Niccolò Machiavelli

First published Tue Sep 13, 2005; substantive revision Wed Dec 6, 2023

Why Machiavelli? That question might naturally and legitimately occur to anyone encountering an entry about him in an encyclopedia of philosophy. Certainly, Machiavelli contributed to a large number of important discourses in Western thought—political theory most notably, but also history and historiography, Italian literature, the principles of warfare, and diplomacy. But Machiavelli never seems to have considered himself a philosopher—indeed, he often overtly rejected philosophical inquiry as beside the point—nor do his credentials suggest that he fits comfortably into standard models of academic philosophy. His writings are maddeningly and notoriously unsystematic, inconsistent and sometimes self-contradictory. He tends to appeal to experience and example in the place of rigorous logical analysis. Yet there are good reasons to include Machiavelli among the greatest of political philosophers, some of which are internal to his writings. In spite of the temptation to emphasize his political pragmatism, a lively scholarly debate rages about the presence of a coherent and original philosophy, addressed to topics of concern to philosophers, at the core of his thought (Benner 2009; Zuckert 2017, 2018; Baluch 2018; Bogiaris 2021).

Moreover, succeeding thinkers who more obviously qualify as philosophers of the first rank did (and still do) feel compelled to engage with his ideas, either to dispute them or to incorporate his insights into their own teachings. Even if Machiavelli grazed at the fringes of philosophy, the impact of his extensive musings has been widespread and lasting. The terms “Machiavellian” or “Machiavellism” find regular purchase among philosophers concerned with a range of ethical, political, and psychological phenomena, regardless of whether or not Machiavelli himself invented “Machiavellism” (a term apparently coined by Pierre Bayle in the seventeenth century) or was in fact a “Machiavellian” in the sense commonly ascribed to him. Machiavelli’s critique of utopian philosophical schemes (such as those of Plato) challenges an entire tradition of political philosophy in a manner that commands attention and demands consideration and response. Finally, a new generation of so-called “neo-Roman” political theorists (such as Philip Pettit [1997], Quentin Skinner [1998] and Maurizio Viroli [1999 [2002]]) finds inspiration in Machiavelli’s version of republicanism. Thus, Machiavelli deserves a place at the table in any comprehensive survey of political philosophy.

1. Biography

Relatively little is known for certain about Machiavelli’s early life in comparison with many important figures of the Italian Renaissance (the following section draws on Capponi 2010; Vivanti 2013; Celenza 2015; Lee 2020) He was born 3 May 1469 in Florence and at a young age became a pupil of a renowned Latin teacher, Paolo da Ronciglione. It is speculated that he attended the University of Florence, and even a cursory glance at his corpus reveals that he received an excellent humanist education. It is only with his entrance into public view, with his appointment in 1498 as the Second Chancellor of the Republic of Florence, however, that we begin to acquire a full and accurate picture of his life. For the next fourteen years, Machiavelli engaged in a flurry of diplomatic activity on behalf of Florence, traveling to the major centers of Italy as well as to the royal court of France and to the imperial curia of Maximilian.

Florence had been under a republican government since 1494, when the leading Medici family and its supporters had been driven from power. After four years under Savonarola’s leadership (and eventual downfall), the Florentine Republic sought more stable government and reformed its institutions accordingly. During this time, Machiavelli entered public service and thrived under the patronage of the city’s gonfaloniere (or chief administrator) for life, Piero Soderini, who was elected to that position in 1502. In his official capacities, Machiavelli travelled considerably, producing a large body of dispatches (known as the Legations) reporting on events across Europe. He also composed personal correspondence, poetic works, and short political analyses (Nederman 2023). In 1512, however, with the assistance of Spanish and papal troops, the Medici defeated the republic’s civic militia (which Machiavelli had organized) and dissolved its government. Machiavelli was a direct victim of the regime change: he was immediately dismissed from office and, when he was (wrongly) suspected of conspiring against the Medici, was imprisoned and tortured for several weeks in early 1513. His retirement thereafter to his family farm outside of Florence afforded the occasion and the impetus for him to turn to intellectual pursuits.

The first of his writings in a more reflective vein was also ultimately the one most commonly associated with his name, The Prince. Penned at the end of 1513 (and perhaps early 1514), but only published posthumously in 1532, The Prince was composed in haste by an author who, among other things, sought to regain his status in Florentine political affairs. (Many of his colleagues in the previous republican government were quickly rehabilitated and returned to service under the Medici.) Originally written for presentation to Giuliano de’Medici (who may well have appreciated it), the dedication was changed, upon Giuliano’s death, to Lorenzo de’Medici (the Younger), who almost certainly did not read it when it came into his hands in 1516.

Meanwhile, Machiavelli’s retirement from politics led him to other literary activities. He wrote verse, plays, and short prose, authored a study of The Art of War (published in 1521), and produced biographical and historical sketches. Most importantly, he composed his other major contribution to political thought, the Discourses on the Ten Books of Titus Livy, an exposition of the principles of republican rule masquerading as a commentary on the work of the famous historian of the Roman Republic. Unlike The Prince, the Discourses was written over a long period of time (commencing perhaps in 1514 or 1515 and completed in 1518 or 1519, although again only published posthumously in 1531). The book may have been shaped by informal discussions attended by Machiavelli among some of the leading Florentine intellectual and political figures under the sponsorship of Cosimo Rucellai.

Near the end of his life, and probably as a result of the aid of well-connected friends whom he never stopped badgering for intervention, Machiavelli began to return to the favor of the Medici family. In 1520, he was commissioned by Cardinal Giulio de’Medici to compose a history of Florence (the so-called Florentine Histories), an assignment completed in 1525 and presented to the Cardinal, who had since ascended to the papal throne as Clement VII, in Rome. Other small tasks were forthcoming from the Medici government, but before the opportunity arose for him to return fully to public life, he died on 21 June 1527.

