Latinx Philosophy

First published Thu Dec 13, 2018

Latinx philosophy is philosophical work substantively concerned with Latinxs, including the moral, social, political, epistemic, and linguistic significance of Latinxs and their experiences.[1] Although its emergence as a distinctive, self-identified field is relatively recent, Latinx philosophy includes a substantial body of work that draws from a variety of philosophical traditions, including critical race theory, Latina feminist philosophy, Latinx and Chicanx Studies, various strands of Latin American, Continental, analytic, Caribbean, and Africana philosophy.

This entry focuses on the nature, history, and recent developments of Latinx philosophy in the United States. It discusses current work in Latinx philosophy, the various origins of Latinx philosophy, disputes about the nature and scope of the field, and ongoing developments.

1. Current Issues

Current work on Latinx philosophy tends to cluster into several subject matters: (1) accounts of group identity, including accounts of the phenomenology and senses of self in Latinxs; (2) broadly social and political questions about Latinxs, with a special eye towards citizenship and immigration issues; and (3) a range of metaphilosophical issues, including efforts to identify or expand the canon of Latinx philosophy, and efforts to speak to various concerns about the status of Latinxs in the profession of philosophy.

1.1 Group Identity

A recurring issue within Latinx philosophy is the characterization of Latinxs. US and Latin American social identity categories are oftentimes distinct, and products of different racial and social categories. Latinx is a term used exclusively within the United States, or nearly so, such that people from Latin America would not ordinarily think of themselves as Latinxs, unless or until they reside in the United States. Within the United States, the social category has had various labels, including “Hispanic”, “Latino”, “Latina/o”, “Latin@”. The adoption of particular labels has served varied roles in response to interests in self-identification, coalition building, marketing pressures, and government bureaucratic interests (Alcoff 1999; Gracia 2000).

In the first decade of the twenty-first century philosophers began to offer systematic accounts of the social category of Hispanics or Latinxs, the way the category functions as an identity category, and how Latinxs fit in (or don’t) within the racial and ethnic matrix of the United States. Three approaches emerged: an ethnoracial account, a cultural ethnic group account, and a familial-historical view.

Linda Alcoff (2000) has maintained that Latinxs are best understood as an ethnoracial group—i.e., a group whose identity in some contexts functions as a racial group, and in others as an ethnic group. As a group, Latinxs do not neatly fit within US racial and ethnic matrix, she has argued (Alcoff 1999, 2000, 2003, 2006). The racial diversity of peoples descended from Latin America, which span the full set of standard US racial categories, make Latinxs an unstable category in US social identity categories. Thus, how the term “Latinx” works in ordinary discourse—and its significance in lived experience—tends to vary in light of the interaction of locally predominant Latinx group (i.e., Mexicans, Dominicans, Cubans, etc.), with US racial categories. The only way to do justice to this complexity, she thinks, is to recognize Latinxs as occupying a hybrid social category, i.e., an ethnorace.

On J. Angelo Corlett’s (2003) account, Latinxs constitute an ethnic group unified by broadly cultural features, including such features as language competence in a “Latino” language, possession of a traditional “Latino” last name, self-recognition, and in- and out-group recognition. However, for public policy purposes, Corlett maintains that to be Latinx is a matter of genealogy or descent from certain Latin American groups. On this approach, in public policy contexts the category Latinx functions in a manner more typical of a racial group, and not like a group unified historically contingent cultural practices (cf. Blum 2009).

In contrast to the cultural ethnic group account, Jorge Gracia’s familial-historical view grounds ethnic group membership in historical ties, such that members of the group need not share any other features, cultural or otherwise (2008). Apart from the very general constraint of a suitable historical tie to the post-1492 events involving the Iberian Peninsula and the Americas, Latinxs in one time and place can have some characteristics in common that are lacked by Latinxs in another time and place.[2] Depending on the local norms that configure contingent (and often scalar) understandings of group membership, one can be Latinx without speaking Spanish or Portuguese, without partaking in various cultural practices associated with the identity, and so on. Gracia thus rejects both the cultural continuity account and the public policy genealogical account emphasized by Corlett.

Beyond attempts to characterize the category of Latinx, and efforts to identify how it does (or should) operate in discourse, philosophers have also considered the distinctive challenges and puzzles of Latinx identity in the face of US social identity categories (e.g., Lugones 1987; Mendieta 1999; Schutte 2000; Alcoff 2000; see also Lewis forthcoming and Spencer 2018). One important strand of this literature—largely grounded in the reflections of Latina feminist philosophers—has focused on the idea that the condition of being Latinx (and, especially, Latina) has tended to produce distinct senses of self-identity that resists easy integration into a unified self (Lugones 1987, 1994; Schutte 2000; Barvosa 2008; Ortega 2016). These works frequently take up and explore particular forms of marginalization, as well as strategies of response to them in light of the varied but distinctive social positions of Latinxs.

1.2 Social and Political Philosophy

If the first decade of twenty-first century work on Latinx philosophy was dominated by questions of identity—in particular, of specifying the nature, experiences, and even preferred term for Latinxs—the second decade might best be characterized as involving the arrival of questions in political philosophy (including citizenship and immigration) and the development of a more pronounced metaphilosophical sensibility.

