Personal Identity

First published Tue Aug 20, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jun 30, 2023

Personal identity deals with philosophical questions that arise about ourselves by virtue of our being people (or as lawyers and philosophers like to say, persons). This contrasts with questions about ourselves that arise by virtue of our being living things, conscious beings, moral agents, or material objects. Many of these questions occur to nearly all of us now and again: What am I? When did I begin? What will happen to me when I die? Others are more abstruse. They have been discussed since the origins of Western philosophy, and most major figures have had something to say about them. (There is also a rich but challenging literature on the topic in Eastern philosophy: see the entry on Mind in Indian Buddhist Philosophy.)

The topic is sometimes discussed under the protean term self. This term is sometimes synonymous with ‘person’, but often means something different: a sort of unchanging, immaterial subject of consciousness, for instance (as in the phrase ‘the myth of the self’). It is often used without any clear meaning and will be avoided here.

After surveying the main questions of personal identity, the entry will focus on our persistence through time.

1. The Problems of Personal Identity

There is no single problem of personal identity, but rather a wide range of questions that are at best loosely connected and not always distinguished. Here are the most familiar:

Characterization. Outside of philosophy, the term ‘personal identity’ commonly refers to properties to which we feel a special sense of attachment or ownership. My personal identity in this sense consists of those properties I take to “define me as a person” or “make me the person I am”. (The precise meaning of these phrases is hard to pin down.) To have an “identity crisis” is to become unsure of what my most characteristic properties are—of what sort of person I am in some deep and fundamental sense. This individual personal identity contrasts with my gender, ethnic, and national identity, which consist roughly of the sex, ethnic group, or nation I take myself to belong to and the importance I attach to this.

Someone’s personal identity in this sense is contingent and temporary: the way I define myself as a person might have been different, and can vary from one time to another. It is a subset, usually a small one, of the properties someone has: it could happen that being a philosopher and a parent belong to my identity but not being a man or a cyclist, while someone else has the same four properties but feels differently towards them, so that being a man and a cyclist belong to his identity but not being a philosopher or a parent. Someone may not even need to have the properties belonging to her identity: if I become convinced that I am Napoleon, being an emperor could be one of the properties central to the way I define myself and thus part of my identity, even though the belief is false.

What determines someone’s personal identity in this sense is sometimes called the characterization question (Schechtman 1996: 1). It asks, in the expectation of a deep and revealing psychological answer, Who am I? (Glover 1988: part 2 and Ludwig 1997 are useful discussions.)

Personhood. What is it to be a person, as opposed to a nonperson? What have we people got that nonpeople haven’t got? The question often arises in connection with specific cases: we may ask, for example, at what point in our development from a fertilized egg there comes to be a person, or what it would take for a chimpanzee or a Martian or a computer to be a person, if they could ever be. An ideal account of personhood would be a definition of the word ‘person’, filling the blanks in the formula ‘Necessarily, x is a person at time t if and only if … xt …’.

The most common answer is that to be a person is to have certain special mental properties. Locke, for instance, said that a person is “a thinking intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing, in different times and places” (1975: 335; Baker 2000: ch. 3 is a detailed account of this sort). Others propose a less direct connection between personhood and these special mental properties: for example that to be a person is be capable of acquiring them (Chisholm 1976: 136f.), or to belong to a kind whose members typically have them when healthy and mature (Wiggins 1980: ch. 6). (A very different answer is mentioned in section 6.)

Persistence. What does it take for a person to persist from one time to another—to continue existing rather than cease to exist? What sorts of things is it possible, in the broadest sense of the word ‘possible’, for you to survive, and what sort of event would necessarily bring your existence to an end? What determines which past or future being is you? Suppose you point to a child in an old class photograph and say, “That’s me.” What makes you that one rather than one of the others? What is it about the way she relates then to you as you are now that makes her you? For that matter, what makes it the case that anyone at all existing back then is you? This is sometimes called the question of personal identity over time, as it has to do with whether the earlier and the later being are one thing or two—that is, whether they are numerically identical. An answer to it is an account of our persistence conditions.

Historically this question often arises from the thought that we might continue existing after we die (as in Plato’s Phaedo). Whether this could happen depends on whether biological death necessarily brings our existence to an end. Imagine that after your death there really will be someone, in this world or the next, who resembles you in certain ways. How would she have to relate to you as you are now in order to be you, rather than someone else? What would the Higher Powers have to do to keep you in existence after your death? Or is it even possible? The answer to these questions depends on the answer to the persistence question.

Evidence. How do we find out who is who? What evidence bears on the question of whether the person here now is the one who was here yesterday? One source of evidence is first-person memory: if you remember doing some particular action (or seem to), and someone really did do it, this supports the claim that that person is you. Another source is physical resemblance: if the person who did it looks just like you—or better, if she is in some way physically or spatio-temporally continuous with you—that too supports her being you. Which of these sources is more fundamental? Does first-person memory count as evidence all by itself, or only insofar as we can check it against physical facts? What should we do when these considerations support opposing verdicts?

