Jeremy Bentham

First published Tue Mar 17, 2015; substantive revision Wed Dec 8, 2021

Jeremy Bentham, jurist and political reformer, is the philosopher whose name is most closely associated with the foundational era of the modern utilitarian tradition. Earlier moralists had enunciated several of the core ideas and characteristic terminology of utilitarian philosophy, most notably John Gay, Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Claude-Adrien Helvétius and Cesare Beccaria, but it was Bentham who rendered the theory in its recognisably secular and systematic form and made it a critical tool of moral and legal philosophy and political and social improvement. In 1776, he first announced himself to the world as a proponent of utility as the guiding principle of conduct and law in A Fragment on Government. In An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (printed 1780, published 1789), as a preliminary to developing a theory of penal law he detailed the basic elements of classical utilitarian theory. The penal code was to be the first in a collection of codes that would constitute the utilitarian pannomion, a complete body of law based on the utility principle, the development of which was to engage Bentham in a lifetime’s work and was to include civil, procedural, and constitutional law. As a by-product, and in the interstices between the sub-codes of this vast legislative edifice, Bentham’s writings ranged across ethics, ontology, logic, political economy, judicial administration, poor law reform, prison reform, punishment, policing, international law, education, religious beliefs and institutions, democratic theory, government, and administration. In all these areas he made major contributions that continue to feature in discussions of utilitarianism, notably its moral, legal, economic and political forms. Upon this rests Bentham’s reputation as one of the great thinkers in modern philosophy.

1. Life and Writings

Jeremy Bentham was born on 15 February 1748 and died on 6 June 1832 in London. He was the elder son of an attorney, Jeremiah Bentham (1712–92) and his first wife, Alicia Whitehorn (d. 1759), and brother to Samuel (1757–1831), a naval architect and diplomat. Bentham’s later interest in educational reform was rooted in his unhappy experiences at Westminster School (1755–60) and Queen’s College, Oxford (BA 1763, MA 1766). He described Westminster as “a wretched place for instruction” (1838–43, X, 30), while his three years at Queen’s, which he entered at the age of twelve, were no more stimulating. He viewed the Oxbridge colleges as seats of privilege, prejudice and idleness. His Oxford experience left him with a deep distrust of oaths and sparked a general antipathy toward the Anglican establishment (2011, 35–40). In the early 1770s, he jotted down notes for a critical work on “Subscriptions [to articles of faith]” (UC v, 1–32; xcvi, 263–341), and returned to the same theme in the controversial tract Swear Not at All (1817).

Following Oxford Bentham attended the Court of King’s Bench, Westminster Hall as part of his preparation for a law career. There he heard cases argued before Lord Mansfield, including the proceedings against the radical journalist and politician John Wilkes. He returned briefly to Oxford in 1763–64 to attend lectures given by William Blackstone, the first Vinerian Professor of English Law, which were published in four celebrated volumes as Commentaries on the Laws of England (1765–69). Bentham was not impressed, detecting glaring fallacies in Blackstone’s natural law reasoning. In the years following other aspects of Blackstone’s theory received his critical attention, notably his defence of England’s “mixed and balanced” government and English common law. Thereafter Blackstone was associated in Bentham’s mind with the “every-thing-as-it-should-be” school of legal and political apologetics.

Bentham was called to the Bar in 1769, but his legal career lasted only one brief. In that year he discovered the utility principle and related ideas in the writings of Hume, Helvétius and Beccaria and chose instead a career dedicated to analytic jurisprudence, law reform, and social and political improvement. Unaware of Hutcheson’s version of the utilitarian formula in An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1729), Bentham was occasionally deceived by faulty memory into thinking he had discovered it in Priestley’s Essay on the First Principles of Government (1768). More plausible, however, are his claims to have found it in Beccaria’s Dei Delitti e delle Pene (1764), where the Italian law reformer announced that the only valid criterion for evaluating the merits of a law is “la messima felicità divisa nel maggior numero”—the greatest happiness of the greatest number. In reading Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40)—which declared that all social inquiry should be based on the “experimental Method of Reasoning”—Bentham found virtue equated with utility, at which he “felt as if scales had fallen from my eyes” (1776 [1977, 440n]). Having borrowed the nomenclature of utility from Hume, Bentham then turned to De lesprit (1758), in which Helvétius delineated the potential for utility to act as a guide to human conduct by making a connection “between the idea attached to the word … ‘happiness’ … and the ideas attached to the words ‘pleasure’ and ‘pain’”. This meant, as he recalled in the “Article on Utilitarianism” (1829), that “attached to the words ‘utility’ and ‘principle of utility’ were now ideas in abundance”, from which “a commencement was made of the application of the principle of utility to practical uses” (1983a, 290).

Bentham’s writings present distinct challenges for the historian of ideas: the dates of publication are not always consistent with the time of composition, in some instances with many intervening years; a good number were published posthumously, and some have still to appear in authoritative editions; many were produced, edited or translated by other hands from original manuscripts with little authorial control.

Bentham launched his career as a legal theorist in 1776 with the anonymously published A Fragment on Government. This slim volume is an offshoot of a larger critique of Blackstone that was not published until the twentieth century, and is now known as A Comment on the Commentaries. In the Fragment Bentham stated the “fundamental axiom” that “it is the greatest happiness of the greatest number that is the measure of right and wrong”, and “the obligation to minister to general happiness, was an obligation paramount to and inclusive of every other” (1776 [1977, 393, 440n]). In An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (IPML), his major work of this early period, he described utility as “that property in any object” which “tends to produce benefit, advantage, good or happiness” (all commensurate terms in Bentham’s moral vocabulary), and the utility principle as “that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question” (1789 [1970, 12]). Bentham would give these basic postulates exposition, argumentative support, and further refinement in the decades following, but it was the operationalization of the utility principle that absorbed most of his energy and time during a long and highly productive working life.

In 1781, Bentham—who delighted in inventing new terminology to describe philosophical concepts—coined the name “utilitarian” in recording a dream he had while a guest at the country estate of his patron, the Whig politician William Petty, 2nd Earl of Shelburne (1737–1805). In this dream he imagined himself “a founder of a sect; of course a personage of great sanctity and importance. It was called the sect of the utilitarians” (text of the dream in Crimmins 1990, 314). It was through Shelburne that he became acquainted with the Genevan exile Étienne Dumont (1759–1829), who was to play a critical role in making Bentham’s name and philosophy known in continental Europe and elsewhere through the publication of a number of translations and redactions of his early writings (1829–30; see Blamires 2008). The most important of these were the three volumes of Traités de législation civil et pénale (1802) assembled from early manuscript drafts, parts of IPML and other works. The first two volumes on civil and penal law were later re-translated into English by the American utilitarian Richard Hildreth and published as The Theory of Legislation (1840 [1864]), a text that remained at the centre of utilitarian studies in the English-speaking world through to the middle of the twentieth century.

In 1786–87 Bentham visited Russia, where his brother Samuel was in the pay of Prince Potemkin, the favourite of Empress Catherine. There he wrote A Defence of Usury (1787), his first contribution to economic affairs, in which he rejected Adam Smith’s defence of a legal maximum for interest rates. Bentham argued that Smith’s position was inconsistent with his general advocacy of freedom of trade and would restrict economic growth and national prosperity by deterring investment and innovation. The volume later received high praise from J.S. Mill, who thought it “the best extant writing on the subject” (1963–91, II, 923). It received its widest audience in America, where it was reprinted on many occasions and frequently cited in the debates over the usury laws (Crimmins 2022, 53–54, 75, 209–11). It was in Russia, too, that Bentham took an idea of Samuel’s and developed it into the “panopticon”, the full dimensions of which he explained in Panopticon; Or, The Inspection House (1791). The panopticon is a building of circular design intended for any institutional arrangement where the “inmates” required constant supervision—such as hospitals, schools, workhouses and poor houses—but the panopticon became most well-known as a prison for “grinding rogues honest and idle men industrious” (1838–43, IV, 342). Appalled by the inefficiency and inhumane conditions in Britain’s penal regime, Bentham developed the idea of the panopticon penitentiary as a substitute penal system, in which convicted criminals would be subject to a disciplinary regime based on the maxim (penned in relation to his poor law writings of 1797, but not then published) that “the more strictly we are watched, the better we behave” (2001, 277). In achieving the ends of punishment it represented a significant advance on the dilapidated condition of England’s gaols, the rat-infested hulks anchored in the Thames and the practice of transporting convicts into penal servitude in the colonies. In the years following, Bentham used this critique as a platform to expand upon his general disdain for colonies, first enunciated in Emancipate Your Colonies! in 1793 (2002, 289–313), to argue for a free, self-governing community of settlers in southern Australia in “Colonization Company Proposal” (1831 [2022]; see also Causer, Finn and Schofield 2022).

Upon his return from Russia, Bentham was encouraged by Shelburne to turn his attentions to foreign policy and international law. The term “international” was coined by Bentham. He drafted short papers on several topics that were later published under the general title Principles of International Law. This work included, as was then the philosophical vogue, “A Plan for Perpetual Peace” and, uniquely, a proposal for an international court of arbitration (1838–43, II, 535–71). Sympathetic to both Russia and France at this time, in 1789 he issued a critique of Prime Minister William Pitt’s war-like stance towards these countries in a series of letters in the Public Advertiser under the nom-de-plume “Anti-Machiavel” (1838–43, X, 201–11).

The political upheaval in France provided Bentham with an opportunity to put certain of his ideas into practice and also the context in which he first developed the utilitarian logic of democracy based on the identification of interests between the ruler and the ruled. He nevertheless stopped short of publicly advocating parliamentary reform in Britain and at this stage was very far from the republicanism he adopted in later life (Dinwiddy 1975; Crimmins 1994; Schofield 2006). With Dumont’s assistance, in 1788 Bentham began sending pamphlets of suggestions to the Comte de Mirabeau. In 1790 he wrote a Draught of a New Plan for the Organisation of a Judicial Establishment in France which, together with Dumont’s translation of parts of Panopticon and parts of An Essay on Political Tactics dealing with the organisation of legislative proceedings, was also placed before the French National Assembly. The bloody excesses of the Terror reinforced his criticism of the abstract and slippery nature of natural and imprescriptible rights, which he famously dismissed as “nonsense on stilts” (1795 [2002, 330])—a disposition formed while listening to Blackstone’s lectures and which shaped his contribution to John Lind’s An Answer to the Declaration [of Independence] of the American Congress (1776). Nevertheless, Bentham’s efforts to stimulate reform in France were recognised in the granting of honorary citizenship in September 1792.

When war broke out between England and revolutionary France, Pitt’s security measures made it precarious to engage in reform activities at home, but Bentham’s caution also stemmed from the need to curry favour in official circles for the panopticon penitentiary (Semple 1993, 187–90). The building of a new prison in London had been authorised by the Penitentiary Act 1794 and Bentham’s plan initially received the support of the Pitt administration. Over the years he devoted considerable sums of his own money to the project, and published further material comparing the merits of the panopticon with the disadvantages of the transportation system (2022). In 1802, however, he admitted defeat, and in 1812 the government officially closed the books on the whole sorry affair, paying Bentham £23,000 in compensation.

