First published Mon May 10, 2010; substantive revision Mon Oct 21, 2019

Immigration occurs when someone moves to another country in order to stay indefinitely. Thus, because of the brevity of their visits, tourists, business travelers and foreign students, for example, typically do not qualify as immigrants even though they spend time in a foreign country. There are a variety of important issues surrounding the morality of immigration, including difficult questions regarding the definition and moral status of refugees, the circumstances (if any) in which it is permissible to use guest workers, what obligations a rich country incurs when it actively recruits skilled workers from a poor state, the rights of irregular migrants, and whether there are any limitations on the selection criteria a country may use in deciding among applicants for immigration. This entry addresses each of these topics below, but first it reviews the most prominent arguments on both sides of the central debate in this area, whether states have the moral right to exclude potential immigrants.

1. Arguments for Closed Borders

1.1 Preserving Culture

The most popular argument for the permissibility and importance of closing borders to outsiders is that this exclusion is necessary in order to preserve a state’s distinctive culture. The appeal of cultural continuity is easy to appreciate. As David Miller explains, “the public culture of their country is something that people have an interest in controlling: they want to be able to shape the way that their nation develops, including the values that are contained in the public culture. They may not of course succeed: valued cultural features can be eroded by economic and other forces that evade political control. But they may certainly have good reason to try, and in particular to try to maintain cultural continuity over time, so that they can see themselves as the bearers of an identifiable cultural tradition that stretches backward historically.” (Miller 2005: 200) Think of the United States, for instance. If the US placed no limits on immigration from Canada, it is clear neither how many Canadians would move south, nor whether their migration would have a discernible affect upon American culture. If the United States did not limit immigration from Mexico, on the other hand, it seems almost certain that much larger numbers of Mexicans would migrate north and that the changes to American culture would be regarded by many as rapid and dramatic. (Huntington 2005) If so, it seems likely that open borders would quickly lead to changes that would leave many Americans less comfortable in their own homeland. Given this, the concern to preserve one’s native culture seems to provide a reasonable justification for restricting immigration.

This line of argument invites a number of empirical and moral questions. Among the empirical questions, we might ask how confident we can be about the numbers and influence of the potential immigrants. Is the immigrants’ culture really that distinctive? And are we sure that these newcomers will resist assimilation? Also, how can we be sure that the cultural changes will be rapid and detrimental? Skeptics of this line of argument often object that people tend to (1) exaggerate how distinctive—and distinctively valuable—their existing cultures are (it is notoriously difficult to characterize “American” culture, for instance), (2) irrationally fear change, and (3) underestimate how much their culture is changing anyway, in the absence of immigration. Even if all of these descriptive objections can be definitively answered, important moral challenges remain. In particular, even if citizens have an understandable interest in maintaining cultural continuity, it remains an open question as to whether they have a corresponding moral right (and, if so, one might wonder about how weighty this right is). These questions matter, because outsiders may also have competing interests in, and/or rights to, enter the country in question, and thus they may permissibly be excluded only if the rights of insiders to preserve their cultural continuity outweigh any rights of foreigners to enter the political territory.

Finally, even if each of these moral challenges could also be conclusively answered, this approach would not justify excluding all outsiders. At most, it could explain only why countries would be entitled to limit the flow of culturally distinct immigrants. To put this point in terms of the United States, for instance, even if the aim of preserving American culture would justify placing limits on Mexican immigration, it would not seem to justify excluding all Mexicans, let alone all Canadians.

1.2 Sustaining the Economy

Another popular argument against open borders is that the influx of newcomers will hurt the economy. In its most straightforward version, this argument simply assumes that the domestic economy can support only a certain number of workers, but more nuanced renditions allege more specifically that at least some types of foreigners should be excluded because, given the cultural differences between insiders and these particular outsiders, the inclusion of the latter would not be conducive to economic growth (perhaps because these outsiders lack the requisite work ethic, for instance).

The most common response to this argument is simply to contest that allowing immigrants will have negative economic consequences. It seems clear that some in the domestic economy may be harmed (typically the less skilled workers disproportionately bear the brunt of the costs, since they must now compete with immigrants whose presence drives down wages), but the economy as a whole often benefits as (1) firms are able to hire cheaper labor (and pass along correspondingly lower prices to consumers), and (2) there is an increased demand for various goods and services. More generally, even if a given domestic economy might suffer if it did not restrict immigration, economists tend to agree that the global economy as a whole would profit from fewer restrictions on who can work where. (From an purely economic perspective, the inefficiencies of barring Africans from competing for work in European countries are costly, just as those which resulted from prohibiting women from working in a ‘man’s’ job were.) This recognition that there will inevitably be net winners and losers whenever a market restriction is lifted points toward the important moral question as to whether anyone has a moral right to the economic benefits of the status quo. For example, let us suppose that less skilled American laborers would be harmed, whereas American firms and consumers along with Mexican immigrants would benefit if the current restriction on Mexican immigration were lifted. If so, then immigration would be impermissible in this case only if the potentially displaced American workers have a right not to face the increased competition for their jobs (Macedo 2007).

We cannot presume that these domestic workers necessarily lack such a right, but neither should we assume that they have it. What is more, even if these workers have a right not to be harmed, it does not follow that opening the economy to foreign workers must be impermissible, at least if there were some way the workers could be adequately compensated for the costs that they disproportionately bear. (Think, for instance, of how the US government routinely provides special unemployment and educational benefits to displaced workers, like those in the textile industry, who lose their jobs as a consequence of new legislation liberalizing trade with foreign countries.) To be successful, then, the economic argument must be much more sophisticated than it might initially appear; in addition to establishing that at least some people will incur economic losses, proponents of this approach must demonstrate that these victims have a moral right to be spared these costs, a right for which they cannot be adequately compensated in other ways.

