Leibniz’s Philosophy of Mind

First published Mon Sep 22, 1997; substantive revision Mon Jun 29, 2020

Leibniz’s place in the history of the philosophy of mind is best secured by his pre-established harmony. In a more popular view, this is the thesis that, roughly, there is no mind-body interaction strictly speaking, for there is only a non-causal relationship of harmony, parallelism, or correspondence between mind and body. Certainly, the pre-established harmony is important for a proper understanding of Leibniz’s philosophy of mind. But there is much more to be considered, and even when it comes to the pre-established harmony, this more popular view needs to be refined, particularly insofar as it suggests that Leibniz accepts a roughly Cartesian, albeit non-interactionist dualism. He does not accept such a dualism, and in fact, Leibniz is justly famous for his critiques not only of materialism but also of any dualism of this sort. In short, he made important contributions to a number of classical topics in the philosophy of mind, including materialism, dualism, and mind-body interaction.

But Leibniz had much to say about the philosophy of mind that goes well beyond these traditionally important topics. Perhaps surprisingly, his system sometimes contains ideas of relevance even to contemporary discussions in the cognitive sciences. More generally, he discusses in depth the nature of perception and thought (conscious and unconscious) and the nature of human motivation and striving (or, as he would say, appetition). We will take up such topics in what follows.

1. Matter and Thought

For present purposes, we may think of materialism as the view that everything that exists is material (or physical) with this view closely allied to another, namely, that mental states and processes are either identical to, or realized by, physical states and processes. Leibniz remained opposed to materialism throughout his career, particularly as it figured in the writings of Epicurus and Hobbes. The realms of the mental and the physical, for Leibniz, form two distinct realms—but not in a way conducive to dualism or the view that there exists both thinking substance and extended substance. By opposing both materialism and dualism, Leibniz carved himself an interesting place in the history of views concerning the relationship between thought and matter.

Most of Leibniz’s arguments against materialism are directly aimed at the thesis that perception and consciousness can be given mechanical (i.e. physical) explanations. His position is that perception and consciousness cannot possibly be explained mechanically, and, hence, could not be physical processes. His most famous argument against the possibility of materialism is found in section 17 of the Monadology (1714):

One is obliged to admit that perception and what depends upon it is inexplicable on mechanical principles, that is, by figures and motions. In imagining that there is a machine whose construction would enable it to think, to sense, and to have perception, one could conceive it enlarged while retaining the same proportions, so that one could enter into it, just like into a windmill. Supposing this, one should, when visiting within it, find only parts pushing one another, and never anything by which to explain a perception. Thus it is in the simple substance, and not in the composite or in the machine, that one must look for perception. (G VI, 609/A&G 215)

Leibniz’s argument seems to be this: the visitor of the machine, upon entering it, would observe nothing but the properties of the parts and the relations they bear to one another. But no explanation of perception or consciousness can possibly be deduced from this conglomerate. No matter how complex the inner workings of this machine, nothing about them reveals that what is being observed are the inner workings of a conscious being. Hence, materialism must be false, for there is no possible way that the purely mechanical principles of materialism can account for the phenomena of consciousness. (For detailed discussion of this argument, see Lodge and Bobro 1998; Lodge 2014.)

In other writings, Leibniz suggests exactly what characteristic it is of perception and consciousness for which the mechanical principles of materialism cannot account. The following passages, the first from the New System of Nature (1695), the second from the Reply to Bayle (1702), are revealing in this regard:

Furthermore, by means of the soul or form, there is a true unity which corresponds to what is called the I in us; such a thing could not occur in artificial machines, nor in the simple mass of matter, however organized it may be. (G IV, 482/W&F 16)

But in addition to the general principles which establish the monads of which compound things are merely the results, internal experience refutes the Epicurean [i.e. materialist] doctrine. This experience is the consciousness which is in us of this I which apperceives things which occur in the body. This perception cannot be explained by figures and movements. (G IV, 559f./W&F 113)

Leibniz’s point is that whatever is the subject of perception and consciousness must be truly one, a single “I” properly regarded as one conscious being. An aggregate of matter is not truly one and so cannot be regarded as a single I capable of being the subject of a unified mental life. This interpretation fits nicely with Lebniz’s oft-repeated definition of perception as “the representation in the simple of the compound, or of that which is outside” (Principles of Nature and Grace, sec.2 (1714)). More explicitly, in a letter to Antoine Arnauld of 9 October 1687, Leibniz wrote that “in natural perception and sensation, it is enough for what is divisible and material and dispersed into many entities to be expressed or represented in a single indivisible entity or in a substance which is endowed with genuine unity.” If perception (and hence, consciousness) essentially involves a representation of a variety of content in a simple, indivisible “I,” then we may construct Leibniz’s argument against materialism as follows: Materialism holds that matter can explain (is identical with, can give rise to) perception. A perception is a state whereby a variety of content is represented in a true unity. Thus, whatever is not a true unity cannot give rise to perception. Whatever is divisible is not a true unity. Matter is infinitely divisible. Hence, matter cannot form a true unity. Hence, matter cannot explain (be identical with, give rise to) perception. If matter cannot explain (be identical to, give rise to) perception, then materialism is false. Hence, materialism is false.

