Notes to Kant’s Philosophical Development

1. Western philosophy after the middle ages can be divided into four periods: the Renaissance, the Enlightenment or modern philosophy, 19th Century philosophy, and 20th Century/ the contemporary period. While determining the boundaries of the periods is a matter of debate, one could say that the Renaissance ended in the early 1600s; that the Enlightenment or modernity lasted from the late 1600s to the late 1700s; and that 19th Century philosophy began with Kant’s critique of rational theology and metaphysics, while 20th Century philosophy begins with the inception of positivism and the Vienna circle. Many of the philosophical questions in the modern period are eclipsed by Kant’s critique and much of 19th and 20th Century philosophy responds to the shift in philosophical paradigm we find in Kant’s works.

2. The discovery of Kant’s ambivalence towards Christianity (documented during Kant’s lifetime) is due to the efforts of Manfred Kuehn, University of Marburg. Kant’s first biographers were L.E. Borowski, R.B. Jachmann, and E.A.C. Wasianski. Their accounts appeared in Königsberg, in the year of Kant’s death (12 Feb. 1804). As the three writers knew their subject personally—Borowski had been his frequent guest; Jachmann had been his research assistant; and Wasianski had been his assistant and executor of will—their portraits were accepted as authoritative. All three had degrees in theology; Jachmann held church services, Wasianski was a deacon, and Borowski was a church administrator. They stressed the importance of Pietism for Kant and presented their subject as a good Christian. This distortion was partly due to an innocent projection of the biographers’ preferences, but to some extent, it was also a systematic effort at spinning the facts, especially in the case of Borowski. Borowski worried that his association with Kant would harm his career and tried to preempt critics, for Kant’s scorn for fundamentalists (Schwärmer) was notorious, and his influence was blamed for the empty churches in town. Kant was cool towards Christianity and did not support its doctrines. For the distortions of Kant’s relation to Christianity, see Kuehn 2001: 2–16. For Kant’s contempt for organized religion, disbelief in an afterlife, and rejection of a monotheistic God, see ibid.: 45–55, 328, 369–78, 382, and 392.

3. See the relevant articles in Schönfeld 2006c, especially by Wenchao Li/Hans Poser, Thomas Fuchs, Gregory Reihman, and Martin Schönfeld.

4. Kant’s work spans over half a century, from 1745 to 1801. The pre-critical period ends with the Inaugural Dissertation (1770); the critical period begins with the Critique of Pure Reason (1781). In old age, with the Strife of Faculties (1798) and the Opus Postumum (mainly written 1799–1801), he advanced claims seemingly at odds with the critical restrictions espoused earlier; hence the term “post-critical period”.

5. One critical oddity is Kant’s contention that space is a force field (a “plenum” instead of a void). The early Kant claims that force created space by stretching itself out as a continuum. The late Kant claims that cognitive tools that organize experience are aspects of an energetic, material, and interactive fabric. This energy-field sustains consciousness and cognition—energetic space is the ultimate condition of experience. Even the Critique of Pure Reason contains suggestions of this sort, but there they conflict with the cautious tenor of the work (such that cognitive conditions are formal, not physical, or that the underlying fabric, the thing in itself, is inaccessible). For the early claims, cf. Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces, #1–10 (1:17–25). For the late claims, cf. the Opus Postumum-material, especially Reflexion 3986 (17:376–7), Oktaventwurf (21:378–9, 383); Transition 1–14 (21:219, 223–4, 226–30, 233, 247, 535, 539, 547–8, 564–5, 588–9, 592); Fascicle 11 (22:425–31, 440, 457); compare also Fascicle 1 (21:87.29–31 and 21:101.5–12). For the “plenum-proof” in the first Critique, cf. A211/B256–A214/B261; for an informative analysis, compare Edwards 2000: 13–47, esp. 38–40. For an interpretation of this ontological oddity in its cross-cultural context, compare Edwards & Schönfeld 2006.

6. For Kant’s views in the critical and late works, see the following entries: Kant’s critique of metaphysics, Kant’s transcendental arguments, Kant’s views on space and time.

7. Harmut and Gernot Böhme have argued elsewhere that Kant was deeply marked psychologically by the death of his mother. Their psychoanalytic reading argues that the deeper impact of this event provides reported explanation for Kant’s view of morality as freedom from emotional affectation.

