Legal Obligation and Authority

First published Mon Dec 29, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jun 30, 2022

Whatever else they do, all legal systems recognize, create, vary and enforce obligations. This is no accident: obligations are central to the social role of law and explaining them is necessary to an understanding of law’s authority and, therefore, its nature. Not only are there obligations in the law, there are also obligations to the law. Historically, most philosophers agreed that these include a moral obligation to obey, or what is usually called “political obligation”. For some, this is the consequence of some sort of transaction we enter with the state. Since states provide us with crucially important benefits, we incur certain duties in return, either because we consent to incurring these duties in exchange for the benefits, or because it would be unfair or ungrateful not to reciprocate for them. Other accounts are non-transactional in nature, and ground political obligation in the fact that obeying the law enhances our ability to do what we have reason to do, in the fact that we have duties to maintain just legal systems, or in special responsibilities qua members of our political community. All these lines of argument have been subjected to thorough criticism, and this has led some to deny that law is entitled to all the authority it claims for itself, even when the legal system is legitimate and reasonably just. On this view there are legal obligations that some of law’s subjects have no moral obligation to perform.

1. Obligations in the Law

Every legal system contains obligation-imposing laws, but there is no decisive linguistic marker determining which these are. The term “obligation” need not be used, nor its near-synonym, “duty”. One rarely finds the imperative mood. The Canadian Criminal Code imposes an obligation not to advocate genocide thus:

Every one who advocates or promotes genocide is guilty of an indictable offence and liable to imprisonment for a term not exceeding five years.

The English Sale of Goods Act says that,

Where the seller sells goods in the course of a business, there is an implied condition that the goods supplied under the contract are of merchantable quality.

That these laws create obligations follows from the way “offence” and “implied condition” function in their respective areas of law, not from the language in which they are expressed.

On the face of it, some laws have other functions. A requirement that “a will must be signed” generally imposes no duty—not a duty to make a will, and not even a duty to have it signed if you do—it sets conditions in the absence of which the document simply does not count as a valid will. Nonetheless, some philosophers argue that the content of every legal system can and should be represented solely in terms of duty-imposing and duty-excepting laws (Bentham Of Laws in General; Kelsen 1960 [1967]). Bentham asks,

What is it that every article of law has in common with the rest? It commands and by doing so creates duties or, what is another word for the same thing, obligations. (Bentham, Of Laws in General [1970: 294])

(For a related contemporary view, see Harris 1979: 84–106.) They think that analysing laws this way reveals what legislators or subjects most need to know: under what conditions the coercive power of law will ultimately be met. Others argue that even if such a reduction were possible, it would be unwieldy, uninformative and unmotivated, concealing as it does the different social functions that laws fulfil (Hart 1961 [1994: 26–49]) and the different kinds of reasons for action that they create (Raz 1975 [1990]). Others still, despairing of any principled way of knowing what a law is, have abandoned the problem entirely and tried to develop a theory of law that bypasses it (Honoré 1977; Dworkin 1978: 71–78). At a minimum, it does seem clear that whether or not all laws impose obligations, they can only be fully understood through their relations to those that do. Thus, a legal right is an interest that warrants holding others under an obligation to protect it, a legal power is the ability to create or modify obligations, and so forth.

What then are legal obligations? They are legal requirements with which law’s subjects are bound to conform. An obligatory act or omission is something the law renders non-optional. Since people plainly can violate their legal obligations, “non-optional” does not mean that they are physically compelled to perform, nor even that law leaves them without any eligible alternative. On the contrary, people often calculate whether or not to perform their legal duties. Could it be then that obligations are simply weighty reasons to perform, even if sometimes neglected or outweighed? This cannot be a sufficient condition: high courts have important reasons not to reverse themselves too frequently, but no legal obligation to refrain. Nor is it necessary: one has an obligation, but only a trivial reason, not to tread on someone’s lawn without his consent.

If their content does not account for the stringency of obligations, what does? An historically important, though now largely defunct, theory explained it in terms of penalty. According to this view, to have a legal obligation is to be subject to a sovereign command to do or forbear, where a command requires an expression of will together with an attached risk, however small, of suffering an evil for non-compliance. As the English jurist John Austin puts it,

[w]hen I am talking directly of the chance of incurring the evil, or (changing the expression) of the liability or obnoxiousness to the evil, I employ the term duty, or the term obligation…. (Austin 1832 [1995: 18]; see also Bentham Of Laws in General; Hobbes 1651 [1968])

Others conceived an indirect connection between duty and sanction, holding that what is normally counted as the content of a legal duty is in reality only part of a triggering condition for the mandatory norm which commands or authorizes officials to impose a sanction. According to this view,

a norm: “You shall not murder” is superfluous, if a norm is valid: “He who murders ought to be punished”. (Kelsen 1960 [1967: 55])


[l]egal obligation is not, or not immediately, the behavior that ought to be. Only the coercive act, functioning as a sanction, ought to be. (Kelsen 1960 [1967: 119])

None of these versions of the sanction theory survived H.L.A. Hart’s criticisms (Hart 1961 [1994: 27–42]; cf. Hacker 1973; but see Schauer 2015 for a recent reformulation of this approach). First, they misleadingly represent a range of disparate legal consequences—including compensation and even invalidation—as if they all function as penalties. Second, they render unintelligible many familiar references to duties in the absence of sanctions, for example, the duty of the highest courts to apply the law. Third, they offer an inadequate explanation of non-optionality. “You have an obligation not to murder” cannot merely mean “If you murder you will be punished”, for the law is not indifferent between people, on the one hand, murdering and being jailed, and on the other hand not murdering at all. “The right to disobey the law is not obtainable by the payment of a penalty or a licence fee” (Francome v. Mirror Group Newspapers Ltd. [1984] 2 All ER 408 at 412). Such dicta are commonplace and reflect familiar judicial attitudes. Most important, the normal function of sanctions in the law is to reinforce duties, not to constitute them. It is true that one reason people are interested in knowing their legal duties is to avoid sanctions, but this is not the only reason nor is it, contrary to what Oliver Wendell Holmes supposed, a theoretically primary one (Holmes 1897). Subjects also want to be guided by their duties—whether in order to fulfil them or deliberately to infringe them—and officials invoke them as reasons for, and not merely consequences of, their decisions.

Sensitivity to such matters led Hart to defend a rule-based theory. He says that while sanctions might mark circumstances in which people are obliged to conform, they have an obligation only when subject to a practised social rule requiring an act or omission. The fact that subjects use it as a rule marks it as normative. Three further features distinguish obligation-imposing rules: they must be reinforced by serious or insistent pressure to conform; they must be believed important to social life or to some valued aspect of it; and their requirements may conflict with the interests and goals of the subject (Hart 1961 [1994: 85–88]). This account of the nature of obligations is not an account of their validity. Hart does not say that a legal duty is binding whenever there is a willingness to deploy serious pressure in its support, etc. He holds that a duty is legally valid if it is part of the legal system (i.e., if it is certified as such by the tests for law in that system), and a legal duty is morally valid only if there are sound moral reasons to comply with it. But, at least in his early work, he offers the practice theory as an explanation of duties generally—legal duties are the creatures of legal rules, moral duties of moral rules and so on. (Hart later modified this view, see 1982: 255–268; and 1961 [1994: 256].)

