Analytical Marxism

First published Mon Sep 5, 2022

Analytical Marxism is a predominantly Anglophone variety of Marxism that emerged in the late 1970s, and whose leading proponents are located in philosophy and social science departments in US and European universities. It can be distinguished from certain classical forms of Marxism by its openness to analytical methods, its critical attitude to certain substantive Marxist claims, its acknowledgement of its own normative commitments, and its assertion of the need for socialist design.

1. Analytical Marxism

1.1 Components

The arrival of analytical Marxism is often dated by the appearance, in 1978, of Karl Marx’s Theory of History. A Defence by G.A. Cohen (1941–2009). This particular label seems to have been coined by Jon Elster (1940–), and first appears in print as the title of a collection published in 1986 and edited by John Roemer (1945–). Those three figures—Cohen, Elster, and Roemer—are plausibly seen as the founders of analytical Marxism as a self-conscious intellectual current.

The label “analytical Marxism” requires some unpacking. Its component terms obviously get used in a wide variety of ways, and the combination looks an unnatural one to some.

Analytical Marxism often describes itself as the self-conscious product of Marxist and non-Marxist traditions, and the “analytical” modifier is provided by the latter. “Non-Marxist” is intended as a neutral descriptive term. It is not, for instance, equivalent to the pejorative use of “un-Marxist” by what—equally pejoratively—might be called “true believers”.

This dual inheritance takes a very particular form. Analytical Marxism is not a miscellaneous assembly of Marxist and non-Marxist elements, but rather embodies a distinctive division of labour between these two.

1.2 Structure

The division of labour internal to analytical Marxism runs between, on the one hand, its (non-Marxist) analytical methods (the plural is important), and, on the other, its (Marxist) substantive concerns and normative commitments.

Perhaps the only methodological commitment that analytical Marxists share is a negative one. They deny that there exists a distinctive and valuable Marxist method, one which is both useful and exclusive to Marxism (unavailable to non-Marxists). Analytical Marxists adopt non-Marxist mainstream methods whenever and wherever appropriate, and they maintain that, to the extent that, historically speaking, Marxism rejected a range of analytical methods—on the grounds of their putatively non-Marxist (“undialectical” or “individualistic”) character—this was to the detriment of Marxism’s engagement with its own substantive and normative concerns (G. Cohen 2000b: xviii).

The positive methodological commitments of analytical Marxism vary significantly, and some generalisations—about aspirations to precision, or rigour in argumentation, for instance—are not especially illuminating. That said, characteristic, if not constitutive, preferences, organised by discipline (and associated with Cohen, Elster, and Roemer, respectively) would include: in Philosophy, “those standards of clarity and rigour” associated with the techniques of logical and linguistic analysis that predominated in the Anglophone philosophical world in the twentieth century (G. Cohen 1978: ix); in Politics, political science treatments of action, choice, and strategy, and especially those which utilise decision theory or rational choice theory; and, in Economics, the major contributions of neoclassical economics, especially the mathematical modelling of general equilibrium and cooperative game theory (Roemer 1982). Whether these various methods have much in common is not certain. Erik Olin Wright suggests that they share: a commitment to conventional scientific norms; an emphasis on the importance of systematic conceptualisation; a concern with fine-grained specification of theoretical arguments; and a willingness to take the relationship between social processes and the intentional actions of individuals seriously (1994: 181–191).

The substantive concerns of analytical Marxism are broadly shared with classical forms of Marxism. They consequently range widely, but certainly include an interest in: historical explanation, class structure, and exploitation. What is potentially distinctive here is the analytical Marxist treatment of those, and other, classical Marxist topics.

The normative commitments of analytical Marxism are also broadly shared with classical forms of Marxism. The status and role of normative commitments in Marxist theory are much argued about, but it seems certain that—whatever their preferred self-descriptions—Marxists do have characteristic normative commitments. What is potentially distinctive here is that analytical Marxists acknowledge this, and see a need for further reflection on the relevant values and commitments. Analytical Marxists typically embrace values associated with socialism, such as equality and community, and endorse normative claims such as that existing capitalism is flawed, and that some non-capitalist alternative would be preferable.

More generally, this preliminary division of Marxism into elements—some of which can be rejected and others improved upon—reveals a further characteristic feature of the understanding and approach of analytical Marxism. In their various critical reflections on what is living, and what is dead, in classical Marxism (see, for instance, Elster 1985), analytical Marxists typically resist treating Marxism as a theoretical entity so systematic that it can only be swallowed, or rejected, as a whole.

1.3 Bullshit

In trying to characterise an intellectual current, it can help to identify those it is opposed to, or consciously contrasts itself with.

Cohen, Elster, and Roemer, all participated in an annual workshop usually known as the September Group. That Group initially also referred to itself as the “Non-Bullshit Marxism Group”. The label is intended both to be humorous—there was even a faux heraldic crest complete with cod Latin tag “Marxismus sine stercore tauri [Marxism without the shit of the bull]” (G. Cohen 2013: 94)—and to convey some truth. It is also an aggressive characterisation, in that it implies that some kinds of Marxism are of the bullshit variety.

The best-known philosophical discussion of bullshit is, of course, that of Harry Frankfurt (2005). Cohen extended Frankfurt’s pioneering analysis to a variety of bullshit neglected in the latter’s original essay. A variety which: naturally inhabits the academy and not ordinary life; consists of the output (the bullshit) not the process (the bullshitting); is related to the (OED) dictionary definition of bullshit as “nonsense” or “rubbish”; and which further specifies the relevant nonsense as being by nature unclarifiable (G. Cohen 2013: 107 fn.27). It is the last of these characteristics—the “unclarifiable unclarity”—which appears central to this variety of bullshit, and which is purportedly celebrated by some of its producers and consumers.

Cohen goes on to affirm and defend the historical and empirical claim that “bullshit Marxism” flourishes in French intellectual culture. (He had judged this second part of his discussion as “too speculative”, and it was only published posthumously [G. Cohen 2013: viii].) In the 1960s, he read a great deal of French Marxism, especially work by Louis Althusser and his followers. At the time, Cohen found much of that material hard to understand, but located the blame for those difficulties entirely within himself. Moreover, whenever he finally managed to extract a reasonable idea from this Althusserian literature, he was inclined—precisely because of that effort and investment—to consider it more important and interesting than it actually was. This psychological mechanism—“a blend, perhaps” of “adaptive preference formation” and “cognitive dissonance reduction”—may be widespread (2013: 95). Despite this youthful attraction, Cohen did not succumb to Althusserianism, because, as he puts it:

I came to see that its reiterated affirmation of the value of conceptual rigour was not matched by conceptual rigour in its intellectual practices. (2013: 95)

And Cohen explicitly identifies this youthful “misguided Althusserian dalliance” as lying behind his own subsequent and fierce intolerance of bullshit (2013: 95).

The same phenomenon—the Althusserian promise of theoretical rigour, and the purported failure to deliver it in practice—may also have found biographical expression in Elster’s early graduate career. Not feeling at home with the Althusserian Marxists at the Ecole Normale Supérieure, Elster ended up writing his dissertation under Raymond Aron.

In a distinct but related account, Erik Olin Wright characterises “full-blown” bullshit Marxism as beset by three intellectual “sins”. First, “obfuscation”, understood as offering arguments and analyses which sound profound, but which are resistant to clarification. The objection here is not to the use of technical, or quasi-technical, vocabulary as such, but rather to its use to obscure. Second, “intellectual dishonesty”, understood as the refusal variously: to clarify arguments in ways that are open to challenge; to acknowledge gaps in one’s understanding or knowledge; or to concede that there exist reasonable grounds for disagreement. This can take the form of what might be characterised as sincere dogmatism, but more often involves something closer to “bad faith”, in which authors repress their genuine doubts and qualifications when presenting their own views in public. The third is an “ideological style of argumentation” in which “a correct understanding of a subject” is conflated with “Marx’s understanding of that subject”; that Marx endorsed such and such a claim being treated as a conclusive argument in its favour (Kirby unpublished: 24–25 in Other Internet Resources). Wright’s account of bullshit is more expansive than Cohen’s—not least, in venturing into the character of the bullshitter—but the idea of “obfuscation” looks to be a close relative of “unclarifiable unclarity”.

Note that the distinction between bullshit Marxism and non-bullshit Marxism is not an exhaustive one; that is, there are varieties of Marxism which are neither analytical nor bullshit. However, Cohen does provocatively suggest that, once analytical Marxism has a clear presence in the world, what might be called “pre-analytical Marxism” is no longer a stable outcome—it must tend to “either become analytical or become bullshit” as the case may be (G. Cohen 2000b: xxvi).

1.4 Further Disambiguation

Analytical Marxism, so understood, is not to be confused with adjacent intellectual movements that have shared the same, or a closely related, label, and with which they may have some affinity. Two earlier and non-Anglophone examples might be noted here.

First, a Japanese school of Marxist economics, also known as “analytical Marxism”, developed in the 1930s and was associated with the work of Shibata Kei and others based at Kyoto University. Shibata pioneered the critical use of tools of modern neoclassical economics to the problems of Marxist economics; in particular, contributing to a mathematical theorem which maintains that viable innovations in production methods will only increase or maintain the equilibrium rate of profit (Howard & King 1992; Negishi 2004; Rieu 2009).

Second, is a Polish school of “analytical-linguistic Marxism”, associated with the work of Adam Schaff and Władysław Krajewski in the 1960s. It is said to have resulted from a “collision” between Marxism and the Polish tradition of analytic philosophy (Skolimowski 1967), and involved, in particular, attempts to incorporate analytical tools into Marxist treatments of semantics and epistemology (Woźniak 2022).

These, and other, adjacent movements are not discussed further in this entry.

2. History

2.1 Origins

This is not the place for a thorough historical account of analytical Marxism. However, it might be helpful to say something about its origins and relation to the annual workshop of the September Group.

Analytical Marxism is sometimes conflated with participation in the September Group. This is both understandable and unfortunate. It is understandable because of the close overlap between the two; many of the best-known analytical Marxists (including the founding trio) were participants in the Group. And it is unfortunate because the two entities are distinct; their fates may often have overlapped but they are not synonymous.

First, analytical Marxism existed prior to, and independently of, the September Group. Each of the three founding figures had put “analytic methods” and Marxism together in their own work before they met the other two (see G. Cohen 1978, Elster 1978, and Roemer 1977), and before the formation of the Group.

(Biographically speaking—in understanding their positive response to analytical methods—it may also be significant that those three founding figures learnt their Marxism independently of, and prior to, their exposure to the analytical methods of their respective academic disciplines. Thus Cohen and Roemer were independently raised in North America by pro-Soviet parents, whilst Elster came from “an intellectual left-wing family” associated with the Norwegian Labour Party (G. Cohen 2000b: xx; Roemer 2019b [Other Internet Resources]; and Elster 2018: 201).)