Suppose Charlie’s memories are erased and replaced with accurate memories (or apparent memories) of the life of someone long dead—Guy Fawkes, say (Williams 1956–7). Ought we to conclude on these grounds that the resulting person is not actually Charlie, but Guy Fawkes brought back to life? Or should we instead infer on the basis of physical continuity that he’s just Charlie with different memories? What principle would answer this question?

The evidence question dominated the anglophone literature on personal identity from the 1950s to the 1970s (Shoemaker 1963, 1970 and Penelhum 1967 are good examples). It’s important to distinguish it from the persistence question. What it takes for you to persist through time is one thing; how we ought to evaluate the relevant evidence is another. If the criminal had fingerprints just like yours, the courts may rightly conclude that he is you, but having your fingerprints is not what it is for a past or future being to be you: it’s neither necessary (you could survive without any fingers at all) nor sufficient (someone else could have fingerprints just like yours).

Population. If the persistence question is about which of the characters introduced at the beginning of a story have survived till the end of it, we may also ask how many are on the stage at any one time. What determines how many of us there are right now? If there are eight billion people on the earth at present, what facts—biological, psychological, or what have you—make that the right number?

You may think the number of people at any given time (or at least the number of human people) is simply the number of human organisms there are then. But this is disputed. Some say that cutting the main connections between the cerebral hemispheres results in radical disunity of consciousness so that two people share a single organism (Nagel 1971; for skeptical views see Wilkes 1988: ch. 5 and van Inwagen 1990: 188–212). Others say that a human being with multiple personality could literally be the home of two or more thinking beings (Wilkes 1988: 127f., Rovane 1998: 169ff.; see also Olson 2003, Snowdon 2014: ch. 7). Still others argue that two people can share an organism in cases of conjoined twinning (Campbell and McMahan 2016; see also Olson 2014).

The population question is sometimes called the problem of “synchronic identity”, as opposed to the “diachronic identity” of the persistence question; but these terms need careful handling. They are apt to give the mistaken impression that identity comes in two kinds, synchronic and diachronic. The truth is simply that there are two kinds of situations where we can ask how many people (or other things) there are: those involving just one moment and those involving several. To make matters worse, the term ‘synchronic identity’ is sometimes used to express the personhood question.

Personal ontology. What are we? What properties of metaphysical importance do we human people have, in addition to the mental properties that make us people? What, for instance, are we made of? Are we composed entirely of matter, as stones are, or are we partly or wholly immaterial? Where do our spatial boundaries lie, if we are spatially extended at all? Do we extend all the way out to our skin? If so, what fixes those boundaries? Do we have temporal as well as spatial parts? Are we substances—metaphysically independent beings—or is each of us a state or an activity of something else?

Here are some of the main proposed accounts of what we are (Olson 2007):

  • We are biological organisms (“animalism”: van Inwagen 1990, Olson 1997, 2003a).
  • We are material things “constituted by” organisms: a person is made of the same matter as a certain animal, but they are different things because what it takes for them to persist is different (Baker 2000, Johnston 2007, Shoemaker 2011).
  • We are temporal parts of animals: each of us stands to an organism as your childhood stands to your life as a whole (Lewis 1976).
  • We are spatial parts of animals: something like brains, perhaps (Campbell and McMahan 2016, Parfit 2012), or temporal parts of brains (Hudson 2001, 2007).
  • We are partless immaterial substances—souls—as Plato, Descartes, and Leibniz thought (Unger 2006: ch. 7), or compound things made up of an immaterial soul and a biological organism (Swinburne 1984: 21).
  • We are collections of mental states or events: “bundles of perceptions”, as Hume said (1978 [1739]: 252; see also Quinton 1962, Campbell 2006).
  • There is nothing that we are: we don’t really exist at all (Russell 1985: 50, Unger 1979, Sider 2013).

There is no consensus or even a dominant view on this question.

What matters in survival. What is the practical importance of facts about our persistence? Why does it matter? If you had to choose between continuing to exist or being annihilated and replaced by someone else exactly like you, what reason would you have to prefer one over the other? And what reason do you have to care about what will happen to you, as opposed to what will happen to other people? Or is there any such reason? Imagine that surgeons are going to put your brain into my head and that neither of us has any choice about this. The resulting person will be in terrible pain after the operation unless one of us pays a large sum in advance. If we were both entirely selfish, which of us would have a reason to pay? Will the resulting person—who will think he is you—be responsible for your actions or for mine? (Or both, or neither?) These questions are summarized in the phrase what matters in survival.