In the intervening years Bentham turned his attentions to poor law reform, the reform of policing, economic and financial questions, judicial administration and the rules of evidence—the last of these being a product of his critique of the archaisms and confusions of common law and the arbitrary character of “judge-made law” (Postema 1989).

The essays on poor law reform from 1796–98 (2001, 2010a) were partly stimulated by rising food prices and the resultant debate about the treatment of the poor. The essays contained a plan for a system of “industry houses” run by a joint-stock company (named the National Charity Company) to house the indigent, provide them with employment, and provide welfare services for the working poor, the short-term unemployed and disabled or unwell (Bahmueller 1981). On police reform, Bentham was in advance of the age in advocating preventive policing and evidence-based crime analysis (see the essays in Jacques and Schofield 2021). Bentham’s writings on political economy include A Manual of Political Economy (1790–95), A Protest Against Law Taxes (1795), Supply without Burthen; or Escheat Vice Taxation (1795), “Circulating Annuities” (1799–1800), “Paper Mischief” (1800–1), The True Alarm (1801), Institute of Political Economy (1800–4), and Defence of a Maximum (1801). Few of these were published during Bentham’s lifetime, and some only became known in the mid-twentieth century (Stark 1952–54), which explains their relative neglect compared to the attention given the writings of other political economists of the period. New editions are now in progress (two volumes so far, 2016a, 2019, with more to come) which will provide abundant material for a reassessment of Bentham’s contributions to this field. The writings on monetary matters, in particular, contain original and innovative solutions to practical financial and currency difficulties. While many of the economic policies recommended and defended in these writings derive from Bentham’s reading of Adam Smith—with the notable exception of the prescriptions contained in Defence of a Maximum—they are also expressly based on the subordinate ends of his theory of civil law (Kelly 1989), as were his ideas for poor law reform (Quinn 2008).

After ruminating on the subject for several years, Bentham took up the reform of judicial administration in Scotch Reform (1808), while the voluminous manuscripts on evidence from this time were later edited and published by J.S. Mill as Rationale of Judicial Evidence (1827). In the latter, Bentham laid down practical guidelines on the forms and admissibility of evidence, favouring “natural” over “technical” procedures as most apt to produce truth in court proceedings and to rid the system of vexation, expense, and delay, which he attributed to the vested interest of lawyers in maintaining an arrangement designed to maximize legal fees. In courts open to the public, judges were to be charged with following basic principles that would allow for the most complete and accurate testimony available (Twining 1985, 42, 70; Schofield 2006, 119–31; Resnick 2011). Adjudication in Bentham’s reformed courts would require the strict application of the utilitarian codes of law. The overriding consideration was the subordination of the judge to the lawmaker, though the judge may (if empowered) suspend the execution of the law where utility demanded, pending a final decision by the legislature (Dinwiddy 1989a).

Despite these wide and varied interests, the government’s betrayal over the panopticon continued to anger Bentham for many years, generating a deep-seated scepticism of the motives of those in positions of power and influence. Added to his own first-hand experience of the maneuvers of aristocratic landowners determined to prevent the erection of a panopticon in the vicinity of their London estates, there was also a suggestion that the King himself, outraged by Bentham’s “Anti-Machiavel” letters and disturbed by rumours of his Jacobinism, may have directly intervened to thwart the project (1830–31 [1838–43, XI, 96–105]). In Bentham’s mind such actions were representative of the “sinister interests” typically ranged against beneficial schemes of reform. This insight served to draw Bentham into an open engagement with parliamentary reform. A further catalyst came from his association with James Mill, whom he met in late 1808, and who for many years thereafter acted as his philosophical and political aide-de-camp.

With Mill’s encouragement, Bentham returned to his earlier manuscripts on political reform and refined and significantly expanded his critique to encompass the forms of “influence” at work in British political institutions. The drafts he wrote in 1809–10 provided the outlines for his first public statement in support of representative democracy in Plan of Parliamentary Reform in the Form of a Catechism with Reasons for Each Article (1817). Based on the arithmetic of interests, aimed at limiting the sinister interests of those in positions of power while promoting the interests of those without power, Bentham advocated a comprehensive set of reforms. These included: the elimination of royal patronage, a substantial extension of the franchise, annual elections by secret ballot, the election of intellectually qualified and independent members of parliament with a system of fines to ensure regular attendance, and the accurate and regular publication of parliamentary debates. Without these reforms Bentham believed Britain risked revolution. From this point on, he became widely recognised as the foremost philosophical voice of political radicalism.

Other political writings from this time include Defence of Economy against the Right Honourable Edmund Burke and Defence of Economy against the Right Honourable George Rose, both written in 1810 but not published until 1817 (1993, 39–155). These essays attacked waste and corruption in government and were later reissued, with other previously published essays, in Official Aptitude Maximized, Expense Minimized (1830), the overall aim of which was to optimize the competence of public servants while reducing government expenditure. In 1824, Bentham’s Book of Fallacies appeared, in which he employed a humorous vein of barbs to lay bare the fallacious reasoning frequently used to bolster sinister interests and stymie proposals for reform (2015).

Bentham’s position on female suffrage at this time was nuanced (Boralevi 1984, Ch.2): he objected to the exclusion of women from the vote in James Mill’s 1820 essay “On Government” (UC xxxiv, 303), an exclusion he had long ago condemned as founded on nothing but prejudice (2002, 247; 1838–43, III, 463), Nevertheless, in public he argued that women were to be excluded until such time as universal male suffrage had been achieved (1838–43, IX, 108).

Closely related to Bentham’s critique of the political establishment were his substantial criticisms of religious institutions, practices and beliefs in Church–of–Englandism and its Catechism Examined (1818), An Analysis of the Influence of Natural Religion on the Temporal Happiness of Mankind (1822), and Not Paul, but Jesus (1823). In these works he brought to bear with telling scepticism his reasoning on logic, language and ontology from the same period (1838–43, VIII, 193–338; Crimmins 1990). At about the same time, he also wrote at length on private ethics in Deontology, published posthumously in two volumes in 1834. Education was another topic that occupied Bentham in these years. In Church–of–Englandism he was highly critical of the education offered in the schools run by the National Society for Promoting the Education of the Poor in the Principles of the Established Church. When Mill, Francis Place and others became involved in a scheme to establish a non-sectarian school in London, Bentham busied himself with ideas for its curriculum, stressing science and vocational subjects over the classics, the first part of which (printed in 1815) appeared in 1816 in Chrestomathia (meaning “conducive to useful learning”) and a second part in 1817 (Itzkin 1978). While the Chrestomathic school was never built, in 1826 the same reformers, with support from a number of Evangelicals and Nonconformists, formed the nucleus of a group that succeeded in founding University College London, England’s first secular university. An important supplement to Bentham’s educational theorizing is contained in a long appendix to the Chrestomathia on logic and classification, later translated and edited by his nephew George Bentham and published as Essai sur la nomenclature et la classification des principles branches d’art-et-science (1823).

In his final years Bentham revisited aspects of his utilitarian philosophy and sought to define his place in the utilitarian tradition in the “Article on Utilitarianism”. However, more often than not his thoughts were focused on constitutional questions, including the administrative structures and the formal and informal arrangements of a viable representative democracy—in short, the ways and means of limiting and controlling political authority or, as Bentham termed them, “securities against misrule”. Codification Proposal, Addressed … to all Nations Professing Liberal Opinions (1822) was intended to advertise his credentials as a codifier of law to politicians and statesmen around the world, first by setting down the utilitarian principles of an “all-comprehensive” code, and second by providing testimonials to his aptitude for the task of codification (1998, 241–384; see also Lieberman 2011). The testimonials came from far and wide in the years 1814–22, in the form of extracts from speeches, requests for information, and letters of support, from the likes of Francis Burdett and Henry Brougham in England, government ministers and representatives of the Cortes in Spain and Portugal, Italian and French liberals, state governors and other political representatives in the “Anglo-American States”, the Russian Emperor Alexander, and the influential Polish statesman Prince Czartoriski. In the years following, Bentham produced draft upon draft of elements of the Constitutional Code, only the first of three volumes of which was published during his lifetime. In these writings he unequivocally pinned his colours to the republican cause, but also demonstrated an acute sense of the growing importance of the administrative functions of the modern state (Rosenblum 1978; Hume 1981; Rosen 1983).

In old age Bentham liked to style himself “the hermit of Queen’s Square Place” (the location of his home in London), but he was anything but a hermit. In December 1823 he provided funds to start the Westminster Review, a periodical dedicated to radical views. He also assumed a leadership role in the movement for law reform and political reform, maintained regular contact with similarly inclined reformers, publishers and intellectuals at home and abroad, and was surrounded by disciples who acted as secretaries, collaborators, and editorial assistants. The Mills, Place, George Grote, Richard Smith, Peregrine Bingham, Thomas Southwood Smith, Edwin Chadwick, and John Bowring all worked with Bentham in this way. Together with others, such as Thomas Perronet Thompson, Charles Buller, John Roebuck and Joseph Hume, these later came to be known as the “philosophic radicals” (a coinage of J.S. Mill’s), though in reality the group was far less cohesive than is sometimes thought (Thomas 1979). Bentham had a telling influence on the Irish socialist utilitarian William Thompson and for a time he maintained close ties with the Irish “Liberator” Daniel O’Connell, whom he sought to bind, with limited success, to the radical cause in parliament (Crimmins 2013, Ch.7). Burdett and Brougham were also treasured acquaintances, though this did not prevent Bentham from expressing scepticism about the dedication to radical reform of the former, or from criticising the latter’s proposals to reform the Chancery Court in Lord Brougham Displayed (1832 [1838–43, V, 549–612).

Bentham never married, and died in the company of friends on the eve of the signing of the Great Reform Act. Convinced that even the dead should serve a utilitarian purpose, in his last will he directed that his body be publicly “anatomised” in order to publicize the benefits of donating bodies for medical research (Richardson 1986). The sanitary reformer and physician Thomas Southwood Smith (1832) delivered the eulogy over Bentham’s dissected remains. In preparation for this final act, in an unpublished pamphlet written in the year before his death, Auto-Icon; or Farther Uses of the Dead to the Living (printed 1842, but not then published), he proposed the display of auto-iconized bodies and heads as a means to public instruction. He requested that his own mummified head and skeleton, dressed in his habitual garments, be displayed, and it can still be viewed today at University College London. Bentham’s (admittedly eccentric and somewhat humorous) ideas about “auto-iconism” can also be understood as an attempt to find a secular substitute for the rituals and practices of conventional religion.

