflicts with his account of the principle of sufficient reason, Clarke fails to see any problem (C 4.18–20, W 4.626).

3.3 Matter and the Laws of Nature

Clarke steadfastly maintained that matter does not have an essential, accidental, or super-added power of self-motion. “All things done in the world, are done either immediately by God himself, or by created intelligent beings: matter being evidently not at all capable of any laws or powers whatsoever.” Consequently, the so called “effects of the natural powers of matter, and laws of motion; of gravitation, attraction, or the like” properly speaking are but the “effects of God’s acting upon matter continually and every moment, either immediately by himself, or mediately by some created intelligent beings.” Thus, the course of nature is “nothing else but the will of God producing certain effects in a continued, regular, constant and uniform manner which…being in every moment perfectly arbitrary, is as easy to be altered at any time, as to be preserved” (D 149, W 2.698). The laws of nature are thus not absolutely necessary but only morally necessary, continuing as they do only because of the unchanging will of God. (For more on Clarke’s theory of necessity see Yenter 2014, 265–266).

With regard to the much contested interpretation of Newton on gravity, he declares that Newton “does not mean to say that attraction is the cause of bodies coming together; but by attraction he means to express the effect” (Kassler 2014; 145–146). Leibniz, in his correspondence with Clarke, denies this reading of Newton that makes no metaphysical commitment to gravity as force, suggesting two importantly different readings of Newton (Janiak 2007). While Newton would not speculate publicly on metaphysical matters, Clarke argued that this effect could not be the work of body. Rather, God and designated (subordinate, intelligent, immaterial) agents, act throughout the world by being present where they act, which is the explanation for gravity and all other movements of matter (Brown 2016, 42ff; but see Schliesser 2013, 44 & 48 for a more modest reading).

The claim that matter has not even an accidental power of self-motion was central to Clarke’s attempt to exhibit the manifest activity of God in the Newtonian world and refute Spinozism (Schliesser 2012, 443–449). The claim was radical for the time and elicited many responses. Collins, in a letter to John Trenchard, was angered and unimpressed by Clarke’s arguments, which was a common reaction for the growing number of freethinkers (Jacob 1977; 20). Andrew Baxter (1733, with an important appendix added in 1750) would later extend Clarke’s arguments against self-motion, showing that they apply to ether as well as matter, at a time when ether theories had gained popularity as interpretations of Newton and as hypotheses for explaining gravity.

Despite his insistence on God’s continual activity in the world, Clarke was not, strictly, an occasionalist. Unlike the occasionalists, Clarke does not claim that God is the real cause of interactions between finite minds and matter. Furthermore, matter has a single “Negative Power” of staying at rest or continuing in motion (W 2.697; Winkler 1989).

3.4 The Soul

In response to Henry Dodwell’s argument that the soul is naturally mortal but is made immortal by God only at a baptism performed by someone properly ordained, Clarke wrote an open letter defending the soul’s “natural” immortality on the basis that the soul cannot be material, because what is material is divisible, and what is divisible cannot be the source of the unity of consciousness. (He assumes throughout that if the soul is immaterial then it is immortal.) In response, the freethinker Anthony Collins defended the position that consciousness can be an emergent property of matter, opening the door for a materialist theory of mind. Although he opposed the natural mortality of the soul, Clarke thinks that God destroys the souls of all the persons that are not admitted to heaven, so there is no hell of eternal suffering, perhaps justifying calling him a “mortalist” (Wigelsworth 2009; 58ff). Clarke clearly endorsed the following: all souls survive bodily death; the soul remains in a state of (literal or metaphorical) sleep until the final judgment; the souls of sinners are destroyed at the final judgment. (See especially Obligations 179–180 of 1706 edition; sermon preached Oct 11 1709; Whiston 1730, 146; Sermon CXXI, 2.38–39; Snobelen 2004, 275–284).

Loosely following Locke’s distinctions, Clarke argues that there are three kinds of properties: those that inhere in the substance (real properties), those that are commonly but improperly believed to reside in the substance (secondary qualities), and “merely abstract names to express the effects” of material substances or systems (CC 56–58). The third category includes magnetism and gravity, which are properly descriptions of a different substance (in this case, divine activity and not matter). The second category are the traditional secondary qualities; the discussed example is the smell of a rose. Consciousness falls in the first category, but, unlike the other members of that category such as magnitude and figure, it does not divide or sum.

Employing what Kant (1781, A351) famously dubbed the “Achilles argument,” Clarke claims that the essential unity of consciousness is incompatible with the divisibility and composability of matter, because the consciousness must be distributed among the various component parts, rendering each part conscious. Clarke is not clear on what exactly it is about consciousness that requires this unity (Rozemond 2003, 175–177). Officially, consciousness is a reflexive act in which I recognize my thoughts as my own and is therefore prior to memory, although Clarke sometimes writes “consciousness” when he seems to mean “memory” (Thiel 2011, 231).

Clarke’s version of the Achilles argument rests on two principles. The Homogeneity Principle says that “a power can really inhere in a composite only if it is of the same kind as the powers of the parts” (Vailati 1993, 395). Strictly, the Homogeneity Principle only applies to the first category of qualities (Rozemond 2009, 180). The Composition Principle says that “the properties of the parts will sum to the same properties of the whole (and that the properties of the whole can be divided into the parts)” (Uzgalis 2011, 23). William Uzgalis finds versions of the Homogeneity Principle in Cudworth and Bayle, and in all three cases it is used to argue that thought or consciousness cannot arise from motion or figure because they are not of the same kind. A less often discussed variation on Clarke’s core argument (but see Rozemond 2003, 182ff) is that “figure, divisibility, mobility and other such like qualities of matter” cannot produce conscious thought (a real power) because they are “not real, proper, distinct, and positive powers, but only negative qualities, deficiencies, and imperfections,” which appeals to the principle that there can be no perfection or power in the effect that is not in the cause (D 41, W 2.545).

The enduring soul serves as Clarke’s explanation for personal identity. Collins, following Locke, argued for a memory theory of personal identity. Clarke’s original attack on Collins claims that God could put one person’s memories into multiple people; they would be distinct people but each would be identical to the original person, so identity is not transitive. Although Clarke’s argument became popular in the eighteenth century (Barresi and Martin 2004, 33–49), it seems to have been forgotten then reintroduced in the 1950s (Uzgalis 33, citing Flew 1951, Prior 1957, and Williams 1957). Collins pointed out that Clarke’s theory faces an unpleasant dilemma, in that either animals (who do exhibit self-motion) do not think or have experiences (implausible) or God has to deal with an animal’s soul (animal heaven? annihilation?) (Garrett 2013, 181).