8. Budde rejected in his Elementa philosophiae theoreticae (“Elements of Theoretical Philosophy”) the Copernican heliocentric model because it does not harmonize with the Scripture (IV.1). The Elementa was published in 1703—more than a century after Copernicus’s De Revolutionibus (1543) and two generations after Galileo’s Two World Systems (1632). Lange deplored in his Medicina Mentis (1704; “Medicine of the Mind”) that the disease at the root of Adam’s fall is intellect (part I, chapter 1); its cure depends on prayer and catechetical tenets (I.2, II.2–8). Logic, ontology, and natural philosophy are threats (I.3, V.7); science, as a secular enterprise, produces heresies and lies (V.5). Rüdiger argued in De sensu veri et falsi (1722; On the Meaning of Truth and Falsehood”) that the mathematics only concerns what is possible and cannot be applied to reality, thus rejecting quantifications of natural phenomena (II 4:3). Crusius insisted in Anleitung über natürliche Begebenheiten ordentlich und vorsichtig nachzudenken (1749; “Instructions on Thinking Orderly and Carefully about Natural Events”) that a physics that quantifies empirical data is misguided (p. 508) and rejected Newton’s physics as a meaningful model of nature (ibid.: 536).

9. One such activity Kant strictly avoided was the Pantoffalparade, whereby university students would line the exits of churches to critically examine departing young women (Kuehn 2001a: 63).

10.Nihil magis praestandum est, quam ne pecorum ritu sequamur antecedentium gregem, pergentes, non qua eundum est, sed qua itur”. See Seneca, De vita beata, chapter 1. Compare Living Forces 1:7.2–3.

11. Using the term “mass” here is somewhat anachronistic. Descartes spoke of “quantity of matter” (quantité de la matière), which he identified mostly with size and occasionally with weight. Leibniz talked about “magnitude of the body” (magnitude corporis), which he identified mostly with weight and occasionally with size. Newton introduced the concept of “mass” in De Motu (1684; hypothesis 2) and explicated it in the Principia (1686; first law). Mass is the measure of the amount of matter that determines a body’s resistance to acceleration by an applied force. Newton’s assumption that mass is constant works for local situations and speeds. A general definition of mass requires Einstein’s correction that mass will increase at (very high) velocities.

12. The principle of the conservation of momentum and energy results from the convertibility of mass and energy. It applies to masses moving in spacetime and is visible in collisions. Momentum and energy, or more precisely, their combination, are the joint measure of mass. Momentum-energy is proportional to mass; it is a vector quantity (it depends on direction); and its arrow points in the same direction as the world line of the object in spacetime. When masses collide, their momentum and energy differ before and after impact, but their sum remains equal. Momentum-energy is fundamental: its conservation governs every collision in the universe, and it is also frame-invariant, remaining the same regardless of the chosen frame of reference.

13. Briefly, Einstein’s first great insight (1905) is that spacetime tells mass how to move, while mass tells spacetime how to curve (Wheeler 1990: 12). That is, force and space mutually determine each other—“force” understood as momentum-energy (the measure of mass, and spacetime’s grip on mass), and “space” understood as spacetime (the four-dimensional continuum). Consider the planets on their orbits around the Sun. While Newton assumed that gravitational forces act over spatial distances to hold Sun and planets in mutual grip, Einstein realized that gravitational forces form a field that locally curves space, primarily around the Sun, such that planets move along the spatial curvature, tracing out orbits. Hence (to quote Wheeler again, ibid.: 11–13) mass grips spacetime, telling it how to curve; spacetime grips spacetime, transmitting curvature from near to far; and spacetime grips mass, telling it how to move. Force and space are not independent absolutes, as Newton had stipulated. Instead, and as Einstein discovered, both are relative to one another (hence “special theory of relativity” as label for the explication of this idea). Kant realized that force acts by Ausbreitung—“out-broadening” or radiation, and that the resulting space has Ausdehnung—“out-stretching” or extension/expansion. As radiation determines extension (by structuring space), extension determines radiation (by an inverse-square law). In this sense, by recognizing that radiation and extension hang together, that neither force nor space stand alone, Kant bypassed Newton and caught up with Einstein.

