Temporal Parts

First published Sun Feb 1, 2004; substantive revision Tue May 5, 2020

Material objects extend through space by having different spatial parts in different places. But how do they persist through time? According to some philosophers, things have temporal parts as well as spatial parts: accepting this is supposed to help us solve a whole bunch of metaphysical problems, and keep our philosophy in line with modern physics. Other philosophers disagree, arguing that neither metaphysics nor physics give us good reason to believe in temporal parts.

1. Introduction

You’re performing an amazing trick right now: you’re in two places at once. How do you manage to be down there, near the floor, and yet also be a metre or two up in the air? Well, it’s not so very amazing: your feet are down there on the floor, and your head is up in the air. Having spatial parts enables you to be in several different places, and to have different properties in different places: you’re cold down there on the tiled floor, and also warm up there by the heater, because your feet are cold and your head is warm. Moreover, having parts could let you be in the same place as someone else: if you shared a hand with a conjoined (‘Siamese’) twin, then you could both wear the same glove without jostling for space.

None of this is special to people: inanimate objects also extend through space by having spatial parts. They have different properties in different places, and sometimes they overlap by sharing their parts. These simple facts about spatial parts explain basic features about the way things and people occupy space.

Things and people take up time as well as taking up space: you existed yesterday, and, unless reading this article is a real strain, you will exist tomorrow too. Just as you can have different properties at different places (hot up here, cold down there), you can have different properties at different times (yesterday you hadn’t heard of temporal parts, by tomorrow you’ll know plenty about them). 

Some philosophers believe that you take up time by having different temporal parts at different times. Your spatial parts are things like your head, your feet and your nose; your temporal parts are things like you-yesterday, you-today and you-tomorrow. If you have different temporal parts, this would explain how you can exist at different times, and it would also explain how you can have different properties at different times (you-yesterday hasn’t heard of temporal parts, you-tomorrow is an expert). According to these philosophers, then, persisting through time is pretty much like extending through space: it’s all a matter of parts.

Other philosophers reject this picture. They argue that you persist through time as a whole: it’s not just a part of you sitting in front of the computer right now, it’s you, the whole you! It was the very same whole person yesterday who knew nothing about temporal parts, and, by tomorrow, the very same whole person will be an expert. ‘You-yesterday’ isn’t a name for some mysterious part of you which only existed for a day; instead, it’s a stilted way of talking about you, and what you were like yesterday.

Discussions of time, space, identity and change have been part of philosophy since its earliest days, and not every question about persistence obviously concerns temporal parts. For example, can we give criteria of identity through time for artefacts, animals or people? What happens to a ship if you replace all of its planks one by one? What if you keep the old planks, then build a new ship out of them? In addressing these questions during recent decades, however, it has proven useful to discuss whether objects have temporal parts, because the answers that philosophers give to these questions can often depend upon whether they believe in temporal parts.

This article is divided into a number of sections. Section 2 looks more closely at what exactly temporal parts are supposed to be, and at what sorts of things are supposed to have them. Sections 3, 4 and 5 look at a range of arguments in favour of believing in temporal parts, and at the responses of those who reject temporal parts. Section 6 discusses connections between debate about temporal parts, and debate about the nature of time more generally. Section 7 considers whether physics can teach us anything about temporal parts. Section 8 discusses a question internal to temporal-parts theories: what relationship is there between the different temporal parts of a single object?  Finally, section 9 touches on special concerns about the persistence of people through time.

2. What are temporal parts, and which things are supposed to have them?

The two most popular accounts of persistence are perdurance theory (perdurantism) and endurance theory (endurantism). Perdurantists believe that ordinary things like animals, boats and planets have temporal parts (things persist by ‘perduring’). Endurantists believe that ordinary things do not have temporal parts; instead, things are wholly present whenever they exist (things persist by ‘enduring’). This looks like a straightforward ontological disagreement, a dispute about what exists. Perdurantists think that objects have both spatial and temporal parts, while endurantists think that they only have spatial parts.

From an endurantist point of view, however, it is difficult even to say what temporal parts are supposed to be. Your temporal parts are parts of you which lie in the past or in the future. But endurantists agree that you have different spatial parts at different times: you exchange molecules with the environment, you grow new hairs or lose a tooth to decay. So, yes, some of your (former) parts lie in the past, and some of your (future) parts lie in the future, but that doesn’t mean that you’re somehow less than a whole person, right here and now. Why do perdurantists make such a big deal of the obvious fact that you have different parts at different times?

Endurantists think about what parts you have at different times, past, present or future. But perdurantists prefer to think atemporally about what parts you have, full stop (what parts you have, period). And they claim that you have you-yesterday, you-today and you-tomorrow amongst your parts. Endurantists don’t accept this atemporal way of talking about parthood, and so they find it difficult even to say what they don’t like about temporal parts.

What moral should we draw from this communication breakdown? Some perdurantists think ‘so much the worse for endurantists: they can’t even say what they’re against’. Some endurantists think ‘so much the worse for perdurantists: their theory doesn’t even make sense’. And some philosophers on both sides look for a neutral way to spell out the notion of a temporal part (for more detail on this, see the reading suggestions at the end of this section). For now, let’s take it that the basic idea of a temporal part is well-enough understood, perhaps via the analogy with spatial parts; later sections will show how the idea is put to work.

So the two standard views of persistence are endurance and perdurance theories. But there are also non-standard views.  According to mixed views, some persisting objects have temporal parts, and others do not. For example, perhaps changing objects have temporal parts, whilst objects with unchanging intrinsic natures do not. Or perhaps ontologically self-sufficient things like organisms don’t have temporal parts, but ontologically dependent things like ocean waves, smiles or universities do. (Most endurantists, perdurantists and others agree that processes or events have temporal parts: whether or not I have earlier and later parts, my birthday party certainly does.)

Other non-standard views take the basic perdurantist idea that persistence is much like spatial extension, then they develop the idea in different ways. For example, perhaps persisting things stretch out four-dimensionally through time, but without being subdivided into temporal parts. Or perhaps, as stage theorists claim, the world is full of four-dimensional objects with temporal parts, but when we talk about ordinary objects like boats and people, we talk about brief temporal parts or ‘stages’ of four-dimensional objects.

How is this supposed to work? Imagine that someone refers to you by name. According to perdurantists, the name refers to a ninety-year-long (let’s hope) four-dimensional object. According to stage theorists, the name refers to a brief part of that ninety-year-long object, a different one at different times. This sounds peculiar: after all, your name refers to you and you have a future (and quite a past), while stages exist only momentarily. Stage theorists say that when we speculate about what you’re going to do next week, our speculations are made true or false by the behaviour of your counterparts next week. These future counterparts of yours are the very objects which, according to perdurantists, are your future temporal parts.

Just how brief are temporal parts or stages? Typically, objects which have any temporal parts are thought to have instantaneous temporal parts (‘time-slices’), which do not themselves persist through time. (Most perdurantists think that things have non-instantaneous temporal parts too, like you-during-1999.) But an alternative is to claim that an object has only as many temporal parts as it has genuinely differentiated periods in its existence; this is a mixed view, because changing objects will have temporal parts, while unchanging objects and temporal parts will persist without having temporal parts of their own.

Some philosophers and some non-philosophers suspect that debate about whether things have temporal parts is empty, that there is no genuine issue at stake here. One idea is that we can’t know for sure whether things have temporal parts: all the theories on offer have good and bad aspects and we’ll never find an undisputed champion. If this is true, it doesn’t undermine the debate unless consensus and certainty are our only goals. A second idea is that metaphysical enquiry is pointless, since irrelevant to daily life. This claim needs support from accounts of relevance, and of the connection between irrelevance and pointlessness. A third idea is that metaphysical enquiry is doomed to fail because there are no absolute metaphysical truths. This claim needs support from accounts of truth, language and reality. All of these topics are too grand for this article. A fourth idea is the much more focused claim that, while certain metaphysical disputes are legitimate, the debate about temporal parts is empty: this doubt may be reinforced by the difficulty of giving a neutral account of what temporal parts are supposed to be, or by scepticism about the so-called ‘problem of change’, as discussed in the next section.

As noted above, the debate between endurantists and perdurantists is an ontological dispute: do temporal parts of ordinary material objects exist, or not? Moreover the endurantist notion of ‘being wholly present’ was understood in terms of parts and wholes. In the past few years, however, some have suggested that debates about persistence are better understood as debates about location – how are material objects located in (or extended through) time, and how does this compare with the way(s) in which material objects are located in (or extended through) space? Temporal parts were introduced at the beginning of this entry via an analogy with spatial parts, but this recent work challenges even the assumption that spatially-extended objects inevitably have spatial parts. The present article focuses, appropriately enough, on persistence questions understood via the notion of temporal parthood, but you can read about alternative approaches in the separate entry on Location and Mereology, especially section 6.3.2.