Second, much analytical Marxist work is by individuals who are not participants in the September Group. A list of some of these, drawn from assorted secondary literature, might include: Alan Carling, Norman Geras, Andrew Levine, Daniel Little, Richard Miller, Charles W. Mills, Richard Norman, Jeffrey Reiman, Debra Satz, David Schweickart, William Shaw, Tommie Shelby, Elliot Sober, Ian Steedman, Nicholas Vrousalis, Robert Paul Wolff, and Allen Wood. All of those have been characterised as producing work, at some point, in the analytical Marxist mode, albeit that the list includes individuals who would not identify themselves as analytical Marxists, and others who have themselves criticised narrower versions of the tradition, such as rational choice Marxism (Wolff 1990)).

Some will also think the relevant conflation mistaken because the September Group is a diverse grouping of analytical Marxists and fellow travellers. “Fellow travellers” is intended here, non-pejoratively, to refer to individuals sympathetic to, and intellectually cooperating with, but not themselves identifying, either as analytical Marxists, or, indeed, as Marxists of any stripe. It might appear counterintuitive to characterise these fellow travellers as analytical Marxists, but the present entry operates on the basis of an expansive notion of analytical Marxism which includes all those working in the relevant mode—both “fellow travellers” in the September Group, and non-participants in the September Group—and attaches no special weight to self-identification.

2.2 September Group

Despite those caveats, the September Group did provide an institutional focus and momentum that was crucial to the early evolution of analytical Marxism.

The “prehistory” of the September Group centred on two London meetings of Marxist and Marxistant scholars working on exploitation—convened at the initiative of Elster, and with the support of Cohen—in September 1979 and 1980. It was then decided to meet annually but no longer limit the discussion to exploitation. Consequently, the third meeting might be identified as the point at which the September Group had properly formed. It was attended by “the most dedicated” of those who had attended the first two meetings, plus “one or two” new invitees (G. Cohen 2000b: xix).

Between 1981 and 2002, membership of the Group was “remarkably stable” (G. Cohen 2000b: xix). These annual early meetings—usually, but not always, held in London—are remembered as intense and rewarding occasions, at which half of the group would pre-circulate papers, which were then introduced and commented on by someone other than the author (Wright 2005a, 343–344).

In 2000 the Group included (with then current academic affiliations in parenthesis): the economist Pranab Bardhan (Berkeley); the economist Samuel Bowles (Amherst); the historian Robert Brenner (Los Angeles); the political philosopher G.A. Cohen (Oxford); the political philosopher Joshua Cohen (Cambridge, Mass.); the political philosopher Philippe van Parijs (Louvain-la Neuve); the economist John Roemer (Yale); the political philosopher Hillel Steiner (Manchester); the political philosopher Robert Jan van der Veen (Amsterdam); the social scientist Erik Wright (Madison). Only two of that list had not been participants in 1982: Bowles had joined in 1987 and Joshua Cohen in 1996 (G. Cohen 2000b: xix).

The academic location of analytical Marxism is often noted, and sometimes linked with its purported distance from practical, real world, concerns. One critic refers to “the donnish remoteness of the whole project” (Roberts 1996: 219), and another maintains that its “standards of judgement” and “sense of proportion” are “derived not from the political arena but from the Senior Common Room” (E. Wood 1989: 88). The gender composition of the September Group is also sometimes raised as a concern, and its early practices would certainly appear to have reproduced, rather than challenged, the contemporary marginalisation of women in the relevant academic disciplines (Wright 2005a: 344).

There is also critical interest in the ideological composition of the Group. Descriptions of the Group as involving “a set of Marxists, or semi-Marxists” (G. Cohen 2013: 95), and as composed of scholars of “Marxist or quasi-Marxist stripe” (G. Cohen 2000b: xix), might be thought not to capture, either its early diversity, or the direction of its subsequent evolution. Wright characterises the politics of participants as ranging:

from fairly traditional commitments to revolutionary democratic socialism to the Greens to what might be termed left-wing libertarianism. (1994: 181)

Amongst proponents of the latter, Steiner characterises his own views as “[b]asically left-wing, though in a sense which has been largely unfashionable for most of this century” (Ricciardi 1997: 38), whilst Van Parijs describes himself as a person emphatically of the left, but as someone who has “never defined myself as a Marxist”, adding that he had always felt “extremely comfortable” within the September Group precisely “because it included fellow travellers and not just analytical Marxists” (1997: 17). At one point, the possibility of “political-ideological criteria for “membership” in the annual meeting” was discussed, but the Group agreed that what really mattered was not a commitment to a particular set of political positions, but rather “the possibility of constructive dialogue among the participants” (Wright 1994: 181 fn4).

The biggest internal disruption in the Group’s early history consisted in the dramatic departure, in 1993, of Elster (the original convener) and the political scientist Adam Przeworski (who had joined in the second year). Its causes remain uncertain. The “leavers” expressed criticisms of the evolving intellectual character of the group, and Przeworski suggested that insofar as its original purpose was the critical evaluation of Marxism, that task had been completed, and that “[w]e ultimately found that not much of Marxism is left and there really wasn’t much more to learn” (2007: 490). Indeed, Elster would subsequently characterise analytical Marxism as a rare case of “intellectual autophagy”, which had succeeded in revealing that “non-bullshit Marxism” was largely “an empty set” (2011: 163). Marx’s only remaining contribution of value was now said to concern, not his substantive views, but “his normative conception of the good life as one of active and joint self-realization” (2011: 163). In contrast, some “remainers” viewed these departures as reflecting external factors, especially the complex impact of the demise of the Soviet Union on a certain generation of leftists. “Complex”, not least, in that its demise was seen as involving both the removal of a hideous regime and the loss of a non-capitalist space (G. Cohen 2009b: 352).

Those contemporary tendencies—the perceived waning of both the value of Marxist ideas, and the availability of non-capitalist alternatives—perhaps impacted more widely on the dynamism and focus of the Group. In 2000 participants debated whether to continue. Some thought the decision to carry on (meeting biannually) was motivated as much by fellowship as strictly intellectual pay-offs (Wright 2005a: 345). Others affirmed the continuing intellectual benefits of a group of “people from different academic disciplines who have a radical orientation and who can fertilize each other’s thoughts” (G. Cohen 2009b: 352).

The September Group is now widely seen to have evolved away from a primarily Marxist orientation and towards other concerns. Wright suggested that whilst the group still shared an egalitarian approach to social justice:

the specific preoccupation with Marxism as a source of ideas and debates for advancing that normative agenda was no longer so important. (2005a: 345)

That tendential evolution was reflected in, and perhaps amplified by, the arrival of new participants (with then current academic affiliations in parenthesis), including the political scientist Stathis Kalyvas (Yale) and the philosopher Seana Shiffrin (UCLA). Even those who identified as Marxists were less likely to think of Marxism as “a comprehensive theoretical paradigm capable of constituting a general theory of history and society” (Wright 2005a: 342). The simple passage of time also left its mark on the composition and character of the Group (G. A. Cohen died in 2009, and Wright in 2019). This evolution remains tendential, in that there may be exceptions, perhaps including Brenner’s work on the transition from feudalism to capitalism, and on the nature of contemporary capitalism (1993, and 2002). However, Roemer has recently confirmed that, although the Group continues to meet, “most of us no longer identify as Marxists” (Roemer 2019b in Other Internet Resources). That “most” appears to include Roemer himself:

I tend not to call myself a Marxist anymore because I do not credit many of the ideas that Marx believed were at the center of his view: the labour theory of value, the falling rate of profit, and the claim that dialectical materialism is a special kind of logic. (Roemer 2020b: 135)

Of course, it is not certain that Roemer had previously subscribed to those particular Marxist ideas either (see 1981), but the changing self-identification says something nonetheless.

Whilst the September Group provided an institutional focus and momentum that was crucial to the early evolution of analytical Marxism, neither the past, nor the future, of these two entities is identical.

3. Form

3.1. Methods

In considering the non-Marxist methods adopted by analytical Marxists, it is important to emphasise the plural. The variety of methods and approaches that analytical Marxists have adopted is striking. Nor is this merely a question of the disciplinary divides mentioned above (between Philosophy, Politics, and Economics). Once we move beyond generalisations about clarity and precision, there is no clear consensus within analytical Marxism about the merits of particular “analytical” methods and approaches.

Two examples of methodological disagreement within analytical Marxism are sketched here.

3.2. Methodological Individualism

The enthusiasm of many analytical Marxists—including Elster, Przeworski, and Roemer—for the doctrine of methodological individualism is widely known. Perhaps as a result, it is sometimes thought that all analytical Marxists are committed to methodological individualism, and that this doctrine forms a fault line between analytical and other forms of Marxism. Both of these claims look questionable.

The proper characterisation of “methodological individualism” is contested (see entry on methodological individualism). It is understood here as a methodological position which maintains that all macro-level social phenomena—political states, economic classes, social processes, group norms, and so on—are in principle reducible to micro-level explanation involving only individuals and their properties (Elster 1985: 5).

So understood, methodological individualism may have fewer implications than sometimes thought. For instance, there is no necessary connection with rational choice explanations (see Wolff 1990). One might think of the two theories as playing different roles: the first arguing for explanations at the level of individuals; and the second adopting a particular model of rational action at that level (Wright, Levine, & Sober 1992: 126). Similarly, there is no necessary connection between methodological individualism and what is sometimes called “atomism”; namely, the claim that only non-relational entities are explanatory (Wright, Levine, & Sober 1992: 110). Methodological individualists can allow that the individual characteristics considered explanatory include inherently relational properties (being an “employer”, for example).

Even so, methodological individualism remains a demanding doctrine. In particular, its proponents insist on the indispensability of micro-level explanations, and the desirability of dispensing with “holist” accounts. Elster, for one, characterises it as “a form of reductionism”, recommending the move from the aggregate to the less aggregate level of phenomena (1985: 5).

Methodological individualism also looks to have an historically uneasy, if not downright antagonistic, relation with Marxism. First, many of the most enthusiastic proponents of the former were fierce critics of the latter (including Friedrich von Hayek and Karl Popper). Second, if pre-analytical Marxists had expressed a view about methodological individualism, then it would probably have been to reject it (perhaps encouraged by Marx’s emphasis on the importance of social totalities, and his scepticism about explanations based on “abstract individuals”). Third, analytical Marxists have often raised methodological individualist concerns about Marx’s own attempts at social explanation; suggesting, for instance, that Marx substituted “wishful thinking” for “social analysis” in his account of the dynamics of communist revolution (Elster 1988: 225).

