The Correspondence Theory of Truth

First published Fri May 10, 2002; substantive revision Thu May 28, 2015

Narrowly speaking, the correspondence theory of truth is the view that truth is correspondence to, or with, a fact—a view that was advocated by Russell and Moore early in the 20th century. But the label is usually applied much more broadly to any view explicitly embracing the idea that truth consists in a relation to reality, i.e., that truth is a relational property involving a characteristic relation (to be specified) to some portion of reality (to be specified). This basic idea has been expressed in many ways, giving rise to an extended family of theories and, more often, theory sketches. Members of the family employ various concepts for the relevant relation (correspondence, conformity, congruence, agreement, accordance, copying, picturing, signification, representation, reference, satisfaction) and/or various concepts for the relevant portion of reality (facts, states of affairs, conditions, situations, events, objects, sequences of objects, sets, properties, tropes). The resulting multiplicity of versions and reformulations of the theory is due to a blend of substantive and terminological differences.

The correspondence theory of truth is often associated with metaphysical realism. Its traditional competitors, pragmatist, as well as coherentist, verificationist, and other epistemic theories of truth, are often associated with idealism, anti-realism, or relativism. In recent years, these traditional competitors have been virtually replaced (at least in terms of publication space) by deflationary theories of truth and, to a lesser extent, by the identity theory (note that these new competitors are typically not associated with anti-realism). Still more recently, two further approaches have received considerable attention. One is truthmaker theory: it is sometimes viewed as a competitor to, sometimes as a more liberal version of, the correspondence theory. The other is pluralism: it incorporates a correspondence account as one, but only one, ingredient of its overall account of truth.

1. History of the Correspondence Theory

The correspondence theory is often traced back to Aristotle’s well-known definition of truth (Metaphysics 1011b25): “To say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false, while to say of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not, is true”—but virtually identical formulations can be found in Plato (Cratylus 385b2, Sophist 263b). It is noteworthy that this definition does not highlight the basic correspondence intuition. Although it does allude to a relation (saying something of something) to reality (what is), the relation is not made very explicit, and there is no specification of what on the part of reality is responsible for the truth of a saying. As such, the definition offers a muted, relatively minimal version of a correspondence theory. (For this reason it has also been claimed as a precursor of deflationary theories of truth.) Aristotle sounds much more like a genuine correspondence theorist in the Categories (12b11, 14b14), where he talks of underlying things that make statements true and implies that these things (pragmata) are logically structured situations or facts (viz., his sitting and his not sitting are said to underlie the statements “He is sitting” and “He is not sitting”, respectively). Most influential is Aristotle’s claim in De Interpretatione (16a3) that thoughts are “likenesses” (homoiomata) of things. Although he nowhere defines truth in terms of a thought’s likeness to a thing or fact, it is clear that such a definition would fit well into his overall philosophy of mind. (Cf. Crivelli 2004; Szaif 2006.)

1.1 Metaphysical and Semantic Versions

In medieval authors we find a division between “metaphysical” and “semantic” versions of the correspondence theory. The former are indebted to the truth-as-likeness theme suggested by Aristotle’s overall views, the latter are modeled on Aristotle’s more austere definition from Metaphysics 1011b25.

The metaphysical version presented by Thomas Aquinas is the best known: “Veritas est adaequatio rei et intellectus” (Truth is the equation of thing and intellect), which he restates as: “A judgment is said to be true when it conforms to the external reality”. He tends to use “conformitas” and “adaequatio”, but also uses “correspondentia”, giving the latter a more generic sense (De Veritate, Q.1, A.1-3; cf. Summa Theologiae, Q.16). Aquinas credits the Neoplatonist Isaac Israeli with this definition, but there is no such definition in Isaac. Correspondence formulations can be traced back to the Academic skeptic Carneades, 2nd century B.C., whom Sextus Empiricus (Adversos Mathematicos, vii, 168) reports as having taught that a presentation “is true when it is in accord (symphonos) with the object presented, and false when it is in discord with it”. Similar accounts can be found in various early commentators on Plato and Aristotle (cf. Künne 2003, chap. 3.1), including some Neoplatonists: Proklos (In Tim., II 287, 1) speaks of truth as the agreement or adjustment (epharmoge) between knower and the known. Philoponus (In Cat., 81, 25-34) emphasizes that truth is neither in the things or states of affairs (pragmata) themselves, nor in the statement itself, but lies in the agreement between the two. He gives the simile of the fitting shoe, the fit consisting in a relation between shoe and foot, not to be found in either one by itself. Note that his emphasis on the relation as opposed to its relata is laudable but potentially misleading, because x’s truth (its being true) is not to be identified with a relation, R, between x and y, but with a general relational property of x, taking the form (∃y)(xRy & Fy). Further early correspondence formulations can be found in Avicenna (Metaphysica, 1.8-9) and Averroes (Tahafut, 103, 302). They were introduced to the scholastics by William of Auxerre, who may have been the intended recipient of Aquinas’ mistaken attribution (cf. Boehner 1958; Wolenski 1994).

Aquinas’ balanced formula “equation of thing and intellect” is intended to leave room for the idea that “true” can be applied not only to thoughts and judgments but also to things or persons (e.g. a true friend). Aquinas explains that a thought is said to be true because it conforms to reality, whereas a thing or person is said to be true because it conforms to a thought (a friend is true insofar as, and because, she conforms to our, or God’s, conception of what a friend ought to be). Medieval theologians regarded both, judgment-truth as well as thing/person-truth, as somehow flowing from, or grounded in, the deepest truth which, according to the Bible, is God: “I am the way and the truth and the life” (John 14, 6). Their attempts to integrate this Biblical passage with more ordinary thinking involving truth gave rise to deep metaphysico-theological reflections. The notion of thing/person-truth, which thus played a very important role in medieval thinking, is disregarded by modern and contemporary analytic philosophers but survives to some extent in existentialist and continental philosophy.

Medieval authors who prefer a semantic version of the correspondence theory often use a peculiarly truncated formula to render Aristotle’s definition: A (mental) sentence is true if and only if, as it signifies, so it is (sicut significat, ita est). This emphasizes the semantic relation of signification while remaining maximally elusive about what the “it” is that is signified by a true sentence and de-emphasizing the correspondence relation (putting it into the little words “as” and “so”). Foreshadowing a favorite approach of the 20th century, medieval semanticists like Ockham (Summa Logicae, II) and Buridan (Sophismata, II) give exhaustive lists of different truth-conditional clauses for sentences of different grammatical categories. They refrain from associating true sentences in general with items from a single ontological category. (Cf. Moody 1953; Adams McCord 1987; Perler 2006.)

Authors of the modern period generally convey the impression that the correspondence theory of truth is far too obvious to merit much, or any, discussion. Brief statements of some version or other can be found in almost all major writers; see e.g.: Descartes 1639, ATII 597; Spinoza, Ethics, axiom vi; Locke, Essay, 4.5.1; Leibniz, New Essays, 4.5.2; Hume, Treatise, 3.1.1; and Kant 1787, B82. Berkeley, who does not seem to offer any account of truth, is a potentially significant exception. Due to the influence of Thomism, metaphysical versions of the theory are much more popular with the moderns than semantic versions. But since the moderns generally subscribe to a representational theory of the mind (the theory of ideas), they would seem to be ultimately committed to spelling out relations like correspondence or conformity in terms of a psycho-semantic representation relation holding between ideas, or sentential sequences of ideas (Locke’s “mental propositions”), and appropriate portions of reality, thereby effecting a merger between metaphysical and semantic versions of the correspondence theory.

1.2 Object-Based and Fact-Based Versions

It is helpful to distinguish between “object-based” and “fact-based” versions of correspondence theories, depending on whether the corresponding portion of reality is said to be an object or a fact (cf. Künne 2003, chap. 3).

Traditional versions of object-based theories assumed that the truth-bearing items (usually taken to be judgments) have subject-predicate structure. An object-based definition of truth might look like this:

A judgment is true if and only if its predicate corresponds to its object (i.e., to the object referred to by the subject term of the judgment).

Note that this actually involves two relations to an object: (i) a reference relation, holding between the subject term of the judgment and the object the judgment is about (its object); and (ii) a correspondence relation, holding between the predicate term of the judgment and a property of the object. Owing to its reliance on the subject-predicate structure of truth-bearing items, the account suffers from an inherent limitation: it does not cover truthbearers that lack subject-predicate structure (e.g. conditionals, disjunctions), and it is not clear how the account might be extended to cover them. The problem is obvious and serious; it was nevertheless simply ignored in most writings. Object-based correspondence was the norm until relatively recently.

Object-based correspondence became the norm through Plato’s pivotal engagement with the problem of falsehood, which was apparently notorious at its time. In a number of dialogues, Plato comes up against an argument, advanced by various Sophists, to the effect that false judgment is impossible—roughly: To judge falsely is to judge what is not. But one cannot judge what is not, for it is not there to be judged. To judge something that is not is to judge nothing, hence, not to judge at all. Therefore, false judgment is impossible. (Cf. Euthydemus 283e-288a; Cratylus 429c-e; Republic 478a-c; Theaetetus 188d-190e.) Plato has no good answer to this patent absurdity until the Sophist (236d-264b), where he finally confronts the issue at length. The key step in his solution is the analysis of truthbearers as structured complexes. A simple sentence, such as “Theaetetus sits.”, though simple as a sentence, is still a complex whole consisting of words of different kinds—a name (onoma) and a verb (rhema)—having different functions. By weaving together verbs with names the speaker does not just name a number of things, but accomplishes something: meaningful speech (logos) expressive of the interweaving of ideas (eidon symploken). The simple sentence is true when Theaetetus, the person named by the name, is in the state of sitting, ascribed to him through the verb, and false, when Theaetetus is not in that state but in another one (cf. 261c-263d; see Denyer 1991; Szaif 1998). Only things that are show up in this account: in the case of falsehood, the ascribed state still is, but it is a state different from the one Theaetetus is in. The account is extended from speech to thought and belief via Plato’s well known thesis that “thought is speech that occurs without voice, inside the soul in conversation with itself” (263e)—the historical origin of the language-of-thought hypothesis. The account does not take into consideration sentences that contain a name of something that is not (“Pegasus flies”), thus bequeathing to posterity a residual problem that would become more notorious than the problem of falsehood.