Leibniz rejected materialism on the grounds that it could not, in principle, ever capture the “true unity” of perceptual consciousness, that characteristic of the self which can simultaneously unify a manifoldness of perceptual content. If this is Leibniz’s argument, it is of some historical interest that it bears striking resemblances to contemporary objections to certain materialist theories of mind. Many contemporary philosophers have objected to some versions of materialism on the basis of thought experiments similar to Leibniz’s, experiments designed to show that qualia and consciousness are bound to elude certain materialist conceptions of the mind (cf. Searle 1980; Nagel 1974; McGinn 1989; Jackson 1982). It is also of historical interest that Leibniz coupled his rejection of materialism with a version of naturalism (or what he would have regarded as naturalism - see Jorgensen 2019).

Leibniz’s rejection of materialist conceptions of the mind was coupled with a strong opposition to dualistic views concerning the relationship between mind and body, particularly the substance dualism that figured in the philosophy of Descartes and his followers. According to this dualism, the world fundamentally consists of two disparate substances: extended material substance (body) and unextended thinking substance (mind). This bifurcation, of course, carries no burden of holding that the operations of the mental are realized by the operations of the physical. But despite his claim that consciousness and perception cannot be realized by, nor reduced to, the mechanical operations of matter, Leibniz found the alternative of postulating two distinct kinds of substance equally implausible.

Leibniz’s opposition to Cartesian dualism stems not from a rejection of unextended substance, but from his denial of the existence of genuine extended material substance. To begin with, Leibniz held the Scholastic thesis that “being” and “one” are equivalent. He writes to Arnauld: “To be brief, I hold as axiomatic the identical proposition which varies only in emphasis: that what is not truly one being is not truly one being either” (30 April 1687; G II, 97/LA 121). For Leibniz, in order for something to count as a real being—a substance—it must be “truly one,” an entity endowed with genuine unity. And, as we saw above, in order for something to be a genuine unity, it must be a simple, indivisible entity. “Substantial unity,” he writes, “requires a complete, indivisible and naturally indestructible entity” (to Arnauld, 28 November 1686; G II, 76/LA 94). But matter is extended, and thus, Leibniz believes, infinitely divisible. Hence, there is no such thing, for Leibniz, as material substance.

There is a positive thesis which goes hand-in-hand with Leibniz’s negative thesis against material substance and which helps to explain further his rejection of material substance. It is summarized in the following passage from a letter to Arnauld of 30 April 1687:

I believe that where there are only beings through aggregation, there will not even be real beings. For every being through aggregation presupposes beings endowed with a true unity, because it obtains its reality from nowhere but that of its constituents, so that it will have no reality at all if each constituent being is still an entity through aggregation; or else, one must yet seek another basis to its reality, which in this way, if one must constantly go on searching, can never be found…. If there are aggregates of substances, there must also be genuine substances from which all the aggregates result. One must therefore necessarily arrive either at mathematical points from which certain authors make up extension, or at Epicurus’ and M. Cordemoy’s atoms (which you, like me, dismiss), or else one must acknowledge that no reality can be found in bodies, or finally one must recognize certain substances in them that possess a true unity. (G II, 96/LA 120)