2. Philosophical Foundations

Preliminary to the analysis of existing legal systems and the construction of the utilitarian pannomion, in 1776 Bentham began drafting “Preparatory Principles” (of censorial jurisprudence or what the law ought to be). In these over 600 pages of manuscript, now published in authoritative form in the Collected Works (2016b), he offered a series of disquisitions on the definitions, distinctions, axioms, and aphorisms intended as tools for demystifying the “fictions” of English law and legal practice, fictions which he found uncritically reiterated in Blackstone’s Commentaries. In these and other early writings we see Bentham striving to emulate in the moral world the great advances made in physical science. In the process he consciously allied himself with the more progressive elements of the Enlightenment and made plain the intellectual influences that shaped his thought, notably Bacon, Locke, Hume, and the French philosophes.

Influenced by the empiricism of Bacon and Locke, Bentham held that all knowledge is derived from sensation: the intellect has no material to work with apart from that obtained by the senses. In the second half of the 17th century, the Royal Society had emphasized the role of experiment and empiricist epistemology in the development of the natural sciences. Suitably impressed by the progress made in this department of knowledge, Bentham carried over into moral science the basic principle that people can only know, in any certain or scientific sense of that term, that which can be observed and verified. He argued that legal science ought to be built on the same immovable basis of sensation and experience as that of medicine, declaring “what the physician is to the natural body, the legislator is to the political: legislation is the art of medicine exercised upon a grand scale” (UC xxxii, 168).

This was the core of the “experimental method” for Bentham; it was an approach implicitly associated in his mind with a materialist ontology and a representational theory of meaning. He rejected all forms of idealism in philosophy and insisted that in principle all matter is quantifiable in mathematical terms, and this extends to the pains and pleasures that we experience—the ultimate phenomena to which all human activity (and social concepts, such as rights and duty) could be reduced and explained.

In Bentham’s theory of language general terms have no corresponding reality: words, ideas and propositions must represent or describe “real entities”, which may be either “perceptions” or “substances” (UC lxix, 62–63), otherwise they are “fictitious entities”. This was a distinction Bentham learnt from d’Alembert (1838–43, III, 286), though he turned it to a more radical ontological purpose. He defined a fictitious entity as “a mere nothing” and “no proposition by which any property is ascribed to it can therefore be in itself and of itself a true one, nor therefore an instructive one”. If there is any truth associated with a fictitious entity it “can not belong to it in any other character than that of the intended and supposed equivalent of … some proposition having for its subject some real entity” (1838–43, VIII, 246). The technique of “paraphrasis” was the key instrument Bentham employed to demystify fictitious entities. Some fictitious entities are necessary for human discourse, but their meaning can only be revealed through their connection to real entities (1977, 495n; 2010b, 287–88, 317–18); if a fictitious entity proves impervious to this paraphrastic technique it is shown to be a meaningless abstraction unrelated to demonstrable reality. Concepts such as “obligation” and “ interests”, for example, can be rendered meaningful in terms of the perceptible pains and pleasures experienced and anticipated by specific individuals. Concepts like “community” derive their meaning from the sum of individuals that compose an actual community, and the happiness of a community is nothing but the aggregate happiness of the individuals that constitute the community in question. On the other hand, theological propositions, having no correlation with material reality, deal not with the facts of ordinary experience but with a supposed “reality” that transcends the physical world, and just as the language of opinion ought to have no place in the discourse of physical science, so the untestable and unverifiable propositions of theology have no place in moral science.

In IPML, Bentham directed this analysis against a host of ethical propositions he sought to eliminate as competing alternatives to the utility principle, such as “moral sense”, “common sense”, “law of reason”, “natural justice”, and “natural equity”. All are dismissed on the grounds that they are merely empty phrases that express nothing beyond the sentiment of the person who advocates them. Not representing verifiable reality, such phrases could not be considered useful. Indeed, they were surely pernicious, serving as a “pretense, and aliment, to despotism; if not … in practice, a despotism however in disposition” (1970, 28n). By comparison, “utility” was a principle rooted in the empirical and verifiable facts of the felt experience of pains and pleasures.

3. Pains and Pleasures

At the beginning of IPML Bentham offered the famous declamation that underscores the primacy of pains and pleasures in utilitarian theory:

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. They govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think: every effort we can make to throw off our subjection, will serve but to demonstrate and confirm it. In words a man may pretend to abjure their empire: but in reality he will remain subject to it all the while. The principle of utility recognises this subjection, and assumes it for the foundation of that system, the object of which is to rear the fabric of felicity by the hands of reason and of law. (1970, 11)

There are two forms of hedonism expressed in this seminal passage: (1) psychological hedonism, which states that all motives of action are grounded in the apprehension of pain or the desire for pleasure; and (2) ethical hedonism, which holds that pleasure is the only good and actions are right in so far as they tend to produce pleasure or avoid pain. As Bentham went on to explain, allowing for “immunity from pain”, pleasure is “the only good”, and pain “without exception, the only evil” (1970, 100). As such, pain and pleasure are the final cause of individual action and the efficient cause and means to individual happiness.

Nor were these observations restricted to humankind in Bentham’s view—the proposed penal code was to include a section on cruelty to animals. As he explained, “the question is not, Can they reason? Nor, can they talk? But, can they suffer?” (1970, 283n)—a proposition that lies at the beginnings of utilitarian arguments for the ethical treatment of animals (see Singer 1975).

Since each person’s happiness is constituted of the aggregate balance of pleasures over pains, this is “the sole end which the legislator ought to have in view: the sole standard in conformity to which each individual ought, as far as depends upon the legislator, to be made to fashion his behaviour” (1970, 34). But how is the legislator to influence individual actions and gain conformity to his decisions? Bentham delineated four “sanctions” or sources of pain and pleasure, which he may have learnt from Gay’s essay Concerning the Fundamental Principle of Virtue or Morality (1731): physical, political, moral, and religious. These sanctions (he later added sympathy to the list) are available to the moralist and to the legislator in guiding and determining an individual’s moral conduct, and they explain how an essentially self-interested individual may be encouraged and, where necessary, directed to perform actions that promote the greatest happiness of both himself and others. It is incumbent on the utilitarian legislator, therefore, to understand the “value” of the pains and pleasures he must employ to achieve this objective.

While the consequences of an act often depend on the motives which give rise to the act (and partly on the agent’s intentions and the circumstances in which the act is performed), in Bentham’s theory the utility of an act is independent of its originating motive(s). In effect, there is no such thing as a good or bad motive. The utility of an act—its goodness or badness—is determined solely by its consequences: the benefits and/or costs that result. When deciding whether to act or which act to undertake, a person must calculate as best as he can the pains and pleasures that may reasonably be expected to accrue to the persons (including himself) affected by the acts under consideration. A similar calculation should guide the legislator in formulating laws. However, Bentham recognised that it was not normally feasible for an individual to engage in such a calculation as a preliminary to undertaking every act. For this reason he spoke of the general tendencies of actions to enhance happiness (suggested by past experience) as a sufficient guide in most situations. On the other hand, the implicit consequentialism of utilitarian theory is central to Bentham’s theory of punishment, in which the objective was to ensure that a punishment is in proportion to the mischief produced by a crime and sufficient to deter others from committing the same offence. To this end he developed rules to guide the lawmaker in the construction of a penal code, including the elements involved in the calculation of the mischief caused by offences and the appropriate punishments.

3.1 Interests

In Helvétius’ account “interest” lies at the epicentre of moral science, but Bentham recognised that the concept only had meaning, like other fictitious entities in ethics such as “desire” and “motive”, when redefined in terms of the avoidance of pains and acquisition of pleasures (1970, 12; 1838–43, VIII, 290). In general he followed Adam Smith in believing the individual to be the best judge of his or her own interests, but the simplicity of this proposition is deceptive (see Engelmann 2001).

First, a person’s consideration of her interest involves expectations or mental projections of the future, not actually existing material interests. This involves the individual in imagining what will occur if she were to act in a certain manner. The specific expectations that attend the consideration of an action may be shaped by a myriad of external considerations, as well as the agent’s own predilections and preferences. For Bentham, the most important elements of the external environment in which a person imagines outcomes are the penalties and rewards laid down by law and those deriving from other educative and moral institutional arrangements and practices, including the sanction exercised by public opinion. In this sense, law and other agencies may be used to construct interests by providing individuals with the motives to pursue courses of action beneficial to the community. It is the individual who then must correctly perceive where her interests lie; she must imagine the expected outcomes the legislator has determined. The result is that Bentham’s material view of pains and pleasures as the factors which define “interest” tends to evaporate in favour of interests composed of imagined (though not imaginary) apprehensions and expectations about the future.

Second, Bentham recognised that explaining action in terms of interest is potentially circular. If we mean by acting according to interest, acting selfishly, then the statement “Agents act in accordance with their self-interest”, is false. If we mean, acting to pursue our interest in the widest sense, then the statement is tautological (2010b, 93n). In this respect, the validity of the “self-preference principle”—the assumption that self-interest is the motivation of all human action—is questionable. Bentham recognised the possibility of altruistic actions, and frequently alluded to his own philanthropy when recommending schemes to further the public good. Moreover, in IPML he held that sympathy was a “primeval and constant source” of pleasure and action (1970, 61), and later, in Deontology, elevated it to his list of sanctions as a source of pain and pleasure (1983a, 84, 183, 201, 203–4). However, if not all action is motivated by self-interest in the narrow or strict meaning of the term, then how far can the self-preference principle be considered a reliable guide for the legislator in constructing motives? Bentham’s answer, probably influenced by Hume’s view of the matter, is that the self-preference principle is a sound generalisation. While it is not true that everyone always acts in his or her self-interest, it is best that the legislator design institutions and law as if this were in fact true. Self-interested acts are the norm; altruism is the exception. As he explained it in the Constitutional Code (1830), even if the self-preference principle “held good in no more than a bare majority, of the whole number of instances, it would suffice for every practical purpose, in the character of a ground for all political arrangements” (1838–43, IX, 6).

Third, although individuals may in general be the best judges of their own interests, they may not always judge wisely. This creates a disjunction between the perception of their interest and their “real” interest. Since the “public interest” is a fictitious entity which represents nothing more than the aggregate of individual interests (1970, 12), an effective legislator must have a fairly accurate understanding of the interests of those individuals that constitute the community, of what will motivate them to act in the desired ways (especially in criminal law). But if people incorrectly perceive their interests, then the legislator may be misled in constructing the appropriate motivation. Clearly, the knowledge needed by the legislator (in order to be effective in constructing adequate motives to direct individual actions) is of people’s apparent interests, while the legislator’s objective is to further their “real” interests, that is, what they would choose if they were fully rational and informed. This means that assessing the value of the constituent elements of interest (pains and pleasures) is a tricky business for the legislator; he must accurately observe the ways people behave, deduce the motives behind their actions, and encompass this knowledge in the sanctions of law. Yet these same observations of human behaviour may not also be reliable guides to the “real” interests of individuals, which must be determined on other grounds. This is why some modern day utilitarians focus on “preferences”, that is on the subjectively expressed opinion of the individual as to what she thinks will be pleasurable or painful (see Bykvist 2013).