Aristotle, in De Interpretatione, adopts Plato’s account without much ado—indeed, the beginning of De Interpretatione reads like a direct continuation of the passages from the Sophist mentioned above. He emphasizes that truth and falsehood have to do with combination and separation (cf. De Int. 16a10; in De Anima 430a25, he says: “where the alternative of true and false applies, there we always find a sort of combining of objects of thought in a quasi-unity”). Unlike Plato, Aristotle feels the need to characterize simple affirmative and negative statements (predications) separately—translating rather more literally than is usual: “An affirmation is a predication of something toward something, a negation is a predication of something away from something” (De Int. 17a25). This characterization reappears early in the Prior Analytics (24a). It thus seems fair to say that the subject-predicate analysis of simple declarative sentences—the most basic feature of Aristotelian term logic which was to reign supreme for many centuries—had its origin in Plato’s response to a sophistical argument against the possibility of falsehood. One may note that Aristotle’s famous definition of truth (see Section 1) actually begins with the definition of falsehood.

Fact-based correspondence theories became prominent only in the 20th century, though one can find remarks in Aristotle that fit this approach (see Section 1)—somewhat surprisingly in light of his repeated emphasis on subject-predicate structure wherever truth and falsehood are concerned. Fact-based theories do not presuppose that the truth-bearing items have subject-predicate structure; indeed, they can be stated without any explicit reference to the structure of truth-bearing items. The approach thus embodies an alternative response to the problem of falsehood, a response that may claim to extricate the theory of truth from the limitations imposed on it through the presupposition of subject-predicate structure inherited from the response to the problem of falsehood favored by Plato, Aristotle, and the medieval and modern tradition.

The now classical formulation of a fact-based correspondence theory was foreshadowed by Hume (Treatise, 3.1.1) and Mill (Logic, 1.5.1). It appears in its canonical form early in the 20th century in Moore (1910-11, chap. 15) and Russell: “Thus a belief is true when there is a corresponding fact, and is false when there is no corresponding fact” (1912, p. 129; cf. also his 1905, 1906, 1910, and 1913). The self-conscious emphasis on facts as the corresponding portions of reality—and a more serious concern with problems raised by falsehood—distinguishes this version from its foreshadowings. Russell and Moore’s forceful advocacy of truth as correspondence to a fact was, at the time, an integral part of their defense of metaphysical realism. Somewhat ironically, their formulations are indebted to their idealist opponents, F. H. Bradley (1883, chaps. 1&2), and H. H. Joachim (1906), the latter was an early advocate of the competing coherence theory, who had set up a correspondence-to-fact account of truth as the main target of his attack on realism. Later, Wittgenstein (1921) and Russell (1918) developed “logical atomism”, which introduces an important modification of the fact-based correspondence approach (see below, Section 7.1). Further modifications of the correspondence theory, bringing a return to more overtly semantic and broadly object-based versions, were influenced by Tarski’s (1935) technical work on truth (cf. Field 1972, Popper 1972).

2. Truthbearers, Truthmakers, Truth

2.1 Truthbearers

Correspondence theories of truth have been given for beliefs, thoughts, ideas, judgments, statements, assertions, utterances, sentences, and propositions. It has become customary to talk of truthbearers whenever one wants to stay neutral between these choices. Five points should be kept in mind:

  1. The term “truthbearer” is somewhat misleading. It is intended to refer to bearers of truth or falsehood (truth-value-bearers), or alternatively, to things of which it makes sense to ask whether they are true or false, thus allowing for the possibility that some of them might be neither.
  2. One distinguishes between secondary and primary truthbearers. Secondary truthbearers are those whose truth-values (truth or falsehood) are derived from the truth-values of primary truthbearers, whose truth-values are not derived from any other truthbearers. Consequently, the term “true” is usually regarded as ambiguous, taking its primary meaning when applied to primary truthbearers and various secondary meanings when applied to other truthbearers. This is, however, not a brute ambiguity, since the secondary meanings are supposed to be derived, i.e. definable from, the primary meaning together with additional relations. For example, one might hold that propositions are true or false in the primary sense, whereas sentences are true or false in a secondary sense, insofar as they express propositions that are true or false (in the primary sense). The meanings of “true”, when applied to truthbearers of different kinds, are thus connected in a manner familiar from what Aristotelians called “analogical” uses of a term—nowadays one would call this “focal meaning”; e.g., “healthy” in “healthy organism” and “healthy food”, the latter being defined as healthy in the secondary sense of contributing to the healthiness (primary sense) of an organism.
  3. It is often unproblematic to advocate one theory of truth for bearers of one kind and another theory for bearers of a different kind (e.g., a deflationary theory of truth, or an identity theory, applied to propositions, could be a component of some form of correspondence theory of truth for sentences). Different theories of truth applied to bearers of different kinds do not automatically compete. The standard segregation of truth theories into competing camps (found in textbooks, handbooks, and dictionaries) proceeds under the assumption—really a pretense—that they are intended for primary truthbearers of the same kind.
  4. Confusingly, there is little agreement as to which entities are properly taken to be primary truthbearers. Nowadays, the main contenders are public language sentences, sentences of the language of thought (sentential mental representations), and propositions. Popular earlier contenders—beliefs, judgments, statements, and assertions—have fallen out of favor, mainly for two reasons:
    1. The problem of logically complex truthbearers. A subject, S, may hold a disjunctive belief (the baby will be a boy or the baby will be a girl), while believing only one, or neither, of the disjuncts. Also, S may hold a conditional belief (if whales are fish, then some fish are mammals) without believing the antecedent or the consequent. Also, S will usually hold a negative belief (not everyone is lucky) without believing what is negated. In such cases, the truth-values of S’s complex beliefs depend on the truth-values of their constituents, although the constituents may not be believed by S or by anyone. This means that a view according to which beliefs are primary truthbearers seems unable to account for how the truth-values of complex beliefs are connected to the truth-values of their simpler constituents—to do this one needs to be able to apply truth and falsehood to belief-constituents even when they are not believed. This point, which is equally fundamental for a proper understanding of logic, was made by all early advocates of propositions (cf. Bolzano 1837, I.§§22, 34; Frege 1879, §§2-5; Husserl 1900, I.§11; Meinong 1902, §6). The problem arises in much the same form for views that would take judgments, statements, or assertions as primary truthbearers. The problem is not easily evaded. Talk of unbelieved beliefs (unjudged judgments, unstated statements, unasserted assertions) is either absurd or simply amounts to talk of unbelieved (unjudged, unstated, unasserted) propositions or sentences. It is noteworthy, incidentally, that quite a few philosophical proposals (concerning truth as well as other matters) run afoul of the simple observation that there are unasserted and unbelieved truthbearers (cf. Geach 1960 & 1965).
    2. The duality of state/content a.k.a. act/object. The noun “belief” can refer to the state of believing or to its content, i.e., to what is believed. If the former, the state of believing, can be said to be true or false at all, which is highly questionable, then only insofar as the latter, what is believed, is true or false. Similarly for nouns referring to mental acts or their objects (contents), such as “judgment”, “statement”, and “assertion”.
  5. Mental sentences were the preferred primary truthbearers throughout the medieval period. They were neglected in the first half of the 20th century, but made a comeback in the second half through the revival of the representational theory of the mind (especially in the form of the language-of-thought hypothesis, cf. Fodor 1975). Somewhat confusingly (to us now), for many centuries the term “proposition” (propositio) was reserved exclusively for sentences, written, spoken or mental. This use was made official by Boethius in the 6th century, and is still found in Locke’s Essay in 1705 and in Mill’s Logic in 1843. Some time after that, e.g., in Moore’s 1901-01, “proposition” switched sides, the term now being used for what is said by uttering a sentence, for what is believed, judged, stated, assumed (etc.)—with occasional reversions to medieval usage, e.g. in Russell (1918, 1919).

2.2 Truthmakers

Talk of truthmakers serves a function similar, but correlative, to talk of truthbearers. A truthmaker is anything that makes some truthbearer true. Different versions of the correspondence theory will have different, and often competing, views about what sort of items true truthbearers correspond to (facts, states of affairs, events, things, tropes, properties). It is convenient to talk of truthmakers whenever one wants to stay neutral between these choices. Four points should be kept in mind:

  1. The notion of a truthmaker is tightly connected with, and dependent on, the relational notion of truthmaking: a truthmaker is whatever stands in the truthmaking relation to some truthbearer. Despite the causal overtones of “maker” and “making”, this relation is usually not supposed to be a causal relation.
  2. The terms “truthmaking” and “truthmaker” are ambiguous. For illustration, consider a classical correspondence theory on which x is true if and only if x corresponds to some fact. One can say (a) that x is made true by a fact, namely the fact (or a fact) that x corresponds to. One can also say (b) that x is made true by x’s correspondence to a fact. Both uses of “is made true by” are correct and both occur in discussions of truth. But they are importantly different and must be distinguished. The (a)-use is usually the intended one; it expresses a relation peculiar to truth and leads to a use of “truthmaker” that actually picks out the items that would normally be intended by those using the term. The (b)-use does not express a relation peculiar to truth; it is just an instance (for “F” = “true”) of the generic formula “what makes an F-thing an F” that can be employed to elicit the definiens of a proposed definition of F. Compare: what makes an even number even is its divisibility by 2; what makes a right action right is its having better consequences than available alternative actions. Note that anyone proposing a definition or account of truth can avail themselves of the notion of truthmaking in the (b)-sense; e.g., a coherence theorist, advocating that a belief is true if and only if it coheres with other beliefs, can say: what makes a true belief true is its coherence with other beliefs. So, on the (b)-use, “truthmaking” and “truthmaker” do not signal any affinity with the basic idea underlying the correspondence theory of truth, whereas on the (a)-use these terms do signal such an affinity.
  3. Talk of truthmaking and truthmakers goes well with the basic idea underlying the correspondence theory; hence, it might seem natural to describe a traditional fact-based correspondence theory as maintaining that the truthmakers are facts and that the correspondence relation is the truthmaking relation. However, the assumption that the correspondence relation can be regarded as (a species of) the truthmaking relation is dubious. Correspondence appears to be a symmetric relation (if x corresponds to y, then y corresponds to x), whereas it is usually taken for granted that truthmaking is an asymmetric relation, or at least not a symmetric one. It is hard to see how a symmetric relation could be (a species of) an asymmetric or non-symmetric relation (cf. David 2009.)
  4. Talk of truthmaking and truthmakers is frequently employed during informal discussions involving truth but tends to be dropped when a more formal or official formulation of a theory of truth is produced (one reason being that it seems circular to define or explain truth in terms of truthmakers or truthmaking). However, in recent years, the informal talk has been turned into an official doctrine: “truthmaker theory”. This theory should be distinguished from informal truthmaker talk: not everyone employing the latter would subscribe to the former. Moreover, truthmaker theory should not simply be assumed to be a version of the correspondence theory; indeed, some advocates present it as a competitor to the correspondence theory (see below, Section 8.5).