According to Leibniz, bodies (qua material) are aggregates, and an aggregate, of course, is not a substance on account of its lack of unity. The claim in the above passage is that whatever being or reality an aggregate has derives from the being and reality of its constituents. Thus, Leibniz thinks that if a body is to have any reality at all, if it is to be more than a mere “phenomenon, lacking all reality as would a coherent dream,” then it must ultimately be composed of things which are real beings. Atoms, he claims, are unfit for this role, because they are themselves extended beings, and for Leibniz, divisibility is of the essence of extension. That is, those who believe in indivisible atoms make matter “divisible in one place, indivisible in another” (On Nature Itself (1698); G IV, 513/A&G 165), but “we cannot explain why bodies of a definite smallness [i.e. atoms] should not be further divisible” (Primary Truths (1686); C 522/A&G 34). Every extended mass, for Leibniz, is composed of extended parts, and so even if we could conceive of an atom as composed of parts which cannot be physically divided, “an invincible attachment of one part to another would not at all destroy the diversity of these parts” (New System of Nature, (1695); G IV, 482/W&F 16), or it would not at all overcome the fact that it is an aggregate composed of parts and not truly one being. Likewise, mathematical points, “even an infinity of points gathered into one, will not make extension,” (to Des Bosses, 30 April 1709; G II, 370/L 597) and so cannot be understood as the constituents of extended bodies. Hence, Leibniz opts for the last of the above quoted alternatives: the constituents of bodies are “certain substances … that possess a true unity.” These substances are partless, unextended, and indivisible, and therefore real beings in Leibniz’s sense. Indeed, in several writings, Leibniz invites us to conceive of these substances on the model of our notion of souls. These simple substances are the only things which suffice for grounding the reality of bodies. To be sure, substances, Leibniz tells us, do not constitute a body as parts of the body, but as the “first elements,” or “primitive unities,” of the body. As he sometimes puts it, bodies “result from” these constitutive unities. That is, bodies just are aggregates of substances which appear to us as extended corporeal phenomena, though they are “well-founded” phenomena; they have their foundation in real beings.

In short, Leibniz stands in a special position with respect to the history of views concerning thought and its relationship to matter. He rejects the materialist position that thought and consciousness can be captured by purely mechanical principles. But he also rejects the dualist position that the universe must therefore be bifurcated into two different kinds of substance, thinking substance and material substance. Rather, it is his view that the world consists solely of one type of substance, though there are infinitely many substances of that type. These substances are partless, unextended entities, some of which are endowed with thought and consciousness, and others of which found the phenomenality of the corporeal world. The sum of these views secures Leibniz a distinctive position in the history of the philosophy of mind.

2. Denial of Mind-Body Interaction, Assertion of Pre-established Harmony

A central philosophical issue of the seventeenth century concerned the apparent causal relations which hold between the mind and the body. In most seventeenth-century settings, this issue was discussed within the context of substance dualism, the view that mind and body are different kinds of substance. As noted above, Leibniz remained fundamentally opposed to dualism. But although Leibniz held that there is only one type of substance in the world, and thus that mind and body are ultimately composed of the same kind of substance (a version of monism), he also held that mind and body are metaphysically distinct. There are a variety of interpretations of what this metaphysical distinctness consists in for Leibniz, but on any plausible interpretation it is safe to assume (as Leibniz seems to have done) that for any person P, P’s mind is a distinct substance (a soul) from P’s body. With this assumption in hand, we may formulate the central issue in the form of a question: how is it that certain mental states and events are coordinated with certain bodily states and events, and vice-versa? There were various attempts to answer this question in Leibniz’s time period. For Descartes, the answer was mind-body interactionism: the mind can causally influence the body and (most commentators have held) vice-versa. For Malebranche, the answer was that neither created minds nor bodies can enter into causal relations because God is the only causally efficient being in the universe. God causes certain bodily states and events on the occasion of certain mental states and events, and vice-versa. Leibniz found Descartes’ answer unintelligible (cf. Theodicy, sec. 60; G VI, 135f.) and Malebranche’s excessive because miraculous (cf. Letter to Arnauld, 14 July 1686; G II, 57/LA 65).

Leibniz’s account of mind-body causation was in terms of his famous doctrine of the pre-established harmony. According to the latter, (1) no state of a created substance has as a real cause some state of another created substance (i.e. a denial of inter-substantial causality); (2) every non-initial, non-miraculous, state of a created substance has as a real cause some previous state of that very substance (i.e. an affirmation of intra-substantial causality); and (3) each created substance is programmed at creation such that all its natural states and actions are carried out in conformity with all the natural states and actions of every other created substance.

Formulating (1) through (3) in the language of minds and bodies, Leibniz held that no mental state has as a real cause some state of another created mind or body, and no bodily state has as a real cause some state of another created mind or body. Further, every non-initial, non-miraculous, mental state of a substance has as a real cause some previous state of that mind, and every non-initial, non-miraculous, bodily state has as a real cause some previous state of that body. Finally, created minds and bodies are programmed at creation such that all their natural states and actions are carried out in mutual coordination.

According to Leibniz, what appear to be real causal relations between mind and body are, in metaphysical reality, the mutual conformity or coordination of mind and body—in accordance with (3)—with no interaction or divine intervention involved. For example, suppose that Smith is pricked with a pin (call this bodily state Sb) and pain ensues (call this mental state Sm), a case of apparent body to mind causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Smith’s mind (soul) prior to Sm was the real cause of Sm and Sb was not a causal factor in the obtaining of Sm. Suppose now that Smith has a desire to raise his arm (call this mental state Sm), and the raising of his arm ensues (call this bodily state Sb), a case of apparent mind to body causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Smith’s body prior to Sb was the real cause of Sb and Sm was not a causal factor in the obtaining of Sb. So although substances do not causally interact, their states accommodate one another as if there were causal interaction among substances.