Writ large, a good deal of recent Latinx philosophy has centered on the consequences of demographic changes in the United States, and on reactions to them. Philosophers have argued that Latinxs constitute distinctive challenges for conventional understandings of social and political theory in the United States (Mendieta 2003; Gracia 2005; Alcoff 2006). In particular, the “browning” of America (Sundstrom 2008) and the implications of these demographic transformation for whiteness (Alcoff 2015; Mendoza 2017) have been subjects of important discussions.

This engagement with questions in political philosophy is not entirely new, of course. For example, there has been ongoing philosophical debate about the status of Latinxs with respect to affirmative action (Corlett 2003; Gracia 2008; McGary 2013; Gracia 2013). Within the recent expansion of work in political philosophy, however, two issues have emerged as particularly salient: citizenship and immigration ethics.

Citizenship, and its entanglement with race, has a long and complicated history within Latin America (Quijano 2000, von Vacano 2012). The same is true in the United States, where the boundaries of citizenship of oftentimes been carved with an eye towards the racial consequences of those boundaries (Silva 2015a). The upshot of these complex but distinct histories is that Latinx populations sometimes stand in systematically produced situations of unorthodox citizenship. For example, Puerto Ricans are US citizens, but those living on the island cannot vote in US presidential elections. The Tohono O’odham Nation, recognized by the US Bureau of Indian Affairs, is a tribal group divided by the US/Mexico border. Members born from those enrolled in the tribe on the US side are US citizens, even if they are born in Mexico and live with their fellow tribe members who are Mexican citizens (Luger 2018).

More generally, immigration rights, border politics, and the status of populations that move across national boundaries have been the subject of particularly sustained discussions within Latinx philosophy (Cisneros 2013; Mendoza 2016; Reed-Sandoval 2016a; Orosco 2016a). Mendoza (2016), for example, has argued that even if we suppose that nation states have some right to control their borders, it does not follow that immigration enforcement is permissible or ethically desirable. Reed-Sandoval (2016b) has argued that some populations within the larger web of immigration patterns (specific Oaxacan communities, in particular) have distinctive rights of migration, given their nature as a transborder community.

1.3 Metaphilosophical Issues

Beyond political philosophy, a number of philosophers have taken up questions about the relationship of Latinxs to the discipline of philosophy. One preoccupation concerns the relatively low numbers of Latinx philosophers in the US academy (Gracia 2000, 2008; R. Sanchez 2013). Others have written about whether Latinxs are subject to bias of some or another sort (Madva 2016). Several philosophers have argued that the particular cultural practices of the discipline of philosophy create special barriers for Latinxs (Gracia 2000: 159–188; C. Sánchez 2016, 135–140; see also essays in Yancy 2012).

A different family of broadly metaphilosophical endeavors has focused on the identification of conceptual continuities and historical ties between Latinxs, Latinx philosophy, and other philosophical movements. For example, Gregory Pappas (2011), Carlos Sánchez (2016: 93–112), and José-Antonio Orosco (2016a) have taken up the question of whether philosophical pragmatism is continuous with, useful for, or particularly representative of Latinx thought and culture.

Another notable interest for some philosophers working within Latinx philosophy has been the expansion of what figures are canonical for philosophy, and in particular, for Latinx philosophy, or more specifically, a Mexican American philosophy. Orosco (2016b) has argued that important figures in the Chicano Civil Rights movement—Cesar Chavez and Armando Rendon, among others—ought to count as philosophers. In a different direction, Carlos Sánchez’s work in the history of Mexican philosophy—including translations and discussions of Mexican existentialism (2012, 2016)—has been animated by the goal of expanding the philosophical canon in ways that might helpfully speak to contemporary Mexican American people and their circumstances (see the introduction and conclusion of Sanchez 2016).

Surveying the state of contemporary work in Latinx philosophy suggests an initial taxonomy of the field. First, there is a distinct set of questions about who is Latinx, the nature of the category, and whether it makes sense to speak of there being any interesting unity to the category. We can characterize this first set of issues as categorical or identitarian.

Second, as we have seen, there is a set of relatively “first order” or substantive philosophical questions within Latinx philosophy. These include questions about racialization of citizenship; the ethics of immigration; matters in political and social philosophy that impinge upon and that are structured by Latinxs; the peculiar features of transnational identities for some Latinx groups; the nature of intersectionality in the Latinx case; epistemic injustice concerning Latinxs; social, moral, and political questions about, for example, the role of Latinxs within the academic discipline of philosophy.

Third, there are questions about whether a Latinx philosophy essentially involves—or ought to involve—aspirations for liberation, whether Latinx philosophy is ultimately a form of identity politics, whether it makes sense to talk of ethnic philosophies at all, and even questions about what sort of work regarding Latinxs (scholarly or otherwise) properly counts as philosophy. Call these metaphilosophical questions about Latinx philosophy.