2.3 Truth

The abstract noun “truth” has various uses. (a) It can be used to refer to the general relational property otherwise referred to as being true; though the latter label would be more perspicuous, it is rarely used, even in philosophical discussions. (b) The noun “truth” can be used to refer to the concept that “picks out” the property and is expressed in English by the adjective “true”. Some authors do not distinguish between concept and property; others do, or should: an account of the concept might differ significantly from an account of the property. To mention just one example, one might maintain, with some plausibility, that an account of the concept ought to succumb to the liar paradox (see the entry on the liar paradox), otherwise it wouldn’t be an adequate account of our concept of truth; this idea is considerably less plausible in the case of the property. Any proposed “definition of truth” might be intend as a definition of the property or of the concept or both; its author may or may not be alive to the difference. (c) The noun “truth” can be used, finally, to refer to some set of true truthbarers (possibly unknown), as in: “The truth is out there”, and: “The truth about this matter will never be known”.

3. Simple Versions of the Correspondence Theory

The traditional centerpiece of any correspondence theory is a definition of truth. Nowadays, a correspondence definition is most likely intended as a “real definition”, i.e., as a definition of the property, which does not commit its advocate to the claim that the definition provides a synonym for the term “true”. Most correspondence theorists would consider it implausible and unnecessarily bold to maintain that “true” means the same as “corresponds with a fact”. Some simple forms of correspondence definitions of truth should be distinguished (“iff” means “if and only if”; the variable, “x”, ranges over whatever truthbearers are taken as primary; the notion of correspondence might be replaced by various related notions):

(1) x is true iff x corresponds to some fact;
x is false iff x does not correspond to any fact.
(2) x is true iff x corresponds to some state of affairs that obtains;
x is false iff x corresponds to some state of affairs that does not obtain.

Both forms invoke portions of reality—facts/states of affairs—that are typically denoted by that-clauses or by sentential gerundives, viz. the fact/state of affairs that snow is white, or the fact/state of affairs of snow’s being white. (2)’s definition of falsehood is committed to there being (existing) entities of this sort that nevertheless fail to obtain, such as snow’s being green. (1)’s definition of falsehood is not so committed: to say that a fact does not obtain means, at best, that there is no such fact, that no such fact exists. It should be noted that this terminology is not standardized: some authors use “state of affairs” much like “fact” is used here (e.g. Armstrong 1997). The question whether non-obtaining beings of the relevant sort are to be accepted is the substantive issue behind such terminological variations. The difference between (2) and (1) is akin to the difference between Platonism about properties (embraces uninstantiated properties) and Aristotelianism about properties (rejects uninstantiated properties).

Advocates of (2) hold that facts are states of affairs that obtain, i.e., they hold that their account of truth is in effect an analysis of (1)’s account of truth. So disagreement turns largely on the treatment of falsehood, which (1) simply identifies with the absence of truth.

The following points might be made for preferring (2) over (1): (a) Form (2) does not imply that things outside the category of truthbearers (tables, dogs) are false just because they don’t correspond to any facts. One might think this “flaw” of (1) is easily repaired: just put an explicit specification of the desired category of truthbearers into both sides of (1). However, some worry that truthbearer categories, e.g. declarative sentences or propositions, cannot be defined without invoking truth and falsehood, which would make the resultant definition implicitly circular. (b) Form (2) allows for items within the category of truthbearers that are neither true nor false, i.e., it allows for the failure of bivalence. Some, though not all, will regard this as a significant advantage. (c) If the primary truthbearers are sentences or mental states, then states of affairs could be their meanings or contents, and the correspondence relation in (2) could be understood accordingly, as the relation of representation, signification, meaning, or having-as-content. Facts, on the other hand, cannot be identified with the meanings or contents of sentences or mental states, on pain of the absurd consequence that false sentences and beliefs have no meaning or content. (d) Take a truth of the form ‘p or q’, where ‘p’ is true and ‘q’ false. What are the constituents of the corresponding fact? Since ‘q’ is false, they cannot both be facts (cf. Russell 1906-07, p. 47f.). Form (2) allows that the fact corresponding to ‘p or q’ is an obtaining disjunctive state of affairs composed of a state of affairs that obtains and a state of affairs that does not obtain.

The main point in favor of (1) over (2) is that (1) is not committed to counting non-obtaining states of affairs, like the state of affairs that snow is green, as constituents of reality.

(One might observe that, strictly speaking, (1) and (2), being biconditionals, are not ontologically committed to anything. Their respective commitments to facts and states of affairs arise only when they are combined with claims to the effect that there is something that is true and something that is false. The discussion assumes some such claims as given.)

Both forms, (1) and (2), should be distinguished from:

(3) x is true iff x corresponds to some fact that exists;
x is false iff x corresponds to some fact that does not exist,

which is a confused version of (1), or a confused version of (2), or, if unconfused, signals commitment to Meinongianism, i.e., the thesis that there are things/facts that do not exist. The lure of (3) stems from the desire to offer more than a purely negative correspondence account of falsehood while avoiding commitment to non-obtaining states of affairs. Moore at times succumbs to (3)’s temptations (1910-11, pp. 267 & 269, but see p. 277). It can also be found in the 1961 translation of Wittgenstein (1921, 4.25), who uses “state of affairs” (Sachverhalt) to refer to (atomic) facts. The translation has Wittgenstein saying that an elementary proposition is false, when the corresponding state of affairs (atomic fact) does not exist—but the German original of the same passage looks rather like a version of (2). Somewhat ironically, a definition of form (3) reintroduces Plato’s problem of falsehood into a fact-based correspondence theory, i.e., into a theory of the sort that was supposed to provide an alternative solution to that very problem (see Section 1.2).

A fourth simple form of correspondence definition was popular for a time (cf. Russell 1918, secs. 1 & 3; Broad 1933, IV.2.23; Austin 1950, fn. 23), but seems to have fallen out of favor:

(4) x is true iff x corresponds (agrees) with some fact;
x is false iff x mis-corresponds (disagrees) with some fact.

This formulation attempts to avoid (2)’s commitment to non-obtaining states of affairs and (3)’s commitment to non-existent facts by invoking the relation of mis-correspondence, or disagreement, to account for falsehood. It differs from (1) in that it attempts to keep items outside the intended category of x’s from being false: supposedly, tables and dogs cannot mis-correspond with a fact. Main worries about (4) are: (a) its invocation of an additional, potentially mysterious, relation, which (b) seems difficult to tame: Which fact is the one that mis-corresponds with a given falsehood? and: What keeps a truth, which by definition corresponds with some fact, from also mis-corresponding with some other fact, i.e., from being a falsehood as well?

In the following, I will treat definitions (1) and (2) as paradigmatic; moreover, since advocates of (2) agree that obtaining states of affairs are facts, it is often convenient to condense the correspondence theory into the simpler formula provided by (1), “truth is correspondence to a fact”, at least as long as one is not particularly concerned with issues raised by falsehood.

4. Arguments for the Correspondence Theory

The main positive argument given by advocates of the correspondence theory of truth is its obviousness. Descartes: “I have never had any doubts about truth, because it seems a notion so transcendentally clear that nobody can be ignorant of it...the word ‘truth’, in the strict sense, denotes the conformity of thought with its object” (1639, AT II 597). Even philosophers whose overall views may well lead one to expect otherwise tend to agree. Kant: “The nominal definition of truth, that it is the agreement of [a cognition] with its object, is assumed as granted” (1787, B82). William James: “Truth, as any dictionary will tell you, is a property of certain of our ideas. It means their ‘agreement’, as falsity means their disagreement, with ‘reality’” (1907, p. 96). Indeed, The Oxford English Dictionary tells us: “Truth, n. Conformity with fact; agreement with reality”.

In view of its claimed obviousness, it would seem interesting to learn how popular the correspondence theory actually is. There are some empirical data. The PhilPapers Survey (conducted in 2009; cf. Bourget and Chalmers 2014), more specifically, the part of the survey targeting all regular faculty members in 99 leading departments of philosophy, reports the following responses to the question: “Truth: correspondence, deflationary, or epistemic?” Accept or lean toward: correspondence 50.8%; deflationary 24.8%; other 17.5%; epistemic 6.9%. The data suggest that correspondence-type theories may enjoy a weak majority among professional philosophers and that the opposition is divided. This fits with the observation that typically, discussions of the nature of truth take some version of the correspondence theory as the default view, the view to be criticized or to be defended against criticism.

Historically, the correspondence theory, usually in an object-based version, was taken for granted, so much so that it did not acquire this name until comparatively recently, and explicit arguments for the view are very hard to find. Since the (comparatively recent) arrival of apparently competing approaches, correspondence theorists have developed negative arguments, defending their view against objections and attacking (sometimes ridiculing) competing views.

5. Objections to the Correspondence Theory

Objection 1: Definitions like (1) or (2) are too narrow. Although they apply to truths from some domains of discourse, e.g., the domain of science, they fail for others, e.g. the domain of morality: there are no moral facts.

The objection recognizes moral truths, but rejects the idea that reality contains moral facts for moral truths to correspond to. Logic provides another example of a domain that has been “flagged” in this way. The logical positivists recognized logical truths but rejected logical facts. Their intellectual ancestor, Hume, had already given two definitions of “true”, one for logical truths, broadly conceived, the other for non-logical truths: “Truth or falsehood consists in an agreement or disagreement either to the real relations of ideas, or to real existence and matter of fact” (Hume, Treatise, 3.1.1, cf. 2.3.10; see also Locke, Essay, 4.5.6, for a similarly two-pronged account but in terms of object-based correspondence).