It should be noted, however, that Leibniz did think that there was a sense in which one could say that mental events influence bodily events and vice-versa. He wrote to Antoine Arnauld that although “one particular substance has no physical influence on another … nevertheless, one is quite right to say that my will is the cause of this movement of my arm …; for the one expresses distinctly what the other expresses more confusedly, and one must ascribe the action to the substance whose expression is more distinct” (28 November 1686 (draft); G II, 71/LA 87). In this passage, Leibniz sets forth what he takes the metaphysical reality of apparent inter-substantial causation to amount to. We begin with the thesis that every created substance perceives the entire universe, though only a portion of it is perceived distinctly, most of it being perceived unconsciously, and, hence, confusedly. Now consider two created substances, x and y (x not identical to y), where some state of x is said to be the cause of some state of y. Leibniz’s analysis is this: when the causal state of affairs occurred, the relevant perceptions of substance x became more distinct, while the relevant perceptions of substance y became more confused. Insofar as the relevant perceptions of x become increasingly distinct, it is “causally” active; insofar as the relevant perceptions of substance y become increasingly confused, it is passive. In general, causation is to be understood as an increase in distinctness on the part of the causally active substance and an increase in confusedness on the part of the passively affected substance. Again, each substance is programmed at creation to be active/passive at the relevant moment with no occurrence of real substantial interaction.

It is difficult to say exactly why Leibniz denied inter-substantial causation. Some of the things he tells us, in both private and public writings, seem unsatisfactory. For example, in Primary Truths (1686?), we are given this:

Strictly speaking, one can say that no created substance exerts a metaphysical action or influx on any other thing. For, not to mention the fact that one cannot explain how something can pass from one thing into the substance of another, we have already shown that from the notion of each and every thing follows all of its future states. What we call causes are only concurrent requisites, in metaphysical rigor. (C 521/A&G 33)

Leibniz’s first reason for denying inter-substantial causation, that “one cannot explain how something can pass from one thing into the substance of another,” is a clear reference to the influx theory of causation. Leibniz found this theory inconsistent with his conception of substance. Influx theory could only explain causal relations between entities with parts, according to Leibniz. It is through these parts that “something can pass from one thing into … another.” But Leibnizian substances do not have parts in the requisite sense. (For more on influx theory, see O’Neil 1993.) Leibniz also gives a reason tied to his complete concept theory of substance, according to which “the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which this notion is attributed” (Discourse on Metaphysics, sec. 8; (G IV, 433/A&G 41)). But there are, it seems, at least two problems with this explanation. First, Leibniz moves rather quickly from a conceptual explanation of substance in terms of the complete concept theory to the conclusion that this consideration is sufficient to explain the activity of concrete substances. Second, even if conceptual considerations about substances were sufficient to explain their apparent causal activity, it does not seem to follow that substances do not interact—unless one is assuming that causal overdetermination is not a genuine possibility. Leibniz seems to be assuming just that but without argument.

Sometimes Leibniz gives a more familiar line of reasoning. At Monadology 7, we read this:

There is no way of explaining how a monad can be altered or changed internally by some other creature, since one cannot transpose anything in it, nor can one conceive of any internal motion that can be excited, directed, augmented, or diminished within it, as can be done in composites, where there can be change among the parts. The monads have no windows through which something can enter or leave. Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances, as the sensible species of the Scholastics once did. Thus, neither substance nor accident can enter a monad from without. (G VI, 607/A&G 213f.)

He seems to think that causal interaction between two beings requires the transmission or transposition of the parts of those beings. But substances are simple unextended entities which contain no parts. Thus, there is no way to explain how one substance could influence another. Unfortunately, however, this line of reasoning would seem to also rule out one case of inter-substantial causation which Leibniz allows, viz., God’s concurrent causal action on finite simple substances.