Clarke’s claim that the unity of consciousness is incompatible with divisible matter is complicated by his apparent belief that souls are extended. At least, he refused to rule out the possibility that souls are extended because “as the parts of space or expansion itself can demonstrably be proved to be absolutely indiscerptible [indivisible], so it ought not to be reckoned an insuperable difficulty to imagine that all immaterial thinking substances (upon supposition that expansion is not excluded out of their idea) may be so likewise” (CC 62, W 3.763). The issue, as Clarke tries to frame it, is not that consciousness is incompatible with extension but that it is incompatible with anything divisible into parts. Because, following Newton, Clarke denies that space is actually divisible into parts, it cannot be ruled out that the soul is extended. His acceptance of the principle that there is no action at a distance and of the claim that immaterial beings (both finite and God) act in space perhaps push him to accept that the soul is extended. If so, he does not provide details, for instance, whether the soul occupies the same space as the whole body, the brain, or some part of the brain, or how souls move from place to place if not affected by bodies. Richard Price, defending Clarke, and Joseph Priestley both read Clarke as accepting extended souls. Priestley objects that souls must therefore have shape (which he takes to be implausible) and must interpenetrate God’s spiritual substance (which he takes to be impossible, as in the case of physical substances) (Price and Priestley 1777, 58–62).

4. Philosophical Theology

This section reviews Clarke’s key arguments in philosophy of religion and philosophical theology. The topic of divine freedom was covered in the earlier section on free will, as well as in the entry on divine freedom. Clarke also wrote on topics such as divine attributes, baptism, the historicity of disputed New Testament writings, and the veracity of various Christian doctrines, which are not discussed here.

4.1 Argument A Priori

Clarke thought highly of the argument from design, largely because it is widely accessible and easily grasped. However, due to the rise of atheistic systems of philosophy, he thought it was necessary to give an argument that would satisfy his fellow metaphysicians, such as the following, presented in his first set of Boyle lectures. The Boyle lectures, especially Clarke’s were crucial to spreading Newton’s views. As Margaret Jacob (1977, 2) has convincingly argued, “Without these sermons, Newton’s system of the world would have remained relatively unknown, and possibly even feared, by an educated and literate public on both sides of the Channel which could not have begun to understand the mathematical intricacies of the Principia.”

Clarke tells us that his argument for the being and attributes of God was done “partly by metaphysical Reasoning, and partly from the Discoveries (principally those that have been lately made) in Natural Philosophy” (W 2.581). His argument, which was known in Clarke’s time as “the argument a priori,” occupies most of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, Clarke’s first set of Boyle Lectures. (Note that Clarke’s use of the term “a priori” is not that which has been standard since Kant. The argument is a priori not primarily because it is available independent of experience, but because it argues from the nature of the cause to the nature of the effect; this is in contrast with the argument a posteriori which works from the effects — e.g., the design of the world— to the cause — e.g., the designer.) The argument is typically classified today as cosmological, but it should not be confused with the kalam cosmological argument (which takes as a premise that the world has a finite history). Clarke’s version belongs to the tradition of modal cosmological arguments that employ the principle of sufficient reason to argue from a contingent series of causes to a necessary being. The main lines of Clarke’s “argument a priori” are as follows.[1]

Something now exists, so something always was (D 8, W 2.524). Otherwise nothing would exist now because it is impossible for something to be produced by nothing. Clarke does not explicitly acknowledge that “something always was” is ambiguous between a stronger, de re reading and a weaker, de dicto reading. Because the stronger, de re claim (this particular thing has always existed) seems unwarranted by the argument thus far and the next step of the argument is to establish that there is a single independent being, the more plausible and weaker de dicto claim (some thing or another, perhaps a succession of various things, has always existed) can be assumed.

What has existed from eternity can only be either an independent being (one having in itself the reason of its existence) or an infinite series of dependent beings. However, such an infinite series cannot be what has existed from eternity because by hypothesis it can have no external cause, and no internal cause (no dependent being in the series) can cause the whole series. Hence, an independent being exists. A frequent objection to this argument is that the demand for an explanation is satisfied when it is conceded that each being in the series has a cause (Rowe 1971, 56–57). The series is not a new entity to be explained, so there is no reason to appeal to an eternal, independent being. Furthermore, if the series is not dependent, then it is not contingent, and if it is not contingent, then it is necessary. Clarke finds this options unacceptable, as have many since (including Rowe 1973, 57–59, and van Inwagen 2014, 159–182), but Clarke’s appeal to God’s will to maintain the contingency of the created world has been challenged, especially by Leibniz (see 3.2, above).

This independent being is “self-existent, that is, necessarily existing” (D 12, W 2.527), a conclusion he also reaches by arguing that space and time cannot be conceived not to exist and they are obviously not self-existent, so the substance on which they depend, God, must exist necessarily as well (D 13, W 2.527–528). (Clarke was criticized for assuming, rather than arguing, that space and time are attributes of God.) It seems that for Clarke a “necessary being” is a being whose non-existence is impossible (either because it is an independent being or is necessarily dependent on an independent being), and a “self-existent being” is a being whose non-existence is impossible because the necessity of its existence is to be found in its own nature. Once these two are distinguished, however, Clarke is open to the criticism that he cannot rule out the existence of two self-existent beings (as he attempts in the seventh proposition) because there may be two beings who are self-existent even though only one self-existent being is required to explain the existence of the world (Law 1758, 21). Anthony Atkey (1725, 3–14) provided a variation on this objection in correspondence. He alleges that Clarke illegitimately moves from the existence of at least one “necessary being” to the existence of no more than one “self-existent being.” Clarke concludes that there exists only one self-existent being, but he has at best shown that we cannot have the idea of two self-existent beings. Atkey’s objection is about the relationship of the conceivable to the possible. Clarke’s response (Atkey 1725, 17–19) is that we have clear ideas in this case, so our ideas can guide us in the nature of things (conceivability entails possibility in the case of clear ideas), but he does not give any reason why we should think our ideas are clear in this case. This problem is exacerbated by his denial that we have adequate ideas of the essences of substances, including God. If we do not have adequate ideas of any substances (including the divine being) then how could we have a clear idea of God? Roger North had previously raised a similar worry about Clarke needing to show “natural things accord with our ideas,” but Clarke’s response has not survived (NC 133).