Before we plunge into arguments about whether temporal parts exist, it’s worth clarifying some terminology. First: perdurance theory is sometimes called ‘worm theory’, especially when it is contrasted with stage theory. This is because perduring objects stretch out through time just as (we all agree) earthworms stretch out through space. Worm theory has nothing to do with wormholes, and, sadly, people don’t usually describe themselves as ‘worm theorists’. Second: ‘four-dimensionalism’ is sometimes used as an umbrella term for perdurance theory and stage theory, and ‘three-dimensionalism’ as a name for endurance theory. This is because perduring objects (and sums of stages) are four-dimensional, whereas enduring objects are three-dimensional, wholly present at each moment. But some non-standard views of persistence, including ‘mixed’ views, do not fall neatly into either category. And beware: other authors use ‘four-dimensionalism’ and ‘three-dimensionalism’ as names for different theories of time, rather than different theories of things in time. Third: ‘continuant’ is sometimes used as a neutral term for any ordinary persisting thing. In this sense, we can ask whether continuants endure or perdure. But the label ‘continuant’ is more commonly reserved for enduring, three-dimensional objects. This marks a contrast with processes or events, and carries the implication that perdurantists foolishly identify material objects with events. So it tends only to be endurantists who use the term ‘continuant’.

Suggested Reading: good introductions to the debate about temporal parts include Loux (1998, chapter 6), Haslanger (2003), McGrath (2007), Sider (2008), Effingham (2009), Balashov (2011), Effingham (2012), Goswick (2013), and Curtis and Robson (2016: chapter 7). Amongst the more recent contributions, Effingham (2009), Goswick, and Curtis and Robson are good on the basics; Effingham (2012) is more detailed and comprehensive; Balashov (2011) is more advanced, guided by relativistic physics. Lewis (1986a, p. 202) introduces the terms ‘endurance’ and ‘perdurance’, attributing them to Johnston. Sider (1997; 2001, section 3.3) discusses the difficulty of defining ‘temporal part’; see also Merricks (1999a), Hawley (2001, section 1.6) and McKinnon (2002). Wasserman (2016) argues that we often conflate the ontological question whether things have temporal parts with the explanatory question whether things persist in virtue of having those parts. Donnelly (2016) is a very helpful exploration of different attempts to define endurance – in terms of parthood, or location, or grounding. Lewis (1976, postscript B) tries to make the notion of a temporal part acceptable to endurantists; van Inwagen (2000) and Noonan (2003a) object, whilst Braddon-Mitchell and Miller (2004) respond. Perdurantists include Quine (1950; 1960), Taylor (1955), Lewis (1971; 1976; 1986a), Armstrong (1980), Noonan (1980), Robinson (1982), Heller (1984; 1990), Le Poidevin (1991), Jubien (1993), and Hudson (2001). Endurantists include Thomson (1965; 1983), Geach (1966; 1967), Chisholm (1976), Mellor (1980; 1981; 1998), Lowe (1983; 1998b), Simons (1987), Forbes (1987), Haslanger (1989a), van Inwagen (1990a; 1990b), Oderberg (1993), Merricks (1994), Fine (2008/2006), and Shoemaker (2015); Simons (2008) responds to Fine. Miller (2005b) defines ‘endurance’, see also Keinanen and Hakkarainen (2010), while Janzen (2011) defends endurantism. Melia (2000) eliminates processes in favour of enduring things. Johnston (1987) explores a mixed view, and so, differently, do Hofweber and Velleman (2011), Grygianiec (2016), and Brzozowski (2017, 2019). Parsons (2000) develops four-dimensionalism without temporal parts, and Miller (2009) develops this further. See also Daniels (2019). Other non-standard accounts of persistence include Giordani and Costa (2013), Miller (2013), Costa (2017), and Giberman (2019b). For stage theory see Sider (1996; 2001) and Hawley (2001); Varzi (2003) is a sympathetic discussion, whilst Balashov (2007) attempts a precise definition of ‘exdurance’ aka stage theory. Moyer (2008), Moss (2012) and Viebahn (2013) compare stage theory with perdurantism. More on stage theory: Stuchlik (2003), Hansson Wahlberg (2008), Wright (2010), Rychter (2012), McKeever (2017) and Giberman (2019a). Questions about how fine-grained temporal parts or stages must be are discussed by Le Poidevin (2000), Stuchlik (2003), Traynor (2013), Effingham (2013), Mazzola (2015), Kleinschmidt (2017), and Giberman (2019a); Leonard (2018) explores endurantism without temporal instants. Cahen (2017) discusses individuation for temporal parts.

For arguments that there is no real dispute here, see McCall and Lowe (2003), Lowe and McCall (2004), and Miller (2005); Reydon (2008) responds by drawing analogies with debate about biological species. Hirsch (2008) shows how more general scepticism about metaphysical disputes might play out here; McGrath (2007) draws out a number of connections with the burgeoning literature on metaontology; see also Benovsky (2011), Hansson Wahlberg (2014b), and Giberman (2018). The role of intuitions and ‘folk theory’ in debate about persistence is discussed by Rose (2015), Benovsky (2016), and Rose et al (2018); the role of experience as evidence is discussed by Prosser (2012), Traynor (2014), Prosser (2015) and Young (2018). Scholl (2007) connects the philosophy and psychology of object persistence. Hawthorne (2006, 2008) explores the distinction between three- and four-dimensionalism (the second of these articles is the more accessible). For discussion of how to define ‘wholly present’, see Wasserman (2004a), Crisp and Smith (2005), Olson (2006), and Donnelly (2016). Cotnoir’s (2015) review of Kleinschmidt (2014) highlights issues about persistence and location; Kleinschmidt’s introduction is very useful,and provides further references; see also Eagle (2016a). Donnelly (2011) advocates the location approach, articulated in Parsons (2007); for further references see the separate entry on Location and Mereology, especially section 6.3.2. Steward (2015) discusses continuants. The present encyclopedia article focuses on contemporary debate in analytic philosophy; work which makes connections to other times and other traditions includes Hirsch (1999a), Helm (2009), Gorham (2010), Fan (2018), McKeever (2018), Costa (2020) and Hayashi (2019).

3. Change and Temporal Parts

Enough about what temporal parts are supposed to be. Why believe in them at all? It’s not clear whether ordinary thinking involves any commitment for or against temporal parts: some believe that it is neutral, while others believe that the default assumption is that things don’t have temporal parts. Regardless of what ordinary thinking tells us, advocates of temporal parts argue that their view offers the best solutions to a number of metaphysical problems. Endurance theorists respond by offering solutions of their own, criticising the temporal-parts solutions, or both.

One metaphysical problem concerns how change is possible (this has become known as the ‘problem of temporary intrinsics’ or sometimes the ‘problem of change’). The banana in the fruitbowl was unripe a few days ago, and today it is overripe. Surely nothing can be both unripe and overripe?  Of course, it’s the fact that the banana is unripe and overripe at different times which saves it from metaphysical peril: we all know that. But it would be nice to understand why this fact is crucial: what is it about the passage of time which makes it possible for one and the same object to have apparently incompatible properties?

If the banana has temporal parts, this explains how it can change: an earlier temporal part of the banana is unripe, while a later temporal part of the banana is overripe. More grandly: an earlier temporal part has the property being-unripe, while a later temporal part has the property being-ripe. There’s no mystery here, any more than there is mystery in your being both hot and cold by having a hot head and cold feet: we’re all familiar with the fact that different parts of the same object can have different properties.

Is this a good explanation of change? One objection is that perdurance-style temporal variation is not really change at all:  the whole four-dimensional banana is neither unripe nor overripe, so can’t change between these states, and the temporal parts are either permanently unripe or permanently overripe, so they don’t change either. In response, perdurantists distinguish two ways of talking about persisting things – an atemporal way, which takes in all times at once, and a temporal way of talking, relative to various times. On the atemporal way of talking, the whole four-dimensional banana is neither unripe nor overripe; nevertheless, it’s true to say in temporal terms that the whole banana is unripe on Monday, and the whole banana is overripe on Friday, because of the properties of the relevant temporal parts. Endurantists who claim that temporal variation is not genuine change must challenge this combination of temporal and atemporal talk.

Stage theorists give the same basic account of change as perdurantists do, but they have a slightly different response to the no-change objection. According to perdurantists, talk about the same banana at different times is straightforwardly made true by one and the same four-dimensional object existing at different times. But some fancy footwork is needed to explain what it is for that object to be overripe right now: it’s for it to have an overripe temporal part right now. In contrast, according to stage theorists, talk about the banana being overripe right now is straightforwardly made true by the banana being overripe, since the banana just is a momentary stage which exists right now. But some fancy footwork is needed to explain what it is for the same banana to exist at different times: it is for the current momentary banana to stand in certain intimate causal relations to momentary bananas in the past and the future.

Temporal-parts accounts of change seem OK, but can endurantists come up with anything equally good or better? How can one and the same thing have different properties at different times? One radical answer is presentism, the view that only present objects, events and states exist: past and future do not exist. Presentism seems to dissolve the problem of change: since only the overripe banana is present, its unripe state does not exist, so there’s nothing to worry about. (For further discussion of presentism, see section 6.)  But unless there are independent reasons for accepting presentism (see the separate entry on time), it seems like a drastic response to the problem of change.

Less radically, endurantists may claim that objects change by standing in different relations to different times. There is no absolute fact of the matter regarding the ripeness of the banana: instead, the banana bears the being-unripe-on relation to Monday, and the being-overripe-on relation to Friday.  (Alternatively, perhaps the banana possesses two compatible properties, being-unripe-on-Monday, and being-overripe-on-Friday.) There’s no mystery in an object which bears apparently incompatible relations to different things: you are bigger than the Mona Lisa, and smaller than the Louvre, but metaphysicians don’t puzzle over how you can be both bigger-than and smaller-than. Those who oppose this relational view of changeable properties claim that it’s just too relational: the banana seems to lose all its intrinsic nature. We may also worry that, as with the temporal parts account, it’s not clear whether anything really changes on this picture: the banana always stands in the same relations to the various times.