The constitutive role of social pressure is sometimes considered an Austinian blemish on Hart’s theory, but there are in any case more serious problems with it as a general account of obligations (Dworkin 1978: 50–54; Raz 1975 [1990: 53–58]). People readily speak of obligations when they are well aware that there are no relevant social practices, as might a lone vegetarian in a meat eating society. And Hart’s practice conditions may be satisfied in cases where there is no obligation but only generally applicable reasons, as when victims are regularly urged to yield their wallets to a mugger. At best, Hart’s theory will apply only to a special class of obligations in which the existence of a conventional practice is an essential part of the reasons for conformity, though even here, the theory is open to doubt (see Dworkin 1978: 54–58; Green 1988: 88–121; cf. Marmor 2011: ch. 3). More recently, some have objected that Hart’s attempt to reduce social rules to social practices fails because rules and practices belong to different metaphysical categories. If so, grounding one in the other is a category mistake. Instead, we should think of the rules of our legal system as grounded in the planning activities of various officials whose intent is to regulate the behaviour of individuals (as well as other bodies) operating within the legal system (Shapiro 2011).

A third account is reason-based. On this view, what constitutes obligations is neither the social resources with which they are enforced, nor the practices in which they may be expressed, but the kind of reasons for action that they offer. Legal obligations are content-independent reasons that are both categorical and pre-emptive in force. The mark of their content-independence is that their force does not depend on the nature or merits of the action they require: in most cases, law can impose an obligation to do X or to refrain from doing X (Hart 1958; 1982: 254–55; but cf. Markwick 2000; Sciaraffa 2009; Valentini 2018). That they are pre-emptive means that they require the subject to set aside his own view of the merits and comply nonetheless. That they are categorical means that they do not condition their claims on the subject’s own goals or interests.

This view is foreshadowed both in Thomas Hobbes and John Locke, but its most influential contemporary version is due to Joseph Raz (1975 [1990: 35–84]). Raz argues that obligations are categorical reasons for action that are “protected” insofar as they are combined with special second-order reasons that require us to exclude from our deliberation some of the competing first order reasons for action. “First-order reasons” are normal reasons for action grounded in self-interest, desires or morality; “second-order reasons” are reasons that we have to act (or refrain from acting) on first-order reasons. Thus, the distinctive feature of obligations, according to Raz, is that they exclude some contrary reasons—typically at least reasons of convenience and ordinary preference—from our practical deliberation. Some but not all. An “exclusionary reason” is not necessarily a conclusive reason. The stringency of an obligation is thus a consequence not of its weight or practice features, but of the fact that it supports the required action by special normative means, insulating it from the general competition of reasons. Or at any rate this is what obligations do when they have the force they claim, i.e., when they are binding. The theory does not assume that all legal obligations actually are binding from the moral point of view, but it does suppose that the legal system puts them forth as if they were—a consequence that some have doubted (Hart 1982: 263–267; Himma 2001: 284–297). And while this account is invulnerable to the objections to sanction-based and practice-based theories, it does need to make good the general idea of an “exclusionary reason”, and some philosophers have expressed doubts on that score also.

Some have criticized the very existence of reasons to act for (or against) other reasons by pointing out that acting for (or against) other reasons is not something we can choose to do (Whiting 2017; Adams 2021). Others have pointed out that the reasons provided by authoritative directives are best understood as reasons that causally constrain our capacity not to conform with the directives in question (Shapiro 2002). Others have argued that what Raz calls exclusionary reasons are ultimately simply reasons that outweigh competing reasons (Mian 2002), reasons that affect the weight of first order reasons (Perry 1989) or reasons that causally change the factual circumstances in a way that triggers pre-existing reasons (Enoch 2011 and 2014). Finally, others have accepted that exclusionary reasons exist, while rejecting the claim that it is ever reasonable to exclude entirely from consideration otherwise valid reasons (Regan 1987; Gur 2007). This has led to formulation of alternative models, according to which obligations are best understood as providing “presumptive reasons”, as opposed to exclusionary reasons for action (Schauer 1991; Renzo 2019). According to these models, competing reasons for action are not excluded altogether from the deliberation of the agent. Rather, the second-order reasons created by the obligation merely create a presumption in favour of their exclusion. Subject to certain epistemic conditions being met, the presumption can be rebutted (but see Venezia 2020).

2. Authority, Obligation, and Legitimacy

A competitive market is not a legal system, even though people adjust their behaviour in response to relative prices and the whole constitutes a form of social order. Neither was the system of mutual nuclear deterrence, though it guided behaviour and generated norms that regulated the Cold War. Many philosophers and social scientists agree that a social order is a legal system only if it has effective authority. An effective (or de facto) authority may not be justified, but it does stand in a special relation to justified (de jure) authority. Justified authority is what effective authorities claim, or what they are generally recognized to have.

What is legal authority, and how is it related to obligations? It is a kind of practical authority, i.e., authority over action. On one influential view, “To claim authority is to claim the right to be obeyed” (R. P. Wolff 1970: 5). There are, of course, authorities that make no such claim. Theoretical authorities, i.e., experts, are not characterized by claims to obedience. They need not even claim a right to be believed. And there are weaker forms of practical authority. To give someone authority to use your car is merely to permit him. But political authority, of which legal authority is one species, is normally seen as a right to rule, with a correlative duty to obey. On this account law claims the right to obedience wherever it sets out obligations. And to obey is not merely to comply with the law; it is to be guided by it. Max Weber says it is

as if the ruled had made the content of the command the maxim of their conduct for its very own sake. (Weber 1922 [1963: II 946])

Or, as Robert Paul Wolff somewhat more perspicuously puts it:

Obedience is not a matter of doing what someone tells you to do. It is a matter of doing what he tells you to do because he tells you to do it. (R. P. Wolff 1970: 9)

This is not to say that one obeys only in treating the authority’s say-so as an indefeasible reason for action; but one must treat as a binding content-independent reason. The question whether there is an obligation of obedience to law is a matter of whether we should act from the legal point of view and obey the law as it claims to be obeyed (Raz 1979: 233–249).