Bentham addressed the potential disjunction between an agent’s perception of her interest and her real interest in his writings on indirect law, which he described as “a secret plan of connected and long-concerted operations to be executed in the way of a stratagem or petite guerre” (2010b, 233). The aim is to tell individuals what they should not do, but also to provide them with motives (pains and pleasures in prospect) sufficient to divert their desires into channels best designed to serve the public interest. Codes of behaviour and other “implements of moral instruction”, such as texts of “history, biography, novels and dramatic compositions” (UC lxxxvii, 18–19), could be utilised to divert people from inclinations damaging to themselves and others and to teach them to derive pleasure from benevolence. In this way government could educate its citizens to make more effective choices, or at least guide them into more appropriate paths to achieve their real interests (1838–43, I, 161).

3.2 Felicific Calculus

Though Bentham did not use this terminology, the calculus he devised—commonly known as the “felicific calculus”—describes the elements or dimensions of the value of a pain or pleasure. To an individual the value of a pain or pleasure will be more or less according to its “intensity”, “duration”, “certainty or uncertainty”, and its “propinquity or remoteness”. Where the object is to measure the value of a pleasure or pain in terms of the tendency of an act, there are two additional circumstances to be taken into account: “fecundity” or “the chance it has of being followed by sensations of the same kind”, and “purity” or “the chance it has of not being followed by sensations of the opposite kind”. Where there are a number of persons, with reference to whom the value of a pleasure or a pain is considered, a further circumstance must be factored into the calculus, that is the “extent” or the number of persons who are affected by the pleasure or pain (1970, 38–39). Although Bentham believed there was nothing in what he had proposed “but what the practice of mankind, wheresoever they have a clear view of their own interest, is perfectly conformable to”, it has often been said that applying the felicific calculus is impractical. Bentham recognised that neither the individual nor the legislator could strictly follow the process he described. Rather, he presented it as a model of the ideal calculation, and “as near as the process actually pursued on these occasions approaches to it, so near will such process approach to the character of an exact one” (1970, 40).

As is well known, while adhering to the basic Benthamic analysis of motives, in Utilitarianism (1861) J. S. Mill introduced the concept of“higher pleasures”, by which he meant aesthetic and spiritual gratification and the pleasures of the intellect, and claimed these were intrinsically more desirable than other pleasures. This tended to undermine the aggregative dimension of the theory laid down by Bentham, since the depth of feeling associated with such pleasures resist quantification. Recent commentators, however, have questioned whether the distance between Bentham and Mill is as large as commonly supposed, arguing for example that “intensity” and “purity” are qualities of pains and pleasures that, in principle, are still subject to measurement, at least when comparing alternative actions on the same index (Warke 2000; Rosen 2003, Ch. 10).

3.3 Diminishing Marginal Utility

Bentham occasionally suggested that pains and pleasures might be evaluated in relation to income or wealth, but he was aware of the limitations of this approach. While we might plausibly assume that, of two individuals with unequal fortunes, the richer of the two would be the happier, it does not follow that adding increments to that person’s wealth will continue to make him happier in the same proportion. It is in the nature of the case that the amount of increase in happiness will not be as great as the increase in wealth; the addition of equal increments of money will eventually bring successively less of an increase in happiness. Modern economists know this analysis as the law of “diminishing marginal utility”. One of its practical consequences for a utilitarian such as Bentham is that, where choices present themselves between giving an additional increment to a rich man or to a poor man, more happiness will result from giving it to the poorer of the two. Also, the analysis underscores why money cannot be a direct measure of utility, since the utility represented by a particular sum of money will vary depending on the relative wealth of the person who receives it. Moreover, it is evident that diminishing marginal utility is also a feature of the additional increments of pleasure a person may experience beyond a certain point; equal increments of pleasure will not necessarily add to the stockpile of happiness if a person has reached a saturation point.

4. Later Improvements

In the 1829 “Article on Utilitarianism” Bentham pointed to two later “improvements” to his understanding of the utility principle—the “disappointment-prevention principle” and the “greatest happiness principle” (a substitute for the “greatest happiness of the greatest number” formula).

4.1 Disappointment-prevention Principle

For Bentham, the unhappiness created by the loss of something will usually have a greater impact on a person than the happiness brought about by its gain to someone else (1838–43, I, 304–7). All other things being equal, the reduction of utility to one person caused by theft will have a greater bearing on that person’s happiness than the gain in utility to another person from a lottery win of the same monetary value. Of course, if the loser is a wealthy person and the gainer a poor man, this will not hold. But in the normal run of things, this is why Bentham gave a higher priority to the protection of property by law and why he held that the alleviation of suffering demands more immediate attention than plans to produce wealth (1952–54, III, 324, 342). It is also the rationale for what Bentham later called the “disappointment-prevention principle” (1838–43, V, 416), which requires that the security of legitimate expectations take precedence over other ends, save where the public interest manifestly justifies government intervention, such as raising funds through taxation for vital services and the emergency expropriation of property in times of war or famine, usually with compensation paid to the property owner.

For Bentham, the significance of this principle as a practical guide could hardly be overstated. It is, he says, the “one all-comprehensive rule” upon which all property arrangements ought to be based (1983a, 308), and by this, “the first application, or say emanation, of the greatest happiness principle”, all the arrangements of the law of property “in its most extensive sense”, meaning “all objects of general desire”, ought to be ordered (295–96; see also 1838–43, III, 312).

4.2 Greatest Happiness Principle

Bentham detected a serious and potentially debilitating defect in rendering the utility principle as the “greatest happiness of the greatest number”. He came to see that such a principle could justify inordinate sacrifices by a minority, however that minority might be composed, in the interest of enhancing the happiness of a majority. He considered this a false conclusion, but one that needed to be addressed. “Be the community in question what it may”, he writes, “divide it into two unequal parts, call one of them the majority, the other the minority, lay out of the account the feelings of the minority, include in the account no feelings but those of the majority, the result you will find is that to the aggregate stock of the happiness of the community, loss, not profit, is the result of the operation”. The less the numerical difference between the minority and majority, the more obvious the deficiency in aggregate happiness will be (1983a, 309). Logically, then, the closer we approximate the happiness of all the members of the community, the greater the aggregate of happiness.

4.3 Universal Interest

As an additional improvement in the manner in which Bentham conceived the utility principle, he might have included the “universal interest”, an idea initially stated in Plan of Parliamentary Reform where it appears as a more particular conception of the greatest happiness principle aimed at the “maximum … of comfort and security” for all (1838–43, III, 452). The universal interest relates to interests that are shared by everyone, and only when it is impossible for government to contrive policies to achieve this end is a distribution of happiness less than universal or less than equal justified (1983b, 136). However, the number of decisions made by governments that are genuinely of universal reach are relatively few and may be limited to national defence and the framework of individual rights (securities). Beyond that, redistributive policies invariably involve unequal sacrifices and benefits. This means that the legislator must employ a utilitarian calculation in which the pain experienced by the few is reduced to the minimum necessary to produce benefits for the many; only on this basis may pleasures be summed and pains subtracted in order to produce the rationale to justify the best policy.

Related to this conception of the universal interest is the egalitarian commitment that in arriving at the appropriate law or policy the interests of each and all must count, and count equally (1840 [1864], I, 144). This does not mean that optimal utility is not the goal, but simply stresses that optimal utility is more likely achieved where there is an approximate equality in the distribution of the basic requirements of happiness (Postema 1998).

This aspect of Bentham’s theory has often been ignored or dismissed as irrelevant by critics who, from T. H. Green forward, argue that calculations of total utility fail to respect the distinctiveness of persons and thereby place their interests at perpetual risk (Rawls 1971, 22–27; Nozick 1974, 28–35; see the discussions in Ten 1987, 13–37; Rosen 2003, Chs. 12–13; and Bykvist 2010, Ch. 5). If deterrence can be achieved by punishing an innocent bystander when the real culprit cannot be caught or brought to justice, then why should the bystander not be punished? Because public utility would be maximised by making an example of an innocent bystander just as much as by punishing the person who was actually guilty of the offence but who has not been apprehended, it seems the utilitarian ought to support the punishment. But this is not only intuitively wrong, it is also wrong because there is a real danger that violations of security would lead to other such violations, with no principled basis to cease inflicting them. Bentham was emphatic on this score: “If it is a good thing to sacrifice the fortune of one individual to augment that of others, it will be yet better to sacrifice a second, a third, a hundred, a thousand, …; for whatever may be the number of those you have sacrificed, you will always have the same reason to add one more. In one word, the interest of everybody is sacred, or the interest of nobody” (1840 [1864], I, 144). Basic securities must be afforded to each and every member of the community, and violations of these vital interests are not justified, whether they be perpetrated by other individuals or government, since they contravene the distributive elements of utilitarian theory. To this extent, at the very least, each person’s happiness must count.

5. Subordinate Ends, Principles and Maxims

From early on in his utilitarian theorizing, Bentham understood that the achievement of utilitarian objectives in practice required the translation of the utility principle into elements amenable to implementation in ways that the philosophically abstract principle itself could not be. Concrete manifestations of happiness, for example, could be found in personal security and reduced crime rates, enhanced health and declining death rates, broader opportunities for education, the reduction of diseases caused by sewage pollution, and so on. The statistical measurement of these and other issues would provide a solid basis for the dissection of existing law and the development of new law, but Bentham’s thirst for such information was always well in advance of the available data. This deficiency did not, however, prevent him from developing the theoretical apparatus to direct the formulation of such laws.

In founding a system of law upon the principle of utility, Bentham announced near the beginning of his career, “I do no more than found it upon a set of rules” (UC lxix, 38). This was more than the Humean observation that utility is embedded in customary rules that have evolved over time. The maximization of utility required that the jurist cast a “censorial” eye on existing practices to test their capacity to enhance the greatest happiness. Where the jurist detects deficiencies, new rules and precepts must be developed that demonstrably accord with the utility principle. In Bentham’s hands this took the form of a multitude of subordinate or secondary ends, principles and maxims designed to give practical direction to the utility principle in each and every aspect of the law. The greatest happiness principle sets the over-arching objective and is the critical standard against which existing practices are to be judged. As such, it stands ever ready to be summoned forth whenever new guidelines are needed, subordinate ends conflict, or existing laws require amendment, refinement, or further elaboration. However, in practice it is the secondary elements of the theory that do the work of producing beneficial outcomes. In this way, they give practical concreteness to the philosophically abstract end of the greatest happiness.