Roughly, categorical questions (the first cluster) concern how we ought to understand the Latinx part of Latinx philosophy. Metaphilosophical questions (the third cluster) concern how we ought to under the philosophy part of Latinx philosophy.[3] Together, the presumptions one has about these questions structure a good deal of the shape of what constitutes substantive Latinx philosophy. Some of these issues are canvassed in §§3–4.

2. Origins

Accounting for the origins of Latinx philosophy is a difficult business, both because of the messy, slowly-emerging nature of academic fields and because of special puzzles about how to characterize the field (see §3, below). Philosophers have only recently begun to speak of Latinx philosophy (and/or Latino and Latina/o philosophy) (Gracia 2008; Mendieta 2011; R. Sánchez 2013; Llorente 2013; Millán & Deere 2017). However, prior to the currency of the term, philosophers were already doing philosophical work that recognizably constituted Latinx philosophy, i.e., philosophy concerned with Latinxs.

Although a wider and more detailed history is still waiting to be told, what follows is a provisional and partial reconstruction of several intertwined origins of Latinx philosophy. This account focuses on four sources of contemporary Latinx philosophy: the Chicano movement, the history of Latin American philosophy, Latina feminism, and recent efforts at philosophy that is explicitly conceived of as Latinx philosophy.

2.1 Chicano Thought

One way to reconstruct the origins of Latinx philosophy goes through the history of the Chicano movement.[4] The Chicano movement was never any one thing, but in broad brushstrokes, it tended to be distinguished by a kind of cultural nationalism that identified a people—a Chicano raza—with a homeland—Aztlán—while also emphasizing an imperative of liberation for those people and, sometimes, for that land (I. Garcia 2015). If we think of early Chicano thought as a species of Latinx philosophy, then early Chicano thought is a natural candidate for one origin of Latinx philosophy.

Important articulations of the movement’s aspirations—including El plan espiritual de Aztlán—employed concepts borrowed from twentieth century Mexican philosophy. Prominently among these was José Vasconcelos’ La raza cósmica. In the prologue to La raza cósmica, Vasconcelos claimed that Latin America had the opportunity to be the future birthplace of a new and final race that would integrate the best cultural features from the rest of the world. The work’s emphasis on seeing humankind as divided by race, its articulation of a glorious indigenous past in the Americas, its assertion that the age of the White race was coming to an end, and its prophetic tone of racial uplift rooted in the peoples of Latin America provided a ready framework for articulating some of the Chicano movement’s early aspirations (cf. Romano 1969).

There is some evidence that syllabi of the period included work by the Mexican philosopher Samuel Ramos, and by Patrick Romanell, an important English-language discussant of Mexican philosophy (Soldatenko 1996).[5] Moreover, Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset’s perspectivism—roughly, the idea that knowledge is perspectival, and frequently structured by features of culture, time, and place—may have filtered into the self-understanding of parts of the movement, in part because of his putative influence on Mexican figures, the availability of translations of his work, and some discussion of him in the work of Octavio Paz. Nevertheless, systematic attempts to pursue anything like a Chicanx philosophy in a form that might be recognized as academic philosophy was rare. In general, the Chicano movement was not marked by frequent or sustained attempts to elaborate an explicit theoretical foundation in philosophical terms (I. Garcia 2015).

Nevertheless, there were some attempts at doing philosophy in a distinctively Chicano vein. Perhaps the most notable example was Elihu Carranza’s Chicanismo: Philosophical Fragments (1978). It is an unusual text. It owes its structure and sensibility in part to Kierkegaard’s Philosophical Fragments, and each of the main chapters has a pseudonymous author. At the same time, its concern and motivations openly draw from Mexican philosopher Samuel Ramos’ critical investigation into a supposedly shared “Mexican” psychological profile. In Carranza’s case, Chicanxs (and Chicano Studies) are the subject.[6]

Despite some threads of influence from Mexican philosophy (for an overview, see Soldatenko 1996), philosophical work on Chicanxs (and Latinxs more generally) seems to have been limited to work by those outside the discipline of philosophy, at least until the later renaissance of Latina feminist philosophy. Moreover, the nature of early Chicanx thought presents an ambiguous case for the origins of a Latinx philosophy.

First, especially in the early period of the Chicano Movement there was comparatively little systematic concern for articulating a theoretical framework that encompassed Latinos more generally. Second, a good deal of the symbolic framework of the movement did not readily generalize to other groups of Latinxs. For example, the mestizo racial narrative has proven to be problematic in a variety of ways and it does not readily extend to all Latinx groups (cf. Velazco y Trianosky 2009; Gallegos forthcoming). Moreover, documents like the Treaty of Guadalupe, and the appeal to an indigenous—especially Aztec—past, cannot be used in the same way to anchor a shared identity with other Latinx groups (or even those groups of Mexican-descended people who cannot trace their ancestry to the Aztecs). Third, it would be something of a cold irony for one strand of the cultural-nationalist (and sometimes separatist wing) of the Chicano movement to be thought of as having constituted the origins of a broader, pan-Latinx intellectual project. Those strands of the Chicano movement were often animated by a resistance to anything that failed to recognize the cultural specificity of Chicanxs. On such views, acceptance of a Latinx identity necessarily entails a risk of cultural dissociation from the specifically Mexican roots of Chicanx identity, and brings with it an impermissible homogenization via a pan-Latinx category.[7] For that reason, it would sound strange to some activists and theorists to frame Chicanx thought as an early exemplar of Latinx philosophy.