1.3 Distributing State Benefits

A related but distinct argument for closed borders focuses on the distribution of state benefits like welfare payments and health insurance. The basic idea here is that countries like Sweden and Canada, for instance, must limit immigration in order to sustain anything like their current provision of state benefits. If an affluent welfare state placed no restrictions on who could enter, then masses of poor people from around the world would flock to this country in order to take advantage of its provision of health and welfare benefits. Indeed, presumably so many would immigrate that there would be no way for this state to continue distributing these benefits at anything like their current rate. Thus, given the existing levels of global poverty, it appears as though you can have open borders or welfare states, but you cannot have both.

It seems hard to deny that rich welfare states like the Scandinavian countries would be inundated with migrants if they lifted all restrictions on immigration, but not everyone agrees that this fact necessarily justifies keeping people out. A libertarian, for instance, would likely regard this as just one more reason to abandon the welfare state. That is, faced with the choice between either respecting everyone’s right to freedom of movement or designing states that can effectively guarantee ample levels of health coverage and welfare transfers to their citizens, the libertarian would favor the former. It is important to recognize, though, that these are not the only two options; the best answer may lie in some middle ground between these two stark alternatives. In particular, perhaps existing welfare states could open their borders to everyone and then provide no, or at least delayed, welfare benefits to newcomers. Imagine, for instance, if Sweden stipulated that immigrants would have their income and wealth taxed from the moment they entered the country, but they would not become vested until they had contributed to the state coffers for something like five years. If immigrants were forced to contribute during a waiting period, such an arrangement would presumably strengthen rather than jeopardize the host state’s capacity to provide state benefits. Thus, while some would no doubt object to newcomers facing a period in which they were net losers, this proposal at least shows that welfare states need not be incompatible with open borders.

Finally, even if all attempts to square open borders with wealthy welfare states are problematic, this argument does not support the right of all countries to design and enforce their own immigration policies. More modestly, it would show only that wealthy welfare states may do so as long as the world is characterized by profound international inequality.

1.4 Political Functioning

One of the most sophisticated arguments on behalf of a state’s right to close its borders is the liberal nationalist approach, which suggests that liberal welfare states must exclude outsiders in order to function properly. This account emphasizes that states of this kind are able to operate as they do only because their citizens are willing to make the enormous political sacrifices necessary to sustain a vibrant democracy and equitable welfare state. What is more, these citizens are inclined to freely sacrifice in these ways only because they identify with one another. Were it not for this fellow feeling among compatriots, far fewer would be motivated to invest their personal energy in the democratic process or to give up a portion of their wealth in order to assist less fortunate fellow citizens. And finally, this identification among compatriots depends upon the existence of a shared culture (Miller 2014).

This liberal nationalist account invites all the usual questions: Do liberal democracies really depend upon sufficient trust and fellow-feeling among their compatriots, and, if so, is a common culture genuinely necessary to secure this trust and mutual concern? Just how homogenous must such a culture be? Liberal democracies like the United States and Canada seem to operate just fine despite a great deal of cultural diversity, for instance. In light of this, why worry that outsiders pose a substantial threat? Is it plausible to think that immigrants will not assimilate to the requisite degree once they have settled in their new state? And even if this account can in some cases justify excluding culturally distinct foreigners, it would appear to provide no grounds for limiting outsiders who share the requisite cultural attributes. Assuming that the answers to these empirical questions ultimately vindicate the liberal nationalist account, tricky moral questions remain. For instance, do the inhabitants of well-oiled liberal democracies have not only an interest, but a moral right to the exclusive protection afforded by their enviable political regimes? Finally, even if each of these questions can be satisfactorily answered, this account applies solely to democratic welfare states, and thus other types of states could not invoke this line of reasoning in defense of excluding outsiders.

1.5 Establishing Security

Since 9/11, an increasingly popular justification for limiting immigration is the need to secure the safety of one’s citizens. After all, given the presence of international terrorists, one can hardly question the threat posed by at least some foreigners.

No one can deny the moral importance of protecting innocent civilians from terrorist attack, but critics have questioned whether restricting immigration is in fact likely to provide the desired security. Chandran Kukathas (2014), for instance, raises two important concerns. First, he notes that, while laws to limit immigration may well decrease legal immigration, they will not realistically be able to eliminate all illegal immigrants. And this point is relevant, of course, because foreign terrorists who feel so passionately about their causes so as to be willing to carry out terrorist missions are not likely to be dissuaded from doing so by the illegality of entering the country whose citizens they seek to attack. Second, even if a state could somehow eliminate all legal and illegal immigration, this would not be enough because foreigners routinely enter countries, not as immigrants, but for shorter periods as tourists, guest workers, visiting students, or for short business trips. Thus, even if a country somehow managed to preclude all immigration, it could not reasonably hope to exclude all foreign terrorists unless it also restricted the flow of temporary visitors.

1.6 Political Self-Determination

Another account of a country’s right to close its borders alleges that this right is merely one component of a state’s more general right to political self-determination (Walzer 1983; Pevnick 2011). Specifically, some contend that a legitimate state’s right to freedom of association entitles it to choose whether or not to admit any given immigrants (Wellman 2008). This type of argument involves three basic premises (1) legitimate states have a right to political self-determination, (2) freedom of association is an essential component of self-determination, and (3) freedom of association entitles one to refuse to associate with others. Thus, just as we would consider it an egregious violation of an individual’s personal self-determination if she had no choice but to marry the suitor of her father’s choice, for instance, we should recognize that no political community is fully self-determining unless it has discretion over which potential immigrants to invite into its political community. According to this line of argument, then, there is nothing mysterious or complicated about a country’s right to screen applicants for admission: it is merely a standard component of a state’s more general right to self-determination.