It is an interesting feature of this account that it supposes that one can tell what the authority requires independent of whether the requirement is justified on its merits. Indeed, one might argue that

if there is no way of telling whether an utterance is authoritative, except by evaluating its contents to see whether it deserves to be accepted in its own right, then the distinction between an authoritative utterance and advice or rational persuasion will have collapsed. (Friedman 1973: 132)

An idea of this sort is developed by Raz into one of the leading arguments for the “sources thesis”, the idea that an adequate test for the existence and content of law must be based only on social facts, and not on moral arguments. (See the entry on legal positivism.) Authority’s subjects

can benefit by its decisions only if they can establish their existence and content in ways which do not depend on raising the very same issues which the authority is there to settle. (Raz 1994: 219)

If law aims to settle disputes about moral issues, then law must be identifiable without resolving these same disputes. The law is therefore exhausted by its sources (such as legislative enactments, judicial decisions, and customs, together with local conventions of interpretation). This kind of argument has been generalized (see Shapiro 1998), but also subjected to criticism. It is uncertain what sort of constraint is posed by the idea that it should not involve “the very same issues”—perhaps if morality is a necessary condition only there could be moral tests for authority that leave the relevant dependent reasons untouched (Coleman 2001: 126–127). And while law does indeed serve as a scheme for guiding and appraising behaviour, it may also have other functions, such as educating its subjects about right and wrong, and this may be ill-served the attitude that the rules are to be obeyed in part because they are the rules (Waluchow 1994).

The obligation-correlative view of authority is not universally accepted. Some argue that the power to impose moral obligations is only one of the many ways in which political authorities have the capacity to shape the normative status of those subject to them. The distinctive feature of political authority, according to this approach, is the broader power unilaterally change the duties, liberties and claim-rights of their subjects (Copp 1999 and Perry 2012). Others argue that political authority involves no claim right, but only a set of liberties: to decide certain questions for a society and to enforce their decisions. (Soper 2002: 85 ff; cf. Ladenson 1980; Greenawalt 1987: 47–61; and Edmundson 1998: 7–70).

The liberty conception must answer two questions. First, is it not a feature of a right to decide that it requires subjects to refrain from acting on competing decisions? If the law says that abortion is permissible and the Church says that it is not, what does the denial of the Church’s right to decide amount to if not that public policy should be structured by the former decision and not the latter, even if the latter is correct? Second, does the right to enforce include a duty of subjects to pay the penalty when required? If it does, then this is only a truncated version of the obligation-correlative theory—one that holds that punitive and remedial obligations, but not primary obligations, are binding. If not, it is starkly at variance with the actual views of legal officials, who do not think that subjects are at liberty to evade penalties if they can.

This reaches a methodological issue in the philosophy of law. Some consider that the character of law’s authority is a matter for descriptive analysis fixed by semantic and logical constraints of official language and traditions of argument. Others maintain that such analysis is impossible or indeterminate, and that we are therefore driven to normative arguments about what legal authority should be (see Soper 2002; Finnis 1979: 12–15). Crudely put, they think that we should understand law to claim only the sort of authority it would be justifiable for law to have. Such is the motivation for Friedrich Hayek’s suggestion that

The ideal type of law … provides merely additional information to be taken into account in the decision of the actor. (Hayek 1960: 150)

Hayek favours the free market, and concludes that the nature of legal authority should be understood analogically. The most radical position of this sort is Ronald Dworkin’s. He prefers what he calls a “more relaxed” understanding of legal authority (Dworkin 1986: 429). Others have argued that the pre-emptive notion of authority is unsatisfactory because it is too rigid (e.g., Perry 1989). Dworkin’s objection runs much deeper. His position is not that law communicates only a weaker form of guidance; it is that law is not to be understood as trying to communicate anything at all. A subject considering his legal duties is not listening to the law; he is engaged in “a conversation with oneself”, and is “trying to discover his own intention in maintaining and participating in that practice” (Dworkin 1986: 58). On this view there is no fact of the matter about what law claims that is independent of what each does well to regard it as claiming.

However we resolve the methodological question, there are two parallel normative questions:

  • The problem of obligation: What if anything justifies the duty to obey the law, and how far does that obedience properly extend?
  • The problem of legitimacy: What if anything justifies the coercive power of law, and how far may that power properly extend?

What is the relationship between these? Some maintain that obligation comes first:

[T]hough obligation is not a sufficient condition for coercion, it is close to a necessary one. A state may have good grounds in some special circumstances for coercing those who have no duty to obey. But no general policy of upholding the law with steel could be justified if the law were not, in general, a source of genuine obligations. (Dworkin 1986: 191)

The idea is that merely having justice on one’s side is an inadequate ground for coercing others; one also needs a special title flowing from the moral status of the law. (Contrast, for example, Locke’s view that everyone has an “executive power of the law of nature”, at least outside political society [Second Treatise, § 13].)

Others contend that this gets the relationship backwards. First, it is doubtful whether one could have an obligation to obey an illegitimate regime. We might think that “acquiescence in, or even consent to, clearly unjust institutions does not give rise to obligations” (Rawls 1971: 343; but cf. Simmons 1979: 78–79). If so, at least some conditions of legitimacy precede an obligation of obedience. Second, there are substantive reasons for thinking we would not have obligations to obey if the law were not already justified in upholding its requirements “with steel”. A legal system that could not justifiably coerce could not assure the law-abiding that the recalcitrant will not take them for suckers. Without being able to solve this assurance problem it would be unjust to impose obligations on them, and unjust to demand their obedience. Underlying this suggestion is that idea that familiar idea that effectiveness is a necessary—but certainly not sufficient—condition for justified authority. (See Kelsen 1960 [1967: 46–50]; cf. Finnis 1979: 250. For an alternative formulation of the view that there can be no duty to obey until we have established the right of the authority to coerce, see Ripstein 2004.)

3. Obligations to the Law

It may affirm our confidence in the obligation-correlative view to know that from earliest times philosophical reflection on political authority has focused on the obligation to obey. The passive obligation of obedience is certainly not all we owe the law (Parekh 1993: 243; Green 2002: 543–547) but many have taken it to be law’s minimum demand. This gives rise to a puzzle. As Robert Paul Wolff puts it:

If the individual retains his autonomy by reserving to himself in each instance the final decision whether to co-operate, he thereby denies the authority of the state; if, on the other hand, he submits to the state and accepts is claim to authority then … he loses his autonomy. (R. P. Wolff 1970: 9)

Wolff resolves the dilemma in favour of autonomy, and on that basis defends anarchism.

Some of Wolff’s worries flow from the “surrender of judgement” itself—how can it ever be rational to act against reason as one sees it? Others flow from the fact that it is a surrender to the law. On the first point, it is relevant to notice that promises and contracts also involve surrender of judgement and a kind of deference to others (see Soper 2002: 103–139), yet a rational anarchist needs such voluntary commitments to substitute for authoritative ordering. A principled objection to every surrender of judgement is thus self-defeating. Moreover, there seem to be cases in which by surrendering judgement on some matters one can secure more time and resources for reflection and decision on things that are more important, or with respect to which one has greater capacity for self-direction. A partial surrender of judgement may therefore enhance the agent’s autonomy overall.