2. The Prince: Analyzing Power

Traditionally, political philosophers of the past posited a special relationship between moral goodness and legitimate authority. Many authors (especially those who composed mirror-of-princes books or royal advice books during the Middle Ages and Renaissance) believed that the use of political power was only rightful if it was exercised by a ruler whose personal moral character was strictly virtuous. Thus rulers were counseled that if they wanted to succeed—that is, if they desired a long and peaceful reign and aimed to pass their office down to their heirs—they must be sure to behave in accordance with conventional ethical standards, that is, the virtues and piety. In a sense, it was thought that rulers did well when they did good; they earned the right to be obeyed and respected on account of their moral and religious rectitude (see Briggs and Nederman 2022).

Machiavelli criticized at length precisely this moralistic view of authority in his best-known treatise, The Prince. For Machiavelli, there is no moral basis on which to judge the difference between legitimate and illegitimate uses of power. Rather, authority and power are essentially coequal: whoever has power has the right to command; but goodness does not ensure power and the ruler has no more authority on account of being good. Thus, in direct opposition to morally derived theories of politics, Machiavelli says that the only real concern in politics is the acquisition and maintenance of power (although he talks less about power per se than about “maintaining the state”). In this sense, Machiavelli presents a trenchant criticism of the concept of authority by arguing that the notion of legitimate rights of rulership adds nothing to the actual possession of power. The Prince purports to reflect the self-conscious political realism of an author who is fully aware—on the basis of direct experience in the service of the Florentine government—that goodness and right are not sufficient to win and maintain political supremacy. Machiavelli thus seeks to learn and teach the rules of political power. For him, it necessary for any successful ruler to know how to use power effectively. Only by means of its proper application, Machiavelli believes, can individuals be brought to obey and will the ruler be able to maintain the state in safety and security.

Machiavelli’s political theory, then, excludes issues of moral authority and legitimacy from consideration in the discussion of political decision-making and political judgment. Nowhere does this come out more clearly than in his treatment of the relationship between law and force. Machiavelli acknowledges that good laws and good arms constitute the dual foundations of a well-ordered political system. But he immediately adds that since coercion creates legality, he will concentrate his attention on force. He says, “Since there cannot be good laws without good arms, I will not consider laws but speak of arms” (Prince CW 47). In other words, valid law rests entirely upon the threat of coercive force; authority is impossible for Machiavelli as a right apart from the power to enforce it. Machiavelli is led to conclude that fear is always preferable to affection in subjects, just as violence and deception are superior to legality in effectively controlling them. He observes that

one can say this in general of men: they are ungrateful, disloyal, insincere and deceitful, timid of danger and avid of profit…. Love is a bond of obligation which these miserable creatures break whenever it suits them to do so; but fear holds them fast by a dread of punishment that never passes. (Prince CW 62; translation revised)

As a result, Machiavelli cannot really be said to have a theory of obligation separate from the imposition of power; people obey only because they fear the consequences of not doing so, whether the loss of life or of privileges. And of course, power alone cannot bind one, inasmuch as obligation is voluntary and assumes that one can meaningfully do otherwise. Someone can choose not to obey only if he possesses the power to resist the ruler or is prepared to risk the consequences of the state’s superiority of coercive force.

Machiavelli’s argument in The Prince is thus designed to demonstrate that politics can only properly be defined in terms of the effective employment of coercive power, what Yes Winter (2018) has termed “the orders of violence.” Authority as a right to command has no independent status. He substantiates this assertion by reference to the observable realities—historical and contemporary—of political affairs and public life as well as by arguments revealing the self-interested tendencies of all human conduct. For Machiavelli it is meaningless and futile to speak of any claim to the authority to command detached from the possession of superior political power. The ruler who lives by his supposed rights alone will surely wither and die by those same rights, because in the rough-and-tumble of political conflict those who prefer power to authority are more likely to succeed. Without exception the authority of states and their laws will never be acknowledged when they are not supported by a show of power which renders obedience inescapable.

3. Power, Virtù, and Fortune

Machiavelli presents to his readers a vision of political rule allegedly purged of extraneous moralizing influences and fully aware of the foundations of politics in the effective exercise of power. The methods for achieving obedience are varied and depend heavily upon the foresight that the prince exercises. Hence, the successful ruler needs special training. The term that best captures Machiavelli’s vision of skill that must be learned in order to engage successfully in power politics is virtù. While the Italian word would normally be translated into English as “virtue”, and would ordinarily convey the conventional connotation of moral goodness, Machiavelli obviously means something very different when he refers to the virtù of the prince. In particular, Machiavelli employs the concept of virtù to refer to the range of personal qualities that the prince will find it necessary to acquire in order to “maintain his state” and to “achieve great things”, the two standard markers of power for him. This makes it brutally clear there can be no equivalence between the conventional virtues and Machiavellian virtù. Machiavelli’s sense of what it is to be a person of virtù can thus be summarized by his recommendation that the prince above all else must possess a “flexible disposition”. That ruler is best suited for office, on Machiavelli’s account, who is capable of varying her/his conduct from good to evil and back again “as fortune and circumstances dictate” (Prince CW 66; see Nederman and Bogiaris 2018).

Not coincidentally, Machiavelli also uses the term virtù in his book The Art of War in order to describe the strategic prowess of the general who adapts to different battlefield conditions as the situation dictates. Machiavelli sees politics to be a sort of a battlefield on a different scale. Hence, the prince just like the general needs to be in possession of virtù, that is, to know which strategies and techniques are appropriate to what particular circumstances (Wood 1967). Thus, virtù winds up being closely connected to Machiavelli’s notion of the power. The ruler of virtù is bound to be competent in the application of power; to possess virtù is indeed to have mastered all the rules connected with the effective application of power. Virtù is to power politics what conventional virtue is to those thinkers who suppose that moral goodness is sufficient to be a legitimate ruler: it is the touchstone of political efficacy.