There are four possible responses to objections of this sort: (a) Noncognitivism, which says that, despite appearances to the contrary, claims from the flagged domain are not truth-evaluable to begin with, e.g., moral claims are commands or expressions of emotions disguised as truthbearers; (b) Error theory, which says that all claims from the flagged domain are false; (c) Reductionism, which says that truths from the flagged domain correspond to facts of a different domain regarded as unproblematic, e.g., moral truths correspond to social-behavioral facts, logical truths correspond to facts about linguistic conventions; and (d) Standing firm, i.e., embracing facts of the flagged domain.

The objection in effect maintains that there are different brands of truth (of the property being true, not just different brands of truths) for different domains. On the face of it, this conflicts with the observation that there are many obviously valid arguments combining premises from flagged and unflagged domains. The observation is widely regarded as refuting non-cognitivism, once the most popular (concessive) response to the objection.

In connection with this objection, one should take note of the recently developed “multiple realizability” view of truth, according to which truth is not to be identified with correspondence to fact but can be realized by correspondence to fact for truthbearers of some domains of discourse and by other properties for truthbearers of other domains of discourse, including “flagged” domains. Though it retains important elements of the correspondence theory, this view does not, strictly speaking, offer a response to the objection on behalf of the correspondence theory and should be regarded as one of its competitors (see below, Section 8.2).

Objection 2: Correspondence theories are too obvious. They are trivial, vacuous, trading in mere platitudes. Locutions from the “corresponds to the facts”-family are used regularly in everyday language as idiomatic substitutes for “true”. Such common turns of phrase should not be taken to indicate commitment to a correspondence theory in any serious sense. Definitions like (1) or (2) merely condense some trivial idioms into handy formulas; they don’t deserve the grand label “theory”: there is no theoretical weight behind them (cf. Woozley 1949, chap. 6; Davidson 1969; Blackburn 1984, chap. 7.1).

In response, one could point out: (a) Definitions like (1) or (2) are “mini-theories”—mini-theories are quite common in philosophy—and it is not at all obvious that they are vacuous merely because they are modeled on common usage. (b) There are correspondence theories that go beyond these definitions. (c) The complaint implies that definitions like (1) and/or (2) are generally accepted and are, moreover, so shallow that they are compatible with any deeper theory of truth. This makes it rather difficult to explain why some thinkers emphatically reject all correspondence formulations. (d) The objection implies that the correspondence of S’s belief with a fact could be said to consist in, e.g., the belief’s coherence with S’s overall belief system. This is wildly implausible, even on the most shallow understanding of “correspondence” and “fact”.

Objection 3: Correspondence theories are too obscure.

Objections of this sort, which are the most common, protest that the central notions of a correspondence theory carry unacceptable commitments and/or cannot be accounted for in any respectable manner. The objections can be divided into objections primarily aimed at the correspondence relation and its relatives (3.C1, 3.C2), and objections primarily aimed at the notions of fact or state of affairs (3.F1, 3.F2):

3.C1: The correspondence relation must be some sort of resemblance relation. But truthbearers do not resemble anything in the world except other truthbearers—echoing Berkeley’s “an idea can be like nothing but an idea”.

3.C2: The correspondence relation is very mysterious: it seems to reach into the most distant regions of space (faster than light?) and time (past and future). How could such a relation possibly be accounted for within a naturalistic framework? What physical relation could it possibly be?

3.F1: Given the great variety of complex truthbearers, a correspondence theory will be committed to all sorts of complex “funny facts” that are ontologically disreputable. Negative, disjunctive, conditional, universal, probabilistic, subjunctive, and counterfactual facts have all given cause for complaint on this score.

3.F2: All facts, even the most simple ones, are disreputable. Fact-talk, being wedded to that-clauses, is entirely parasitic on truth-talk. Facts are too much like truthbearers. Facts are fictions, spurious sentence-like slices of reality, “projected from true sentences for the sake of correspondence” (Quine 1987, p. 213; cf. Strawson 1950).

6. Correspondence as Isomorphism

Some correspondence theories of truth are two-liner mini-theories, consisting of little more than a specific version of (1) or (2). Normally, one would expect a bit more, even from a philosophical theory (though mini-theories are quite common in philosophy). One would expect a correspondence theory to go beyond a mere definition like (1) or (2) and discharge a triple task: it should tell us about the workings of the correspondence relation, about the nature of facts, and about the conditions that determine which truthbearers correspond to which facts.

One can approach this by considering some general principles a correspondence theory might want to add to its central principle to flesh out her theory. The first such principle says that the correspondence relation must not collapse into identity—“It takes two to make a truth” (Austin 1950, p. 118):

No truth is identical with a fact correspondence to which is sufficient for its being a truth.

It would be much simpler to say that no truth is identical with a fact. However, some authors, e.g. Wittgenstein 1921, hold that a proposition (Satz, his truthbearer) is itself a fact, though not the same fact as the one that makes the proposition true (see also King 2007). Nonidentity is usually taken for granted by correspondence theorists as constitutive of the very idea of a correspondence theory—authors who advance contrary arguments to the effect that correspondence must collapse into identity regard their arguments as objections to any form of correspondence theory (cf. Moore 1901/02, Frege 1918-19, p. 60).

Concerning the correspondence relation, two aspects can be distinguished: correspondence as correlation and correspondence as isomorphism (cf. Pitcher 1964; Kirkham 1992, chap. 4). Pertaining to the first aspect, familiar from mathematical contexts, a correspondence theorist is likely to adopt claim (a), and some may in addition adopt claim (b), of:

(a) Every truth corresponds to exactly one fact;
(b) Different truths correspond to different facts.

Together, (a) and (b) say that correspondence is a one-one relation. This seems needlessly strong, and it is not easy to find real-life correspondence theorists who explicitly embrace part (b): Why shouldn’t different truths correspond to the same fact, as long as they are not too different? Explicit commitment to (a) is also quite rare. However, correspondence theorists tend to move comfortably from talk about a given truth to talk about the fact it corresponds to—a move that signals commitment to (a).

Correlation does not imply anything about the inner nature of the corresponding items. Contrast this with correspondence as isomorphism, which requires the corresponding items to have the same, or sufficiently similar, constituent structure. This aspect of correspondence, which is more prominent (and more notorious) than the previous one, is also much more difficult to make precise. Let us say, roughly, that a correspondence theorist may want to add a claim to her theory committing her to something like the following:

If an item of kind K corresponds to a certain fact, then they have the same or sufficiently similar structure: the overall correspondence between a true K and a fact is a matter of part-wise correspondences, i.e. of their having corresponding constituents in corresponding places in the same structure, or in sufficiently similar structures.

The basic idea is that truthbearers and facts are both complex structured entities: truthbearers are composed of (other truthbearers and ultimately of) words, or concepts; facts are composed of (other facts or states of affairs and ultimately of) things, properties, and relations. The aim is to show how the correspondence relation is generated from underlying relations between the ultimate constituents of truthbearers, on the one hand, and the ultimate constituents of their corresponding facts, on the other. One part of the project will be concerned with these correspondence-generating relations: it will lead into a theory that addresses the question how simple words, or concepts, can be about things, properties, and relations; i.e., it will merge with semantics or psycho-semantics (depending on what the truthbearers are taken to be). The other part of the project, the specifically ontological part, will have to provide identity criteria for facts and explain how their simple constituents combine into complex wholes. Putting all this together should yield an account of the conditions determining which truthbearers correspond to which facts.

Correlation and Structure reflect distinct aspects of correspondence. One might want to endorse the former without the latter, though it is hard to see how one could endorse the latter without embracing at least part (a) of the former.

The isomorphism approach offers an answer to objection 3.C1. Although the truth that the cat is on the mat does not resemble the cat or the mat (the truth doesn’t meow or smell, etc.), it does resemble the fact that the cat is on the mat. This is not a qualitative resemblance; it is a more abstract, structural resemblance.

The approach also puts objection 3.C2 in some perspective. The correspondence relation is supposed to reduce to underlying relations between words, or concepts, and reality. Consequently, a correspondence theory is little more than a spin-off from semantics and/or psycho-semantics, i.e. the theory of intentionality construed as incorporating a representational theory of the mind (cf. Fodor 1989). This reminds us that, as a relation, correspondence is no more—but also no less—mysterious than semantic relations in general. Such relations have some curious features, and they raise a host of puzzles and difficult questions—most notoriously: Can they be explained in terms of natural (causal) relations, or do they have to be regarded as irreducibly non-natural aspects of reality? Some philosophers have claimed that semantic relations are too mysterious to be taken seriously, usually on the grounds that they are not explainable in naturalistic terms. But one should bear in mind that this is a very general and extremely radical attack on semantics as a whole, on the very idea that words and concepts can be about things. The common practice to aim this attack specifically at the correspondence theory seems misleading. As far as the intelligibility of the correspondence relation is concerned, the correspondence theory will stand, or fall, with the general theory of reference and intentionality.

It should be noted, though, that these points concerning objections 3.C1 and 3.C2 are not independent of one’s views about the nature of the primary truthbearers. If truthbearers are taken to be sentences of an ordinary language (or an idealized version thereof), or if they are taken to be mental representations (sentences of the language of thought), the above points hold without qualification: correspondence will be a semantic or psycho-semantic relation. If, on the other hand, the primary truthbearers are taken to be propositions, there is a complication:

  1. On a broadly Fregean view of propositions, propositions are constituted by concepts of objects and properties (in the logical, not the psychological, sense of “concept”). On this view, the above points still hold, since the relation between concepts, on the one hand, and the objects and properties they are concepts of, on the other, appears to be a semantic relation, a concept-semantic relation.
  2. On the so-called Russellian view of propositions (which the early Russell inherited mostly from early Moore), propositions are constituted, not of concepts of objects and properties, but of the objects and properties themselves (cf. Russell 1903). On this view, the points above will most likely fail, since the correspondence relation would appear to collapse into the identity relation when applied to true Russellian propositions. It is hard to see how a true Russellian proposition could be anything but a fact: What would a fact be, if not this sort of thing? So the principle of Nonidentity is rejected, and with it goes the correspondence theory of truth: “Once it is definitely recognized that the proposition is to denote, not a belief or form of words, but an object of belief, it seems plain that a truth differs in no respect from the reality with which it was supposed merely to correspond” (Moore 1901-02, p. 717). A simple, fact-based correspondence theory, applied to propositions understood in the Russellian way, thus reduces to an identity theory of truth, on which a proposition is true iff it is a fact, and false, iff it is not a fact. See below, Section 8.3; and the entries on propositions, singular propositions, and structured propositions in this encyclopedia.