However, analytical Marxists have also held that, whilst Marx often (implicitly) denied methodological individualism, he was also “at least intermittently” committed to it. That more positive attitude is said to be evident, for instance, in some of his anti-teleological remarks in the German Ideology manuscripts (Elster 1985: 109). At a time when Elster insisted that “most of the views” that he himself held to be “true and important” could be traced back to Marx, he explicitly included methodological views in that category, alongside substantive views and values (1985: 531).

Other analytical Marxists—including Wright, Levine, and Sober—have sought to resist the reductive ambitions of methodological individualism, without embracing the position they call “radical holism” (which seeks to eliminate the individual level of analysis). Broadly speaking, the central issue here—between Elster on the one hand, and Wright, Levine, and Sober on the other—is whether the only good social explanations are what J.W.N. Watkins calls “rock-bottom” explanations in terms of individual actions, or whether “half-way” explanations might not also be meaningful and useful (Watkins 1957: 106). For the methodological individualist, to explain a social phenomenon just is to provide an account of the individual level mechanism that produces it. In the absence of such an account, the phenomenon remains unexplained. However, Wright, Levine, and Sober embrace a position they call “anti-reductionism”, which denies that all “macro-level” social explanations are in principle reducible to “micro-level” accounts in terms of individuals and their properties (1992: 115).

This line of response draws on a distinction between two distinct threads in the methodological individualist position: its ontological claim that all macro-level social entities are constituted by individuals; and its explanatory claim that all macro-level social entities are ultimately explicable in terms of facts about individuals. Accepting the truth of the former does not require one to endorse the distinctive “reductive” ambitions of the latter. And there might be good reasons for resisting the latter, including: the possibility of regularities at the macro-level which are not derivable from regularities at the micro-level; and (more pragmatically) in the existence of cases where, although it might in principle be possible to perform the derivation, the benefits of doing so might be extremely limited. In both cases, there are good reasons to preserve the “explanatory autonomy” of the social (Little 1991: 183–195).

One kind of case which resists reduction is where there is no single relation between the social phenomenon and individual properties, because the relevant macro-level phenomenon can be realised in multiple ways at the micro-level. Examples might include the idea of “fittingness” in evolutionary biology, or of “economic survival” (of capitalist firms) in economics (Wright, Levine, & Sober 1992: 119). In such circumstances, no particular micro-level account can be identified as explaining the macro-level phenomenon, because the latter can be realised in multiple combinations of the former. The provision of a micro-level account might still be desirable—for instance, identifying a possible micro-foundation might improve our confidence in the macro-level explanation—but here it offers no support for a general project of reduction (1992: 122). In short, Wright, Levine, and Sober recognise that facts about social phenomenon might supervene on facts about individuals and their interaction, without it being the case that all social phenomenon can be explained in individualistic terms alone. The question of how many social phenomenon are irreducible to individual level properties looks to be an open empirical matter (List & Spiekermann 2013).

There are complex issues in the philosophy of social science raised here, but—irrespective of one’s considered judgement about the balance of argument—these disagreements confirm that a commitment to analytical methods does not require endorsement of methodological individualism. Wright, Levine, and Sober, for example, have all produced work within the analytical Marxist tradition and yet reject elements of this particular methodological doctrine.

3.3. Functional Explanation

The methodological diversity of analytical Marxism is also apparent in disagreements about the legitimacy of functional explanation in the social sciences. The initial context of this disagreement is provided by Cohen’s Karl Marx’s Theory of History. A Defence (1978).

Cohen and Elster had independently come to see that Marx, in his theory of history, was, in some sense, committed to functional explanation. They differ in that, whereas Elster deplores that commitment and recommends an alternative game theoretic account, Cohen defends this role for functional explanation and expresses scepticism about the suitability of Elster’s alternative (G. Cohen 2014: 284). (Note that only some elements of their debate are covered here.)

Cohen identifies a number of explanatory connections between the “ensembles” that appear in Marx’s “1859 Preface”: the productive forces; the relations of production; and the superstructure. Consider an example involving the first two of those ensembles. The productive forces are those facilities and devices—means of production (including tools, raw materials, and premisses) and labour power (including strength, skill, and technical knowledge)—used to productive effect in the process of production. They are said, on this account, to grow in power over the course of human history. And the relations of production—the sum total of which are said to constitute the economic structure (or “base”) of a given society—are the relations of power that people enjoy, or lack, over those forces, over means of production and labour power (G. Cohen 1988: 4).

In the context of the relationship between those growing forces and the relations of production (the economic structure), Marx propounds two claims which might look to be in tension with each other. First, that the productive forces have explanatory primacy over the relations; that is, that the level of development of the productive forces explains the nature of the economic structure. And second, that the economic structure has considerable effect on the forces; not least, that the economic structure controls (facilitates or frustrates) the development of the productive forces. It is this combination of claims which confirms that the “first primacy thesis”—that “the level of development of the productive forces in a society explains the nature of its economic structure” (G. Cohen 2014: 289)—is best understood as functional in form.

A functional explanation is one in which something that has an effect, is explained in terms of its effect. Cohen often uses an example from evolutionary biology to illustrate this; namely, that “birds have hollow bones because hollow bones facilitate flight”. Here, something (birds having hollow bones) which has a certain effect (facilitating flight) is explained by the fact that it has that effect (“birds have hollow bones because hollow bones facilitate flight”; G. Cohen 1988: 8). In short, where e is a cause and f is its effect, functional explanations maintain that: e occurred because it would cause f. Or, more properly, functional explanations maintain that: e occurred because the situation was such that an event like e would cause an event like f (G. Cohen 1988: 8).

Functional explanation, so understood, renders these two claims—namely, that the relations of production are explained by the forces of production, and that the relations of production control the development of the forces of production—consistent. For instance, where relations of production endure (that is, exist in a stable fashion), they do so because they promote the development of the productive forces. And, where relations of production are revolutionised (that is, where old relations are abandoned for new ones), old relations cease to exist because they no longer favour the forces, and the new relations come into being (and/or come to preponderate) because they do favour the forces. On this reading, the impact of the relations on the forces is no embarrassment to Marx’s theory of history because of the functional manner in which it explains economic structures in terms of productive forces. Economic structures rise and fall according to whether they sustain or frustrate the development of the productive forces. To be clear, the suggestion is not, strictly speaking, that Marx propounds functional explanations, but rather that the claims which he does propound put severe constraints on the kind of explanation that is required, and that functional explanation is the most plausible candidate meeting those constraints.

Elster takes issue with Cohen’s twofold claim that, historical materialism “cannot shed its commitment to functional explanation”, and that “there is nothing inherently suspect in it” (G. Cohen 2014: 294). Elster maintains that the conditions that justify the use of functional explanation in evolutionary biology do not obtain in social theory, and especially not in the context of historical materialism.

Elster insists that functional explanations of macro-phenomena are methodologically acceptable only where it is possible to indicate, at least schematically, the mechanisms at the level of individual behaviour through which the aggregate behaviour emerges. That is, macro-explanations require what he calls “microfoundations” at the level of the processes of individual choice and action. Indeed, it seems that “holist” social explanations are not really considered explanations at all. They involve—in this figuratively mechanistic account—a black box whose internal workings are hidden, when to explain just:

is to provide a mechanism, to open up the black box and show the nuts and bolts, the cogs and wheels, the desires and beliefs that generate the aggregate outcomes. (Elster 1985: 5)

In this context, Elster recommends that Marxism abandon (insufficiently supported) functional explanation and utilise game theoretic explanation in its place.

In response, Cohen makes two broad points.

First, Cohen maintains that, whilst providing “microfoundations”—what he prefers to call “elaborations” of a functional mechanism—would improve a functional explanation, their absence does not necessarily invalidate it. The nineteenth-century Darwinian claim that birds have hollow bones because hollow bones facilitate flight, for example, was already an “excellent” explanation, which was subsequently rendered “even better” through twentieth-century developments in the science of genetics (G. Cohen 1988: 12). Marx’s theory of history might be figuratively located at an analogous position to that not-yet-fully-elaborated Darwinian stage.

Second, Cohen judges the proposal to replace functional explanation with game theoretic accounts as an unpromising one. Whilst game theory can provide imaginative accounts of aspects of class struggle—of alliances and revolution, for instance—class struggle is not the most basic of the phenomena that historical materialism is trying to explain. For Marxists, “class struggle has primary political significance, but the political dimension of society is not itself primary” (G. Cohen 1988: 17). Game theory might help explain the immediate outcome of various political struggles, but whether those outcomes stick, or not, is explained by the material conditions in which they take place.

Again, there are complex issues in the philosophy of social science raised here, but—irrespective of one’s considered judgement about the balance of argument—this dispute confirms that analytical Marxism is home to disagreement and debate about particular methods.

3.4. Dialectic

Commentators sometimes claim that analytical Marxism holds an unremittingly negative view of “dialectic”, with one suggesting that:

a good test to follow if in doubt whether a particular writer supports the analytic school is to see whether he mentions dialectics with favour. If he does, he must immediately be crossed off the list. Even to cite the word at all counts against membership in the analytic school. (Gordon 1990: 22–3.)

Both that claim and this test are rejected here. (This section draws on Leopold 2008.)

Analytical Marxists share the negative methodological view that there is no distinctive Marxist method, no valuable tools and approaches which are available only to Marxists. That view is perhaps most likely to be resisted by “Hegelian Marxists” who identify the Marxist method with some variety of dialectic. However, it does not follow that analytical Marxists have to reject all talk of dialectic. (There is, of course, also a potential irony in the hostility of Hegelian Marxists to the embrace of non-Marxist methods by analytical Marxists, given that their own preferred method presumably owes much to its eponymous “bourgeois” source.)

Many of the best-known analytical Marxists are proponents of what can be called modest conceptions of dialectic. Consider, for example, Elster’s account of three dialectical strands in Marx’s work, of which two are judged valuable (Elster 1978: chapters 3–5; Elster 1985: 37–48; and Elster 1986a: 34–39).

The first, and wholly unpromising, strand concerns dialectic as a method of presentation. In parts of the Grundrisse (1986–87 [1857–58]) and Capital (1996 [1867]), for instance, Marx appears to adopt a “quasi-deductive procedure”, presenting certain results of his economic analysis in a manner analogous to the developing categorical system of Hegel’s science of logic. Elster is deeply unsympathetic to this method of presentation, purporting to find, both the relevant passages, and their underlying motivation, scarcely intelligible (1985: 37). (For a more positive account, see Arthur 2004.)

The second, and modestly promising, strand concerns the “dialectical laws”, associated with Friedrich Engels, but also found in Marx’s own work. In Engels’ famous formulations, these “laws” include: the “negation of the negation”; the “transformation of quantity into quality”; and the “interpenetration of opposites”. Elster scales down the status and explanatory reach of Engels’ account, suggesting that, rather than indicating laws of nature, we think of these terms as describing “not infrequent patterns of change” sometimes found in nature, society, and consciousness (1985: 40). There is no suggestion that all developments, in those various contexts, follow such patterns, and their extent is treated as an open empirical question. However, with those, and other, cautions in place, Elster suggests that these imprecise but suggestive ideas can be illuminating.