There are a number of ways in which one might contest this line of argument (Fine 2010; Wellman and Cole 2011). Most obviously, one might question whether corporate political entities are even eligible for moral rights. Value-individualists, for instance, contend that only individual persons ultimately matter morally, and thus, while political states may be extremely valuable instruments, they are merely instruments and, as such, are not the type of entities to which we can sensibly ascribe moral rights. Secondly, even if countries can somehow qualify for moral rights, it seems far-fetched to liken a country’s freedom of association with respect to immigrants to an individual’s right to refuse a marriage proposal, since presumably marital freedom of association is incalculably more important to an individual than her right to exclude potential compatriots. What is more, it is not clear that the analogy between personal and political freedom of association is even apt, because states that deny immigrants do not merely refuse to politically associate with those who seek to migrate, they also forcibly exclude them from the state’s territory. Finally, even if all of these concerns could somehow be addressed, notice both that this argument purports to establish only that legitimate states have a presumptive right to exclude outsiders. Both of these qualifications are important. The condition that only legitimate states are morally entitled to be self-determining is significant because, given the plausible assumption that many existing states are illegitimate, this argument would not justify the immigration policies of many current states. And the fact that this argument would at best ground only a presumptive right to exclude outsiders is noteworthy, because it leaves open the possibility that this right could be over-ridden by the weightier rights various foreigners may have to be admitted. If a refugee needs to gain entrance in order to escape persecution or a child needs to be admitted in order to reunite with her mother, for instance, then defenders of political self-determination cannot antecedently assume that the legitimate state’s right to freedom of association necessarily trumps these individuals’ claims.

1.7 Democracy

Democratic governance provides another potential link between self-determination and controls on immigration. Given that democracy’s principal virtue is thought to be its connection to self-determination, democrats often favor bounded groups which enjoy dominion over their own affairs. As Frederick Whelan puts it, “democracy requires that people be divided into peoples (each people hopefully enjoying its own democratic institutions), with each unit distinguishing between its own citizens—understood in a political sense as those eligible to exercise democratic political rights here—and others, who are regarded as aliens here, although (hopefully) citizens somewhere else.” (Whelan 1988: 28) The basic idea here is that, in order for democracies to function, there must be rule by the same people upon whom the rule is imposed. But this is possible only if the same group of individuals who first vote are subsequently bound by the outcome. If membership constantly fluctuated, however, then self-determination would not occur, because the “self” that votes would not match the “self” which is then bound by the results.

In response, theorists like Phillip Cole (2000) have suggested at least two grounds on which we might question whether democracy requires closed borders. First, even if Whelan is right that democracy cannot function properly unless we sort people into territorially defined groups (What is wrong with a democratic world state, for instance?), why does it follow that the constituents within any given set of territorial boundaries must have control over admissions? Citing local and regional democratic units within larger federal structures as counterexamples, Coles suggests that “[i]t seems clear that democratic rights can be confined to a region, with people entering and leaving that region freely and exercising the local democratic rights during their residency.” (Cole 2000: 184) Second, Cole suggests that one of the chief reasons to insist upon democracy in the first place is presumably the belief that coercive political institutions could not permissibly be imposed unless those coerced are given an equal say in how the political arrangements are ordered. But if so, this makes extending suffrage to only those already within the territorial boundaries objectionable, because, as Cole reminds us, “there are two groups subjected to the laws of the state: its own members, and those non-members who are applying for inclusion.” (Cole 2000: 186) Thus, because exclusive immigration laws are coercively imposed upon foreigners who seek to enter, democratic principles suggest that these outsiders should also have a say in immigration laws. So if Cole is right, the democratic case for closed borders is doubly problematic. Not only is it false that open borders is inconsistent with a functioning democracy, democratic principles may even prohibit a state’s coercively excluding disenfranchised foreigners from entering its territory.

1.8 Jurisdiction

The jurisdictional theory of immigration emphasizes that, while political states are morally required to respect everyone’s human rights, they are obligated to protect the rights of only those within their territory. Given this, whenever someone moves to a new state, the citizens of the receiving country become responsible for this newcomer in a way that they were not before her arrival. It would thus seem weird to suppose that everyone should be free to move to whatever country they like, because this would entitle each of us to unilaterally impose moral responsibilities upon others. If we value individual liberty, then we should begin with at least a presumption against others being at liberty to unilaterally foist these responsibilities on us (Blake 2013). Our immunity against unwelcome obligations may not be absolute, but it would presumably require a compelling competing consideration to outweigh it. If someone could not enjoy sufficient protection of her human rights unless she moved to Canada, for instance, then this vulnerable person may be entitled to immigrate without permission even though this move will saddle Canadian citizens with moral duties to which they did not consent. But if someone whose rights are adequately respected elsewhere sought to move to Canada merely because she thinks she would be happier there, Canadians would be well within their rights to forcibly exclude her if they would prefer not to be responsible for protecting her human rights.

Those who think that there is a natural duty to support just institutions may question the pivotal premise in this approach: that we should be skeptical of political obligations to which we have not consented. After all, if each of us was really immune from political duties to which we did not consent, then many of us would not have duties to protect the human rights of our compatriots. But if we must do our part of the collective chore of protecting the human rights of our fellow citizens despite the fact that we never agreed to do so, why think that there is anything distinctively problematic about our similarly having such duties to newcomers who have recently immigrated? Indeed, given that we are already morally encumbered with duties to protect the human rights of those within our state’s territorial boundaries, an influx of newcomers does not create any new types of duties, at most it creates additional tokens which would make fulfilling these responsibilities more costly (Kates and Pevnick 2014).

In response, an advocate of the jurisdictional approach might counter that prospective immigrants have no right to unilaterally act in ways that make our natural duties more demanding. But retreating to this position raises new questions. Given that immigrants also contribute to the state’s performance of its political functions, it is not obvious why an influx of prospective immigrants would necessarily make it more difficult for those already present to fulfill their political obligations. (Indeed, given economies of scale, the newcomers may often lighten the load of the native population.) And even if there are instances in which the arrival of immigrants would create net costs for a state’s existing population, this fact would generate a right to forcibly exclude outsiders only if the increased demands upon those already present should be given moral precedence over the costs imposed upon prospective immigrants who are denied entry. Because prospective immigrants often have pressing interests in entering a country (even if their human rights are satisfactorily protected), however, there may be many cases in which the interests of those who want to enter would prevail over a native population’s desire to avoid more costly political responsibilities (Kates and Pevnick 2014).

