First published Mon Sep 8, 2003; substantive revision Sat Mar 25, 2023

Zombies in philosophy are imaginary creatures designed to illuminate problems about consciousness and its relation to the physical world. Unlike the ones in films or witchcraft, they are exactly like us in all physical respects but without conscious experiences: by definition there is ‘nothing it is like’ to be a zombie. Yet zombies behave just like us, and some even spend a lot of time discussing consciousness.

Few people, if any, think zombies actually exist. But many hold they are at least conceivable, and some that they are possible. It seems that if zombies really are possible, then physicalism is false and some kind of dualism is true. For many philosophers that is the chief importance of the zombie idea. But it is also valuable for the stimulus and focus it gives to wider philosophical theorizing about consciousness and other aspects of the mind. It also figures in more general metaphysical and epistemological investigations, for example by raising questions about the relations between imaginability, conceivability, and possibility, and by reactivating the ‘other minds’ problem.

1. The idea of zombies

Descartes held that non-human animals are automata: their behavior is wholly explicable in terms of physical mechanisms. But human behavior (he argued) could not be explained like that. Exploring the idea of a machine that would look and behave like a human being, he thought two things would unmask it: it could not use language creatively, and it could not produce appropriate non-verbal behavior in arbitrarily various situations (Discourse V). For him, therefore, no machine could behave like a human being. Knowing only seventeenth century technology, he concluded that to explain distinctively human behavior required something beyond the physical: an immaterial mind, interacting with processes in the brain and the rest of the body. (Importantly, he also had a priori arguments for the same conclusion, one of which anticipates the ‘conceivability argument’ discussed in Section 3 below.) If he is right, there could not be a world physically like the actual world but lacking such minds: human bodies would not work properly. If we suddenly lost our minds our bodies might continue to run on for a while: our hearts might continue to beat, we might breathe while asleep and digest food; we might even walk or sing in a mindless sort of way (so he implies in his Reply to Objections IV). But without the contribution made by minds, behavior could not show characteristically human features. So although Descartes did everything short of spelling out the idea of zombies, the question of their possibility did not arise for him. The nearest thing was automata whose behavior was easily recognizable as not fully human.

In the nineteenth century scientists began to think that physics was capable of explaining all physical events that were explicable at all. It seemed that every physical effect has a physical cause: that the physical world is ‘closed under causation’. The developing science of neurophysiology was set to extend such explanations to human behavior. But if human behavior is explicable physically, how does consciousness fit into the story? One response — physicalism (or materialism) — is to insist that consciousness too involves only physical processes. However, the phenomena of consciousness are hard to account for in those terms, and some thinkers concluded with Descartes that something nonphysical must be involved. Given they accepted the causal closure of the physical, they were forced to conclude that consciousness has no effects on the physical world. On this view human beings are ‘conscious automata’, as T. H. Huxley put it: all physical events, human behavior included, are explicable in terms of physical processes; and the phenomena of consciousness are causally inert by-products — epiphenomena (see James 1890, Chapter 5). It eventually became clear that this view entailed there could be purely physical organisms exactly like us except for lacking consciousness. G. F. Stout argued that if epiphenomenalism (the more familiar name for the ‘conscious automaton’ theory) is true,

it ought to be quite credible that the constitution and course of nature would be otherwise just the same as it is if there were not and never had been any experiencing individuals. Human bodies would still have gone through the motions of making and using bridges, telephones and telegraphs, of writing and reading books, of speaking in Parliament, of arguing about materialism, and so on. There can be no doubt that this is prima facie incredible to Common Sense (Stout 1931: 138f.).

What Stout describes here and finds prima facie incredible is a zombie world: an entire world whose physical processes are closed under causation (as the epiphenomenalists he was attacking held) and exactly duplicate those in the actual world, but where there are no conscious experiences.

Similar ideas were current in discussions of physicalism in the 1970s. As a counterexample to the psychophysical identity theory there was an ‘imitation man’, whose ‘brain-states exactly paralleled ours in their physico-chemical properties’ but who felt no pains and saw no colors (Campbell 1970). Zombies were put forward as a counterexample to physicalism in general, and arguments devised to back up the intuition that they are possible (Kirk 1974a, 1974b). However, these arguments fell short of their target because they depended on much the same cluster of intuitions as the original idea.

Other kinds of systems were envisaged which behaved like normal human beings, or were even functionally like human beings, but lacked the ‘qualia’ we have (Block 1980a, 1980b, 1981; Shoemaker 1975, 1981). (Roughly, qualia are the properties by which we classify experiences according to ‘what they are like’: what it is like to smell roasting coffee beans, for example. Even physicalists can use this expression, although unlike dualists they take qualia to be physical.) The most systematic use of the zombie idea against physicalism is by David Chalmers 1996, whose important contributions to the debate will be considered shortly.