But Russellians don’t usually renounce the correspondence theory entirely. Though they have no room for (1) from Section 3, when applied to propositions as truthbearers, correspondence will enter into their account of truth for sentences, public or mental. The account will take the form of Section 3’s (2), applied to categories of truthbearers other than propositions, where Russellian propositions show up on the right-hand side in the guise of states of affairs that obtain or fail to obtain. Commitment to states of affairs in addition to propositions is sometimes regarded with scorn, as a gratuitous ontological duplication. But Russellians are not committed to states of affairs in addition to propositions, for propositions, on their view, must already be states of affairs. This conclusion is well nigh inevitable, once true propositions have been identified with facts. If a true proposition is a fact, then a false proposition that might have been true would have been a fact, if it had been true. So, a (contingent) false proposition must be the same kind of being as a fact, only not a fact—an unfact; but that just is a non-obtaining state of affairs under a different name. Russellian propositions are states of affairs: the false ones are states of affairs that do not obtain, and the true ones are states of affairs that do obtain.

The Russellian view of propositions is popular nowadays. Somewhat curiously, contemporary Russellians hardly ever refer to propositions as facts or states of affairs. This is because they are much concerned with understanding belief, belief attributions, and the semantics of sentences. In such contexts, it is more natural to talk proposition-language than state-of-affairs-language. It feels odd (wrong) to say that someone believes a state of affairs, or that states of affairs are true or false. For that matter, it also feels odd (wrong) to say that some propositions are facts, that facts are true, and that propositions obtain or fail to obtain. Nevertheless, all of this must be the literal truth, according to the Russellians. They have to claim that “proposition” and “state of affairs”, much like “evening star” and “morning star”, are different names for the same things—they come with different associations and are at home in somewhat different linguistic environments, which accounts for the felt oddness when one name is transported to the other’s environment.

Returning to the isomorphism approach in general, on a strict or naïve implementation of this approach, correspondence will be a one-one relation between truths and corresponding facts, which leaves the approach vulnerable to objections against funny facts (3.F1): each true truthbearer, no matter how complex, will be assigned a matching fact. Moreover, since a strict implementation of isomorphism assigns corresponding entities to all (relevant) constituents of truthbearers, complex facts will contain objects corresponding to the logical constants (“not”, “or”, “if-then”, etc.), and these “logical objects” will have to be regarded as constituents of the world. Many philosophers have found it hard to believe in the existence of all these funny facts and funny quasi-logical objects.

The isomorphism approach has never been advocated in a fully naïve form, assigning corresponding objects to each and every wrinkle of our verbal or mental utterings. Instead, proponents try to isolate the “relevant” constituents of truthbearers through meaning analysis, aiming to uncover the logical form, or deep structure, behind ordinary language and thought. This deep structure might then be expressed in an ideal-language (typically, the language of predicate logic), whose syntactic structure is designed to mirror perfectly the ontological structure of reality. The resulting view—correspondence as isomorphism between properly analyzed truthbearers and facts—avoids assigning strange objects to such phrases as “the average husband”, “the sake of”, and “the present king of France”; but the view remains committed to logically complex facts and to logical objects corresponding to the logical constants.

Austin (1950) rejects the isomorphism approach on the grounds that it projects the structure of our language onto the world. On his version of the correspondence theory (a more elaborated variant of (4) applied to statements), a statement as a whole is correlated to a state of affairs by arbitrary linguistic conventions without mirroring the inner structure of its correlate (cf. also Vision 2004). This approach appears vulnerable to the objection that it avoids funny facts at the price of neglecting systematicity. Language does not provide separate linguistic conventions for each statement: that would require too vast a number of conventions. Rather, it seems that the truth-values of statements are systematically determined, via a relatively small set of conventions, by the semantic values (relations to reality) of their simpler constituents. Recognition of this systematicity is built right into the isomorphism approach.

Critics frequently echo Austin’s “projection”-complaint, 3.F2, that a traditional correspondence theory commits “the error of reading back into the world the features of language” (Austin 1950, p. 155; cf. also, e.g., Rorty 1981). At bottom, this is a pessimistic stance: if there is a prima facie structural resemblance between a mode of speech or thought and some ontological category, it is inferred, pessimistically, that the ontological category is an illusion, a matter of us projecting the structure of our language or thought into the world. Advocates of traditional correspondence theories can be seen as taking the opposite stance: unless there are specific reasons to the contrary, they are prepared to assume, optimistically, that the structure of our language and/or thought reflects genuine ontological categories, that the structure of our language and/or thought is, at least to a significant extent, the way it is because of the structure of the world.

7. Modified Versions of the Correspondence Theory

7.1 Logical Atomism

Wittgenstein (1921) and Russell (1918) propose modified fact-based correspondence accounts of truth as part of their program of logical atomism. Such accounts proceed in two stages. At the first stage, the basic truth-definition, say (1) from Section 3, is restricted to a special subclass of truthbearers, the so-called elementary or atomic truthbearers, whose truth is said to consist in their correspondence to (atomic) facts: if x is elementary, then x is true iff x corresponds to some (atomic) fact. This restricted definition serves as the base-clause for truth-conditional recursion-clauses given at the second stage, at which the truth-values of non-elementary, or molecular, truthbearers are explained recursively in terms of their logical structure and the truth-values of their simpler constituents. For example: a sentence of the form ‘not-p’ is true iff ‘p’ is false; a sentence of the form ‘p and q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true and ‘q’ is true; a sentence of the form ‘p or q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true or ‘q’ is true, etc. These recursive clauses (called “truth conditions”) can be reapplied until the truth of a non-elementary, molecular sentence of arbitrary complexity is reduced to the truth or falsehood of its elementary, atomic constituents.

Logical atomism exploits the familiar rules, enshrined in the truth-tables, for evaluating complex formulas on the basis of their simpler constituents. These rules can be understood in two different ways: (a) as tracing the ontological relations between complex facts and constituent simpler facts, or (b) as tracing logico-semantic relations, exhibiting how the truth-values of complex sentences can be explained in terms of their logical relations to simpler constituent sentences together with the correspondence and non-correspondence of simple, elementary sentences to atomic facts. Logical atomism takes option (b).

Logical atomism is designed to go with the ontological view that the world is the totality of atomic facts (cf. Wittgenstein 1921, 2.04); thus accommodating objection 3.F2 by doing without funny facts: atomic facts are all the facts there are—although real-life atomists tend to allow conjunctive facts, regarding them as mere aggregates of atomic facts. An elementary truth is true because it corresponds to an atomic fact: correspondence is still isomorphism, but it holds exclusively between elementary truths and atomic facts. There is no match between truths and facts at the level of non-elementary, molecular truths; e.g., ‘p’, ‘p or q’, and ‘p or r’ might all be true merely because ‘p’ corresponds to a fact). The trick for avoiding logically complex facts lies in not assigning any entities to the logical constants. Logical complexity, so the idea goes, belongs to the structure of language and/or thought; it is not a feature of the world. This is expressed by Wittgenstein in an often quoted passage (1921, 4.0312): “My fundamental idea is that the ‘logical constants’ are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts”; and also by Russell (1918, p. 209f.): “You must not look about the real world for an object which you can call ‘or’, and say ‘Now look at this. This is ‘or’’”.

Though accounts of this sort are naturally classified as versions of the correspondence theory, it should be noted that they are strictly speaking in conflict with the basic forms presented in Section 3. According to logical atomism, it is not the case that for every truth there is a corresponding fact. It is, however, still the case that the being true of every truth is explained in terms of correspondence to a fact (or non-correspondence to any fact) together with (in the case of molecular truths) logical notions detailing the logical structure of complex truthbearers. Logical atomism attempts to avoid commitment to logically complex, funny facts via structural analysis of truthbearers. It should not be confused with a superficially similar account maintaining that molecular facts are ultimately constituted by atomic facts. The latter account would admit complex facts, offering an ontological analysis of their structure, and would thus be compatible with the basic forms presented in Section 3, because it would be compatible with the claim that for every truth there is a corresponding fact. (For more on classical logical atomism, see Wisdom 1931-1933, Urmson 1953, and the entries on Russell's logical atomism and Wittgenstein's logical atomism in this encyclopedia.)

While Wittgenstein and Russell seem to have held that the constituents of atomic facts are to be determined on the basis of a priori considerations, Armstrong (1997, 2004) advocates an a posteriori form of logical atomism. On his view, atomic facts are composed of particulars and simple universals (properties and relations). The latter are objective features of the world that ground the objective resemblances between particulars and explain their causal powers. Accordingly, what particulars and universals there are will have to be determined on the basis of total science.

Problems: Logical atomism is not easy to sustain and has rarely been held in a pure form. Among its difficulties are the following: (a) What, exactly, are the elementary truthbearers? How are they determined? (b) There are molecular truthbearers, such as subjunctives and counterfactuals, that tend to provoke the funny-fact objection but cannot be handled by simple truth-conditional clauses, because their truth-values do not seem to be determined by the truth-values of their elementary constituents. (c) Are there universal facts corresponding to true universal generalizations? Wittgenstein (1921) disapproves of universal facts; apparently, he wants to re-analyze universal generalizations as infinite conjunctions of their instances. Russell (1918) and Armstrong (1997, 2004) reject this analysis; they admit universal facts. (d) Negative truths are the most notorious problem case, because they clash with an appealing principle, the “truthmaker principle” (cf. Section 8.5), which says that for every truth there must be something in the world that makes it true, i.e., every true truthbearer must have a truthmaker. Suppose ‘p’ is elementary. On the account given above, ‘not-p’ is true iff ‘p’ is false iff ‘p’ does not correspond to any fact; hence, ‘not-p’, if true, is not made true by any fact: it does not seem to have a truthmaker. Russell finds himself driven to admit negative facts, regarded by many as paradigmatically disreputable portions of reality. Wittgenstein sometimes talks of atomic facts that do not exist and calls their very nonexistence a negative fact (cf. 1921, 2.06)—but this is hardly an atomic fact itself. Armstrong (1997, chap. 8.7; 2004, chaps. 5-6) holds that negative truths are made true by a second-order “totality fact” which says of all the (positive) first-order facts that they are all the first-order facts.