For example, the “negation of the negation” describes the third step of a triadic development from a stage of “undifferentiated unity” (where some subject is undivided from some object), through a stage of “differentiated disunity” (where that subject is divided from the object in a manner which creates discord), to a stage of “differentiated unity” (where the distinction between subject and object remains but harmony between them is restored). Analytical Marxists are happy to allow that certain social and individual developments exhibit this dialectical pattern. Cohen, for instance, describes a historical development from pre-capitalist society, where collective structures and consciousness inhibit individualism (a stage of undifferentiated unity), through the divisions of capitalism, which stimulate an unbridled individualism and undermine community (a stage of differentiated disunity), to a communist future, which will preserve (aspects of) individuality in a context of regained community (a stage of differentiated unity). Note that society is said to undergo a dialectical transformation here simply by virtue of experiencing the relevant stages in turn. There is no suggestion of the development being a necessary one, of each stage having to generate the next (G. Cohen 1988: 185).

The third, and most promising, of the three dialectical strands is a theory of social contradictions. Elster sees Marx as a pioneer in the study of “real contradictions”; that is, situations in (psychological or social) reality which can only be described in terms of logical contradiction. The core idea here involves a contrast between the local and the global, between what is possible for a particular social agent and what is possible for all agents in that social position. This core idea is judged both clear (impervious to some standard “analytical” objections to dialectical talk) and fertile (operationalizable and capable of generating substantive social scientific results).

Elster outlines two variants of social contradiction: “counterfinality” and “suboptimality”. Only the former is discussed here. Broadly speaking, counterfinality refers to the discrepancy between individual intentions and actual results which obtains when each individual acts upon non-universalizable beliefs about the behaviour of others (see Van Parijs 1982, 592). In what Elster calls “condensed jargon”, counterfinality can be described as “the embodiment of the fallacy of composition” (1985: 44). Consider the following example of the contradictory character of capitalist behaviour. In response, say, to some exogenously induced fall in demand, each individual capitalist reduces their own workers’ wages in order to maintain profits. The aggregative result, contrary to that intention, is a further reduction of workers’ buying power (and thus a further reduction also of profits). Any capitalist might have succeeded were they the only one to act, but when they all act in this way they fail (Elster 1985: 46). These desires taken together are contradictory, in the sense that there is no possible world in which all capitalists can have that desire satisfied. Given certain structural contexts, those social contradictions can cause social change; for instance, in certain cases, generating collective action (perhaps including state intervention) designed to overcome or mitigate those contradictions.

There is no suggestion that only Marxists can identify or appreciate these two kinds of modest dialectic. For instance, there is an interesting parallel of “the negation of the negation” in Alexis de Tocqueville’s account of three “distinct and often successive” stages in the relation between an individual and religious belief (see Tocqueville 1835–40 [1994: 187]). And Elster (1978: 106) notes that the concept of counterfinality was developed by an intellectually highly diverse group of, both early proponents (Bossuet, Mandeville, Vico, Adam Smith, Hegel, and Marx), and more recent defenders (Oskar Morgenstern, Jean-Paul Sartre, Robert Nozick, and Trygve Haavelmo).

Finally, no support is offered here to those insisting on the existence of a radical gulf between “dialectical” and “analytical” reasoning. The explicit assumption is that dialectical talk can make analytic sense. Indeed, as Cohen remarks, in a slightly more aggressive formulation, the idea that belief in dialectic is a rival to analysis “thrives only in an atmosphere of unclear thought” (G. Cohen 2000b: xxiii).

These modest conceptions will, of course, be too modest for some, but they confirm that analytical Marxism does not reject the very idea of dialectic.

4. Content

4.1 Marxist Substance

It is the substantive concerns of analytical Marxism which—along with its normative commitments—are said to embody its Marxist heritage (by comparison with its adoption of non-Marxist methods).

This section outlines some aspects of analytical Marxist treatments of: historical explanation; class structure; and exploitation.

4.2 History

The present section sketches some aspects of Cohen’s account of historical materialism (1978), and of his subsequent reflections on the explanatory scope of that theory (1988: 155–179).

Marx is said to understand history as, fundamentally, the growth of human productive power, maintaining that forms of society, which are organised around economic structures, “rise and fall according as they enable and promote, or prevent and discourage, that growth” (G. Cohen 1988: 3). The canonical text for this interpretation being Marx’s “1859 Preface” to A Contribution to the Critique of Political Economy, which is treated not as one piece of evidence amongst many, but as the text providing the clearest theoretical statement of historical materialism.

Cohen presents Marx as committed to the following claims, amongst others:

  • First, the Development Thesis: which claims that the productive forces have an autonomous tendency to develop throughout history. The productive forces are those facilities and devices—means of production (including tools, raw materials, and premisses) and labour power (including strength, skill, and technical knowledge)—used to productive effect in the process of production. Growth here can be measured by the decreasing amount of labour it takes with given forces to produce what is necessary to satisfy the basic physical needs of the immediate producers.
  • Second, the First Primacy Thesis: which claims that the level of development of the productive forces in a given society explains the economic structure (the set of relations of production) that obtain in that society. The relations of production—the sum total of which are said to constitute the economic structure (or “base”) of a given society—are the relations of power that people enjoy, or lack, over the productive forces, over means of production and labour power (G. Cohen 1988: 4).
  • Third, the Second Primacy Thesis: which claims that the “base”, understood as the economic structure of a given society, explains the legal and political “superstructure” in that society.
  • Fourth, the claim that the kind of explanation involved in both of these two Primacy Theses is functional explanation (see section 3.3).

To put a little flesh on those abstract bones, consider the following elaboration of the First Primacy Thesis (Wright, Levine, & Sober 1992: 19). A given level of development of the productive forces is only compatible with a certain type (or with limited types) of economic structure. Since forces of production tend to develop over time (see the “Development Thesis”), the forces eventually reach a level where they are no longer compatible with the relations of production under which they had previously developed. When such incompatibilities arise, the relations are said to “fetter” the development of the forces of production (G. Cohen 1988: 109–123). This fettering leads to revolution, in which social actors (classes) with the capacity to bring new relations into effect emerge, and revolutionise the economic structure in ways that restores growth in the productive forces.

This model of growing levels of productive power, and their associated forms of society, is said to generate a four-stage periodisation of progressive epochs in human history (G. Cohen 1978: 197–201). In the first stage, the material position involves an absence of surplus, and the corresponding social form is a primitive classless society (productive power being too low to enable a class of non-producers to live off the labour of producers). In the second stage, the material position is a surplus large enough to support an exploiting class, but too small to sustain capitalist accumulation, and the corresponding social form is a pre-capitalist class society. In the third stage, the material surplus is moderately high—high enough to support capitalist accumulation—and the corresponding social form is capitalist class society. Capitalism subsequently generates a growing surplus such that it becomes itself unsustainable (for contested reasons), leading to a fourth and final stage, where, on the basis of a precondition of a massive surplus, a modern classless society emerges.

Such an abbreviated summary ignores many interesting complexities and changes in Cohen’s views, but hopefully give some sense of its character as a defence of a “traditional”, even “old-fashioned”, conception of historical materialism attaching explanatory primacy to the forces of production (G. Cohen 1978: x).

There is a huge critical literature on Cohen’s reading of Marx’s theory of history. A thorough survey is scarcely possible here, but most criticisms tend to cluster around three main kinds of concern.

First, there are criticisms based on Cohen’s treatment of what might be called textual issues. For example, there is some suspicion of what is seen as his over-reliance on the “1859 Preface” (critics sometimes utilising Printz 1969). Or, to give another example, there are appeals to the lack of fit between Cohen’s interpretation and some of the more concrete accounts of historical development found elsewhere in Marx’s own writings (Miller 1984: 188–195).

Second, there are criticisms pressing on coherence issues arising from Cohen’s reconstruction of Marx’s theory. For example, there is some scepticism about whether the “base” can be distinguished from the “superstructure” in the way that he requires (F. Cohen & Acton 1970; Lukes 1982). Or, to give another example, whether Cohen’s distinction between social and material properties is conceptually flawed in ways that undermine his claims about the primacy of the productive forces (Coram 1989).

Third, there are criticisms examining the empirical truth of this account of Marx’s theory. For example, there are doubts about whether the historical record of pre-capitalist societies—especially given cases such as the “long period” in Chinese history, or the “second serfdom” in Poland—offer support for the claim that there is little productive regression in history (J. Cohen 1982: 266–268). In addition, some historians are sceptical of whether, given pre-capitalist relations, economic actors have the relevant incentives to act in the ways—especially, in transforming property relations—that Cohen’s theory seems to require (Brenner 1985a, 1985b, and 1986). Or, to give a final empirical example, as part of a wider insistence that Cohen’s early work is flawed by its lack of gender awareness, Paula Casal argues that his four-stage periodisation of epochs (and associated producers) cannot survive serious reflection on the economic position of women (2020).

These, and many other, critical questions are not pursued further here. Instead, the remainder of the section considers the explanatory scope of historical materialism.

Cohen accepts that Marx’s theory makes some large and controversial claims, but comes to think that these may be less demanding than is often thought. Cohen distinguishes two interpretations of historical materialism. On an inclusive reading, the theory claims that material and economic developments explain the principal features of other, non-economic developments. However, on a restricted reading, the theory commits itself to explaining non-economic phenomena only when, if they weren’t so explained, they would seem to control material development. The theory, on this “restricted” reading, limits itself to explaining non-economic phenomena which possess “economic relevance” (G. Cohen 1988: 173). It seems likely that Marx and Engels—perhaps under the influence of Hegel’s philosophy of history—assumed an inclusive reading, but Cohen suggests that the restricted reading is consistent with the “1859 Preface”, and may offer a better fit with historical evidence.