6. Civil Law and Political Economy

The subordinate ends of civil law are security, subsistence, abundance, and equality, in this order of priority. “The more perfect enjoyment is in all these respects”, Bentham wrote, “the greater is the sum of social happiness: and especially of that happiness which depends upon the laws” (1840 [1864], I, 96). As we have seen, security is maintained by laws that protect property and the expectations derived from ownership, and uphold the contracts that facilitate the trade in goods and services. Subsistence and abundance are also derived from this source. When an overall abundance exists but not all enjoy the necessary means of subsistence, then legislative intervention may be conducted in accordance with the “disappointment-prevention principle”, such as when the state takes ownership of an estate for which there is no legitimate heir (122–23), or when a tax on income or property can be introduced without materially detracting from a person’s expectations, and the funds accrued used to provide food and basic services to those in need. Based on this redistribution of wealth, a degree of equalization is also achieved (Kelly 1990, 191–97), an objective entirely consistent with the view that, properly understood, the utility principle entails a presumption in favour of an equal distribution, unless there is compelling empirical evidence that utility would not be served by such a policy. As Bentham put it in Leading Principles of a Constitutional Code, “the more remote from equality are the shares … the less is the sum of felicity produced by the sum of those shares” (1838–43, II, 276).

The theory of “diminishing marginal utility” also lends support to equalization policies, dictating that decreases to the wealth of a rich man cause less pain than similar decreases to a poor man, while additions to the wealth of the poor man bring happiness in a greater amount than they would to a rich man (1840 [1864], I, 103–9). In First Principles Preparatory to Constitutional Code, written 1822 but not then published, Bentham went further, to postulate that the greatest happiness of the people “requires that the external instruments of felicity, whatsoever they may be, be shared by the whole number in a proportion so near to equality as is consistent with universal security” (1989, 16; see also 1840 [1864], I, 104). However, he refused to countenance the idea that policies to redistribute wealth at the cost of security would be beneficial either to social prosperity or individual wellbeing. Proposals to alter the distribution of wealth in line with diminishing marginal utility must, therefore, be conducted in accordance with the “disappointment-prevention principle”.

On the other hand, Bentham believed that a system of laws based on the utility principle would gradually and “indirectly” evolve towards greater equality in the distribution of goods, and pointed to the historical evidence of post-feudal Europe in support of his position. In the long run the key to achieving a more equal distribution of property lay in abundance: “in a nation prosperous in its agriculture, its manufactures and its commerce, there is a continual progress towards equality” (1840 [1864], I, 123). The important caveat Bentham introduced to justify this optimism is the proviso that government must not impede this tendency by allowing monopolies, putting “shackles” on trade and industry, or placing obstacles in the path of the division of property on inheritance.

Bentham believed that facilitating individuals in the pursuit of their interests in a free market is what government should do, because this is the proven best way to maximise the public good. Where laissez-faire does not produce the best result, however, the legislator must act in other direct and indirect ways to produce the optimal outcome. The question, as Bentham explained in Manual of Political Economy, “is to know what ought and what ought not to be done by government. It is in this view, and in this view only that the knowledge of what is done and takes place without the interference of government can be of any practical use” (1952–54, I, 224). In the Institute of Political Economy, he argued that past experience provided sufficient evidence to convince us that governments should not act in the economic realm as much as they often do, hence the motto “Be quiet” and the lists of “Non-agenda” items. Where departures from this general rule are required—such as when vital subsistence goods would be priced beyond the reach of many—they become “Agenda” items for government (1952–54, III, 333; see also 247–302). But radical schemes for property re-distribution are ruled out; the axiomatic requirement that each be treated equally, that the happiness of each be counted, justified policies to equalize the distribution of goods only where this could be achieved without disappointing legitimate expectations.

7. Penal Law and Punishment

Civil and penal law are inextricably connected in Bentham’s legal theory. Just as the primary purpose of civil law is economic security and national prosperity, so it draws powerful support from the protection afforded persons, property and expectations by the threat of punishment (1838–43, III, 203). To this end, utilitarian penal law is framed in terms of the principal objective of deterrence, but it also embraces the secondary ends of disablement, moral reformation, and compensation (see Crimmins 2011). The effectiveness of the theory in practice depends on two additional features: offences must be classified solely on the basis of the harm perpetrated, and there must be an appropriate proportion between crimes and punishments. It is because of its failure to satisfy the first feature that Bentham (2014) rejected the prevailing criminalization of consensual sexual acts, and developed the first systematic defence of sexual liberty in the English language.

In settling the required proportions of punishment, Bentham recognised he had burdened the legislator with a vastly complex task—the calculation of the correct quantity and type of pain needed to achieve the desired ends, in particular the objective of deterrence. To guide the legislator in proportioning punishments to offences he stipulated thirteen rules or “canons”, such as that the punishment must outweigh the profit of the offence, venture more against a great offence than a small one, punish for each particle of the mischief, and the like (1970, 167–71; see also Bedau, 2004; Draper, 2009). The delineation of such guidelines to protect against “unfrugal” or excessive punishments is indicative of his attempt to be as comprehensive and as exact as possible while attending to practicalities. This is nowhere more apparent than in Bentham’s critical analysis of the death penalty.

Bentham first examined the utility of the death penalty in the 1770s when he delineated the principles of penal law (1838–43, I, 441–50; see also 1970, Ch. XV), and followed this with an unpublished essay in 1809 in which he presented a critique of William Paley’s defence of the death penalty in his Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy (1785), and in particular the use of discretionary pardons (UC cvii, 193–277; Crimmins 1987). A further short essay “On Death-Punishment”, published in 1830, repeats many of the arguments from the first essay (1838–43, I, 525–32). Arguably, Bentham’s utilitarian analysis of the issues raised by the death penalty in the first of these essays stands as the most thoroughgoing examination of the question up to this time (Bedau 1983). In sum, it is a special application of his utilitarian theory of punishment. The framework of analysis is presented as an objective, neutral exercise, by which the benefits and costs of the death penalty in cases of murder are assessed in comparison with life imprisonment with hard labour. All things considered, Bentham believed the weight of the calculation worked against the death penalty on the grounds of deterrence, the fact that it is inequable in its application, falling mainly on the shoulders of the poor, and because it is a form of punishment that is irremissible in the face of judicial error. Nevertheless, at that time he thought the death penalty might reasonably be maintained for murder with aggravating circumstances and for cases of treason “in which the name of the offender, so long as he lives, may be sufficient to keep a whole nation in a flame” (1970 183). By 1809, however, he abandoned the exceptions and argued that no offence warranted capital punishment (UC cvii. 201).

8. Panopticon

Subordinate ends are also evident in the design and management of the panopticon prison: security and economy are foremost, but tempered by humanity and accountability. Impressed by the dynamic of its circular architecture which allowed the warden, obscured from view in the shuttered watchtower, to observe the activities of prisoners day and night, Michel Foucault took the perspective that “panopticism” defined a “new physics of power”, an experimental “laboratory of power” in which behaviour could be modified, and he viewed the panopticon—that “cruel, ingenious cage”—as a symbol of the repressive, disciplinary society, the modern “society of surveillance” (Foucault 208). This view of the panopticon has opened up some interesting lines of discourse on the encroaching methods of control and surveillance in contemporary liberal societies (Brunon-Ernst 2012). However, as a critique of Bentham’s proposals it hardly does justice to the intricacies of the project, as Semple (1993) has shown.

The end of economy determined that the panopticon prison should be a private self-sustaining operation not requiring financial assistance from the public purse. Security determined that the community be protected from convicted criminals, and severity in punishment was to serve the ends of deterrence and reformation. But security also required that the inmate be protected from cruel treatment, and humanity determined that prisoners should be deprived only of liberty not health or life. Prisoners were to be kept clean and their labour made productive and profitable, including the development of skills that might be useful to them when released. In support of these objectives, Bentham invoked several devices to effect transparency and accountability in prison government. The chief mechanism intended to bring the interest of the prison owner/administrator in line with his duty to be humane is publicity, described as “the most effectual means of applying the force of moral motives, in a direction tending to strengthen the union between his interest and the humane branch of his duty; by bringing to light, and thus exposing to the censure of the law and of public opinion … every instance of contravention” (1838–43, VIII, 380). To the seemingly “constant” but unseen surveillance of the inmates by the warden, Bentham added the observation of the warden and his subordinates by the public. Interested members of the public and members of parliament were to be guaranteed free access to the prison, making the panopticon subject to “the great open committee of the tribunal of the world” (1838–43, IV, 46). This was the prototype for Bentham’s later ruminations on the benefits of the Public Opinion Tribunal in a system of representative democracy.

9. Administration, Government, Constitutional Law

As with the panopticon, economy, transparency and accountability were equally important in Bentham’s innovative account of administration, as were devices to ensure the maximization of “intellectual”, “moral”, and “active” aptitude in public officials. In government utilitarian outcomes required various democratic procedures that function as “securities against misrule”. These procedures include: “virtual” universal suffrage, annual parliaments, the secret ballot, and provisions for transparency, publicity and unconstrained public debate.

Much of what Bentham recommended in relation to administrative and political institutions is governed by “the interest-junction-prescribing principle”, designed to ensure that the interests of those with power would be reconciled with the public interest, the interests of the governed. This idea was prominent in A Fragment on Government, where he argued that effective government was not to be had on the foundation of abstract formulas such as “mixed and balanced” institutions, but required “the frequent and easy changes of condition between governors and governed; whereby the interests of one class are more or less indistinguishably blended with those of the other” (1977, 485). In the later constitutional writings Bentham added many more administrative devices to ensure aptitude, transparency and accountability, none more important than the “Public Opinion Tribunal”, or the open court of public opinion founded on the freedom of the press, by which government actions could be held up to public scrutiny (1983b, 36). And, just as the panopticon was to be monitored by the publication of regular reports, so reports of government activity were required to keep the democratic polity informed and facilitate the accountability of public officials.

When Bentham turned his thoughts to constitutional law in earnest in the 1820s, partly inspired by constitution-making in parts of southern Europe, it was with the conviction that all states in which the institutions of representative democracy already existed or in which they could be introduced were fertile soil for the utilitarian pannomion. “Of this constitution”, he announced near the beginning of the Constitutional Code, “the all-comprehensive object, or end in view, is, from first to last, the greatest happiness of the greatest number; namely, of the individuals, of whom, the political community, or state, of which it is the constitution, is composed” (1983b, 18). The administrative, electoral and legislative details of this project occupied much of the last decade of his life, with its core ideas discussed in the pages of a variety of works in addition to the Code, such as Securities Against Misrule, First Principles Preparatory to Constitutional Code, and Official Aptitude Maximized; Expense Minimized. The subsidiary principles of accountability, efficiency, and economy underpinned the institutional design and procedural operations elaborated in these writings. In essence, these principles provided the grounding for the “securities against misrule” that Bentham thought essential to ensure that the greatest happiness would be the sole objective of government in a republican representative democracy.