Atomism and the Russellian view of propositions (see Section 6). By the time Russell advocated logical atomism (around 1918), he had given up on what is now referred to as the Russellian conception of propositions (which he and G. E. Moore held around 1903). But Russellian propositons are popular nowadays. Note that logical atomism is not for the friends of Russellian propositions. The argument is straightforward. We have logically complex beliefs some of which are true. According to the friends of Russellian propositions, the contents of our beliefs are Russellian propositions, and the contents of our true beliefs are true Russellian propositions. Since true Russellian propositions are facts, there must be at least as many complex facts as there are true beliefs with complex contents (and at least as many complex states of affairs as there are true or false beliefs with complex contents). Atomism may work for sentences, public or mental, and for Fregean propositions; but not for Russellian propositions.

Logical atomism is designed to address objections to funny facts (3.F1). It is not designed to address objections to facts in general (3.F2). Here logical atomists will respond by defending (atomic) facts. According to one defense, facts are needed because mere objects are not sufficiently articulated to serve as truthmakers. If a were the sole truthmaker of ‘a is F’, then the latter should imply ‘a is G’, for any ‘G’. So the truthmaker for ‘a is F’ needs at least to involve a and Fness. But since Fness is a universal, it could be instantiated in another object, b, hence the mere existence of a and Fness is not sufficient for making true the claim ‘a is F’: a and Fness need to be tied together in the fact of a’s being F. Armstrong (1997) and Olson (1987) also maintain that facts are needed to make sense of the tie that binds particular objects to universals.

In this context it is usually emphasized that facts do not supervene on, hence, are not reducible to, their constituents. Facts are entities over and above the particulars and universals of which they are composed: a’s loving b and b’s loving a are not the same fact even though they have the very same constituents.

Another defense of facts, surprisingly rare, would point out that many facts are observable: one can see that the cat is on the mat; and this is different from seeing the cat, or the mat, or both. The objection that many facts are not observable would invite the rejoinder that many objects are not observable either. (See Austin 1961, Vendler 1967, chap. 5, and Vision 2004, chap. 3, for more discussion of anti-fact arguments; see also the entry facts in this encyclopedia.)

Some atomists propose an atomistic version of definition (1), but without facts, because they regard facts as slices of reality too suspiciously sentence-like to be taken with full ontological seriousness. Instead, they propose events and/or objects-plus-tropes (a.k.a. modes, particularized qualities, moments) as the corresponding portions of reality. It is claimed that these items are more “thingy” than facts but still sufficiently articulated—and sufficiently abundant—to serve as adequate truthmakers (cf. Mulligan, Simons, and Smith 1984).

7.2 Logical “Subatomism”

Logical atomism aims at getting by without logically complex truthmakers by restricting definitions like (1) or (2) from Section 3 to elementary truthbearers and accounting for the truth-values of molecular truthbearers recursively in terms of their logical structure and atomic truthmakers (atomic facts, events, objects-plus-tropes). More radical modifications of the correspondence theory push the recursive strategy even further, entirely discarding definitions like (1) or (2), and hence the need for atomic truthmakers, by going, as it were, “subatomic”.

Such accounts analyze truthbearers, e.g., sentences, into their subsentential constituents and dissolve the relation of correspondence into appropriate semantic subrelations: names refer to, or denote, objects; predicates (open sentences) apply to, or are satisfied by objects. Satisfaction of complex predicates can be handled recursively in terms of logical structure and satisfaction of simpler constituent predicates: an object o satisfies ‘x is not F’ iff o does not satisfy ‘x is F’; o satisfies ‘x is F or x is G’ iff o satisfies ‘x is F’ or o satisfies ‘x is G’; and so on. These recursions are anchored in a base-clause addressing the satisfaction of primitive predicates: an object o satisfies ‘x is F’ iff o instantiates the property expressed by ‘F’. Some would prefer a more nominalistic base-clause for satisfaction, hoping to get by without seriously invoking properties. Truth for singular sentences, consisting of a name and an arbitrarily complex predicate, is defined thus: A singular sentence is true iff the object denoted by the name satisfies the predicate. Logical machinery provided by Tarski (1935) can be used to turn this simplified sketch into a more general definition of truth—a definition that handles sentences containing relational predicates and quantifiers and covers molecular sentences as well. Whether Tarski’s own definition of truth can be regarded as a correspondence definition, even in this modified sense, is under debate (cf. Popper 1972; Field 1972, 1986; Kirkham 1992, chaps. 5-6; Soames 1999; Künne 2003, chap. 4; Patterson 2008.)

Subatomism constitutes a return to (broadly) object-based correspondence. Since it promises to avoid facts and all similarly articulated, sentence-like slices of reality, correspondence theorists who take seriously objection 3.F2 favor this approach: not even elementary truthbearers are assigned any matching truthmakers. The correspondence relation itself has given way to two semantic relations between constituents of truthbearers and objects: reference (or denotation) and satisfaction—relations central to any semantic theory. Some advocates envision causal accounts of reference and satisfaction (cf. Field 1972; Devitt 1982, 1984; Schmitt 1995; Kirkham 1992, chaps. 5-6). It turns out that relational predicates require talk of satisfaction by ordered sequences of objects. Davidson (1969, 1977) maintains that satisfaction by sequences is all that remains of the traditional idea of correspondence to facts; he regards reference and satisfaction as “theoretical constructs” not in need of causal, or any, explanation.

Problems: (a) The subatomistic approach accounts for the truth-values of molecular truthbearers in the same way as the atomistic approach; consequently, molecular truthbearers that are not truth-functional still pose the same problems as in atomism. (b) Belief attributions and modal claims pose special problems; e.g., it seems that “believes” is a relational predicate, so that “John believes that snow is white” is true iff “believes” is satisfied by John and the object denoted by “that snow is white”; but the latter appears to be a proposition or state of affairs, which threatens to let in through the back-door the very sentence-like slices of reality the subatomic approach was supposed to avoid, thus undermining the motivation for going subatomic. (c) The phenomenon of referential indeterminacy threatens to undermine the idea that the truth-values of elementary truthbearers are always determined by the denotation and/or satisfaction of their constituents; e.g., pre-relativistic uses of the term “mass” are plausibly taken to lack determinate reference (referring determinately neither to relativistic mass nor to rest mass); yet a claim like “The mass of the earth is greater than the mass of the moon” seems to be determinately true even when made by Newton (cf. Field 1973).

Problems for both versions of modified correspondence theories: (a) It is not known whether an entirely general recursive definition of truth, one that covers all truthbearers, can be made available. This depends on unresolved issues concerning the extent to which truthbearers are amenable to the kind of structural analyses that are presupposed by the recursive clauses. The more an account of truth wants to exploit the internal structure of truthbearers, the more it will be hostage to the (limited) availability of appropriate structural analyses of the relevant truthbearers. (b) Any account of truth employing a recursive framework may be virtually committed to taking sentences (maybe sentences of the language of thought) as primary truthbearers. After all, the recursive clauses rely heavily on what appears to be the logico-syntactic structure of truthbearers, and it is unclear whether anything but sentences can plausibly be said to possess that kind of structure. But the thesis that sentences of any sort are to be regarded as the primary truthbearers is contentious. Whether propositions can meaningfully be said to have an analogous (albeit non-linguistic) structure is under debate (cf. Russell 1913, King 2007). (c) If clauses like “‘p or q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true or ‘q’ is true” are to be used in a recursive account of our notion of truth, as opposed to some other notion, it has to be presupposed that ‘or’ expresses disjunction: one cannot define “or” and “true” at the same time. To avoid circularity, a modified correspondence theory (be it atomic or subatomic) must hold that the logical connectives can be understood without reference to correspondence truth.

7.3 Relocating Correspondence

Definitions like (1) and (2) from Section 3 assume, naturally, that truthbearers are true because they, the truthbearers themselves, correspond to facts. There are however views that reject this natural assumption. They propose to account for the truth of truthbearers of certain kinds, propositions, not by way of their correspondence to facts, but by way of the correspondence to facts of other items, the ones that have propositions as their contents. Consider the state of believing that p (or the activity of judging that p). The state (the activity) is not, strictly speaking, true or false; rather, what is true or false is its content, the proposition that p. Nevertheless, on the present view, it is the state of believing that p that corresponds or fails to correspond to a fact. So truth/falsehood for propositions can be defined in the following manner: x is a true/false proposition iff there is a belief state B such that x is the content of B and B corresponds/fails to correspond to a fact.

Such a modification of fact-based correspondence can be found in Moore (1927, p. 83) and Armstrong (1973, 4.iv & 9). It can be adapted to atomistic (Armstrong) and subatomistic views, and to views on which sentences (of the language of thought) are the primary bearers of truth and falsehood. However, by taking the content-carrying states as the primary corresponders, it entails that there are no truths/falsehoods that are not believed by someone. Most advocates of propositions as primary bearers of truth and falsehood will regard this as a serious weakness, holding that there are very many true and false propositions that are not believed, or even entertained, by anyone. Armstrong (1973) combines the view with an instrumentalist attitude towards propositions, on which propositions are mere abstractions from mental states and should not be taken seriously, ontologically speaking.