14. Kant writes (1:24.19–23):

Accordingly I am of the opinion that substances in the existing world, of which we are a part, have essential forces of such a kind that they propagate their effects in union with each other according to the inverse-square relation of the distances.

15. Johannes Kepler formulated the inverse-square law in the Astronomia pars optica (1604). Kepler showed that the intensity of light decreases with the square of the distance (prop. 9); cf. Werke 2:22. He characterized light as the primordial living force, cf. chap. 1 (sec. “Lucis encomium”), Werke 2:19. He suspected the identity of the radiation of light and gravity, and applied the inverse-square law to gravitation; cf. letter to David Fabricius (11 Oct. 1605), Werke 15:241, and Astronomia nova (1609), introduction (sec. “Vera doctrina de gravitate”), Werke 3:25. Newton tied the inverse-square to Kepler’s planetary laws (1684) and derived it for gravity (1687).

16. Bilfinger was known for a work on Confucianism (1724), a quasi-Taoist commentary on Wolff’s German Metaphysics (1725), and a tract on force (1728). Wolff’s speech on the Chinese (1721)—a watershed event in the Enlightenment—had motivated him, then at Tübingen, to study these provocative pagans (in 1726 Wolff would cite Bilfinger when preparing his speech for print). In Taoist ontology, the dynamic principle (Tao) weaves the world by “stretching out” the void (dao zhong) and that produces things and life by individuating the resulting field into lingering wholes. Nature and the good are opposites but harmonize in their parallel thrust toward sustainable complexity. Moral practice is their alignment. Bilfinger stressed the significance of this thrust, in the guise of Aristotle’s possibilitas or dynamis, in his Wolffian commentary. The theologians at Tübingen were upset, and Bilfinger lost his job. He joined Daniel Bernoulli (1700–82) at the Russian Academy to study dynamics—and the resulting tract on force inspired Kant in not-too-distant Königsberg two decades later. Bilfinger’s book on Chinese philosophy is Specimen doctrinae veterum Sinarum moralis et politicae (1724; “Specimen of the Moral and Political Teachings of the Ancient Chinese”); his commentary on Wolff’s German Metaphysics (1719) is Dilucidationes philosophicae de Deo, anima humana, mundo et generalibus rerum affectionibus (1725, “Philosophical Dilucidations of God, the Human Soul, the Word, and the General Impressions of Things”); and his treatise on force is De viribus corpori moto insitis et illarum mensura, (w. 1725–6, p. 1728; “On the Essential Forces of Bodily Motion and their Measure”). He states his heuristic rule in De viribus #16. In his study of Chinese thought, Bilfinger was taken by the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong). This Confucian classic strikes a bridge to Taoism (whose chief text, the Tao Te Ching, would arrive in the West later). The Doctrine of the Mean describes nature as a web of force-points and humans as nodes in the web. It begins with,

what cosmos imparts to humans is called vitality; following vitality is called the Way; and cultivating the Way is called education

cf. Zhongyong Jiyi (Taibei: Sangyang 1985), 2 (my trans.). The text had been printed twice; Wolff knew the work in Noël’s translation (Immutabile medium, 1711), and Bilfinger in Couplet’s earlier version (Medium sempiternum, 1687). In the Specimen, Bilfinger explains that vitality and Tao are aspects of a unified idea constitutive of creation and good, and refers to his idea as “light of reason” (lumen rationis; #41, margin). See Schönfeldb. Kant was ignorant of the Chinese but absorbed the Taoist motif. The middle way is not a lukewarm compromise but a dialectical harmony of opposites in a golden mean. Bilfinger’s transmission of the Tao involved a Western spin: while Taoism stresses the paradoxical essence of nature, the Jesuit translators of Tao as “light of nature” (lumen naturalis) and “rational nature” (natura rationalis) had read it to mean that nature is consistent and rational—which is, of course, a premise of scientific research. Kant says that he put Bilfinger’s rule to good use (#20; 1:32), and he certainly did—it led him to reconcile momentum and energy, force and space, field and void, mind and matter, and God and nature. It was Kant’s universal rule, guiding him at the time. It is an irony that one of the West’s greatest thinkers was first inspired by the Tao of the East.