If successful, Clarke’s argument a priori establishes all the metaphysical attributes of God (independence, eternality, immutability, infinitude, omnipresence) by examining the nature of necessity and positing the contingency of the world. To reach the personal and moral attributes of God, it is necessary to draw upon further features of the world and argue a posteriori (D 38, W 2.543). Clarke attempted a variety of arguments to establish that God is an agent (that is, that God is not only intelligent but has a will that is free in a libertarian sense). First, one real feature of the world is that there are intelligent beings in it. Intelligence, being a perfection, must exist to at least as great a degree in the cause as in the effect (an instance of Clarke’s applying a causal version of the principle of sufficient reason). So God must be intelligent (D38–39, W 4.543). Second, this intelligence can be established from the order and beauty of the world, so a teleological argument can reach this conclusion as well. Third, Clarke claimed that “intelligence without liberty … is really (in respect of any power, excellence, or perfection) no intelligence at all,” so therefore God must be an agent. Fourth, the person positing a God without freedom (Clarke specifically mentions Spinoza) is positing a contradiction and has failed to explain the source of activity in the world (D 46–47, W 4.548–549). Finally, the necessitarian (like Spinoza) is forced to deny a number of (to Clarke) obvious points, including that things could be different than they are, that there are final causes in the universe, and that there is a variety of finite things in the universe (Yenter 2014).

With God’s intelligence and agency in place, he sketches how God’s wisdom, goodness, justice, and other moral perfections can be established.

4.2 God, Space, and Time

According to traditional Christian theology, God is eternal and omnipresent. Clarke accepted both, but his attempts to explain what those claims mean are not always clear. Four central tenets of Clarke’s position are unpacked below.

God is able to act at all times and in all places because he is substantially present in all times and in all places. To deny this would entail accepting action at a distance, which Clarke, like most of his contemporaries, found mysterious or impossible (Brown 2016).

God’s substantial presence entails that the Scholastic view of divine eternity and immensity is false. Clarke rejected the view of God as substantially removed from space and time. Divine eternity involves both necessary existence and infinite duration which, however, could not be identified with the traditional notion of the eternal present (nunc stans) according to which God exists in an unchanging permanent present without any successive duration. He considered such a view unintelligible at best and contradictory at worst (CC 107, W 3.794). The attribution of successive duration to God might suggest that God, like us, is in time but, unlike us, does not change. However, this was not Clarke’s view. In his exchanges with Butler he clarifies that God is not technically in space and time, because God is prior (in the order of nature) to time whereas things in time are metaphysically subsequent to the existence of time. Moreover, he attributed distinct and successive thoughts to God; otherwise God could not “vary his will, nor diversify his works, nor act successively, nor govern the world, nor indeed have any power to will or do anything at all” (W 3.897). Hence, God is immutable with respect to his will only in the sense that he does not change his mind.

God is not identical to space or time; although necessary, they depend for their existence upon God. Clarke’s earliest reported philosophical idea, years before he read Newton, is that God cannot destroy space (Whiston 1730, 22–23). A common worry about absolute space in the eighteenth century was that if space is infinite, necessary, and indestructible then either God is not the only infinite, necessary, and independent being or God is identical to space, both of which were theologically unorthodox. Clarke’s position in the Demonstration, the letters to Butler, and the letter to an anonymous author (almost certainly Daniel Waterland) is that space and time are divine attributes or properties, a view he may have found in Henry More (Thomas 2015, 18). Because they depend on the only self-subsisting being, they are not independent beings (D 122–123, W 4.758). He told Leibniz that immensity and eternality are “an immediate and necessary consequence” of God’s existence, without supplying any further argument or explaining the relationship between “consequence,” “mode,” “attribute,” and “property.” Many have understood Clarke to mean that God is literally dimensional. Clarke’s early critic Anthony Collins (1713, 47–48) read him this way. Emily Thomas (2018, 172–176) has recently provided strong evidence that Clarke’s views undergo a change after 1719; from this point on Clarke is careful to say that immensity and eternality are “modes of existence” rather than attributes, where modes of existence can be ascribed to God and to God’s attributes, whereas an attribute cannot be ascribed to any other attribute. For example, God is eternal and God’s intelligence is eternal, but God’s will is not intelligent, so intelligence is an attribute but eternality is a mode of existence.

God’s immensity and eternality are consistent with God’s unity. As Leibniz and Waterland noted, the identification of divine immensity with space endangers the simplicity of the divine being because space has parts, albeit not separable ones. The objection, though formidable, was not new; Bayle in the Dictionnaire (entry “Leucippus,” remark G) had chided the Newtonians for identifying space with divine immensity in order to solve the ontological problem created by the positing of an infinite space because it leads to the destruction of divine simplicity and to various absurdities. As a further point, Waterland suggests that since Clarke accepts that nothing with parts can be the subject of consciousness, God’s immensity also undermines divine intelligence and consciousness. Clarke offered two responses. Firstly, not everything extended has parts. Space is extended, but (as Newton had claimed) its “parts” cannot be moved, so they are not truly parts. Secondly, Clarke claimed parity between spatial and temporal extendedness: because the former is compatible with the simplicity of what “stretches” temporally, the latter is compatible with the simplicity of what stretches spatially. But the parity between space and time, were it to be granted, rather than showing that spatial extendedness is not detrimental to a thing’s simplicity because temporal extendedness is not, could be taken to show that the latter is detrimental to a thing’s simplicity because the former is.

4.3 Trinitarian Views

In his lifetime, Clarke was infamous for his view of the trinity, and he sparked a vociferous debate (Ferguson 1974, 59–149; Pfizenmaier 1997, 179–216). Clarke was not officially censured (but nearly so), but it surely prevented his rising to higher office. Clarke’s writing on the trinity are relevant for understanding his other metaphysical positions, especially his identification of “person” with intelligent, acting agent rather than with a particular substance, which has not been sufficiently reconciled with his account of personal identity as wrapped up with an immaterial soul.