8. The Correspondence Theory and Its Competitors

8.1 Traditional Competitors

Against the traditional competitors—coherentist, pragmatist, and verificationist and other epistemic theories of truth—correspondence theorists raise two main sorts of objections. First, such accounts tend to lead into relativism. Take, e.g., a coherentist account of truth. Since it is possible that ‘p’ coheres with the belief system of S while ‘not-p’ coheres with the belief system of S*, the coherentist account seems to imply, absurdly, that contradictories, ‘p’ and ‘not-p’, could both be true. To avoid embracing contradictions, coherentists often commit themselves (if only covertly) to the objectionable relativistic view that ‘p’ is true-for-S and ‘not-p’ is true-for-S*. Second, the accounts tend to lead into some form of idealism or anti-realism, e.g., it is possible for the belief that p to cohere with someone’s belief system, even though it is not a fact that p; also, it is possible for it to be a fact that p, even if no one believes that p at all or if the belief does not cohere with anyone’s belief system. Cases of this sort are frequently cited as counterexamples to coherentist accounts of truth. Dedicated coherentists tend to reject such counterexamples, insisting that they are not possible after all. Since it is hard to see why they would not be possible, unless its being a fact that p were determined by the belief’s coherence with other beliefs, this reaction commits them to the anti-realist view that the facts are (largely) determined by what we believe.

This offers a bare outline of the overall shape the debates tend to take. For more on the correspondence theory vs. its traditional competitors see, e.g., Vision 1988; Kirkham 1992, chaps. 3, 7-8; Schmitt 1995; Künne 2003, chap. 7; and essays in Lynch 2001. Walker 1989 is a book-lenght discussion of coherence theories of truth. See also the entries on pragmatism, relativism, the coherence theory of truth, in this encyclopedia.

8.2 Pluralism

The correspondence theory is sometimes accused of overreaching itself: it does apply, so the objection goes, to truths from some domains of discourse, e.g., scientific discourse and/or discourse about everyday midsized physical things, but not to truths from various other domains of discourse, e.g., ethical and/or aesthetic discourse (see the first objection in Section 5 above). Alethic pluralism grows out of this objection, maintaining that truth is constituted by different properties for true propositions from different domains of discourse: by correspondence to fact for true propositions from the domain of scientific or everyday discourse about physical things; by some epistemic property, such as coherence or superassertibility, for true propositions from the domain of ethical and aesthetic discourse, and maybe by still other properties for other domains of discourse. This suggests a position on which the term “true” is multiply ambiguous, expressing different properties when applied to propositions from different domains. However, contemporary pluralists reject this problematic idea, maintaining instead that truth is “multiply realizable”. That is, the term “true” is univocal, it expresses one concept or property, truth (being true), but one that can be realized by or manifested in different properties (correspondence to fact, coherence or superassertibility, and maybe others) for true propositions from different domains of discourse. Truth itself is not to be identified with any of its realizing properties. Instead, it is characterized, quasi axiomatically, by a set of alleged “platitudes”, including, according to Crispin Wright’s (1999) version, “transparency” (to assert is to present as true), “contrast” (a proposition may be true without being justified, and v.v.), “timelesness” (if a proposition is ever true, then it always is), “absoluteness” (there is no such thing as a proposition being more or less true), and others.

Though it contains the correspondence theory as one ingredient, alethic pluralism is nevertheless a genuine competitor, for it rejects the thesis that truth is correspondence to reality. Moreover, it equally contains competitors of the correspondence theory as further ingredients.

Alethic pluralism in its contemporary form is a relatively young position. It was inaugurated by Crispin Wright (1992; see also 1999) and was later developed into a somewhat different form by Lynch (2009). Critical discussion is still at a relatively nascent stage (but see Vision 2004, chap. 4, for extended discussion of Wright). It will likely focus on two main problem areas.

First, it seems difficult to sort propositions into distinct kinds according to the subject matter they are about. Take, e.g., the proposition that killing is morally wrong, or the proposition that immoral acts happen in space-time. What are they about? Intuitively, their subject matter is mixed, belonging to the physical domain, the biological domain, and the domain of ethical discourse. It is hard to see how pluralism can account for the truth of such mixed propositions, belonging to more than one domain of discourse: What will be the realizing property?

Second, pluralists are expected to explain how the platitudes can be “converted” into an account of truth itself. Lynch (2009) proposes to construe truth as a functional property, defined in terms of a complex functional role which is given by the conjunction of the platitudes (somewhat analogous to the way in which functionalists in the philosophy of mind construe mental states as functional states, specified in terms of their functional roles—though in their case the relevant functional roles are causal roles, which is not a feasible option when it comes to the truth-role). Here the main issue will be to determine (a) whether such an account really works, when the technical details are laid out, and (b) whether it is plausible to claim that properties as different as correspondence to a fact, on the one hand, and coherence or superassertibilty, on the other, can be said to play one and the same role—a claim that seems required by the thesis that these different properties all realize the same property, being true.

For more on pluralism, see e.g. the essays in Monnoyer (2007) and in Pedersen & Wright (2013); and the entry on pluralist theories of truth in this encyclopedia.

8.3 The Identity Theory of Truth

According to the identity theory of truth, true propositions do not correspond to facts, they are facts: the true proposition that snow is white = the fact that snow is white. This non-traditional competitor of the correspondence theory threatens to collapse the correspondence relation into identity. (See Moore 1901-02; and Dodd 2000 for a book-length defense of this theory and discussion contrasting it with the correspondence theory; and see the entry the identity theory of truth: in this encyclopedia.)

In response, a correspondence theorist will point out: (a) The identity theory is defensible only for propositions as truthbearers, and only for propositions construed in a certain way, namely as having objects and properties as constituents rather than ideas or concepts of objects and properties; that is, for Russellian propositions. Hence, there will be ample room (and need) for correspondence accounts of truth for other types of truthbearers, including propositions, if they are construed as constituted, partly or wholly, of concepts of objects and properties. (b) The identity theory is committed to the unacceptable consequence that facts are true. (c) The identity theory rests on the assumption that that-clauses always denote propositions, so that the that-clause in “the fact that snow is white” denotes the proposition that snow is white. The assumption can be questioned. That-clauses can be understood as ambiguous names, sometimes denoting propositions and sometimes denoting facts. The descriptive phrases “the proposition…” and “the fact…” can be regarded as serving to disambiguate the succeeding ambiguous that-clauses—much like the descriptive phrases in “the philosopher Socrates” and “the soccer-player Socrates” serve to disambiguate the ambiguous name “Socrates” (cf. David 2002).

8.4 Deflationism About Truth

At present the most noticeable competitors to correspondence theories are deflationary accounts of truth (or ‘true’). Deflationists maintain that correspondence theories need to be deflated; that their central notions, correspondence and fact (and their relatives), play no legitimate role in an adequate account of truth and can be excised without loss. A correspondence-type formulation like

(5) “Snow is white” is true iff it corresponds to the fact that snow is white,

is to be deflated to

(6) “Snow is white” is true iff snow is white,

which, according to deflationists, says all there is to be said about the truth of “Snow is white”, without superfluous embellishments (cf. Quine 1987, p. 213).

Correspondence theorists protest that (6) cannot lead to anything deserving to be regarded as an account of truth. It is concerned with only one particular sentence (“Snow is white”), and it resists generalization. (6) is a substitution instance of the schema

(7) “p” is true iff p,

which does not actually say anything itself (it is not truth-evaluable) and cannot be turned into a genuine generalization about truth, because of its essential reliance on the schematic letter “p”, a mere placeholder. The attempt to turn (7) into a generalization produces nonsense along the lines of “For every x, “x” is true iff x”, or requires invocation of truth: “Every substitution instance of the schema ““p” is true iff p” is true”. Moreover, no genuine generalizations about truth can be accounted for on the basis of (7). Correspondence definitions, on the other hand, do yield genuine generalizations about truth. Note that definitions like (1) and (2) in Section 3 employ ordinary objectual variables (not mere schematic placeholders); the definitions are easily turned into genuine generalizations by prefixing the quantifier phrase “For every x”, which is customarily omitted in formulations intended as definitions.

It should be noted that the deflationist’s starting point, (5), which lends itself to deflating excisions, actually misrepresents the correspondence theory. According to (5), corresponding to the fact that snow is white is sufficient and necessary for “Snow is white” to be true. Yet, according to (1) and (2), it is sufficient but not necessary: “Snow is white” will be true as long as it corresponds to some fact or other. The genuine article, (1) or (2), is not as easily deflated as the impostor (5).

The debate turns crucially on the question whether anything deserving to be called an “account” or “theory” of truth ought to take the form of a genuine generalization (and ought to be able to account for genuine generalizations involving truth). Correspondence theorists tend to regard this as a (minimal) requirement. Deflationists argue that truth is a shallow (sometimes “logical”) notion—a notion that has no serious explanatory role to play: as such it does not require a full-fledged account, a real theory, that would have to take the form of a genuine generalization.

There is now a substantial body of literature on truth-deflationism in general and its relation to the correspondence theory in particular; the following is a small selection: Quine 1970, 1987; Devitt 1984; Field 1986; Horwich 1990 & 19982; Kirkham 1992; Gupta 1993; David 1994, 2008; Schmitt 1995; Künne 2003, chap. 4; Rami 2009. Relevant essays are contained in Blackburn and Simmons 1999; Schantz 2002; Armour-Garb and Beall 2005; and Wright and Pedersen 2010. See also the entry the deflationary theory of truth in this encyclopedia.

8.5 Truthmaker Theory

This approach centers on the truthmaker or truthmaking principle: Every truth has a truthmaker; or alternatively: For every truth there is something that makes it true. The principle is usually understood as an expression of a realist attitude, emphasizing the crucial contribution the world makes to the truth of a proposition. Advocates tend to treat truthmaker theory primarily as a guide to ontology, asking: To entities of what ontological categories are we committed as truthmakers of the propositions we accept as true? Most advocates maintain that propositions of different logical types can be made true by items from different ontological categories: e.g., propositions of some types are made true by facts, others just by individual things, others by events, others by tropes (cf., e.g. Armstrong 1997). This is claimed as a significant improvement over traditional correspondence theories which are understood—correctly in most but by no means all cases—to be committed to all truthmakers belonging to a single ontological category (albeit disagreeing about which category that is). All advocates of truthmaker theory maintain that the truthmaking relation is not one-one but many-many: some truths are made true by more than one truthmaker; some truthmakers make true more than one truth. This is also claimed as a significant improvement over traditional correspondence theories which are often portrayed as committed to correspondence being a one-one relation. This portrayal is only partly justified. While it is fairly easy to find real-life correspondence theorists committing themselves to the view that each truth corresponds to exactly one fact (at least by implication, talking about the corresponding fact), it is difficult to find real-life correspondence theorists committing themselves to the view that only one truth can correspond to a given fact (but see Moore 1910-11, p. 256).