1.9 Realism

Though less popular than it once was, international relations was once dominated by realists who argued that political states are not constrained by morality in their dealings with foreign states and individuals. The basic idea motivating this approach was most often the Hobbesian presumption that morality consists solely of contracts which are binding only in the presence of a sovereign who could enforce them. And since there is no world sovereign capable of punishing states, the latter cannot be morally bound by any putative contracts which purport to apply to them. As a consequence, realists have traditionally supposed that states will and should orient their dealings with foreigners in whatever fashion maximally suits their national interests. And if this is correct, there can be no duties of any kind owed to foreign states or individuals, and thus no duty to open one’s borders to foreigners.

Many are reluctant today to endorse realism, in part because they reject the Hobbesian approach to morality, but also because they believe that states can be held accountable even in the absence of a single, global sovereign. Given this, theorists typically feel no need to defeat the realist case for closed borders. It is worth noting, however, that the permissibility of closed borders does not automatically follow from realism, because (more) open borders may be in a country’s national interest. It is not just that any given country might stand to benefit in various ways from immigration, it may also be that a country’s own citizens have rights which require the state’s borders to be porous. If individuals have property rights which entitle them to invite foreigners onto their land or rights to freedom of association which entitle them to associate domestically with foreigners, for instance, then a country may well be duty-bound to allow open immigration even if it owes no moral duties to outsiders.

1.10 Indirect Cosmopolitanism

Because cosmopolitans value all people equally, they often argue in favor of (more) open borders. Given that the life of a Western European is no more valuable than that of a sub-Saharan African, for instance, how can we justify a geo-political arrangement in which people are effectively forced to remain in their country of birth when sorting humans according to this (morally arbitrary) criterion has such a profound effect upon their chances of living a minimally decent life? After all, it is a matter of brute luck where one is born, so neither the Europeans nor the Africans can plausibly be said to deserve their relatively good/bad life prospects.

It is important to recognize, however, that embracing cosmopolitanism does not necessarily require one to endorse open borders, because one might develop an ‘indirect cosmopolitan’ defense for protecting a state’s right to exclude outsiders. Such an account might take any number of forms, but one particularly interesting version is to suggest that wealthy liberal democratic states must be allowed to exclude foreigners (for the time being, at least) so as to be better able (and more willing) to build the international institutions which are most likely to put the world’s poor in a better position to live minimally decent lives (Christiano, 2008).

This approach begins with the plausible premise that people like those currently enduring absolute poverty in sub-Saharan Africa will likely continue to be vulnerable to horrifically corrupt and incompetent domestic governance until the larger geo-political context is dramatically improved via the construction of international institutions, like the International Criminal Court. And if these international institutions are going to be created/reformed/made more effective in the foreseeable future, it will be predominantly by wealthy, liberal democracies. These states will be able and willing to undertake this task, however, only if their domestic economies, cultures and political environments are relatively safe and secure, and this requires that they be free from worries about massive unwanted immigration. Thus, for the indefinite future we should grant states the right to design and enforce their own immigration policies, not because the constituents of wealthy liberal democratic countries are necessarily morally entitled to their current high levels of wealth and security, but because denying states such a right will almost surely undermine the prospects that these regimes will be able and willing to construct the larger, international mechanisms which, in turn, will provide the best long term chances of substantially improving the lot of the world’s poorest denizens.

An argument as elaborate as this one obviously depends upon a number of controversial premises about the best, most realistic way to help the world’s poor and the likely future conduct of wealthy liberal democracies. It is also important to recognize that, even if each of these claims is accurate, this argument does not establish the type of conclusion that many defenders of closed borders might want. This is for two reasons. First, rather than establish a state’s moral right to exclude outsiders, it would seem to show at most that we should treat states as if they had this moral right by, for instance, respecting their international legal right to design and enforce their own immigration policies. Second, this argument’s conclusion would not hold indefinitely; rather, the argument would apply only until the desired international institutions were constructed. Once the geo-political environment was suitably repaired, this particular argument would no longer provide any reasons to resist open borders. Of course, most cosmopolitans will regret neither of these features of this argument, but many who seek to defend a state’s right to exclude outsiders may well be considerably less sanguine about such limitations.

2. Arguments for Open Borders

2.1 Cosmopolitan Egalitarianism

The cosmopolitan egalitarian case for open borders combines the core moral insight that all human beings, whether they are compatriots or foreigners, are equally deserving of moral consideration with the central empirical observation that one’s country of birth often has a profound impact upon one’s life prospects. The staggering levels of international inequality would not be so objectionable if the typical Swede had done something to deserve a better life than the typical Chadian, for instance, but the truth, of course, is that Swedes were merely lucky to have been born in Sweden rather than Chad. And given this, what justification could the Swedes have for putting guns at their borders to deter Chadians from trying to move north and take advantage of the preferable social, political and economic environment? In the eyes of cosmopolitan egalitarians, they have none. As Joseph Carens puts it, “Citizenship in Western liberal democracies is the modern equivalent to feudal privilege—an inherited status that greatly enhances one’s life chances. Like feudal birthrights privileges, restrictive citizenship is hard to justify when one thinks about it closely.” (Carens 1987: 252) In other words, egalitarians regard open borders as the requisite response to the enormous economic inequalities which currently exist between countries.

This case for open borders presumes a specific, highly contentious version of cosmopolitan egalitarianism. Thus, if one were not an egalitarian (or, more specifically, if one were not a so-called “luck” egalitarian who believes that justice requires that we correct for all inequalities which stem merely from luck), or if one denied that egalitarian (or at least luck egalitarian) considerations extend beyond one’s political borders, then one would be unmoved by this argument. More importantly, even if one accepts all of the cosmopolitan egalitarian’s moral premises, it is not clear that the desired conclusion follows. This is because wealthy states seem to have other ways to fulfill their duties of distributive justice. Even if Sweden has demanding duties of distributive justice to Chad, for instance, why may Sweden not keep its borders closed as long as it transfers the requisite amount to Chad? That is certainly how we handle duties of distributive justice in the domestic realm. Consider Jeff Bezos, for instance. While there are various accounts of Bezos’s duties to share his wealth with those who are less fortunate, no one supposes that he must remarry, adopt or otherwise open his family to a poor person. Rather, whatever he must transfer to others, everyone agrees that he can exclude others from his home life as long as he fulfills his duties of distributive justice. And if duties of distributive justice do not undermine an individual’s right to freedom of association in the domestic realm, why need they do so for a state in the international arena? If Jeff Bezos need not open his home to those who are less fortunate, then why must Sweden welcome poor foreigners into their political community?