(For further discussion see the separate entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties, especially section 1.1.)

A third endurantist account of change is adverbialism. Change is puzzling because it seems that a single object (like the banana) both has and doesn’t have a single property (like being-unripe). The adverbialist idea is that, instead of subdividing the object into temporal parts (the banana-on-Monday and the banana-on-Friday), or subdividing the property (into being-unripe-on-Monday and being-overripe-on-Friday), we should subdivide the way in which the object has the property. The banana has the property being-unripe in a Monday way, and it fails to have that same property in a Friday way. (Adverbialism is so-called because it focuses on ways of having properties: an adverb tells you about the way something is done.) Objections to adverbialism focus on whether this relativisation of ways things have (or ‘instantiate’) properties can explain change without simply raising further problems about the nature of instantiation.

In summary, then, those who believe in temporal parts seem to have a nice explanation of change to hand. But those who reject temporal parts also have a range of options, none of which seems decisively to have been ruled out. (For further discussion, see the separate entries on change and on singular propositions .)

There have been a number of challenges to the idea there is any genuinely metaphysical ‘problem of change’; this is sometimes diagnosed as a problem arising from confusions about tensed language. However, there is no consensus about what the consequence would be if there were no metaphysical problem of change: should we default to endurance, or to perdurance, or should we conclude that the contrast between these two positions is also somehow illusory?

Suggested Reading: It’s a good idea to start with Lewis (1986a, pp. 203–4), who coins the phrase ‘problem of temporary intrinsics’, argues that none of the endurance theories of change are satisfactory, and sets out the perdurance account of change. Wasserman (2006) surveys the debate; see also Wasserman (2010). McTaggart (1927, sections 315–6), Simons (1987), Mellor (1998, section 8.4), McCall and Lowe (2009), and Oderberg (2004) argue that variation between temporal parts is not genuine change (Oderberg 2004 is also sceptical as to whether there is any genuine puzzle here). For a response see Heller (1992), then Lombard (1994) in return. Botterell (2004) also criticises the temporal parts account of change; Sattig (2002, 2003) objects to the perdurantist and stage accounts of predication; see also Hansson Wahlberg (2009, 2010), Lombard (2006) and Perovic (2019); Giberman (2017) argues against endurantist accounts of change. For the presentist account of change, see Merricks (1994), Hinchliff (1996), Zimmerman (1998a), and Fiocco (2010); Rettler (2012) makes other connections between the metaphysics of persistence and of time. van Inwagen (1990a) advocates a relations-to-times view of temporary properties, as do Wasserman (2003) and Mellor (1981), although Mellor (1998) has a different account, in terms of fact-constituents; Effingham and Melia (2007) defend the view against objections from Sider (2001). For discussion of Lewis’s objection to the relations-to-times view, see MacBride (2001) and Rodriguez-Pereyra (2003); for a related objection see Browning (1988). Rychter (2008) discusses what it is to have a property atemporally. Lowe (1987), Johnston (1987) and Haslanger (1989b) all propose versions of adverbialism. For discussion of these, see Lewis (1988; 2002), Lowe (1988b) and Lombard (2003). Miller and Braddon-Mitchell (2007) defend both adverbialism and relations-to-times against objections; see also Bottani (2016). Rea (1998b) argues that consideration of change does not favour perdurantism. For stage theory see Sider (2000; 2001, section 4.6). Hawley (2001, chapter 1) also advocates stage theory, and discusses most of the issues covered in this section. Alternative accounts of change are mooted by Ehring (1997; 2001), Simons (2000a), MacBride (2001), Parsons (2001), and Brower (2010). Klein (1999) argues that neither endurance nor perdurance theories permit genuine change; see also Meincke (2019). In various ways, Rychter (2009), Hansson (2007), and Hofweber (2009) argue that there is no genuine problem of change; Raven (2011) argues that there is, whilst Einheuser (2012) gives a nuanced assessment. Eddon (2010a) argues that the problem cannot give us purchase on which theory of persistence to adopt.

4. Coincidence

We usually assume that two different things can’t be in the same place at the same time: how could there be room? But certain puzzle cases challenge this assumption. These puzzles are of interest in their own right, but they feature in this article because, as with the problem of change, perdurantists have argued that believing in temporal parts is the best way to solve the puzzles. And, as with the problem of change, endurantists may reply that temporal parts don’t help, or that there is a perfectly good endurantist alternative, or both.

4.1 Temporary Coincidence

In some puzzle cases it seems that two objects occupy the same place at the same time, but not forever: one or both of them exist either before or after the period of coincidence. For example, suppose you take a lump of clay, and by moulding and shaping it create a statue, which you place proudly on a plinth. What’s on the plinth? Well, the statue is. Is the original lump of clay also on the plinth? It seems so: you didn’t destroy or even damage the lump of clay just by changing its shape. So are there are two statue-shaped things on the plinth, a statue and a lump of clay? On the one hand it seems daft to count these as two different objects. But on the other hand they do seem different: the lump of clay is older than the statue, for example, and perhaps it makes sense to describe the statue as ‘well-made’ or as ‘yet another derivative bit of art-as-therapy’, while the lump of clay is neither well-made nor derivative: it was just dug out of the garden. These differences suggest that the lump of clay and the statue are two different things, occupying the same place at the same time.

This argument is sometimes expressed using Leibniz’s Law, the principle which says that if objects differ in their properties, they cannot be one and the same thing. Leibniz’s Law should be distinguished from the more controversial Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, which says that if objects share all their properties, they must be one and the same thing. (See the separate entry on the identity of indiscernibles.)

Similar examples of temporary coincidence can arise when objects gain or lose parts. Tibbles the cat is made of the usual catty parts, including a tail, and a tail-complement, i.e., all of Tibbles except for her tail. A tail-complement is a slightly strange object, but it’s rather like a torso, i.e., all of an animal except for its limbs and head. Tibbles has a whimsical owner, who names the tail-complement ‘Tib’. One eventful day, Tibbles loses her tail in an accident: she shrinks to become exactly the same size and shape as Tib. On the one hand it seems daft to count Tibbles and Tib as two different objects after the accident. But on the other hand they do seem different: Tibbles has been a cat for years, unlike Tib, and Tibbles is her owner’s favourite animal, while perhaps we cannot say this of Tib. These differences suggest that, after the accident, Tibbles and Tib are two different things occupying the same place at the same time.

(Related problems about cats and their parts are dealt with in the separate entry on the problem of the many.)

What have these puzzles about temporary coincidence got to do with temporal parts? If we accept that statues, lumps of clay, cats, tails and tail-complements all have temporal parts, then we can tell a coherent story about these cases. This should tempt us to believe in temporal parts, unless endurantists can come up with a good story of their own. Let’s look at the perdurantist and endurantist stories in turn.

Central to the perdurantist account of temporary coincidence is the claim that, while it is bizarre to think that two distinct objects could entirely coincide, there is nothing bizarre about two objects partially coinciding by sharing a part, and nothing bizarre about an object partially coinciding with one of its own parts. Recall the example of you and your conjoined twin. If you share a hand, there is no puzzle about how you can both be in the same glove without jostling for space: you and your twin partially coincide by sharing a part. And think of your left foot: there is no mystery about how you and your foot can both be in the same sock, nor about how you can be partially in the same place as your own foot. According to perdurantists, cases of temporary coincidence involve objects which partially overlap by sharing temporal parts, or objects which partially overlap because one is a temporal part of the other (we can think of this as a limiting case of sharing parts).

Think of the lump of clay and the statue. Suppose you formed the lump out of smaller bits on Monday, made it into a statue on Wednesday, then smashed the thing to pieces on Sunday. According to perdurantists, the lump of clay is a week-long four-dimensional object, and the statue is a five-day-long four-dimensional object. Indeed, the statue is a temporal part of the lump of clay, composed of some of the instantaneous temporal parts which compose the lump. Now, how many statue-shaped things are on the plinth on Thursday? Well, the lump of clay and the statue both have a temporal part sitting on the plinth on Thursday, so they’re both partially on the plinth on Thursday. But neither the lump nor the statue is wholly there on the plinth on Thursday. This explains both our intuition that there’s only one object there (there’s just the one arty-looking temporal part at any given moment) and our intuition that the statue and the lump are different objects with different properties (they occupy different four-dimensional regions).

Much the same can be said for Tib and Tibbles. Tib and Tibbles are both long-lasting four-dimensional objects, according to perdurantists. Before the accident, at any given moment a temporal part of Tib is a spatial part of a temporal part of Tibbles. After the accident, Tib and Tibbles share temporal parts. But there’s no mystery as to how Tib and Tibbles can coincide after the accident yet still be different things: neither the whole Tib nor the whole Tibbles is there, just some of their shared temporal parts.