The answer may seem to turn entirely on whether the resulting person would be you or I. Only I can be responsible for my actions. The fact that some person is me, by itself, gives me a reason to care about him. Each person has a special, selfish interest in her own future and no one else’s. Identity itself (numerical identity) is what matters in survival. But some say that I could have an entirely selfish reason to care about someone else’s future for his own sake. Perhaps what gives me a reason to care about what happens to the man people will call by my name tomorrow is not that he is me, but that he is then psychologically continuous with me as I am now (see Section 4). If someone else were psychologically continuous tomorrow with me as I am now, he would have what matters to me and I ought to transfer my selfish concern to him. Likewise, someone else could be responsible for my actions, and not for his own. Identity itself has no practical importance. (Sosa (1990) and Merricks (2022) argue for the importance of identity; Parfit (1971, 1984: 215, 1995) and Martin (1998) argue against.)

That completes our survey. Though some of these questions may bear on others, they are to a large extent independent. Many discussions of personal identity leave it unclear which one is at stake.

2. Understanding the Persistence Question

Turn now to the persistence question. Few concepts have led to more misunderstanding than identity over time. The persistence question is often confused with others or stated in a tendentious way.

It asks roughly what is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be someone existing now. If we point to you now, then describe someone or something existing at another time, we can ask whether we are referring twice to one thing or once to each of two things. The persistence question is what determines the answer to such queries. (And there are precisely analogous questions about the persistence of other things, such as dogs or stones.)

Here are three common misunderstandings of this question. Some take it to ask what it means to say that a past or future being is you. This would imply that we can answer it simply by reflecting on our linguistic knowledge—on what we mean by the word ‘person’, for example. The answer would be knowable a priori. It would also imply that necessarily all people have the same persistence conditions—that the answer to the question is the same no matter what sort of people we considered. Though some endorse these claims (Noonan 2019b: 84–93), they are disputed. What it takes for us to persist might depend on whether we are biological organisms, which we cannot know a priori. And if there could be immaterial people—gods or angels, say—what it takes for them to persist might differ from what it takes for a human person to persist. In that case our persistence conditions could not be established by linguistic or conceptual analysis.

Second, the persistence question is often confused with the question of what it takes for someone to remain the same person (as in this passage by Bertrand Russell (1957: 70): “Before we can profitably discuss whether we shall continue to exist after death, it is well to be clear as to the sense in which a man is the same person as he was yesterday.”) If Baffles were to change in certain ways—if she lost much of her memory, say, or changed dramatically in character, or became severely disabled—we might ask whether she would still be the person she was before, or instead become a different person. This is not a question about persistence—about numerical identity over time. To ask whether Baffles is the same person that she was before, or to say that she is a different person from the one she used to be, presupposes that she herself existed at the earlier time. The question arises only when numerical identity is assumed. To ask about Baffles’ persistence, by contrast, is to ask not whether she has continued to be the same person, but whether she has continued to exist at all.

When we speak of someone’s remaining the same person or becoming a different one, we mean remaining or ceasing to be a certain sort of person. For someone no longer to be the same person is for her still to exist, but to have changed in some important way. This typically has to do with her individual identity in the sense of the characterization question—with changes in respect of those properties that “define someone as a person.”

Third, the persistence question is often taken to ask what it takes for the same person to exist at two different times. The most common formulation is something like this:

  1. If a person x exists at one time and a person y exists at another time, under what possible circumstances is it the case that x is y?

This asks, in effect, what it takes for a past or future person to be you, or for you to continue existing as a person. We have a person existing at one time and a person existing at another, and the question is what is necessary and sufficient for them to be one person rather than two.

This is narrower than the persistence question. We may want to know whether each of us was ever an embryo, or whether we could survive in an irreversible vegetative state (where the resulting being is biologically alive but has no mental properties). These are clearly questions about what it takes for us to persist. But as personhood is most commonly defined (recall Locke’s definition quoted earlier), something is a person at a given time only if it has certain special mental properties at that time. Embryos and human beings in a vegetative state, having no mental properties at all, are thus not people when they’re in that condition. And in that case we cannot infer anything about whether you were once an embryo or could exist in a vegetative state from a principle about what it takes for a past or future person to be you.

We can illustrate the point by considering this answer to question 1:

Necessarily, a person x existing at one time is a person y existing at another time if and only if x can, at the first time, remember an experience y has at the second time, or vice versa.

That is, a past or future person is you just if you (who are now a person) can now remember an experience she had then, or she can then remember an experience you’re having now. Call this the memory criterion. (It too is often attributed to Locke, though it’s uncertain whether he actually held it: see Behan 1979.)

The memory criterion may seem to imply that if you were to lapse into an irreversible vegetative state, you would cease to exist (or perhaps pass to the next world): the resulting being could not be you because it would not remember anything. But no such conclusion follows. Assuming that an organism in a vegetative state is not a person, this is not a case involving a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time. The memory criterion can only tell us which past or future person you are, not which past or future being generally. It says what it takes for someone to persist as a person, but not what it takes for someone to persist without qualification. So it implies nothing about whether you could exist in a vegetative state or even as a corpse, or whether you were once an embryo. As stated, it’s compatible with your surviving with no memory continuity at all, as long as this happens when you are not a person (Olson 1997: 22–26, Mackie 1999: 224–228).