An example can illuminate the difference between these two readings (G. Cohen 1988: 160–165). Assume that the following increasingly Weberian-looking claims are all true: first, that Protestantism took hold and persisted for non-economic reasons; second, that Protestantism had important consequences for European religious life; and, third, that Protestantism had important consequence for European economic life. Note that inclusive historical materialism is challenged by both the conjunction of the first two claims, and the third claim; whereas restricted historical materialism is challenged only by the addition of the third claim to the first two. Moreover, on Cohen’s functionalist account, the latter can meet that challenge:

if the features of Protestantism in virtue of which it had economic effects arose because of their tendency to have such effects. (1988: 176)

Cohen was subsequently persuaded (by Wright) that this distinction between restricted and inclusive historical materialism is better understood in the light of a “prior distinction” between Marxist theory of history and Marxist sociology (G. Cohen 1988: 176–177). Marxist theory of history is identified with the restricted variant, and the familiar Marxist claims that the latter refrained from affirming (about the economic explaining the principal features of non-economic life) are now allocated to Marxist sociology. Where Marxist theory of history is concerned with the issue of how social formations succeed one another, Marxist sociology is concerned with how the elements within a social formation are related. The latter, but not the former, insists that non-economic structures and modes of consciousness are, in their broad outlines, explained by material and economic factors. The two theories are often conflated, but they are sufficiently distinct that they require independent assessment (G. Cohen 1988: 178).

4.3 Class

The concept of class is central to the Marxist tradition. Of course, many non-Marxist thinkers—including Ricardo, Weber, Durkheim, and Bourdieu—also utilise some idea of class, but it is typically conceptualised differently, and allocated a less important role in their social theory. For Marxists, class is standardly defined in an “objective” manner, and designates the social position occupied by individuals within a network of relations of production. Indeed, an objective account is necessary if certain Marxist claims about the ways in which class conditions and shapes “consciousness, culture, or politics” are to be sustained (G. Cohen 1978: 73). And class, so understood, typically plays a crucial explanatory part in Marxist accounts of, variously: the character of, and development between, historical epochs; the institutional form, and behaviour, of the state; and many of the beliefs, and actions, of individual and collective agents.

Class is a recurring topic in analytical Marxist writings. Examples include: Wright’s account of the “middle class ”; Przeworski’s analysis of the class basis of social democracy (1985); Roemer’s discussion of the relationship between class position and exploitation status (1982); and Alan Carling’s game theoretic portrayal of relations between men and women as class relations (1991: 253–299). This section outlines some aspects of the first of those examples.

Wright has written at least five books on the subject, changed his views over time, and collaborated in extensive empirical work using modern sample survey methodology and multivariate statistical techniques across countries (Wright 1989). This section only touches on: the Marxist character of Wright’s view of class structure; his early response to the problem of “the middle class”; and his revised understanding of the relation between exploitation and class.

Wright identifies six “conceptual constraints” that diverse Marxist approaches to class—including his own—typically respect (1985: 26–37). First, that the class structure of a society is the “basic” determinant (1985: 28) of the limits of possible variation in class formations, class consciousness, and class struggle. Second, that class structures constitute the central organising principle of societies, shaping the possible variations of “the state, ethnic relations, gender relations, etc.”, and offering the best way of identifying historical epochs (1985: 31). Third, that the concept of class is a relational one, classes are defined within social relations, and especially by their relation to other classes (to be a feudal serf, for instance, is to stand in a certain relation to a feudal lord). Fourth, that the social relations which define classes are intrinsically antagonistic; that is, classes have conflicting interests, between which compromise or accommodation—but not harmony—is possible. Fifth, that the objective basis of those antagonistic relations is exploitation (Marxists do not, for instance, merely claim that lords are rich and serfs are poor, but insist rather that the former are rich because they appropriate a surplus produced by the latter). Sixth, and finally, that the fundamental basis of exploitation is located in the social organisation of production, notwithstanding disagreements about how to locate classes within relations of production (whether, for instance, ideology, property, control, or something else, are crucial). The last four of these constraints can be said to elaborate the structural properties of the Marxist concept of class.

Wright’s best-known early contribution to class analysis—his model of “contradictory class locations”—is preoccupied with theorising the class character of “the middle class” within a Marxist framework. The context here is the seeming tension between modern historical developments and the classical Marxist idea of capitalist society as increasingly composed of two hostile camps (capitalists and proletarians) with any third class (the “petit-bourgeoisie”) as “transitional” in nature (on its way to being squeezed out by the other two). That claim about a pervasive tendency towards class polarisation would appear to conflict with the huge growth of professional, managerial, technical, and bureaucratic positions, in both modern corporations and modern states (Wright 1985: 7–9). The resulting “problem of the middle class” raises issues, not only about the accuracy of received Marxist accounts of class structure, but also about the sociological plausibility of their associated accounts of class formation, class consciousness, and class struggle (since these newer groups do not obviously share the interests and attitudes of traditional proletarians).

Wright rejects Marxist responses which either deny the gap between the polarisation account and empirical reality, or assimilate these new social groups to the petit-bourgeoisie. Instead, his own early approach abandons the assumption that the class locations of individuals are mapped in a one-to-one relation to the actual class structure of capitalism. Rather than assuming that individuals are only ever capitalist, petit-bourgeois, or proletarian, Wright suggests that some occupy positions that have “a multiple class character; they may be in more than one class simultaneously” (1985: 43). Those individuals occupy “contradictory class locations”; or, more precisely, “contradictory locations within contradictory class relations”.

Wright’s earliest attempts to operationalise this increasingly differentiated account of the class structure of contemporary capitalism focuses on whether individuals are self-employed, and whether they supervise the labour of others. This resulted in a simplified typology which added “managers” to the three original Marxist classes (capitalists, petit-bourgeoisie, and proletariat). His subsequent work further differentiated these new social groups on the basis of the extent of individual control (full, partial, minimal, or none) over money capital, physical capital, and labour within production. The resulting contradictory class locations now included: managers (simultaneously bourgeois and proletarian); non-managerial technical/professional staff (simultaneously petty-bourgeois and proletarian); and small employers (simultaneously bourgeois and petty-bourgeois). By 1979, Wright had a schematic typology that added five contradictory class locations to the three original Marxist classes (Wright 1985: 48 figure 2.2).

After 1979, Wright’s account evolved significantly in response to criticisms, especially from Roemer. Wright now criticised his own earlier view for emphasising domination, and downplaying exploitation. Exploitation is understood here as diagnosing the ways in which income inequalities are generated by inequalities in rights and powers over productive resources; that is, the ways in which:

exploiters, by virtue of their exclusionary rights and powers over resources, are able to appropriate surplus generated by the efforts of the exploited. (Wright 2005b: 17)

This new account resulted in a typology in which ownership and non-ownership of means of production are complicated by effective control of “organisation assets” and “credential assets”, both of which can constitute a strategic basis for generating higher incomes. Some of the resulting class locations are occupied by individuals who are both exploited in one dimension (because they don’t own or control capital), and exploiters in another (because they can leverage their organisational and credential assets in the relevant ways). Wright’s new typology of class locations has twelve categories: three types of owner of means of production (differentiated by their amount of capital); and nine varieties of wage-earner (differentiated by organisation and credential assets). The latter group contains a wide range of class locations distinct from proletarians proper, including expert managers, expert non-managers, semi-credentialled supervisors, and more (Wright 1985: 88 table 3.3).

Critics have acknowledged Wright’s theoretical ingenuity, but sometimes identified a gradational neo-Weberian account of stratification as really doing the work here, only partially concealed behind Marxist rhetoric about exploitation (Mayer 1994: 137). Wright concedes the similarity of appearances here—in particular, the shared focus on the ways in which class determines “life chances”—but insists on the distinctiveness of the two theoretical frameworks. The Marxist character of his own account is said to rest on the central role of exploitation—and the distribution of the rights and powers of individuals over productive resources—in determining the distribution of income and economic activities (Wright 2005b: 16–19).

Finally, Wright also identifies possible continuities with his earlier views. The idea of the “middle classes” occupying “contradictory locations” is perhaps preserved in the idea of those individuals having interests that conflict with both capital and labour (Wright 1985: 87). The relevant groups are like workers in that they are excluded from ownership of the means of production, but they also have interests opposed to workers because of their effective control of organisational and credential assets.

4.4 Exploitation

Exploitation is a highly contested concept. This section is intended only to introduce some aspects of its treatment by analytical Marxism, and not to rule out alternative usages.

The basic concept of exploitation involves some agent benefitting from social interaction with another by taking advantage of that other, sometimes (interestingly) in ways that are both mutually beneficial and consensual (A. Wood 1995: 151). Of course, not all kinds of “taking advantage” are morally problematic. To give a standard example: there may be nothing wrong with a chess grandmaster exploiting a weakness in their opponent’s endgame. Consequently, we might want to avoid “moralised” definitions of “exploitation” which make it wrongful or unjust by definition. That said, cases of “wrongful exploitation” are of particular significance in the Marxist tradition, often being treated as providing a reason for seeking to replace capitalist economic arrangements with non-exploitative alternatives.

Marxist claims about exploitation are often said—by both Marxists and their critics—to depend on the labour theory of value. This is denied by Cohen who, in a well-known article, argues that the relation between the two, despite their long historical association, is one of mutual irrelevance (1988: 209). The labour theory of value is understood here as a theory of equilibrium price, whose central claim is that magnitude of value is determined by socially necessary labour time. Cohen suggests that those Marxists who have insisted on the labour theory as the basis of exploitation have confused the idea of producers creating value with the idea of producers creating that which has value (the product). This latter, somewhat simpler, idea is the real basis of the charge of exploitation. What matters for exploitation is not that capitalists appropriate value created by workers, but rather that they appropriate (part of) the value of what the worker produces.

In the place of arguments that make exploitation claims depend on the labour theory of value, Cohen endorses the “Plain Argument” (1988: 228):

  1. The labourer is the person who creates the product, that which has value.
  2. The capitalist appropriates some of the value of the product.
  3. The labourer receives less value than the value of what she creates,


  1. The capitalist appropriates some of the value of what the labourer creates.
  2. The labourer is exploited by the capitalist.

It is this Plain Argument which is said typically to motivate Marxists, whatever their official view of the labour theory of value.

Note that the claim that the capitalist appropriates part of the value of the worker’s product (step 4) is not (as it stands) a normative one. For that appropriation to constitute wrongful exploitation the normative dimensions of the step from 4 to 5 in the Plain Argument would need to be fleshed out. The present section outlines three candidate explanations of the relevant wrongfulness—involving the ideas of unfairness, instrumentalising vulnerability, and domination, respectively—which have found support within analytical Marxism.

The first, and best-known, analytical Marxist account maintains that wrongful exploitation rests on the capitalist benefitting from prior unfairness, in particular, benefitting from the injustice of property relations. (This account is associated with Roemer, amongst others, but note that many additional issues raised by the latter’s innovative work on exploitation—for instance, his account of socialist exploitation resting on unequal ownership of productive skills—are not discussed here (see Roemer 1982, 1986b, 1986c, 1988).)

Roemer develops a general theory of exploitation; “general”, not least, in aiming to capture both Marxist and neoclassical accounts within the same framework. He proposes that a group is exploited “if it has some conditionally feasible alternative under which its members would be better off” (1986c: 103). Formally this involves specifying a game played by coalitions of agents in an economy, and specifying payoffs if they withdraw.