In Christian theology, God is represented as tripartite—three persons but one God. In the 1662 Book of Common Prayer, in use in England during Clarke’s lifetime, one of the liturgies draws from the Athanasian Creed, which includes the following discussion of the Trinity: “For there is one Person of the Father, another of the Son: and another of the Holy Ghost. But the Godhead of the Father, of the Son, and of the Holy Ghost, is all one… So the Father is God, the Son is God : and the Holy Ghost is God. And yet they are not three Gods: but one God.” In his position as a cleric, Clarke was required to subscribe to this formulation. In 1712, against the advice of his friends, he published The Scripture-Doctrine of the Trinity, in which he diverged from what his opponents considered the plain sense of this formulation. The Scripture-Doctrine of the Trinity begins by collecting all the passages of the New Testament that relate to the Trinity. It then sets out a series of 55 propositions regarding the Trinity, each supported by references to the texts collected in the first section and writings from the early Christian church. However, the biblical texts do not primarily discuss God’s metaphysical attributes, according to Clarke, but ascribe dominion to God (W 4.150; Snobelen 2004, 265–275). The third section relates these propositions to the Anglican liturgy. This approach reflects Clarke’s general expectation that the correct theological doctrines are found in the Bible, are endorsed by the early church, and are compatible with reason. Through hundreds of years of what he considered bad metaphysics, the correct and intelligible doctrine of the trinity had become obscured, and Clarke hoped to return to a pre-Athanasian understanding of the trinity.

Clarke’s position in The Scripture-Doctrine of the Trinity was labeled by his opponents as “Arian,” “Socinian,” and “Sabellian.” Although they were commonly used as abusive terms for anyone holding non-traditional or anti-trinitarian views, they also have more precise meanings. An Arian holds that the Son (the second person of the Trinity) is divine but not eternal; he was created by God the Father out of nothing before the beginning of the world. A Socinian holds that the Son is merely human and was created at or after the conception of Jesus. A Sabellian holds that the Son is a mode of God. In the precise use of the terms, Clarke is none of these. Unlike the Arians, Clarke affirmed that the Son is co-eternal with the Father and not created (W 4.141). (Pfizenmaier 1997 provides further textual and historical arguments that Clarke should not be classified as an Arian.) From this it also follows that, contra the Socinians, the Son existed before the conception of Jesus. Unlike the Sabellians, Clarke denied that the Son was a mode of the Father. (This would have been very problematic given that he sometimes claimed that space is a mode of God.) Clarke’s claimed ignorance about substance made him reluctant to declare that the Father and the Son were the same divine substance, but the Son is endowed by the Father with all of the power and authority of the Father. He also called the manner of the Son’s generation from the father “ineffable.” So while Clarke denied that the trinity was a “mystery,” he did believe that the manner in which the Father’s power is communicated to the Son is “after a manner to us unknown” (Proposition 35; 4.159).

Clarke affirms that each member of the trinity is a person, but only the Father is self-existent, which means that the Father by essence (rather than by “office”) has a property that the Son does not. His views are best described as subordinationist but he could also be called a unitarian, in at least some senses of the term (Tuggy 2014; 204–205). See especially Prop. 25 (W 4.150); Prop. 27 (W 4.151); and Prop. 34 (“The Son, whatever his metaphysical essence of substance be, and whatever divine greatness and dignity is ascribed to him in scripture; yet in this he is evidently subordinate to the Father, that he derives his being, attributes, and powers, from the Father, and the Father nothing from him”; 4.155). To the Father alone are ascribed “independence and supreme authority” (Proposition 27; 4.151). Every other attribute and power that can be ascribed to the Father can also be ascribed to the Son, “but the titles ascribed to the Son, must always carry along with them the idea of being communicated or derived” (4.153).

4.4 Miracles

Like many associated with the Royal Society, Clarke thought that miracles could be used as evidence for the claim that Christianity is the true religion. However, given that matter is inactive, God is actively involved in all or nearly all events in the world. What then could separate out a particular action of God as miraculous? According to Clarke, a miracle is a “work effected in a manner unusual, or different from the common and regular Method of Providence, by the interposition either of God himself, or of some Intelligent Agent superior to Man, for the Proof or Evidence of some particular Doctrine, or in attestation to the Authority of some particular Person” (W 2.701).

Miracles became a point of controversy in the letters that passed between Clarke and Leibniz (W 4.605). One focus of the debate is which would be greater: a world so perfectly crafted that God does not need to intervene to keep it running (Leibniz), or a world so dependent on God that one cannot understand the world without recognizing its continual dependence on the operations of God (Clarke). A second focus of the debate is the proper understanding of a miracle: something that exceeds the natural power of created things (Leibniz), or something that seems different from our human expectation of how things operate (Clarke).

Clarke maintains that miracles are miraculous only from a human perspective and that God actively and continuously works in the physical world because matter is completely passive. Since God’s wisdom and goodness are unchanging, if God chooses to act differently in the world at a certain time (e.g., by changing the laws of motion), it is only because it was always good to do so and was part of God’s plan from eternity. Because it requires no more power for God to do the miraculous-to-us as to do the natural-to-us, neither one is “with Respect to God, more or less Natural or Supernatural than the other.” From our perspective, God is changing the order of things; from God’s perspective, everything is equally a part of God’s design. A miracle, then, is only a miracle “with Regard to our Conceptions” (C2.6–12, W 4.598–601). In his final letter Clarke elaborates on this, suggesting that we call the sun stopping in the sky miraculous only because it is unusual; if it was always at the same point in the sky, then that would be natural, and its motion miraculous. Similarly, raising a dead body from the ground is miraculous, but only because God does not usually act that way (C5.107–109, W 4.693; C3.17, W 4.611–612). Unusualness is a necessary but not sufficient condition for being a miracle (C4.43, W 4.629–630), but Clarke nowhere says what else is required.