Still, if one did think it plausible that Chicanx thought was an origin for Latinx philosophy, it might seem natural to find the origin of Latinx philosophy still further back in Latin American philosophy. Indeed, there is a case to be made for that more distal origin.

2.2 Latin American Precursors

Philosophy within Latin America was, for many centuries, undertaken with a sense of its general continuity with European philosophy. However, by the second half of the nineteenth century a number of prominent thinkers in Latin America began to speak of the possibility or need of a distinctively Latin American philosophy (Magallón 1991: 212; Gracia 1995: 462). In his “Ideas for a Course in Philosophy” [“Ideas para un curso de filosofía contemporánea”] Argentinian Juan Alberdi (1812–1884) called for the creation of national philosophies in Latin America. The idea was that these philosophical theories were to be responses to local social and political circumstances, expressing “the most vital and highest needs of these countries” (1842 [1978: 14] translation by entry author). Similarly, Andrés Bello (1848) and Francisco Bilbao (1856) called for philosophical work to be responsive to national and broadly Latin American circumstances, and to separate itself from mere imitation of European thought.

It is unclear how influential any of these proposals were (Nuccetelli 2017: §2.2.3), and whether they were really understood as calls for radical originality in Latin American thought, as opposed to invitations to be more attentive to local circumstances when deploying philosophical proposals that largely originated elsewhere. Still, these gestures came to be regarded as early canonical statements of the need for an autochthonous Latin American philosophy.

Proposals to develop an autochthonous Latin American philosophy figured prominently in the early to mid-twentieth century philosophical scene of Mexico, subsequently spreading to other parts of Latin America. The concerns for a distinctively Mexican and Latin American philosophy figured in the work of José Gaos, Leopoldo Zea, Emilio Uranga, and Octavio Paz. In their concern for the particular circumstances of Mexico (and less frequently, Latin America), this work extended threads already present in earlier work, e.g., that of José Vasconcelos, Samuel Ramos, and Ortega y Gasset. However, mid-twentieth century concerns for articulating features of a putatively Mexican circumstance, and subsequent efforts by Zea to articulate a broadly pan-Latin American philosophical picture, ultimately gave rise to several generations of critical reactions concerning the proper nature and aspirations of philosophy in Latin America (for discussion, see Nuccetelli 2017; Gracia & Vargas 2018).

As we saw in the prior section, invocations of Latin American philosophers sometimes played a role in the articulation of the ideological aspirations of the Chicano movement. So, it is tempting to read at least some early efforts at a Latinx philosophy as inheritors of a prior Latin American tradition of efforts at a self-consciously autochthonous body of philosophical work.[8] This narrative is not unproblematic, however. It is unclear how systematic and serious the philosophical influence of Mexican philosophy was on the Chicano movement. It was sporadically present, to be sure, and there were various attempts to appeal to Mexican philosophers as antecedents or intellectual forerunners of the movement. Nonetheless, apart from providing a sense of intellectual forerunners and a license for advocating for curricular changes, there is only sporadic evidence of efforts at engagement with that work in a way continuous with Mexican and US academic philosophy.

What makes those tenuous connections to Latin American philosophy somewhat more intriguing as an origin story for Latinx philosophy is that the mainstream of current work in Latinx philosophy reflects at least some familiarity with the history of Latin American philosophy (cf. R. Sánchez 2013; Millán & Deere 2017). Beyond familiarity with the history of Latin American philosophy, there is also a variety of more recent strands of influence from Latin American philosophy of liberation, postcolonial, and decolonial philosophy into the work of several Latinx philosophers (e.g., those in Alcoff & Mendieta 2000, also, Maldonado-Torres 2008, Lugones 2010, Silva 2015b, Ruíz 2016).[9] So, even if early strands of Latinx philosophy were not intellectually connected to impulses for an autochthonous Latin American philosophy, or otherwise systematic engagements with themes and concerns in Latin American philosophy, later strands clearly came to have those connections.[10] For this reason, is not entirely unreasonable to locate the origin of at least some important forms of Latinx philosophy in impulses to autochthonous philosophy within Latin American philosophy.

2.3 Latina Feminism

Richard Bernstein once declared the following:

Let me be fully explicit. I am not questioning that there is Hispanic philosophy or Latin American philosophy, or even that some Hispanic Americans in the United States are concerned with their history and traditions. I am questioning whether there now exists something that we can identify as Hispanic American philosophy. (2001: 50)

At the time, such skepticism was plausibly the standard view among those who entertained the question of whether Latinx or Hispanic American philosophy existed. However, there is a compelling case to be made that such a philosophy already existed when Bernstein wrote those words, albeit pursued under another name. That body of work is Latina feminist philosophy. It constitutes perhaps the best proximal candidate for the formation of a distinctively Latinx philosophy. Unlike the philosophical gestures of the Chicano movement, the development of Latina feminist philosophy constituted (and continues to constitute) a substantial body of disciplinarily recognizable work—albeit one that has had to fight for its recognition. And, unlike Latin American philosophical work, which has a more tenuous link to US Latinxs, Latina feminism is centrally focused on US Latinxs.