17. Kepler, in Harmonice Mundi, composed melodies for planets, which allowed him to discover the Harmonic Law—the square of the periodic times are to each other as the cubes of the mean distance. The Harmonic Law is Kepler’s third planetary law; it concerns the relation of planetary orbits and solar distances, such that the squares of the periodical times t of the planets in their orbits around the Sun are to one another as the cubes of their distances r from the sun, or t2 = r3.

18. See Universal Natural History, 1:264–6 for the general structural-dynamic formation of the cosmos, 231.18–209 for star motions, 250.5–24 for galactic formation, 255.24–6 for analogous formation of distant galaxies; 250.34–6 for analogous formation of planetary systems; and 256.11–14 for the galactic field. Kant’s nebular hypothesis of star and galaxy formation was proposed once more, in a slightly different version, by P.S. de Laplace (1796), and was confirmed by C.F.v. Weizsäcker and J.G. Kuiper (1944). The discovery that the “foggy stars” (neblichte Sterne) are star clusters and galaxies is sometimes credited to T. Wright (1750). But as various commentators pointed out, the credit goes to Kant, not Wright. Wright states the idea as a conjecture; Kant integrated it in the correct Newtonian framework. Kant’s galactic hypothesis was reformulated by H. Curtis and confirmed by E. Hubble (1921).

19. For final causes and divine design, cf. the “Scholium Generale” in Newton 1972 [1726]: 2:760–3. For the loss of motion as a general feature of nature, cf. “Query 31” in Newton 1979 [1730]: 399–400. For the need of God to sustain nature, see the letter to Richard Bentley (25 February 1693), in which Newton argues: “this frame of things could not always subsist without a divine power to conserve it”; cf. Newton 1953: 56.

20. See Alexander Pope, An Essay on Man (written 1730–32, printed 1733–4) cf. Epistle VII 1–45.

21. See Christian Wolff, Deutsche Teleologie (1723) #2, 8, 47. William Derham’s Physikotheologie (1714) and Bernhard Niewentyt’s Het regt gebruik der Werelt geschowingen (1715) inspired Wolff. For the views of the physico-theologians, cf. Schönfeld 2000: 96–106.

22. See Bernard le Boyer de Fontenelle, Entretiens sur la pluralité des mondes habités (1686), especially “3ieme soir”, in Oeuvres 2:70. Fontenelle’s Entretiens was a best-selling introduction to astronomy in its day, inspired by Copernicus, Kepler, and others.

23. Kant’s identity as the author was discovered within a year. The classified ads of the local Wöchentlichen Frag- und Anzeigungs-Nachrichten (1 May 1756) contained the note: “Book printer Driest sells: Magister Kant’s Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens”. See Rahts 1902: 545. For details on the Universal Natural History, see Schönfeld 2000: 88–127 and 264–74.

24. If one wanted to visualize this fluidly rising energy, then Kant’s precursor Kepler would propose the use of light. It is as hot as it gets when focused to a point, and it radiantly pulses upward toward complexity. Its shine flares out material dust, floods of particles, like streamers of smoke. Since it impels the dust as their vector, the blaze illuminates the particles. A suggestive image by Albrecht Altdorfer (1480–1538) is the sun at the fiery bottom of a tunnel of clouds, fleeing the slaughter of the East, on the canvas Alexanderschlacht (“Alexander’s Battle,” 1529). See Johannes Kepler, Astronomia pars optica (1604: chap. 1), “De natura lucis,” Werke 2:18–45, especially the section “Lucis encomium,” Werke 2:18–20. See also Alexanderschlacht—Albrecht Altdorfer.

25. This very observation will have a significant impact on German Idealism as it develops after Kant’s body of work. See J.G. Fichte Wissenschaflehre (I, 420; I, 93; I, 109), also F.W.J. Schelling System of Transcendental Idealism (1800: 378–381).

26. Kant’s argument is as follows: something is possible only if it is thinkable; something is thinkable only if data are present to the mind; data can be present to the mind only if the complete set of thinkable data already exists; therefore something is possible only if something exists. Because negation of possibility is impossible, what is presupposed as existing must exist necessarily. Kant shows in summary form (2:84–9) that the complete set of thinkable data is the complete set of all positive properties, which is unified as a set, and divine in virtue of its completeness. For details, see Schönfeld 2000: 183–208 and 288–97.

Copyright © 2019 by
Martin Schönfeld
Michael Thompson <>

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