If zombies are to be counterexamples to physicalism, it is not enough for them to be behaviorally and functionally like normal human beings: plenty of physicalists accept that merely behavioral or functional duplicates of ourselves might lack qualia. Zombies must be like normal human beings in all physical respects, and they must have the physical properties that physicalists suppose we have. This requires them to be subject to the causal closure of the physical, which is why their supposed lack of consciousness is a challenge to physicalism. If instead they were to be conceived of as creatures whose behavior could not be explained physically, physicalists would have no reason to bother with the idea: there is plenty of evidence that, as epiphenomenalists hold, our movements actually are explicable in physical terms (see e.g. Papineau 2002).

The usual assumption is that none of us is actually a zombie, and that zombies cannot exist in our world. The central question, however, is not whether zombies can exist in our world, but whether they, or a whole zombie world (which is sometimes a more appropriate idea to work with), are possible in some broader sense.

2. Zombies and physicalism

A metaphor of Saul Kripke’s helps to show how the zombie idea threatens physicalism (Kripke 1972/80, 153f.). Imagine God creating the world and deciding to bring into existence the whole of the purely physical universe. Having created this physical universe, did he have to do any more work to provide for consciousness? Answering yes to this question implies there is more to consciousness than the physical facts alone can supply. If nothing else, it implies that consciousness depends at least partly on nonphysical properties, ones that would not exist in a purely physical world; it would be a zombie world. Physicalists, on the other hand, are committed to answering no. They have to say that by fixing the purely physical facts, God did everything necessary to fix the mental facts about the organisms thereby created, including their thoughts, feelings, emotions, and experiences. In other words, it seems that physicalists must say that in some sense the purely physical truths entail the mental truths (Kirk 1974a, 1974b argued that physicalism requires an ‘Entailment Thesis’ to that effect). If indeed fixing the physical facts alone is enough to fix the mental facts, then a zombie world is impossible.

Not everyone agrees that physicalism entails the impossibility of zombies. One suggestion is that physicalists can concede there are possible worlds which are exact duplicates of our world in all purely physical respects, but where the physical properties which give rise to consciousness in our world are prevented from doing so by nonphysical items which block consciousness. That would let physicalists consistently allow the possibility of zombie worlds (Leuenberger 2008. On such ‘blockers’ see Hawthorne 2002b; Chalmers 2010, 163–165). This approach, however, is inconsistent with maintaining that actual conscious states are either identical with or constituted by physical or functional states. If my conscious state is the same as or constituted by a physical state, then there is no possible world where the latter exists without the former. It is therefore not clear that physicalists can consistently allow the possibility of consciousness-blockers. Lei Zhong 2021 takes a very different approach, challenging the widely held view that physicalism commits one to the supervenience of the mental on the physical.

But what kind of impossibility is relevant here? Physicalists cannot just say zombies are ruled out by the laws of nature, since even dualists can agree they are impossible in that sense: that it is by nomological necessity that the physical facts about us bring consciousness with them. Physicalism therefore needs something stronger.

Two further kinds of necessity are usually considered: logical and metaphysical. Now, many philosophers (largely influenced by the zombie idea) believe the connection from physical facts to consciousness cannot be logical even in a broad sense. And certainly the conceptual scheme of physics does not appear to leave room for logical links from physical to phenomenal (see e.g. Kriegel 2011; Stoljar 2006). However, some argue that nevertheless zombies are not really conceivable at all (Kirk 2005, 2008, 2013; Tye 2006); Kirk 2013 also maintains that although the physical facts do not entail the truth about conscious experience a priori, they nevertheless entail it by logical necessity.

Still, many physicalists hold that what guarantees the impossibility of zombies is ‘metaphysical’ necessity. Typically they maintain that states of phenomenal consciousness are identical with physical states, and that these identities are necessary a posteriori as argued by Kripke (see e.g. McLaughlin 2005, and for criticism, Stoljar 2000). But the vocabulary of possibility and necessity is slippery. For example there is disagreement over whether logical and metaphysical possibility are different (section 3.1 below); when Kripke (1972/80) writes of ‘logical’ and ‘metaphysical’ possibility he seems to use those words interchangeably (Yablo 1999: 457n.), and some use ‘logical’ where others prefer ‘conceptual’ (Chalmers 1999: 477); compare Latham 2000, 72f.).

Many think that if the physical facts entail consciousness by metaphysical necessity, then physicalists can maintain that even though zombies are metaphysically impossible, they are still conceivable (Balog 2012; Loar 1990/97; McLaughlin 2005; Sections 5.1, 5.2 below). To the contrary, Chalmers argues that conceivability actually entails metaphysical possibility. If he is right, then that popular brand of physicalism is mistaken. The so-called ‘conceivability argument’ for the possibility of zombies will provide a focus for discussing some of the main problems raised by the zombie idea.