3. Language and Mind

Some scholars have suggested that Leibniz should be regarded as one of the first thinkers to envision something like the idea of artificial intelligence (cf. Churchland 1984; Pratt 1987). Whether or not he should be regarded as such, it is clear that Leibniz, like contemporary cognitive scientists, saw an intimate connection between the form and content of language, and the operations of the mind. Indeed, according to his own testimony in the New Essays, he “really believe[s] that languages are the best mirror of the human mind, and that a precise analysis of the signification of words would tell us more than anything else about the operations of the understanding” (bk.III, ch.7, sec.6 (RB, 333)). This view of Leibniz’s led him to formulate a plan for a “universal language,” an artificial language composed of symbols, which would stand for concepts or ideas, and logical rules for their valid manipulation. He believed that such a language would perfectly mirror the processes of intelligible human reasoning. It is this plan that has led some to believe that Leibniz came close to anticipating artificial intelligence. At any rate, Leibniz’s writings about this project (which, it should be noted, he never got the chance to actualize) reveal significant insights into his understanding of the nature of human reasoning. This understanding, it turns out, is not that different from contemporary conceptions of the mind, as many of his discussions bear considerable relevance to discussions in the cognitive sciences.

According to Leibniz, natural language, despite its powerful resources for communication, often makes reasoning obscure since it is an imperfect mirror of intelligible thoughts. As a result, it is often difficult to reason with the apparatus of natural language, “since it is full of innumerable equivocations” (On the Universal Science: Characteristic (undated); G VII, 205/S 18). Perhaps this is because of his view that the terms of natural language stand for complex, or derivative, concepts—concepts which are composed of, and reducible to, simpler concepts. With this “combinatorial” view of concepts in hand, Leibniz notices “that all human ideas can be resolved into a few as their primitives” (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 205/S 18). We could then assign symbols, or “characters,” to these primitive concepts from which we could form characters for derivative concepts by means of combinations of the symbols. As a result, Leibniz tells us, “it would be possible to find correct definitions and values and, hence, also the properties which are demonstrably implied in the definitions” (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 205/S 19). The totality of these symbols would form a “universal characteristic,” an ideal language in which all human concepts would be perfectly represented, and their constitutive nature perfectly transparent. Now it is true that Leibniz eventually came to doubt “whether any concept of this [primitive] kind appears distinctly to men, namely, in such a way that they know they have it” (An Introduction to a Secret Encyclopedia (1679?); C 513/MP 7). But it is also clear that he did not see this skepticism concerning our ability to reach the primitive concepts as much of a barrier to the project of a universal language. He writes in The Art of Discovery (1685) that “there are certain primitive terms which can be posited, if not absolutely, at least relatively to us” (C 176/W 51). The suggestion seems to be that even if we cannot provide a catalog of absolutely primitive concepts, we can nevertheless construct a characteristic based on concepts which cannot be further resolved by humans.

In addition to the resolution of concepts, and their symbolic assignments, Leibniz envisages the formulation of logical rules for the universal characteristic. He claims that “it is plain that men make use in reasoning of several axioms which are not yet quite certain” (The Method of Certitude and the Art of Discovery (undated); G VII, 183/W 49). Yet with the explicit formulation of these rules for the logical manipulation of the symbols—rules which humans use in reasoning—we would be in possession of a universal language which would mirror the relations between the concepts used in human reasoning. Indeed, the universal characteristic was intended by Leibniz as an instrument for the effective calculation of truths. Like formal logic systems, it would be a language capable of representing valid reasoning patterns by means of the use of symbols. Unlike formal logic systems, however, the universal language would also express the content of human reasoning in addition to its formal structure. In Leibniz’s mind, “this language will be the greatest instrument of reason,” for “when there are disputes among persons, we can simply say: Let us calculate, without further ado, and see who is right” (The Art of Discovery (1685); C 176/W 51).

Judging from Leibniz’s plans for a universal language, it is clear that Leibniz had a specific view about the nature of human cognitive processes, particularly about the nature of human reasoning. According to this view, cognition is essentially symbolic: it takes place in a system of representations which possesses language-like structure. Indeed, it was Leibniz’s view that “all human reasoning uses certain signs or characters,” (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 204/S 17) and “if there were no characters, we could neither think of anything distinctly nor reason about it” (Dialogue (1677); G VII, 191/A&G 271)). Add to this conception Leibniz’s view that human cognitive processes follow determinable axioms of logic, and the picture that emerges is one according to which the mind operates, at least when it comes to intelligible reasoning, by following implicit algorithmic procedures. Regardless of whether or not Leibniz should be seen as the grandfather of artificial intelligence, he did conceive of human cognition in essentially computational terms. In fact, as early as 1666, remarking favorably on Hobbes’ writings, Leibniz wrote: “Thomas Hobbes, everywhere a profound examiner of principles, rightly stated that everything done by our mind is a computation” (On the Art of Combinations (1666); G IV, 64/P 3).