We can say that capitalist exploitation obtains when capitalists are made better off by the existence of workers, but workers are made worse off by the existence of capitalists (Roemer 1996: 40). More precisely, capitalists exploit workers if and only if the following three conditions obtain. First, if workers were to withdraw from the society, endowed with their per capita share of society’s alienable property (including means of production) then workers would be better off (in terms of income and leisure) than they are at the present allocation. Second, if capitalists were to withdraw under the same conditions, then capitalists would be worse off (in terms of income and leisure) than they are at present (because some of their current share would go to workers). Third, if workers were to withdraw from society with their own endowments (not their per capita share), then capitalists would be worse off than at present (because they would no longer be able to benefit from the workers’ labour).

For Roemer, exploitation as such is not morally objectionable. In an adjacent context (1988: 129–130), he describes a two-person economy where a fair initial distribution of resources, but differing preferences for work and leisure: X prefers to work hard and defer consumption while Y prefers leisure and immediate consumption, which results in X being able to hire Y under conditions such that (a) X is made better off by this arrangement, (b) Y is not made worse off by this arrangement; (c) Y could have freely chosen not to enter into this arrangement; and (d) Y is exploited by X in that X appropriates some of the labour time of Y. In examples like these, Roemer maintains, exploitation exists but does not appear morally objectionable or unjust.

For Roemer, exploitation is best understood as the distributive result of inequalities in the distribution of productive assets and resources. It is unjust only where it results from a prior injustice in the underlying distribution of those assets and resources (Roemer 1996: 96). He consequently recommends that Marxists should drop their traditional focus on the micro level of the relationship between classes in production, and attend rather to the macro level of the distribution of property in society. It is unjust distribution—specifically, the unjust capitalist monopoly of effective control of the means of production—that generates (the secondary phenomenon of) unjust capitalist exploitation, and which should be the primary locus of any normative concern.

One critical concern about this account is that, although the existing capitalist monopoly over the means of production may have come about in a morally problematic way (not least, through violence and theft), we can at least imagine (perhaps having read Nozick 1974) a capitalism with a morally clean origin story, where the same inequalities emerge from a just starting point and just subsequent steps (involving, perhaps, voluntary choices and the right kind of luck). In such circumstances, Roemer’s three conditions might be met, but, on his own account, there looks to be nothing wrongful about the result. This might appear a surprising result in a Marxist account of exploitation, and is perhaps indicative of a wider problem.

In this context, consider the paradigmatic example of exploitation suggested by Nicholas Vrousalis (2013: 148); namely “the pit case”:

A finds B in a pit that B cannot exit unaided. A can get B out at little cost or difficulty. A offers to get B out, but only if B agrees to pay a million euros, or to sign a sweatshop contract with A. B signs the contract.

We do not seem to require to know how B came to be in the pit—whether, for instance, it was through just or unjust steps—in order to assess the offer as wrongfully exploitative. It seems enough to notice that A could easily rescue B without asking for anything, but instead takes advantage of B’s vulnerability in order to improve their own lot (Vrousalis 2013: 149). By analogy, asset injustice does not look to be a necessary condition for wrongful exploitation.

A second analytical Marxist account maintains that wrongful exploitation rests on capitalists enriching themselves by taking advantage of the vulnerability of workers. (This model is suggested by some of Wood’s writings on exploitation (see especially 1995).)

Wood maintains that exploitation in general “consists in the exploiter”s using something about the person for the exploiter’s ends by playing on some weakness or vulnerability in that person’ (1995: 147). And he acknowledges that, so understood, exploitation is not always wrongful (as, for instance, in cases like the previously mentioned chess grandmaster).

Exploitation is wrongful, on this account, when exploiters enrich themselves by taking advantage of the vulnerability of the exploited. The wrongfulness here seems to involve the instrumental treatment of others in ways which are humiliating or disrespectful. Wood maintains that:

Proper respect for others is violated when we treat their vulnerabilities as opportunities to advance our own interests or projects. It is degrading to have your weaknesses taken advantage of, and dishonourable to use the weakness of others for your ends. (1995: 150–151)

The relation between capitalist and worker would appear to exemplify this account of wrongful exploitation. The vulnerability here arises from the workers’ propertyless condition, which compels them to sell their labour power in terms advantageous to the capitalist. This structural feature of the capitalist economy is not fundamentally altered, and only lightly mitigated, by the existence of some collective bargaining and government regulation (A. Wood 1995: 155). (Note that “wrongful exploitation” here might, or might not, constitute an injustice on Wood’s account.)

One critical concern about this pure vulnerability account is that it might look too expansive; that is, it might look liable to indicate falsely that exploitation is present in particular cases. It might, for example, seem committed to the claim that a cancer doctor, who makes a very comfortable living out of treating the seriously ill, necessarily exploits their patients (Arneson 2016: 10). Those who hesitate to endorse that claim may seek to resist such implications.

A third analytical Marxist account treats the instrumentalization of vulnerability as a necessary but not sufficient condition for wrongful exploitation. The additional condition for exploitation to obtain is that this instrumentalization of vulnerability occurs in a manner which involves domination. (This model is suggested in some of Wood’s writings on exploitation (1972, 2014), as well as in work by Vrousalis (2013, 2016).)

On this domination account, it is the abuse of power that is the real wrong-making feature of exploitation; exploitation is paradigmatically “domination for self-enrichment” (Vrousalis 2013: 131). The relevant kind of domination obtains when the exploiter either inflicts some “power-induced injury” to the status of the exploited, or imposes some “servitude” on the part of the exploited (Vrousalis 2016: 3). This refinement appears to address the critical concern about the expansiveness of the pure vulnerability account; for instance, domination looks to be missing in the case of the cancer doctor and patient, but present in the relation between A and B in the case of the pit.

To be clear, the present account is intended to give some introductory sense of an ongoing debate about whether unfairness, the instrumentalization of vulnerability, or domination, are at the heart of wrongful exploitation. There is no suggestion here that any consensus about the precise character of exploitation has emerged within analytical Marxism.

5. Socialism

5.1 Embracing Design

Analytical Marxists have typically broken with Marx’s “utopophobia”, rejecting his view that providing detailed descriptions of the socialist future is undemocratic, impossible, and unnecessary (Leopold 2016). Instead, analytical Marxists have embraced the need for socialist design, and explicitly sought to develop coherent and credible accounts: first, of the values of socialism; second, of the institutional, and other, arrangements which might best embody and promote those values; and third, of the forms that a transition to those alternatives to capitalism might take (Elster & Moene 1989).

The values endorsed by analytical Marxism are familiar from the wider socialist tradition (see entry on socialism, §3.1). They include: equality; community; democracy; individual freedom; and self-realization. Within analytical Marxism, there is no general agreement about the character, weight, or potential to conflict, of these. However some examples of their elaboration by analytical Marxists can be given.

Equality is understood by Cohen as “socialist equality of opportunity” (distinct from bourgeois and left-liberal variants of equality of opportunity). He construes this in a luck egalitarian way, as seeking to correct for all unchosen disadvantage, disadvantage for which the agent herself cannot be held responsible, whether it reflects social or natural misfortune (2009a: 10–11). Community, on Cohen’s account, requires “that people care about, and, where necessary and possible, care for, one another, and, too, care that they care about one another” (2009a: 34–35). Meaningful community is put under strain when large inequalities obtain, and so this principle limits certain inequalities that the egalitarian principle alone would permit. Democracy can be understood as extending beyond the political, narrowly construed, to require that people have “broadly equal access to the necessary means to participate meaningfully in decisions” affecting their lives as members of society (Wright 2010: 12). Individual freedom is defended in a variety of increasingly demanding ways, from negative liberty, though non-domination, to the “real freedom” of having security, self-ownership, and the greatest possible opportunity to do whatever you might want to do (Van Parijs 1995: ch. 1). And self-realisation is seen as valuable (for reasons involving welfare and autonomy), even if considerations of feasibility and desirability require some scaling down of the classic Marxist requirement of “the full and free actualization and externalization of the powers and the abilities of the individual” (Elster 1989: 131).

Turning to the kind of institutions that might best embody and promote these, and other, values, it might be said that analytical Marxists typically proceed with a certain humility. In particular, they often acknowledge the inhuman and irrational dimensions of many twentieth-century varieties of actually-existing-socialism. Wright figuratively warns that, rather than having detailed maps with clear destinations and identifiable routes, contemporary socialists are in the position of early explorers with a “compass” and some sense of the direction in which they want to go (2006). And Cohen wryly cautions that, although we have a reasonably clear sense of socialist values “we now know that we do not now know” how to design the social institutions that might best embody and promote those goods (2009a: 81).

Two institutional examples of alternatives to capitalism—market socialism and basic income—associated with analytical Marxism are sketched here (see also Arneson 1992).

5.2 “Coupon Socialism”

Market socialism can take many different forms. John Roemer has developed, and serially refined, a particular variant referred to here as “coupon socialism” (1994a, 1994b, 1996). Coupon socialism is an example of a kind of market socialism sometimes called “shareholder socialism”; that is, a type of economic model which combines a stock market with public ownership of firms (Corneo 2017: 184–197). Sceptics might characterise the result as “capitalism without capitalists”, but Roemer defends it as a feasible and desirable attempt to combine: efficient market mechanisms; some state planning over broad investment priorities; an egalitarian distribution of property rights; and an egalitarian distribution of profits.

Roemer is keen not to rerun earlier battles between socialism and the market. Socialists, he insists, cannot afford to neglect the importance of efficiency and innovation in generating sustainable prosperity. He variously: allows that Soviet-style command economies failed; presents Friedrich Hayek as winning the “socialist calculation debate”; and recommends learning from the real-world institutional “experiments” of contemporary capitalisms (where ownership and control are already differentiated, and diverse mechanisms—involving figurative “carrots” and “sticks”—have been developed to tackle principal-agent problems). A strong public sector is likely to be a central ingredient of a socialist society, but socialists are admonished to stop “fetishizing” public ownership, and to be open-minded about possible ownership relations, judging them only by their effects on equality and efficiency (Roemer 1994b: 454–457). Roemer’s own earlier work on exploitation had convinced him that property relations and asset inequalities—not markets as such—are the real problems.