Discourse about a specifically Latina feminism extends at least as far back as the late 1970s. However, the idea of a self-consciously Latina theorizing by philosophers (and philosophically-minded theorists working outside of philosophy departments), began to emerge in the late 1980s.[11] If there is a founding text of Latina feminist philosophy, it is plausibly Gloria Anzaldúa’s Frontera/Borderlands (1987).[12] Anzaldúa was not herself trained as an academic philosopher, but her writing inspired generations of more traditionally trained academic philosophers, many of whom continue to reflect on, revisit, and draw from the distinctive phenomenology, vocabulary, concerns, and methodology expressed in her work.[13] Anzaldúa’s work pulled together threads of feminist, queer, and Chicana thought, and situated them the US/Mexico border context. In doing so, she gave expression to a distinctive range of experiences and concerns that had, until that point, been mostly invisible to academic work in Chicano studies, feminism, and academic philosophy.

Other self-consciously Latina feminist writing by academic philosophers followed. Important work in this vein includes essays by Lugones (1994, 2003) and Schutte (1998, 2000), and monographs by Alcoff (2006) and Ortega (2016). Much of this work emphasizes the importance of lived experience, the significance of the social ties and the norms governing them, and the unique ways in which gender interacts with Latina-hood. In recent years, this literature has been marked by a reinvigoration of a broadly phenomenological approach to identity, selfhood, oppression, alienation, and marginalization.

The case for thinking of Latina feminist philosophy as plausibly the most important origin of Latinx philosophy is straightforward: from the 1980s onward, self-identified Latina feminist philosophers were exploring a wide range of philosophical issues concerning agency, epistemology, and politics, especially as structured by gender. Within that matrix of issues, a central recurring issue in that literature was (and continues to be) the lived consequences of latinidad, or the property of being Latinx. As such, this work has as much a claim to being Latinx philosophy as any philosophical work that has been produced under the label.

To be sure, given the focus on gender, Latina feminist philosophy has not always been explicitly concerned about the global status of Latinxs qua Latinxs (as opposed to, for example, being focused on Latinas qua Latinas). For example, Lugones’ observations about the emergence of different selves in the context of world-traveling (1987) as well as her thoughts about the tacit metaphysics presupposed by the discourse of purity (1994) are intended to offer particular insight into the condition of Latinas. However, the central insights in these works plausibly generalizes to Latinxs in general, and perhaps beyond. Similarly, Schutte’s (1998) reflections about the peculiar dilemma of visibility for Latinas—they must either erase their Latinidad or be able to show that their facility with multiple cultures is beneficial in the Anglo-American public sphere—is not unfamiliar to many Latinxs more generally, and indeed, to a variety of other social identity groups.

At this stage, it is difficult to do extensive work within Latinx philosophy without engaging with the work of Latina feminist philosophers. In light of these considerations, and the relatively direct connections in motivations and subjects of theorizing, it is otiose to resist the idea that Latina feminist philosophy is a main, if not the main proximal origin to what we now recognize as Latinx philosophy.

2.4 Self-Consciously Latinx Philosophy

There is a final thread to the origin of Latinx philosophy that merits attention: the emergence of a self-aware field, a field that thinks of itself as engaged in explicitly Latinx philosophy. At roughly the end of the twentieth century, a group of US-based academic philosophers began to frame their work in terms of its significance for Latinx populations in the United States. For example, Eduardo Mendieta (1999) explored the complexities of US citizenship and the “becoming Hispanic” that is sometimes involved in Latinx identity. Alcoff (2000, 2006) explored the difficulty of thinking of Latinxs as simply a race or simply an ethnic group, and in general, the complexity of lived social identities in the US context. Gracia (2000, 2008) and Corlett (2000, 2003) each offered accounts of the nature of group membership, and explored the consequences of these things for concrete political questions, such as affirmative action.

All of this work was explicitly about Latina/os, and is now rightly thought of as squarely in the ambit of Latinx philosophy. It was also true that when it was written, it was not regularly thought of as a contribution to Latinx philosophy, per se. As we saw above, to the extent that scholars considered the possibility, they tended to deny that such a field existed (cf. Bernstein 2001). So, even when Latinx-focused work was undertaken partly in conversation with developments in Africana philosophy, Asian-American philosophy, and various developments in ethnic studies, the work of Latinx-specific philosophy was typically understood as a contribution to, for example, the philosophy of race, or as a piece of social and political philosophy.