3. The conceivability argument for the possibility of zombies

The simplest version of this argument goes:

  1. Zombies are conceivable.
  2. Whatever is conceivable is possible.
  3. Therefore zombies are possible.

(Kripke used a similar argument in his 1972/80. For versions of it see Chalmers 1996, 93–171; 2010, 141–205; Levine 2001; Nagel 1974; Stoljar 2001. Michael Pelczar (2021) argues for the same conclusion without appealing to conceivability.) Clearly the conceivability argument is valid. However, both its premisses are problematic. They are unclear as stated, and controversial even when clarified. A key question is how we should understand ‘conceivable’ in this context.

Many philosophers are willing to concede that zombies are conceivable in some sense (e.g. Hill 1997; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Yablo 1999). However, that sense is sometimes quite broad. For example, a claim that ‘there are no substantive a priori ties between the concept of pain and the concept of C-fiber stimulation’ has been backed up by the point that ‘it is in principle possible to master either of these concepts fully without having mastered the other’ (Hill 1997, 76). By that standard, though, it would be conceivable that the ratio of a circle’s circumference to its diameter is a rational number, when it isn’t. If conceivability in that sense entailed possibility, it would be both possible and impossible for the ratio to be rational; which would make such conceivability useless for the purposes of the conceivability argument. So understood, premiss (1) would be easy to swallow; but (2) would have to be rejected. Evidently, the lower the threshold for conceivability, the easier it is to accept (1) — but the harder it is to accept (2). So the kind of conceivability invoked in premisses (1) and (2) needs to be strongly constrained. A common and useful definition, which will be followed here, is: something is conceivable if and only if it cannot be ruled out a priori. (For sophistication of these and related ideas see Chalmers 1999, 477; 2002; 2007; 2010; and 5.1 below.)

Joseph Levine discusses a version of the conceivability argument, seeing the conceivability of zombies as ‘the principal manifestation of the explanatory gap’ (2001: 79). In his view, what creates this gap is the epistemological problem of explaining how the phenomenal is related to the physical. He sees no way to solve this problem, and thinks it remains even if zombies are impossible.

Campbell, Copeland and Deng 2017 argue that, quite generally, for any conceivability argument there is a corresponding ‘mirror argument’ which can be rejected only at the cost of undermining the main argument, and conclude that all conceivability arguments are ‘logically bankrupt’.

We now face two key questions: Are zombies conceivable in the sense explained? If they are conceivable, does it follow that they are possible? Only if the answer to both questions is yes will the conceivability argument succeed. We can take them in that order.

4. Are zombies conceivable?

Those who exploited the zombie idea in the 1970s typically assumed without argument that zombies are not just conceivable but possible (e. g. Campbell 1970, Nagel 1970). When Chalmers reactivated the idea he found the conceivability of zombies ‘obvious’, remarking that ‘it certainly seems that a coherent situation is described; I can discern no contradiction in the description’ (1996, p. 96). However, he also recognized that this intuition cannot be relied on. The nature of conscious experience is after all hard to understand: what strikes some people as obviously possible could still turn out to harbour hidden contradictions (Nagel 1998; Stoljar 2001). Clearly, those who maintain that zombies are conceivable must provide justification, recognizing that, being an epistemic claim dependent on our cognitive abilities, it is defeasible.

4.1 Arguments for the conceivability of zombies

Chalmers (1996) set out five arguments against the view that there is an a priori entailment from physical facts to mental facts — and so for the view that zombies are conceivable. Each argument would directly or indirectly reinforce the intuitive appeal of the zombie idea. The first will be considered shortly; the other four appeal respectively to the alleged possibility of ‘inverted spectrum’ without physical difference; the alleged impossibility of learning about conscious experience on the basis of purely physical information; Jackson’s (1982) ‘knowledge argument’ (related to the last); and what Chalmers calls ‘the absence of analysis’: the point being that his opponents ‘will have to give us some idea of how the existence of consciousness might be entailed by the physical facts’, when (assuming the other arguments work) ‘any attempt to demonstrate such an entailment is doomed to failure’ (1996, p. 104).