Objections to the perdurance account of temporary coincidence focus on more general (alleged) difficulties for perdurantism; on whether the account can generalise to cope with all coincidence problems (see section 4.2); and on whether it can explain why we are happy to call the statue but not the lump ‘well-made’ or ‘derivative’. There are also specific objections to the perdurance account of cases of temporary coincidence which involve people (see section 9 for these). What can endurantists come up with instead?

One popular endurantist option is simply to accept that two different objects can wholly occupy exactly the same location at the same time. This view is sometimes called the ‘standard account’ of coincidence. The relationship between wholly-coinciding objects is often called ‘constitution’, and so the slogan of the standard account is ‘constitution is not identity’. The lump of clay constitutes the statue, so they do not have to jostle for space, but they are distinct objects, so they can differ in their age, in whether they are derivative, and so on. (Beware: the similar-sounding ‘composition is not identity’ usually represents the quite different view that a whole is not identical to its several parts.)

The examples we have seen so far involve coincidence between objects of different kinds: a cat and a tail-complement, a statue and a lump of clay. According to some versions of the standard account, constitution is always a one-way relationship: the lump constitutes the statue, but not vice versa. Accounts without this restriction can be sympathetic to coincidence between objects of the same kind. This may occur, for example, if objects of the same kind can ‘merge’ without losing their identity, or if what looks like a single object can ‘divide’ into two of the same kind (some versions of the ‘ship of Theseus’ problem have this form). The most intriguing imagined cases of fusion and fission involve people, and will be discussed briefly in section 9. (The claim that same-kind coincidence is impossible is sometimes called ‘Locke’s thesis’.)

Opponents of the standard account make the following objections: it requires just too many objects (a particular problem in vague cases, see section 5); it entails that when a 1kg statue is constituted by a distinct 1kg lump, the result ought to weigh 2kg; and, most seriously, it fails to explain how two distinct objects, made of the same parts and matter, arranged in the same way and at the same place and time, can be distinct objects with different properties. How could all these facts about the arrangement of parts fail to fix the facts about the whole?

Defenders of the standard account make various responses.  Regarding the ‘too many objects’ accusation, some point out that perdurantists require even more objects when you count up all the temporal parts, some attempt to establish principled limits on how many objects are required, and others simply accept the multitude.  After all, it’s not so bad having all those objects when you realise they don’t all need separate locations. The response to the objection about mass turns on an analogy with ordinary parts and wholes: your various internal organs and limbs weigh several kilos each, but we wouldn’t expect these to show up on the scales in addition to your total body mass, since you are made of the same stuff as your organs and limbs. Likewise, supposedly, although the lump and the statue are distinct 1kg objects, we shouldn’t expect these to show up separately on the scales, since they are made of the same stuff.

Explanations of how coinciding objects can have different properties vary with different versions of the standard account. Some claim that coinciding objects share all their parts (and are parts of one another). Others claim that, for example, the arm of the statue is not part of the lump of clay, although there may be an arm-shaped lump of clay which constitutes the statue-arm and is part of the bigger lump of clay. But a couple of themes recur in defences of the standard account: first, there is an attempt to shift the burden of proof. Why expect all the properties of a composite object to be determined by the identity, properties and interrelations of its present parts? Second, there is the point that, although the standard account entails that objects made of the same parts may differ, there is no arbitrariness here. Not every object made of suitably-arranged particles of clay is a lump of clay, for some are statues, but whenever there are suitably-arranged particles of clay, there is a lump of clay.

Those who find these explanations unsatisfactory and thereby reject the standard account needn’t become perdurantists, however, for there are several less-popular endurantist accounts of temporary coincidence. Perhaps identity can be temporary: the statue and the lump are identical once the statue exists, although the lump was not always identical to the statue; Tib and Tibbles begin as non-identical, and become identical. This proposal requires us to change our views of identity, and of the connection between identity and sharing of properties. Or perhaps objects can be destroyed more easily than we had realised: the lump of clay ceases to exist when the statue is created (it is replaced by a new, statue-shaped lump of clay, made from the same clay particles); the cat’s tail-complement ceases to exist when it is separated from the tail.

Or perhaps we should be more restrictive about the kinds of object we accept into our ontology. After all, a tail-complement seemed like a dubious object from the beginning, and if there is no such thing as Tib, we don’t have to explain what relationship holds between Tib and Tibbles (we may grandly deny that cats have ‘arbitrary undetached parts’). Similarly, perhaps it is a mistake to think that there literally are such things as statues and lumps of clay, as opposed to mere quantities of stuff or pluralities of particles. Restrictive ontologies come in different strengths: accepting only partless objects and living organisms; accepting only partless objects and those composite objects which are ‘greater than the sum of their parts’; accepting only partless objects; accepting only ‘stuff’ or matter and not objects at all; accepting only ‘proper’ objects and not quantities of stuff.  Difficulties here include reconciling such radical claims with our everyday beliefs, and, for the more moderate versions, ensuring that each and every possible case of coincidence really has been ruled out.

Further discussion of these and other options can be found in the separate entry on relative identity.

4.2 Permanent Coincidence

The cases discussed so far involve objects which seem to coincide for a while, yet fail to coincide at other times at which at least one of them exists. Perdurantists claim that temporarily-coincident objects are not wholly coincident: their non-coincident parts lie in the past or future. But other puzzle cases seem to involve permanently-coincident objects: even perdurantists have to accept that permanently-coinciding objects wholly coincide.

Suppose that, instead of first forming or digging up the lump of clay then later moulding it into a statue, you make the two halves of the statue separately, then create both statue and large lump in one fell swoop, by sticking the halves together. Later, you petulantly smash the thing into pieces, destroying statue and lump simultaneously. Here, it seems that the lump of clay and the statue coincide at every moment at which either exists, yet they seem to be distinct objects because they differ in how they could have been: for example, the statue could have been made of a different lump of clay, but the lump could not. Talk of temporal parts doesn’t help here: lump and statue share all their temporal parts, and differ only in their modal features (in how they could have been different).

Can perdurantists accept that the lump and statue are distinct, coinciding objects? In principle, yes, but this would be strategically unwise: accepting the possibility of complete coincidence without identity leaves perdurantism with no advantage over the standard endurantist account of coincidence. Perdurantists are better advised to claim that the statue and the lump of clay are one and the same object, then come up with some explanation of why they appear to have different properties. We may say that the object in question could, qua statue, have been made out of a different lump of clay, but could not, qua lump, have been made out of a different lump of clay. There are various ways of explaining what the ‘qua’ clauses are doing in this peculiar claim, and perhaps the most popular explanation involves counterpart theory, a controversial theory about our talk of possibilities. Objections here turn either on problems for counterpart theory, or else on whether a satisfactory theory of how we talk about actual things can ever be compatible with this view.

Endurantists are in a happier position regarding permanent coincidence: whatever solution they have adopted in response to temporary coincidence will also handle permanent coincidence (although adjustments are necessary in some cases).

Suggested reading: This is a large field, but Rea (1995) provides a helpful overview, and the papers collected in Rea (ed.) (1997) are a useful next step. Sider (2001, chapter 5) and Hawley (2001, chapters 5 and 6) also survey this area, both from a temporal-parts perspective. Korman (2015: chapter 11) and Sattig (2015: chapters 3 and 5) provide more up-to-date entry points to the debate. The standard account is advocated or discussed sympathetically by Doepke (1982), Baker (1997), Fine (2000; 2003), Johnston (1992), Robinson (1985), Levey (1997), Lowe (1983; 1997; 2003), Moyer (2006), Oderberg (1996), Rea (1997), Simons (1985; 1986; 1987; 1997), Yablo (1987), Thomson (1983; 1998), Paul (2006) and Wasserman (2002); critics include Olson (1997), Heller (2000), Hughes (1997a; 1997b), Lewis (1971), Noonan (1993) and Burke (1992). Gilmore (2007) argues that endurance theorists can handle coincidence by paying attention to the appropriate notion of spatiotemporal location; Eagle (2010a) criticises this argument, and Gilmore (2010) responds, followed by Eagle (2010b). McGrath (2007a) argues that temporal parts views suffer the same difficulties as the standard account; Hawley (2008) discusses this further, whilst Hawley (2005) explores related issues; see also Donnelly (2016). Moyer (2009) argues that coincidence is neutral between endurance and perdurance; in response, Eddon (2010) defends perdurance; Rychter (2011) also defends perdurance here. Sattig (2008) argues that perdurantists cannot combine coincidence with informative identity criteria. Temporary identity is advocated by Baxter (1989) and Gallois (1990; 1998). The claim that objects can be very easily destroyed is advocated by Burke (1994a; 1994b; 1997a; 1997b) and Rea (2000), and critically discussed by Carter (1997), Denkel (1995), Lowe (1995b), Noonan (1999b), Olson (1997a), Zimmerman (1997) and Zammiello (2001). Restrictive ontologies are discussed by Chisholm (1973), Elder (1999), Merricks (2000; 2001), Olson (1996; 1997b), van Inwagen (1981; 1990b), and Zimmerman (1997; 1995); Sidelle (1998) explores a number of interesting options, as does Needham (2010). Walters (2019) draws connections with debates in mereology. It’s hard to avoid Wiggins (1980; 2001). The classic discussion of permanent coincidence is Gibbard (1975). Temporal-parts accounts of permanent coincidence include Noonan (1988; 1993; 1999a). Counterpart theory is advocated by Lewis (1986, chapter 4). Magidor (2016) argues that the arguments discussed in this section cannot settle the endurance-perdurance debate. A more formal approach to problems concerning change of parts can be found in the separate entry on mereology, especially in section 3.2; further discussion can also be found in the separate entries on material constitution, on relative identity and on ordinary objects.