Coupon socialism aims to distribute the profits of firms equally amongst citizens without unacceptable losses in efficiency compared to contemporary capitalism. The model eliminates capitalist class relations whilst retaining market mechanisms. Ownership is distributed equally through arrangements which involve a stock market and decentralised decision making. Its most striking institutional feature is perhaps the creation of two kinds of money—call them “dollars” and “coupons”—which are not convertible by individuals (who cannot legally exchange coupons for dollars or transfer coupons as gifts or bequests). Dollars are used to buy all the commodities that you might currently purchase (including labour power and consumption goods) except that they cannot be used to buy ownership rights in listed companies. The latter can only be purchased by individuals with coupons, and coupons are distributed to individuals in an egalitarian manner. The shares are priced in coupons but any subsequent dividend would be in dollars. At the legal age of maturity, individuals receive their per capita share of the total coupon value of the economy. It is assumed that most individuals will invest their coupons in shares through mutual funds rather than directly. A share of a firm entitles the mutual fund to a share of the relevant firm’s profits, and a share of a mutual fund entitles the individual to a share in the fund’s revenues (Roemer 1996: 20). The model effectively endows citizens at adulthood with a modest income stream during their lives, generated from the profits of public companies that are not directly owned by the state. The various restrictions on the relevant property rights ensure that the scope for accumulating wealth in means of production is limited. Differentials in coupon wealth would exist, but the main causes of inequality would be differential wages and savings behaviour.

Such a brief sketch of coupon socialism raises many questions (see Wright 1995, and Veneziani 2021, for further discussion). These include questions about its feasibility and desirability.

Feasibility worries often concern the economic details of the model. Critics wonder variously about: the place of small private capitalist firms (shops, restaurants, small manufacturers); the modesty of the coupon-driven income stream; and the structures needed for raising investment funds (through credit markets and other mechanisms which allow companies to convert coupons into dollars subject to regulation) (Corneo 2017: 184–197).

Desirability worries often concern the socialist credentials of the model. Critics wonder variously about: the extent to which these institutional arrangements might embody and promote an individualism corrosive of community; or how far these arrangements might fail to embody and promote the kind of control over work arrangements that socialists have historically endorsed and sought to realise (Wright 1995).

More generally, much seems to depends on the intended aim of the model. Should we think of coupon socialism as: an imaginative theoretical demonstration that economic efficiency can be conceptualised outside of capitalist private ownership; a deliberately modest and accessible first step away from capitalist society towards a more egalitarian future; or as the very best socialist arrangements that are feasible? (These alternatives are not intended to be exhaustive.)

Roemer has continued to work on issues of socialist design, focussing more recently on the modelling of individual economic behaviour (Roemer 2019a). Any coherent socio-economic system, he suggests, requires “three pillars”: a set of property relations and institutions that organise the allocation of resources; a distributive ethic that identifies a fair or just pattern of income and resources; and a behavioural ethos that specifies how economic actors make decisions. These three should work together, in that if economic agents act according to the relevant ethos, then the relevant institutional arrangements should implement the relevant just distribution. Roemer now insists that the behavioural ethos is as important as the other two pillars, and criticises earlier models of market socialism—including coupon socialism—for having changed the institutional arrangements of capitalism but kept its behavioural ethos (Roemer 2019a: 179; see Carens 1981 for a possible exception).

In capitalism, the behavioural ethos is said to be “individualism” (the individual “goes it alone”), where each actor is conceived as “being in competition with all other actors, and the actions of all are constrained by nature”. In socialism, in contrast, the behavioural ethos is cooperation, where citizens of a socialist society are engaged in a cooperative enterprise to transform nature in order to improve the lives of everyone (Roemer 2020a: 10–11).

More precisely, Roemer recommends a socialist model of cooperation that he calls “Kantian optimisation”. Kantian optimisation challenges both the standard economic picture of individuals as utility maximisers, and in the standard ways in which that standard picture is adjusted for other-regarding motivations (Roemer rejects the idea that Nash optimisation is the uniquely rational way to optimise). In Kantian optimisation, individuals choose the action that maximises their payoff, assuming that all other agents take the same action. Very roughly, cooperation depends, not on altruism (which is implausibly demanding), but on solidarity (the idea that we are “all in the same boat”) and trust (the idea that if we take the cooperative action, enough others will do so as well). This socialist model of cooperation is said to be realistic, in that it respects certain behavioural results in both the laboratory and real life (recycling and tipping, for instance (Roemer 2019a: 14–16)).

Roemer uses formal models—general competitive equilibrium and game theory—to demonstrate some surprising payoffs for socialist design once this model of cooperation is integrated into it. Not least, he demonstrates that, under some fairly uncontroversial assumptions, market socialist economies can rectify the unequal income distribution of capitalism without paying a price in efficiency or market failures (Roemer 2019a: 206–207, and Veneziani 2021). In short, given Kantian optimisation, certain familiar problems in socialist design may be less serious than were once thought (Roemer 2015: 107).

5.3 Basic Income

The idea of basic income has a long history (early forerunners include Thomas Spence 1797 [2004] and Joseph Charlier 1848 [2004]), and some confusingly close relatives (including basic endowment and a negative income tax). Its most recent revival owes much to Philippe Van Parijs. The core idea is deceptively simple and seductive. Basic income consists in:

a regular income paid in cash to every individual member of a society, irrespective of income from other sources and with no strings attached. (Van Parijs & Vanderborght 2017: 4)

The proposal assumes a territorially defined political community, and that recipients are fiscal residents. The regular payment is in cash and not in kind (food, shelter, clothes, etc.). It is paid to each individual, irrespective of their domestic arrangements (not, for instance, only to “heads of households”). It is universal, involving no means test, but paid, at the same rate, to rich and poor alike. And it is an obligation-free payment, carrying no requirement, in particular, for beneficiaries to work or be available to work.

Beyond that core idea, particular basic income schemes differ considerably; not least concerning the level at which the basic income is to be paid. To help calibrate alternatives, Van Parijs suggests that an amount corresponding to a quarter of current GDP per capita—which, in 2015, would have corresponded to $1163 per month in the United States—would sit between “modest” and “generous” versions of the idea (Van Parijs & Vanderborght 2017: 11).

Since the model apparently assumes an economy dominated by appropriately regulated capitalist markets, enthusiasm for a basic income might be thought to sit uneasily with the normative commitments of analytical Marxism. One response is to emphasise the ways in which a basic income scheme might reduce our dependence on that market. It could variously: strengthen the bargaining position of workers (against their employers and others); effect a partial decommodification of labour power (reducing the economic compulsion to sell the latter); and make engagement in socially useful but unpaid activities much easier (Wright 2005c). So understood, basic income answers questions about both socialist transition and socialist design; a basic income scheme might help us move away from a capitalist society, and form part of the institutional structure of the non-capitalist alternative.

In a set of delightfully provocative essays written with Robert van der Veen, Van Parijs took that suggestion—that a basic income scheme might transform capitalism in a progressive direction—and ran with it (Van der Veen & Van Parijs 1986a, 1986b, 2006). They laid out the possibility of “a capitalist road to communism”; arguing that welfare state capitalisms have the potential to move smoothly, if slowly, towards Marx’s own communist ideal. The communist “realm of freedom”—understood here as involving widespread material abundance, voluntary productive contributions according to ability, and distribution according to need—is now reached via the introduction of, and gradual increase in, a basic income scheme in capitalist societies. It is not reached by the traditional “transitional”, or “strictly socialist”, stage involving state or social ownership of means of production. On this account, that “strictly socialist” stage is redundant, and can be skipped entirely (for critical comment, see Wright 1994: 157–172).

Framed in this way, the case for basic income seems to rest on controversial perfectionist assumptions; for instance, about the disvalue of wage labour and value of unalienated activities (see Kandiyali 2022). This might make it a hard sell in liberal pluralistic societies committed to respecting a diversity of conceptions of the good life, and Van Parijs has subsequently sought to reposition the proposal.

The appeal of basic income is now said to rest on its emancipatory potential, its ability to deliver “real freedom”—the “genuine capacity” of individuals to act on their own life plans free from certain debilitating pressures (including unemployment and employment traps)—to all. Freedom considerations also, of course, play a role in determining the form of basic income; for instance, helping to justify its being a cash payment with no restriction on what is purchased or when. The tightness of the connection between basic income and this real libertarian foundation might be doubted, but this is now Van Parijs’ preferred grounding.

So understood, basic income rests on a conception of social justice which is both liberal, in not privileging particular contested conceptions of the good, and egalitarian, in requiring justifications for any derivation from a baseline equal distribution. Freedom is treated not as a constraint on what justice requires, but as “the very stuff that justice consists in distributing fairly” (Van Parijs & Vanderborght 2017: 104). Basic income is justified as a way of maximising the level of real freedom to those with the least of it (“maximin real freedom”), or rather “maximining” the “gifts” that form the “material substratum” of such real freedom. “Gifts” here refer to the immense stock of wealth for which none of us are individually responsible, and which should be treated as our common inheritance (Van Parijs & Vanderborght 2017: 104–109).

Criticisms of basic income are sufficiently many and varied to make meaningful summary impractical. However, two familiar worries might be noted.

First, a familiar desirability worry is that basic income involves an apparent unfairness. In advocating unconditional benefits it violates some conception of “reciprocity”, allowing individuals to receive a share of their society’s income without making a productive contribution in return (White 2003). Elster provocatively describes basic income as a recipe for the “exploitation of the industrious by the lazy” (1986b: 719). A number of responses are available, including: conceding the validity of the concern, but seeing it as outweighed by the practical difficulties of enacting conditionality; or allowing that reciprocity considerations are persuasive in the context of certain cooperative ventures, but denying their relevance in the context of distributive justice.

Second, a familiar feasibility worry is that basic income schemes might be unaffordable. In facilitating a move away from paid productive activities, basic income risks undermining the very source of funding on which it depends. Again, a number of responses are available, including: claiming that perverse labour supply effects might be reduced by taxing things other than individual income (natural resources, financial transactions, consumption, and so on); or stressing that the weight of this objection depends on the level at which the basic income is set (uncertainty perhaps recommending that we start low and introduce increases experimentally).

5.4 Transition

The lack of agreement about the shape of a desirable and feasible post-capitalist future, might make discussion of how to reach that goal look premature. However, preliminary reflection on the issue of socialist transition—of how to get from “here” to “there”—might still be useful. The many examples of such reflection from within analytical Marxism include: Cohen’s discussion of the proletariat as a collective agent (2000a: 101–115); Adam Przeworski’s account of the electoral dilemmas of social democracy (1985); and Erik Olin Wright’s reflections on socialist strategy. An outline of the latter is provided here.

Wright’s ambition—looking both “behind” and “ahead”—is to move beyond the tired and limited contrast between “reform” and “revolution”. He offers a conceptual map of socialist—and, more broadly, anti-capitalist—strategies that have been historically important, as well as suggesting how they might be combined in a strategic vision for those seeking to escape the harms of contemporary capitalism (2010: 273–365).