His first argument goes roughly as follows. Suppose a population of tiny people disable your brain and replicate its functions themselves, while keeping the rest of your body in working order (see Block 1980a); each homunculus uses a cell phone to perform the signal-receiving and -transmitting functions of an individual neuron. Would such a system be conscious? Intuitively one may be inclined to say not. Some, notably functionalists, bite the bullet and answer yes. However, the argument does not depend on assuming that the homunculus-head would not be conscious. It depends only on the assumption that its not being conscious is conceivable — which many people find reasonable. In Chalmers’s words, all that matters here is that when we say the system might lack consciousness, ‘a meaningful possibility is being expressed, and it is an open question whether consciousness arises or not’ (1996, p. 97). If he is right, then conceivably the system is not conscious. In that case it is already very much like a zombie, the only difference being that it has little people where a zombie has neurons. And why should that make a difference to whether the situation is conceivable? Why should switching from homunculi to neurons necessarily switch on the light of consciousness? (For doubts about the assumption that it is conceivable that the homunculus-head lacks consciousness, see e.g. Loar 1990/1997, pp. 613f.)

Other considerations favoring the conceivability of zombies can be found in Block 1995, 2002; Levine 2001; Searle 1992. Chalmers 2010 develops his defense further. Brian Cutter 2020 offers an anti-materialist modal argument which does not rely on the assumption that the physical truths are compatible with the absence of consciousness.

4.2 Arguments against the conceivability of zombies

Although in the past it was quite widely accepted that zombies are conceivable, skepticism has grown. Before considering direct attacks on the idea, let us briefly recall three views which once appeared to support the claim that we can know a priori that dualism is false — hence, on reasonable assumptions, that zombies are not conceivable.

The first is verificationism, according to which a (declarative) sentence is meaningful just in case its truth or falsity can be verified. This entails that unverifiable sentences are literally meaningless, so that no metaphysical claim according to which unobservable nonphysical items exist can be true. However, since our ability to think and talk about our experiences is itself a problem for verificationism, to presuppose this view when attacking the zombie idea would beg the question. The second view appeals to Wittgenstein’s private language argument. Although not crudely verificationistic, it depends on the assumption that in order for words to be meaningful, their use must be open to public checking. But since this checkability assumption, if sound, would prove that we cannot talk about qualia in the ways defenders of the zombie possibility think we can, it too seems question-begging in the present context. According to the third view, behaviorism, there is no more to having mental states than being disposed to behave in certain ways. As a possible basis for attacking the zombie idea, behaviorism is in a similar situation to verificationism and the private language argument. Zombies would satisfy all behavioral conditions for full consciousness, so that if we could know a priori that behaviorism was correct, zombie worlds would be inconceivable for that reason. It seems unlikely, though, that behaviorism can be shown to be correct. (Dennett 1991 defends a position with strong affinities to behaviorism, though it might be better classified as a variety of functionalism).

Functionalism is a much more widely supported approach to the mental. According to it, mental states are not just a matter of behavior and dispositions, but of causal or other functional relations among sensory inputs, internal states, and behavioral outputs. (It is important to take account of internal functions not necessarily reflected in behavioral dispositions, otherwise functionalism falls to the usual objections to behaviorism, such as the ‘homunculus-head’ described in the last section (Kirk 2005, 2013, 2017).) Now, since zombies would satisfy all the functional conditions for full consciousness, functionalism entails that zombies are impossible — though it would obviously be question-begging to presuppose it when attacking the zombie idea. Increasingly sophisticated versions of functionalism are being developed, however, and any arguments for it are a fortiori arguments against the possibility of zombies. (For defenses of functionalism against zombies see Dennett 1991; 1995; 1999; Kirk 2017; Shoemaker 1999; Tye 2006; 2008; for doubts about functionalism’s capacity to deal with zombies see for example Harnad 1995.)

Apart from broad-front functionalist theories of the mental, there are more narrowly focused attacks on the conceivability of zombies, some of which are noted below.

Can we really imagine zombies? Daniel Dennett thinks those who accept the conceivability of zombies have failed to imagine them thoroughly enough: ‘they invariably underestimate the task of conception (or imagination), and end up imagining something that violates their own definition’ (1995, p. 322. Marcus 2004 makes a related point). Given his broadly functionalist model of consciousness, he argues, we can see why the ‘putative contrast between zombies and conscious beings is illusory’ (325. See also his 1991; 1999). Consciousness is ‘not a single wonderful separable thing … but a huge complex of many different informational capacities’ (1995, 324. Cottrell 1999 supports this approach).

The ‘epistemic approach’. Stoljar (2006, 2020) emphasizes that the conceivability argument presupposes we have a complete knowledge of the relevant physical facts, when it is likely that we don’t. If that is right, we cannot properly conceive of the possibilities in question, in which case premiss (1) of the conceivability argument is false. A bonus of this view is that it leaves us free to suppose there is a reductive explanation of consciousness — that the physical facts are such that there is consciousness in all possible worlds where those facts obtain — even when we don’t know what those facts are.