No advocate of the memory criterion would accept this. The view is intended to imply that if a person x exists now and a being y exists at another time—whether or not it’s a person then—they are one just if x can now remember an experience y has at the other time or vice versa. But this not an answer to Question 1: what it takes for a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time to be one rather than two. It’s an answer to a more general question: what it takes for something that is a person at one time to exist at another time as well, whether or not it’s a person then:

  1. If a person x exists at one time and something y exists at another time, under what possible circumstances is it the case that x is y?

Those who ask Question 1 are commonly assuming that every person is a person essentially: nothing that is in fact a person could possibly exist without being a person. (By contrast, no student is a student essentially: something that is in fact a student can exist without being a student.) This claim, “person essentialism,” implies that whatever is a person at one time must be a person at every time when she exists, making Questions 1 and 2 equivalent.

But person essentialism is controversial (Olson and Witt 2020). Combined with a Lockean account of personhood, it implies that you were never an embryo: at best you may have come into being when the embryo that gave rise to you developed certain mental capacities. Nor could you exist in a vegetative state. It rules out the brute-physical view described in the next section. Whether we were once embryos or could exist in a vegetative state, or whether we are people essentially, would seem to be substantive questions that an account of our persistence should answer, not matters to be presupposed in the way we frame the debate.

3. Accounts of Our Persistence

Three main sorts of answers to the persistence question have been proposed. Psychological-continuity views say that our persistence consists in some psychological relation, the memory criterion mentioned earlier being an example. You are that future being that in some sense inherits its mental features from you—beliefs, memories, preferences, the capacity for rational thought, and so on—and you are that past being whose mental features you have inherited in this way. There is dispute over what sort of inheritance this has to be—whether it must be underpinned by some kind of physical continuity, for instance, and whether it requires a “non-branching” restriction—and about what mental features need to be inherited. (We will return to some of these points.) But most philosophers writing on personal identity since the early 20th century have endorsed some version of this view: e.g. Dainton 2008, Hudson (2001, 2007), Johnston (1987, 2016), Lewis (1976), Nagel (1986: 40), Parfit (1971; 1984: 207; 2012), Shoemaker (1970; 1984: 90; 1997; 1999, 2008, 2011), Unger (1990: ch. 5; 2000).

A second answer is that our persistence consists in a physical relation not involving psychology: you are that past or future being that has your body, or that is the same biological organism as you are, or the like. Call these brute-physical views. (Advocates include Ayers (1990: 278–292), Carter (1989), Olson (1997), Snowdon (2014), van Inwagen (1990: 142–188), and Williams (1956–7, 1970).)

Some try to combine these views, saying that we need both mental and physical continuity to survive, or that either would suffice without the other (Nozick 1981: ch. 1, Langford 2014, Madden 2016, Noonan 2021).

Both views agree that there is something that it takes for us to persist—that there are informative, nontrivial, necessary and sufficient conditions for a person existing at one time to exist at another time. A third view, anticriterialism, denies this. Psychological and physical continuity are evidence for persistence, it says, but do not always guarantee it and may not be required. The clearest advocate of this view is Merricks (1998; see also Swinburne 1984, Lowe 1996: 41ff., 2012; Langford 2017; for criticism see Zimmerman 1998, Shoemaker 2012). There is also debate about how anticriterialism should be understood (Olson 2012, Noonan 2011, 2019a).

4. Psychological-Continuity Views

Most people—most Western philosophy teachers and students, anyway—feel immediately drawn to psychological-continuity views. If your brain were transplanted, and that organ carried with it your memories and other mental features, the resulting person would be convinced that he or she was you. This can make it easy to suppose that she would be you, and this would be so because of her psychological relation to you. But there is no easy path from this thought to an attractive answer to the persistence question.

What psychological relation might it be? We have already mentioned memory: a past or future being might be you just if you can now remember an experience she had then or vice versa. This proposal faces two historical objections, dating to Sergeant and Berkeley in the 18th century (see Behan 1979) but more famously discussed by Reid and Butler (see the snippets in Perry 1975).

First, suppose a young student is fined for overdue library books, and as a middle-aged lawyer remembers paying the fine. In her dotage, however, she remembers her law career but has entirely forgotten not only paying the fine but all the other events of her youth. According to the memory criterion the young student is the middle-aged lawyer, the lawyer is the elderly woman, but the elderly woman is not the young student. This is an impossible result: if x and y are one and y and z are one, x and z cannot be two. Identity is transitive; memory continuity is not.