4. Perception and Appetition

What do we find in the human mind? Representations on the one hand, and tendencies, inclinations, or strivings on the other, according to Leibniz. Or, to put this in Leibniz’s more customary terminology, what is found within us is perception and appetition. Human minds count for Leibniz as simple substances, and, as he says in a letter to De Volder of 30 June 1704, “it may be said that there is nothing in the world except simple substances, and, in them, perception and appetite” (G II, 270/A&G 181).

Perception has already been discussed briefly above. But it will be advisable to consider also a definition from a letter to Des Bosses (and echoed in many other passages) in which Leibniz discusses perception as the representation or “expression” of “the many in the one” (letter to Des Bosses, 11 July 1706; G II, 311). We shall return to this definition below. Appetitions are explained as “tendencies from one perception to another” (Principles of Nature and Grace, sec.2 (1714); G VI, 598/A&G 207). Thus, we represent the world in our perceptions, and these representations are linked with an internal principle of activity and change (Monadology, sec.15 (1714); G VI, 609/A&G 215) which, in its expression in appetitions, urges us ever onward in the constantly changing flow of mental life. More technically explained, the principle of action, that is, the primitive force which is our essence, expresses itself in momentary derivative forces involving two aspects: on the one hand, there is a representative aspect (perception), by which the many without are expressed within the one, the simple substance; on the other, there is a dynamical aspect, a tendency or striving towards new perceptions, which inclines us to change our representative state, to move towards new perceptions. (For more details, see Carlin 2004 and Jorati 2017.)

It should not be inferred that this appetitive tendency to change is entirely governed by efficient causation only. For in Leibniz’s view, value and final causes are not excluded from the action of the mind, the change of mental states. As he says in section 13 of the Discourse on Metaphysics (1686), just as “God will always do the best, … a man shall always do … that which appears to him to be the best” (G IV, 438/A&G 46). Appearance, of course, has to do with perception; doing, with appetition. So this principle of human action applies directly, as one would expect, to the two key factors of monadic interior life, only with the role of value, or an end in view, now more clearly in focus. This is why Leibniz says that, at the level of bodies (that is, for Leibniz, at the level of well-founded phenomena), all occurs according to the laws of efficient causes; whereas with respect to perceptions and appetites (or at least with some of these—interpretations differ here) all occurs according to the laws of final causes. And although both types of causation can be found at both levels (cf. Carlin 2006), there is no clash here given the harmony of final and efficient causes in Leibniz’s system.

To be sure, at an ultimate level, the only actions of substances are changes of perceptions. Thus, at the ultimate level, the appetitions are not so much the tendencies impelling a person towards voluntary motions of the human body (although at the level of well-founded phenomena this may indeed be the case) but rather tendencies arising out of present perceptions (present appearances) towards new perceptions. This explains why Leibniz defines appetitions in the initially surprising way noted above, as “tendencies from one perception to another”—another perception, that is.

The last two paragraphs have helped to clarify appetition. It is time to return to perception. In Leibniz’s definition (the expression of the many in the one) the two key terms are “expression” and “one.” Both of them bear considerable weight in Leibniz’s metaphysics. Representation or expression (Leibniz uses the two terms interchangeably) has its own definition: “One thing expresses another … when there is a constant and regulated relation between what can be said of the one and of the other” (letter to Arnauld, 9 October 1687; G II, 112/LA 144). Examples, in addition to perception, include a map expressing or representing a geographical region and an algebraic equation representing or expressing a geometric figure, such as a circle or an ellipse.

As we saw in the first section, with respect to oneness, Leibniz famously claims that only something with true unity is truly real. For Leibniz, what truly is is substance, so it is not surprising that at one point he clarifies his definition of perception by saying that perception is “the expression of many things in one, or in simple substance” (A New Method of Learning and Teaching Jurisprudence, revision notes of 1697–1700; A VI, i, 272/L 91).

Finally, it should be recalled that for Leibniz there are quite distinct levels of perception among created substances. Some of these will be taken up in more detail in the following section, but the basic point for now is that the three major levels, from the lowest to the highest, are bare perception (without special distinctness or memory), sensation (with heightened distinctness and memory), and thought (with distinctness, memory, and reflection). These are distinctive of the three levels of monads, respectively, the bare monads, souls, and spirits. Only the last of these may properly be said to have reason. Only the last of these is strictly a mind in the Leibnizian classification.

5. Apperception, Desire and the Unconscious

One of the better-known terms of Leibniz’s philosophy, and of his philosophy of mind, is “apperception.” A famous definition is presented in section 4 of the Principles of Nature and of Grace (1714), where Leibniz says that apperception is “consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state.” He adds that this is “something not given to all souls, nor at all times to a given soul” (G VI, 600/A&G 208).