5. Vagueness

(The so-called ‘argument from vagueness’, sometimes invoked in support of temporal parts, is discussed in Section 8 below.)

Vagueness, or indeterminacy, seems to be a feature of our everyday experience of persisting things, and it creates problems which, according to temporal parts theorists, can best be solved by accepting that things have temporal parts. As with the problems of change and of coincidence, endurantists may criticise the temporal parts solution to this problem, provide solutions of their own, or both.

Vagueness often occurs at the beginning and ending of existence. It is notoriously controversial whether there is a precise moment at which human people begin to exist, and if so when that moment is. But most of us will have a grey area at the end of our existence, a few seconds, a few minutes, or even longer during which we seem to be neither clearly alive nor clearly dead. More mundanely, formation and decay are gradual processes for many kinds of object, both natural and artificial: think of a lake or haystack which gradually comes into existence, or a building or a rock formation which slowly crumbles away. Let’s call this phenomenon ‘fuzzy temporal boundaries’.

Indeterminacy can also arise when objects intermingle in a way which seems to leave it clear that they survive the process, but unclear which object is which. Suppose you remove about half the parts from the bicycle your uncle gave you, about half the parts from the bicycle your aunt gave you, and switch them over. Afterwards, you have two bicycles, each half-made of parts that used to be in the bicycle your uncle gave you, and half-made of parts that used to be in the bicycle your aunt gave you. Which post-repair bicycle is the one your uncle gave you, and which the one your aunt gave you? There seems to be no clear fact of the matter. Let’s call this phenomenon ‘radical disruption’.

In their bare essentials, the two types of indeterminacy are the same (and it is possible to construct cases of intermediate types). In each case, we are not sure how to pin down the career of an object. In fuzzy-boundary cases, we don’t know which of many overlapping career paths an object follows (one which begins earlier, or later?); in radical disruption cases, we don’t know which of (at least) two intersecting career paths an object follows.

Typical temporal parts theorists argue that such indeterminacy results from a mismatch between human language and temporarily-coincident objects (of the sort discussed in section 4.1). Take a building which slowly crumbles away to nothing. According to most temporal parts theorists, there are very many ‘nested’ four-dimensional objects involved in this process, some of which end before others do. We are unclear about when the building ceases to exist because our use of language just doesn’t determine which of these many four-dimensional objects is ‘the building’.

Likewise, in radical disruption cases like that of the bicycles, perdurantists typically recognise a number of different temporarily-coincident four-dimensional objects. Suppose the bicycle your uncle gave you starts off made of parts A and parts B, and the bicycle your aunt gave you starts off made of parts C and parts D. After the switch-around, you have a bicycle made of parts A and parts C, and a bicycle made of parts B and parts D. Perdurantists recognise (at least) the following four-dimensional objects:

  1. something that begins with A and B, then continues with A and C;
  2. something that begins with A and B, then continues with B and D;
  3. something that begins with C and D, then continues with A and C;
  4. something that begins with C and D, then continues with B and D.

Before the switch-around, objects (1) and (2) temporarily coincide, in the place where you keep the bicycle your uncle gave you, and objects (3) and (4) temporarily coincide, in the place where you keep the bicycle your aunt gave you. After the switch-around, objects (1) and (3) coincide, and objects (2) and (4) coincide. When we initially talked about ‘the bicycle your uncle gave you’, there was no fact of the matter as to whether we were talking about (1) or (2). And (1) and (2) end up in different places after the switch-around, which is why we don’t know what to say about the final location of the bicycle your uncle gave you.

From a typical perdurantist perspective, apparent indeterminacy in persistence arises from our fumbling failures to deal with the multitude of precise four-dimensional objects around us. This account of indeterminacy is not a consequence of perdurance theory alone: as well as the claim that ordinary things have temporal parts, it involves the claim that there are many more persisting things than we recognise in ordinary life. It is possible to believe in temporal parts without accepting this second claim but, as we will see in section 8, most perdurantists do accept the second claim. The typical perdurantist story also involves a theory of vagueness which traces it to our use of language; it is not compulsory for perdurantists to think about vagueness in this way, but many do adopt this ‘linguistic’ or ‘semantic’ approach to vagueness.

Objections to the typical temporal parts account of indeterminacy in persistence turn on the sheer number of temporarily coincident objects required to make the story work; or on independent objections to the language-based account of vagueness (see the separate entry on vagueness); or on particular objections to telling such a story about indeterminacy involving people (see section 9).

What can endurantists say about indeterminacy in persistence?  One option is to mimic the perdurantist temporary-coincidence account, but without the temporal parts. That’s to say, endurantists could claim that there are very many wholly-present coincident building-like objects where the building stands, each of which ends at a slightly different moment from all the others. This multiplicity, together with our loose talk, accounts for the unclarity in when the building ceases to exist. Likewise, endurantists could recognise objects (1)–(4), just as perdurantists do, but claim that each is wholly present whenever it exists. This strategy is unpopular, because temporarily-coincident enduring objects can seem worse than temporarily-coincident perduring objects: temporarily-coincident endurers are wholly coincident, unlike temporarily-coincident perdurers. Endurantists may want to recognise some temporarily coinciding things (see section 4.1), yet stop short of the multitudes which would be required to explain fuzzy boundaries.

A second endurantist option is to accept that sometimes there just are no precise facts of the matter about the temporal boundaries and careers of objects, because the world itself is sometimes indeterminate. This is the claim that there can be worldly (‘ontic’, or ‘metaphysical’) vagueness. (A worldly-vagueness option is also available to perdurantists, and might be attractive to those who want to avoid commitment to a multitude of temporarily-coincident four-dimensional objects. But typical perdurantists adopt the temporary-coincidence-plus-linguistic-vagueness account outlined above.)

Many people recoil at the thought that the world itself could be vague or indeterminate, perhaps because they believe that indeterminacy must be a result of mismatch between what is represented (the world), and what does the representing (thought or language). Even those who don’t mind a bit of worldly vagueness may have reason to reject worldly vagueness in persistence, because this amounts to worldly vagueness in identity: it’s vague whether the original bicycle your uncle gave you is identical with the bicycle you now ride to work. Worldly vagueness in identity is thought to be especially problematic, because all identity is self-identity, and it’s hard to see how there could be any vagueness in self-identity.

Third, endurantists could claim that we speak precisely, that there always are determinate facts of the matter about the identity, existence and careers of objects, but it’s just that sometimes we can’t tell what these facts are. (This involves an ‘epistemicist’ account of vagueness.) This claim could be developed in one of two ways. In the case of the crumbling building, for example, endurantists could claim that there is a single building-shaped object with an unknown final moment. Or they could claim that there are very many temporarily-coincident building-like objects, each with a different final moment, that we refer to just one of these when we say ‘the building’ but we do not know which. (Again, perdurantists may adopt one of these epistemicist strategies, but typically do not.)

Objections here may turn on problems for the epistemicist view of vagueness in general; on the oddity of insisting that, for example, there is an exact number of molecules which a building can lose before it stops existing (on the first version of the view); or on objections to multitudinous temporary coincidents (on the second version of the view).

Finally, endurantists could adopt a restricted ontology, as some do in response to temporary coincidence. If there aren’t really any such things as bicycles, buildings or lakes, just particles moving around and interacting, then there are no issues to resolve about the careers and identities of bicycles, buildings or lakes. As before, the main difficulty here is in reconciling our everyday beliefs with a sufficiently restricted ontology: after all, people and even fundamental particles seem sometimes to be indeterminate. (Again, it is open to perdurantists to adopt a restricted ontology, but typically they do not.)

In summary then, both perdurantists and endurantists can adopt various responses to apparent vagueness in persistence; which they choose depends in part upon their more general views about the nature of vagueness. Typical perdurantists posit temporary coincidence between objects, and a failure on our part to talk determinately about any one of these. Endurantists could make the same claim, but typically do not. A temporary-coincidence view could instead be paired with an epistemic account of vagueness, and our failure to know which object we’re talking about. Alternatively, vagueness may be either attributed to objects themselves, and their failure to have determinate careers, or else to our failure to know what careers they have. A radical option is to deny that any genuine object is involved (thus restricting ontology). In different ways, all of these options are available to perdurantists and endurantists alike, but the costs and benefits differ.

Suggested Reading: For a way into the general debate about vagueness, try Keefe and Smith (eds.) (1997), and the separate entry on vagueness. Stalnaker (1988) is a particularly nice discussion of vague persistence.  Issues discussed in this section are covered in more detail by Hawley (2001, chapter 4). Temporal parts accounts of vague persistence are defended by Sider (2001, section 4.9) (Sider presents a distinctive argument which will be discussed in section 8) and Heller (2000); these are criticised by Lowe (2005). Romerales (2008) compares perdurance and stage theory on this front. Endurantist worldly vagueness is defended by van Inwagen (1988; 1990b) and discussed by Cowles (1994), Garrett (1991), and Hirsch (1999). The classic argument against worldly vagueness in identity can be found in Evans (1978) and Salmon (1981). Heller (1996) objects to worldly vagueness of all kinds. Hudson (2000) defends an epistemicist temporal parts theory. Williamson (1994, chapter 9) discusses an epistemicist account of vague objects. Haslanger (1994) considers multitudes of coinciding endurers, and Sosa (1987; 1999) looks kindly upon the idea, as does Kurtsal Steen (2010). Further discussion can also be found in the separate entries on ordinary objects and on identity.