Second, it seems to belong to the very idea of remembering that you can remember only your own experiences. To remember paying a fine (or the experience of it) is to remember yourself paying. That makes it uninformative to say that you are the person whose experiences you can remember—that memory continuity is sufficient for us to persist. It’s uninformative because we could not know whether someone genuinely remembers a past experience without already knowing whether she is the one who had it. Suppose we ask whether Blott, who exists now, is the same as Clott, whom we know to have existed at some past time. The memory criterion tells us that Blott is Clott just if Blott can now remember an experience Clott had then. But Blott’s seeming to remember one of Clott’s experiences counts as genuine memory only if Blott actually is Clott. So we should already have to know whether Blott is Clott before we could apply the principle that is supposed to tell us whether she is. (There is, however, nothing uninformative about the claim that memory connections are necessary for us to persist—that you cannot survive in a condition in which you are unable to remember anything, for example.)

One response to the first problem (about transitivity) is to modify the memory criterion by switching from direct to indirect memory connections: the old woman is the young student because she can recall experiences the lawyer had at a time when the lawyer remembered the student’s life. The second problem is commonly met by replacing memory with “quasi-memory”, which is just like memory but without the identity requirement: even if it’s impossible to remember doing something you didn’t do but someone else did, you could still “quasi-remember” it (Penelhum 1970: 85ff., Shoemaker 1970; for criticism see McDowell 1997).

But there remains the obvious problem that there are many times in our pasts that we cannot remember or quasi-remember at all, and to which we are not linked even indirectly by an overlapping chain of memories. There is no time when you could recall anything that happened to you while you dreamlessly slept last night. The memory criterion has the absurd implication that you have never existed at any time when you were unconscious, and that the person sleeping in your bed last night was someone else.

A better solution replaces memory with the more general notion of causal dependence (Shoemaker 1984, 89ff.). We can define two notions, psychological connectedness and psychological continuity. A being is psychologically connected, at some future time, with you as you are now just if she is in the psychological states she is in then in large part because of the psychological states you are in now (and this causal link is of the right sort: see Shoemaker 1979). Having a current memory (or quasi-memory) of an earlier experience is one sort of psychological connection—the experience causes the memory of it—but there are others. The important point is that our current mental states can be caused in part by mental states we were in at times when we were unconscious. For example, most of your current beliefs are the same ones you had while you slept last night: they have caused themselves to continue existing. You are then psychologically continuous, now, with a past or future being just if some of your current mental states relate to those he or she is in then by a chain of psychological connections.

That would enable us to say that a person x who exists at one time is the same thing as something y existing at another time just if x is, at the one time, psychologically continuous with y as it is at the other time. This avoids the most obvious objections to the memory criterion.

It still leaves important questions unanswered, however. Suppose we could somehow copy all the mental contents of your brain to mine, much as we can copy the contents of one computer drive to another, thereby erasing the previous contents of both brains. Whether this would be a case of psychological continuity depends on what sort of causal dependence counts. The resulting being (with my brain and your mental contents) would be mentally as you were before, and not as I was. He would have inherited your mental properties in a way—but a funny one. Is it the right way? Could you literally move from one organism to another by “brain-state transfer”? Psychological-continuity theorists disagree. (Shoemaker (1984: 108–111, 1997) says yes; Unger (1990: 67–71) says no; see also van Inwagen 1997.)

5. Fission

A more serious worry for psychological-continuity views is that you could be psychologically continuous with two past or future people at once. If your cerebrum—the upper part of the brain largely responsible for mental features—were transplanted, the recipient would be psychologically continuous with you by anyone’s lights, and any psychological-continuity view will imply that she would be you. If we destroyed one of your cerebral hemispheres, the resulting being would also be psychologically continuous with you. (Hemispherectomy—even the removal of the left hemisphere, which controls speech—is sometimes carried out as a treatment for severe epilepsy: see Shurtleff et al. 2021.) And it would be the same if we did both at once, destroying one hemisphere and transplanting the other: the recipient would be you on any psychological-continuity view.

But now suppose that both hemispheres are transplanted, each into a different empty head. (We needn’t pretend that the hemispheres are exactly alike.) The two recipients—call them Lefty and Righty—will each be psychologically continuous with you. The psychological-continuity view as we have stated it implies that any being who is psychologically continuous with you must be you. It follows that you are Lefty and also that you are Righty. But that again is an impossible result: if you and Lefty are one and you and Righty are one, Lefty and Righty cannot be two. And yet they are: there are evidently two people after the operation. One thing cannot be numerically identical with two different things.

Psychological-continuity theorists have proposed two different solutions to this problem. One, sometimes called the “multiple-occupancy view”, says that if there is fission in your future, then there are two of you, so to speak, even now. What we think of as you is really two people, who are now exactly similar and located in the same place, doing the same things and thinking the same thoughts. The surgeons merely separate them (Lewis 1976, Perry 1972, Noonan 2019b: 141–144).