Leibniz attacks Clarke’s position from multiple angles. Leibniz’s first letter accuses Newton of making an imperfect machine that requires tuning to keep it running, like a watch that requires winding, but this is unfitting a perfect God. In Newton’s world, miracles are required “in order to supply the Wants of Nature” (L1.4, W 4.588). Clarke responds that there is a disanalogy between the watch and the world. The watch requires winding because a human watchmaker can only compose parts and put them in motion, whereas God is both the creator and preserver of forces and powers. On the offensive, Clarke charges those who deny God’s constant involvement in the world to be allowing a mechanical world, a world of “Materialism and Fate,” where God is not needed at all (C1.4, W 4.590). In response, Leibniz makes the interesting objection that either Clarke is explaining natural things by the supernatural, which is absurd, or else God is a part of nature (specifically, the soul of the world) (L2.12, W 4.596; L4.110–11, W 4.666). Leibniz also charges that Clarke cannot explain the difference between natural and supernatural action. “But it is regular, (says the Author,) it is constant, and consequently natural. I answer; it cannot be regular, without being reasonable; nor natural, unless it can be explained by the Natures of creatures” (L5.121, W 4.668–669). Regularities require explanations, and to be natural these explanations must come from the natures of the creatures. The Clarkean picture, in which matter is completely passive, is incapable of explaining the regularities exhibited in the interaction of material bodies in terms of those bodies. Whereas Clarke saw this as the pinnacle of what natural philosophy contributes to natural theology, Leibniz saw it as a failure to exhibit a fully rational world suited to being created by a perfectly good God.

4.5 Revelation and the Four Categories of Deism

Clarke is very confident in the prospects of general revelation; that is, he thinks that human reason is capable of discovering the existence and attributes of God by reasoning from the evidence of nature. Indeed, Clarke believes that Christianity presupposes natural religion (W 4.582). Many theological and ethical truths (e.g., there is a God, God is to be worshiped, it is good to be just and righteous) are plainly understandable to everyone, and if one is mistaken in these matters “’tis not by his Understanding, but by his Will that he is deceived.” Yet it is very common to oppose these truths; the most common causes are “a presumptuous Ignorance, which despises Knowledge”; carelessness, which leads to blindly following local customs; prejudice, which is relying implicitly on others and traditions rather than an examination of the evidence; and vice, a willful opposition to the truth due to the love of wickedness, debauchery, and power (W 2.147–160). The reasoned defense of natural religion, although perhaps unable to sway the prejudiced, was central to Clarke’s project.

Clarke thought deists could be convinced to abandon their position because deism is unstable. In Clarke’s taxonomy, there are four categories of deists (W 2.600ff). The first category of deist say they believe in “an Eternal, Infinite, Independent, Intelligent Being” that made the world, but this God is not involved in the governing of the world nor does God care for what happens in it. In response, Clarke argues (1) that the best science of the day has shown that the nature of matter is insufficient to ground the laws by which matter acts and thus requires the continuous dependence upon its Creator, and (2) a God that isn’t concerned for what happens in the world must be lacking in knowledge of what is happening, power to affect what is happening, ability to act in the world, or wisdom to know that intervention is needed, and thus is not the God that the deist claimed to accept. The second category accept providential action in the world, but deny that God has moral attributes; ethics is a matter of human construction. They fail to see, thinks Clarke, (1) that ethics is a matter of eternal, fixed relations and (2) that to deny the moral attributes of God entails the denial of either God’s wisdom or power. The third group of deists affirm God’s moral attributes, but they deny the immortality of the human soul and that moral terms apply univocally between God and humans, which in practice leads to the denial of a future state after death. Clarke claims that this explodes all the attributes of God so that we no longer know what we are saying when we talk about God. Finally, some deists hold all the right theological and ethical doctrines, but claim that they know this solely on the basis of general revelation and thus have no need of a special, Christian revelation. Clarke suspects that this fourth category of deists no longer exist in lands where Christianity has reached.

5. Ethics

Although some of his sermons contain interesting analyses of individual Christian virtues, the most sustained exposition of Clarke’s deontological, rationalist ethics is contained in his second set of Boyle Lectures, A Discourse Concerning the Unalterable Obligations of Natural Religion. Clarke begins by stating that clearly there are different relations among persons and that from these relations there arise a “fitness” or “unfitness” of behavior among persons. So, for example, given the relation of infinite disproportion between humans and God, it is fit that we honor, worship, and imitate God. These facts can be rationally apprehended by anyone with a sound mind, although in some cases we may be at a loss in clearly demarcating right from wrong. Being grounded in necessary relations, ethical truths, like geometrical truths, are universal and necessary. As such, they are independent of any will, divine or human, and of any consideration of punishment or reward.

In somewhat more detail, the central tenets of Clarke’s ethics are elucidated in the subordinate components of the first proposition of A Discourse.

  1. There are eternal and necessary differences (or “reasons”) of things, from which “necessarily arises an agreement or disagreement of some things with others, or a fitness or unfitness of the application of different things or different relations one to another” (W 2.608).
  2. God wills to act according to these eternal reasons of things (W 2.612).
  3. All rational creatures should choose to act according to the eternal rule of reason (by which Clarke seems to mean these eternal relations) (W 2.612), and the human mind “naturally and necessarily Assents to the eternal Law of Righteousness” (W 2.616).
  4. This eternal law is classified into piety (duty toward God), righteousness (duty to other human persons), and sobriety (duty to oneself) (W 2.618).
  5. This law of nature is (temporally and logically) prior to and independent of human interaction (W 2.624).
  6. It is also (logically) prior to and independent of the will of God (W 2.626).
  7. The obligation to follow this law is “antecedent to all Consideration of any particular private and personal Reward or Punishment” (W 2.627).

From (3) and in clarification of sobriety and piety in (4), Clarke argues the ideal (created) moral agent is one who acts within the scope of what God, with full authority and compatibly with reason, has commanded. For instance, we ought to preserve our own being because God has created us and sustains us and only God ought to remove us from the world (Heydt 2018, 135). Regarding (4), Clarke argues that duties toward others are governed by equity, which demands that one deal with other persons as one can reasonably expect others to deal with one (W 2.619), and by love, which demands that one further the well-being happiness of all persons (W 2.621). Duties towards oneself demand that one preserve one’s physical health, mental faculties, and spiritual well-being so as to be able to perform one’s duties (W 2.623). Clarke uses (5) as an opportunity to develop a series of interesting attacks on Hobbes’ account of political and moral obligation. Among his many criticisms, he argues that a social contract cannot be obligatory unless there were already an obligation to obey contracts; if a contract benefits the community then there are real benefits prior to the contract so the contract does not generate benefits and harms; it is a contradiction for everyone to have a right to the same thing in the state of nature; and if power is to be obeyed then an all-powerful devil should be obeyed, which is absurd (W 2.609–616, 631–638).