This suggests that Wolff’s concern is better understood as scepticism about whether it is justifiable to surrender one’s judgement wholesale to the law. Some philosophers have queried the intelligibility of this doubt; they say that it is of the nature of law that there is an obligation to obey it, at least in its central case (Fuller 1958 [2000: 100]; Finnis 1979: 14–15). Some go so far as to conclude that it is therefore absurd to ask for any ground of the duty to obey the law: law is that which is to be obeyed (McPherson 1967: 64). We need a way into this circle, and the best entrance is in specifying the nature of law in away compatible with various theories of its nature. Three features are especially important (drawing on Hart 1961 [1994: 193–200]; Raz 1975 [1990: 149–154]; and Lyons 1984: 66–68). First, law is institutionalized: nothing is law that is not connected with the activities of institutions such as legislatures, courts, administrators, police, etc. Second, legal systems have a wide scope. Law not limited to the affairs of small face-to-face groups such as families or clans, nor does it only attend to a restricted domain of life such as baseball. Law governs open-ended domains of large, loosely structured groups of strangers and it regulates their most urgent interests: life, liberty, property, kinship, etc. But although law necessarily deals with moral matters, it does not necessarily do so well, and this is its third central feature: law is morally fallible. This is acknowledged by both positivists and natural lawyers, whose slogan “an unjust law is not a law” was never intended to assert the infallibility of law.

The question of political obligation, then, turns on whether there is are moral reasons to obey the mandatory requirements of a wide-ranging, morally fallible, institutionalized authority. This obligation purports to be comprehensive in that it covers all legal obligations and everyone whose compliance the law requires. It is not assumed to bind come what may, though it is to be one genuine obligation among others. Some philosophers also consider that it should bind people particularly to their own states, i.e., the states of which they are residents or citizens, and that an argument that could not show that one had more stringent duties to obey one’s own country than a similarly just foreign one would be in that measure deficient (Simmons 1979: 31–35; Green 1988: 227–228). Finally, it is common ground the obligation exists only when a threshold condition of justice is met.

4. Transactional Theories

Two main strategies are traditionally employed in justifying political obligation. One appeals to some sort of transaction existing between the state and its members; the other appeals to specific sets of duties that individuals have either simply qua moral agents, or in virtue of particular positions they occupy. We will start by considering the first one.

4.1 Consent

“The Right of all Sovereigns”, says Hobbes in Leviathan (chap. 42) “is derived originally from the consent of everyone of those that are to be governed”. In the Second Treatise (§ 95) Locke says:

Men being … by nature all free, equal, and independent, no one can be put out of this estate and subjected to the political power of another without his own consent.

The ideological influence of such theories in the struggles for representative government and decolonization was immense. Few now deny, in the words of the United States’ Declaration of Independence, that all governments “deriv[e] their just powers from the consent of the governed”, and it is perhaps not too much to say that consent has become the “gold standard” for political authority (and, indeed, for a theory of any political power; Buchanan 2002).

But whose consent, and to what? Not the consent of our ancestors, for such an “original” contract, as it was called in the seventeenth century, can have no authority over those who did not agree to it. A voluntarist theory requires the actual consent of each subject. But this cannot mean consent to every law or application thereof. The evident absurdity of that idea leads some to declare consent “intrinsically implausible”: As Finnis puts it,

the need for authority is, precisely, to substitute for unanimity in determining the solution of practical co-ordination problems which involve or concern everyone in the community. (Finnis 1979: 248)

Consent theorists, however, have not generally proposed the principle as a solution to “practical co-ordination problems”. Unanimous consent would be a very bad decision rule: the transaction costs would be enormous and hold-outs could block many desirable policies. Consent is more commonly proposed as a part of the constitution rule that sets up the political community in the first place. Consent theorists reject, therefore, Immanuel Kant’s idea (discussed below) that the mere capacity of A to violently affect B’s interests is sufficient licence for anyone to subject them both to a regime of positive law (the Metaphysics of Morals § 44). For consent theorists, an A-B interaction does not become a candidate for authoritative regulation until A and B agree to unite under one jurisdiction. We cannot ask which or what sort of authority is justified over both the Kurds and the Shiites in Iraq until we answer why there should be one at all. Beyond this foundational role, however, consent theorists take different views of whether it has any further significance in policy. Locke thinks it is then displaced by majority rule by delegates as the natural procedure for most decisions; for Rousseau, this is but another form of slavery.

Even in its confined role, however, consent has attracted powerful criticism. (For a good survey see Simmons 1979: 57–100; for a qualified defence see Beran 1987.) Much of it has focused on the questions of whether consent is in fact given and, if given, whether it would bind. The first thing to notice is that here consent is meant to be a performative commitment that undertakes an obligation through the very act of consenting. Thus, it is closer to how we normally understand the notion of a promise, rather than to how consent is used in other contexts. (When you consent to surgery, for example, you don’t incur an obligation to undergo surgery. You simply waive your objection to undergoing surgery.) Like other promises and oaths, however, there are limits to the validity of consent. Not only because consent is invalid if secured via coercion, manipulation or duress, but also because there are things we lack the moral power to consent to. Locke, for example, argues that one can consent neither to be killed nor to slavery, and thus not to anything tantamount to slavery, including absolute government. One can imagine a similar argument to the conclusion that political consent must be revocable. But as we build in all these validity conditions, the commitment itself seems to be doing less and less work, leading some to conclude it becomes “essentially irrelevant” (Pitkin 1965 [1972: 57]). Consent is saved from irrelevance only if we can explain why we also value a power to bind ourselves to obey. David Hume could conceive no reason at all: promise-keeping is an “artificial virtue” serving the public good, just like obedience to law. So long as law is tolerably legitimate—and Hume is prepared to give it a very wide berth—a promise to obey is redundant, for any plausible answer to the question of why we are bound by the promise would “immediately, without any circuit, have accounted for our obligation to allegiance”; “being of like force and authority, we gain nothing by resolving the one into the other” (Hume 1748 [1985: 481]).

Now, whilst a consent theory need not “resolve” allegiance into a promise—there may also be non-promissory conditions on obedience—, it must explain why it should be conditional on it. Three sorts of arguments have been popular. First, there are instrumental reasons for wanting deliberate control over the liability to legal duties. In political authority, where the stakes are as high as they come, the power to give and withhold consent serves an ultimate protective function beyond what we could expect from the fallible institutions of limited government. Second, consent enables people to establish political allegiances by creating new political societies or joining existing ones without awaiting the gradual emergence of bonds of community and reciprocity; consent is an immediate passport to “perfect membership” in a commonwealth (Locke, Second Treatise, § 119). Third, though consent is defined by its performative character, ancillary non-performative features naturally accompany it: consent also expresses the acceptability, or at least tolerability, of the government. This may mark consented-to rulers as salient from among a number of possible contenders, and it may signal that they stand a good chance of being effective, which is itself a necessary condition for the justification of any political authority.