What is the conceptual link between virtù and the effective exercise of power for Machiavelli? The answer lies with another central Machiavellian concept, Fortuna (usually translated as “fortune”). Fortuna is the enemy of political order, the ultimate threat to the safety and security of the state. Machiavelli’s use of the concept has been widely debated without a very satisfactory resolution. Suffice it to say that, as with virtù, Fortuna is employed by him in a distinctive way. Where conventional representations treated Fortuna as a mostly benign, if fickle, goddess, who is the source of human goods as well as evils, Machiavelli’s fortune is a malevolent and uncompromising fount of human misery, affliction, and disaster. While human Fortuna may be responsible for such success as human beings achieve, no man can act effectively when directly opposed by the Goddess (Discourses CW 407–408).

Machiavelli’s most famous discussion of Fortuna occurs in Chapter 25 of The Prince, in which he proposes two analogies for understanding the human situation in the face of events. Initially, he asserts that fortune resembles

one of our destructive rivers which, when it is angry, turns the plains into lakes, throws down the trees and buildings, takes earth from one spot, puts it in another; everyone flees before the flood; everyone yields to its fury and nowhere can repel it.

Yet the furor of a raging river does not mean that its depredations are beyond human control: before the rains come, it is possible to take precautions to divert the worst consequences of the natural elements. “The same things happen about Fortuna”, Machiavelli observes,

She shows her power where virtù and wisdom do not prepare to resist her and directs her fury where she knows that no dykes or embankments are ready to hold her. (Prince CW 90)

Fortune may be resisted by human beings, but only in those circumstances where “virtù and wisdom” have already prepared for her inevitable arrival.

Machiavelli reinforces the association of Fortuna with the blind strength of nature by explaining that political success depends upon appreciation of the operational principles of Fortuna. His own experience has taught him that

it is better to be impetuous than cautious, because Fortuna is a woman and it is necessary, in order to keep her under, to beat and maul her.

In other words, Fortuna demands a violent response of those who would control her. “She more often lets herself be overcome by men using such methods than by those who proceed coldly”, Machiavelli continues, “therefore always, like a woman, she is the friend of young men, because they are less cautious, more spirited, and with more boldness master her” (Prince CW 92). The wanton behavior of Fortuna demands an aggressive, even violent response, lest she take advantage of those men who are too retiring or “effeminate” to dominate her.

Machiavelli’s remarks point toward several salient conclusions about Fortuna and her place in his intellectual universe. Throughout his corpus, Fortuna is depicted as a primal source of violence (especially as directed against humanity) and as antithetical to reason. Thus, Machiavelli realizes that only preparation to pose an extreme response to the vicissitudes of Fortuna will ensure victory against her. This is what virtù provides: the ability to respond to fortune at any time and in any way that is necessary.

4. Morality, Religion, and Politics

These basic building blocks of Machiavelli’s thought have induced considerable controversy among his readers going back to the sixteenth century, when he was denounced as an apostle of the Devil, but also was read and applied sympathetically by authors (and politicians) enunciating the doctrine of “reason of state” (Meinecke 1924 [1957]). The main source of dispute concerned Machiavelli’s attitude toward conventional moral and religious standards of human conduct, mainly in connection with The Prince. For many, his teaching endorses immoralism or, at least, amoralism. The most extreme versions of this reading find Machiavelli to be a “teacher of evil”, in the famous words of Leo Strauss (1958: 9–10), on the grounds that he counsels leaders to avoid the common values of justice, mercy, temperance, wisdom, and love of their people in preference to the use of cruelty, violence, fear, and deception. A more moderate school of thought, associated with Benedetto Croce (1925), views Machiavelli as simply a “realist” or a “pragmatist” advocating the suspension of commonplace ethics in matters of politics. Moral values have no place in the sorts of decisions that political leaders must make, and it is a category error of the gravest sort to think otherwise. Perhaps the mildest version of the amoral hypothesis has been proposed by Quentin Skinner (1978), who claims that the ruler’s commission of acts deemed vicious by convention is a “last best” option. Concentrating on the claim in The Prince that a head of state ought to do good if he can but must be prepared to commit evil if he must (Prince CW 58), Skinner argues that Machiavelli prefers conformity to moral virtue ceteris paribus.

Disinterest in ethical concerns also permeates the claim, popular in the early- and mid-twentieth century, that Machiavelli simply adopts the stance of a scientist—a kind of “Galileo of politics”—in distinguishing between the “facts” of political life and the “values” of moral judgment (Olschki 1945; Cassirer 1946; Prezzolini 1954 [1967]). He is thereby set into the context of the scientific revolution more generally. The point of Machiavellian “science” is not to distinguish between “just” and “unjust” forms of government, but to explain how politicians deploy power for their own gain. Thus, Machiavelli rises to the mantle of the founder of “modern” political science, in contrast with Aristotle’s classical norm-laden vision of a political science of virtue. More recently, the Machiavelli-as-scientist interpretation has largely gone out of favor (Viroli 1998 1–3), although some have recently found merit in a revised version of the thesis (e.g., Dyer and Nederman 2016).

Other of Machiavelli’s readers have found no taint of immorality or amoralism in his thought whatsoever. Jean-Jacques Rousseau long ago held that the real lesson of The Prince is to teach the people the truth about how princes behave and thus to expose, rather than celebrate, the immorality at the core of one-man rule (quoted in Connell 2005, 178). Various versions of this thesis have been disseminated more recently. Some scholars, such as Garrett Mattingly (1958), have pronounced Machiavelli the supreme satirist, pointing out the foibles of princes and their advisors. The fact that Machiavelli later wrote biting popular stage comedies is cited as evidence in support of his strong satirical bent. Thus, we should take nothing Machiavelli says about moral conduct at face value, but instead should understand his remarks as sharply humorous commentary on public affairs. Alternatively, Mary Deitz (1986) asserts that Machiavelli’s agenda was driven by a desire to “trap” the prince by offering carefully crafted advice (such as arming the people) designed to undo the ruler if taken seriously and followed.