The multiple-occupancy view is usually combined with the general metaphysical claim that people and other persisting things are composed of temporal parts (often called “four-dimensionalism”; see Hudson 2001, Sider 2001a, Olson 2007: ch. 5). For each person, there is, for example, such a thing as her first half: an entity just like the person only briefer, like the first half of a meeting. On this account, the multiple-occupancy view is that Lefty and Righty coincide before the operation by sharing their pre-operative temporal parts or “stages”, then diverge by having different temporal parts located afterwards. They are like two roads that coincide for a stretch and then fork, sharing some of their spatial parts but not others. Much as the roads are just like one road where they overlap, Lefty and Righty are just like one person before the operation when they share their temporal parts. Even they themselves can’t tell that they are two. There are two coinciding people before the operation because of what happens later, just as there may be coinciding two roads here because of what’s the case elsewhere. Whether we really are composed of temporal parts, however, is disputed. (Its consequences are explored further in section 8.)

The solution more commonly proposed by psychological-continuity theorists abandons the claim that psychological continuity by itself suffices for us to persist, and says that a past or future being is you only if she is then psychologically continuous with you and no other being then is. (There is no circularity in this. We need not know the answer to the persistence question in order to know how many people there are at any one time: that comes under the population question.) So neither Lefty nor Righty is you: they both come into existence when your cerebrum is divided. If both your cerebral hemispheres are transplanted, you cease to exist—though you would survive if only one were transplanted and the other destroyed. Fission is death. (Shoemaker 1984: 85, Parfit 1984: 207; 2012: 6f., Unger 1990: 265).

This proposal, the “non-branching view”, has the surprising consequence that if your brain is divided, you will survive if only one half is preserved, but you will die if both halves are. That looks like the opposite of what we should expect: if your survival depends on the functioning of your brain (because that’s what underlies psychological continuity), then the more of that organ we preserve, the greater ought to be your chance of surviving.

In fact the non-branching view implies that transplanting one hemisphere and leaving the other in place would be fatal. Its consequences are especially surprising if brain-state transfer counts as psychological continuity: in that case, even copying your total brain state to another brain without doing you any physical harm would kill you.

These consequences are not only hard to believe, but mysterious as well. Keeping half your brain functioning is normally sufficient for your survival, according to psychological-continuity views. Why then would you not survive if the other half too were kept functioning, separate from the first? How could an event that would normally ensure your survival destroy you if accompanied by a second such event having no causal effect on the first (Noonan 2019b: 128–141)?

The non-branching view is largely responsible for the interest in the question of what matters in identity. Faced with the prospect of having one of your hemispheres transplanted, there is no evident reason to want the other one to be destroyed. Most of us, it seems, would rather have both preserved, even if they go into different heads. Yet on the non-branching view that is to prefer death over continued existence. This leads Parfit and others to say that that is precisely what we ought to prefer. We have no reason to want to continue existing, at least for its own sake. What you have reason to want (assuming that your life is going well) is that there be someone in the future who is psychologically continuous with you, whether or not she is you. The usual way to achieve this is to continue existing yourself, but on the non-branching view it’s not necessary.

Likewise, even the most selfish person may have a reason to care about the welfare of the beings who would result from her undergoing fission, whether or not either of them would be her. The non-branching view suggests that the sorts of practical concerns you ordinarily have for yourself can apply to someone other than you. More generally, facts about numerical identity—about who is who—have no practical importance. All that matters is who is psychologically continuous with whom. Psychological-continuity views are often said to be superior to brute-physical views in accounting for what matters in identity. Fission cases threaten this claim. (Lewis 1976 and Parfit 1976 debate whether the multiple-occupancy view can preserve the conviction that identity is what matters practically.)

6. The Too-Many-Thinkers Objection

Another objection to psychological-continuity views is that they rule out our being biological organisms (Carter 1989, Ayers 1990: 278–292, Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997: 80f., 100–109). This is because no sort of psychological continuity appears to be either necessary or sufficient for a human organism to persist.

We can see that it’s not necessary by noting that each human organism persists as an embryo without psychological continuity. And we can see that it’s not sufficient by imagining that your brain is transplanted. In that case the recipient would be uniquely psychologically continuous with you, and this continuity would be continuously physically realized. Any psychological-continuity view implies that she would be you. More generally, any person would go with her transplanted brain. But it does not appear as if any organism would go with its transplanted brain. It looks as if the operation would simply move an organ from one organism to another, like transplanting a liver. It follows that if you were an organism, you would stay behind with an empty head, contrary to psychological-continuity views.

Psychological-continuity views do not merely rule out our being essentially or “fundamentally” organisms, but our being organisms at all. They say that each person has the property of persisting by virtue of psychological continuity: of being such that psychological continuity (perhaps with a non-branching restriction) is both necessary and sufficient for it to continue existing. But no organism has this property. (Or at least no human organism does, and we are clearly not non-human organisms.) Or again: every person would go with her transplanted brain, but no organism would do so. And if every person has a property that no organism has, then no person is an organism.

That is said to be a problem for psychological-continuity views because healthy, adult human organisms appear to be conscious and intelligent. Suppose they are. And suppose, as psychological-continuity views appear to imply, that we ourselves are not organisms. Three awkward consequences follow.