It is open to doubt how persuasive such considerations are. But matters are even worse, for it is in any case clear that many people have done nothing that counts as giving such consent. Even freely given oaths of office and naturalization do not usually amount to a general commitment to obey the law (Greenawalt 1987). Other acts are even less plausibly so interpreted. Plato’s Crito introduces the idea that continued residence counts as some kind of tacit consent to obey, and Locke extends that to include any enjoyment of the benefits of government—“whether it be barely travelling freely on the highway” (Second Treatise, § 199). Whatever the moral relevance of these facts, they do not count as consent, for people do these things without imagining they will create obligations, and they do them in circumstances in which they have no feasible alternative. Other non-promissory actions, for example voting or participating in politics, fare no better: many do not vote, and few who do regard it as undertaking any duties at all. Perhaps we can say that if people consent, and if the relevant legitimacy conditions are fulfilled, then they will have a duty to obey the law. That is obviously a far cry from establishing law’s claims, however.

Alternatively, we might amend our theory and justify political authority not by appealing to the fact that we have consented to it, but rather by appealing to the fact that we would, or perhaps should, have consented to it, under some idealized condition—say, if we had been more rational or better informed (Estlund 2008: 117–135). The problem with this move, however, is that in grounding political authority in hypothetical, rather than actual, consent, the view seems to lose much of its appeal. The reason the notion of consent is especially attractive is that it promises to reconcile being subject to someone else’s authority with retaining our capacity to act as autonomous agents. Consent does that because insofar as we have consented to someone else having authority over us, any obligations they impose on us, can ultimately be traced back, although indirectly, to an exercise of our will, namely our decision to consent. In this limited sense, the obligations in question are obligations that we have willingly incurred. None of this is true in the case of hypothetical consent, however. For our will plays no role in generating any of the obligations that the political authority imposes on us if the authority is justified not by appealing to our actual choice to consent to it, but rather by appealing to the hypothetical choice of some idealized version of ourselves. Indeed, some have argued that hypothetical consent is best understood as a version of natural duty view in disguise (Simmons 2005: 117). Ultimately, what justifies political authority here is the fact that we have independent reasons to act as the authority requires. For these are the very reasons that explain why we would (or should) consent to an authority that requires those things if we were more rational, or better informed. If so, hypothetical consent is at most a heuristic device which helps us see what those reasons are (Raz 1986; Sreenivasan 2009; Thomson 1990; but see Enoch 2017).

4.2 Fairness

Even if we cannot be said to have meaningfully consented to them, it seems clear that (reasonably just) political authorities do provide us with crucially important benefits, such as security and the rule of law. Some have pointed to these benefits to justify our duty to obey and support the authorities in question. The core idea here is that those who benefit from a fair scheme of cooperation have a duty to do their allotted part under that scheme. In other words, if others obey the law to our benefit, we owe them a duty not to take a free-ride on their compliance (Hart 1955; Rawls 1964).

Upon closer look, however, some of the worries that afflict consent theories crop up here as well. For intuitively it’s only when the benefits produced by a cooperative scheme are accepted by its members that the existence of fair-play obligations is uncontroversial. If a scheme of cooperation simply thrusts benefits on people as the unavoidable fall-out of the cooperative activity of others—even very valuable benefits—it is doubtful that we have a duty to comply with the scheme. However, it’s unclear in what sense we can be said to have accepted the benefits provided by the state. After all, the central benefits of an effective legal system, including security and order, are the sort of non-excludable public goods that Simmons (1979: 138–139) calls “open benefits”. They are provided to all those living in the territory over which the state claims authority, regardless of whether the benefits in question are welcomed or not. Rarely can these benefits be avoided, and when they can, it’s only at great cost. More importantly, states typically claim the same type of authority both over those who accept the benefits and over those who don’t (Nozick 1974; Rawls 1964; Simmons 2001: Chapters 1–2).

In reply, some have argued that although it is true that, normally, acceptance is required in order to incur fair-play obligations, this is not the case when it comes to the sort of “presumptively beneficial” goods that states provide. Since goods like security and order are necessary for any acceptable life, we can presume that everyone would pursue these benefits, if doing so were necessary to receive them. Failing to do so would be irrational after all (Klosko 1991, 2005; see also Arneson 1982; Dagger 1997, 2018). The problem with this argument is that we often make choices that are irrational in this sense but—leaving aside cases where paternalistic interference might be justified—this is normally enough to shield us from incurring the costs associated with making the reasonable choice. Although it might be irrational not to buy a particular life-insurance policy, if I refuse to do so, you’re not allowed to provide me with the policy and expect me to pay for it. Why think that refusing to accept the benefits provided by the state should not protect us in the same way from incurring the costs attached to them? After all, these obligations are meant to rule out attempts to take advantage of the members of a cooperative scheme by exploiting their sacrifices and reaping the benefits produced by the scheme without bearing any of the costs associated with their production. But if I don’t accept the relevant benefits because, perhaps foolishly, I fail to appreciate their value, I am not trying to take advantage of anyone.

Things are more complicated than we might think at first here because it’s not unrealistic that, at least in some cases, the rejection of essential open benefits that we know we are going to receive anyway might be the product of motivationally-biased beliefs triggered by a desire to free-ride (i.e., irrational beliefs that we have developed, perhaps unconsciously, in order to receive those benefits without having to contribute our fair share to their production). And it’s plausible that when this is what explains our failure to accept the benefits in question, our fair-play obligations are not undermined (Renzo 2014). But there is no reason to think that this explanation will be valid in every case in which the benefits provided by the state are rejected. Realistically, some cases of rejection will be genuine, and in those cases, fairness seems unable to vindicate our obligation to obey the law.

A further complication concerns the fact that, despite being non-excludable in the sense that they cannot be selectively provided only to those who ask for them, many of the “open benefits” provided by states are not fairly distributed among all citizens. Even in societies that present themselves as liberal and egalitarian, minorities are often discriminated against and suffer serious injustice at the ends of their government. When this is the case, the idea that obedience might required as a way of doing one’s fair share in maintaining a cooperative scheme for reciprocal benefit surely lose much of its force (Shelby 2016; see also Kelly 2022 and Yankah 2022).

4.3 Gratitude

Fairness (in its voluntaristic interpretation) requires some sort of acceptance, as opposed to mere receipt, of the benefits produced by the state in order for political obligation to be generated. However, some transactions seem to generate obligations, despite the fact that the benefits received have not been accepted. For example, if you provide me with a benefit, I ought at least to be grateful, and express my gratitude in a suitable form. Couldn’t this idea be used to justify political obligation? Some argue that it can. Obeying the law, according to them, is a way for us to discharge the duty of gratitude we owe our own state for the benefits we receive from it (Plato [Crito]; W. D Ross 1930; Walker 1988; Klosko 1989).