A similar range of opinions exists in connection with Machiavelli’s attitude toward religion in general, and Christianity in particular. Machiavelli was no friend of the institutionalized Christian Church as he knew it. The Discourses makes clear that conventional Christianity saps from human beings the vigor required for active civil life (CW 228–229, 330–331). And The Prince speaks with equal parts disdain and admiration about the contemporary condition of the Church and its Pope (CW 29, 44–46, 65, 91–92). Many scholars have taken such evidence to indicate that Machiavelli was himself profoundly anti-Christian, preferring the pagan civil religions of ancient societies such as Rome, which he regarded to be more suitable for a city endowed with virtù. Anthony Parel (1992) argues that Machiavelli’s cosmos, governed by the movements of the stars and the balance of the humors, takes on an essentially pagan and pre-Christian cast. For others, Machiavelli may best be described as a man of conventional, if unenthusiastic, piety, prepared to bow to the externalities of worship but not deeply devoted in either soul or mind to the tenets of Christian faith. A few dissenting voices, most notably Sebastian de Grazia (1989) and Maurizio Viroli (2006 [2010]), have attempted to rescue Machiavelli’s reputation from those who view him as hostile or indifferent to Christianity. Grazia demonstrates how central biblical themes run throughout Machiavelli’s writings, finding there a coherent conception of a divinely centered and ordered cosmos in which other forces (“the heavens”, “fortune”, and the like) are subsumed under a divine will and plan. Cary Nederman extends and systematizes Grazia’s insights by showing how such central Christian theological doctrines as grace, free will and prayer form important elements of Machiavelli’s conceptual framework (2009: 28–49; Nederman and Lahoud 2023). Viroli considers, by contrast, the historical attitudes toward the Christian religion as manifested in the Florentine republic of Machiavelli’s day.

5. The State and the Prince: Language and Concepts

Machiavelli has also been credited (most recently by Skinner 1978) with formulating for the first time the “modern concept of the state”, understood in the broadly Weberian sense of an impersonal form of rule possessing a monopoly of coercive authority within a fixed territorial boundaries. Certainly, the term lo stato appears widely in Machiavelli’s writings, especially in The Prince, in connection with the acquisition and application of power in a coercive sense, which renders its meaning distinct from the Latin term status (condition or station) from which it is derived. Moreover, scholars cite Machiavelli’s influence in shaping the early modern debates surrounding “reason of state”—the doctrine that the good of the state itself takes precedence over all other considerations, whether morality or the good of citizens—as evidence that he was received by his near-contemporaries as a theorist of the state (Meineke 1924 [1957]). Machiavelli’s name and doctrines were widely invoked to justify the priority of the interests of the state in the age of absolutism.

Yet, as Harvey Mansfield (1996) has shown, a careful reading of Machiavelli’s use of lo stato in The Prince and elsewhere does not support this interpretation. Machiavelli’s “state” remains a personal patrimony, a possession more in line with the medieval conception of dominium as the foundation of rule. (Dominium is a Latin term that may be translated with equal force as “private property” and as “political dominion”.) Thus, the “state” is literally owned by whichever prince happens to have control of it. Moreover, the character of governance is determined by the personal qualities and traits of the ruler—hence, Machiavelli’s emphasis on virtù as indispensable for the prince’s success. These aspects of the deployment of lo stato in The Prince mitigate against the “modernity” of his idea. Machiavelli is at best a transitional figure in the process by which the language of the state emerged in early modern Europe, as Mansfield concludes.

Another factor that must be kept in mind when evaluating the general applicability of Machiavelli’s theory in The Prince stems from the very situation in which his prince of virtù operates. Such a ruler comes to power not by dynastic inheritance or on the back of popular support, but purely as a result of his own initiative, skill, talent, and/or strength (all words that are English equivalents for virtù, dependent upon where it occurs in the text). Thus, the Machiavellian prince can count on no pre-existing structures of legitimation, as discussed above. In order to “maintain his state”, then, he can only rely upon his own fount of personal characteristics to direct the use of power and establish his claim on rulership. This is a precarious position, since Machiavelli insists that the throes of fortune and the conspiracies of other men render the prince constantly vulnerable to the loss of his state. The idea of a stable constitutional regime that reflects the tenor of modern political thought (and practice) is nowhere to be seen in Machiavelli’s conception of princely government.

Indeed, one might wonder whether Machiavelli, for all of his alleged realism, actually believed that a prince of complete virtù could in fact exist. He sometimes seems to imagine that a successful prince would have to develop a psychology entirely different from that known hitherto to mankind, inasmuch as this “new” prince is

prepared to vary his conduct as the winds of fortune and changing circumstances constrain him and … not deviate from right conduct if possible, but be capable of entering upon the path of wrongdoing when this becomes necessary. (MP 62)

This flexibility yields the core of the “practical” advice that Machiavelli offers to the ruler seeking to maintain his state: exclude no course of action out of hand, but be ready always to perform whatever acts are required by political circumstance.