2.2 Libertarianism

When one thinks of the individual rights which conflict with a state’s control over immigration, an outsider’s right to freedom of movement is likely to come to mind. As Joseph Carens reminds us, though, the rights of insiders are also limited when the political community as a whole has dominion over immigration. As he explains, “Suppose a farmer from the United States wanted to hire workers from Mexico. The government would have no right to prohibit him from doing this. To prevent the Mexicans from coming would violate the rights of both the American farmer and the Mexican workers to engage in voluntary transactions.” (Carens 1987: 253) Thus, a state’s exclusive immigration policy is doubly disrespectful of individual rights, because it interferes with both an outsider’s freedom of movement and an insider’s property right to unilaterally invite foreigners onto her land.

The libertarian is right to suggest that a state’s dominion over immigration is inconsistent with individuals having unlimited rights in this domain, but it is not clear why we should presume that the individual’s right must always prevail. Certainly the state’s right would be over-ridden if individual rights were always perfectly general and absolute, but this construal of moral rights is implausible. A person’s right to freedom of movement does not give her the right to enter my house without my permission, for instance, so why must we assume that it gives her a right to enter my country’s territory without first getting the permission of the political community as a whole? One could make a similar point about a property owner’s rights over her land. A property owner would have the right to unilaterally invite foreigners onto her land if property rights were general and absolute, but most eschew this account of property. Few would say that each property owner has a right to unilaterally enforce the criminal law on her own land, for instance, and if property owners must defer to the state as a whole when it comes to the enforcement of criminal law, why must it be any different for the immigration of foreigners?

2.3 Democracy

As was explained above, Phillip Cole has offered reasons to question the view that democratic governance depends upon there being closed borders. More recently, though, Arash Abizadeh (2008) has extended this reasoning to argue that democratic principles are actually incompatible with a state’s right to unilaterally exclude outsiders. As he puts it, “anyone who accepts a genuinely democratic theory of political legitimation domestically is thereby committed to rejecting the unilateral domestic right to control and close the state’s boundaries…” (Abizadeh 2008: 38) His argument involves two core premises, one moral and the second descriptive. The moral premise is his construal of the democratic justification thesis, which stipulates that a state’s coercive presence is illegitimate unless it is democratically justified to everyone coerced. The second premise is merely the descriptive observation that a state coerces foreigners when it forcibly prevents unwelcome immigrants from entering the state’s territory. In light of these two points, Abizadeh concludes that a state may not unilaterally exclude outsiders; it can permissibly adopt an exclusive immigration policy only if it democratically justifies this practice to outsiders. In other words, it would be impermissible for a state to forcibly restrict outsiders without first giving these outsiders a vote in the referendum which decided whether or not to adopt this restrictive immigration policy.

Corresponding to the two central premises, there are two ways to contest this line of reasoning. First and most obviously, one might follow David Miller’s lead and deny that forcibly restricting immigration actually coerces outsiders in the morally relevant sense (Miller 2010). Even if one concedes that potential immigrants are coerced, though, one might doubt that coercion cannot be permissible in the absence of democratic justification. To appreciate the appeal of this second strategy, imagine that two criminals want to enter my house and help themselves to my copy of Michael Walzer’s Spheres of Justice. It seems crazy to think that I may not take proportionate steps to coercively repel them without first putting my planned resistance up to a vote among the three of us. And if I do not need to democratically justify my coercively protecting my right to keep strangers out of my house, why think that a state must democratically justify its attempts to keep uninvited foreigners out of its political community? Of course, a defender of this type of democratic case for open borders might counter that, unlike a legitimate owner of private property, the constituents of a state have no dominion over the state’s territory, but this response would be available only if it could be shown that a state’s constituents lack the relevant moral standing over the political territory in question.

2.4 Utilitarianism

Finally, the utilitarian case for open borders stresses that restricting freedom of movement leads to obvious inefficiencies and is therefore impermissible. There are any number of ways in which it is suboptimal to forcibly restrain people within territorial boundaries, but one of the most obvious worries is that it is economically inefficient. Restricting Mexicans from fully developing and capitalizing upon their talents in the United States economy, for instance, makes no more sense than relegating men and women into separate spheres. Just as a system in which only men may be doctors and only women may work as nurses unjustifiably deprives the world of countless excellent female doctors and male nurses, a geo-political system in which countries are entitled to exclude outsiders regrettably fails to capitalize upon the talents and work ethic of foreigners who are denied access to the world’s most robust labor markets. Given this, it seems reasonable to believe that people would on average be much better off if there were no restrictions on immigration.

This argument can be contested on either empirical or moral grounds. For instance, without questioning whether restricting immigration is in some ways inefficient, one might still defend the merits of dividing the globe into separate states, each of which has sovereign control over its territory. This view seems plausible if the advantages to such a state system outweigh the inefficiencies in question. For instance, David Miller (2005) argues that restrictions on immigration improve our ability effectively to address population control. As Miller recognizes, we will make progress in this regard only if leaders in countries like India and China are able and willing to enact the relatively unpopular laws necessary to limit population growth. And these laws would be met with much more resistance than they already are if there were no restrictions on migration, because the costs of population growth would not be wholly internalized. If a country’s exploding population were free to move anywhere in the world, for instance, then its citizens would not bear the full costs of population growth and would therefore be that much more resistant to laws designed to limit the number of children born. If Miller is right, the advantages of restricting immigration may more than compensate for the costs involved.