By the end of the first decade of the twenty-first century, this presumption began to change. A body of self-described Latinx philosophy began to emerge, with all the usual academic apparatus surrounding it, along with more frequent usages of the term “Latinx philosophy” and its variants (R. Sánchez 2013).[14]

3. Defining Latinx Philosophy

This entry has relied on a particular conception of Latinx philosophy, namely, philosophy focused on (primarily) US Latinxs. In the terminology that follows, this is a narrow scope and subject-based characterization of the field; narrow in terms of how “Latinx” is understood, and subject-based in topic, as opposed to a construal of the field based on the identity of the authors. Each of these presumptions—about scope and whether a subject-based characterization is apt—is subject to dispute. First, there is a disagreement about whether “Latinx” ought to be understood expansively (as including both Latin Americans and US Latinxs) or whether it ought to be understood narrowly (as focused on US Latinxs).[15] The second axis of disagreement concerns whether Latinx philosophy should be thought of as philosophy produced by Latinxs (Gracia 2008) or as philosophy about Latinxs (cf. Reed-Sandoval 2016a: 11).

3.1 Wide vs. Narrow Scope

On the question of scope, a more expansive conception of the field tends to take its cue from the work of Jorge Gracia. Gracia characterizes Hispanic/Latinx philosophy as an ethnic philosophy, that is, the philosophy produced by an ethnic group. In his groundbreaking Hispanic/Latino Identity (2000), Gracia argues for the idea of a Hispanic philosophy, understood as philosophy produced by members of the ethnic group Hispanics. On Gracia’s account—the “Familial-Historical View”—Hispanics constitute an ethnic group unified by historical connections to the events following 1492 and the Iberian peninsula’s subsequent role in the Americas. Putting aside some complexities, he holds that Hispanics include the people of the Iberian Peninsula, Latin America, and their descendants in, for example, the United States.

In later work, Gracia explicitly recognizes that, in at least some contexts, there are important reasons to emphasize the term Latino rather than Hispanic (see Gracia 2008, esp. 58–9). In acknowledging this, he does not abandon the idea that “Hispanic philosophy” picks out an explanatorily important thing. For Gracia, what makes Hispanic philosophy interesting as a category of philosophical work is that the underlying historical ties that define the maximal limits of the ethnic group (recall: roughly, historical connection to the Iberian-influenced aftermath of 1492) also structure important features of philosophical work by that group.

Gracia’s thought is that these historical connections matter: one cannot understand the work of Las Casas and Clavijero, for example, without understanding the significance of scholastic work in Spain. And, one cannot understand the work of Latin American liberals and positivists without understanding the web of historical ties that followed from Iberian colonialism. Certainly, one cannot understand early twentieth century Latin American philosophy without understanding the Iberian-to-Latin American intellectual connections that go through José Ortega y Gasset or José Gaos. So, on Gracia’s account, the term “Hispanic philosophy” earns its theoretical keep by organizing our conception of things in a way that informatively characterizes some contingent but nevertheless real and informative feature of the world.

In the context of this account of Hispanic and Latin American philosophy, Gracia introduces the term Latino philosophy to pick out “philosophical work produced by Latinos both in Latin America and the United States” (2008: 129). This way of formulating the category is deceptively simple. Gracia accepts a broadly contextualist understanding of what it is to be Latino, the consequence of which is that “[w]hat Latino philosophy is, when it is understood ethnically, can be asked only in the context of the Latino ethnos” (2008: 141). That is, whether a work of philosophy counts as a work of Latino philosophy is never a transhistorical fact, as it were, but always something indexed to a local, historically-specific standard given by the ethnos.

Gracia understands himself to be committed to a kind of non-essentialism about both Latinxs and Hispanics. Although there is the general fact of an ethnos-defining set of historical events to which many people are related, the standards of membership in the group is always contingent on those facts plus local facts about which particular kinds and degrees of relations matter. So, whether Frantz Fanon—born in Martinique—counts as a Latino philosopher depends in part of what a given, historically specific standard of Latino membership specifies.[16]

Gracia’s original and distinctive proposal for how to understand the term Latinx philosophy was perhaps the first account to explicitly define the term “Latino philosophy”. It has the virtue of being continuous with his well-developed and extensively defended accounts of ethnic philosophy, Hispanic philosophy, and Latin American philosophy. It also faces challenges along multiple dimensions.

First, notice that Gracia’s account doesn’t specify what Latinx philosophy actually is, here and now. Rather, it gives us a kind of formula for defining it: we are to look to the ethnic group’s conception of Latinx philosophy. Second, putting aside the various empirical and conceptual puzzles about how we would determine the ethnic group’s views (surveys? conceptual analysis? patterns of linguistic usage?), it simply unclear there is anything in the views of the ethnos that would settle the question. That is, it is entirely unclear that the ethnos has a conception of philosophy—much less Latinx philosophy—that would settle the reference of “Latinx philosophy”. Perhaps Gracia would regard this as an adequate result. Nevertheless, it is easy enough to see why it might be attractive to others to have a more practicable account of Latinx philosophy, one that tells us something about what the term does (or ought to) pick out.