Yet Machiavelli himself apparently harbored severe doubts about whether human beings were psychologically capable of generating such flexible dispositions within themselves. In spite of the great number of his historical examples, Machiavelli can point in The Prince to no single ruler who evinced the sort of variable virtù that he deems necessary for the complete control of fortune. Rather, his case studies of successful rulers repeatedly point to the situation of a prince whose characteristics suited his times but whose consistency of conduct (as in the case of Pope Julius II) “would have brought about his downfall” if circumstances had changed (Prince CW 92). Even the Emperor Severus, whose techniques Machiavelli lauds, succeeded because he employed “the courses of action that are necessary for establishing himself in power”; he is not, however, to be imitated universally (Prince CW 73). Machiavelli’s evaluation of the chances for creating a new, psychologically flexible type of character is extremely guarded, and tends to be worded in conditional form and in the subjective mood: “If it were possible to change one’s nature to suit the times and circumstances, one would always be successful” (Prince CW 91, translation revised). Such observations must make us wonder whether Machiavelli’s advice that princes acquire dispositions which vary according to circumstance was so “practical” (even in his own mind) as he had asserted.

6. The Discourses on Livy: Liberty and Conflict

While The Prince is doubtless the most widely read of his works, the Discourses on the Ten Books of Titus Livy perhaps most honestly expresses Machiavelli’s personal political beliefs and commitments, in particular, his republican sympathies. The Discourses certainly draw upon the same reservoir of language and concepts that flowed into The Prince, but the former treatise leads us to draw conclusions quite different from—many scholars have said contradictory to—the latter. In particular, across the two works, Machiavelli consistently and clearly distinguishes between a minimal and a full conception of “political” or “civil” order, and thus constructs a hierarchy of ends within his general account of communal life. A minimal constitutional order is one in which subjects live securely (vivere sicuro), ruled by a strong government which holds in check the aspirations of both nobility (grandi) and people (Popolo), but is in turn balanced by other legal and institutional mechanisms. In a fully constitutional regime, however, the goal of the political order is the freedom of the community (vivere libero), created by the active participation of, and contention between, the nobility and the people (Pedullà 2011 [2018]). As Quentin Skinner (2002, 189–212) has argued, liberty forms a value that anchors Machiavelli’s political theory and guides his evaluations of the worthiness of different types of regimes. Only in a republic, for which Machiavelli expresses a distinct preference, may this goal be attained.

Machiavelli adopted this position on both pragmatic and principled grounds. During his career as a secretary and diplomat in the Florentine republic, he came to acquire vast experience of the inner workings of French government, which became his model for the “secure” (but not free) polity. Although Machiavelli makes relatively little comment about the French monarchy in The Prince, he devotes a great deal of attention to France in the Discourses.

Why would Machiavelli effusively praise (let alone even analyze) a hereditary monarchy in a work supposedly designed to promote the superiority of republics? The answer stems from Machiavelli’s aim to contrast the best-case scenario of a monarchic regime with the institutions and organization of a republic. Even the most excellent monarchy, in Machiavelli’s view, lacks certain salient qualities that are endemic to properly constituted republican government and that make the latter constitution more desirable than the former.

Machiavelli asserts that the greatest virtue of the French kingdom and its king is the dedication to law. “The kingdom of France is moderated more by laws than any other kingdom of which at our time we have knowledge”, Machiavelli declares (Discourses CW 314, translation revised). The explanation for this situation Machiavelli refers to the function of the Parlement. “The kingdom of France”, he states,

lives under laws and orders more than any other kingdom. These laws and orders are maintained by Parlements, notably that of Paris: by it they are renewed any time it acts against a prince of the kingdom or in its sentences condemns the king. And up to now it has maintained itself by having been a persistent executor against that nobility. (Discourses CW 422, translation revised)

These passages of the Discourses suggest that Machiavelli has great admiration for the institutional arrangements that obtain in France (Nederman 2023: 52–55). Specifically, the French king and the nobles, whose power is such that they would be able to oppress the populace, are checked by the laws of the realm which are enforced by the independent authority of the Parlement. Thus, opportunities for unbridled tyrannical conduct are largely eliminated, rendering the monarchy temperate and “civil”.

Yet such a regime, no matter how well ordered and law-abiding, remains incompatible with vivere libero. Discussing the ability of a monarch to meet the people’s wish for liberty, Machiavelli comments that

as far as the … popular desire of recovering their liberty, the prince, not being able to satisfy them, must examine what the reasons are that make them desire being free. (Discourses CW 237).

He concludes that a few individuals want freedom simply in order to command others; these, he believes, are of sufficiently small number that they can either be eradicated or bought off with honors. By contrast, the vast majority of people confuse liberty with security, imagining that the former is identical to the latter: “But all the others, who are infinite, desire liberty in order to live securely (vivere sicuro)” (Discourses CW 237). Although the king cannot give such liberty to the masses, he can provide the security that they crave:

As for the rest, for whom it is enough to live securely (vivere sicuro), they are easily satisfied by making orders and laws that, along with the power of the king, comprehend everyone’s security. And once a prince does this, and the people see that he never breaks such laws, they will shortly begin to live securely (vivere sicuro) and contentedly (Discourses CW 237).

Machiavelli then applies this general principle directly to the case of France, remarking that

the people live securely (vivere sicuro) for no other reason than that its kings are bound to infinite laws in which the security of all their people is comprehended. (Discourses CW 237)

The law-abiding character of the French regime ensures security, but that security, while desirable, ought never to be confused with liberty. This is the limit of monarchic rule: even the best kingdom can do no better than to guarantee to its people tranquil and orderly government.

Machiavelli holds that one of the consequences of such vivere sicuro is the disarmament of the people. He comments that regardless of “how great his kingdom is”, the king of France “lives as a tributary” to foreign mercenaries.

This all comes from having disarmed his people and having preferred … to enjoy the immediate profit of being able to plunder the people and of avoiding an imaginary rather than a real danger, instead of doing things that would assure them and make their states perpetually happy. This disorder, if it produces some quiet times, is in time the cause of straitened circumstances, damage and irreparable ruin (Discourses CW 410).