One problem with this account is that the mere receipt of a benefit doesn’t seem enough to warrant a duty of gratitude. Perhaps I enjoy listening to your trombone practice, but if you provide this benefit to me unwittingly (perhaps you think that I’m away on holiday, while you practice next door) do I owe you a duty of gratitude? And do I owe you a duty if your intention is to harm me, rather than benefit me? (Perhaps you know I’m next door, and you practice loudly in order to bother me, unaware that there’s nothing I enjoy more than listening to your trombone.) This seems implausible. The mere provision of a benefit doesn’t seem to generate duties of gratitude, unless the benefit in question is provided with the right intention. But can states have intentions to begin with (if not in a metaphorical sense)? Those who deny that conclude that, for this reason, no duties of gratitude can be owed to them (Simmons 1979: ch. 7; but see Knowles 2002).

This objection is, in a sense, symmetrical to one considered in relation to fair-play accounts. There we saw that merely receiving the services provided by the state is not enough to ground political obligation unless those receiving these benefits have certain mental states (i.e., the intention to accept the benefits). Here the objection is that receiving the same services is not enough to ground political obligation unless those providing them have certain mental states (i.e., the intention to benefit their recipients). However, it’s worth noticing that the former objection applies here as well. As we have seen, the services provided by the state are hard to avoid and, more importantly, the demands that states make on us are the same whether we welcome those services or not. But the claim that we can incur duties of gratitude for benefits that we don’t welcome, and perhaps explicitly reject, seems controversial. Once again, it might be that it’s irrational to reject the benefits, but if we do (and we are sincere), it’s unclear that any costs may be imposed on us as a way of discharging our duties of gratitude.

5. Non-Transactional Theories

The appeal of transactional theories is that it seems intuitively plausible that political obligation has something to do with the duties generated by the important benefits that states provide to their members. The problem is that the mere provision of benefits seems insufficient to generate obligations unless certain psychological conditions are fulfilled by those who receive the benefits, and possibly also by those who provide them. But, as we have seen, it is doubtful that these conditions will be fulfilled by all those over whom states claim authority.

This has led some to abandon the idea that political obligation can be grounded in some sort of transaction whereby we offer our allegiance to our state in return for the services it provides. Some of the most interesting developments in the contemporary debate consists in exploring viable alternatives to this strategy.

5.1 Instrumental Justification

One influential line of argument justifies authority instrumentally, as a way to help its subjects do what they ought.

The normal and primary way to establish that a person should be acknowledged to have authority over another person involves showing that the alleged subject is likely better to comply with reasons which apply to him (other than the alleged authoritative directives) if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding, and tries to follow them, than if he tries to follow the reasons which apply to him directly. (Raz 1994: 214; see also Raz 1986: 38–69; Raz 2006)

Raz calls this the “normal justification thesis” (NJT). It is satisfied only if the authority bases his directives on the reasons which apply to the subjects (the “dependence thesis”) and if the subjects take his directives as “exclusionary” or “pre-emptive” reasons (see Section 1 above), displacing their own judgements about what is to be done on the merits (the “pre-emption thesis”). Three points need emphasis. First, a normal justification is not a unique justification, but one typical to a variety of practical and theoretical authorities. At its core idea is that justified authorities help their subjects do what they already have good reason to do; it does not apply when it is more important for the subjects to decide for themselves than to decide correctly. Second, although NJT has similarities to rule-utilitarianism, it is not a utilitarian theory: that requires further commitments about what sort of reasons are relevant and how about indirect policies may be pursued. Third, NJT does not require valid authority to promote the subject’s self-interest. For example, if there are investments it is immoral to make (e.g., in countries that tolerate slavery) then a consultant’s recommendations merit deference only they steer one away from those investments: it is not enough (or permissible) for them to maximize one’s financial returns. NJT is governed by whatever reasons correctly apply to the case, not reasons of which the agent is aware, or which serve his self-interest narrowly understood.

Something like this does capture the way we justify deferring to expert opinions of scientists or to the advice of doctors who know better than we do. Were we to try to second-guess them we could not profit from their expertise. To accept them as authoritative therefore requires deferring to their judgement, and allowing that to displace our own assessment of what is to be done. This is not blind deference: the subject remains attentive to higher-order considerations that determine whether the authority is trustworthy, acting in good faith, and so on. And the deference may be limited in scope and subject to checks of its effectiveness over time.

How far do such considerations apply to political authority? The idea that political authority is primarily justified by virtue of some valuable service it provides to those that are subject to it certainly seems appealing. And the view has a broader application than we might initially think, once we consider the important role that political authority is normally deemed to play in creating or supporting valuable schemes of social cooperation. If we have reasons to support such schemes and the NJT is correct, we may be justified in obeying the authority, even though the schemes in question are not those we would have chosen ourselves. The NJT is thus considered by many as well placed to justify obedience in general “co-ordination problems” and in situations in which individual reasoning might be self-defeating, for instance, in prisoner dilemmas.

A worry some have raised about NJT is that although able to vindicate the claim that we have reason to act as the authority requires, it seems unable to vindicate the claim that we have an obligation to do so. As we have seen, authorities are normally thought to have the moral power to impose obligations over us, or at least the right to coerce us to act as they require. Experts, by contrast, lack such power. Refusing to comply with their directives, no matter how foolish, doesn’t give them the standing to demand compliance or to sanction us if we refuse. One of the main objections raised against NJT is that it blurs the distinction between being subject to someone’s authority and merely receiving advice from an expert (Perry 2005; Himma 2007; Darwall 2013: chs. 8–9; Tadros 2020; but see Raz 2010). A further objection is that Raz’s view fails to pay sufficient attention to the procedural aspects of the justification for political authority. We normally think that it’s important that the decisions of political authorities are the product of fair-democratic procedures, but a purely instrumental justifications seems insensitive to this sort of consideration (Waldron 1999; Shapiro 2002; Hershovitz 2003; Christiano 2004; Viehoff 2011).

As for its capacity to deal with coordination problems, it is uncertain how far deference to authority is really needed here. The extent to which people need authoritative guidance to secure cooperation varies with context, and law can solve some problems of cooperation simply by providing information or by restructuring incentives (see Green 1988: 89–157). That suggests that NJT covers only a narrow range of legitimate state activity. But in another way, NJT seems too broad. We do not think that political authority should be acknowledged whenever the rulers can better ensure conformity to right reason. There are matters that are too trivial or otherwise inappropriate for political regulation. So perhaps some sort of threshold condition must first be met, and NJT should be confined to issues of general social importance. (Raz’s view has had a pervasive influence in the debate, generating a vast literature. Recent works that engage with it include Shapiro 2002; Perry 2012; Enoch 2014; Macklem 2015.)