First, you are one of two intelligent beings sitting there and reading this entry: there is, in addition to you, an organism reading it. More generally, there are two thinking beings wherever we thought there was just one, a person and an organism distinct from it.

Second, we would expect the organism not just to be intelligent, but to be psychologically indistinguishable from you. That would make it a person, if being a person amounts to having mental special properties (as on Locke’s definition)—a second person in addition to you. In that case it cannot be true that all people (or even all human people) persist by virtue of psychological continuity, contrary to psychological-continuity views. Some—those who are organisms—would have brute-physical persistence conditions.

Third, it’s hard to see how you could know whether you yourself were the nonanimal person with psychological persistence conditions or the animal person with brute-physical ones. If you thought you were the nonanimal, the organism would use the same reasoning to conclude that it was too. For all you could ever know, it seems, you might be the one making this mistake.

We can illustrate the nature of this epistemic problem by imagining a three-dimensional duplicating machine. When you step into the “in” box, it reads off your complete physical (and mental) condition and uses this information to assemble a perfect duplicate of you in the “out” box. The process causes momentary unconsciousness but is otherwise harmless. Two beings wake up, one in each box. The boxes are indistinguishable. Because each being will have the same apparent memories and perceive identical surroundings, each will think, for the same reasons, that he or she is you—but only one will be right. If this happened to you, it’s hard to see how you could know, afterwards, whether you were the original or the duplicate. (Suppose the technicians who work the machine are sworn to secrecy and immune to bribes.) You would think, “Who am I? Did I do the things I seem to remember doing, or did I come into being only a moment ago, complete with false memories of someone else’s life?” And you would have no way of answering these questions. In the same way, psychological-continuity views raise the questions, “What am I? Am I a nonanimal that would go with its brain if that organ were transplanted, or an animal that would stay behind with an empty head?” And here too there seem to be no grounds on which to answer them.

This is the “too-many-thinkers” or “thinking-animal” objection to psychological-continuity views. The most popular defense against it is to say that, despite sharing our brains and showing all the outward signs of consciousness and intelligence, human organisms do not think and are not conscious. There simply are no thinking animals to create problems for psychological-continuity views (Shoemaker 1984: 92–97, Lowe 1996: 1, Johnston 2007: 55; Baker 2000 offers a more complex variant).

But although this is easy to say, it’s hard to defend. If human organisms cannot be conscious and intelligent, it would seem to follow that no biological organism could have any mental properties at all. This threatens to imply that human organisms are “zombies” in the philosophical sense: beings physically identical to conscious beings, with the same behavior, but lacking consciousness (Olson 2018). And it leaves us wondering why organisms cannot be conscious. The best proposed answer is given by Shoemaker (1999, 2008, 2011), who argues that it is because organisms have the wrong persistence conditions, but it’s highly controversial.

A second option is to concede that human organisms are psychologically indistinguishable from us, but try to explain how we can still know that we are not those organisms. The best-known proposal of this sort focuses on personhood and first-person reference. It says that not just any being with mental properties of the sort that you and I have—rationality and self-consciousness, for instance—counts as a person (contrary to anything like Locke’s definition). A person must also persist by virtue of psychological continuity. It follows that human animals are not people (thus avoiding the second awkward consequence, about personhood).

Further, personal pronouns such as ‘I’, and the thoughts they express, refer only to people in this sense. So when your animal body says or thinks ‘I’, it refers not to itself but to you, the person. The organism’s statement ‘I am a person’ does not express the false belief that it is a person, but the true belief that you are. So the organism is not mistaken about which thing it is: it has no first-person beliefs about itself at all. And you’re not mistaken either. You can infer that you are a person from the linguistic facts that you are whatever you refer to when you say ‘I’, and that ‘I’ never refers to anything but a person. You can know that you are not the animal thinking your thoughts because it is not a person and personal pronouns never refer to nonpeople (thus avoiding the third, epistemic consequence; see Noonan 1998, 2010, Olson 2002; for a different approach see Brueckner and Buford 2009).

The too-many-thinkers problem arises on the assumption that we are not organisms, which appears to follow from psychological-continuity views because organisms don’t seem to persist by virtue of psychological continuity. But some say that human organisms do persist by virtue of psychological continuity. Although you are an organism, the transplant operation would not move your brain from one organism to another, but would cut an organism down to the size of a brain, move it across the room, and then give it new parts to replace the ones it lost. The view is sometimes called “new animalism” (Madden 2016, Noonan 2021; see also Langford 2014, Olson 2015: 102–106).

7. Animalism and Brute-Physical Views

Animalism says that we human people are organisms. This does not imply that all organisms, or even all human organisms, are people: as we saw earlier, human embryos and animals in a vegetative state are not people on the most common definitions of that term. Being a person may be only a temporary property of us, like being a student. Nor does it imply that all people are organisms: it is consistent with there being wholly inorganic people such as gods or intelligent robots. Animalism is not an answer to the personhood question. (It is consistent, for instance, with Locke’s definition of ‘person’.)