9.1 Securities Against Misrule

Bentham held that those who hold the “operative power” in government, administration, and judiciary are, like everyone else, motivated by personal interest. It is imperative, therefore, to devise mechanisms that will ensure that only by acting in the public interest could they promote their own interests. So, for example, under representative democracy the members of the legislature, as the representatives of the “constitutive power” of the people, could be counted on to promote the greatest happiness and hold other functionaries to account, since elected legislators only serve at the will of their constituents and risk not being re-elected if they fail to do their duty (Schofield 1996, 226–28; see also Lieberman 2008). Given the extensive powers Bentham envisaged the thirteen ministries of the reformed government would possess—far more power in the areas of public health, education, and relief of the poor and indigent than existed at the time—further safeguards would be required. Refining and expanding the suggestions contained in his Plan of Parliamentary Reform, he stipulated that public officials must possess the required “moral aptitude” (the disposition to promote the greatest happiness), “intellectual aptitude” (divided into scientific aptitude or knowledge, and judicial aptitude or judgement), and “active aptitude” (the conscientious performance of assigned responsibilities) (1990, 272). Intellectual and active aptitude were to be tested through an examination process, though this would come to naught if the appointed official did not possess the appropriate moral aptitude (1838–43, IX, 128). Other devices designed to ensure, encourage, and test the required aptitude of public officials include: (1) the precise definition of responsibilities attached to each office, against which the actions of officials could be judged by either a superordinate official or the public; (2) the principle of subordination, according to which every official was subordinate to another who could punish him for inefficiency in the performance of his tasks; (3) complete exposure to legal prosecution of all officials for wrong-doing; (4) the elimination of the practice of handing out unwarranted titles of honour to party supporters and other favourites; (5) complete publicity of government business and the elimination of secrecy; and (6) freedom of the press, speech and association (see Rosen 1983, Ch. 8).

9.2 Sovereignty

The popular dimensions of the constitutional code appear to run contrary to the legal positivism commonly associated with Bentham’s utilitarianism, which implies a theory of sovereignty that requires that power be located in the hands of the legislator, however constituted, and stipulates that all laws are imperative and depend for their enforcement on coercive sanctions. Rosen has argued that as early as A Fragment on Government, Bentham rejected the Hobbesian idea of sovereignty based on simple command and obedience, in which the sovereign is necessarily a single, unified supreme power, in favour of “the notions of the legal limitation and division of sovereign power” (Rosen 1983, 41, 44).

Generally, by the term “sovereignty” Bentham meant the power to legislate (legal sovereignty), but he also employed it in relation to the power of the people to limit or control government and public officials (political or popular sovereignty). In the first sense of the term it is seemingly impossible for there to be a law that deliberately functions contrary to the will of the legislature. All law emanates from the will of the sovereign and the will of the sovereign “cannot be illegal” (2010b, 38). However, Bentham also held that all political authority, no matter what form it takes, is necessarily limited by its capacity to compel obedience from the people. As he put it in A Fragment on Government, “By a sovereign I mean any person or assemblage of persons to whose will a whole political community are (no matter on what account) supposed to be in a disposition to pay obedience” (1977, 18). And in Of the Limits of the Penal Branch of Jurisprudence he explained that this implies two volitions, both of which are necessary components of a complete theory of sovereignty: on the one hand, the enactments of a legislature and, on the other, the will of the people to obey those enactments. In effect, the will of the people to disobey amounts to a permanent constitutional check on the authority of the sovereign, and in this sense “the submission and obedience of the people” acts as the “constituent cause” of sovereignty (2010b 150n). The legislature may be “supreme” but it “can never of itself be absolute and unlimited” or “amount to the entire power of imperation” (113). The result is a “split concept” of sovereignty defined by a dynamic interaction between the legislature and the people, subject to changing times and the reflection of this in the public’s attitude to law, to what is admissible and inadmissible (see Ben-Dor 2000, Ch. 2). The process of public deliberation and accountability this requires is greatly facilitated by the communicative freedoms of the “liberty of the press” and the “liberty of public association” (1977, 485)—crystalized in Bentham’s conception of the “Public Opinion Tribunal” (POT).

9.3 Public Opinion Tribunal

Based on his earlier enunciation of “the motto of the good citizen”in A Fragment on Government—“To obey punctually, to censure freely” (1776 [1977, 399])—in the Constitutional Code Bentham conceived the POT as a “fictitious tribunal” or public court of opinion, argument, and debate. “Able rulers lead it”, he advised, “prudent rulers use or follow it; foolish rulers disregard it”. The POT would scrutinize the actions of elected representatives, public and judicial officials, prosecuting charges where they are found remiss in their responsibilities, censoring misrule and imposing penalties when applicable. Penalties would generally take the form of the “moral sanction”—the broadcasting of the shame and disgrace of bad conduct and the imputation of the reputation of the person responsible (1830 [1983b, 35–39]; 1989, 283). In these terms, the POT would be the leading security against the misuse and abuse of power (1989, 125). Operating on a continuing basis, and therefore not constrained as a check in the same limited way as periodic elections, it would act as “the only force … [by] which … government when operating in a sinister direction can experience any the least impediment to its course” (1990, 121).

Vital to the functioning of the POT is the dissemination of information. In the first instance this would require the establishment of a public archive of government actions and activities containing records of law, policy, legislative debate, and statistics, which the government would be constitutionally required to make available to the public by a freedom of information provision in the constitutional code to ensure transparency. Secondly, it would require an unshackled press to ensure widespread publicity and the freedom to criticize unimpeded by censorship or gagging orders. Here Bentham drew upon his essay On the Liberty of the Press, and Public Discussion (1821) to point out the dangers of laws designed to limit these liberties. The liberty of the press is an indispensable check on arbitrary government, and therefore “necessary to the maintenance of good government” (1838–43, II, 277, 279). Publicity is vital in this process, since “the greater the number of the members of the whole community to whom the existence of an act of oppression has been made known, the greater is the number of those by whom … not only may obedience be withholden, but resistance opposed” (1990, 30).

Bentham did not consider that the effectiveness of the POT as a check on misrule could be undermined by secret government methods to limit the flow of information, nor did it occur to him that a press dominated by the views of one class or by special interests could subvert the veracity of the information it disseminated. He pinned his faith on transparency and publicity (Postema 2014, 49). Ideally, the public would be adequately informed, and the POT would be constituted by those among the public who were both knowledgeable and concerned about the issues before it. Its judgements could change as new evidence came to light or as new arguments were enunciated, and it could be fragmented or unified in its view in proportion to the variety of individual opinions expressed.

10. Influence

Before the publication of Dumont’s edition of the Traités de législation in 1802, Bentham’s writings had a very limited distribution. During the revolutionary years in France, Dumont fed his ideas into the debates over judicial, legal, penal and legislative reform, and if his proposals had little impact on the social and political improvements undertaken they yet contributed to the direction of French liberalism (Champs 2015). With the publication of the Traités de législation Bentham’s stock as a legal philosopher increased dramatically. 3000 copies of the Traités were sold almost immediately (1838–43, I, 388), the Emperor Alexander ordered a Russian translation, and this was followed by translations (or partial translations) into Spanish, German, Polish, Portuguese and Hungarian, with particularly impressive sales in Spain, Portugal, and Latin America (1838–43, XI, 33, 88; see Avila-Martel 1981; McKennon 1981; Luño 1981). The 1820 edition of the Traités lists nineteen booksellers in eleven European countries from whom the book could be purchased. It was from this platform that Bentham was able to promote himself as a potential codifier of the laws in countries near and far. Despite the herculean efforts of Dumont, however, his ideas received a mixed reception in France (see Champs 2015, Ch.15). The aging André Morellet was keen to see the principles of utilitarian legal philosophy implemented in French law and administration, and Marc-Antoine Jullien and Jean-Baptiste Say among others appealed to Bentham in their attempt to ground political economy on scientific principles. On the other hand, self-interest and the utility principle was rejected by Germaine de Stael as an impoverished grounding for moral duty, and rejected by other reformers such as Benjamin Constant who grounded their liberalism on natural rights.

Bentham’s ideas began circulating in Spain in 1810 through the London-based El Español (Dinwiddy 1984, 20), but interest increased during the liberal triennium of 1820–23. In 1820, Toribio Núñez published a two-volume account of utilitarian legal philosophy based on the Traités—titled Espiritu de Bentham ó sistéma de la ciencia social, ideado por Jeremías Bentham—and his own writings on moral and political philosophy were greatly influenced by Bentham’s ideas. In 1821–22, Ramón de Salas produced the first Spanish translation of the Traités in five volumes, which received a scathing critique by José Vidal, a Dominican theologian at the University of Valencia, who condemned the work as an encouragement to revolution (Orígen de los errores revolucionarios de Europe, y su remedio 1827). Earlier, in 1793, Bentham had counselled the French National Convention to divest itself of its colonies on the grounds of their disutility (though the text Emancipate Your Colonies! was only published in 1830; Bentham 2002, 289–315). In the 1820s he directed his arguments towards Spain in “Rid Yourselves of Ultramaria” and “Emancipation Spanish” (1995, 3–276), and was gratified to see his ideas gaining traction in its former colonies in Latin America.

Andrés Bello used Salas’ translation as the basic text for his law lectures at the Colegio de Santiago in Chile, as did Pedro Alcántra de Somellera, Professor of Civil Law at the University of Buenos Aires. In 1825 Francisco de Paula Santander, the Vice-President of Gran Colombia, decreed that the work be required reading for all law students in the vast territories of the new republic, but in 1828 its President Simón Bolívar, the legendary “Liberator”, after previously embracing the principles and purpose of Bentham’s legal philosophy, bowed to clerical pressure and banned its teaching as detrimental to religion, morality, and social order (1838–43, X, 552–54). Santander, who was more inclined to resist the influence of the Catholic Church, restored it to the curriculum of the universities when he became President of the newly constituted state of Colombia in 1832.

Following the Greek revolution against Ottoman rule, the historian and legal scholar Anastasios Polyzoides, who had a hand in drafting its new constitution in 1822, translated an extract on “publicity” from Dumont’s Tactiques des assemblée legislatives for a Missolonghi newspaper in 1824, promoting transparency in legislative proceedings and in government more broadly. A year later he published in Greek A General Theory of Administrative Systems and especially of the Parliamentary One, Accompanied by a Short Treatise on Justices of the Peace and Juries in England (1825), containing a defense of representative government and advocating a judicial system based on utilitarian principles, replete with references to Bentham (Peonidis 2009).

In the United States, the dissemination of utilitarianism was initially hampered by the absence of an English translation of the Traités, but there too Bentham’s influence was not long in being felt. David Hoffman first introduced utilitarian ideas into legal education in America at the University of Maryland in the early 1820s. John Neal, who studied law under Hoffman’s guidance, described Hoffman as one of Bentham’s “most enthusiastic admirers” (Neal 1830, 300). In his bibliographic A Course of Legal Study (1817), Hoffman recommended students read parts of Dumont’s redaction of Bentham, Théorie des peines et des récompenses (2 vols., 1811), and it was Hoffman who encouraged Neal to translate the Traités into English, a task he began during the eighteen months he stayed with Bentham in London in 1825–26. In the event, only the introductory sections of the Traités appeared in Neal’s Principles of Legislation (1830), parts of which had first appeared in a series of articles in The Yankee, a journal he edited under the banner heading “the greatest happiness of the greatest number”.