Wright (2019: 38–53) identifies five “strategic logics” embodied in anti-capitalist struggles (historical examples of movements adopting them are in parentheses). The initial pair of examples share a revolutionary goal—replacing capitalism with a very different kind of economic structure—but have competing accounts of how that might be accomplished. First, smashing capitalism: according to which “a decisive, ruptural break” with a system that is, at root, unreformable is necessary (see early twentieth-century revolutionary communism). Second, dismantling capitalism: according to which democratic politics facilitate state-directed reforms gradually replacing capitalist elements with alternatives (see “democratic socialism”). Third, taming capitalism: which typically uses state policies of regulation and redistribution in order to “neutralise” the harms of capitalism, without trying to destroy their underlying causes (see post-war social democracy). Those last two strategies rely heavily on the exercise of state power, and in this respect differ from Wright’s final two models. Fourth, resisting capitalism: which involves more or less organised attempts within civil society—and not primarily the state—to alleviate the harms of capitalism (see trade unions, boycotts, consumer movements, and anarchist-inflected social movements). And fifth, escaping capitalism: which pursues a more separatist strategy, not tackling capitalism directly, but rather seeking to isolate a group from its harms (see intentional communities, communes, and certain religious communities).

Wright locates these five “strategic logics” within a schematic typology with two dimensions (2019: 53–58). The first dimension differentiates between “neutralising harms” and “transcending structures”. The “taming” and “resistance” models aim to neutralise harms; and the “smashing”, “dismantling”, and “escaping”, models aim to transcend structures. The second dimension differentiates between three “transformative logics” using the metaphor of a “game”. The “ruptural” strategy seeks to change the game being played, and is exemplified by the “smashing” model. The “symbiotic” strategy seeks to change the rules of the game being played, and is exemplified by the “taming” and “dismantling” models. And the “interstitial” strategy seeks to change the way in which one plays within a given set of rules, and is exemplified by the “resisting” and “escaping” models. Anyone seeking to visualise a grid with these two dimensions will realise that one of the six resulting cells is empty. No-one presumably uses a sledgehammer to crack a nut, or, a little less figuratively, no-one thinking that the most effective way of neutralising harms is to change the game itself.

Wright’s evaluation of these historical movements is broadly negative; they all seem to have either failed at the time, or to have only limited current purchase. From the political vantagepoint of developed capitalist countries: revolutionary communism and democratic socialism have largely disappeared; social democracy has declined, and lost its connection with labour militancy; and, whilst “anarchist inflected social movements” survive as perhaps the most dynamic form of anti-capitalism, they often remain disconnected from political projects and parties. Wright appears most critical of the ruptural strategy, doubting that democratic support for a sharp break and rapid transition is sustainable given the nature of the “transition trough”—a concept adopted from Przeworski—faced by the middle classes, in particular (2010: 308–320). (A “transition trough” refers to the initial decline in production and living standards that is likely to follow a ruptural break with capitalism. Depending on the depth and extent of these troughs, it might not be in the material interests of individuals to support a ruptural path to socialism even where they plausibly believe that the material conditions of life under socialism will eventually come to exceed those of previously-existing capitalism.)

Looking forwards, Wright recommends the strategy of eroding capitalism (2019: 59–64). Existing economic systems are said to combine capitalism with other economic arrangements, including what we might call proto-socialist alternatives (embodying democracy, equality, and community). The eroding strategy combines elements of interstitial and symbiotic approaches. In the former mode, it involves a “bottom-up” strategy focused on civil society, participating in various marginal alternative economic activities. In the latter mode, it involves a “top-down” strategy focused on the state, seeking to secure and expand those alternatives through law and public policy. The ambition of this mixed approach is gradually to allow proto-socialist economic relations and practices to succeed and displace their capitalist counterparts.

The strategic vision of eroding capitalism corresponds only uncertainly to real world movements, but Wright suggests that certain movements in Latin America and Southern Europe (including Podemos in Spain) may capture something of its spirit. He also portrays it as analogous to the process by which capitalism itself historically displaced feudalism. Proto-capitalist forms of economic life emerged in the niches of feudalism, and slowly grew to the point where they displaced the dominant feudal structures. Political upheavals occurred as part of this process, but they typically served to consolidate and rationalise socioeconomic changes that had already taken place (Wright 2019: 61).

6. Overarching Criticisms

This entry already contains many examples of criticisms of particular authors and particular arguments within analytical Marxism. However, these were not typically targeted at the intellectual current as a whole. Indeed, some were advanced from perspectives sympathetic to the approaches, concerns, and commitments, of analytical Marxism. However, there are also less sympathetic critics willing to move beyond specific authors and arguments, and issue a negative verdict on analytical Marxism as such. These comprehensive criticisms are varied, but might be grouped roughly according to which of the three sources and component parts of analytical Marxism forms their central target.

A first group of comprehensive criticisms focus on the methodological claims of analytical Marxism. The diversity of positive methodological approaches amongst analytical Marxists has been emphasised here, but there remains a shared (negative) premise; namely, that there is no distinct and valuable Marxist method. And there are critics who—holding that there is such a method, and that it is superior to the “bourgeois” tools adopted by analytical Marxism—reject that premise. For example, they might maintain that Marxism is necessarily committed to a “dialectical” approach—sometimes based on a wider philosophy of “internal relations”—which analytical Marxists are bound to reject (Sayers 1984, 2015). Or, they might suggest that “analytical” and “Marxist” are rival methodologies embodying a tension that can only be resolved fully by one side routing the other; on this account, some September Group participants are portrayed as remaining true to their analytical methods by slowly abandoning their Marxism (Roberts 1996: 14).

A second group of comprehensive criticisms focus on the substantive concerns of analytical Marxism. The critical suggestion here is typically that in translating the substantive concerns of traditional Marxism into the language and frameworks of “mainstream social science”, analytical Marxism has lost what was valuable about them (Levine 2003: 123). For instance, it is suggested that analytical Marxism’s treatment of exploitation, class, and history, involves an abstract, individualistic, and ahistorical, framework that makes its conclusions hard to distinguish, in many respects, from the theories of “bourgeois social science” (E. Wood 1989: 55). Or, in an another variant, that analytical Marxists seem to have lost sight of, or never really appreciated, the centrality of the “system of labour” to Marx’s substantive account of human society (Chitty 1998: 40).

A third, and final, group of comprehensive criticisms focus on the “normative turn” of analytical Marxism, reacting against the suggestion that the predictive failures of classical Marxism might have amplified the need for normative clarification and argument (G. Cohen 2000a: 103–4). One variant insists that Marxism neither has, nor needs, a normative theory. Marx is rather to be commended for holding that normative theory is pointless because it is motivationally ineffective or unnecessary (Leiter 2002, 2015). Another variant criticises the content, rather than the fact, of analytical Marxist commitment to normative theory. For instance, normatively speaking, it suggests that analytical Marxism has increasingly “fused and interpenetrated” with left-liberalism, to a point where it is difficult to tell them apart (Bertram 2007: 137).

These comprehensive criticisms are not directly challenged here. However, there are reasons, at least, to hesitate before endorsing them.

First, it might simply be too early for comprehensive criticism. Attempts at the latter sometimes fail to consider that only a very provisional assessment of analytical Marxism as a research programme might be appropriate at this point. After all, many participants in the first wave of analytical Marxism—including Brenner, Roemer, and Van Parijs—continue to produce significant and interesting work. In addition, there are more recent contributions which offer the possibility of a constructive future development of the paradigm. Consider, for example, the “Afro-analytical Marxism” outlined and endorsed by Tommie Shelby (2021). Very roughly, Shelby approves of analytical Marxism’s methodological combination of analytical and empirical rigour, together with its substantive interest in exploitation and ideology, but regrets—and seeks to make good—its failure, both to theorise racism and racial hierarchy, and to examine the place of the black radical resistance in the fight for social justice and a “post-capitalist” future (2021, and Mills 2003: 155). More generally, the future of analytical Marxism looks open; its research programme does not appear closed to future development, nor has it been replaced decisively by a competitor. The intellectual merits of intellectual traditions—think of utilitarianism, for instance—are not always exhausted by one’s judgement of the first group of authors with whom they are associated. Simply put, it might be better to leave the full autopsy until the death of the patient is more certain.

Second, some of these comprehensive criticisms might appear to be unproductively preoccupied with the Marxist credentials of analytical Marxism. “Marxism” is treated stipulatively as an honorific, and then this analytical variant is located beyond the pale—exposed as not Marxist, or not Marxist enough, or not Marxist in the right kind of way, or even “anti-Marxist” (Lebowitz 1988: 195; Hunt 1992: 105).) Of course, this issue—of whether, and to what extent, analytical Marxism is Marxist—can take a legitimate form. It might, for instance, form a step in a more substantive argument, or the context might be one in which proper labelling is an appropriate concern (intellectual history, for instance). However, in the absence of further argument, these criticisms can appear to adopt an inappropriately “religious” approach to the evaluation of an ongoing research programme. Cohen expresses regret that, historically, it was the label “Marxism”—rather than, say, that of “scientific socialism”—that came to be associated with the relevant concerns and commitments. After all, it is typically religions, rather than sciences, which are named after their founders. Progressive disciplines are not expected to preserve the theses of their founders (G. Cohen 2000b: xxvii). We do not, for instance, ask physicists whether they are still sufficiently Galilean (assuming, for the sake of the example, that Galileo founded physics)?

Third, and finally, some of these comprehensive criticisms look ungenerous and one-sided, making little effort to consider the potential achievements here. More positively, analytical Marxism might be said to have established itself as an intelligent and valuable form of “Enlightenment Marxism”. Its enthusiasm for clarity in, careful elaboration of, and honesty about, arguments, constitute contextually-important reminders of significant intellectual virtues. Substantively, its evolving treatment of core Marxist concerns—including historical development, class, and exploitation—reflect and confirm an openness to science, reason, and empirical evidence. As such, analytical Marxism recognises and continues certain valuable, and often neglected, elements of Marx’s own thought (Little 1986). In addition, analytical Marxism aspires to advance our understanding of the social world without abandoning, or obscuring, or disparaging, the role of normative theory. Finally, its rejection of Marx’s “utopophobia” is well-founded, and its corresponding efforts to explore and promote alternatives to capitalism, in ways which balance the concerns of desirability and feasibility, are imaginative and thought-provoking. Analytical Marxism, it might be suggested, rightly takes its place as one current of thought, in a wider radical stream, striving to understand social oppression, and to contribute to its reduction and elimination (G. Cohen 2001: 14).


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Other Internet Resources

  • Kirby Mark, unpublished, “An Interview with Erik Olin Wright”, written 2001, [Kirby 2001 available online].
  • Roemer, John E., 2019b, “‘Exploitation, Cooperation, and Distributive Justice’ Interview by Maya Adereth and Jerome Hodges”, in Phenomenal World, 24 October 2019. [Roemer 2019b available online]


I am grateful to Jan Kandiyali, Lucinda Rumsey, and an anonymous SEP referee, for comments on a previous version of this entry.

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