Zombies’ utterances. Suppose I smell roasting coffee beans and say, ‘Mm! I love that smell!’. Everyone would rightly assume I was talking about my experience. But now suppose my zombie twin produces the same utterance. He too seems to be talking about an experience, but in fact he isn’t because he’s just a zombie. Is he mistaken? Is he lying? Could his utterance somehow be interpreted as true, or is it totally without truth value? Nigel Thomas (1996) argues that ‘any line that zombiphiles take on these questions will get them into serious trouble’.

Knowing about and referring to qualia. Recall that by definition a zombie world is just like our world as physicalists suppose it to be, but without consciousness. Since this implies that consciousness depends on something nonphysical, it follows that zombies (assuming they are possible in the first place) could be made conscious by the addition of something nonphysical, which might as well be qualia. And given that a zombie world would be causally closed, these qualia would have to be causally inert: perhaps still caused by the correlated physical processes, perhaps just parallel to them. It therefore seems that if a zombie world is conceivable, so is epiphenomenalism. (Of course this does not require epiphenomenalism to be actually true as well as conceivable.) If that is correct, objections to the conceivability of epiphenomenalism are also objections to the conceivability of zombies, the most obvious of these being simply that experiences have effects on behavior. A less obvious objection starts from the fact that we refer to and know about our conscious experiences — which can hardly be denied, since otherwise we could not be discussing these ideas in the first place. The objection appeals to the widely held view that whatever we can know about or refer to must have effects on us, if only indirectly (Kripke 1972/80). On that basis our counterparts in epiphenomenalistic worlds could not know about or refer to their qualia, with the consequence that (given the above reasoning) neither epiphenomenalistic worlds nor zombie worlds are conceivable.

To this attack Chalmers replies that the crucial consideration is that we are ‘acquainted’ with our experiences. This ‘intimate epistemic relation’ both ensures that we can refer to experiences and also justifies our claims to know about them. Since, in contrast, our zombie twins have no experiences, what appear to be their judgments about experience are unjustified. Chalmers suggests that even if qualia have no causal influence on our judgments, their mere presence in the appropriate physical context ensures that our thoughts are about those qualia. He thinks it also constitutes justification for our knowledge claims even if experiences are not explanatorily relevant to making the judgments in question (Chalmers 1996, 172—209; 1999, 493f; see also his 2003, 2010).

The problem of epistemic contact. Just now it seemed that if zombies are conceivable, then epiphenomenalist and parallelist worlds are also conceivable. In that case the friends of zombies must explain how the epiphenomenal qualia in such worlds could possibly be objects of acquaintance, or indeed make any sort of intimate contribution to people’s lives; and here Kirk (2005; 2008) suggests the zombie idea faces a further difficulty. This emerges when we consider such things as attending to, thinking about, comparing and — especially — remembering our experiences. These activities bring us into ‘epistemic contact’ with them and involve cognitive processing, which in turn involves changes causing other changes. Being causally inert, the epiphenomenal qualia themselves could not do that processing; so if they actually constitute our experiences (as epiphenomenalism and parallelism imply) then the necessary processing must be purely physical. The trouble is that the zombie story appears to make it impossible for such processing to put us into epistemic contact with epiphenomenal qualia. This is because the only resources it can appeal to for that purpose are the assumed causation of qualia by neural processes and their isomorphism with them: factors which cannot do the necessary cognitive work (Kirk 2005; 2008). If that is right, the notions of epiphenomenal qualia and zombies lead to a contradiction. They imply a conception of consciousness which requires people to be in epistemic contact with their qualia, while at the same time ruling out the possibility of such contact.

‘Powerful qualities’. Another interesting objection to the zombie idea is based on the (controversial) idea of ‘powerful qualities’: the view that all properties are both dispositional and qualitative, and indeed that a thing’s dispositions are identical with its qualities. Alexander Carruth (2016), for example, argues that the conceivability argument presupposes that while physical properties are dispositional, phenomenal ones are qualitative. On that basis a zombie duplicate of our world would instantiate our world’s dispositional properties but not its phenomenal ones. The powerful qualities view rules that out a priori, making it not even conceivable. For if a thing’s dispositions are identical with its qualities, nothing can instantiate certain dispositional properties without also instantiating all qualities supposedly identical with them. Countering this line of argument, Henry Taylor (2017) claims it depends on an implausible account of the distinction between the physical and the phenomenal, arguing in particular that the physical cannot be confined to the dispositional.

For other attacks on the conceivability of zombies see Balog 1999; Cottrell 1999; Harnad 1995; Kirk 2005, 2008, 2013; Marcus 2004; Shoemaker 1999; Stoljar 2001; Tye 2006.