It was Richard Smith, a government tax officer and one of Bentham’s young London disciples, who eventually translated the civil and penal law parts of the Traités into English for the The Works of Jeremy Bentham in 1838 (1838–43, I, 297–580). While Smith was at work in England, the historian and anti-slave propagandist Richard Hildreth, Bentham’s foremost American disciple, was busy translating the same material on the other side of the Atlantic, convinced that the widespread interest in legal reform in the United States would benefit greatly from utilitarian ideas. The reviews of Hildreth’s translation praised Bentham’s legal philosophy while objecting to its underlying moral assumptions and disdain for religion, a position frequently adopted by early critics—even Hildreth took this less than consistent view (1840 [1864], I, iii). The reviews paid particular attention to the systematic presentation of the theory of civil law, which also impressed itself on the teaching of law in the newly independent states of South America, where property rights were a matter of considerable importance in the aftermath of the collapse of the Spanish and Portuguese empires.

Hildreth, whose own Theory of Morals (1844) drew substantially on the Traités, was correct in thinking that law reformers in the United States would find sustenance in Bentham’s critical jurisprudence. Thomas Cooper, who left England for the United States in 1794 with Joseph Priestley, from whom he initially derived his utilitarianism, was a confirmed Benthamite by the 1820s and the intended recipient of writings Bentham entrusted to John Quincy Adams. Thereafter Cooper employed utilitarian principles in his writings on law and political economy, most notably in the Lectures on the Elements of Political Economy (1826), based on the lectures he gave at South Carolina College in Columbia, the first course of lectures on the subject in America. Edward Livingston, the famous author of codes of law for Louisiana, corresponded with Bentham, who sent him books for his research. Livingston acknowledged it was his reading of the Traités which “fortified me in a design to prosecute the subject” of a code of penal law (1838–43, XI, 51). In its final comprehensive and systematic version, Livingston’s System of Penal Law (1833) was celebrated by many continental jurists and became the centrepiece of the codification campaign in the United States—a campaign Bentham had attempted to launch himself some years earlier by directing copies of his Papers Relative to Codification and Public Instruction (1817) to a number of well-placed American politicians. The freethinker Gilbert Vale used his position as editor of the radical periodical The Diamond (1840–42)—like The Yankee, published with the banner heading “the greatest happiness of the greatest number”—to disseminate Bentham’s criticisms of the vagaries, chicanery, and technicalities of the law. Inspired by Bentham, Vale was in favour of humane penal laws that proportioned penalties to the objective of deterrence and an advocate of state intervention to alter the social circumstances that fostered crime. John O’Sullivan, the quixotic editor of the United States Magazine and Democratic Review, wrote sympathetic reviews of Bentham, Livingston, and Hildreth, and followed them in advocating utilitarian law reform, particularly the abolition of the death penalty. Bentham’s influence on these figures is discussed in detail in Crimmins (2022).

Bentham’s influence continued throughout the century in America, where the Traités paved the way for the reception of other editions and versions of his writings, which in turn led to sympathetic responses to the more amenable forms of utilitarian moral and legal theory offered by John Austin, J. S. Mill, and Henry Sidgwick. On the other hand, Bentham’s political prescriptions made little impact in the United States, which was, by comparison to aristocratic England, already an advanced democracy. If the utilitarian Constitutional Code was directed “for the use of all nations and all governments professing liberal opinions”, as its title page declared, the political positions it embraced were recommended, in the first instance, for adoption at home.

For all Bentham’s success abroad, in the early years of the nineteenth century he was little known in his own country. The April 1804 issue of the Edinburgh Review announced his arrival on the British stage in a substantial critical review of Dumont’s Traités, though his main appeal was initially confined to a small band of law reformers determined to tackle the antiquated and notoriously harsh punishments meted out by English penal law. In the years following the defeat of Napoleon in 1815, however, when calls for legal, social, and political reform were becoming commonplace, Bentham’s reputation in Britain was transformed from that of an eccentric and often misunderstood oracle on the periphery of the intellectual and political world to that of a venerable sage situated at the center of a broad reform movement. Throughout the following century his influence continued to be felt, particularly in discussions of moral and legal philosophy and economic theory and practice.

John Austin became acquainted with Bentham’s utilitarian legal philosophy during his undergraduate years at Cambridge. In 1821 he was hired to tutor J.S. Mill in Roman law, began attending meetings of the Utilitarian Society established by the younger Mill in 1823, and in 1826 was appointed to the Chair of Jurisprudence at the newly founded University of London, where he was the first in England to introduce utilitarian ideas into legal education. Building on Bentham’s science of legislation, Austin imported its leading ideas into his own jurisprudence, none more so than Bentham’s distinction between the law as it is and the law as it ought to be, an idea that stands at the foundation of the doctrine of legal positivism (1977, 397). With the posthumous publication of Lectures on Jurisprudence or The Philosophy of Positive Law (1863), Austin’s legal philosophy was to have a major impact on English and American jurisprudence—in the latter context his conceptualization of the nature of sovereignty proved especially influential.

Bentham’s most important influence was on John Stuart Mill. In his Autobiography (1873) Mill relates that when he first encountered Bentham’s ideas in the Traités “I now had opinions, a creed, a doctrine, a philosophy; in one among the best senses of the word, a religion; the inculcation and diffusion of which could be made the principal outward purpose of a life” (1963–91, I, 67–68). It was in the flush of his early commitment to utilitarianism that Mill edited the five volumes of Bentham’s writings on evidence, Rationale of Judicial Evidence (1838–43, VI, 189–585, VII 1–644). Around this time, however, partly in response to the challenge of T. B. Macaulay’s criticism of his father’s “On Government” and partly the result of his own reflections on his intellectual inheritance, Mill developed a revised version of utilitarian theory. This revisionism was first announced to the world in the essay “Bentham” (1838) and received definitive expression in Utilitarianism (1861), in which he introduced the notion of higher pleasures. Though, like Bentham, an advocate of representative democracy based on universal suffrage, Mill also made several proposals to temper the potential excesses of unconstrained majoritarian institutions. In other respects, including his defence of individual freedom and individuality in On Liberty (1859), Mill’s utilitarianism remained within the Benthamic framework.

Bentham’s influence has been felt to a considerable extent in the field of economics, in which the felicific calculus provided the groundwork for the development of policy based on cost-benefit analysis. As we have seen, he shared Adam Smith’s view that the route to a nation’s prosperity is by individuals pursuing their interests in ways of their own choosing, with government intervention limited accordingly. However, he also developed the theory of diminishing marginal utility, furnishing the legislator with a conceptual tool by which to address the uneven distribution of social happiness. The collectivist conclusions Bentham drew from this principle were modest in scope, but later reformist economists like W. S. Jevons (1871), impressed by the idea that social utility could be calculated based on the aggregate of individual interests, developed the theory in the direction of modern welfare economics. F. Y. Edgeworth (1881) thought Bentham’s formula of the “greatest happiness of the greatest number” a mathematical absurdity, and reformulated the goal in terms of the greatest total happiness (or greatest average happiness for a fixed number of people). The Fabian socialist Sidney Webb also applied utilitarian ideas to maximize and better distribute “total utility”—Webb’s wife Beatrice once described Bentham as her husband’s “intellectual godfather” (Mack 1955). Graham Wallas, another of the Fabians, was deeply impressed by Bentham’s legal, political and administrative innovations and hailed him as “Britain’s greatest political inventor” (Wallas 1926).

On the other side of the ledger we find the libertarian Herbert Spencer who deployed the utility principle in Man versus the State (1884) and other writings to underwrite the liberty of the individual, defend the existing social order, and attack the drift towards socialism and “slavery”. James Fitzjames Stephen, Henry Sidgwick, and A.V. Dicey all advocated versions of utilitarian individualism, although Sidgwick occasionally gave voice to “socialist” sentiments in developing his intuitional utilitarian theory in The Methods of Ethics (1874). Reform-minded liberals such as J.A. Hobson and L.T. Hobhouse viewed themselves as “new” utilitarians, finding in the protean nature of utilitarianism a justification for distinctly non-individualist policies. Thus Hobhouse in Liberalism (1911) incorporated utilitarianism into a new liberal discourse that, in addition to laissez-faire economics (and notwithstanding Herbert Samuel’s quasi-Benthamic motto “the greatest liberty of the greatest number”) also included elements of socialism, social Darwinianism, and the reformist idealism of T. H. Green.

11. Critics and Commentators

Once Bentham’s ideas began to take hold in the early nineteenth century, critics were not hard to find. In his Principles of Politics Applicable to All Governments (1810), Benjamin Constant, who admired Bentham’s originality and praised his contributions to political economy and penal law, questioned the vagueness of the concept of utility, which he thought susceptible to many different definitions and pregnant with danger as a principle of policy. Constant preferred the prescriptions of natural law as the philosophical basis for government. William Hazlitt, who was for a time Bentham’s tenant, satirised him as a venerable anchorite in the quiet of his cell reducing law to a system and the mind of man to a machine, divorced from the life of spirit, imagination, passion and sentiments of love, a philosophy “fit neither for man nor beast” (1826, 184). Thomas Carlyle summed up the general perception of the crassness of “Benthamee utility” as the “pig-philosophy”, nothing more than “virtue by Profit and Loss” (1840, 65). Other critics, like the Whig reformers James Mackintosh and T.B. Macaulay, ready to follow Bentham’s lead in law reform, were also dismayed by the diminished view of human nature that underpinned his philosophy and attacked the radical proposals for political reform that emanated from the utilitarian camp (Lively and Rees 1978). The Anglican divine John Colls, for a time Bentham’s secretary before he took holy orders, published an intemperate exposé of his former employer as a selfish and bigoted subversive in Utilitarianism Unmasked (1844), a work which proved popular among his fellow clergymen.