5.2 Necessity and Natural Duty

Arguments based on necessity may be motivated by just that worry. On this account, it is not enough that someone be able to help others track right reason, he must be able to do so within a certain domain. Locke thought the most urgent question for political philosophy was to “distinguish exactly the business of civil government” (Locke 1689 [1983: 26]), to determine what things are properly Caesar’s. Some contemporary writers take a related view. Elizabeth Anscombe argues that the domain of authority is the domain of necessary social functions.

If something is necessary, if it is, for example, a necessary task in human life, then a right arises in those whose task it is, to have what belongs to the performance of the task. (Anscombe 1978: 17)

But what tasks are necessary? Some, as we have seen, point to the production of “presumptively beneficial public goods”, goods that anyone would want and which require social co-operation to produce (Klosko 1991). Other views are more expansive. Finnis, for example, believes that law must provide a comprehensive framework for realizing a list of supposedly self-evident values including life, knowledge, play and religion (Finnis 1979: 81–97, 154–156). In between, we find a range of nuanced intermediate positions (see, for example, Copp 1999 and Perry 2012). An influential intermediate position ties political authority to the realm of justice and grounds obedience in a natural duty. According to John Rawls,

[t]his duty requires us to support and comply with just institutions that exist and apply to us. It also constrains us to further just arrangements not yet established, at least when this can be done without too much cost to ourselves. (Rawls 1971: 115)

The basis of Rawls’s theory in necessity becomes evident if we explore what it might be for a just institution to “apply to us”. An Institute for the Advancement of Philosophers cannot benefit us, however justly, and then demand that we pay its dues (Simmons 1979: 148). If so, it looks as if we need to accept the benefits provided by a given institution before the institution in question can be said to “apply to us”. But that is to transform a natural duty account into a weakly voluntarist one like fairness (see above, §4.2). One way to diagnose the force of such counterexamples is to notice that, although operating justly, the Institute is not something whose activities are required by justice: they are optional, not necessary (Waldron 1993).

This line of argument is one of the most popular in the contemporary debate. Some have developed Rawls’ somewhat vague idea of a duty to “support and comply with just institutions that exist and apply to us” by drawing on Kant’s political philosophy, whose central idea is that political authority is necessary to give concrete content and shape to moral rights that are otherwise indeterminate in the state of nature (Christiano 2008; Ripstein 2009; Stilz 2009). Others have drawn instead on Locke’s political philosophy, whose central idea is that even if fully determined rights do exist in the state of nature, they cannot be adequately protected without authoritative mechanisms designed to adjudicate and punish their violations (Buchanan 2002; Wellman 2005). On either of these views, we have a natural duty to leave the state of nature and enter civil society in order to be able to live next to each other on peaceful terms, respecting each other’s rights.

This duty is often conceived as a positive duty, for example as a duty to do our part in saving others from the dangers of the state of nature by supporting just institutions (Wellman 2005). But this view seems problematic if we accept that the dangers of the state of nature are primarily the product of a range of coordination problems which are generated by the fact that we live next to each other without being subject to the same political authority. These are not dangers that we can save others from by subjecting ourselves to the political authority; these are dangers that we expose others to if we live next to them without being subject to the political authority (Renzo 2008). If so, the duty to support just institutions is best understood as grounded in a negative duty not to threaten others, rather than in a positive one. Political authority is necessary to neutralize the threat we pose to each other when we live in physical proximity while lacking mechanisms to set and enforce shared norms (Kant 1797; Renzo 2011; but see Steinhoff 2016).

The main challenge for Natural Duty views is, once again, that it’s unclear how we should make sense of the idea that certain institutions “apply to us”. For even if we rule out just institutions whose activities are not required by justice (like Simmons’ Institute for the Advancement of Philosophers), we are still left with a large number of candidates that, in principle, seem to have authority over us. At least when we think about the political authority of states, we normally think that the scope of the authority is limited to the individuals living on the territory of each state (or individuals related in special ways to those living in their territory). And we normally think that those individuals owe political obligations to their state in particular, obligations that they do not owe to other states, regardless of how just they are. But how can we vindicate this idea, if what grounds political authority is our duty to support just institutions? Why couldn’t we discharge this duty by obeying and supporting some state other than the one which claims authority over the territory where we live? (See Waldron 1993 for an influential answer to this question; and Simmons 2005 for further criticism.)

Another challenge concerns a second component of Anscombe’s claim that

[i]f something is necessary, if it is, for example, a necessary task in human life, then a right arises in those whose task it is, to have what belongs to the performance of the task.

Suppose we have adequately answered the question of which tasks states ought to be perform in order to perform their socially necessary functions. We then need to identify which rights they needed in order to be able to perform such tasks? Anscombe refers to the right to have what is necessary for the role, but what is that? Hume thought it obvious that political society could not exist without “exact obedience of the magistrate” but this is surely empiricism without the facts. Legal systems do tolerate a certain amount of disobedience without this hampering their capacity to function (Green 1988: 228–230).

5.3 Constitutive Obligations

A third type of non-transactional view challenges the very idea that a justification for political obligation is needed. For example, Thomas McPherson writes

[W]hy should I obey the government is an absurd question. We have not understood what it means to be a member of political society if we suppose that political obligation is something we might not have had and that therefore needs to be justified. (McPherson 1967: 64)

On this view, the many attempts to find independent moral principles to justify obligation are not merely mistaken, they are conceptually confused; they exhibit a “symptom of philosophical disorder” (Pitkin 1965 [1972: 75]). The question of political obligation should be addressed instead by attending to the meaning of “member”.

It is hard to find philosophers who still think that normative questions can be resolved by linguistic considerations, but a more sophisticated version of this strategy has been recently advanced by Margaret Gilbert (2006), relying on the idea that members of political communities are jointly committed to uphold its institutions, and thereby obligated to play their part in executing this joint commitment. (Notice, however, that for Gilbert, these obligations are not moral in nature and thus her view is, in this important respect, very different from all the other views we are considering.)

A more influential version of the constitutive argument appeals to the value of associative obligations. Here the starting point is the observation that we often find ourselves involved in relationships and practices that come with special responsibilities attached to them. Even when we have not chosen to be part of them, it’s our very membership in them that brings with it distinctive “role obligations” (Hardimon 1994). Failing to realize this fact is failing to correctly interpret the responsibilities and practices in question (Dworkin 1986: 198). It’s in this sense that Ronald Dworkin claims that

[p]olitical association, like family or friendship and other forms of association more local and intimate, is itself pregnant of obligation. (Dworkin 1986: 206)

We can make sense of these valuable practices and relationships only if we correctly understand the role that the obligations associated with them are meant to play. Indeed, some go further and argue that given that these roles are typically crucial components of our own identity, correctly understanding the obligations in question is necessary to avoid being alienated from ourselves (Horton 2010; Tamir 1995). The social preconditions of our identity are partly constituted by these obligations, so making sense of them is required to ultimately make sense of who we are. By making sense of these obligations, we ultimately make sense of ourselves.