Despite being well known, Leibniz’s concept of apperception is not necessarily well understood. In particular, the place of apperception in the three-fold classifications given at the end of the previous section—of three kinds of perceptions and of simple substances—is not agreed upon, despite the fact that this would seem to be of considerable importance. (See Kulstad 1991a for discussion.) A common understanding is that for Leibniz apperception is distinctive of spirits and is not present in even the highest of animals beneath humans. While there is evidence that Leibniz at least sometimes adopts this position, there is also evidence that he sometimes endorses the view that (at least some) beasts also apperceive. Since we may assume that at a minimum apperception involves consciousness (though not necessarily certain higher forms of consciousness, e.g., self-consciousness, or reflective consciousness, in one sense or another), this leads to some uncertainty as to whether Leibniz assigns consciousness to beasts, that is, whether he does or does not agree with the famous Cartesian principle that beasts are not conscious but only material automata.

There are at least three specific lines of evidence for apperception in beasts. The first is that Leibniz sometimes uses very similar definitions and examples when talking about the contrast between, on the one hand, apperceptions and petites perceptions (perceptions which are not apperceived), and, on the other, sensation and bare perceptions. This suggests, though it does not demonstrate, that Leibniz is identifying apperception and sensation, not apperception and rational thought. The second line of evidence is that he often appears to take the side of the common man against Descartes’ position on beasts, for example, when he says,

It will be difficult to rid mankind of this opinion which has been held always and everywhere and which is universal if any opinion deserves that term, namely, that beasts have feelings (letter to Arnauld, 9 October 1687; G II, 117/LA 150).

Finally, there are passages, notably in the New Essays concerning Human Understanding (1704), in which Leibniz quite simply ascribes apperception, directly or indirectly, to beasts, as, for example, when he discusses the case of a wild boar that has only a bare perception of a human until the human shouts at it, at which point the boar apperceives the person (“s’apperçoit d’une personne”) and begins a charge (Bk.II ch.21, sec.5; A vi VI 173).

Without trying to proceed further with this issue here, we can see that whichever of these views is ultimately adopted, it remains the case that Leibniz’s theory of perception involves something very distinctive in an age dominated by Descartes’ theory of ideas, the thesis that there are some perceptions of which we are not conscious, the much-discussed petites perceptions. Although Leibniz may not have been the first to propose such an idea (Aquinas, for example, might have had a similar view; see his Summa Theologiae, I-II, q.1, art.3), and although the view in his hands did not have the explosive quality that it did in the hands of Freud, the thesis remains an intriguing and important part of his philosophy of mind. Indeed, the Preface of the New Essays concerning Human Understanding contains as strong a statement as one is likely to find about the centrality of this view in a particular metaphysical system. Among other things, Leibniz makes it very clear that it is not just lower simple substances that have such unconscious perceptions but also human minds.

Having raised the issue of unconscious perceptions, we should consider also the question of unconscious appetitions. This is infrequently discussed, but the question should not be overlooked. Since appetitions are tendencies or strivings, ones which profoundly influence human actions, it is relevant whether or not an individual human is conscious of all of these strivings. Certainly, some have taken the possibility of urges of which we are not conscious as highly important for the proper understanding of individual humans and, indeed, of the human condition generally.

There is evidence, notably from the New Essays, that Leibniz did indeed draw a parallel between perceptions and appetitions with respect to consciousness. Although he did not always explain the distinction between conscious and unconscious appetitions with care and uniformity, it seems clear that he committed himself to appetitions of which we are not conscious, or which we do not apperceive, just as he had committed himself to perceptions which are not apperceived. Consider the following two statements in combination: “desires and tendencies which are apperceived are often called volitions” (New Essays, Bk.II, ch.21, sec.39; RB 192); and, “There are also efforts that result from insensible perceptions which one does not apperceive, and these I prefer to call appetitions rather than volitions (although there are also apperceptible appetitions)” (New Essays, Bk.2, ch.21, sec.5; RB 173).

In short, and perhaps oversimplifying to a certain extent, we can say that in the Leibnizian realm of mind there are indeed only perceptions and appetitions, but in these there is a fundamental divide between the realm of consciousness and unconsciousness. In the former, there are apperceptions and desires, the perceptions and appetitions of which we are conscious. In the latter, there are perceptions and appetitions of which we are not conscious. That does not mean, however, that this latter realm is unimportant in our mental lives. As Leibniz says, “insensible perceptions are as important to [the science of minds, souls, and soul-like substances] as insensible corpuscles are to natural science, and it is just as unreasonable to reject the one as the other on the pretext that they are beyond the reach of our senses” (New Essays, Preface; RB 56). He would have said the same, no doubt, about inapperceptible appetitions.