As the nineteenth century wore on assailants came forth from all points across the philosophical spectrum. Marx considered Bentham an “arch-philistine” and utilitarianism a superficial and ephemeral bourgeois ideology (Capital I, Ch. XXIV, sect. 5). Sundry religionists, including those of a philosophical bent like the classicist J.B. Mayor, intuitionists like William Whewell, and idealists like Green, F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet and D.G. Ritchie combined to attack its atomism, crude materialism, narrowly construed theory of motivation, and lack of appreciation of the spiritual dimension of the human condition. The legal scholar Henry Maine could admire the bravado and ambition of Bentham’s science of jurisprudence, but also deplored his failure to appreciate the historical and evolutionary nature of law; he further objected to Bentham’s faith that the ignorant masses could truly know what is in their best interest. As we have seen, on the other side of the Atlantic, Bentham’s legal philosophy made some headway but the underlying moral ideas met stiff resistance, and his supposed atheism added fuel to the fire of outrage bellowing from evangelical critics. In a different vein, the Pragmatists, notably William James and John Dewey, may have shared Bentham’s ontological misgivings about the meaning and misrepresentation of fictions and fictitious entities (Quinn 2012) and recognised the critical value of the utility principle to the development of Liberalism as a philosophy of action (Dewey 1935, 13–17), but they rejected the claim that all motivation may be reduced to a drive to seek pleasure and avoid pain, which they viewed as a self-defeating commitment to materialist individualism (Dewey and Tufts 1908, 271–74; see also Crimmins 2022, Epilogue). Like J. S. Mill, the Pragmatists also dismissed the idea that any single form of the summum bonum could account for the many goods that people seek (James 1891, 186–200). There have been many critics of Bentham since.

Numerous commentaries on Bentham’s philosophy have also appeared, from the early general accounts of Leslie Stephen (1900) and Elie Halévy (1901–4), to more recent introductions to his ideas (Harrison 1983; Dinwiddy 1989b; Crimmins 2004, 2013; Schofield 2009; Quinn 2022) and a wide range of revisionist disquisitions on discrete aspects of his thought. In addition to the themes and issues already addressed in this article, Hart (1982) and Postema (1989) have penned important studies of Bentham’s jurisprudence, while topics that have engaged contemporary commentators include his critical views on race and slavery (Jones 2005; Rosen 2005), colonialism and empire (Pitts 2005; Cain 2011; Causer, Finn and Schofield 2022), marriage, divorce, adultery, desertion and wife-beating (Sokol 2011), and sexual liberty (Dabhoiwala 2010, 168–74; Schofield 2014). Schofield (2013) provides an overview of some new directions in Bentham studies, to which may be added essays on the global Bentham (Armitage 2011; Zhai and Palmer 2021), Bentham and the arts (Julius, Quinn and Schofield 2020), and policing (Jacques and Schofield 2021). Many of these commentaries have been inspired by the publication of the authoritative volumes in The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham that began appearing in 1968 to replace the poorly edited and incomplete Bowring edition (1838–43). The Collected Works continues to bring to light new and more complete versions of Bentham’s writings and previously unpublished material. At the time of writing, 35 of the projected 80 volumes have been published. As new volumes appear the topics of discussion and debate will continue to increase, burnishing the reputation of a philosopher whose ideas remain relevant in a great number of areas of interest to moralists, psychologists, economists, historians, legal and political philosophers.


Primary sources


  • Bentham Manuscripts at University College London (UC followed by box and page/folio no.).

Collected Editions of Bentham’s Works

  • 1829–30, Œuvres de Jérémie Bentham, 3 volumes, E. Dumont (ed.), Bruxelles: Hauman.
  • 1838–43, The Works of Jeremy Bentham, Published under the Superintendence of his Executor, John Bowring, 11 vols., Edinburgh: William Tait.
  • 1952–54, Jeremy Bentham’s Economic Writings, 3 volumes, W. Stark (ed.), London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1968–, The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham, General Editors: J. H. Burns, J. R. Dinwiddy, F. Rosen, T. P. Schofield, London: Athlone Press; Oxford: Clarendon Press; and London: UCL Press, in progress:
    • 1970, An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, J. H. Burns and H. L. A. Hart (eds.).
    • 1977, A Comment on the Commentaries and A Fragment on Government, J. H. Burns and H. L. A. Hart (eds.).
    • 1983, Chrestomathia, M. J. Smith and W. H. Burston (eds.).
    • 1983a, Deontology together with A Table of the Springs of Action and the Article on Utilitarianism, A. Goldworth (ed.).
    • 1983b, Constitutional Code, volume 1, F. Rosen and J. H. Burns (eds.).
    • 1989, First Principles Preparatory to Constitutional Code, T. P. Schofield (ed.).
    • 1990, Securities Against Misrule and other Constitutional Writings for Tripoli and Greece, T. P. Schofield (ed.).
    • 1993, Official Aptitude Maximized; Expense Minimized, P. Schofield (ed.).
    • 1995, Colonies, Commerce, and Constitutional Law: Rid Yourselves of Ultramaria and other writings on Spain and Spanish America, P. Schofield (ed.)
    • 1998,“Legislator of the World”: Writings on Codification, Law, and Education, P. Schofield and J. Harris (ed.).
    • 1999, Political Tactics, M. James, C. Blamires and C. Pease-Watkin (eds.).
    • 2001, 2010a, Writings on the Poor Laws, 2 volumes, M. Quinn (ed.).
    • 2002, Rights, Representation, and Reform: Nonsense upon Stilts and other Writings on the French Revolution, P. Schofield, C. Pease-Watkin and C. Blamires (eds.).
    • 2010b, Of the Limits of the Penal Branch of Jurisprudence, ed. P. Schofield.
    • 2011, Church-of-Englandism and its Catechism Examined, J. E. Crimmins and C. Fuller (eds.).
    • 2012, On the Liberty of the Press, and Public Discussion, and other Legal and Political Writings for Spain and Portugal, C. Pease-Watkin and P. Schofield (eds.).
    • 2013, “Not Paul, But Jesus Part III. Doctrine”, Bentham Project.
    • 2014, Of Sexual Irregularities, and other writings on Sexual Morality, P. Schofield, C. Pease-Watkin, and M. Quinn (eds.).
    • 2015, The Book of Fallacies, P. Schofield (ed.).
    • 2016a, 2019, Writings on Political Economy, Volume 1: including “Defence of Usury”; “Manual of Political Economy”; and “Protest against Law Taxes”), and Volumes 2: including “Supply without Burthen” and “Proposals Relative to Divers Modes of Supply”, M. Quinn (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • 2016b, Preparatory Principles, D. G. Long and P. Schofield (eds.).
    • 2022, Panopticon versus New South Wales and Other Writings on Australia, T. Causer and P. Schofield (eds.).

Other Cited Works by Bentham

  • 1795, “Nonsense upon Stilts, Or Pandora’s Box Opened, Or The French Declaration of Rights prefixed to the Constitution of 1791 laid open and exposed–with a Comparative Sketch of what has been done on the same subject in the Constitution of 1795”, in Collected Works, 2002, 317–401.
  • 1830–31, “History of the War between Jeremy Bentham and George the Third. By one of the Belligerents”, in The Works of Jeremy Bentham, 1838–43, XI, 96–105.
  • 1831, “Colonization Company Proposal: Being a proposal for the formation of a joint-stock company by the name of the Colonization Company on the entirely new principle intituled the vicinity-maximizing or dispersion-preventing principle”, in Collected Works, 2022, forthcoming.
  • 1840 [2nd edn 1864], Theory of Legislation; by Jeremy Bentham. Translated from the French of Etienne Dumont, by Richard Hildreth, 2 vols., rept. with an introduction, appendix and index by James E. Crimmins, Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 2004.
  • 1842, Auto-Icon; or Farther Uses of the Dead to the Living; in James E. Crimmins (ed.), Jeremy Bentham’s Auto-Icon and Related Writings, Bristol: Thoemmes, 2002.

Other Primary Sources

  • Carlyle, T., 1840, On Heroes, Hero-Worship, and the Heroic in History, M.K. Goldberg, J.J. Brattin, and M. Engel (eds.), Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1993.
  • Edgeworth, F. Y., 1881, Mathematical Psychics: An Essay on the Application of Mathematics to the Moral Sciences, London: C. Kegan Paul & Co.
  • Hazlitt, W., 1826, “The New School of Reform: A Dialogue between a Rationalist and a Sentimentalist”, in The Complete Works of William Hazlitt, 21 vols., P. P. Howe (ed.), London: J.M. Dent and Sons, 1930–4, vol. 12, pp. 179–95.
  • Jevons, W. S., 1871, The Theory of Political Economy, London: Macmillan and Co.
  • Mill, J. S., 1963–91, Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, J. M. Robson (general editor), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Neal, J., 1830, Principles of Legislation: From the Ms. of Jeremy Bentham; … By M. Dumont …; With Notes and a Biographical Notice of Jeremy Bentham and of M. Dumont, Boston, MA: Wells and Lilly.
  • Smith, T. S., 1832, Lecture Delivered over the Remains of Jeremy Bentham, Esq., in the Webb-Street School of Anatomy & Medicine, on the 9th June, 1832, London: Effingham Wilson.

Secondary Sources

  • Armitage, D., 2011, “Globalizing Jeremy Bentham”, History of Political Thought, 32 (1): 63–82.
  • Avila-Martel, A. de, 1981, “The Influence of Bentham on the Teaching of Penal Law in Chile”, The Bentham Newsletter, 5: 22–8.
  • Bahmueller, C. F., 1981, The National Charity Company: Jeremy Bentham’s Silent Revolution, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Bedau, H. A., 1983, “Bentham’s Utilitarian Critique of the Death Penalty”, Journal of Criminal Law and Criminology, 74 (3): 1033–65.
  • –––, 2004, “Bentham’s Theory of Punishment: Origin and Content”, Journal of Bentham Studies, 7: n.p. [Bedau 2004 available online].
  • Ben-Dor, O., 2000, Constitutional Limits and the Public Sphere, Oxford & Portland, OR: Hart Publishing.
  • Blamires, C., 2008, The French Revolution and the Creation of Benthamism, London: Palgrave.
  • Boralevi, L. C., 1984, Bentham and the Oppressed, Berlin: W. de Gruyter.
  • Brunon-Ernst, A. (ed.), 2012, Beyond Foucault: New Perspectives on Bentham’s Panopticon, Farnham: Ashgate.
  • Bykvist, K., 2010, Utilitarianism: A Guide for the Perplexed, London: Continuum.
  • –––, 2013, “Preferences (Preferentialism),” in J.E. Crimmins (ed.), Bloomsbury Encyclopedia of Utilitarianism, London & New York: Bloomsbury; reprinted 2017, pp. 440–45.
  • Cain, P. J., 2011, “Bentham and the Development of the British Critique of Colonialism”, Utilitas, 23 (1): 1–24.
  • Causer, T., M. Finn and P. Schofield (eds.), 2022, Bentham and Australia: Convicts, Utility and Empire, London: University College London Press.
  • Champs, E. de., 2015, Enlightenment and Utility: Bentham in French, Bentham in France, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Crimmins, J. E., 1987, “‘Strictures on Paley’s Net’: Capital Punishment and the Power to Pardon”, The Bentham Newsletter, 11: 23–34.
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Michael Quinn and David Lieberman, generous and wise colleagues, gave careful attention to an earlier draft of this article and I am greatly indebted to them for the important improvements they recommended. I am also grateful to the SEP’s anonymous reviewer for correcting stylistic infelicities in the article.

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