Some have resisted this move by pointing out that while people in organic associations do often feel obligations to other members, we normally seek an independent ground to justify them (see Simmons 1996; Wellman 1997). After all, it’s hardly surprising that members who have been socialized within a certain practice will feel that their identity is shaped in important ways by the responsibilities associated with it. The worry is that, absent a justification for this treatment, these feelings are merely an instance of false consciousness. It’s worth noticing, however, that whilst this might be an objection for communitarian versions of the theory (Horton 2010), it is not an objection against Dworkin’s formulation of the associative view. Dworkin does believe that we have

a duty to honour our responsibilities under social practices that define groups and attach special responsibilities to membership. (Dworkin 1986: 198)

provided the group’s members think that their obligations are special, personal, and derive from a good faith interpretation of equal concern for the well-being of all its members. But for him these conditions are not a matter of the members’ actual feelings and thoughts. Rather, they are interpretive properties that we would do well to impute to the members. Even so, why think that they ground a duty of obedience, as opposed to a duty of respectful attention, or a duty to apologize for cases of non-compliance? Certainly obedience is not part of Dworkin’s paradigm virtue of “fraternity”—mutual aid and support are the normal obligations there. Indeed, the classical associative model for political authority was not fraternity, but paternity, against which Locke argued so decisively. This is not to deny that we owe something to those decent associations of which we find ourselves non-voluntary members—but this doesn’t seem enough to vindicate political obligation (on Dworkin’s view, see Perry 2008).

A second objection to the associative model consists in pointing out that even if we concede that the model can justify obligations that are owed to members of small groups, which are structured around close personal interactions, this is not yet to say that it can do the same with obligations that are owed members of large groups, such as our political communities, most of whom we never have a chance to meet or interact with (Simmons 2001: Chapter 4; but see Horton 2010 and Gilbert 2006). It’s unclear, however, how forceful this obligation is. Suppose that I’ve been unable to interact with my parents or my siblings for most—or even all—of my life, for reasons that none of us could control. Does that mean that my special obligations to them are automatically cancelled? Perhaps, under certain circumstances, but not necessarily.

A more promising objection targets the idea that associative obligations are non-voluntary. This is certainly true if by “non-voluntary” we mean that we don’t necessarily choose to enter the relationships and the practices that are meant to generate the obligations. While it might be unclear whether we can choose to become friend with someone (as opposed to our friendship forming spontaneously), we normally don’t choose to enter our family. Still, it is possible for parents to disown their children and for children to deny their parents, under certain conditions. When the attitudes of reciprocal trust and affection that are meant to support these relationships disappear, the accompanying obligations are significantly weakened, and possibly extinguished. This has led some to argue that associative responsibilities are best understood as “quasi-voluntarist”. Although they are not premised on a choice to enter the relationship with which they are associated, they are conditional on the relationship being endorsed, if only in the minimal sense that we could have stepped out of it, had we wished to (Renzo 2012; but see Dagger 2018: 79–82). But once we go down this road, we are faced, once again, with the worry afflicting voluntaristic accounts, such as those that appeal to consent or fairness. If endorsing our membership in the political community is a condition for having the role obligations associated with such membership, then anyone who fails to do so lacks political obligation.

6. Scepticism and Anarchism

As the above survey suggests, there are plausible objections to each of the dominant justifications for the duty to obey the law. (For helpful assessments of other theories, see also Wasserstrom 1963; Smith 1973; Simmons 1979; Huemer 2013.) Each leaves significant gaps in the authority of law. This is not an impossibility proof—only anarchists like Wolff think that justified political authority is impossible. But neither is it just the familiar problem that philosophical theories provide only a rough fit to our casuistic judgements. The problem is that the typical justifications for authority are all sensitive to context in a way that the claims of law are not. To put it another way, law itself purports to determine how far and in what contexts its authority binds. (For a formulation of the sceptical view that explores its relationship with legal positivism, see Kramer 1999.)

The resulting scepticism about the obligation to obey has given rise to a debate about its significance (Senor 1987; Gans 1992: 90). As in other areas of philosophy, some treat sceptical conclusions as a reductio against whatever premises seem to support them; others are inclined to follow the arguments where they lead. In assessing the significance of scepticism, one needs to bear in mind several points.

To begin with, scepticism about political obligation flows from the special features of legal authority, in particular, its wide scope, its institutionalized character, and its moral fallibility. That is why the familiar principles by which we justify the authority of teachers, parents, doctors, or executors do not readily generalize to cover all laws. Most sceptical arguments are about over-reach. They do not deny that legal authority is often valuable, or that there is often content-dependent reason to do what law requires; they do not deny that some people have moral obligations to obey; they do not even deny that there are some laws that everyone has a moral obligation to obey. They deny only that the conscientious subject is bound to take the law at its word, that he must share the self-image of the state.

This does not amount to endorsing a policy of “pick and choose”. It is consistent with a mixed policy: there may be areas and issues with respect to which one should accept an obligation of obedience and others where one should apportion one’s compliance to the merits. Hart writes:

The recognition of an obligation to obey the law must as a minimum imply that there is at least some area of conduct regulated by law in which we are not free to judge the moral merits of particular laws and to make our obedience conditional on this judgment. (Hart 1958: 104)

Sceptical arguments need not deny that there is some such area; they deny that it coincides with law’s actual claims.

Secondly, scepticism about obligation does not entail scepticism about legitimacy: one may affirm that law is entitled to coerce while denying that all of law’s subjects have a duty to obey it (see Green 1988; Simmons 1979; Edmundson 1998). Scepticism about the possibility of legitimate government leads to anarchism of the ordinary sort; scepticism about political obligation leads only to what is called “philosophical anarchism”: the denial that law has all the authority it claims for itself.

Thirdly, scepticism is not the view that assuming an obligation to obey would be impermissible, as suggested by anarchists like William Godwin or R. P. Wolff and extreme individualists like Thoreau. Rather, sceptics argue that there are also other morally permissible attitudes to have towards the law. These attitudes may be more prevalent, and more justifiable, than some philosophers suppose.

Finally, it’s worth noticing that, if successful, the objections considered above only show that there is no principle capable of grounding political obligation over all those over whom states claim authority. But why think that a sound theory of political obligation should appeal to a single principle? Perhaps our best account of political obligation will employ different principles to justify the state’s right to demand our obedience in different areas (Klosko 2005) and over different individuals (Renzo 2012 and 2014). One way of overcoming skepticism about political obligation is to be pluralist about it (J. Wolff 2000; Knowles 2010; Mokrosinska; 2012)


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