5. Does conceivability entail possibility?

Premise (2) of the conceivability argument is: Whatever is conceivable is possible. It has been attacked from several angles, as follows.

5.1 Objections based on a posteriori necessity

A number of philosophers argue that Kripke’s ideas about a posteriori necessary truth facilitate the defense of physicalism. They urge that even if a zombie world is conceivable, that does not establish it is possible in the way that matters. Conceivability is an epistemic notion, they say, while possibility is a metaphysical one: ‘It is false that if one can in principle conceive that P, then it is logically possible that P; … Given psychophysical identities, it is an ‘a posteriori’ fact that any physical duplicate of our world is exactly like ours in respect of positive facts about sensory states’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, 446. See also Hill 1997; Loar 1990/1997; 1999; McLaughlin 2005; Webster 2006). Some philosophers reject even the assumption that conceivability is a guide to possibility, challenging the view that the burden of proof is on those who deny the zombie possibility (Block and Stalnaker 1999; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Yablo 1993).

Chalmers has responded in several places (1996, 131–134; 1999, 476–7; 2010, 141–205). His most detailed version of the conceivability argument (2010) uses the framework of two-dimensional semantics. This enables him to distinguish two kinds of possibility and two corresponding kinds of conceivability. In the ‘primary’ sense conceivability entails possibility; for example it is conceivable that water should have been a substance chemically different from H2O. In the other, ‘secondary’ sense, it is neither conceivable nor possible that water should have been chemically different. The difficulty for the conceivability argument can be expressed by saying that even if zombie worlds are primarily conceivable and therefore primarily possible, it does not follow that they are also secondarily possible. And a posteriori physicalists will typically deny that it follows, on the ground that only the secondary possibility of zombie worlds would entail the falsity of physicalism. At this point Chalmers in effect presents his opponents with a dilemma, which is (crudely summarizing his conclusions) that either the primary conceivability of zombies does after all entail their secondary possibility, in which case the conceivability argument works and materialism is false; or else ‘Russellian monism’, briefly considered at Section 5.3 below, is true. (See also Jackson 1998; and for discussions, Brueckner 2002; Loar 1999; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Piccinini 2017; Sebastián 2017; Shoemaker 1999; Soames 2005; Yablo 1999.)

5.2 The phenomenal concept strategy

Many physicalists hold that both the zombie idea and Frank Jackson’s knowledge argument can be dealt with through a proper understanding of the nature of phenomenal concepts (roughly, the concepts we use when conveying the character of our experiences: for example ‘sweet’, ‘the way I see blue’). Exponents of the conceivability argument hold that the supposed ‘explanatory gap’ between the physical and the phenomenal — which is expressed in the idea that zombies are conceivable — brings with it an ontological gap. According to the ‘phenomenal concept strategy’ (Stoljar 2005) there is really only a conceptual gap: phenomenal concepts have features which mislead us into supposing there is an ontological gap in addition to an epistemic one, when there isn’t.

Thus it is argued that even if a zombie world is conceivable, it does not follow that there are nonphysical properties in our world. If that is right, physicalists can concede the conceivability of zombies while insisting that the properties we pick out in terms of phenomenal concepts are physical. ‘Given that properties are constituted by the world and not by our concepts’, Brian Loar comments, ‘it is fair of the physicalist to request a justification of the assumption that conceptually distinct concepts must express metaphysically distinct properties’ (Loar 1999, 467; see also his 1997). He also argues that phenomenal concepts are ‘recognitional’, in contrast to physical concepts, which are ‘theoretical’. Phenomenal concepts, Loar says, ‘express the very properties they pick out, as Kripke observed in the case of ‘pain’’ (1999, 468). He thinks these points explain the conceivability of a zombie world, while maintaining that there is no possible world in which the relevant physical properties are distinct from consciousness. Chalmers objects that Loar’s account does not justify the view that physical concepts refer to phenomenal properties (1999, 488). He argues further (2007) that exponents of this approach face a dilemma. Let C be whichever psychological ‘key features’ we have but zombies lack. Then if it is conceivable that the purely physical facts about us should have held without C, then C is not physicalistically explicable. On the other hand, if that is not conceivable, then in his view C cannot explain our epistemic situation as contrasted with that of zombies. So either C is not physicalistically explicable, or it cannot explain our epistemic situation. (For discussions see Ball 2009; Balog 2012; Carruthers 2005; Chalmers 1999; 2007; 2010; Crane 2005; Loar 1990/97; Papineau 2002; Pereboom 2011; Stoljar 2000; Tye 2008.)