In clarification of (6), Clarke adds that because God always does what is just and good, God’s commands align with the eternal law (W 2.637), and that because God wants to make us happy and good, God promotes the goodness and welfare of the whole of creation, including us (W 2.640). While the law is antecedent to considerations of reward and punishment (7), God’s justice ensures the proper rewards and punishments for following the law (W 2.641). These sanctions are not uniformly present in this life, so the reward and punishment must (at least partly) occur in the next life. Moreover, human depravity makes the prospect of future sanctions a necessary incentive for proper behavior. God might also ensure that our acting from the best reasons does not have overall much worse consequences (Schneewind 1997, 317).

Clarke’s theory has been roundly criticized on several grounds, especially on the meaning and sufficiency of (1). He never adequately explained the nature of the relations among persons that ground morality. For instance, his explanation for why it is “fit” to honor, worship, obey, and imitate God is that “God is infinitely superior to Men” (W 2.608). If the infinite superiority is in reference to power or being, it is not obviously to the point; if it is an expression of an ethical relation, the argument is circular. Additionally, it is unclear what in the “Nature and Reason of Things” is necessary. Is it that good is necessarily not evil? (This is trivial and unhelpful.) Is it that one thing cannot be both good from one perspective and evil from another? (In which case, Clarke is offering a response to Hobbes or maybe Spinoza, but he doesn’t provide a substantial alternative.) Is it that whatever is good is necessarily good? (In which case, he is perhaps restating his opposition to divine command theory, but again not in a way that makes clear his alternative.) Is it something else? Clarke’s position is not clear, but he does seem to affirm each of these interpretations at different times. A further structural problem is that Clarke slides between the claim that ethical truths are relations between mind-independent objects in the world, and that they are grounded in the nature of rationality itself, apparently without distinguishing the two positions. Relatedly, there is an interpretive question about whether Clarke is ontologically committed to the existence of mind-independent values that are not reducible to anything in the world (Kelly 2002). Finally, even if these relations exist, it is not clear how moral obligation arises from such relations. Hume (1739,–7) famously charged theories like Clarke’s with motivational impotence because the perception of “fitness” cannot, by itself, move the will. However, as we saw, Clarke denied that evaluation causes motivation, although he clearly thought that evaluation provides the agent, who ultimately causes the volition, with reasons for action.

6. Influence and Reception

Clarke’s influence on his contemporaries and the generation that followed was immense. One important aspect of his immediate influence was that as the translator of the standard textbook in physics in England in the early eighteenth century, as the defender of absolute space and atomism in the correspondence with Leibniz, as the translator of Newton’s Opticks into Latin, and as a recognized close friend of Newton, Clarke was perhaps the most significant spokesperson for the Newtonian natural philosophy, and a primary interpreter of its implications for metaphysics, philosophy of science, and theology. In particular, his use of the passivity and scarcity of matter in his argument for the existence of God was noted by his contemporaries internationally.

Clarke’s influence was greatest in England and Scotland, where all of his works were widely read. (Although his Boyle lectures went through ten editions in thirty years, Dahm [1970, 176] finds only one translation during that time, into French.) Daniel Waterland was his sharpest contemporary critic, but the two remained friendly throughout (Ferguson 1976, 217). A. A. Sykes and John Jackson were Clarke’s most forceful defenders in the 1710s and 1720s. Clarke often made suggestions to Jackson about how best to defend his views (Ferguson 1976, 218–219). Among those sympathetic to Clarke’s methodology and positions in the next two generations, Andrew Baxter was the most polemical, John Stewart the most irritating to Hume, Richard Price the most similar, and Thomas Reid the most well known today. Clarke’s ethics (with some metaphysical support) were defended by William Wollaston and Catharine Trotter Cockburn (see Thomas 2017, 210ff), supplemented by Joseph Butler, and attacked by David Hume (see Greenberg 2013, 251ff).

Hume clearly has Clarke in mind in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, where Demea recites the argument a priori and both Cleanthes and Philo offer critiques. Furthermore, Clarke is cited by name in Treatise 1.3.3 and is a likely object of the arguments against ethical rationalism in Treatise 3.1. In A Letter from a Gentleman (1745), Hume admits that Clarke’s argument a priori is undermined by the claims of the Treatise. Russell (1997 and 2008) has proposed that Clarke is a major target of Hume’s Treatise, and that Hume’s opposition to natural theology as defended by Clarke is a uniting theme of the Treatise.

Clarke profoundly influenced philosophers in the eighteenth century that had interests in the intersection of theology and philosophy, particularly on the freedom of the will and the relationship between God, space, and matter. Jonathan Edwards singled out Clarke as a major opponent in his Freedom of the Will, where Edwards runs together libertarianism with Arminian theology. That same libertarianism made Clarke popular among the German Pietists. Among them, Crusius is the most notable, both for his work and for his importance to Kant, and the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence is a likely source for Kant’s discussions of space and time. Voltaire (1752) declared, “Among these philosophers [the last generation of British philosophers], Clarke is perhaps altogether the clearest, the most profound, the most methodical, and the strongest of all those who have spoken of the Supreme Being.” Voltaire as a young man was particularly impressed with Clarke; later in life, he seems to have been less convinced by Clarke’s argument for the existence of God. In Emile, Rousseau refers to “the illustrious Clarke enlightening the world, proclaiming at last the Being of beings and the Dispenser of things,” but whether Rousseau was steadfastly sympathetic to Clarke’s system is in doubt (Attfield 2004, 433–434).

Clarke’s influence waned late in the eighteenth century. In 1778, Richard Price could still write on behalf of many that “Dr. Clarke is, without all doubt, the best and ablest of all writers, on the subjects of the Immateriality and Natural Immortality of the Soul, and also on Liberty and Necessity,” but by the nineteenth century interest in and appreciation of Clarke had dwindled. Samuel Coleridge (1854, 405) considered him “over-rated,” and Leslie Stephen (1881, 119) claimed that to nineteenth-century eyes, Clarke “appears to be a second-rate advocate of opinions interesting only in the mouths of greater men who were their first and ablest advocates.” Henry Sidgwick (1886, 175–180), despite his criticisms, is a nineteenth-century exception in holding Clarke in high regard.