Second, several philosophers have noted that standard usages of “Latino” or “Latinx” is typically understood to pick out people living in non-Latin American countries who are either Latin American immigrants or descendants of Latin Americans (Llorente 2013: 73; Millán & Deere 2017; see also Mendieta 2011).[17] In contrast, Gracia’s conception of Latinos includes Latin Americans residing in Latin America. An important reason for having a term to pick out the narrower group—US Latinxs, we might say in an effort at provisional neutrality—is that the social position of Latinxs in the United States—and thus, of Latinx philosophers in the United States—is very different from the social position of Latin Americans in Latin America, and the position of Latin American philosophers with respect to philosophy in the United States and beyond.[18] Thus, there is reason to be able to pick out and talk about philosophy that is in some or another way specifically tied to Latinxs as conventionally understood, i.e., as a population of people outside of Latin America who are themselves either Latin Americans by origin or descendants of Latin Americans.

Collectively, these concerns might be put as follows: even if there is some useful category or property picked out by Gracia’s usage of “Latino”, his usage runs afoul of the standard usage of the term, a term that reflects important differences between Latin-Americans-in-Latin-America and those people (and their descendants) who reside outside of Latin America. Thus, if we accept Gracia’s explicitly revisionist proposal[19] for using “Latino Philosophy”—a proposal according to which Latin American nationals doing philosophy in Latin America are doing Latinx philosophy—the worry is that it displaces a more natural and explanatorily helpful usage of the term.

Renzo Llorente (2013) has made the striking proposal that the difficulties with Gracia’s revisionism about “Latino”—particularly the way it departs from exclusively picking out US Latinos—is grounds for abandoning the term “Latino philosophy”. In its stead, he recommends sticking with the older and more familiar categories of Latin American and Hispanic philosophy.

This proposal has its own difficulties. For example, it would obscure work by US Latina feminist philosophers, as well as other contemporary philosophers working on Latinx-connected issues. Those works all have a relatively clear claim on being an instance of Latinx philosophy, in a way that doesn’t do violence to either ordinary or standard specialist understandings of “Latinx” and “philosophy”. Because there is a discernible body of work there, united by an interest that we can helpfully and accurately designate with the term “Latinx philosophy”, abandoning the term would produce no gain, but it would entail a loss of expressive precision.

3.2 Source vs. Subject Matter

One might accept a narrower scope for the term “Latinx”, but emphasis that the right understanding of “Latinx philosophy” is defined in terms of the source of the philosophical work, rather than its subject or content. That is, one could accept that “Latinx philosophy” picks out Latinxs as conventionally understood, and treats Latinx philosophy as the philosophy produced by that group, rather than being philosophy about that group. This proposal would respect standard usage of the term without denying that there can be important relationships between Hispanic, Latin American, and Latinx philosophy. Further, it would allow us to think of Latinx philosophy as an ethnic philosophy, i.e., philosophy (whatever that is) that is produced by a specific ethnos (whatever that comes to). One appeal to thinking of Latinx philosophy in this way—as unified by its source (i.e., Latinxs)—is that it is continuous with other familiar ways of characterizing some parts of philosophy. That is, it is a familiar to thing to characterize some parts of philosophy in terms of their source (e.g., Asian philosophy; German philosophy; European philosophy etc.).

However, a source-based characterization of Latinx philosophy remains at odds with current usage. Consider a Latina philosopher who spends her life work on the philosophy of quantum mechanics, or on set theory, or on free will. Suppose she has no interest in social identity and does not think of her work as in any way informed, connected to, or directly relevant to Latinxs. On a source-based account, she would nevertheless count as doing Latinx philosophy. This seems strange. Inverse cases generate infelicitous results as well. Consider a scholar who is not Latinx but who exclusively works on questions of Latinx identity, the politics of Latinx immigration, and topics in Latina feminism. On a source-based conception, such a scholar could not be said to be working on Latinx philosophy, at least not in the sense under consideration.

Current linguistic convention suggests that a subject-based characterization of the field is preferable. Construing the field as defined by subject matter—i.e., philosophy that is concerned with Latinxs—gets the right results in the cases mentioned above. That is, non-Latinxs can do Latinx philosophy, and Latinxs can do philosophy that isn’t Latinx philosophy.[20] Moreover, subject-based approaches to defining a field is already familiar from our standard understandings of, for example, ethics, metaphysics, and epistemology. To be sure, the appeal of a subject-based characterization depends in large part on whether it picks out anything of interest. The body of work gestured at in this entry makes the case for that conception.

Why not pluralism, allowing for different construals of the scope and content of Latinx philosophy? In everyday discourse, we are prepared to allow that any number of terms admit of multiple meanings, picking out different, if sometimes overlapping things. In Southern California, “Mexican” can refer to both Mexican nationals and to nth-generation US citizens descended from Mexican nationals.[21] Given the fact that many terms have multiple meanings, perhaps there is room for both a source-based and subject-based account of Latinx philosophy? Perhaps there is. Still, there is reason to plump for a single privileged meaning in disciplinary contexts: labels and characterizations of a nascent subject matter are the public face of the field. When a field is more mature and there are plenty of familiar and undisputed exemplars of it, the precise characterizations of a field is less pragmatically significant and more a matter of taxonomical fussiness. In light of this, there seems to be at least some reason to prefer to think of Latinx philosophy in terms of its subject matter, i.e., as philosophy concerned in some substantive way with Latinxs.