Works of Leibniz

A Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Edited by the German Academy of Science. Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923–. Cited by series, volume, and page.
A&G Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
C Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Edited by Louis Couturat. Paris: Felix Alcan, 1903.
G Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875–1890. Cited by volume and page.
Grua Textes Inédits. Edited by Gaston Grua. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1948.
H Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952.
L Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited by Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
LA The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Translated and edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester UP, 1967.
MP Philosophical Writings. Translated and edited by Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson. London: Dent, 1973.
P Leibniz: Logical Papers. Translated and edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1966.
RB New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982.
S Monadology and Other Philosophical Essays. Translated and edited by Paul Schrecker and Anne Martin Schrecker. New York: Bobbs-Merrill Co., 1965.
W&F Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited and translated by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Clarendon, 1997.
W Leibniz: Selections. Edited by Philip P. Wiener. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1951.

Secondary Literature

  • Carlin, L., 2004. “Leibniz on Conatus, Causation, and Freedom,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 85: 365–379.
  • –––, 2006. “ Leibniz on Final Causes,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 44: 217–233.
  • Churchland, P., 1984. Matter and Consciousness, Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Cole, D., 1984. “Thought and Thought Experiments,” Philosophical Studies, 45: 431–444.
  • Cook, D., 1972. “Leibniz and Hegel on the Philosophy of Language,” Studia Leibnitiana Supplementa, 15: 229–238.
  • Dascal, M., 1987. Leibniz: Language, Signs, and Thought, Philadelphia: John Benjamins.
  • Garber, D., 2009. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gennaro, R., 1999. “Leibniz on Consciousness and Self-Consciousness,” in New Essays on the Rationalists, R. Gennaro and C. Huenemann (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 353–371.
  • Jackson, F., 1982. “Epiphenomenal Qualia,” Philosophical Quarterly, 32: 127–136.
  • Jorati, J., 2017. Leibniz on Causation and Agency, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jorgensen, L., 2019. Leibniz’s Naturalized Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kulstad, M., 1977. “Leibniz’s Conception of Expression,” Studia Leibnitiana, 9: 55–76.
  • –––, 1982. “Some Difficulties in Leibniz’s Definition of Perception,” Leibniz: Critical and Interpretive Essays, M. Hooker (ed.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota, 65–78.
  • –––, 1991a. Leibniz on Apperception, Consciousness, and Reflection, München: Philosophia.
  • –––, 1991b. “Appetition in the Philosophy of Leibniz,” Mathesis rationis: Festschrift für Heinrich Schepers, Münster: Philosophia, 133–52.
  • Lodge, P., 2014. “ Leibniz’s Mill Argument Against Mechanical Materialism Revisited,” Ergo, 1: 79–99.
  • Lodge, P. and Bobro, M., 1998. “Stepping back inside Leibniz’s Mill,” Monist, 81: 554–73.
  • McGinn, C., 1989. “Can We Solve the Mind-Body Problem,” Mind, 98: 346–366.
  • McRae, R., 1976. Leibniz: Perception, Apperception, and Thought, Toronto: Toronto University Press..
  • Nagel, T., 1974. “What is it Like to be a Bat?” Philosophical Review, 83: 435–450.
  • O’Neill, E., 1993. “Influxus Physicus,”Causation in Early Modern Philosophy, S. Nadler (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Pratt, V., 1987. Thinking Machines: The Evolution of Artificial Intelligence, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Rossi, P., 1989. “The Twisted Roots of Leibniz’s Characteristic,” The Leibniz Renaissance, Florence: Olschki, 271–289.
  • Rutherford, D., 1995. “Philosophy and Language in Leibniz,” The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 224–269.
  • Seager, W., 1991. “The Worm in the Cheese: Leibniz, Consciousness, and Matter,” Studia Leibnitiana, 23: 79–91.
  • Searle, J., 1990. “Minds, Brains, and Programs,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 3: 417–457.
  • Simmons, A., 2001. “Changing the Cartesian Mind: Leibniz on Sensation, Representation, and Consciousness,” Philosophical Review, 110: 31–75.
  • Sleigh, R.C., 1990. “Leibniz on Malebranche on Causality,” Central Themes in Early Modern Philosophy, J.A.Cover and Mark Kulstad (eds.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 161–194.
  • Wilson, M., 1974. “Leibniz and Materialism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 3: 495–513.

Other Internet Resources


The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for noting and informing us about a number of typographical errors in this entry; we are grateful for her careful eye.

Copyright © 2020 by
Mark Kulstad
Laurence Carlin <carlin@uwosh.edu>

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