A state that makes security a priority cannot afford to arm its populace, for fear that the masses will employ their weapons against the nobility (or perhaps the crown). Yet at the same time, such a regime is weakened irredeemably, since it must depend upon foreigners to fight on its behalf. In this sense, any government that takes vivere sicuro as its goal generates a passive and impotent populace as an inescapable result. By definition, such a society can never be free in Machiavelli’s sense of vivere libero, and hence is only minimally, rather than completely, political or civil.

Confirmation of this interpretation of the limits of monarchy for Machiavelli may be found in his further discussion of the disarmament of the people, and its effects, in The Art of War. Addressing the question of whether a citizen army is to be preferred to a mercenary one, he insists that the liberty of a state is contingent upon the military preparedness of its subjects. Acknowledging that “the king [of France] has disarmed his people in order to be able to command them more easily”, Machiavelli still concludes “that such a policy is … a defect in that kingdom, for failure to attend to this matter is the one thing that makes her weak” (Art CW 584, 586–587). In his view, whatever benefits may accrue to a state by denying a military role to the people are of less importance than the absence of liberty that necessarily accompanies such disarmament. The problem is not merely that the ruler of a disarmed nation is in thrall to the military prowess of foreigners. More crucially, Machiavelli believes, a weapons-bearing citizen militia remains the ultimate assurance that neither the government nor some usurper will tyrannize the populace: “So Rome was free four hundred years and was armed; Sparta, eight hundred; many other cities have been unarmed and free less than forty years” (Art CW 585). Machiavelli is confident that citizens will always fight for their liberty—against internal as well as external oppressors. Indeed, this is precisely why successive French monarchs have left their people disarmed: they sought to maintain public security and order, which for them meant the elimination of any opportunities for their subjects to wield arms. The French regime, because it seeks security above all else (for the people as well as for their rulers), cannot permit what Machiavelli takes to be a primary means of promoting liberty.

The case of disarmament is an illustration of a larger difference between minimally constitutional systems such as France and fully political communities such as the Roman Republic, namely, the status of the classes within the society. In France, the people are entirely passive and the nobility is largely dependent upon the king, according to Machiavelli’s own observations. By contrast, in a fully developed republic such as Rome’s, where the actualization of liberty is paramount, both the people and the nobility take an active (and sometimes clashing) role in self-government (McCormick 2011; Holman 2018). The liberty of the whole, for Machiavelli, depends upon the liberty of its component parts. In his famous discussion of this subject in the Discourses, he remarks,

To me those who condemn the tumults between the Nobles and the Plebs seem to be caviling at the very thing that was the primary cause of Rome’s retention of liberty…. And they do not realize that in every republic there are two different dispositions, that of the people and that of the great men, and that all legislation favoring liberty is brought about by their dissension (Discourses CW 202–203).

Machiavelli knows that he is adopting an unusual perspective here, since customarily the blame for the collapse of the Roman Republic has been assigned to warring factions that eventually ripped it apart. But Machiavelli holds that precisely the same conflicts generated a “creative tension” that was the source of Roman liberty. For “those very tumults that so many inconsiderately condemn” directly generated the good laws of Rome and the virtuous conduct of its citizens (Discourses CW 202). Hence,

Enmities between the people and the Senate should, therefore, be looked upon as an inconvenience which it is necessary to put up with in order to arrive at the greatness of Rome. (Discourses CW 211)

Machiavelli thinks that other republican models (such as those adopted by Sparta or Venice) will produce weaker and less successful political systems, ones that are either stagnant or prone to decay when circumstances change.

7. Popular Liberty and Popular Speech

Machiavelli evinces particular confidence in the capacity of the people to contribute to the promotion of communal liberty. In the Discourses, he ascribes to the masses a quite extensive competence to judge and act for the public good in various settings, explicitly contrasting the “prudence and stability” of ordinary citizens with the unsound discretion of the prince. Simply stated, “A people is more prudent, more stable, and of better judgment than a prince” (Discourses CW 316). This is not an arbitrary expression of personal preference on Machiavelli’s part. He maintains that the people are more concerned about, and more willing to defend, liberty than either princes or nobles (Discourses CW 204–205). Where the latter confuse their liberty with their ability to dominate and control the popolo, the masses are more concerned with protecting themselves against oppression and consider themselves “free” when they are not abused by the more powerful or threatened with such abuse (Discourses CW 203). In turn, when they fear the onset of such oppression, ordinary citizens are more inclined to object and to defend the common liberty. Such an active role for the people, while necessary for the maintenance of vital public liberty, is fundamentally antithetical to the hierarchical structure of subordination-and-rule on which monarchic vivere sicuro rests. The preconditions of vivere libero simply do not favor the security that is the aim of constitutional monarchy.

One of the main reasons that security and liberty remain, in the end, incompatible for Machiavelli—and that the latter is to be preferred—may surely be traced to the “rhetorical” character of his republicanism. Machiavelli clearly views speech as the method most appropriate to the resolution of conflict in the republican public sphere; throughout the Discourses, debate is elevated as the best means for the people to determine the wisest course of action and the most qualified leaders. The tradition of classical rhetoric, with which he was evidently familiar, directly associated public speaking with contention: the proper application of speech in the realms of forensic and deliberative genres of rhetoric is an adversarial setting, with each speaker seeking to convince his audience of the validity of his own position and the unworthiness of his opponents’. This theme was taken up, in turn, by late medieval Italian practitioners and theorists of rhetoric, who emphasized that the subject matter of the art was lite (conflict). Thus, Machiavelli’s insistence upon contention as a prerequisite of liberty also reflects his rhetorical predilections (Viroli 1998). By contrast, monarchic regimes—even the most secure monarchies such as France—exclude or limit public discourse, thereby placing themselves at a distinct disadvantage. It is far easier to convince a single ruler to undertake a disastrous or ill-conceived course of action than a multitude of people. The apparent “tumult” induced by the uncertain liberty of public discussion eventually renders more likely a decision conducive to the common good than does the closed conversation of the royal court.