A truthmaker theory may be presented as a competitor to the correspondence theory or as a version of the correspondence theory. This depends considerably on how narrowly or broadly one construes “correspondence theory”, i.e. on terminological issues. Some advocates would agree with Dummett (1959, p. 14) who said that, although “we have nowadays abandoned the correspondence theory of truth”, it nevertheless “expresses one important feature of the concept of truth…: that a statement is true only if there is something in the world in virtue of which it is true”. Other advocates would follow Armstrong who tends to present his truthmaker theory as a liberal form of correspondence theory; indeed, he seems committed to the view that the truth of a (contingent) elementary proposition consists in its correspondence with some (atomic) fact (cf. Armstrong 1997; 2004, pp. 22-3, 48-50).

It is not easy to find a substantive difference between truthmaker theory and various brands of the sort of modified correspondence theory treated above under the heading “Logical Atomism” (see Section 7.1). Logical atomists, such as Russell (1918) and Wittgenstein (1921), will hold that the truth or falsehood of every truth-value bearer can be explained in terms of (can be derived from) logical relations between truth-value bearers, by way of the recursive clauses, together with the base clauses, i.e., the correspondence and non-correspondence of elementary truth-value bearers with facts. This recursive strategy could be pursued with the aim to reject the truthmaker principle: not all truths have truthmakers, only elementary truths have truthmakers (here understood as corresponding atomic facts). But it could also be pursued—and this seems to have been Russell’s intention at the time—with the aim to secure the truthmaker principle, even though the simple correspondence definition has been abandoned: not every truth corresponds to a fact, only elementary truths do, but every truth has a truthmaker; where the recursive clauses are supposed to show how truthmaking without correspondence, but grounded in correspondence, comes about.

There is one straightforward difference between truthmaker theory and most correspondence theories. The latter are designed to answer the question “What is truth?”. Simple (unmodified) correspondence theories center on a biconditional, such as “x is true iff x corresponds to a fact”, intended to convey a definition of truth (at least a “real definition” which does not commit them to the claim that the term “true” is synonymous with “corresponds to a fact”—especially nowadays most correspondence theorists would consider such a claim to be implausibly and unnecessarily bold). Modified correspondence theories also aim at providing a definition of truth, though in their case the definition will be considerably more complex, owing to the recursive character of the account. Truthmaker theory, on the other hand, centers on the truthmaker principle: For every truth there is something that makes it true. Though this principle will deliver the biconditional “x is true iff something makes x true” (since “something makes x true” trivially implies “x is true”), this does not yield a promising candidate for a definition of truth: defining truth in terms of truthmaking would appear to be circular. Unlike most correspondence theories, truthmaker theory is not equipped, and usually not designed, to answer the question “What is truth?”—at least not if one expects the answer to take the form of a feasible candidate for a definition of truth.

There is a growing body of literature on truthmaker theory; see for example: Russell 1918; Mullligan, Simons, and Smith 1984; Fox 1987; Armstrong 1997, 2004; Merricks 2007; and the essays in Beebe and Dodd 2005; Monnoyer 2007; and in Lowe and Rami 2009. See also the entry on truthmakers in this encyclopedia.

9. More Objections to the Correspondence Theory

Two final objections to the correspondence theory deserve separate mention.

9.1 The Big Fact

Inspired by an allegedly similar argument of Frege’s, Davidson (1969) argues that the correspondence theory is bankrupt because it cannot avoid the consequence that all true sentences correspond to the same fact: the Big Fact. The argument is based on two crucial assumptions: (i) Logically equivalent sentences can be substituted salva veritate in the context ‘the fact that...’; and (ii) If two singular terms denoting the same thing can be substituted for each other in a given sentence salva veritate, they can still be so substituted if that sentence is embedded within the context ‘the fact that...’. In the version below, the relevant singular terms will be the following: ‘(the x such that x = Diogenes & p)’ and ‘(the x such that x = Diogenes & q)’. Now, assume that a given sentence, s, corresponds to the fact that p; and assume that ‘p’ and ‘q’ are sentences with the same truth-value. We have:

  • s corresponds to the fact that p

which, by (i), implies

  • s corresponds to the fact that [(the x such that x = Diogenes & p) = (the x such that x = Diogenes)],

which, by (ii), implies

  • s corresponds to the fact that [(the x such that x = Diogenes & q) = (the x such that x = Diogenes)],

which, by (i), implies

  • s corresponds to the fact that q.

Since the only restriction on ‘q’ was that it have the same truth-value as ‘p’, it would follow that any sentence s that corresponds to any fact corresponds to every fact; so that all true sentences correspond to the same facts, thereby proving the emptiness of the correspondence theory—the conclusion of the argument is taken as tantamount to the conclusion that every true sentence corresponds to the totality of all the facts, i.e, the Big Fact, i.e., the world as a whole.

This argument belongs to a type now called “slingshot arguments” (because a giant opponent is brought down by a single small weapon, allegedly). The first versions of this type of argument were given by Church (1943) and Gödel (1944); it was later adapted by Quine (1953, 1960) in his crusade against quantified modal logic. Davidson is offering yet another adaption, this time involving the expression “corresponds to the fact that”. The argument has been criticized repeatedly. Critics point to the two questionable assumptions on which it relies, (i) and (ii). It is far from obvious why a correspondence theorist should be tempted by either one of them. Opposition to assumption (i) rests on the view that expressibility by logically equivalent sentences may be a necessary, but is not a sufficient condition for fact identity. Opposition to assumption (ii) rests on the observation that the (alleged) singular terms used in the argument are definite descriptions: their status as genuine singular terms is in doubt, and it is well-known that they behave rather differently than proper names for which assumption (ii) is probably valid (cf. Follesdal 1966/2004; Olson 1987; Künne 2003; and especially the extended discussion and criticism in Neale 2001.)

9.2 No Independent Access to Reality

The objection that may well have been the most effective in causing discontent with the correspondence theory is based on an epistemological concern. In a nutshell, the objection is that a correspondence theory of truth must inevitably lead into skepticism about the external world, because the required correspondence between our thoughts and reality is not ascertainable. Ever since Berkeley’s attack on the representational theory of the mind, objections of this sort have enjoyed considerable popularity. It is typically pointed out that we cannot step outside our own minds to compare our thoughts with mind-independent reality. Yet—so the objection continues—on the correspondence theory of truth, this is precisely what we would have to do to gain knowledge. We would have to access reality as it is in itself, independently of our cognition, and determine whether our thoughts correspond to it. Since this is impossible, since all our access to the world is mediated by our cognition, the correspondence theory makes knowledge impossible (cf. Kant 1800, intro vii). Assuming that the resulting skepticism is unacceptable, the correspondence theory has to be rejected, and some other account of truth, an epistemic (anti-realist) account of some sort, has to be put in its place (cf., e.g., Blanshard 1941.)

This type of objection brings up a host of issues in epistemology, the philosophy of mind, and general metaphysics. All that can be done here is to hint at a few pertinent points (cf. Searle 1995, chap. 7; David 2004, 6.7). The objection makes use of the following line of reasoning: “If truth is correspondence, then, since knowledge requires truth, we have to know that our beliefs correspond to reality, if we are to know anything about reality”. There are two assumptions implicit in this line of reasoning, both of them debatable.

(i) It is assumed that S knows x, only if S knows that x is true—a requirement not underwritten by standard definitions of knowledge, which tell us that S knows x, only if x is true and S is justified in believing x. The assumption may rest on confusing requirements for knowing x with requirements for knowing that one knows x.

(ii) It is assumed that, if truth = F, then S knows that x is true, only if S knows that x has F. This is highly implausible. By the same standard it would follow that no one who does not know that water is H2O can know that the Nile contains water—which would mean, of course, that until fairly recently nobody knew that the Nile contained water (and that, until fairly recently, nobody knew that there were stars in the sky, whales in the sea, or that the sun gives light). Moreover, even if one does know that water is H2O, one’s strategy for finding out whether the liquid in one’s glass is water does not have to involve chemical analysis: one could simply taste it, or ask a reliable informant. Similarly, as far as knowing that x is true is concerned, the correspondence theory does not entail that we have to know that a belief corresponds to a fact in order to know that it is true, or that our method of finding out whether a belief is true has to involve a strategy of actually comparing a belief with a fact—although the theory does of course entail that one obtains knowledge only if one obtains a belief that corresponds to a fact.

More generally, one might question whether the objection still has much bite once the metaphors of “accessing” and “comparing” are spelled out with more attention to the psychological details of belief formation and to epistemological issues concerning the conditions under which beliefs are justified or warranted. For example, it is quite unclear how the metaphor of “comparing” applies to knowledge gained through perceptual belief-formation. A perceptual belief that p may be true, and by having acquired that belief, one may have come to know that p, without having “compared” (the content of) one’s belief with anything.

One might also wonder whether its competitors actually enjoy any significant advantage over the correspondence theory, once they are held to the standards set up by this sort of objection. For example, why should it be easier to find out whether one particular belief coheres with all of one’s other beliefs than it is to find out whether a belief corresponds with a fact?

In one form or other, the “No independent access to reality”-objection against correspondence theoretic approaches has been one of the, if not the, main source and motivation for idealist and anti-realist stances in philosophy (cf. Stove 1991). However, the connection between correspondence theories of truth and the metaphysical realism vs. anti-realism (or idealism) debate is less immediate than is often assumed. On the one hand, deflationists and identity theorists can be, and typically are, metaphysical realists while rejecting the correspondence theory. On the other hand, advocates of a correspondence theory can, in principle, be metaphysical idealists (e.g. McTaggart 1921) or anti-realists, for one might advocate a correspondence theory while maintaining, at the same time, (a) that all facts are constituted by mind or (b) that what facts there are depends somehow on what we believe or are capable of believing, or (c) that the correspondence relation between true propositions and facts depends somehow on what we believe or are capable of believing (claiming that the correspondence relation between true beliefs or true sentences and facts depends on what we believe can hardly count as a commitment to anti-realism). Keeping this point in mind, one can nevertheless acknowledge that advocacy of a correspondence theory of truth comes much more naturally when combined with a metaphysically realist stance and usually signals commitment to such a stance.


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