For the sake of argument, though, let us suppose that the gains of open borders would be greater than the costs. Even so, it is not clear that the utilitarian case for open borders is decisive, since, as a moral matter, it may be that states have the right to organize their affairs in a suboptimal fashion. Most believe that parents would retain the right to raise their natural children in exclusive, nuclear families even if Plato were right that it would be preferable if a community’s children were raised together by the community as a whole. And if we think, contra utilitarianism, that individuals are entitled to arrange their lives in suboptimal ways in the domestic sphere, why presume that political states lack the analogous right to organize themselves as they see fit in the geo-political context? Even if it were true that Norway and the European Union would be better off if the former joined this regional body as a full member, for instance, it seems to many that Norway should have the right to refrain from joining this Union. And if Norway has the right to (inefficiently) refuse to associate fully with the European Union, it might also be entitled to (inefficiently) refuse to associate with various individuals who would like to join Norway’s political community.

3. Applied Questions in Immigration

As the preceding discussion shows, there are a variety of promising arguments in favor of a state’s right to control immigration and many strong considerations which suggest that countries are obligated to maintain open borders. While some arguments are more popular than others, critical questions can be raised about each of them. Rather than try to decisively defend either side here, let us conclude by briefly surveying some of the more engaging applied issues related to the morality of immigration. These include the definition and moral claims of refugees, the conditions under which one may hire guest workers, the permissibility of recruiting skilled professionals from poor countries where individuals with these talents are already in short supply, the rights of irregular migrants, and what kinds of selection criteria a country may use to distinguish among applicants for immigration

3.1 Refugees

The 1951 Convention Relating to the Status of Refugees defines a refugee as someone who “owing to a well-founded fear of being persecuted for reasons of race, religion, nationality, membership of a particular social group, or political opinion, is outside the country of his nationality, and is unable to or, owing to such fear, is unwilling to avail himself of the protection of that country.” (Article 1A[2]) Critics like Andrew Shacknove (1985) have questioned this definition on at least three grounds. First, why focus exclusively on victims of group-based persecution? And even if we do think in terms of groups, why restrict ourselves to these particular groups? What if someone is persecuted qua woman or qua homosexual, for instance? Second, given the variety of threats to living a minimally decent human life, why insist that only those vulnerable to persecution can qualify as refugees? What about so-called “economic refugees” or people fleeing a civil war, for instance? Third, why stipulate that someone who is not “outside the country of his nationality” cannot be a refugee? What if an individual is being detained at the border or simply lacks the means to migrate without assistance, for example?

Shacknove speculates that this narrow understanding of refugees is likely the consequence of real-world political pressures from leaders who are wary of the international legal obligations that would follow from a more expansive definition. As he puts it, “…states reason in reverse from their fear that they will be forced to shoulder the burden of assisting refugees unilaterally to a narrow conception of refugeehood which limits the number of claimants.” (Shacknove 1985: 277) Whether one accepts the international legal definition or lobbies on behalf of a more expansive conception, however, there is broad-based support for the view that refugees constitute a special category of potential immigrants who possess particularly urgent claims to admittance. Thus, while theorists may vehemently disagree as to whether a country has a right to design and enforce its own immigration policies, even those who affirm a state’s general right to exclude foreigners typically make an exception in the case of refugees. It is one thing for the United States to refuse to admit a Russian ballerina who would like to study and perform in New York, for instance, but is another thing altogether for it to turn away a political dissident who rightly fears persecution by the oppressive regime in her home state. In the latter case, the dire nature of the refugee’s circumstances are thought to give her a pressing claim which trumps whatever presumptive right a state generally has to reject hopeful immigrants. More recently, however, some have come to question this line of thinking. Few suggest that a state has no duties to imperiled foreigners, but theorists increasingly question whether a state’s duty to assist refugees must come in the form of admitting them. Consider the Kurds in Northern Iraq, for instance. Given the abuses they suffered under Saddam Hussein’s rule, many would argue they should have qualified as refugees. One way to offer assistance would have been to provide them refuge in various foreign countries. But as history shows, this was not the only way to help. Another option was to protect the Kurds where they lived, by securing a safe-haven fortified by a no-fly zone in Northern Iraq. (A third possible option might be for rich countries to pay poorer countries to admit the refugees.) Of course, for a variety of reasons, countries might prefer not to intervene in the affairs of a foreign state, but the important point is the more general lesson that, even if we take for granted that stable, wealthy countries can have stringent duties to refugees, it does not follow that these duties must be paid in the currency of open borders.

3.2 Guest Workers

The classic analysis of guest workers is Michael Walzer’s discussion of Western European countries’ former practice of hiring laborers from nearby states such as Turkey. This practice was a sensible solution for all, since it enabled a country like West Germany to hire foreign workers to do various relatively onerous jobs for considerably less than it would have had to pay its domestic labor force, and the imported laborers also profited, as they were able to earn considerably more than they could have in their own countries. Walzer objects to this practice, however, because these workers were not given equal political status in their host countries. Even when Turkish workers lived in West Germany with their families for many years, for instance, they would have no chance of acquiring German citizenship. For understandable reasons, Walzer is deeply troubled by the creation of this political underclass. As he puts it, “These guests experience the state as a pervasive and frightening power that shapes their lives and regulates their every move—and never asks for their opinion. Departure is only a formal option; deportation, a continuous practical threat. As a group, they constitute a disenfranchised class. They are typically exploited or oppressed as a class as well, and they are exploited or oppressed at least in part because they are disenfranchised, incapable of organizing effectively for self-defense.” (Walzer 1983: 59) As a consequence, Walzer insists that, while countries are perfectly within their rights to either hire or exclude foreign workers, they are not free to bring in outsiders without according them all the standard rights and privileges of equal citizenship. Thus, if a country is willing to embrace foreign workers as political equals, it may invite in as many as it would like. If a political community is unwilling to treat guest workers as equals, on the other hand, then it may not hire them and must pay the higher wages demanded by the domestic labor market.