This connects to the claim in the Discourses that the popular elements within the community form the best safeguard of civic liberty as well as the most reliable source of decision-making about the public good. Machiavelli’s praise for the role of the people in securing the republic is supported by his confidence in the generally illuminating effects of public speech upon the citizen body. Near the beginning of the first Discourses, he notes that some may object to the extensive freedom enjoyed by the Roman people to assemble, to protest, and to veto laws and policies. But he responds that the Romans were able to

maintain liberty and order because of the people’s ability to discern the common good when it was shown to them. At times when ordinary Roman citizens wrongly supposed that a law or institution was designed to oppress them, they could be persuaded that their beliefs are mistaken … [through] the remedy of assemblies, in which some man of influence gets up and makes a speech showing them how they are deceiving themselves. And as Tully says, the people, although they may be ignorant, can grasp the truth, and yield easily when told what is true by a trustworthy man (Discourses CW 203).

The reference to Tully, that is, Cicero (one of the few in the Discourses) confirms that Machiavelli has in mind here a key feature of classical republicanism: the competence of the people to respond to and support the words of the gifted orator when he speaks truly about the public welfare.

Machiavelli returns to this theme and treats it more extensively at the end of the first Discourse. In a chapter intended to demonstrate the superiority of popular over princely government, he argues that the people are well ordered, and hence “prudent, stable and grateful”, so long as room is made for public speech and deliberation within the community. Citing the formula vox populi, vox dei, Machiavelli insists that

public opinion is remarkably accurate in its prognostications…. With regard to its judgment, when two speakers of equal skill are heard advocating different alternatives, very rarely does one find the people failing to adopt the better view or incapable of appreciating the truth of what it hears (Discourses CW 316).

Not only are the people competent to discern the best course of action when orators lay out competing plans, but they are in fact better qualified to make decisions, in Machiavelli’s view, than are princes. For example,

the people can never be persuaded that it is good to appoint to an office a man of infamous or corrupt habits, whereas a prince may easily and in a vast variety of ways be persuaded to do this. (Discourses CW 316)

Likewise, should the people depart from the law-abiding path, they may readily be convinced to restore order:

For an uncontrolled and tumultuous people can be spoken to by a good man and easily led back into a good way. But no one can speak to a wicked prince, and the only remedy is steel…. To cure the malady of the people words are enough. (Discourses CW 317)

The contrast Machiavelli draws is stark. The republic governed by words and persuasion—in sum, ruled by public speech—is almost sure to realize the common good of its citizens; and even should it err, recourse is always open to further discourse. Non-republican regimes, because they exclude or limit discursive practices, ultimately rest upon coercive domination and can only be corrected by violent means.

8. The Character of Republican Leaders

Machiavelli’s arguments in favor of republican regimes also appeal to his skeptical stance toward the acquisition of virtù by any single individual, and hence the implication that a truly stable principality may never be attainable. The effect of the Machiavellian dichotomy between the need for flexibility and the inescapable constancy of character is to demonstrate an inherent practical limitation in single-ruler regimes. For the reader is readily led to the conclusion that, just because human conduct is rooted in a firm and invariant character, the rule of a single man is intrinsically unstable and precarious. In the Discourses, Machiavelli provides a psychological case that the realities of human character tend to favor a republic over a principality, since the former “is better able to adapt itself to diverse circumstances than a prince owing to the diversity found among its citizens” (Discourses CW 253).

Machiavelli illustrates this claim by reference to the evolution of Roman military strategy against Hannibal. After the first flush of the Carthaginian general’s victories in Italy, the circumstances of the Roman required a circumspect and cautious leader who would not commit the legions to aggressive military action for which they were not prepared. Such leadership emerged in the person of Fabius Maximus, “a general who by his slowness and his caution held the enemy at bay. Nor could he have met with circumstances more suited to his ways” (Discourses CW 452). Yet when a more offensive stance was demanded to defeat Hannibal, the Roman Republic was able to turn to the leadership of Scipio, whose personal qualities were more fitted to the times. Neither Fabius nor Scipio was able to escape “his ways and habits” (Discourses CW 452), but the fact that Rome could call on each at the appropriate moment suggests to Machiavelli an inherent strength of the republican system.

If Fabius had been king of Rome, he might easily have lost this war, since he was incapable of altering his methods according as circumstance changed. Since, however, he was born in a republic where there were diverse citizens with diverse dispositions, it came about that, just as it had a Fabius, who was the best man to keep the war going when circumstances required it, so later it had a Scipio at a time suited to its victorious consummation (Discourses CW 452).

Changing events require flexibility of response, and since it is psychologically implausible for human character to change with the times, the republic offers a viable alternative: people of different qualities fit different exigencies. The diversity characteristic of civic regimes, which was so reviled by Machiavelli’s predecessors, proves to be an abiding advantage of republics over principalities.

This does not mean that Machiavelli’s confidence in the capacity of republican government to redress the political shortcomings of human character was unbridled. After all, he gives us no real indication of how republics manage to identify and authorize the leaders whose qualities are suited to the circumstances. It is one thing to observe that such variability has occurred within republics, quite another to demonstrate that this is a necessary or essential feature of the republican system. At best, then, Machiavelli offers us a kind of empirical generalization, the theoretical foundations of which he leaves unexplored. And the Discourses points out that republics have their own intrinsic limitation in regard to the flexibility of response needed to conquer fortune. For just as with individual human beings, it is difficult (if not impossible) to change their personal characteristics, so

institutions in republics do not change with the times … but change very slowly because it is more painful to change them since it is necessary to wait until the whole republic is in a state of upheaval; and for this it is not enough that one man alone should change his own procedure. (Discourses CW 453)

If the downfall of principalities is the fixed structure of human character, then the failing of republics is a devotion to the perpetuation of institutional arrangements whose time has passed. Whether it is any more plausible to hold out hope for the creation of more responsive republican institutions than to demand flexibility in the personal qualities of princes is not directly examined by the Discourses.