In the last few decades, a renewed interest in Clarke’s argument a priori, a rediscovery of Newton’s unpublished writings and subsequent study of his associates, and a greater appreciation for Clarke’s historical importance to ethics, metaphysics, and more have philosophers reading Clarke again, and the estimation of his philosophical acuity has increased.


Primary Literature

W Clarke, S., 1738, The Works, B. Hoadly (ed.), London; reprint New York: Garland Publishing Co, 2002.
D Clarke, S., 1705, A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God And Other Writings, E. Vailati (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
CC Clarke, S., and Collins, A., 1707–1708, The Correspondence of Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins, W. Uzgalis (ed.), Buffalo, NY: Broadview Press, 2011.
L,C Leibniz, G.W., and Clarke, S., 1715–1716, The Leibniz–Clarke Correspondence, H. G. Alexander (ed.), Manchester, UK: Machester University Press, 1956.
NC North, R. and Clarke, S., 1704–1713, Seeking Truth: Roger North’s Notes on Newton and Correspondence with Clarke, c. 1704–1713, J. C. Kassler (ed.), Farnham: Ashgate Press, 2014.

Secondary Literature


  • Brewster, D., 1855, Memoirs of the Life, Writings, and Discoveries of Sir Isaac Newton, 2 vols, Edinburgh: Thomas Constable & Co. [Second volume available online.]
  • Ferguson, J. P., 1976, An Eighteenth Century Heretic. Dr Samuel Clarke, Kineton, UK: Roundwood Press.
  • Hoadly, B. (ed.), 1730, Sermons on Several Subjects by Samuel Clarke, D.D., London: W. Botham. [Available online.]
  • Stephen, L., 1881, “Clarke and Wollaston,” A History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, 2 vols., 2nd ed., London: Smith, Elder, & Co. [Available online.]
  • Stephen, L., and Lee, S., (eds.), 1882, Dictionary of National Biography, London; reprinted by London: Oxford University Press, 1949–50, sub voce.
  • Sykes, A., 1729, “The Elogium of the late truly Learned, Reverend and Pious Samuel Clarke, D.D.,” W. Whiston (ed.), Historical Memoirs of the Life of Dr. Samuel Clarke, 3rd edition, London, 1748. [Available online.]
  • Whiston, W., 1728, A Collection of Authentick Records, London. [Available online.]
  • –––, 1730, Historical Memoirs of the Life of Dr. Samuel Clarke, London. [Available online.]

Metaphysics and Correspondence

  • Attfield, R., 1977, “Clarke, Collins and Compounds,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 15: 45–54.
  • Brown, G., 2004, “Leibniz’s Endgame and the Ladies of the Courts”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 65 (1): 75–100.
  • –––, 2016, “Did Samuel Clarke Really Disavow Action at a Distance in His Correspondence with Leibniz?: Newton, Clarke, and Bentley on Gravitation and Action at a Distance,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 60: 38–47.
  • Garrett, A., 2013, “Mind and Matter”, The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century, J. A. Harris (ed.), 171–193.
  • Greenberg, S., 2013, “Liberty and Necessity”, The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century, J. A. Harris (ed.), 171–193.
  • Harris, J., 2005, Of Liberty and Necessity: The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth-Century British Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Janiak, A., 2007, “Newton and the Reality of Force,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 45 (1): 127–147.
  • Khamara, E., 2006, Space, Time, and Theology in the Leibniz-Newton Controversy, Frankfurt: ontos verlag.
  • Koyré, A., and Cohen, I. B., “The Case of the Missing Tanquam: Leibniz, Newton & Clarke,” Isis 52 (4): 555–566.
  • O’Higgins, J., (ed.), 1976, Determinism and Freewill: Anthony Collins’ “A Philosophical Inquiry concerning Human Liberty”, The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • Pfizenmaier, T. C., 1997, The Trinitarian Theology of Dr. Samuel Clarke (1675–1729): Context, Sources, and Controversy, Leiden: Brill.
  • Price, R., and Priestley, J., 1778, A Free Discussion of the Doctrines of Materialism and Philosophical Necessity, London: J. Johnson. [Available online.]
  • Rowe, W. L., 1971, “The Cosmological Argument”, Noûs, 5 (1): 49–61.
  • –––, 1973, Philosophy of Religion, New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich.
  • –––, 1975, The Cosmological Argument, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1987, “Causality and Free Will in the Controversy Between Collins and Clarke,” The Journal of the History of Philosophy, 25: 51–67.
  • Rozemond, M., 2003, “Descartes, Mind-Body Union, and Holenmerism”, Philosophical Topics, 31 (1–2): 343–367.
  • –––, 2008, “The Achilles Argument and the Nature of Matter in the Clarke-Collins Correspondence,” The Achilles of Rationalist Psychology, T. Lennon & R. Stainton (eds.), 159–175.
  • –––, 2009, “Can Matter Think? The Mind-Body Problem in the Clarke-Collins Correspondence,” Topics in Early Modern Philosophy of Mind, J. Miller (ed.), 171–192.
  • Schliesser, E., 2012, “Newton and Spinoza: On Motion and Matter (And God, Of Course),” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 50: 436–458.
  • Thiel, U., 2011, The Early Modern Subject, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Thomas, E., 2018, Absolute Time: Rifts in Early Modern British Metaphysics, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Tuggy, D., 2014, “Divine Deception and Monotheism”, Journal of Analytic Theology, 2: 186–209.
  • Vailati, E., 1993, “Clarke’s Extended Soul,”Journal of the History of Philosophy, 28: 213–28.
  • –––, 1997, Leibniz and Clarke: A Study of their Correspondence, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Wigelsworth, J. R., 2009, Deism in Enlightenment England: Theology, Politics, and Newtonian Public Science, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Yenter, T., 2014, “Clarke Against Spinoza on the Manifest Diversity of the World,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 22: 260–280.