6. Time and Temporal Parts

As well as disagreeing about whether persisting things have temporal parts, philosophers disagree about the nature of time itself. Does time flow? Are the past and the future as real as the present? Philosophers also disagree about the connection between these disagreements: does taking a certain view about the nature of time commit you to any particular view about the existence of temporal parts? What about vice versa?

You can find a more detailed discussion of the nature of time elsewhere in this encyclopedia (see the separate entry on time). The most relevant debate for our purposes turns on whether distant times are like distant places. For example, people, objects and places in Antarctica exist, even though they are far away (if you are reading this in Antarctica, please adjust the example). It can be difficult to communicate with distant places, and they may be less important to us than our immediate surroundings, but they exist nevertheless. What about eighteenth-century people, objects and times? Does David Hume exist, despite being far away in time? Or is it more reasonable to say that Hume used to exist, but now does not exist?  Eternalists believe that past and future things exist, just like present things. Presentists, in contrast, believe that distant times are not like distant places: things in distant places exist, but things at distant times do not. According to the intermediate ‘growing universe’ theory, past and present things exist, but future things do not.

What connection is there between the eternalism-presentism debate, and the debate about temporal parts? It’s natural to suppose that presentists should be endurantists, claiming that things are wholly present whenever they exist. If you don’t believe in either the past or the future, there’s nowhere and nowhen for any ‘missing’ parts to be. This argument from presentism to endurantism needs some work, however. Presentists think that only the present exists, but they’re happy for us to talk about the causes of the First World War, about next week’s seminar, or about David Hume. Although Hume does not exist, it’s right to say that David Hume wrote An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, and wrong to say that David Hume wrote The Feminine Mystique. Presentists worth their salt provide a story about what makes certain statements about the past and the future right, and others wrong. Can presentists claim that, although past and future temporal parts of the banana do not exist, the banana did have temporal parts in the past, and will have other temporal parts in the future? This takes us back to the question of how to define ‘temporal part’ (see section 2), and it raises a methodological issue: should ‘temporal part’ be defined in such a way that presentists can believe in temporal parts, or not?

Well, perhaps presentists should reject temporal parts and so be endurantists. Must eternalists, who believe in the past and the future, accept temporal parts and so be perdurantists? Or are eternalists free to choose between endurantism and perdurantism?  One reason to think that eternalists should believe in temporal parts is that without them they may have difficulty explaining how things change. How can you both know about theories of persistence (tomorrow) and fail to know about theories of persistence (yesterday)? Presentists don’t seem to have a problem here: your failure yesterday to know about theories of persistence just doesn’t exist. But eternalists are committed to the existence of your two apparently-conflicting states. If eternalists accept temporal parts, they have a neat explanation at hand: your yesterday temporal part doesn’t know about theories of persistence, but your tomorrow part does know about theories of persistence. But if eternalists reject temporal parts, then the two apparently-conflicting states are states of one and the same thing (you), and it’s not obvious how to resolve the conflict. So perhaps eternalists should believe in temporal parts, and, conversely, those who reject temporal parts should be presentists. This argument succeeds only if eternalists really can’t explain change without believing in temporal parts (see section 3).

If we could establish that things have temporal parts if and only if the past and the future exist, this would raise a number of issues. First, should we attempt to establish a theory of persistence, and then let this dictate our theory of time? Or should we start with the theory of time? (See section 7 for an argument from physics against presentism and thus, perhaps, against endurantism.) Or can we somehow establish both at once? Second, tying the dispute about persistence to the dispute about time makes trouble for anyone who thinks that one of the disputes is genuine but the other is merely a verbal disagreement. And, third, since presentism and eternalism seem clearly to be incompatible, if each compels a different account of persistence, then there can’t be ‘mixed’ worlds in which some things perdure and others endure (a peculiar consequence, since most endurantists think that processes perdure).

Attempts to connect debates about time with debates about persistence have focused on the disagreement between eternalists and presentists. But there is another dispute about time which may have some bearing on whether things have temporal parts. Eternalists agree that past, present and future times all exist, but they disagree amongst themselves as to whether there are important ontological differences between the three categories. Advocates of the ‘A-theory’ of time argue that the flow of time pushes events from one ontological status to another (presentists are usually taken to be A-theorists too). But advocates of the ‘B-theory’ of time think that there is no important ontological difference between past, present and future, and that there is no such thing as ‘the flow of time’. There is some tendency to think that the A-theory is more hospitable to endurantism, and the B-theory more hospitable to perdurantism, but there is no consensus on this matter.

Finally, considerations about the possibility of time-travel have been used to argue both for and against the existence of temporal parts; these arguments connect with debate about whether we should approach persistence as an issue about parthood and/or as an issue about location. For more on this debate, see section 4.2 of the separate entry on Time Travel, and section 6.3.5 of the separate entry on Location and Mereology.

Suggested Reading: Earlier discussions of temporal parts paid close attention to analogies and disanalogies between space and time: e.g. Taylor (1955), Meiland (1966); Butterfield (1985) reflects on these. Lombard (1999) and Brogaard (2000) argue that presentism is compatible with perdurantism, while Merricks (1995) and Hestevold and Carter (2002) argue that presentism compels endurantism. Benovsky (2009) takes an even-handed approach. Merricks (1995) and Hinchliff (1996) argue that eternalism rules out endurantism, because of the problem of change; see the suggested reading at the end of section 3 for endurance-friendly eternalist accounts of change. Lowe (1998a) argues for a connection between theories of time and theories of persistence. Markosian (1994) attempts to formulate the endurance-perdurance debate in a way which is independent of the eternalism/presentism debate. Mellor (1981; 1998) and Johnston (1987) combine eternalism and endurantism, whilst Ingthorsson (2009) opposes this combination, and Pezet (2019) favours endurance with presentism. Tallant (2018) argues that presentism is incompatible with each of perdurantism, endurantism, and stage theory; responses include Baron (2019), Noonan (2019), Iaquinto (2019), and Hochstetter and Hess (2020). For discussion of the relationship between the A/B-theory debate and the debate about persistence, see Butterfield (1985), Oaklander (1992), Wilson (1955), and Carter and Hestevold (1994). Parsons (2005) highlights a semantic problem for B-theory perdurantists. Barker and Dowe (2003) criticise endurantism by drawing on rival theories of time; McDaniel (2003) and Beebee and Rush (2003) respond, provoking Barker and Dowe (2005); see also Benovsky (2009a). Following Sider (2001), Effingham and Robson (2007) argue that endurantism cannot account for the possibility of time travel, as does Simon (2005), whilst Miller (2006a) defends endurantism; Gilmore (2007) and Effingham (2011a) argue that time travel is a problem for perdurantism. See also Effingham (2010) and Daniels (2014). Wasserman (2017: chapter 6) sets this discussion in the context of wider debates about time travel; Proetti and Smid (2019) are sceptical about time travel arguments here. See also Mooney (2019a, 2019b), Valaris and Michael (2015). Gilmore et al (2016) consider other connections between the metaphysics of time and debates about persistence.

7. Special Relativity and Temporal Parts

Didn’t Einstein show that space and time are basically the same thing? It’s true that Einstein’s two theories of relativity radically altered our scientific picture of space and time, although it is more controversial what consequences the theories have for metaphysics. (See section 3 of the separate entry on being and becoming in modern physics for more detail on this issue.) It is the Special Theory of Relativity (STR) which has had most impact on the debate about temporal parts: three quite different arguments have been proposed, each of which purports to show that STR lends support to the perdurantist claim that things have temporal parts.

For our purposes, the key feature of STR is its claim that, for many pairs of events, there is no absolute fact of the matter as to which event, if either, happened first, or whether both occurred at the same time. The question of precedence has different answers according to different frames of reference, and there are no grounds for selecting any single frame of reference as the one which gives the ‘real’ answer. This means that, for many events, there is no absolute fact of the matter as to whether they are occurring in the present, in the past or in the future. (If they were occurring now, they’d be occurring simultaneously with your reading this sentence, but there’s no absolute fact of the matter about this simultaneity issue.)

A first argument from STR to perdurantism goes as follows: STR shows space to be much like time, objects extend in space by having spatial parts, so objects persist through time by having temporal parts.  But this argument is weak: although STR does show space to be like time in some respects, the theory does still differentiate between spatial and temporal dimensions. Even if it did not, we would need some further reason to believe that persistence must be just like spatial extension.

A second argument from STR to perdurantism proceeds via the debate about time (see section 6). According to STR, for many events there is no absolute fact of the matter as to whether those events are simultaneous with now. That’s to say, at any moment, there is no absolute fact of the matter as to which events are present. This makes life difficult for presentists, who claim that only present events exist. If STR thereby rules out presentism, and if endurantism requires presentism in order to explain change (see section 3), then STR rules out endurantism: things have temporal parts. But not all endurantists agree that they must be presentists, and not all presentists agree that their view is undermined by STR.