Machiavelli thus seems to adhere to a genuinely republican position. But how are we to square this with his statements in The Prince? It is tempting to dismiss The Prince as an inauthentic expression of Machiavelli’s “real” views and preferences, written over a short period in order to prove his political value to the returned Medici masters of Florence. (This is contrasted with the lengthy composition process of the Discourses.) Yet Machiavelli never repudiated The Prince, and indeed refers to it in the Discourses in a way that suggests he viewed the former as a companion to the latter. Although there has been much debate about whether Machiavelli was truly a friend of princes and tyrants or of republics, and hence whether we should dismiss one or another facet of his writing as ancillary or peripheral, the questions seems irresolvable. Mark Hulliung’s suggestion that “both” Machiavellis need to be lent equal weight thus enjoys a certain plausibility (Hulliung 1983).

9. Machiavelli’s Place in Western Thought

What is “modern” or “original” in Machiavelli’s thought? What is Machiavelli’s “place” in the history of Western ideas? The body of literature debating this question, especially in connection with The Prince and Discourses, has grown to truly staggering proportions. John Pocock (1975), for example, has traced the diffusion of Machiavelli’s republican thought throughout the so-called Atlantic world and, specifically, into the ideas that guided the framers of the American constitution. Paul Rahe (2008) argues for a similar set of influences, but with an intellectual substance and significance different from Pocock. For Pocock, Machiavelli’s republicanism is of a civic humanist variety whose roots are to be found in classical antiquity; for Rahe, Machiavelli’s republicanism is entirely novel and modern. The “neo-Roman” thinkers (most prominently, Pettit, Skinner and Viroli) appropriate Machiavelli as a source of their principle of “freedom as non-domination”, while he has also been put to work in the defense of democratic precepts and values (McCormick 2011). Likewise, cases have been made for Machiavelli’s political morality, his conception of the state, his religious views, and many other features of his work as the distinctive basis for the originality of his contribution.

Yet few firm conclusions have emerged within scholarship. (The unsettled state of play in current research on Machiavelli is well represented in Johnston et al. 2017.) One plausible explanation for the inability to resolve these issues of “modernity” and “originality” is that Machiavelli was in a sense trapped between innovation and tradition, between via antiqua and via moderna (to adopt the usage of Janet Coleman 1995), in a way that generated internal conceptual tensions within his thought as a whole and even within individual texts (Nederman 2009). This historical ambiguity permits scholars to make equally convincing cases for contradictory claims about his fundamental stance without appearing to commit egregious violence to his doctrines. This point differs from the accusation made by certain scholars that Machiavelli was fundamentally inconsistent (see Black 2022) or simply driven by “local” agendas (Celenza 2015). Rather, salient features of the distinctively Machiavellian approach to politics should be credited to an incongruity between historical circumstance and intellectual possibility. What makes Machiavelli a troubling yet stimulating thinker is that, in his attempt to draw different conclusions from the commonplace expectations of his audience, he still incorporated important features of precisely the conventions he was challenging. In spite of his repeated assertion of his own originality (for instance, Prince CW 10, 57–58), his careful attention to preexisting traditions meant that he was never fully able to escape his intellectual confines. Thus, Machiavelli ought not really to be classified as either purely an “ancient” or a “modern”, but instead deserves to be located in the interstices between the two (a point recently underscored by Pedullà 2023, for whom “Machiavelli resembles the mythical Janus, the Roman god of openings and ending …” [xi]).


Primary Sources in Italian

  • Machiavelli, Opere, Corrado Vivanti (ed.), 3 volumes, Turin: Einaudi-Gallimard, 1997.

Primary Sources in English Translation

  • [CW] Machiavelli: The Chief Works and Others, Alan H. Gilbert (ed. and trans.), 3 volumes, continuous pagination, Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1965.
    • The Prince (in Volume 1, pp. 10–96)
    • Discourses on the First Decade of Titus Livius (in Volume 1, pp. 175–532)
    • The Art of War (in Volume 2, pp. 561–726)
  • [MP] The Prince, Quentin Skinner and Russell Price (eds.), (Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • [MF] Machiavelli and His Friends: Their Personal Correspondence, James B. Atkinson and David Sices (eds.), Dekalb, IL: Northern Illinois University Press, 1996.

Secondary Literature

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  • Bogiaris, Guillaume, 2021, Machiavelli’s Platonic Problems: Neoplatonism, Eros, Mythmaking, and Philosophy in Machiavellian Thought, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Black, Robert, 2022, Machiavelli: From Radical to Reactionary, London: Reaktion Books.
  • Briggs, Charles F. and Cary J. Nederman, 2022, “Mirrors of Princes in the Christian Occident (12th-15th Century)”, in A Companion to the “Mirrors of Princes” Literature, Noëlle-Laetitia Perret and Stéphane Péquignot (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 160–196.
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  • Nederman, Cary J. and Guillaume Bogiaris, 2018, “Niccolò Machiavelli”, in The History of Evil in the Early Modern Age: 1450–1700 CE, Daniel M. Robinson, Chad Meister, and Charles Taliaferro (eds.), (The History of Evil, 3), London: Routledge, 53–68.
  • Nederman, Cary J. and Nellie Lahoud, 2023, “’This is the Way I Pray’: Precatory Language in the Writings of Niccolò Machiavelli”, Intellectual History Review 15(1): 161–182.
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  • Pocock, John, 1975, The Machiavellian Moment: Florentine Political Thought and the Atlantic Republican Tradition, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
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  • –––, 2014, Redeeming the Prince: The Meaning of Machiavelli’s Masterpiece, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
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