Political theorists typically take for granted that states must treat all of their constituents as free and equal, so it is no wonder that so many are attracted to Walzer’s analysis of guest workers. (And it should be noted that countries like Germany have since dramatically revised their guest worker policies, so that they are now much more in accord with Walzer’s recommendations.) Still, at least two big questions present themselves. First, even if we assume that Walzer is correct that long-term visitors like those employed in Western European countries must eventually be given the opportunity to become citizens, it does not follow that all guest workers must be treated as equal citizens. What if Walzer were to spend a year as a Visiting Professor at the Sorbonne, for example? Would this arrangement be morally impermissible if the offer did not give Walzer full voting rights in France for that year? Presumably not. If so, then there are interesting and difficult questions about how long and under what conditions one can work in a foreign country without the standard rights and privileges of equal citizenship before one becomes objectionably treated as a political subordinate.

Second and more important, even if we presume that political states must generally treat their constituents as free and equal citizens, it is controversial whether this requirement should apply in the case of guest workers. Because most accept the principle of volenti non fit injuria, it is typically presumed that a relationship among unequals need not be unjust, especially if both parties freely consent to the relationship. There need not be anything unjust about an arrangement in which an employee has a much less desirable set of powers, privileges and responsibilities than her employer, for instance, as long as the employee freely and with full information accepted these terms of employment. Of course, political states are still required to treat their constituents as free and equal citizens precisely because the volenti principle is generally irrelevant to relations among compatriots. In other words, states coerce all those within their territorial boundaries whether or not these constituents have consented to this imposition; and, given this, they cannot invoke volenti and thus have no choice but to treat everyone coerced as equals. Importantly, though, guest workers are an exception to this general rule precisely because they do give their consent to the relationship. Unlike most of the state’s constituents, guest workers are not coerced by the adoptive state unless they decide that they would like to accept the terms of employment and move to the new country. As a consequence, it is not clear that the volenti principle should not apply in the case of guest workers.

3.3 Recruiting Immigrants

The vast bulk of the discussion concerning the morality of immigration concerns the exclusion of outsiders, but some also worry about the way in which wealthy countries currently admit skilled workers from poorer states, especially when the specialists are actively recruited away from their native lands. This practice would not garner the attention of moral theorists if it were restricted to countries like the United States targeting the most talented long-distance runners from Kenya, for instance, but it is thought to rise to the level of injustice when the wealthiest countries actively recruit professionals from developing countries where people with their skill sets are already in terribly short supply. Perhaps the most noteworthy and worrisome instance of this is the manner in which wealthy, western states actively recruit medical professionals away from Africa. As Gillian Brock comments, “Arguably, it is not the total number of health care professionals that exist in the world today that is a problem, but rather their distribution. Consider how, for instance, while only 21 per cent of the world’s population resides in Europe and North America, it commands 45 per cent of the world’s doctors and 61 of its nurses. Africa, which contains 13 per cent of the world’s population, has only 3 per cent of its doctors and 5 per cent of its nurses. An estimated 1.3 per cent of the world’s health care workers provide services to 13.8 per cent of the world’s population in a region suffering 25 per cent of the world’s disease burden.” (Brock 2009: 200)

Given both the relative shortage of health care professionals in Africa and the fact that many posit a human right to a decent minimum level of health care, the recruitment (if not the mere admission) of doctors and nurses from developing countries would seem to raise human rights issues. An obvious response, then, would be to issue a blanket prohibition on the emigration of health care professionals from countries where they are in desperately short supply. This extreme measure strikes many as problematic, though, for the way in which it curtails the individual liberty of the skilled workers in the poor countries. A more subtle response, then, would be to insist only that the adoptive countries provide adequate compensation to the states from which the talented individuals emigrate. Thus, just as those who worry about deforestation urge that all those who chop down mature trees should be held responsible for planting even more young trees in their place, authors like Brock (2009) suggest that it would not be too much to ask those countries who admit skilled workers from countries where they are already in short supply to provide compensatory resources which will assist these poor countries in their future efforts to train and retain the next generation of such professionals.

3.4 Irregular Migrants

Following Joseph Carens (2013), I call those who have settled in a foreign country without authorization (who some label “undocumented” or “illegal” immigrants) irregular migrants. Irregular migrants pose vexing moral questions even for those who are convinced that states have the right to control immigration, because many believe that over time an irregular migrant can gradually acquire a moral right to stay (and perhaps even to full and equal citizenship), despite the fact that she had no right to migrate without authorization in the first place. Carens articulates this sentiment nicely when he writes:

The moral right of states to apprehend and deport irregular migrants erodes with the passage of time. As irregular migrants become more and more settled, their membership in society grows in moral importance, and the fact that they have settled without authorization becomes correspondingly less relevant. At some point a threshold is crossed, and they acquire a moral claim to have their actual social membership legally recognized. They should acquire a legal right of permanent residence and all the rights that go with that, including eventual access to citizenship. (Carens 2013: 150)

Given the psychological importance of social membership and the fact that (authorized or not) a migrant will typically become deeply socially imbedded in her new society after a prolonged period, the appeal of this judgment is easy to appreciate. Critics might counter, however, that this account wrongly presumes that psychological attachment is sufficient to generate moral entitlement. To see why one might doubt this, imagine that I grow incredibly attached to the Mona Lisa during the ten years that it takes for the authorities to discover that I am the one who stole it from the Louvre. No matter how attached I become to the painting (and regardless of how psychologically difficult it will be for me to find happiness in my new life without it), most would presumably deny that I have therefore acquired a right to retain the stolen painting. And given that we are so resistant to suppose that the right of authorities to reclaim the Mona Lisa and return it to the Louvre erodes with the passage of time, perhaps we should similarly be suspicious of the notion that the “moral right of states to apprehend and deport irregular migrants erodes with the passage of time” (as in the quote from Carens above).