A third argument from STR to perdurantism does not rely on the claim that STR is out-and-out incompatible with endurantism. Instead, the claim is that STR highlights a phenomenon which can better be explained by perdurantists than by endurantists. To understand the phenomenon, imagine a three-dimensional cylindrical chocolate cake which you want to cut up into two-dimensional pieces (you’ve got a lot of friends). If you cut only at right angles to the length of the cake, then each piece will be circular. But if you cut at a different angle, then each piece will be oval. The cylindrical shape of the cake explains the shapes of the various pieces produced by cutting at various angles.

Now imagine a four-dimensional object, cut into three-dimensional timeslices. In a non-relativistic world, there’s only one way to do this, because there’s only one way to divide up events into groups of simultaneous events: it’s like cutting the cake at right-angles. But, by relativising simultaneity to reference frames, STR gives us lots of different ways to cut the four-dimensional object into three-dimensional slices, just as there are lots of different angles at which to cut the cake. The shape of the three-dimensional slices you get by cutting in different ways, from the perspective of different reference frames, can all be explained by the shape of the four-dimensional object you’re cutting up.

Endurantists don’t think there is any four-dimensional object to do this explaining job. There are only the three-dimensional slices, which are just the single, persisting three-dimensional object (each slice is that object, at a different time). STR tells us that the persisting thing has different three-dimensional shapes with respect to different reference frames. The different shapes in different reference frames are correlated, but according to the endurance theorist there is no ‘underlying’ four-dimensional object to explain these correlations. Endurantists may respond by questioning the need for explanation here.

In short, while the general ambience of modern physics may seem more friendly to perdurance than to endurance theory, it is remarkably difficult to devise any conclusive argument from physics to temporal parts.

More recent concerns have focused on how the various theories of persistence can be formulated within a relativistic framework: can we sustain a distinction between temporal and spatial parts, or should we think in terms of spatiotemporal parts?

Suggested Reading: Balashov (2011) is an advanced overview of these issues, Hawley (2009) is much more introductory, and Gilmore (2008) is a very useful middle ground; Balashov (2008) is a more technical paper which attempts precise definitions of the rival theories of persistence against a relativistic backdrop. Broad (1927, chapter 2) is an early discussion of the links between perdurantism and STR; see also Quine (1960, p. 172); Rea (1998b, section 1.1) responds. Mellor (1981) argues that STR is compatible with endurantism, while Mellor (1980) argues that the General Theory of Relativity is also compatible with endurantism, contrary to Nerlich (1979). Balashov (1999; 2000a) argues that perdurantism can better explain relativistic phenomena. Balashov (2002) argues that STR favours perdurantism over stage theory; Balashov (2000b) raises further problems for endurantism, while Gilmore (2002) responds, followed by Balashov (2005a); Gilmore (2006) develops a relativistic version of endurance theory. Hales and Johnson (2003) weigh in against endurance theory; see also Hales and Johnson (2007), and Schmidt (2015). Further installments include Balashov (2009), Sattig (2006), Miller (2004), Harrington (2005), Gibson and Pooley (2006). See also Hudson (2005) and Balashov (2010) for book-length treatments of this and related topics. McCall and Lowe (2003) argue for an STR-friendly notion of the flow of time. Davidson (2013). Balashov (2014), and Calosi (2015) exchange arguments about four-dimensional shapes in relativistic contexts. Pashby (2013) argues that quantum objects lack temporal parts, see also Pashby (2016); Gomori and Szabo (2019) discuss the persistence of the electromagnetic field .

8. Relations Between Temporal Parts

Suppose we accept that ordinary persisting things have temporal parts. What can we say about the relations which hold between those temporal parts? For example: must the different temporal parts of a single object lie along a smooth trajectory through space and time, or can objects jump about instantaneously, or pop out of and back into existence? Similar questions also arise for endurantists, and not all perdurantists answer these questions in the same way, but for the most part perdurantists do agree on a particular type of answer to these questions. This is because perdurantism is very often held in conjunction with two other doctrines: the doctrine of universalism, and that of Humean Supervenience.

Universalism is the view that any collection of objects whatsoever has a sum, an object they compose. Thinking just of the present moment, this entails that there is an object composed right now of your left ear, the front fork of your bicycle, and the Louvre. If you think about all times, and imagine that ordinary things are made of instantaneous temporal parts, then you can see that universalist perdurantists believe in quite an extraordinary number of objects. Any combination of temporal parts of any objects from any times, no matter how scattered and disparate, composes an object. So there is an object made of your maternal grandmother’s wedding ring on the day she was married, your right ear yesterday and a brief temporal part of an electron in the year 2525. (Universalism is sometimes called ‘unrestricted mereology’, ‘unrestricted composition’ or ‘unrestricted fusion’; ‘fusion’ means ‘sum’. For more on universalism, see the separate entry on mereology, especially section 4.2.)

There are a number of reasons why perdurantists typically adopt universalism  First, the claim that there is a large number of nested four-dimensional objects is central to the most common perdurantist account of vagueness in persistence (see section 5). The building doesn’t seem to have a clear last moment of existence because there are very many coinciding building-shaped four-dimensional objects, each of which ends at a slightly different moment, and it is vague which of these is ‘the building’. Whether its role in this story is a reason to accept universalism depends upon the strength or weakness of alternative accounts of vagueness in persistence.

Second, it often seems that whether or not an object survives a certain kind of change is in some sense conventional, or up to us. Many believe that we set the standards for how many repairs you can make to your bicycle without destroying it, and that whether or not a person can survive massive memory loss is partly a matter of what we mean by ‘person’. How things persist seems sometimes to be a matter of what kind of classifications we choose to use. A radical version of this suggests that physical objects come into and out of existence when we decide they do. This sounds mysterious: how could we have such powers? But the combination of universalism and perdurantism permits a less radical version of the view: there are lots of four-dimensional objects which share temporal parts with the wheeled thing in your bike shed, and it’s up to us which one of those counts as a ‘bicycle’. Similarly, perhaps it’s up to us which of the multitude of four-dimensional objects count as ‘people’. 

Third, perdurantists who reject universalism seem committed to giving an account of the difference between collections of temporal parts which have a sum, and collections which do not. But such accounts seem to permit borderline cases, in which it’s not clear whether a certain collection has a sum. And borderline cases look like cases in which it is not clear whether a certain object (the sum of those parts) exists or not. And many find such vagueness in existence unacceptable. Objections to this argument turn on whether non-universalists really have to give such an account, and on whether vague existence really is unacceptable.

This third type of argument for universalism has also been used to argue directly for the existence of temporal parts. Roughly speaking, instead of asking which temporal parts have a sum, we ask which matter-filled regions exactly contain objects. Unless we agree that they all do, we will get into trouble with borderline cases, as in the previous paragraph. But if every matter-filled region exactly contains an object, then even three-dimensional matter-filled regions exactly contain objects. So the world is full of instantaneous objects: these look very like temporal parts. This argument is now often known as the ‘argument from vagueness’. Objections here include those mentioned in the previous paragraph; we might also question whether the instantaneous objects are really temporal parts.

However they argue for their position, perdurantists who are also universalists have an easy answer to some questions about what paths objects may take through space-time: any series of object-stages composes an object. It is certainly interesting to ask which of those objects are bicycles, or ships, or people, but these now look like questions about the classification of objects, rather than questions about persistence.

The other doctrine which usually goes along with perdurantism is Humean Supervenience. This is the claim that, roughly speaking, facts about which intrinsic properties are instantiated at which points determine all the facts there are. There are no irreducibly holistic facts. In conjunction with perdurantism, this entails that all the facts about a given persisting object supervene upon intrinsic facts about its briefest temporal parts. That’s to say, if you fix what’s happening at each moment, you’ve fixed everything. This sounds pretty plausible, but it turns out that it’s rather difficult to reduce facts about motion, for example, to suitable moment-by-moment facts.

There are various responses to this difficulty. Endurantists are not usually tempted by Humean Supervenience, since they are committed to facts about identity between objects wholly existing at different times, and these identity facts are not easily reducible to moment-by-moment facts. So some take the difficulty for Humean Supervenience to be a reason for adopting endurantism. Some perdurantists stick with perdurantism, but reject Humean Supervenience. Instead, they accept that some facts about persisting objects cannot be reduced to facts about their briefest temporal parts; they may accept, for example, that causal relations between earlier and later parts are irreducible in this way. Finally, some perdurantists insist that the supposed facts which seem to cause problems for Humean Supervenience are not real facts after all.