5.3 Russellian monism

Following Russell (1927), some philosophers suggest that physics tells us only about the ‘structural’ properties of things — such as their dispositions and nomic relations — rather than the ‘intrinsic’ properties which supposedly underlie and account for those structural properties. Thus Daniel Stoljar (2001) argues that there are two distinct notions of the physical and correspondingly of physicalism, depending on whether one appeals only to what is provided for by physics or also to the intrinsic properties of physical objects. He suggests that even if one of the corresponding two versions of the conceivability argument is sound, the other is not — because (roughly) physicalists can always object that, since we do not know enough about the physical world (in particular, about its intrinsic properties), we cannot ‘strongly’ conceive of the possibility of zombies.

These ideas are exploited in what Chalmers calls ‘Russellian monism’ (a variety of neutral monism). In our world, he suggests, the underlying intrinsic properties might be ‘phenomenal properties, or they might be protophenomenal properties: properties that collectively constitute phenomenal properties when organized in the appropriate way’ (2010: p. 151); while in some other worlds the corresponding intrinsic physical properties did not provide for consciousness. If the intrinsic properties which supposedly provide for our consciousness are nevertheless classified as physical, exponents can deny the possibility of zombies if these are understood to be our ‘full’ physical duplicates. At the same time they can concede the possibility of zombies which duplicate us only in their structural properties. As he points out, this view is ‘a highly distinctive form of physicalism that has much in common with property dualism and that many physicalists will want to reject’ (Chalmers 2010, p. 152; see also Pereboom 2011). One obstacle to counting it as physicalism is that it seems unable to explain why the special intrinsic properties in our world should provide for consciousness, while those which perform the same functions in those other worlds do not: this has to be accepted as a brute fact.

Philip Goff (2010; see also his 2017) suggests that this loophole for Russellian versions of physicalism weakens the zombie argument. He recommends instead an argument from ghosts: pure subjects of experience without any physical nature. He argues that such ghosts are conceivable and possible, and that they provide an argument against physicalism which leaves no loophole for Russellian monism. (Physicalists are likely to object that arguments against the conceivability of zombies can also be mobilized against ghosts.)

5.4 Other objections

Special factors. It has been suggested that there are special factors at work in the psychophysical case which have a strong tendency to mislead us. For example it is claimed that what enables us to imagine or conceive of states of consciousness is a different cognitive faculty from what enables us to conceive of physical facts: ‘there are significant differences between the cognitive factors responsible for Cartesian intuitions [such as those about zombies] and those responsible for modal intuitions of a wide variety of other kinds’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, p. 449. See also Hill 1997). The suggestion is that these differences help to explain the ease with which we seem able to conceive of zombies, and the difficulty we have in understanding the claim that they are nevertheless impossible.

Conditional analysis. Another line of objection rests on conditional analyses of the concept of qualia. Roughly, the idea is that if there actually are certain nonphysical properties which fit our conception of qualia, then that is what qualia are, in which case zombies are conceivable; but if there are no such nonphysical properties, then qualia are whichever physical properties perform the appropriate functions, and zombies are not conceivable. It is argued that this approach enables physicalists to accept that the possibility of zombies is conceivable, while denying that zombies are conceivable (Hawthorne 2002a; Braddon-Mitchell 2003. For criticism see Alter 2007; Chalmers 2010, pp. 159–59).

Causal essentialism. According to the theory of causal essentialism, the causal properties of physical properties are essential to them. Brian Garrett (2009) exploits this theory to argue that the zombie argument against physicalism depends on broadly Humean assumptions about the laws of nature and property identity which presuppose the falsity of causal essentialism. If we reject those assumptions and accept that some physical properties have essentially the capacity to produce consciousness, then ‘we cannot accept the genuine possibility of zombie worlds’ even if such worlds are conceivable (see also Aranyosi 2010).

More on zombies’ utterances. Consider a zombie world that is an exact physical duplicate of our world and contains zombie twins of all philosophers, including some who appeal to the conceivability argument. Katalin Balog (1999) argues that while their utterances would be meaningful, their sentences would not always mean what they do in our mouths. She further argues — to oversimplify — that if the conceivability argument were sound in actual philosophers’ mouths, then it would be sound in the mouths of zombie philosophers too. But since by hypothesis physicalism is true in their world, their argument is not sound. Therefore the conceivability argument used by actual philosophers is not sound either. If this argument works, it has the piquant feature that ‘the zombies that antiphysicalists think possible in the end undermine the arguments that allege to establish their possibility’ (502. Chalmers offers brief replies in his 2003; 2010, pp. 159–60).