One exception to this line of thought may be the children of irregular migrants who were brought to the new country at a very young age. After all, because they had no choice in their migration, they have no culpability which needs to erode over time. Critics have room to resist even this case, however, because the crucial issue is entitlement, not culpability. Suppose that I pass the Mona Lisa on to my son, Jackson (who has no idea that I stole it), and that he becomes incredibly attached to it over the course of several years. Despite the twin facts that (1) Jackson is in no way culpable for possessing the Mona Lisa and (2) he has gradually become very attached to it, he does not seem entitled to keep the painting. And if we think the authorities would violate none of Jackson’s rights if they took the Mona Lisa from him and returned it to the Louvre, then why think that the authorities would violate the rights of an irregular migrant who at a young age had settled without authorization in a foreign country with her parents? Just as Jackson should not be punished for his possession of the painting, the child should clearly not be punished for having entered a foreign country without authorization. But Jackson’s right against being punished is distinct from his right to retain the Mona Lisa, and the child’s right not to be punished for her family’s migration is distinct from her right to remain in the new country. These objections do not show that irregular migrants do not gradually acquire a right to stay, but they do suggest that advocates of this position who also believe in the state’s right to control immigration must do more than merely point to the psychological costs to those who might be deported.

3.5 Selection Criteria

Finally, one of the most complex and controversial issues within the literature on the morality of immigration is what criteria a state may permissibly employ to distinguish among applicants for admission. Countries might use either a lottery or a first-come, first-admitted waitlist, but they might also screen the applicants and give preference to those whose language, culture and/or skill sets make them most likely to assimilate in the host state’s economy and political culture. But what if a country’s immigration policies differentiate among applicants on the basis of race, ethnicity, gender, religion or country of origin? What if a country flatly refused to even consider applications for immigration from Asians or Africans, for instance?

As with so many issues in this area, Walzer’s (1983) treatment of this question is seminal. In this case, though, many have recoiled at his conclusions. To see why, consider his take on “White Australia,” Australia’s erstwhile practice of recruiting immigration from England while explicitly prohibiting immigration from non-European countries. Walzer writes, “Assuming, then, that there actually is superfluous land, the claim of necessity would force a political community like that of White Australia to confront a radical choice. Its members could yield land for the sake of homogeneity, or they could give up homogeneity (agree to the creation of a multiracial society) for the sake of the land. And those would be their only two choices. White Australia could survive only as Little Australia.” (Walzer 1983: 47) Walzer may well be right that Australia had a duty to share its vast land with those who needed it, but it is striking that he had no principled objection aimed specifically at Australia’s racism. If Australia did not have so much territory, then Walzer apparently would not object to their excluding immigrants on the basis of their race or ethnicity.

A number of critics agree that Walzer’s analysis is misguided, but there has been no consensus as to precisely where and why it goes off the tracks. Consider, for instance, the conflicting accounts offered by David Miller, Joseph Carens and Michael Blake. Miller’s take is interesting, because he accepts Walzer’s arguments and conclusion that political communities enjoy a general right to design and enforce their own immigration policies. Unlike Walzer, though, Miller stops short of concluding that states can exclude potential immigrants on whatever grounds they like. As he puts it,

I have tried to hold a balance between the interest that migrants have in entering the country they want to live in, and the interest that political communities have in determining their own character. Although the first of these interests is not strong enough to justify a right of migration, it is still substantial, and so the immigrants who are refused entry are owed an explanation. To be told that they belong to the wrong race, or sex (or have the wrong color) is insulting, given that these features do not connect to anything of real significance to the society they want to join. Even tennis clubs are not entitled to discriminate among applicants on grounds such as these. (Miller 2014: 373–374)

Miller’s analysis will be attractive to many, but some may worry that it is too quick. What would we say about a white woman who refused to even consider marrying someone outside of her race, for instance? We might well condemn her racism as deplorable, and we should not be the least bit surprised if non-whites were sorely offended by her attitudes, but presumably we would stop short of saying that she had a duty to marry a black person. And if a white person is within her rights to refuse to marry anyone who is not white, then why is a predominantly white political community not equally entitled to reject potential immigrants on the basis of their race?

Joseph Carens offers an answer to this question by invoking the standard distinction between public and private spheres. He writes, “There is a deep tension between the right of freedom of association and the right to equal treatment. One way to address this tension is to say that in the private sphere freedom of association prevails and in the public sphere equal treatment does. You can pick your friends on the basis of whatever criteria you wish, but in selecting people for offices you must treat all candidates fairly….So, the fact that private clubs may admit or exclude whomever they choose says nothing about the appropriate admission standards for states. When the state acts it must treat individuals equally.” (Carens 1987: 267–8) This answer is promising, but even if one is generally sympathetic to the public/private distinction, it is not obvious that it applies to admissions into a country in the same way that it applies to decisions regarding those already within this state. This is because, many presume that in order to be legitimate, states must treat all of their constituents as free and equal, and one way to pursue this freedom and equality is to ensure that individuals are not excluded from various spheres of power and prestige on the basis of their membership in historically disadvantaged groups. But because states need not ensure that their constituents are free and equal to all outsiders, it does not have the same reason to protect against foreigners being excluded on the basis of characteristics that would rightly be ruled out if used by public groups within the state.

Finally, Michael Blake (2003) has offered an account which promises to avoid all of these pitfalls. His view is striking because it explains the impermissibility of excluding outsiders on the basis of racist criteria in terms of how it mistreats insiders. If Australia refuses to allow Asians to enter the country, for instance, then this is an affront to all Asian Australians who are thereby treated as second class citizens. As he says, “To identify the purpose of the state with the preservation of a cultural group is inevitably to draw an invidious distinction against those citizens who do not happen to belong to that community. In all cases in which there are national or ethnic minorities—which is to say, the vast majority of actual cases—to restrict immigration for national or ethnic reasons is to make some citizens politically inferior to others…. Seeking to eliminate the presence of a given group from your society by selective immigration is insulting to the members of that group already present.” (Blake 2003: 232–3) Thus, Blake is able to explain what is objectionable about racist selection criteria by invoking the requirement that states treat all of their own constituents as free and equal, since these criteria clearly treat those insiders in the dispreferred group as inferior and subordinate.

Blake’s account has much to offer, but it has at least one major drawback: it appears unable to explain the impermissibility of a racially or culturally homogenous political community excluding potential immigrants on the basis of their race or culture. If Australia had no Asian citizens, for instance, then there would be no insiders who would be wronged by a policy excluding Asian immigrants, and thus Blake’s argument would provide us with no grounds to criticize it.


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