Suggested Reading: Lewis (1986a, pp. 212–3), Heller (1990, section 2.9), Jubien (1993, section 2.2), Quine (1981, chapter 1), Rea (1998a) and Hudson (2000) argue for universalism; van Inwagen (1990b, section 8), Markosian (1998), Merricks (2001) and Varzi (2003) object in various ways. Balashov (2007a) discusses universalism and stage theory; Campdelacreu (2010) responds. Sosa (1999) investigates the options for endurantist universalism, whilst Miller (2006) develops an endurantist ‘universalism’ based on constitution rather than parthood; see also Inman (2014). Sider (1997; 2001, section 4.9) develops the ‘argument from vagueness’ via universalism to temporal parts; Koslicki (2003) is critical, while Sider (2003a) responds. Further discussions of Sider’s argument include Balashov (2005), Nolan (2006), Markosian (2004), Sider (2004), Miller (2005a), Varzi (2005), Noonan (2010), Magidor (2015) and Eagle (2016b). Korman (2010) provides an overview of this debate, with further references. Hirsch (1982) is an extensive, rewarding discussion of criteria of persistence. Humean Supervenience is articulated by Lewis (1986b, pp. ix-x), and discussed by Loewer (1996). The problem about motion is raised by Armstrong (1980), and addressed by Robinson (1989) Hawley (1999; 2001, chapter 3), Zimmerman (1998b; 1999), Callender (2001), Sider (2001, section 6.5), Lewis (1999), Teller (2002) and Butterfield (2006), while Jaskolla (2017) makes intriguing connections between this debate and panpsychism. Butterfield (2005) raises many interesting connections between the physics of motion and the metaphysics of persistence, see also Pashby (2016). Balashov (2003a, 2003b, 2010), Hudson (2002, 2003), Effingham (2011) and Torre (2015) discuss issues about restricted composition and laws of nature. Haslanger (1994) discusses the connection between endurance and Humean Supervenience; Hawley (2015) discusses links between persistence, temporary intrinsics and Humean Supervenience in Lewis’s work. Oakes (2004) raises causal difficulties for perdurantism without relying on HS. Magidor (2016) argues that much of the debate around perdurance and endurance looks very different when we notice implicit assumptions about universalism; see also Miller (2008) and Varzi (2007). Della Rocca (2011) argues that endurantists must adopt an implausible kind of anti-reductionism about persistence; Baker (2013) responds.

9. Do People have Temporal Parts? And Other Special Cases.

Issues about the persistence of people are the subject of an entire encyclopedia article in their own right (see the separate entry on personal identity), but it is worth highlighting points where the arguments discussed in earlier sections have special consequences for personal survival. People have various distinctive features: we have moral status, we have mental properties like reasoning and being conscious, and we are associated in an intimate but somewhat puzzling way with living organisms.  Moreover, most of us seem to have a special concern for our own future, and are willing to limit current pleasures like smoking, shopping, and not writing encyclopedia articles, because we believe that sacrifices made now will benefit us in the future. We also feel a distinctive kind of pride or shame about our own past actions, and are bound by our own past promises but not by those of other people.

Is there room for these distinctive features within the different theories of persistence? It has been suggested that only endurantists can justify our willingness to make sacrifices for our future selves, to act upon the plans formulated by our past selves, and to rely upon the evidence gathered by our past selves . The idea is that these activities make sense only if a present person is identical to her past and future selves. Perdurantists may respond in one of two ways. First, they may argue that it is the whole, identical, four-dimensional person who makes sacrifices, acts upon plans and reasons from evidence, via the activities of her temporal parts. Alternatively, they may accept that it is short-lived temporal parts which act, sacrifice and reason, but that past- and future-regarding actions can be justified by the intimate relations between distinct temporal parts of the same person. Stage theorists must take this second route, for they claim that the person just is a brief stage, who takes responsibility for the actions of her past counterparts, and acts to benefit her future counterparts.

There are a number of issues about coincidence involving people. For example, it seems that we human people at least coincide with human organisms. You occupy the same location as a human organism right now, but it seems that you differ in various ways: the organism may have existed since conception, and will go on until biological death, but some believe that the person does not come into existence until the organism is relatively well-developed, and that the person may cease to exist before biological death, by entering a persistent vegetative state. You also seem to differ from the organism regarding what’s possible: perhaps you could have been a robot, or a disembodied intelligence, whereas the organism could not.

Certain puzzle cases also seem to suggest that a person might divide into two: suppose that, as a result of philosophical confusion on the hospital ethics committee, a doctor is permitted to remove the two halves of your brain and implant them into two different (brainless) bodies. On one understanding of this process, each of the resulting people has a good claim to be you. Is this a reason to think that two coincident people were walking around together before the operation, and that they have only now been separated?

Moreover, it seems that people are prone to indeterminacy, just like crumbling buildings and bicycles: some people have gradual endings, and sometimes, in stories at least, a person can undergo such a traumatic change that it’s not clear whether the same person exists after the change.

We saw a number of ways of dealing with coincidence and indeterminacy more generally, in section 4 and section 5. But any talk of either partial or total coincidence involving people can seem problematic, because of concerns about the use of first-person pronouns (who does your ‘I’ refer to before your brain-splitting operation, if there are two of you?), and about multiplying conscious entities (could two people have literally the same headache? if you merely coincide with a human organism, are you sure it’s you who has the headache, and not the organism?). It’s not clear, however, whether we should revise our theories of persistence as a consequence of these problems, or whether we should revise our ideas about people. This ‘too many thinkers’ problem is discussed in more detail in the entry on personal identity.

The ‘too many thinkers’ problem looms even if we just consider two entities, the person and the organism, but it proliferates if we adopt a combination of perdurantism and universalism (as discussed in section 8). On such a view, there seem to be a multitude of person-like entities sitting in your chair right now, each with slightly different start-dates and end-dates. Perdurantists may argue that only the longest-lived of these is really a person, and that the others are mere temporal parts of a person, but opponents resist this move.

People are especially interesting, but metaphysical questions about persistence have been raised for objects of various other kinds, including musical works, social entities such as institutions or groups of people, and biological species. It is often controversial what sort of entities these are – material objects, abstract types, processes, sets? – and so it is also controversial how far the arguments discussed above, which focus on material objects, are relevant to these special cases. Useful articles elsewhere in this Encyclopedia include Philosophy of Music, Philosophy of Theater, Biological Individuals, and Social Ontology.

Finally, this article has focused on debates about temporal parts within philosophy, with a dash of physics. However temporal parts are also significant within applied ontology, where they may feature within the conceptual schemes adopted by computer scientists, biologists and others to represent information systematically.

Suggested Reading: There is a huge literature on personal identity, but everyone should read Williams (1973) and Parfit (1971; then 1984 part 3 (at least)). Work on people which is informed by the broader debate about persistence includes Lowe (1996), Olson (1997; 2007), Merricks (2001), Baker (2000), Hudson (2001), Noonan (2003b), Tappenden (2011), Langford (2016), Oyowe (2016). Lewis (1976) and Hudson (1999) provide perdurantist accounts of people, while Merricks (1999b) advocates endurantism, and Brueckner (2009) responds to Merricks; Patrone (2017) advocates stage theory. Haslanger (1992) argues that rational enquirers must endure; Rosenkrantz (2005) argues from self-knowledge to endurance; Prosser (2006) uses the nature of experience to explain away the appeal of endurantism in general; Parsons (2015) argues from the nature of experience to stage theory, see also Smith (2010); Brink (1997) discusses self-concern in a perdurantist framework; Broome (1991 chapter 11) discusses connections between theories of persistence and utilitarianism; Braddon-Mitchell and West (2001) argue that stages are primary. Other questions of ethics and self-concern are addressed by Olson (2010), Tognazzini (2010), Taylor (2013), Miller (2014, 2015), Mullins (2014), and Briggs and Nolan (2015). Duncan (2015) argues from the temporal extendedness of thought to the falsity of certain views about personal persistence. Dietz (2020) argues that temporal parts can be agents, whilst Hochstetter (2015) argues that stages cannot act. Rimmel (2018) argues that tensed belief creates difficulties for perdurantists. Hedden (2015) challenges many standard assumptions about the connection between personal persistence and rationality. Special concerns about coincidence involving people, including ‘too many thinkers’ are discussed by Noonan (1999a), Merricks (2003), Olson (1997a), Shoemaker (1999), Sider (2003b), Sutton (2014), Johnston (2016, 2017), Kovacs (2016, 2019), Kaiserman (2019), Eklund (2019), and Longenecker (2019). Burke (1997b), Ehring (1995), Heller (2000), Roache (2010), Wasserman (2005) and Demarest (2016) are also relevant.

Dodd (2004), Thomasson (2004), Caplan and Matheson (2006), Tillman (2011), Aliyev (2017), Moruzzi (2018), Alward (2019), Friedell (2020) discuss the persistence of musical works. Slater and Varzi (2007), Jansen (2008), Hansson Wahlberg (2014a), Epstein (2015 ch.12), Hawley (2017), Faller (2019), Hansson Wahlberg (2019), and Wilhelm (2020) discuss the persistence of social entities. Merkouris (2014) discusses the persistence of legal treaties. Reydon (2008) discusses biological species. Nicholson and Dupre eds. (2018) is an open-access collection including many interesting articles about the persistence and broader metaphysics of biological entities, from a ‘process’ perspective. A final very special case: Baber (2002) discusses God’s temporal parts; for discussion see the entry on the Trinity. There are many resources on applied ontology at the Buffalo Ontology Site (see Other Internet Resources), whilst Bittner, Donnelly and Smith (2004) explicitly discusses endurance and perdurance in an applied ontology context.


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Thanks to Jon Hesk and to Penelope Mackie for helpful suggestions. And thanks to my colleagues in St Andrews and to the Arts and Humanities Research Board, for enabling me to take the research leave during which this entry was originally written.

Copyright © 2020 by
Katherine Hawley

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