4. Ongoing Developments

Given how the contents of Latinx philosophy has been partly propelled by the experiences and interests of Latinxs, it plausibly matters that the demographics of the philosophers working on Latinx philosophy is changing. A substantial portion of the early work in Latinx philosophy, especially work recognized as straightforwardly academic philosophy, has been done by scholars who were born outside of the United States.[22] Over the past decade, however, there has been a marked increase of work on Latinx philosophy by US-born philosophers, and in particular, by Mexican American philosophers. Along with this change has been increased attention in the idea of a specifically “Mexican American philosophy”. It remains to be seen the extent to which those working on issues within the ambit of Latinx philosophy will continue to focus on a broader Latinx landscape, as previous generations have done, or whether newer work will tend to focus on more narrowly circumscribed topics.

Questions about the demographic makeup of the philosophers and its consequences for the discipline has been a matter of increased attention the academy. Presumably, these discussions will continue until as long as academics remain concerned about discrepancies between the academy and the populations it serves. However, one thread that is oftentimes implicit but only infrequently taken up concerns the possibility of duties (real or imagined, moral or otherwise) that Latinx scholars have to undertake engagement with Latin American and Latinx philosophy (Gracia 2000: 159–188; J.L.A. García 2001: 96–7; Covarrubias 2015). It is imaginable that as Latinx philosophy grows, questions about who does it, what falls into its ambit, and whether there are obligations to do Latinx philosophical scholarship in particular ways, will animate discussions within parts of the field.

A third ongoing development involves more explicit ties between philosophical work in Latin America and the United States In this context, a US-based academic field focused on Latinxs risks perpetuating epistemically and morally fraught practices with respect to Latin Americans. As noted above, a number of philosophers working in Latinx philosophy explicitly draw from and interact with aspects of Latin American philosophy. Similarly, there is some evidence of Latin American attention on the work of US Latinx philosophy.[23] Given the differences in comparative support, visibility, and global prestige of academic work within the United States, it seems plausible that academic work on Latinx philosophy in the United States will go a long way towards defining the field internationally, including its terminology and its chief subjects. It is this fact—US academic influence on the global academy, and the way it can occlude the contributions and work of those outside the US scene—that provides the background for a worrisome set of possibilities about how we understand Latinxs and their philosophical significance.

From the standpoint of US-based academics, this risk may not be obvious. After all, the subject just is US populations, their experiences, and the philosophical issues they raise. However, Latinxs are not just US populations. Latinxs are also, for example, members of the Salvadoran diaspora, indigenous Oaxacan laborers, Argentinian ex-patriate academics, and so on. Once we recognize these facts, it is less obvious that US identity categories and frameworks should be taken as presumptive, fundamental, or guiding when it comes to understanding the philosophical—phenomenological, conceptual, social, moral, political, etc.—significance of these populations. Moreover, taking US identity categories as presumptive also threatens to re-enact a tradition of domination-and-description-from-without that has plagued Latin America since its inception. So, given the fact of a field constructed on US identity categories, and given the fact of US influence on the global academy, the construction of the field’s categories and practices (and who may speak authoritatively about them) may itself become an important subject matter, especially in Latinx-Latin American academic discussions.

A final development worth noting here concerns methodological frictions. There are philosophers working in Latinx philosophy whose philosophical work is substantively structured by liberationist, activist, or praxis-oriented methodologies. At the same time, there are philosophers working on Latinx philosophy who are drawn to other conceptions of philosophy, including versions committed to something like a putatively disinterested search for truth, and/or philosophy in the mode of a love of wisdom. Competing visions about what work is methodologically preferable is a matter of ongoing contestation.

That said, it is not always clear that these differences in philosophical orientation have the significance they are ordinarily taken to have. Accounts of the phenomenology of racialized identities in the US subject to immigration pressures might speak to broader features of human beings. At the same time, putatively non-liberationist accounts of, say, the structure of responsible agency and how oppression alters it, might be thought to provide resources of its own for more straightforwardly liberationist theories. So, although the broadly liberationist and theory-for-its-own-sake threads of the subfield may sometimes find themselves at cross-purposes, it is unclear that these disagreements need to result in a deep fissure in the field. For the field as a whole, one aspiration might be for philosophical work to have “exemplary validity”, i.e., philosophy that teaches us something about wider features of humanity without losing its cultural specificity.

Still, there is reason for caution. Philosophical fights about methodology have consequences for what is viewed as inside and outside of a field. Moreover, scholars have noted that philosophical borders are oftentimes particularly vigorously patrolled—and worse, that this has been especially so for work in Latinx (Ortega 2016: 4–5) and Latin American (Vargas 2007: 61–63) philosophy. For that reason, it is very likely that what counts as “good” work, or even as part of the field, will remain a contested matter.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Special thanks to Francisco Gallegos, Eduardo Mendieta, Sofia Ortiz-Hinojosa, Amy Reed-Sandoval, Carlos Sánchez, and Robert Sanchez for feedback on this entry.

Copyright © 2018 by
Manuel Vargas <>

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