The anti-zombie argument for physicalism. The conceivability argument — which assumes physicalism entails that zombies are impossible — purports to refute it by showing they are possible. As we saw, the simplest version of this argument goes: (1) zombies are conceivable; (2) whatever is conceivable is possible; (3) therefore zombies are possible. However, ‘anti-zombies’ — duplicates of ourselves made conscious by the purely physical facts (Frankish 2007) — also seem conceivable. So we have a parallel argument: (1*) anti-zombies are conceivable; (2) whatever is conceivable is possible; (3*) therefore anti-zombies are possible. But (3) and (3*) cannot both be true, since if the purely physical facts about anti-zombies make them conscious, then the exactly similar physical facts about zombies make them conscious too, and they are not zombies after all (Frankish 2007; Marton 1998; Piccinini 2017; Sturgeon 2000, pp. 114–116). One moral is that we should reject the inference from conceivability to possibility. (Brown 2010 argues that if anti-zombies are conceivable, then zombies are inconceivable.) The most promising reply for exponents of the conceivability argument seems to be to deny that anti-zombies are conceivable (Chalmers 2010, 180).

6. Other issues

The list of ‘Related Entries’ below indicates the range and depth of the issues raised by the zombie idea, only some of which have been touched on in this entry. If zombies are really possible, then not only is physicalism problematic, so are widely held views on other topics. Here are three striking examples.

6.1 Mental causation

Descartes accepted the common assumption that not only do physical events have mental effects, but mental events have physical effects (for example, thinking about the political situation makes me write a letter). The difficulty for his dualism, it was thought, was to understand how the nonphysical could have effects on the physical. But if zombies are possible — which requires the physical world to be causally closed — there is no work for nonphysical qualia to do. In that case the difficulty is to understand how, in spite of appearances, the nonphysical could fail to have effects on the physical. Still supposing zombies are possible, it then becomes hard to see any alternative to parallelism or epiphenomenalism, with the radical revision of common assumptions about mental causation that those views entail. True, the friends of zombies do not seem compelled to be epiphenomenalists or parallelists about the actual world. They may be interactionists, holding that our world is not physically closed, and that as a matter of actual fact nonphysical properties do have physical effects. Or they may adopt some variety of panpsychism, according to which what is metaphysically fundamental is not physical properties, but phenomenal or perhaps ‘protophenomenal’ ones (Chalmers 1991, 297—299; 1999, 492; Goff 2017; Strawson 2008) — a view arguably compatible with the causal closure of the physical. But neither of those options is easy. Abandoning causal closure appears to conflict with empirical evidence; while the idea that phenomenal or quasi-phenomenal properties are fundamental remains obscure.

6.2 The function of consciousness

The apparent possibility of zombies also seems to pose a problem for evolutionary theory. Why did creatures with qualia survive rather than those creatures’ zombie counterparts? If zombies could have survived, what’s the use of consciousness? Owen Flanagan and Thomas Polger have used the apparent possibility of zombies to support the claim that ‘There are as yet no credible stories about why subjects of experience emerged, why they might have won — or should have been expected to win — an evolutionary battle against very intelligent zombie-like information-sensitive organisms’ (1995, 321): a problem not faced by those who reject the possibility of zombies. One response on behalf of those who do accept it is to suggest that there might be fundamental laws linking the phenomenal to the physical. Such laws would not depend on whether conscious creatures ever happened to evolve, in which case, arguably, evolution raises no special problem (Chalmers 1996, 171) — although the existence of such laws would pose its own problems.

6.3 Other minds

If qualia have no physical effects, then nothing will enable anyone to establish for certain that anyone else actually has qualia. Philosophers who believe they have a solid response to skepticism about other minds may therefore conclude that this consequence of the zombie idea is enough to condemn it. Others may draw the opposite conclusion and take the skeptical consequence as ‘a confirmation’, on the ground that we really are ignorant of others’ minds (Campbell 1970, 120). (Of course not all responses to other minds skepticism imply that zombies are inconceivable.)

7. Conclusion

The intuitive appeal of the zombie idea can be overwhelming. But that was true once of the idea that the earth stands still, and is true now of the idea that science can explain events without appealing to anything nonphysical. Some anti-physicalists believe their opponents’ commitment makes them turn a blind eye to the difficulties:

Some may be led to deny the possibility [of zombies] in order to make some theory come out right, but the justification of such theories should ride on the question of possibility, rather than the other way round (Chalmers 1996, 96).

On the other hand, some physicalists believe the zombie idea exerts an irrational grip on anti-physicalist thinking, so that

it is tempting to regard anti-physicalist arguments as rationalizations of an intuition whose independent force masks their tendentiousness (Loar 1990/1997, 598).

In spite of the fact that the arguments on both sides have become increasingly sophisticated — or perhaps because of it — they have not become more persuasive. The pull in each direction remains strong.


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Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to David Chalmers and to Bill Fish for detailed comments and suggestions on drafts of this entry.

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Robert Kirk <Robert.Kirk@nottingham.ac.uk>

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