The dominant view among both animalists and their opponents is that organisms persist by virtue of some sort of brute-physical continuity with no psychological element. So most animalists accept a brute-physical account of our persistence. And most advocates of brute-physical views take us to be organisms. This suggests that we have the same persistence conditions as certain nonpeople, such as oysters. And our persistence conditions differ from those of immaterial people, if there could be such things, so that there are no persistence conditions for people as such. Though some object to this (Baker 2000: 124), many psychological-continuity theorists say that all beings with mental properties have the same persistence conditions (Shoemaker 2008, Unger 2000), which has the same implication.

The most common objection to brute-physical views (and, by extension, to animalism) focuses on their implication that transplanting your brain into my head would not give you a new body, but would give me a new brain. You would stay behind with an empty head (e.g. Unger 2000; for an important related objection see Johnston 2007, 2016). Animalists generally concede that this is counterintuitive, but take this fact to be outweighed by other considerations: that we appear to be organisms, for example, that it’s hard to say what sort of nonorganisms we might be, and that our being organisms would avoid the too-many-thinkers problem. And animalism is compatible with our beliefs about who is who in real life: every actual case in which we take someone to survive or perish is a case where a human organism does so. Psychological-continuity views, by contrast, conflict with the appearance that each of us was once a foetus. When we see an ultrasound picture of a 12-week-old foetus, we ordinarily think we’re seeing something that will, if all goes well, be born, learn to speak, and eventually become an adult human person, yet no person is in any way psychologically continuous with a 12-week-old foetus.

And the “transplant objection” may be less compelling than it first appears (Snowdon 2014: 234). Suppose you had a tumor that would kill you unless your brain were replaced with a healthy donated organ. This would have grave side-effects: it would destroy your memories, plans, preferences, and other mental properties. It may not be clear whether you could survive it, even if the operation were successful. But is it really obvious that you could not survive it? Maybe it could save your life, though at great cost. And this might be so, the argument goes, even if the new brain gave you memories, plans, and preferences from the donor. But if it’s not obvious that the brain recipient would not be you, then it’s not obvious that it would be the donor. A brain transplant might be metaphysically analogous to a liver transplant. Again, the claim is not that this is obviously true, but only that it’s not obviously false. And in that case it’s not obvious that a person must go with her transplanted brain. (Williams 1970 argues in a similar way.)

8. Wider Themes

The debate between psychological-continuity and brute-physical views cannot be settled without considering more general matters outside of personal identity. For instance, psychological-continuity theorists need to explain why human organisms are unable to think as we do. This will require an account of the nature of mental properties. Or if human organisms can think, psychological-continuity theorists will want an account of how we can know that we are not those organisms. This will turn on how the reference of personal pronouns and proper names works, or on the nature of knowledge.

Some general metaphysical views suggest that there is no unique right answer to the persistence question. The best-known example is the ontology of temporal parts mentioned in section 5. It says that for every period of time when you exist, short or long, there is a temporal part of you that exists only then. This gives us many likely candidates for being you—that is, many different beings now sitting there and reading this. Suppose you are a material thing, and that we know what determines your spatial boundaries. That should tell us what counts as your current temporal part or “stage”—the temporal part of you located now and at no other time. But that stage is a part of a vast number of temporally extended objects (Hudson 2001: ch. 4).

For instance, it is a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological continuity (Section 4) among its stages. That is, one of the beings thinking your current thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically continuous with each of the others and with no other stage. If this is what you are, then you persist by virtue of psychological continuity. Your current stage is also a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological connectedness. That is, one of the beings now thinking your thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically connected with each of the others and to no other stage. This may not be the same as the first being, as some stages may be psychologically continuous with your current stage but not psychologically connected with it. If this is what you are, then psychological connectedness is necessary and sufficient for you to persist (Lewis 1976). What’s more, your current stage is a part of an organism, which persists by virtue of brute-physical continuity, and a part of many bizarre and gerrymandered objects (Hirsch 1982, ch. 10). Some even say that you are your current stage itself (Sider 2001a, 188–208). And there would be many other candidates.

The temporal-parts ontology implies that each of us shares our current thoughts with countless beings that diverge from one another in the past or future. If this were true, which of these things should we be? Of course, we are the things we refer to when we say ‘I’, or more generally the referents of our personal pronouns and proper names. But these words would be unlikely to succeed in referring to just one sort of thing—to only one of the many candidates on each occasion of utterance. There would probably be some indeterminacy of reference, so that each such utterance referred ambiguously to many different candidates. That would make it indeterminate what things, and even what sort of things, we are. And insofar as the candidates have different histories and different persistence conditions, it would be indeterminate when we came into being and what it takes for us to persist (Sider 2001b).


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Some material in this entry appeared previously in E. Olson, ‘Personal Identity’, in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by S. Stich and T. Warfield, Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.

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