Ethics, Religion, and the Boyle Lectures

  • Atkey, A., 1725, Letters Written, in MDCCXXV, to the Rev. Dr. Samuel Clarke, relating to an argument advanced by the Doctor, in his Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, in proof of the Unity of the Deity: with the Doctor’s Answers, London: Daniel Browne, 1745.
  • Dahm, J. J., 1970, “Science and Apologetics in the Early Boyle Lectures,” Church History, 39 (2): 172–186.
  • Force, J. E., 1984, “Hume and the Relation of Science to Religion among Certain Members of the Royal Society,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 45 (4): 517–536.
  • –––, 1996, “Samuel Clarke’s Four Categories of Deism, Isaac Newton, and the Bible,” Scepticism in the History of Philosophy, R. Popkin (ed.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 53–74.
  • Jacob, M. C., 1976, The Newtonians and the English Revolution: 1689–1720, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1977, “Newtonianism and the Origins of the Enlightenment: A Reassessment”, Eighteenth Century Studies, 11 (1): 1–25.
  • Kelly, E., 2002, “Moral Agency and Free Choice: Clarke’s Unlikely Success against Hume”, Archiv fur Geschichte der Philosophie, 84 (3): 297–318.
  • Khamara, E. J., 1992, “Hume Versus Clarke on the Cosmological Argument,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 42: 34–55.
  • Le Rossignol, J. E., 1892, The Ethical Philosophy of Samuel Clarke, Leipzig.
  • MacIntosh, J. J., 1997, “The Argument from the Need for Similar or ‘Higher’ Qualities: Cudworth, Locke, and Clarke on God’s Existence,” Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 29–59.
  • Rowe, W. R., 1997, “Clarke and Leibniz on Divine Perfection and Freedom,” Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 60–82.
  • Schneewind, J. B., 1997, The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sidgwick, H., 1886, Outlines of the History of Ethics, London: Macmillan and Co.
  • Snobelen, S., 2001, “‘God of Gods, and Lord of Lords:’ The Theology of Isaac Newton’s General Scholium to the Principia”, Osiris, 16: 169–208.
  • –––, 2004, “Socinianism and Newtonianism: The Case of Samuel Clarke”, Fausto Sozzini e la Filosofia in Europa, M. Priarolo and M. E. Scribano (eds.), Accademia Senese Degli Intronat.
  • Stewart, L., 1981, “Samuel Clarke, Newtonianism and the Factions of Post-Revolutionary England,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 42: 53–71.
  • –––, 1996, “Seeing through the Scholium: Religion and Reading Newton in the Eighteenth Century”, History of Science, 34 (2): 123–165.
  • Thomas, D. O., 1997, “Reason and Revelation in Samuel Clarke’s Epistemology of Morals,” Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 114–135.
  • Zebrowski, M. K., 1997, “’Commanded of God, Because ‘tis Holy and Good’: The Christian Platonism and Natural Law of Samuel Clarke,” Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 3–28.

Influence and Reception

  • Attfield, R., 2004, “Rousseau, Clarke, Butler and Critiques of Deism,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 12 (3): 429–443.
  • Barresi, J., and Martin, R., 2004, Naturalization of the Soul: Self and Personal Identity in the Eighteenth Century, New York: Routledge.
  • Baxter, A., 1733, An Enquiry into the Nature of the Human Soul, London: James Bettenham.
  • Coleridge, S. T., 1854, “Notes on Waterland’s Vindication of Christ’s Divinity”, The Complete Works of Samuel Taylor Coleridge, volume 5, New York: Harper and Brothers Press.
  • Edwards, J., 1754, Freedom of the Will, P. Ramsey (ed.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1957. [Available online]
  • Ferguson, J. P., 1974, The Philosophy of Dr Samuel Clarke and Its Critics, New York: Vantage Press.
  • Flew, A., 1951, “Locke and the Problem of Personal Identity,” Philosophy, 26: 359–383.
  • Hume, D., 1739, A Treatise of Human Nature, London: John Noonan. [Available online]
  • –––, 1745, A Letter from a Gentleman to His Friend in Edinburgh, Edinburgh.
  • Kant, I., 1781/1787, Critique of Pure Reason, P. Guyer and A. W. Wood (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Law, E., 1758, Collected Works of Edmund Law, 5 vols., V. Nuovo (ed.), Chippenham: Thoemmes, 1997.
  • Meli, D. B., 1999, “Caroline, Leibniz, and Clarke,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 60 (3): 469–486.
  • Newton, I., 1726, The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, I. B. Cohen and A. Whitman (trans. and eds.), Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1999.
  • Prior, A., 1957, “Opposite Number,” Review of Metaphysics, 11: 196–201.
  • Rousseau, J., 1762, Emile or On Education, A. Bloom (ed. and trans.), New York: Basic Books, 1997.
  • Russell, P., 1997, “Clarke’s ‘Almighty Space’ and Hume’s Treatise,” Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 83–113.
  • –––, 2008, The Riddle of Hume’s Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Stewart, J., 1754, “Some Remarks on the Laws of Motion, and the Inertia of Matter,” Essays and Observations, Physical and Literary, Edinburgh: G. Hamilton and J. Balfour.
  • Thomas, E., 2017, “Creation, Divine Freedom, and Catherine Cockburn: An Intellectualist on Possible Worlds and Contingent Laws”, Women and Liberty, 1600–1800: Philosophical Essays, J. Broad and K. Detlefsen (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Tull Baker, J., 1932, “Space, Time, and God: A Chapter in Eighteenth Century English Philosophy,” The Philosophical Review, 41 (6): 577–593.
  • Voltaire, 1752, “Plato,” Philosophical Dictionary, W. F. Fleming (trans.), New York: E. R. Dumont, 1901.
  • Watts, I., 1733, Philosophical Essays on Various Subjects, 2nd edition, London: Richard Ford.
  • Williams, B., 1957, “Personal Identity and Individuation,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 57: 229–252.
  • Winkler, K., 1989, “Our Modern Metaphysicians,” British Society for the History of Philosophy Newsletter, 4: 35–40.
  • Yolton, J. W., 1983, Thinking Matter: Materialism in Eighteenth-Century Britain, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Google Books has digitized versions of Volume 2 (including the Demonstration) and Volume 4 (including the correspondence with Leibniz) of the definitive 1738 edition of the Works, edited by Hoadly.
  • The Internet Archive has many digitized editions of various works by Clarke and his contemporaries.
  • Samuel Clarke in the Early Modern Philosophy Texts, prepared by Jonathan Bennett and Peter Millican, contains the texts of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, the correspondence with Butler, and the correspondence with Leibniz, in heavily edited versions prepared for students.
  • Samuel Clarke, catalog of the Galileo Project, maintained by Albert Van Helden.

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Ezio Vailati

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